James Hutchison Stirling (1820—1909)

StirlingJames Hutchison Stirling was a 19th century British Idealist philosopher. In 1865 Stirling’s The Secret of Hegel appeared and marked the inauguration of a new era in the development of English idealism. In an article in the Fortnightly Review for October 1867 (republished in the volume Jerrold, Tennyson, and Macaulay) the author passes a ruthless condemnation upon the spurious reputation for a knowledge of German idealism which had attached itself to the name of Coleridge, as well as, in a minor degree, to that of De Quincey, and fastens especially upon Coleridge’s ‘dreamy misapprehensions’ and ‘strange misrepresentations’ of the Kantian philosophy. Himself profoundly convinced of the truth of the Hegelian system, he set himself, in the Secret, to explain and defend that system. Stirling undoubtedly possessed ‘the temperament of genius,’ and was a man of remarkable speculative insight; but his style, though often striking, is so marked by the influence of Carlyle, and he so resolutely declines to conform to ordinary standards of systematic exposition, that his work is almost as difficult as the original which it is intended to illuminate. Yet its importance, and its influence at the time of its appearance, are not to be underestimated; it certainly called the attention of the English-speaking world to the significance of a system which even Ferrier had pronounced unintelligible, and brought home to the English mind the necessity of coming to terms, not only with Hegel, but with his predecessors, Kant, Fichte, and Schelling.Stirling insisted upon going back to the origins of Hegelianism in these earlier systems, and in 1881 he followed up the Secret of Hegel with the Textbook to Kant, in which the defects of the earlier work were less apparent and in which he supported a one-sided interpretation of the Kantian philosophy, as represented by the first two divisions of the Critique of Pure Reason, with great learning and with remarkable ability. His translation of Schwegler’s History of Philosophy, published in 1867, which passed through many editions and was used by many generations of students, contains a series of illuminating ‘annotations’ which rival in interest and value the substance of the History itself. A little volume of lectures on The Philosophy of Law (1873) and the Gifford lectures on Philosophy and Theology (1890) complete the list of Stirling’s more important contributions to philosophy. The standpoint is always the same — that of the Hegelian idealism, which Stirling is inclined to interpret in a theistic rather than in a pantheistic sense.

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