What Else Science Requires of Time

This article adds to the main Time article and its other supplements. The three most fundamental theories of physical science are (i) the general theory of relativity, (ii) quantum mechanics, including the standard model of particle physics, and (iii) the big bang theory of cosmology. Their amalgamation is what Nobel Prize winner Frank Wilczek called the Core Theory, the theory of everything physical. Wilczek said:

[T]he Core has such a proven record of success over an enormous range of applications that I can’t imagine people will ever want to junk it. I’ll go further: I think the Core provides a complete foundation for biology, chemistry, and stellar astrophysics that will never require modification. (Well, “never” is a long time. Let’s say for a few billion years.)

The physics community agrees with this. It means the laws of biology and so forth supervene on the laws of the Core, even though as a practical matter one rarely would or should try to explain biological laws by reducing them to true statements within the Core. The Core has been tested in many extreme circumstances and with great sensitivity. Physicists are motivated to find where it fails a test because finding a failure produces great praise from the rest of the physics community. When Wilczek says the Core will never need modification for the purposes he mentions, he would agree that for more esoteric work in the foundations of physics it will need modification if only to reconcile the inconsistencies between relativity theory and quantum theory.

The term “law” in the Core Theory refers to human-made scientific laws. There is a different conception of what a scientific law is. Many philosophers of science say the laws of the Core Theory are approximations to the physical laws of nature which are how the universe works. That is, the natural world necessarily “obeys” a set of the true laws of nature that the scientific enterprise is searching for, and the laws of nature are not at all human-made. These two conceptions of laws have received considerable attention in the literature of the philosophy of science. The second conception is integral to the manifest image.

The field of physics tries to explain the observed varieties of phenomena by appeal to universal laws. Hopefully, the laws are simple for humans, but there is no guarantee. These laws are expected to be the products of one or more theories of physics. Think of theories as special groups of laws, and think of a law as patterns of possible events.  The laws describe allowed physical processes.

Table of Contents

  1. Relativity Theory
  2. Quantum Theory
  3. Standard Model
  4. Big Bang
    1. Inflation
    2. Eternal Inflation and the Multiverse
  5. Infinite Time

1. Relativity Theory

When the term relativity theory is used, sometimes it means the special theory of relativity of 1905, sometimes the general theory of relativity of 1915, and sometimes both. The general theory of relativity was co-discovered independently by the physicist Albert Einstein and the mathematician David Hilbert. Because Einstein published slightly sooner, it is called Einstein’s general theory of relativity. Both theories have been well-tested, and they continue to be tested. They are almost universally accepted, and today’s physicists understand them better than Einstein did.

The relationship between the special and general theories is slightly complicated. Both theories are about motion of objects and both approach agreement with Newton’s theory the slower the speed, the weaker the gravitational forces, and the lower the energy. Special relativity allows objects to have mass but not gravity. It always requires a flat geometry—that is, a Euclidean geometry for space and a Minkowski geometry for spacetime. General relativity does not have those restrictions. General relativity is a specific theory of gravity, assuming the theory is supplemented by a specification of the distribution of matter-energy at some time. Special relativity is not a specific theory but rather a general framework for theories, and it is not a specific version of general relativity. Nor is General relativity a generalization of special relativity. The main difference between the two is that, in general relativity, spacetime does not simply exist passively as a background arena for events. Instead, spacetime is dynamical in the sense that changes in the distribution of matter and energy are identical to changes in the curvature of spacetime.

In the Core theories,  the word time is a theoretical term, and time is treated somewhat like a dimension of space. Space is a set of all possible point-locations. Time is a set of all possible point-times. Spacetime is a set of all possible point-events. Spacetime is presumed to be four-dimensional and also smooth, with time being a distinguished, one-dimensional sub-space of spacetime. Because the time dimension is so different from a space dimension, physicists very often speak of (3+1)-dimensional spacetime rather than 4-dimensional spacetime. Technically, any spacetime, no matter how many dimensions it has, is required to be a differentiable manifold with a metric tensor defined on it, but that requirement is not explained in this article.

The special and general theories of relativity imply that to place a reference frame upon spacetime is to make a choice about which part of spacetime is the space part and which is the the time part. No choice is objectively correct, although some choices are more convenient or some purposes. This relativity of time, namely the dependency of time upon a choice of reference frame, is perhaps the most significant implication of both the special and general theories of relativity.

Since the discovery of relativity theory, scientists have come to believe that any objective description of the world can be made only with statements that are invariant under changes in the reference frame. Saying, “It is 8:00” does not have a truth value unless a specific reference frame is implied, such as one fixed to Earth with time being the time that is measured by our civilization’s standard clock. This relativity of time to reference frames is behind the remark that Einstein’s theories of relativity imply time itself is not objectively real but spacetime is.

In regard to the idea of relativity to frame, Newton would say that if you are seated in a vehicle moving along a road, then your speed relative to the vehicle is zero, but your speed relative to the road is not zero. Einstein would agree. However, he would surprise Newton by saying the length of your vehicle is slightly different in the two reference frames, the one in which the vehicle is stationary and the one in which the road is stationary. Equally surprising to Newton, the duration of the event of your drinking a cup of coffee while in the vehicle is slightly different in those two reference frames. These relativistic effects are called space contraction and time dilation, respectively. So, both length and duration are frame dependent and, for that reason, say physicists, are not objectively real characteristics of objects. Speeds also are relative to reference frame, with one exception. The speed of light in a vacuum has the same value c in all frames.

Relativity theory allows great latitude in selecting the classes of simultaneous events, as shown in this diagram. Because there is no single objectively-correct frame to use for specifying which events are present and which are past, one philosophical implication of the relativity of time is that it seems to be more difficult to defend McTaggart’s A-theory that implies the temporal properties of events such as “is happening now” or “happened in the past” are intrinsic to the events and are objective, frame-free properties of those events.

Relativity theory challenges other ingredients of the manifest image of time. For two events A and B occurring at the same place but at different times, relativity theory implies their temporal order is absolute in the sense of being independent of the frame of reference, and this agrees with common sense and thus the manifest image of time, but if they are distant from each other and occur close enough in time to be within each other’s absolute elsewhere, then event A can occur before event B in one reference frame, but after B in another frame, and simultaneously with B in yet another frame. No person before Einstein ever imagined time has such a strange feature.

The special and general theories of relativity provide accurate descriptions of the world when their assumptions are satisfied. Both have been carefully tested. The special theory does not mention gravity,  and it assumes there is no curvature to spacetime, but the general theory requires curvature in the presence of mass and energy, and it requires the curvature to change as their distribution changes. The presence of gravity in the general theory has enabled the theory to be used to explain phenomena that cannot be explained with special relativity and Newton’s theory of gravity and Maxwell’s theory of electromagnetism.

Because of this relationship between spacetime and gravity, the equations of general relativity are much more complicated than are those of special relativity. General relativity assumes the equations of special relativity hold at least in all infinitesimal regions of spacetime.

To give one example of the complexity just mentioned, the special theory clearly implies there is no  time travel to events in one’s own past.  Experts do not agree on whether the general theory has this same implication because the equations involving the phenomena are too complex to solve directly. Approximate solutions have to be used, yet still there is disagreement about time travel.

Regarding curvature of time and of space, the presence of mass at a point implies intrinsic spacetime curvature at that point, but not all spacetime curvature implies the presence of mass. Empty spacetime containing no mass can still have curvature. This point has been interpreted by many philosophers as a good reason to reject Leibniz’s classical relationism. The point was first mentioned by Arthur Eddington.

Two accurate, synchronized clocks do not stay synchronized if they undergo different gravitational forces. This is a second kind of time dilation. So, a correct clock’s time depends on the clock’s history of both speed and gravitational influence. Gravitational time dilation would be especially apparent if a clock were to approach a black hole. The time shown on the clock approaching the black hole slows radically upon approach to the horizon of the hole—relative to time on a clock that remains safely back on Earth. After a clock falls through the event horizon, it can no longer report its values to Earth, and when it reaches the center of the hole not only does it stop ticking, but it also reaches the end of time, the end of its proper time.

The general theory of relativity theory has additional implications for time. In 1948-9, the logician Kurt Gödel discovered radical solutions to Einstein’s equations, solutions in which there are closed time-like curves in graphical representations of spacetime. The unusual curvature is due to the rotation of all the matter in Gödel’s possible universe. As one progresses forward in time along one of these curves, one arrives back at one’s starting point. Fortunately, there is no empirical evidence that our own universe has this rotation. Here is Einstein’s reaction to Gödel’s work on time travel:

Kurt Gödel’s essay constitutes, in my opinion, an important contribution to the general theory of relativity, especially to the analysis of the concept of time. The problem involved here disturbed me already at the time of the building of the general theory of relativity, without my having succeeded in clarifying it.

Time, as described by all the Core theories is smooth and not quantized. What does that mean? In mathematical physics, the ordering of instants by the happens-before relation of temporal precedence is complete in the sense that there are no gaps in the sequence of instants. Any interval of time is smooth, so the points of time form a linear continuum. Unlike physical objects, physical time is believed to be infinitely divisible—that is, divisible in the sense of the actually infinite, not merely in Aristotle’s sense of potentially infinite. Regarding the density of instants, the ordered instants are so densely packed that between any two there is a third so that no instant has a next instant. Regarding continuity, time’s being a linear continuum implies that there is a nondenumerable infinity of instants between any two non-simultaneous instants. The rational number line does not have so many points between any pair of different points; it is not continuous the way the real number line is, but rather contains many gaps. The real numbers such as pi, which is not a rational number, fill the gaps.

The actual temporal structure of events can be embedded in the real numbers, at least locally, but how about the converse? That is, to what extent is it known that the real numbers can be adequately embedded into the structure of the instants, at least locally? This question is asking for the justification of saying time is not discrete or atomistic. The problem here is that the shortest duration ever measured is about 250 zeptoseconds. A zeptosecond is 10−21 second. For times shorter than about 10-43 second, which is the physicists’ favored candidate for the duration of an atom of time, science has no experimental grounds for the claim that between any two events there is a third. Instead, the justification of saying the reals can be embedded into an interval of instants is that (i) the assumption of continuity is very useful because it allows the mathematical methods of calculus to be used in the physics of time; (ii) there are no known inconsistencies due to making this assumption; and (iii) there are no better theories available. The qualification earlier in this paragraph about “at least locally” is there in case there is time travel to the past so that the total duration of the time loop is finite. A circle is continuous, and one-dimensional, but it is finite, and it is like the real numbers only locally.

One can imagine two empirical tests that would reveal time’s discreteness if it were discrete—(1) being unable to measure a duration shorter than some experimental minimum despite repeated tries, yet expecting that a smaller duration should be detectable with current equipment if there really is a smaller duration, and (2) detecting a small breakdown of Lorentz invariance. But if any experimental result that purportedly shows discreteness is going to resist being treated as a mere anomaly, perhaps due to error in the measurement apparatus, then it should be backed up with a confirmed theory that implies the value for the duration of the atom of time. This situation is an instance of the kernel of truth in the physics joke that no observation is to be trusted until it is backed up by theory.

The speed of light in a vacuum has the same value in all reference frames. The value is customarily called “c.” It is commonly remarked that, according to relativity theory, nothing can go faster than light. The remark needs some clarification, else it is incorrect. Here are three ways to go faster than light. (1) First, the medium needs to be specified. The speed of light in certain crystals can be much less than c, say 40 miles per hour, and a horse outside the crystal could outrun the light beam. (2) Second, the limit c applies only locally to objects within space relative to other nearby objects within space, and it requires that no object pass another object locally at faster than c. However, globally the general theory of relativity places no restrictions on how fast space itself can expand. So, two distant galaxies can drift apart from each other at faster than the speed of light simply because the intervening space expands. (3) Imagine standing still outside on the flat ground and aiming your laser pointer forward toward an extremely distant galaxy. Now aim the pointer down at your feet. When that happens, the point of intersection of the pointer and the plane of the ground will move toward your feet faster than the speed c. The point of intersection is merely a geometrical object, not a physical object, so its speed is not restricted by relativity theory.

The age of a photon created at the big bang is the same age as when it blasts into Earth.  If you wish to stop aging, turn yourself into a group of photons.

2. Quantum Theory

The broad term quantum mechanics, or equivalently, quantum theory, includes both quantum field theory, which is quantum mechanics applied to fields, and the standard model of particle physics. Quantum theory is mostly useful for microscopic phenomena, although strictly speaking it applies everywhere, and is expected to coarse-grain to chemistry, biology, and psychology. It has never been shown to disagree with a careful observation. Nevertheless, physicists still do not agree on the exact formulation of the theory. Its many competing interpretations are just competing versions of the theory. So, there could be no agreement on the axioms of quantum theory.

According to certain interpretations of quantum theory, it violates Leibniz’s Principle of Sufficient Reason. Leibniz’s metaphysical principle requires any single event to happen for a reason, a sufficient reason that determines that the event occurs. The popular Copenhagen Interpretation of quantum theory implies that when a single nucleus of radioactive uranium decays at a specific time, there is no determining cause or reason for the decay; the best our quantum theory can say is that there was a certain probability of the decay occurring at that time and certain probabilities for other possible experimental outcomes. The statistical veil of quantum theory cannot be penetrated. Because of this, quantum theory is, on this interpretation, inconsistent with the Principle of Sufficient Reason.

The Copenhagen Theory also is indeterministic. However, there are deterministic interpretations of quantum theory. The many worlds or Everettian interpretation of quantum theory is deterministic. And it does not violate Leibniz’s Principle  of Sufficient Reason, but it implies we cannot know which world is determined to happen next, a world in which the nucleus of that uranium decayed or a world in which it did not decay. What we can know in advance is the probability of its being observed in our world to decay.

All physicists believe that relativity and quantum theory are logically contrary and need to be replaced with a revised Core Theory containing a theory customarily called quantum gravity that is “more fundamental.” It is usually not made clear what it is that makes a fundamental theory be fundamental, but the overall idea is that a fundamental theory should not leave anything clearly in need of explanation. For more discussion of what is meant or should be meant by the terms fundamental theory, more fundamental theory, and final theory, see (Crowther 2019). Regardless of this fine philosophical point, a successful theory of quantum gravity may have radical implications for our understanding of time. Two prominent suggestions are that (1) time will be understood to be quantized, that is, to be discrete rather than smooth and continuous, and that (2) time emerges from more fundamental entities. Another prominent suggestion is that (2) is incorrect, and time is fundamental. Because there is no well-accepted theory of quantum gravity, so far the best game in town says time is smooth and not emergent except from spacetime.

Quantum theory, but not relativity theory, implies that at any place and at any time, the energy there cannot be zero. There is always some “wiggle room,” so to speak, in a lowest possible energy state of any system. Out of that wiggle room of energy there appear particle-antiparticle pairs of particles which soon meet and annihilate each other:

The effect of all these particles wiggling into and out of being is a thrumming “vacuum energy” that fills the cosmos and pushes outward on space itself. This activity is the most likely explanation for dark energy—the reason the universe, rather than staying static or even expanding at a steady rate, is accelerating outward faster and faster every moment (Moskowitz 2021, p. 26).

By guessing how quantum mechanics would apply to gravity, John Wheeler suggested that the ultramicroscopic structure of spacetime for periods on the order of the Planck time (about 5.4 x 10-44 seconds) in regions about the size of the Planck length (about 1.6 x 10-35 meters) probably is a quantum foam of rapidly changing curvature of spacetime, with black holes and perhaps wormholes rapidly forming and dissolving.

The Planck time is the time it takes light to travel a Plank length. The terms Planck length and Planck time are inventions of Max Planck in the early twentieth-century during his quest to find basic units of length and time that could be expressed in terms only of universal constants. He defined the Planck unit of time algebraically as

√(ħG/c5).

is the square root symbol. ħ is Planck’s constant in quantum theory divided by 2π; G is the gravitational constant in Newtonian mechanics; c is the speed of light in relativity theory. The three theories of physics are tied together in this one expression. The  Planck time is a theoretically interesting unit of time, but not a practical one. No known experimental procedure can detect events that are this brief.

The term time does not become meaningless at this small scale, but it does become more difficult to understand because this is where quantum theory and general relativity theory do not agree with each other, and there is no agreement among the experts on how to resolve the disagreement.

Even though both the special and general theory place the speed limit c on how fast a causal influence can propagate through space, classical quantum mechanics does not have this limit. Also, it is claimed by most physicists that a measurement of one member of an entangled pair of particles will instantaneously determine the value of any similar measurement to be made on the other member of the pair. This is philosophically significant because, in 1935, E. Schrodinger had said:

Measurements on (spatially) separated systems cannot directly influence each other—that would be magic.

Perhaps the resolution of the tension here requires a better understanding of the phrase “directly influence.” Entangled pairs of particles are not well understood. There are no-go theorems that imply entangled particles cannot be used to send messages from one place to another instantaneously, although this does not rule out instantaneous, coordinated behavior across great distances. Also, with entanglement, there are not two particles separated by a distance, but rather a single spatially-extended particle-like system. There has been serious speculation that the two particles in this system are connected by a wormhole.

Here is an example of “instantaneous, coordinated behavior across great distances.” Let two electrons interact so that they become entangled, the separate them by a great distance. Now perform a measurement on one of the particles. Suppose the electron’s spin is up. If a similar measurement were made on the distant particles, it would be found to be, say, up also. And this second measurement can be made before a particle moving at the speed of light could have carried information to the second particle about what happened back at the first particle. The transmission happens in zero time! This coordinated behavior cannot be used to send data faster than c, but it is probably the most shocking implication of quantum theory for our manifest image.

Some physicists, including the philosopher and physicist David Albert, suggest that the explanation of non-local phenomena such as entanglement requires some notion of absolute simultaneity, and therefore a revision in the general theory of relativity.

3. Standard Model

The standard model of particle physics describes three of the four fundamental forces (the strong force, the weak force, electromagnetic force, but not the gravitational force), and it describes the thirteen known subatomic particles other than the graviton—six quarks, six leptons, and the Higgs-Boson. It is our best theory of matter even though it is really a loose collection of theories about different particle fields. The standard model describes over 100 distinct kinds of elementary particles. It is quite a spectacular advance upon the particle theory of the Greek Atomists.

Except for gravity, this quantum mechanical theory does describe all other forces, particles, and fields. The standard model contains both quantum chromodynamics and the electroweak theory.

According to the standard model, but not according to relativity theory, all particles must move at the speed c unless acted upon by other fields. The protons and electrons in your body would move at the speed c if they were not continually interacting with the Higgs Field. The Higgs field can be thought as being like a sea of molasses that slows down the protons and electrons and gives them the mass they have. Ultimately that is why, when you flip a switch to turn on an electric light, the free electrons constituting the wire’s current cannot move as fast as the photons of the massless electric signal. Neutrinos are not affected by the Higgs Field, but they move slightly less than c because they are slightly affected by weak interactions.

The standard model was proposed in the 1970s, and it has subsequently been very well-tested. There has been an intense search for a fifth force, without success. However, ultimately the standard model may need revision if only because, among all the matter described by the standard model, there is no candidate for dark matter.

4. Big Bang

The classical big bang theory declares that the universe once was in a very small, very compressed, and very hot state. Then the entire universe suddenly exploded, and it has been expanding and cooling ever since. The explosion was an explosion of space, not merely an explosion of material within an already existing space. Judging primarily from today’s rate of expansion of the universe plus the assumption that gravity is the main force affecting the size change, it is estimated the explosion began about 13.8 billion years ago. At that time, the universe would have had an ultramicroscopic volume. The explosive process created new space, and is still creating, new space. In fact, in the late 20th century the classical theory was revised to say the expansion rate is accelerating. The big bang theory in some form or other is accepted by nearly all astronomers, astrophysicists, and philosophers of physics, but it is not as firmly accepted as is the theory of relativity.

In 1922, the Russian physicist Alexander Friedmann discovered that the theory of general relativity allows an expanding universe. Unfortunately, Einstein reacted by saying this is a mere physical possibility but surely not a feature of the actual universe. Then the Belgian physicist Georges Lemaître independently suggested in 1927 that there is some evidence the universe is expanding, and he defended his claim using previously published measurements to show a pattern that the great the distance of a galaxy from Earth the great is the galaxy’s speed away from Earth. He calculated these speeds from the Doppler shifts in their light frequency. In 1929, the American astronomer Edwin Hubble observed clusters of galaxies expanding away from each other, with the more distant ones moving away at greater speeds, and these observations were very influential in causing scientists to accept what is now called the big bang theory of the universe. Both Lemaître’s calculations and Hubble’s observations suggest that, if time were reversed, all those galaxies would merge into a single point at what today is called the beginning of the big bang.

The term big bang does not have a precise definition. It does not always refer to a single, first event; rather, it often refers to a brief range of early events as the universe underwent a rapid expansion that continues today. Actually, the big bang theory itself is not a specific theory, but rather is a framework for more specific big bang theories.

Astronomers on Earth detect microwave radiation arriving in all directions from the light produced about 380,000 years after the big bang explosion when the universe suddenly turned transparent, allowing photons for the first time to move freely without being immediately reabsorbed by other particles. This electromagnetic radiation was light radiation that has now become thermal radiation because its frequency was continually lower as the universe expanded.  The hot radiation of 380,000 years ago has now subsided to a cool 2.7 degrees K. Over the last 14 billion years it has dimmed in the same manner that a car’s headlamp dims the farther away from you it is, and it has been red shifted by a Doppler effect due to the expansion of  the universe.  This incoming Cosmic Microwave Background radiation is observed with infrared detectors. Measuring its temperature reveals it to be extremely uniform in all directions in the sky. It varies in different directions by only a factor of 1/105 of a degree. More specifically, the temperature is 2.72548 ± 0.00057 K. This uniform temperature implies the early universe had great uniformity and was very smooth macroscopically, and it implies the entropy of the big bang was very low. The small microwave temperature fluctuations are traces of even smaller fluctuations in the density of primordial material shortly after the big bang. These early, small fluctuations are believed to be the origin of what later became galaxies.

However, the expansion rate over the last 13.8 billion years has not been uniform because there is a second source of expansion, the repulsion of dark energy. The influence of dark energy was initially insignificant, but its key feature is that it does not dilute as the space it is within undergoes expansion. So, finally, after about eight or nine billion years of space’s expanding, the dark energy became an influential factor in accelerating this expansion, and it is becoming more and more significant. Dark energy goes by other names: vacuum energy and the cosmological constant. It is not known whether it is the energy of space itself or of a particle within space.

The initial evidence for this dark energy came from observations in 1998 of Doppler shifts of supernovas. These observations are best explained by the assumption that distances between supernovas are increasing at an accelerating rate. Because of this rate increase, it is estimated that the volume of the universe will double every 1010 years. Any galaxy cluster that is now 100 light-years away from our Milky Way will, in another 13.8 billion years, be more than 200 light-years away and will be moving much faster away from us. Eventually, it will be moving so fast away from us that it will become invisible. In enough time, all galaxies other than the Milky Way will become invisible. After that, all the stars in the Milky Way will become invisible. Astronomers are never going to see more than they see now.

Regarding the universe’s expansion, atoms are not currently expanding. They are held together tightly by the electromagnetic force and strong force (with a little help from the weak force and gravity) which overpower the current value of repulsive force of dark energy or whatever it is that is causing the expansion of space. What is expanding now is the average distances between clusters of galaxies. It is as if the clusters are exploding away from each other, and, in the future, they will be very much farther away from each other.

Eventually, though, if the rate of expansion of space were to increase fast enough, then galaxies themselves cannot stay stable in volume and will be torn apart, then all solar systems, and ultimately even molecules and atoms and all other configurations of elementary particles.

Why does the big bang theory say space exploded instead of saying matter-energy exploded into a pre-existing space? This is a subtle issue. If it had said matter-energy exploded but space did not, then there would be uncomfortable questions: Where is the point in space that it exploded from, and why that point? Picking one would be arbitrary. And there would be these additional uncomfortable questions: How large is this pre-existing space? When was it created? Experimental observations clearly indicate that some clusters of galaxies must be separating from each other faster than the speed of light, but adding that they do this because they are moving that fast within a pre-existing space would require an ad hoc change to the theory of relativity to make exceptions to Einstein’s speed limit. So, it is much more “comfortable” to say the big bang is an explosion of space or spacetime, not of matter-energy within spacetime.

Nevertheless, in our universe, nothing is passing, or ever has passed, or will pass anything at faster than the speed of light; so, in that sense, light speed is still our cosmic speed limit.

The term “our observable universe” and the synonymous term “our Hubble bubble,” refer to everything that a person on Earth could in principle observe. However, there are distant places in our observable universe in which an astronomer there could see things that Earth astronomers could not observe, because they are closer to those objects than Earth is. Physicists are agreed that, because of this reasoning, there exist objects that are in the universe but not in our observable universe. Because those unobservable objects are the product of our big bang, cosmologists assume that the unobservable objects are similar to the observable objects—that those objects form atoms and galaxies, and that time behaves there as it does here. But there is no guarantee this convenient assumption is a correct assumption.

Because the big bang happened about 14 billion years ago, you would think at first that no visible object can be more than 14 billion light-years from Earth, but this would be a mistake. The increasing separation of clusters of galaxies over the last 14 billion years is why astronomers can see about 45 billion light-years in any direction and not just 14 billion light-years.

When contemporary physicists speak of the age of our universe and of the time since our big bang, they are implicitly referring to cosmic time measured in the cosmological rest frame. This is time measured in a unique reference frame in which the average motion of all the galaxies is stationary and the Cosmic Microwave Background radiation is as close as possible to being the same in all directions. This frame is not one in which the Earth is stationary. Cosmic time is time measured by a clock that would be sitting as still as possible while the universe expands around it. In cosmic time, t = 0 years is when the big bang occurred, and t = 13.8 billion years is our present. If you were at rest at the spatial origin in this frame, then the Cosmic Microwave Background radiation on a large scale would have the same temperature in any direction, and the universe’s matter would be about uniformly distributed. At that scale, it is as if the galaxies are dust particles floating in a large room, and at the center of the room the distribution of dust in one direction is the same as in any other direction, and in any region of the room there is as much dust as in any other region. This is a unique, privileged reference frame for astronomical convenience, but there is no reason to suppose it is otherwise privileged. It is not the frame sought by the A-theorist who believes in a unique present, nor by Isaac Newton who believed in absolute rest, nor by Maxwell who believed in his nineteenth century aether.

The cosmic frame’s spatial origin point is described as follows:

In fact, it isn’t quite true that the cosmic background heat radiation is completely uniform across the sky. It is very slightly hotter (i.e., more intense) in the direction of the constellation of Leo than at right angles to it…. Although the view from Earth is of a slightly skewed cosmic heat bath, there must exist a motion, a frame of reference, which would make the bath appear exactly the same in every direction. It would in fact seem perfectly uniform from an imaginary spacecraft traveling at 350 km per second in a direction away from Leo (towards Pisces, as it happens)…. We can use this special clock to define a cosmic time…. Fortunately, the Earth is moving at only 350 km per second relative to this hypothetical special clock. This is about 0.1 percent of the speed of light, and the time-dilation factor is only about one part in a million. Thus to an excellent approximation, Earth’s historical time coincides with cosmic time, so we can recount the history of the universe contemporaneously with the history of the Earth, in spite of the relativity of time.

Similar hypothetical clocks could be located everywhere in the universe, in each case in a reference frame where the cosmic background heat radiation looks uniform. Notice I say “hypothetical”; we can imagine the clocks out there, and legions of sentient beings dutifully inspecting them. This set of imaginary observers will agree on a common time scale and a common set of dates for major events in the universe, even though they are moving relative to each other as a result of the general expansion of the universe…. So, cosmic time as measured by this special set of observers constitutes a type of universal time… (Davies 1995, pp. 128-9).

It is a convention that cosmologists agree to use the cosmic time of this special reference frame, but it is an interesting fact and not a convention that our universe is so organized that there is such a useful cosmic time available to be adopted by the cosmologists. Not all physically possible spacetimes obeying the laws of general relativity can have such a cosmic time.

a. Inflation

According to one of the more popular big bang theories, the inflation theory, the universe underwent an inflationary expansion soon after t = 0. It was a sudden expansion with an exponentially increasing rate for a very short time. Nobody knows whether it expanded uniformly in all directions. It began for some unknown reason, and, again for some unknown reason,  very stopped inflating.

The theory of inflation implies the universe has no overall curvature. Assuming there is no curvature, our observations and energy measurements indicate some energy is missing that would ensure this lack of curvature. The energy that is needed to make the universe have no overall curvature is called dark energy.

The theory of inflation is a version of the big bang theory that offers the most popular solution to the big bang’s horizon problem. This is the problem of accounting for the fact that, looking in any direction, we see almost the same temperature of the light reaching us from that direction. These regions are nearly in thermal equilibrium. This is a remarkable feature because distant regions at different angles were not in any causal contact when their light was generated several hundred thousand years after the big bang. This nearly identical temperature is a sign that when these regions were in causal contact early in the history of the big bang, the universe had a very nearly uniform temperature and a very low entropy.

The big bang theory is considered to be confirmed in the field of astronomy, but the version called the theory of inflation is still unconfirmed. Here is the argument in favor of inflation, followed by an elaboration of its details. The cosmic microwave background (CMB) radiation reaching Earth from all directions is on average the same cold temperature everywhere, about 2.7 degrees Kelvin or about negative 455 degrees Fahrenheit, but with small temperature differences in different directions on the order of a hundred-thousandth of a degree. Room temperature, by comparison, is 300 degrees Kelvin. The classical big bang theory can account for the number 2.7 but not for the temperature being uniform in all directions at the largest scale nor for the very slight deviations in uniformity in temperature on the order of a hundred-thousandth of a degree. The big bang theory of inflation can account for these cosmological features, and in the early 21st century, the majority of cosmologists say there are no better accounts. The claim that there are no better accounts is challenged in (Ijjas, et. al., 2017).

The theory of inflation postulates that extremely early in the big bang process there was exponential inflation of space, or perhaps a small patch of space, due to the presence of a gram of very dense repulsive material having negative pressure. In other words, it was very explosive. Newton-style gravity (or energy) cannot be repulsive, but Einstein’s theory does not rule out repulsive gravity. The addition by Einstein of the so-called cosmological term to his equations allows for this repulsive gravity. Einstein, however, did not consider the possibility that there could be inflation.

Assuming the big bang began at time t = 0, then the epoch of inflation (the epoch of repulsive gravity or anti-gravity) began at t = 10−36 seconds and lasted until about t = 10−33 seconds, during which time the volume of space increased by a factor of at least 1078, and any initial unevenness in the distribution of energy was almost all smoothed out. The inflationary expansion speed is much faster than light speed, but it does not violate Einstein’s general theory of relativity because it is a local theory, and locally no entity passes any other at faster than the speed of light.

At the end of that inflationary epoch, the explosive material decayed for some unknown reason and left only normal matter with attractive gravity. This decay began the period of the so-called quark soup. At this time, our universe continued to expand, although now at a nearly constant rate. It went into its “coasting” phase. Regardless of any previous curvature in our universe, by the time the inflationary period ended, the overall structure of space had very little curvature, so it was extremely homogeneous, as is the universe we observe today in its largest scale. But at the very beginning of the inflationary period, there were some very tiny imperfections due to quantum fluctuations. The densest of these quantum fluctuations turned into what would eventually become galaxies, and these fluctuations have left their traces in the very slight hundred-thousandth of a degree differences in the temperature at different angles of the CMB radiation.

Before inflation began, for some unknown reason the universe contained an unstable field or false vacuum field. This field underwent a spontaneous phase transition (analogous to superheated liquid water suddenly and spontaneously expanding into steam) causing its region of highly repulsive material to hyper-inflate exponentially in volume for a very short time. During this primeval inflationary epoch, the gravitational field’s stored, negative gravitational energy was rapidly released, and all space wildly expanded. At the end of this early inflationary epoch, the highly repulsive material decayed for some as yet unknown reason into ordinary matter and energy, and the universe’s expansion rate settled down to just below the rate of expansion observed in the universe today.

Guth described the inflationary period this way:

There was a period of inflation driven by the repulsive gravity of a peculiar kind of material that filled the early universe. Sometimes I call this material a “false vacuum,” but, in any case, it was a material which in fact had a negative pressure, which is what allows it to behave this way. Negative pressure causes repulsive gravity. Our particle physics tells us that we expect states of negative pressure to exist at very high energies, so we hypothesize that at least a small patch of the early universe contained this peculiar repulsive gravity material which then drove exponential expansion. Eventually, at least locally where we live, that expansion stopped because this peculiar repulsive gravity material is unstable; and it decayed, becoming normal matter with normal attractive gravity. At that time, the dark energy was there, the experts think. It has always been there, but it’s not dominant. It’s a tiny, tiny fraction of the total energy density, so at that stage at the end of inflation the universe just starts coasting outward. It has a tremendous outward thrust from the inflation, which carries it on. So, the expansion continues, and as the expansion happens the ordinary matter thins out. The dark energy, we think, remains approximately constant. If it’s vacuum energy, it remains exactly constant. So, there comes a time later where the energy density of everything else drops to the level of the dark energy, and we think that happened about five or six billion years ago. After that, as the energy density of normal matter continues to thin out, the dark energy [density] remains constant [and] the dark energy starts to dominate; and that’s the phase we are in now. We think about seventy percent or so of the total energy of our universe is dark energy, and that number will continue to increase with time as the normal matter continues to thin out. (World Science U Live Session: Alan Guth, published November 30, 2016 at https://www.youtube.com/watch?v=IWL-sd6PVtM.)

Before about t = 10-46 seconds, there was a single basic force rather than what we have now, which are four separate, basic forces: the force of gravity, the strong nuclear force, the weak force, and the electromagnetic force. At about t = 10-46 seconds, the energy density of the primordial field was down to about 1015 GEV, which allowed spontaneous symmetry breaking (analogous to the spontaneous phase change in which steam cools enough to spontaneously change to liquid water); this phase change created the gravitational force as a separate basic force. The other three forces had not yet appeared as separate forces.

During the period of inflation, the universe (our bubble) expanded from the size of a proton to the size of a marble. Later at t = 10-12 seconds, there was more spontaneous symmetry breaking. First the strong nuclear force, then the weak nuclear force and electromagnetic forces became separate forces. For the first time, the universe now had exactly four separate forces. At t = 10-10 seconds, the Higgs field turned on (that is, came into existence). This slowed down many kinds of particles by giving them mass so they no longer moved at light speed.

Much of the considerable energy left over at the end of the inflationary period was converted into matter, antimatter, and radiation, such as quarks, antiquarks, and photons. The universe’s temperature escalated with this new radiation, and this period is called the period of cosmic reheating. Matter-antimatter pairs of particles combined and annihilated, removing the antimatter from the universe, and leaving a small amount of matter and even more radiation. At t = 10-6 seconds, quarks combined together and thereby created protons and neutrons. After t = 3 minutes, the universe had cooled sufficiently to allow these protons and neutrons to start combining strongly to produce hydrogen, deuterium, and helium nuclei. At about t = 380,000 years, the temperature was low enough for these nuclei to capture electrons and to form the initial hydrogen, deuterium, and helium atoms of the universe. With these first atoms coming into existence, the universe became transparent in the sense that light was now able to travel freely without always being absorbed very soon by surrounding particles. Due to the expansion of the universe, this early light is today much lower in frequency than it was 380,000 years ago. It is detected on Earth as the cosmic microwave background radiation and not as ordinary light. It is almost homogenous and almost isotropic. The energy is continually arriving at the Earth’s surface from all directions.

In the literature in both physics and philosophy, descriptions of the big bang often speak of it as if it were the first event, but the theory does not require there to be a first event. This description mentioning the first event is a philosophical position, not something demanded by the scientific evidence. Physicists James Hartle and Stephen Hawking once suggested that looking back to the big bang is like following the positive real numbers back to ever-smaller positive numbers without ever reaching the smallest positive one. If Hartle and Hawking are correct that time is actually like this, then the big bang had no beginning point event, no initial time.

The classical big bang theory is based on the assumption that the universal expansion of clusters of galaxies can be projected all the way back to a singularity, a zero volume, at t = 0. Yet physicists agree that the projection must become untrustworthy then and even slightly later in the Planck epoch before exponential expansion began. Current science cannot speak with confidence about the nature of time within this tiny Planck epoch, nor at t=0, nor before t=0. If a theory of quantum gravity does get confirmed, it is expected to provide more reliable information about the Planck epoch, and it may even allow physicists to answer the questions, “What caused the big bang?” and “Did anything happen before then?”

b. Eternal Inflation and the Multiverse

Eventually the inflation ends in a part of the inflationary material. In the region or bubble in which it ends, the material their continues to expand, but only at a constant rate.  The theory of eternal inflation implies that, even though all this happens, not all the inflationary material stops inflating. Some of it continues to expand in some region of space not observable from the previous bubble. Eventually some part of this inflating material also collapses to produce another bubble universe similar to the previous bubble. This bubble expands at a constant rate. There is yet more uncollapsed inflationary material that expands at an inflationary rate and with some part of it collapsing to produce other conventional big bangs, and so on to forever.

Most of the big bang inflationary theories are theories of eternal inflation, of the eternal creation of more and more separate, expanding bubbles of earlier inflating material, each bubble being its own universe and each generating more entropy. Our own bubble is called the Hubble Bubble. This theory of eternal inflation is called the multiverse theory.

The original theory of inflation was created by Guth in 1981, and the multiverse theory of eternal inflation was created by Gott, Linde, and Vilenkin in the early 1980s. There is no consensus among physicists about whether there is more than one universe. The multiplicity of universes also is called parallel worlds, many worlds, alternative universes, and alternate worlds.

Some of these universes occur far away in our space but most do not occur in our space. They are disconnected from us. Also, in some of these universes, the physical laws might be different and in some there may be no time dimension at all. A great many universes can occur if the multiverse theory is correct. A typical estimate is a googolplex per second, but there are limits to the variety. Not all logically possible universes are allowed. Only the physically possible universes are allowed in the multiverse. And there are multiverse theories that do not allow very much variety, for example, the constants such as the mass of the electron in our universe, might have to be the same in all universes. There is much uncertainty because of the lack of experimental tests.

Could the expansion of our universe eventually slow down? Yes. Could the expansion of the multiverse eventually slow down? No. The primordial or earlier explosive material in any single universe decays quickly, but as it decays the part that has not decayed becomes much larger, and so the expansion of the multiverse continues. The rate of creation of new bubble universes is increasing exponentially. Unfortunately, physicists cannot make sense of the remark that one universe came into existence before some other. New energy is not required to create these universes, so there are no implications about whether energy is or is not conserved in the multiverse.

More speculatively, perhaps the theory of inflation is incorrect because our universe never underwent a period of early hyperinflation but instead is almost a mirror image of an antimatter universe extending backward in time before the big bang.

Because of the lack of experimental evidence for this mirror theory or the multiverse theory, many physicists complain that their fellow physicists who are developing these theories are doing technical metaphysical speculation, not physics. However, physics is whatever physicists do; and experimental evidence might someday be obtainable, hopefully before our Sun expands and incinerates the Earth.

5. Infinite Time

Is time infinitely divisible? Yes, because general relativity theory and quantum theory require time to be a continuum. But this answer will change to “no” if these theories are eventually replaced by a Core Theory that quantizes time. “Although there have been suggestions that spacetime may have a discrete structure,” Stephen Hawking said in 1996, “I see no reason to abandon the continuum theories that have been so successful.” Two decades later, physicists were much less sure.

Stephen Hawking, James Hartle, and other cosmologists have said the difficulty of knowing whether the past and future are infinite turns on our ignorance of whether the universe’s positive energy is exactly canceled out by its negative energy. If the total is non-zero and if quantum mechanics is to be trusted, including the law of conservation of energy, then time is infinite in the past and future. There is no solid evidence that the total is non-zero, but the experts’ somewhat favor a non-zero total, although their confidence in this is not strong. If the total is zero, on the other hand, then time is not fundamental (nor is spacetime), but is emergent from a finite collection of moments as described in the timeless Wheeler-DeWitt equation of quantum mechanics; in that case, the big chill theory is incorrect.

Inside any black hole, future time ends; see the supplement to the main “Time” article for details about this. But what about outside all black holes in the normal part of the universe? The big chill’s extension of the big bang theory implies the universe’s expansion continues forever because the dark energy will not disappear, and it causes expansion. So, forever there will be new events produced from old events. Here are more details of this future. The last star will burn out in 1015 years. Then all the stars and dust in each galaxy will fall into black holes, and then the material between galaxies will fall in as well, and finally in about 10100 years all the black holes will evaporate, leaving only a soup of elementary particles that gets “chillier” and less dense as the universe’s expansion continues. Future space will look more and more like empty space, but because of vacuum energy, the temperature will only approach, but never quite reach, zero (on the Kelvin scale). Thus the universe descends into a big chill.

Regarding past time, the classical big bang theory implies the universe began a finite time ago at a singularity called the big bang. The idea of such a singularity is inconsistent with quantum mechanics. According to (Carroll 2016, pp. 197-199),

If the universe had a nonzero amount of some conserved quantity like energy or charge, it couldn’t have an earliest moment in time—and still obey the laws of physics. The first moment of such a universe would be one in which energy or charge existed without any previous existence, which is against the rules.

What if, instead, the total is exactly zero? In this second scenario, the negative energy of spacetime’s curvature and all the gravitational forces exactly balances the positive energy of the universe’s mass and its kinetic energy. In this zero-sum scenario, temporal change is not fundamental but is a higher-level emergent feature. The universe in this zero-sum scenario is fundamentally a linear combination of all individual moments as described by the timeless version of the Schrödinger equation, namely the Wheeler-DeWitt equation. Probably there are only a finite number of these moments, and this implies that the past and future are finite.

Here is more commentary about this from Carroll (2016, pp. 197-8):

There are two possibilities: one where the universe is eternal, one where it had a beginning. That’s because the Schrödinger equation of quantum mechanics turns out to have two very different kinds of solutions, corresponding to two different kinds of universe.

One possibility is that time is fundamental, and the universe changes as time passes. In that case, the Schrödinger equation is unequivocal: time is infinite. If the universe truly evolves, it always has been evolving and always will evolve. There is no starting and stopping. There may have been a moment that looks like our Big Bang, but it would have only been a temporary phase, and there would be more universe that was there even before the event.

The other possibility is that time is not truly fundamental, but rather emergent. Then, the universe can have a beginning. The Schrödinger equation has solutions describing universes that don’t evolve at all: they just sit there, unchanging.

…And if that’s true, then there’s no problem at all with there being a first moment in time. The whole idea of “time” is just an approximation anyway.

Back to the main “Time” article for references.

Author Information

Bradley Dowden
Email: dowden@csus.edu
California State University, Sacramento
U. S. A.