Claude Adrien Helvetius (1715—1771)


French philosopher; born in Paris January, 1715; died there Dec. 26, 1771. He studied at the College Louis-le Grand, and in 1738 received the lucrative post of farmer-general, which, however, he soon exchanged for the position of chamberlain to the queen. Tiring of the idle and dissipated life of the court, he married in 1751, and retired to a small estate at Vore, in Perche, where he devoted himself chiefly to philosophical studies. He visited England in 1764, and the following year he went to Germany, where he was received with distinction by Frederick II. He was one of the Encyclopedists, and held the skeptical and materialistic views common to that school of philosophy. His principal works are: De l’esprit (Paris, 1758; Eng. transl., De l’Esprit: or, Essays on the Mind, London, 1759), which, condemned by the Sorbonne and publicly burned at Paris, was translated into most European languages, and read more than any other book of the time; and the posthumous De l’homme, de ses facultes intellectuelles et de son Mucation (2 vols., London, 1772; Eng. transl., A Treatise on Man; his Intellectual Faculties and his Education, 2 vols.).

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