William Hamilton (1788—1856)


Table of Contents

Life and Writings

Scottish philosopher, born at Glasgow March 8, 1788, died at Edinburgh May 6, 1856. He studied first in Glasgow University, where his father had been professor of anatomy and botany; took a course in medicine at the University of Edinburgh in 1806-07; and in May, 1807, entered Balliol College, Oxford (B.A., 1811; M.A., 1814), where he concentrated upon classics and philosophy and gained the reputation of being the most learned Aristotelian in the university. In 1813 he settled in Edinburgh as an advocate, though he never secured a large practice. In 1820 he established his claim to the baronetcy of Preston, and was thenceforth known as Sir William. In the same year he was defeated for the chair of moral philosophy at the University of Edinburgh by John Wilson (Christopher North), but was elected to the professorship of civil history in 1821. About 1826 he took up the study of phrenology, and in 1826 and 1827 he read before the Royal Society of Edinburgh several papers antagonistic to the alleged science. He made his reputation as a philosopher by a series of articles that began to appear in the Edinburgh Review in 1829. In 1836 he was elected to the chair of logic and metaphysics in the University of Edinburgh, and held the position till his death. In 1843 he contributed to the lively ecclesiastical controversy of the time by publishing a pamphlet against the principle of non-intrusion. He was answered by William Cunningham. In July, 1844, he suffered a stroke of paralysis, which made him practically an invalid for the rest of his life.

Hamilton’s principal works are: Discussions on Philosophy and Literature, Education and University Reform (London, 1852), containing his articles published in the Edinburgh ReviewNotes and Dissertations, published with his edition of T. Reid’s Works (2 vols., Edinburgh, 1846-63); and his Lectures on Metaphysics and Logic (ed. H. L. Mansel and J. Veitch, 4 vols., 1859-60), of which an abridgment of the metaphysical portion (vols. i. and ii.) was edited by F. Bowen (Boston, 1870).

Philosophy Views

Hamilton was an exponent of the Scottish common-sense philosophy and a conspicuous defender and expounder of Thomas Reid, though under the influence of Kant he went beyond the traditions of the common-sense school, combining with a naive realism a theory of the relativity of knowledge. His psychology, while marking an advance on the work of Reid and Stewart, was of the ” faculty ” variety and has now been largely superseded by other views. His contribution to logic was the now well-known theory of the quantification of the predicate, by which he became the forerunner of the present algebraic school of logicians.

It is his law of the conditioned, with his correlative philosophy of the unconditioned, which comes into nearest relation with theology. This law is ” that all that is conceivable in thought lies between two extremes, which, as contradictory of each other, can not both be true, but of which, as mutually contradictory, one must be true. . . . The law of the mind, that the conceivable is in every relation bounded by the inconceivable, I call the law of the conditioned.” This involved his position that the Infinite is “incognizable and inconceivable.” This doctrine on its philosophic side is a protest against Kant’s skeptical result affirming that reason lands in hopeless contradictions; on its theological side it proclaims the impossibility of knowing the Absolute Being. Only by taking first the philosophic aspect can we correctly interpret its theological relations. Kant had made a priori elements only forms of the mind; and accordingly, the ideas of self, the universe, and God, became only regulative of our intellectual procedure, and in no sense guaranties of truth. Accordingly, Kant has dwelt on ” the self-contradiction of seemingly dogmatical cognitions (the cum antithesi) in none of which we can discover any decided superiority.” These were, that the world had a beginning, that it had not; that every composite substance consists of simple parts, that no composite thing does consist of simple parts; that causality according to the laws of nature is not the only causality operating to originate the world, that there is no other causality; that there is an absolutely necessary being, that there is not any such being. Hamilton’s object was to maintain that such contradictions are not the product of reason, but of an attempt to press reason beyond its proper limits. If, then, we allow that the conceivable is only of the relative and bounded, we recognize at once that the so-called antinomies of reason are the result of attempts to push reason beyond its own province, to make our conceptions the measure of existence, attempting to bring the incomprehensible within the limits of comprehension.

Thus far a real service was rendered by Hamilton in criticizing the skeptical side of Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason. He estimated this result so highly as to say of it, ” if I have done anything meritorious in philosophy, it is in the attempt to explain the phenomena of these contradictions.” At this point Hamilton ranks Reid superior to Kant; the former ending in certainty, the latter in uncertainty. But there remain for Hamilton’s philosophy the questions: If we escape contradiction by refusing to attempt to draw the inconceivable within the limits of conception, what is the source of certainty as to the infinite? How are knowledge and thought related to the existence and attributes of the Infinite Being? Here Hamilton is entangled in the perplexity of affirming certainty which is yet unknowable. That there is an Absolute Being, source of all finite existence, is, according to him, a certainty; but that we can have any knowledge of the fact is by him denied. Reid had maintained the existence of the Supreme Being as a necessary truth; and Hamilton affirms that the divine existence is at least a natural inference; but he nevertheless holds that the Deity can not be known by us. This is with him an application of the law of the conditioned-a conclusion inevitable under admission that all knowledge implies the relative, the antithesis of subject and object. This doctrine of ignorance was developed by H. L. Mansel, and eagerly embraced by the experientialists, J. S. Mill and Herbert Spencer. This gave an impulse to Agnosticism, the influence of which must be largely credited to Kant, who reduced the a priori to a form of mental procedure, and to Hamilton, who rejected Kant’s view, yet regarded the absolute as incognizable. However, while insisting that ” the infinite God can not by us, in the present limitation of our faculties, be comprehended or conceived,” Hamilton adds that “faith-belief is the organ by which we apprehend what is beyond our knowledge.”

Author Information

The author of this article is anonymous. The IEP is actively seeking an author who will write a replacement article.