John Anderson (1893-1962)
Scottish-Australian philosopher John Anderson was a passionate defender of a philosophy typically described as Realism. Anderson exercised a significant and lasting influence over several generations of students, including such later philosophers as John Passmore, J.L. Mackie, and D.M. Armstrong. These students criticised and developed several key features of Anderson’s own philosophy such as the defense of a theory of objective good, the rejection of any theory of absolute morality or imperative, and a logically rigorous approach to metaphysical questions such as causation.
The significance of this influence was primarily due to Anderson’s systematic conception of philosophy as a Realist theory of logic, ethics, and aesthetics; this was unusual because it was in a century dominated by the analytic method in philosophy. Anderson’s systematic conception of philosophy sought to provide a unified theory of the traditional subjects of philosophy freed from their association with Platonism and Idealism.
Hence Anderson advanced a doctrinal conception of metaphysics as composed of three distinct elements: an epistemology of Realism as the direct experience of things, an ontology of Empiricism as situations of objects existing independently of the relations they have, and the logical theory of Positivism as the theory that terms and propositions always refer to existing objects or situations. Further, Anderson also developed the important ethical and aesthetic theory that ‘good’ and ‘beauty’ can never be in terms of the relations that they have (for example, being valued, being obliged, being striven after, ‘expressing’ etc.) and must be qualities of natural human activities.
One of the most controversial aspects of Anderson’s ontology was his logical analysis of Space-Time and its refutation of ‘physicalist’ (that is, general relativity) assumptions about the nature of space-time. Put briefly, space-time (in Einstein’s sense) cannot have an origin or a boundary because beyond that limit or origin, there must always be more Space-Time (in Anderson’s sense). Associated with this view of existence was his theory of the categories. Developing the ideas of Samuel Alexander, Anderson argued that there were thirteen categories that are universal to all things.
Table of Contents
- Early Systematic Realism: 1926-1937
- Mature Philosophy 1939-1962
- References and Further Reading
John Anderson was born in 1893 in the small town of Stonehouse, twenty miles south-west of Glasgow, Scotland. He attended the local school, where his father was headmaster, before enrolling at the Hamilton Academy in 1907. In 1911, he won first place in the All Scotland Bursary Competition which enabled him to study at Glasgow University from 1911 to 1917. During this time he won several prizes and awards, before graduating with an M.A. degree in philosophy in 1917. From 1917 to 1922 he worked in the philosophy departments at Glasgow University and the University of Wales, before being employed at Edinburgh University on the Shaw Fellowship from 1922 to 1926. In 1927, he was appointed Professor of Philosophy at Sydney University and, apart from a sabbatical year spent in Britain and America in 1938, he remained there until his retirement in 1958. He died in Sydney in 1962 at the age of 69.
Anderson was initially influenced by the Hegelian Idealism established at Glasgow University by Edward and John Caird and further developed by Anderson’s own teacher, Henry Jones. The distinctive form of Hegelianism developed at Glasgow University is typically described as Christian Idealism, as it emphasized the dialectical development of an organic universe culminating in the realization of God. Anderson was also influenced by other Scottish philosophers such as Robert Adamson and John Burnet, although it was the Australian philosopher, Samuel Alexander, who had the most significant and permanent impact on his philosophical development. Anderson had already been exposed to the Realist writings of the early Moore and Russell, and the work of William James and the American New Realists before he attended Alexander’s Gifford lectures at Glasgow University between 1915 and 1917. These lectures, later published as Space, Time and Deity, were to exercise such a decisive influence on Anderson that he was still lecturing on them thirty years later. [Anderson 2005, 2007i] From within the history of philosophy itself, the most significant influences on him were Heraclitus, Socrates, Plato, and Hegel. He often praised Greek objectivity with its emphasis on ‘things’ and thought that almost all of modern philosophy, with its emphasis on epistemology, was irrelevant to the systematic study of philosophy, with only Hegel and Alexander being singled out for praise from the entire modern period. [Anderson 2008i, 2008ii]
Anderson’s intellectual development was also influenced by a range of non-philosophical thinkers including James Joyce, Mathew Arnold, Sigmund Freud, Karl Marx, Georges Sorel, Giambattista Vico, Henrik Ibsen, Fyodor Dostoevsky, and Herman Melville. He was particularly well read in the Marxist and Communist literature of the early twentieth century, being familiar with the works of Engels, Lenin, Trotsky, Bukharin, Kautsky, and Stalin. While these various political and cultural influences cannot be said to fit neatly into Anderson’s overall philosophic system, his interest in these thinkers meant that his students gained an education that was much more ‘continental’ in scope than was typical at other English-speaking universities around the world at that time. In a very real sense, Anderson’s students received an education that was unique. This diverse intellectual and cultural context, when coupled with the logical discipline of his systematic philosophy, enabled many of his students to succeed in a variety of academic and non-academic occupations.
In philosophy, his students included John Passmore, J.L. Mackie, and D.M. Armstrong, whose collective work in metaphysics, ethics, and the history of philosophy, contributed greatly to the development of philosophy during the last quarter of the twentieth century. [Armstrong 2001, Passmore 1997] Apart from these luminaries, Anderson’s students who pursued careers in academic philosophy number more than thirty and comprise more than a dozen professors. These include Alec Ritchie (Professor of Philosophy), David Stove (Associate Professor of Philosophy), A.J. Baker, Bill Doniela (A/Professor of Philosophy), Sandy Anderson, Ruth Walker, Kim Lycos, Margaret Mackie, Gaius MacIntosh, George Molnar (author, Powers: a Study in Metaphysics), Alan Olding (author, Modern Biology and Natural Theology), Perce Partridge (Professor of Philosophy), Tom Rose (Associate Professor of Philosophy), Vic Dudman, Robert McLaughlin, Eric Dowling, Graham Pont, and David Dockrill.
Anderson’s students also succeeded to a number of professorial positions outside philosophy. These include Eugene Kamenka (Professor, History of Ideas), L.J. Hume (Reader, Political Science), Les Hiatt (Professor of Anthropology), Donald Horne (author, The Lucky Country), Doug McCallum (Professor of Political Science), Neil McInnes (author, The Western Marxists), Wesley Milgate (Professor of English), Bill Morison (Professor of Law), H.J. Oliver (Professor of English), Bill O’Neil (Professor of Psychology), John Ward (Professor of History), Brian Beddie (Professor of Government), Hedley Bull (Professor of International Relations), P.D. Craig (Professor of Chemistry), Rawdon Dalrymple (Professor of Government), J.A.B. Holland (Professor of Divinity), A.D. Hope (Professor of English), James McAuley (Professor of English), and R.F. Jackson (Professor of French). Studying under Anderson also enabled a great number of his students to succeed in the commercial, journalistic, and political spheres. He is widely regarded as the ‘father’ of the Sydney Push, the amorphous social and political movement that produced such significant public intellectuals as Clive James, Germaine Greer, Robert Hughes, and Barry Humphries.
Anderson’s tenure at Sydney University was a controversial one and he was twice subject to public censure: once by the Sydney University Senate, and once by the NSW Parliament. He participated in many student societies at the University and was president of the Sydney University Freethought Society for over twenty years. He was also a passionate defender of freedom of speech and thought, a critic of all forms of censorship, and an active participant in several radical political movements during his early years.
Since his death, Anderson’s philosophy has been little studied and, in general, is misunderstood. A significant reason for this state of affairs is that he only wrote journal articles during his lifetime and the greater majority of these were for the Australasian Journal of Psychology and Philosophy, which, at that time, was not widely read internationally. He was working on the publication of a collection of a selection of these articles at the time of his death and these were published posthumously as Studies in Empirical Philosophy. Over the next forty years, only two other collections of his work were published – Art and Reality dealing with aesthetics and literary criticism and Education and Inquiry dealing with education. The creation of the position of the John Anderson Research Fellow at Sydney University led to the publication of a number of editions of his lectures from 2003 to 2008, but that position has been vacant since 2008. It is not known when, or if, that position will be filled again so further publication of Anderson’s philosophy can occur.
Another difficulty in properly understanding Anderson’s philosophy is the spread of his philosophical writing during his academic career. During his first ten years at Sydney University (1927-1937), he wrote 75% of all his published articles in philosophy. Hence for the remaining twenty four years of his life (1938-1962) he wrote only 25% of his published work. This lack of publication after 1938 makes assessment of his mature philosophical position very difficult. While an irregular spread of publication over a lifetime might not always present a problem for understanding a philosopher’s theories, in Anderson’s case it is significant because in his political writings, where the same irregular publication occurs, there is a radical change in his political position: from a radical Communist in 1927 to conservative anti-Communist in 1962. He described his political writings for the decade from 1927 to 1937 as his ‘proletarian’ period, as at this time he adhered to a general Communist theory of society and political change. After 1938, he entered his ‘anti-proletarian’ period of political theorizing which was characterized by an emphasis on liberty, democracy, the importance of traditions in political life, and anti-Communism.
Given these marked changes in his political position, the question is raised whether Anderson’s philosophic views also went through any substantial changes during his lifetime. To adequately assess this claim, it is necessary to present the systematic character of Anderson’s philosophy as formulated during his first decade at Sydney University. It is during this period that Anderson’s ‘systematic Realism’ is most in evidence. The systematic nature of this philosophy can then be contrasted with the more episodic writings of the last twenty years of his life to assess whether any pronounced changes occurred in his understanding of philosophy.
The most distinctive feature of John Anderson’s philosophy is that it was a systematic philosophy in a century dominated by the analytic methodology in Anglo-Saxon philosophy. System building of the sort Anderson engaged upon was frowned upon by analytic philosophers, whether of the conceptual or linguistic variety. In contrast, continental philosophers at this time were much more at ease with systematic philosophy, although the phenomenological and existential orientation of that philosophy did not fit easily with Anderson’s scientific conception of philosophy. As early as 1922, Anderson was describing his systematic philosophy as a unified theory of the ‘sciences’ of logic, ethics, and aesthetics and this characterization of his philosophy is one that he maintained into the 1930s. For Anderson, to assert that logic, ethics, or aesthetics were sciences was to assert that they were definite subjects that could be studied and that their method of study was as objective as any other science.
The most common term that has been used to characterize Anderson’s philosophy is that of Realism, hence the common title ‘Andersonian Realism’. During the twentieth century, Realism was primarily understood as an epistemological term that refers to the ‘real’ or ‘objective’ existence of the object of knowledge. However for Anderson, Realism was not merely an epistemological doctrine, but, based on the theory of external relations developed by the American New Realists, was a systematic enterprise – a ‘systematic Realism’ – that treated the subjects of logic, ethics, and aesthetics in a Realist manner. It should be noted that Anderson’s understanding of the term ‘logic’ was not restricted to its contemporary usage of formal logic but was more of the traditional sense of metaphysics as including epistemology, ontology, and formal logic as distinct disciplines within that subject.
In an early article, “Realism and Some of its Critics’, Anderson outlined the logic he believed that his general metaphysical system followed. He argued that Realism appears firstly as an epistemology based on the doctrine of external relations. Secondly, it appears as an ontology, which he described as Empiricist, but is more properly described as a theory of situations or spatio-temporal existence. Finally it appears as a logic which he described as Positivist, meaning by that term, not the Logical Positivism common during the 1930s, but the more general view that logic is a positive and not a relativistic subject.
Twentieth century Realism as first articulated by Moore, Russell, and others referred to either an epistemology of direct or indirect (representational) knowledge. For Anderson, such a distinction was false: Realism could only be an epistemology of the direct knowledge of the object. Anderson’s Realist epistemology was the view that in any relationship of knowledge, there are three distinct parts: a subject of knowledge or ‘knower’ (the –er); an object of knowledge or ‘known’ (the –ed); and the relation of knowing itself, the knowing (the –ing). On a Realist analysis, such a relationship had the logical form ‘S/r/O’; further, each part of the relationship – the S, r, O, or -er, -ing, -ed – was distinct from the other and could not be reduced to any other part. On this account, the relation of knowing between the subject and the object must be immediate and direct. Further, following the American New Realists, Anderson argued that the logic underlying such an epistemology was the doctrine of external relations, viz. in any relationship a/R/b, the terms of the relationship ‘a’ and ‘b’ exist independently of each other and of the relation ‘R’ between them. On Anderson’s view, to attempt to identify the relations a thing has with the things themselves is to commit the error of relativism. On this view, any attempt to identify or reduce the relation of knowing to the subject, or the object, is to render knowledge of either impossible as it fails to maintain the distinctness of the various parts of the relationship of knowledge. A further implication of this view for Anderson is that the qualities of either the subject or object cannot be constituted by the relations that it has. There is, then, an absolute distinction between qualities and relations. Again, to attempt to identify or reduce the qualities that a thing has with the relations that the qualities have is to commit the error of relativism. This criticism of relativism is the most common technique used in the exposition Anderson’s systematic Realist philosophy.
This conclusion – that an object, or its qualities, cannot be constituted by the relations that it has – had several interesting implications for Anderson’s philosophy of mind. Firstly, in terms of his epistemological theory, it implied that ‘consciousness’ – understood as both a quality of mind and a relation that mind has – cannot exist. There is, in brief, no such thing as ‘consciousness’. Further, since being conscious is a relation, then what is conscious must be some other quality of mind and since volition or will is also a relation, then it cannot be the required quality of mind. For Anderson, the only possible quality of mind that could be aware or conscious of the things around it, had to be emotion, feeling, or affect. It is emotions which know and it is emotions which act. This is Anderson’s theory of ‘mind as feeling’. This view appears to square with at least two important facts we know about the mind from Freudian psychoanalytic theory: firstly, that the mind, while unconscious, that is, asleep, can be active, for example, dreaming; secondly, that while the mind is conscious, there can be conflicting emotions operating at the same time and this can account for such mental features as slips of the tongue – one emotion is conscious in wanting to say something, but another emotion actually says what it needs to. While such a theory appears to be quite suggestive as a Realist theory of mind, it is unfortunate that Anderson never developed a detailed theory of which emotions constitute mind and how they operate.
Anderson, following Alexander, described his ontological theory of existence as Empiricism, although, quite clearly, this is not the position of the British Empiricists, a theory he regarded as idealistic. His own understanding of Empiricism was a theory of situations or occurrences, where a situation is an occurrence in Space-Time and, as such, is characterized by various categories of existence. Anderson argued that there are three important associated doctrines associated with Empiricism: pluralism, determinism, and objectivism.
Anderson’s pluralism is the view that any thing is both a particular and a universal. That is, any thing is a universal that is composed of various things which together constitute it, and is a particular and therefore part of a thing greater than itself. In other words, there are no absolute or pure universals and no absolute or pure particulars. This is the foundation of Anderson’s theory of infinite complexity whereby there is no indivisible ‘atom’ from which all things are made, and no unrelatable totality – no ‘universe’ – which has nothing outside of it. Hence Anderson distinguished his position from the theories of monism and atomism understood as theories of logical totalities and logical simples.
Anderson’s determinism is the view that every thing or occurrence is caused. Since every thing is an occurrence in Space-Time, then every thing will have causal relations acting on it, and causal relations from it acting on other things. Hence Anderson opposed any theory of indeterminism and rejected the notion of a ‘free will’ as something outside the universe of spatiotemporal causality. Anderson’s objectivism is the view that any subject must also be an object. That is, he rejected the doctrine of subjectivism viz. that there things that are ‘irreducibly’ subjective. In terms of mind, the alleged ‘subjectivity’ of the mind is as objective as any other thing, that is, the mind as a subject, as a knower, is an existing thing with all the categorical features that other things possess.
Anderson’s logical position is one he described as Positivism, although this is not to be confused with Logical Positivism, as Anderson believed that experimentation was an inadequate test for the truth or falsity of propositions. He believed, for example, that love is not something that can be studied experimentally. Anderson’s Positivism was simply a theory of the positive truth and falsity of propositions and therefore opposed to any theory which postulates that the context of a proposition or judgment determines its truth or falsity. Hence he rejected the Absolute Idealist view that it is the ‘Absolute’ which determines the truth of a judgment as well as the relativist position expressed by F.C.S. Schiller that it is the particular context of judging that determines the truth of a judgment. Judgements, or in Anderson’s terms, propositions, are true or false independently of any context at all. Their truth or falsity is determined simply in terms of things themselves. This theory of absolute truth or falsity implied the denial on any theory such as the Hegelian dialectic where logic ‘develops’ through the resolution of a logical contradiction into a ‘higher truth’.
Anderson accepted the traditional Aristotelian analysis of the proposition viz. that it is comprised of a subject, a predicate, a copula, and the quantifiers. The most general form of the proposition is ‘S is P’ where S is the subject function and P is the predicate function, while the copula ‘is’ incorporates both the positive and negative formulations, ‘is’ and ‘is not’. When the universal and particular quantifiers, ‘All’ and ‘Some’, are introduced, this yields the classical four forms of the proposition: All S are P (SaP), Some S are P (SiP), All S are not P (SeP), and Some S are not P (SoP).
However what distinguished Anderson’s treatment of the proposition from the traditional Aristotelian analysis was his insistence that the terms of the proposition must only refer to existing things and that the function of the copula was to indicate whether something was or was not the case, or, as he expressed it, was ‘an issue’. Hence he refused to admit fictional entities as terms in his logic and rejected non-existential uses of the copula such as the copula of identity and the copula of predication. So, any proposition must have a real or existing thing as a term in the subject function, a real or existing thing as a term in the predicate function, and the copula ‘is or is not’ either attributing the occurrence of the predicate to the subject, or not, as the case may be. In other words, a proposition expresses the occurrence of a predicate attributed to a subject in a particular situation located in Space-Time.
Another term used to describe Anderson’s Positivism was ‘Propositional Realism’. This expression is most typically used to describe the view that reality is propositional in nature. This is Anderson’s controversial identity theory of the proposition. Briefly stated, this is the view that any occurrence or situation is identical any proposition asserted about it. Anderson had rejected the view that the ‘proposition’ could be a tertium quid, (a representational view that a proposition is something which mediates our description about an actual occurrence), which committed him to the view that there must be, in some sense, an identity between propositions and situations. The difficulty with this view was that while it seems quite natural and correct to assert that true propositions are identical with existing situations, this clearly cannot be the case with false propositions. What situation, it can be asked, is identical with a false proposition? Are we meant to believe that a false proposition is identical with a non-existing situation? Anderson’s own solution to this problem was to assert that the mind ‘mis-takes’ a non-existing situation, for example, the sky being green today, with an actual existing situation viz. that the sky is blue. The plausibility of this reply focuses attention back on the initial criticism. If it is asserted that all situations are identical with proposition, then it is irrelevant to ask for the ontological status of false propositions. Ex hypothesi, they are identical with a situation. On the other hand, if we simply assert that it is only true propositions which are identical with existing situations, then there is no problem with the status of false propositions at all. As Anderson would say, the mind simply ‘mis-takes’ a non-existing situation for an existing one.
In his Realist ethical theory, Anderson drew a sharp distinction between ethics and morality. Morality is a system of imperatives and obligations which can only be understood relationally. If we assert that ‘X ought or should be done’, then there must always be a subject who is asserting that obligation. The function of moral science on this account is not to establish the absolute or categorical nature of the imperative, but to establish who is asserting such an imperative. In contrast, Anderson conceived of ethics as a science of goodness and badness. In this theory, good and bad are naturally occurring qualities of social and psychological activities. Hence he rejected the relativist view that relations somehow determine the quality of good. It is one of the more unusual features of Anderson’s ethical theory that there is no recommendation or discouragement implicit in the description of an activity as good or bad: we are simply describing an activity in an ordinary scientific sense.
As to the exact nature of the goods and bads themselves, Anderson argued that if we look at the history of ethical and moral philosophy then certain qualities which are consistently described as good, virtuous, or obligatory gives an indication as to the nature of the goods themselves. In his classification of goods and bads, Anderson was much influenced by Sorel’s theory of the producer ethic and the consumer ethic. The producer ethic is one which consumes in order to produce, while the consumer ethic is one which produces in order to consume. This implies that the producer ethic is essentially creative, inquiring, and productive (qualities that are exhibited in Sorel’s classification of social culture of Art, Science, and Industry), while the consumer ethic is imitative, obscurantist, and consumptive. Anderson later included love as the good, and hate as the bad, within the domestic sphere.
Anderson also utilized Socrates’ view that goods support one another but oppose bads, while bads oppose both goods and other bads to assist in his classification process. In other words, goods are essentially supportive, while bads are essentially oppositional. On this basis, Anderson argued that goods are co-operative and communicative, while bads are competitive and uncommunicative. That is, goods, in their relations of support, will seek to work with and communicate with other goods, while bads, in their relations of opposing, will fight against and not communicate with, both bads and goods. Anderson also listed other goods in his ethical theory including a care for exactitude and a rejection of the notion of a reward for doing something, but he never developed a full classification of the various goods and bads. This is one of the major criticisms of his ethical theory. It is one thing to assert that certain qualities are good and bad and that they operate in certain ways; it is quite another thing to actually show that this is a correct and true classification. Anderson never fulfilled this latter task.
Anderson’s social and political theory during the 1930s has been described as a proletarian theory and by this term it is meant that it was of a general Marxist, and a specifically Communist, orientation. [Weblin 2003] Anderson’s Marxism was unique in that while he adhered to an overall materialist outlook such as the class structure of society and the distinction between economic base and social superstructure, he rejected Marx’s historical theory of dialectic. Hence while he agreed that during capitalism the proletariat and the bourgeoisie are engaged in class warfare, he did not think that the proletariat would succeed simply because it was part of a dialectical progression of history. Anderson’s analysis of this social conflict was also more pluralistic than Marx’s as he believed that the proletariat needed to work with artists and intellectuals to achieve social and political revolution. In this respect, the bourgeois origins of certain artists and intellectuals, such as Anderson himself, was irrelevant to the ongoing social conflict.
Apart from the broad proletarian orientation of Anderson’s social and political theory during the 1930s, there were two quite distinct moments in his active political engagement. From 1927 to 1932 Anderson was actively involved in the Communist Party of Australia. At this time, he believed Russian Communism was the pre-eminent model for Communist parties everywhere, although he supported the independent operation of local parties. Initially unaware on the pernicious influence of Stalin in Moscow, Anderson came to see that the Russian party was beset by bureaucracy, censorship, and ideology and his independent stance increasingly bought him into conflict with local members who were more prone to following the Moscow line. Anderson’s writings in defense of Communism during this period generally reflect his belief in determinism, pluralism, and objectivism in social and political activity.
In 1933, he helped form the Trotskyist Workers Party of Australia and remained actively involved for the next four years. His break with Communism in 1933 was occasioned more by his recognition of the corrupt nature of Stalinism, rather than any belief that Communism was inconsistent with his philosophic doctrines. Hence during this period, he retained the belief that Communist theory, untainted by Stalinist practice, was deterministic, pluralistic, and objective, and accepted that Trotskyism provided a viable theoretical and practical alternative to Stalinism. However by the time of his departure on sabbatical in December 1937, he had come to reject Trotskyism as a viable alternative to Stalinism and was questioning whether Marxism was in fact consistent with his Realist philosophy.
In his Realist aesthetic theory, Anderson often criticized aesthetic theories on the basis of either their relativism or their subjectivism. [Anderson 1982] Hence, in criticism of Subjectivism in aesthetics, he argued that if beauty is simply a question of what the subject believes or prefers, then there is nothing that is beautiful in itself. Such a claim is quite simply a denial of the very possibility of aesthetic theory. In contrast, in his criticism of relativist aesthetic theories such as Romanticism or Marxism, he argued that if beauty resides merely in the political context of the aesthetic judgment or the active willing of the aesthetic judgment, then again there can be no objective aesthetic theory. From these arguments, it could be reasonably assumed that Anderson believed that beauty, like goodness, was a quality of natural objects. However Anderson never explicitly stated this view, although he did once assert that beauty is a ‘character’ of natural objects.
Apart from these more formal features of Anderson’s aesthetic theory, there is some indication that he was also developing a more substantive theory of aesthetic damnation and redemption. Several times during the 1930s he quoted Joyce’s expression that ‘history is a nightmare from which I am trying to awake’, and that this subjection of man to history is the state of alienation of the self. Release from this servitude, Anderson suggested, is the affirmation of the human spirit through artistic creation and aesthetic criticism. However, he did not develop these views in detail.
After Anderson’s return from sabbatical in 1938, there was a marked reduction in his academic output with only 25% of his entire academic corpus being written over the next twenty three years. While there was a marked change in his political views, the changes in his philosophical views are less detectable. In his writings on ethics, aesthetics, and history, it was not immediately apparent that he was departing from systematic Realism.
During the war years, whilst Anderson’s ethical writings still stressed the qualitative nature of goodness, there was also an apparent change in emphasis on the concepts of liberty and servility as ethical relations within society. While he rejected an apparent inconsistency in his view that goodness is something which can be pursued, he still emphasized that goodness is a character or quality of specific social activities and cannot be identified with ‘that which is obliged or commanded’. He was also forced to clarify whether such qualities were psychological – for example, creativity and inquiry – or social – for example, co-operation and communication. His belief that goods, such as inquiry, might occur at the intersection of the psychological and social fields, led to speculation that goods might occupy a unique place of ‘psycho-social’ activity. [Eddy 1942] Anderson now stated that goods only occur in ‘causes’ or social movements which themselves strive after freedom. Accordingly, individuals who participate in social movements can be transformed by these movements to such an extent that they ‘transcend’ their self-imposed limitations and become free and creative in the process.
Apart from developing the formal features of his own theory, Anderson criticized both Christianity and Socialism for fostering an ethic of philanthropy. He argued that philanthropy seeks to provide relief to the underprivileged, but that such protection actually weakens the operation of those actual and independent social movements which can provide escape from the servitude of bourgeois society. He argued that such servility is not something that one can be ‘saved from’, as it is only by what men are and not by what they are given that they can win release from servitude. He also criticized Mill’s theory of ethical hedonism, arguing that while pleasure is a quality of natural things and hence could in principle define the nature of goodness, in fact it is too narrow a conception to provide such a definition.
This emphasis on liberty and servility became a more prominent feature of Anderson’s ethical writing and he argued that goods only exist in their struggle with evils. Accordingly, any attempt to abolish evil must also result in the abolition of good. In particular, he asserted that liberty only exists in its struggle with servility, and that the attempt to establish a State where insecurity and insufficiency are abolished is a servile goal and can never succeed.
After his return from sabbatical, Anderson gradually developed a distinctive theory of liberal democracy. Consistent with his view that liberty only exists in relation to servility, he argued that liberty was not to be found enshrined in the rights, rules, and procedures of the State, but was exemplified in independent opposition to the State. Hence, at the time of the formulation of the Atlantic Charter with its statement of the ‘four freedoms’, he argued there are no rights that can guarantee freedom. A ‘right’, in this view, is only the expression of a certain social ‘might’.
Similarly, Anderson believed that democracy was not a ‘thing’ that is instituted in a polity, for example, representative democracy, but was the balance of diverse social interests, one of which was the State itself. Even though a polity may be nominally called a representative democracy, if the social and political organizations within that polity do not oppose incorporation into the State structure, it cannot truly be a democracy.
After the end of the war, Anderson’s writings on political theory were infrequent, although in the writing that does exist, two themes are dominant. Firstly, he opposed Communism at every opportunity. However, this opposition did not extend to supporting the banning of the Communist Party of Australia and in the 1950 referendum on this issue, he publicly and forcefully argued for the No case. Further, his opposition to the theoretical underpinnings of Communism led him to assert that egalitarianism was ‘the disease of the modern time’. Secondly, Anderson also defended the general features of a conservative theory of society. In particular, he defended the notion that social and cultural traditions have their own ‘rights’ and modes of operation with which the State must not interfere. This was especially the case with universities and academic traditions. It should be stressed that the distinction between Anderson’s democratic and conservative period is not clear cut, although in general terms he referred to his political thinking during this period as ‘anti-proletarian’. [Stavropolous 1992]
After his return from sabbatical, the only writings of Anderson’s that deal expressly with aesthetic theory are his 1942 lectures on ethics and aesthetics. These lectures are a detailed discussion of the concept of beauty understood as either a theme in temporal arts such as music or drama, or as structure in spatial arts such as painting and sculpture. However, while Anderson was undecided on whether theme or structure was the best general description of beauty, he made the remarkable assertion that beauty cannot be a quality. Anderson’s equivocation over describing beauty as a quality during the 1930s has already been noted, but the implications of expressly denying that beauty is a quality cannot be underestimated. He must either assert that beauty is a relation and therefore deny the very possibility of any objective aesthetic theory or he must admit the inconsistency in his position and argue that aesthetics does not form part of his systematic Realist philosophy. In his more substantive aesthetic theory, he argued that man’s estrangement from society is caused by the loss of love between self and others, and that this estrangement can only be overcome by the activity of love. He further argued that the ‘eternal affirmation of the spirit of man in literature’ can be achieved in science as well as art, the difference being in terms of their style of presentation.
Even though Anderson published very little after 1943, in his lectures he presented details of his ontology which were unknown previously. In his 1944 and 1949 lectures on Alexander’s Space, Time and Deity, Anderson presented his criticism of Alexander’s philosophy of emergent evolutionism. [Anderson 2005, 2007i. The 2005 lectures are in Anderson’s own hand and therefore are more accurate] For Alexander, Space and Time are the point and moment from which the universe begins and from which all things and qualities emerge, culminating, ultimately, in the emergence of Deity. [See entry in IEP on Samuel Alexander] In some places of Space, Time and Deity, Alexander held that Space and Time are created (and hence Super-Substantialist), although in other places he simply refers to Space and Time as the logical conditions of existence. It is this latter understanding of Space and Time that Anderson developed in his own lectures on Alexander.
Like Alexander, Anderson rejected both Idealist and physicalist accounts of the nature of Space and Time. He rejected the Idealist claim that Space-Time is simply an aspect of the Absolute and also rejected the physicalist or substantialist theory whereby Space-Time is itself a thing which comes into existence. Anderson argued that if we examine our own experience of Space and Time, we discover that our experience of Space is characterized by one, two, and three dimensionality such that we experience the spatiality of all things in terms of their length, breadth, and height. He similarly argued that our experience of Time is characterized by successiveness, transitiveness, and irreversibility. That is, our experience of Time is characterized by the experience of successive times, that one time follows another, that such times are transitive, that if B follows A, and C follows B, then C must follow A, and that time is irreversible, that we never experience time ‘going backwards’. He argued further that while we can abstractly separate Space and Time to consider their individual characteristics, we must always experience them as unified in Space-Time: there can be no experience of Space which is not also an experience of Time and there can be no experience of Time which is not also an experience of Space. Further, there are no limits to Space-Time insofar as both Space and Time are infinite. Space, in its extension, and Time, in its duration, has no finite beginning or end. So for Anderson, to say ‘a thing exists’ is to say it is an occurrence in Space-Time. He also called an occurrence in Space-Time, a ‘situation’.
For Anderson, a thing, in existing in Space-Time, has certain categorical features. He followed Alexander’s treatment of the categories, albeit in a slightly modified form, and argued there were a total of thirteen categories: Identity, Diversity, Existence, Relation, Universality, Particularity, Number, Order, Quantity, Intensity, Substance, Causality, and Individuality. However, we immediately strike a difficulty in Anderson’s treatment of these categories because, while in the text of his lectures he treats the above thirteen categories separately, when he came to classify them he treated two of them – Universality and Quantity – as having dual senses, and therefore expanded the number of categories to fifteen. Hence in one grouping of the categories he distinguishes between logical or propositional categories, mathematical or quantitative categories, and physical or qualitative categories in the following manner:
Logical: Identity; Diversity; Existence; Relation; Universality (Logical)
Mathematical: Universality (Mathematical); Particularity; Number; Order; Quantity (Mathematical)
Physical: Quantity (Physical); Intensity; Substance; Causality; Individuality (Physical Identity)
Quite clearly, this grouping can only be achieved by treating the categories on Universality and Quantity in the dual manner outlined above. Further, as if this classification was not confusing enough already, he also argued that the final category, Individuality, could be regarded as Physical Identity and thus contrasted with the first category, Identity, which he now described as Abstract Identity. This would imply that Individuality is simply one aspect of Identity and thus would reduce the original thirteen categories down to twelve. The exact number of categories is determined only by the method by which you approach them: thirteen as they appear in the text; fifteen if you treat them as three groups of five; or twelve if you treat Individuality as simply an aspect of Identity.
Regarding the specifics of the categories, Anderson argued Alexander failed to present a principle by which the categories could be ordered and he argued that such a principle could be found in the ‘proposition’. He argued that in the logical or propositional categories, the first category, Identity, is treated as mere abstract identity and is indicated by the subject term of the proposition. In contrast, Diversity is everything that is not Identity and is indicated by the rest of the proposition. The contrast and distinction between Identity and Diversity gives us the category of Existence which is indicated by the copula in the proposition. However to assert one specific existence implies that we must have another distinct existence and hence we develop the category of Relation, of various existences related in Space and Time to each other, and these are indicated by the predicate of the proposition. Finally, in having various existences commonly related, we have the category of Universality in its logical sense as a theory of types.
In the transition to the quantitative or mathematical categories, Universality is now treated in its quantitative sense as the universal quantifier to the proposition, ‘All’. In contrast to the universal quantifier, we have the particular quantifier of the proposition, ‘Some’, and this gives us the category of Particularity. While Anderson often asserted that the universal and particular quantifiers were all that was needed to provide the four logical forms of the proposition, his next category, Number, indicates that Universality and Particularity are simply numerical in that they refer to objects that can be counted within a specific field or situation. Further, the next category, Order, indicates that not only can objects be counted, but that they can also be ordered within a given series as they occur in a given field or situation. The final mathematical category is Quantity and this refers to the fact that any number that occurs along a spatial or temporal continuum is real and hence either rational or irrational.
In the transition to the physical categories, Quantity is now treated in its physical sense as the filling of the spaces and times that mathematical Quantity indicated as only an abstraction. In this sense, physical quantity can be described as ‘matter’, although the better general description is ‘solidity’. On this account, solidity is the ‘space-filling’ that occurs when something is located in Space-Time. The next category, Intensity, is probably the most difficult of all of Anderson’s categories to understand. On the one hand, Intensity refers to the qualities that a thing possesses and if this was all that was meant it would be an unproblematic category. However, Anderson also intended Intensity to refer to any comparative of an object (such as its size) and it is clear that the one category cannot refer to both comparative differences between objects and their actual qualities. The next category is Substance and this refers to the structure of a thing or the internal balance or harmony of the tensions that occur within a thing. As a concrete example of Substance, Anderson argues that the substance or structure of water is H20. While this idea is clear enough, the relation of Substance to Intensity remains unclear. The category of Substance leads on to the category of Causation which is not a mere succession of situations, but involves the replacing of one situation with another. The final category is that of Individuality, which is the combination of the quality and quantity of a thing to give us the concrete identity of a thing. As concrete Identity, Individuality can be contrasted with the abstract Identity with which we began.
Some of the key criticisms of Anderson’s theory of the categories have already been noted, although there is one further criticism that goes to the heart of his metaphysical system. For Anderson, any meaningful proposition must have terms that are referential – that is, they refer to actual objects, qualities, and situations. However Anderson insisted on several occasions that the categories cannot be understood as mere things, as they are, by definition, those universal or categorical features which all things possess. The difficulty for Anderson is that since his criteria for intelligible and meaningful discourse is limited to ‘propositions’ which have terms that refer to things, since the categories can never be such terms, then we can never have meaningful or intelligible discourse of the categories. This criticism is often described as ‘the unspeakability of the categories’.
While Anderson’s lectures on Alexander were an important contribution to the development and presentation of an ontology he described as Empiricism, it is important to note that at the very time that these lectures were being given, he appeared to be revising his assessment of the relationship between Realism and Idealism. During the 1930s, Anderson treated Realism and Idealism as logical opposites: one could not be asserted without denying the other and the assertion of Idealism led to certain irresolvable difficulties. It is surprising then that in 1949 in personal correspondence with his colleague Ruth Walker, he stated that his major intellectual problem since childhood appears to have been his ‘idealism’; his inability to accept multiplicity as a feature of the world rather than as something to be overcome or transcended. [Weblin 2005i] Even more significantly, he went on to say that only Walker would appreciate his idealism and see it as a ‘stimulating influence’ and ‘not as mere waste’. Unfortunately, Anderson didn’t go on to elaborate exactly how this ‘idealism’ manifested itself in his philosophy and so we have to simply accept his view that he regarded his philosophy, or at least significant parts of it, as ‘Idealist’. It is also noteworthy that in 1950 he wrote to Walker that he appears to be going ‘more and more Hegelian’ and in 1952 he spoke of his ‘revived Hegelianism’. Again, in neither case did he elaborate on the meaning of these statements and so we must accept his prima facie claim that he now thought of his philosophy in Hegelian terms.
Anderson did not reconsider his views on his systematic Realism until an address on the occasion of his retirement from Sydney University in 1958. [Anderson 1958] Much of this article was a standard defense of his conception of Realism. He argued that Realism denies the privileged position that Idealism had reserved for mind as qualifying all of reality and that there was no special difficulty in showing that there was nothing mental about the logic of relations. He emphasized that the most important advance made by Realism was the movement from the vague notion of ‘the real’ to the spatio-temporality of things as part of a general objective theory of reality. However, in an apparent qualification of his earlier views, he also argued that a common error made by Realists is to mistake the object of Realist attack as Idealism, whereas the real object of criticism is Rationalism and its dualist doctrine of ‘essences’. He also praised Hegel’s doctrine of Objective Mind as an important step towards a general objectivist position. So despite his criticism of the Idealist claim the relations are mental, he thought that Idealists such as Hegel had made important contributions towards Realism and qualified his earlier claim that Idealism is the true object of Realist criticism. When these admissions are coupled with his earlier self-description as an ‘Idealist’ promoting a ‘revived Hegelianism’, it is questionable that he believed Realism was the best overall description for his systematic conception of philosophy.
During the 1950s Anderson’s main academic interest was the question of history. While he had shown a general interest in questions of history since the 1930s, and during the 1940s had dealt especially with Croce’s writings on history. From 1950 onwards he wrote several academic articles dealing specifically with the subject of history. [Anderson 1954, 1959, 1960] The most noteworthy feature of these writings was their consistency with Anderson’s empiricist ontology. Firstly, Anderson insisted that history operates according to deterministic causal laws. There is no place for ‘free will’ within his theory of history. Secondly, Anderson’s theory of history was objectivist and materialist. That is, there is no place for any peculiar subjective or non-material entities. In this respect, even though Anderson was at this time rejecting Communism and egalitarianism as mere political ideologies, he was defending Marx’s historical materialism as an accurate theoretical account of historical forces. However he did not, as previously noted, adhere to a dialectical materialism. Dialectic, as a historical force, is inconsistent with strict determinism. Further, Anderson’s theory of history was a pluralist theory in that it recognized the complex interplay between psychological and social forces in history. One final feature of Anderson’s theory of history which coalesces with his Empiricist ontology is his emphasis on liberty as a dominant force in the working of historical processes. While this at first appears inconsistent with his denial of free will, Anderson understood liberty to be an objective and determined social force. It is only through the causally determined operation of social movements that liberty can be expressed.
In the last decade of his life, Anderson wrote little on his systematic conception of philosophy. However the last article he wrote was titled ‘Empiricism and Logic’ and this use of the term ‘Empiricism’, and the fact that his collection of articles was titled Studies in Empirical Philosophy, gives us a clear indication that Anderson believed that Empiricism was the best name for his overall conception of philosophy. In this article he argued that Empiricism is the doctrine of the continuity of all things; that is, that any thing, in existing, is continuous with all other things by existing in Space-Time and sharing common categories such as Substance, Causality, and Identity. Since these categories are universal features of any existing thing, they cannot themselves be things and can only be understood as formal features of things. Further, these common categorical forms can only be known and expressed in terms of propositional functions such as subject, predicate, and copula and the propositional form ‘S is P’. It is significant that Anderson also argued that the common measure of terrestrial events cannot itself be a thing, for such a common measure could only be something formal, that is, non-terrestrial. The ‘idealism’ in Anderson’s Empirical philosophy is clearly evident in this view that the logical or formal nature of categories and propositions could not be understood in terms of things subject to ordinary empirical experience.
For a philosopher who had a significant, albeit indirect, influence on twentieth century Anglo-Saxon philosophy, there is a very little contemporary research into Anderson’s philosophy and a remarkably poor understanding of what that philosophy actually is. The explanation of this lies partly in the character of the man himself. His philosophic style was confined to writing condensed articles for a journal that, at that time, was remote from the main centers of philosophical activity. He never published a philosophic book during his lifetime and therefore never exposed himself to criticism beyond the confines of the Australian philosophical community. He also appears to have been reluctant to publish articles on philosophy during the last fifteen years of his life. Only a small percentage of his total published output was written during that period. However, the most serious criticism that can be directed at him is that he never bothered to develop the positions that he advanced. Whether it was his mature political position, his philosophy of mind, his ethical theory, or his aesthetic theory, Anderson sketched out a position but never provided the details or framework of how that position might be developed further. Be that as it may, the scope and logical rigor of Anderson’s philosophy provides a uniquely systematic alternative to the strictures of twentieth century analytic philosophy.
Nonetheless, the exact nature and name of this systematic philosophy is matter of some debate. The most commonly known title of Realism was most widely used during the 1930s, but after that time Anderson made statements and advanced positions that clearly qualified his acceptance of the suitability of that term as a relevant description of his philosophy. In contrast, after the end of the 1930s Anderson used and discussed the term Empiricism far more widely. Indeed his lectures on Alexander during the 1940s are detailed examinations of the substance of Empiricism itself. It may be thought that such a change is merely a change of a name, although the change from the Realist doctrine of external relations and the consequent distinction between qualities and relations to a theory of spatiotemporality, propositionality, and the categories of existence is clearly more than simply a nominal one.
- Anderson, John (1954) ‘Politics and Morals,’ Australasian Journal of Philosophy 32: 213-22.
- Anderson, John (1958) ‘Realism’ The Australian Highway (Journal of the Workers Educational Association, Australia): Sept. pp 53 -56.
- Anderson, John (1959)‘The Illusion of the Epoch’ Australasian Journal of Philosophy 37: 156-67.
- Anderson, John (1960) ‘Time and Idea’ Australasian Journal of Philosophy 38: 163-72.
- Anderson, John (1962) Studies in Empirical Philosophy. Angus and Robertson: Sydney.
- [Collection of Anderson’s metaphysical and ethical articles published posthumously. Includes 15pp Introduction by J.A. Passmore.]
- Anderson, John (1980) Education and Inquiry. Edited by Phillips, D. Z. Basil Blackwell: Oxford.
- [Collection of Anderson’s educational articles]
- Anderson, John (1982) Art and Reality. Edited by Cullum, Graham and Lycos, Kimon. Hale and Ironmonger: Sydney.
- [Collection of Anderson’s aesthetic and literary criticism articles. Includes 17pp Introduction by G. Cullum and K. Lycos.]
- Anderson, John (2003) A Perilous and Fighting Life. Edited by Weblin, Mark. Pluto Press: Sydney
- [Collection of Anderson’s political articles. Includes 12pp Introduction and 10pp Postscript by M. Weblin.]
- Anderson, John (2005) Space-Time and the Proposition. Edited by Weblin, Mark. Sydney University Press: Sydney
- [Anderson’s 1944 lectures on Alexander’s Space, Time and Deity. Original notes in own hand. Includes 18pp Introduction by M. Weblin.]
- Anderson, John (2007i) Space, Time and the Categories. Edited by Cole, Creagh. Sydney University Press: Sydney
- [Anderson’s 1944 lectures on Alexander’s Space, Time and Deity. Student notes only. Includes 5pp Introduction by D.M. Armstrong.]
- Anderson, John (2007ii) Lectures in Political Theory. Edited by Cole, Creagh. Sydney University Press: Sydney
- [Anderson’s 1941 lectures on T.H. Green’s Principles of Political Obligation, 1942 lectures on Political Theory (discussing Bosanquet and Lenin), and 1945 lectures on Socialism. Original notes in own hand. Includes 18pp Introduction by C. Cole.]
- Anderson, John (2008i) Lectures in Greek Philosophy. Edited by Cole, Creagh. Sydney University Press: Sydney
- [Anderson’s 1928 lectures on Greek Philosophy. Original notes in own hand. Includes 11pp Introduction by G. Cullum]
- Anderson, John (2008ii) Lectures in Modern Philosophy: Hume, Reid, James. Edited by Cole, Creagh. Sydney University Press: Sydney
- [Anderson’s 1932 lectures on Hume and 1935 lectures on Reid and James. Original notes in own hand. Includes 18pp Introduction by C. Cole.]
- The John Anderson Archive, the online archive of Anderson’s lectures and articles at the University of Sydney Library (compiled 2006–2010).
- Armstrong, David M., (1977) “On Metaphysics”, Quadrant, 21 (7): 64–69.
- [Outline of Anderson’s metaphysical position.]
- Armstrong, David M., (2001) “Interview” Matters of the Mind: Poems, Essays and Interviews in Honour of Leonie Kramer, Edited by Lee Jobling and Catherine Runcie. Sydney: University of Sydney Press: pp. 322-332.
- [Discusses importance of Anderson on Armstrong’s intellectual development.]
- Baker, A.J. (1979) Anderson’s Social Philosophy. Angus and Robertson: Sydney.
- [Outline of Anderson’s political theories and development.]
- Baker, A.J. (1986) Australian Realism. Cambridge University Press: Cambridge.
- [Critical discussion of Anderson’s systematic Realism]
- Birchall, B. (1983) “The Problem of Form” International Studies in Philosophy 15: 15-40.
- [Critical discussion of Anderson’s theory of form.]
- Cole, Creagh McLean, (2009) “John Anderson’s Political Thought Revisited”, Australian Journal of Political Science, 44(2): 229–44.
- [Critical discussion of Anderson’s political theory.]
- Cole, Creagh McLean, (2010) “The Ethic of the Producers: Sorel, Anderson and Macintyre”, History of Political Thought, 31(1): 155–76.
- [Critical discussion of Anderson’s ethical theory.]
- Cole, Creagh McLean, (2012) ‘John Anderson’ Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
- [Detailed discussion of Anderson’s philosophy.]
- Eddy, Harry (1944) “Ethics and Politics” Australasian Journal of Psychology and Philosophy 22: 70-92.
- [Critical discussion of Anderson’s psycho-social conception of good.]
- Hibberd, Fiona, (2009) “John Anderson’s Development of (Situational) Realism and its Bearing on Psychology Today”, History of the Human Sciences, 22(4): 63–92.
- [Critical discussion of Anderson’s philosophy in relation to contemporary psychology.]
- Kennedy, Brian (1996) A Passion to Oppose. Melbourne University Press: Melbourne.
- [Biography of Anderson’s life focusing on personal, social and political themes.]
- Mackie, John L., (1951) “Logic and Professor Anderson”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 29(2): 109–113.
- [Reply to Ryle (1950).]
- Mackie, John L., (1985) “The Philosophy of John Anderson”, Logic and Knowledge: Selected Papers (Volume I), Oxford: Clarendon Press, pp. 1–20.
- [Detailed exposition of Anderson’s philosophy. Originally published in AJP following Anderson’s death.]
- Passmore, John (1969) “Russell and Bradley”. Contemporary Philosophy in Australia. Edited by R. Brown and C. Rollins. London: George Allen & Unwin, 21-30.
- [Critical exposition of Anderson’s pluralism.]
- Passmore, John (1997) Memoirs of a Semi-detached Australian. Melbourne: Melbourne University Press.
- [Extensive discussion of Anderson’s influence on Passmore’s philosophical development.]
- Ryle, Gilbert, (1950) “Logic and Professor Anderson”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 28(3): 137–53.
- [Critical analysis of Anderson’s philosophy.]
- Stavropoulos , Pam (1992) “Conservative Radical” The Australian Journal of Anthropology 3: 67-79.
- [Discussion of Anderson’s conservatism.]
- Weblin, Mark. (1995) ‘The Place of John Anderson in the History of Philosophy’ unpublished PhD thesis. University of New England, Armidale, N.S.W., Australia
- [Critical and systematic exposition of Anderson’s philosophical development.]
- Weblin, Mark (2005) ‘John Anderson’ Dictionary of Twentieth Century British Philosophers. Edited by Stuart Brown. Bloomsbury Academic: London.
- [Discussion of Anderson’s place in twentieth century British philosophy.]
- Weblin, Mark (2007) ‘John Anderson on Reid and Scottish Philosophy’ The Monist 90: 310-25.
- [Critical discussion of Anderson’s criticisms of Thomas Reid.]
- Weblin, Mark (2010) ‘John Anderson and Idealism’ Biographical Encyclopedia of British Idealism. Edited by Sweet, William. Bloomsbury Academic: London.
- [Discussion of Anderson’s ‘Idealism’.]
- Weblin, Mark (2014) “John Anderson Arrives: 1930s” History of Philosophy in Australia and New Zealand. Edited by Oppy, Graham & Trakakis, Nick. Springer: Netherlands pp 55-87.
- [Detailed discussion of Anderson’s philosophical, social, and political development.]