What Else Science Requires of Time

This article adds to the main “Time” article and its supplements. The three most fundamental theories of physical science are (i) the general theory of relativity, (ii) quantum mechanics, including the standard model of particle physics, and (iii) the big bang theory of cosmology. Their amalgamation is usually called the Core Theory, the theory of everything physical. The Nobel Prize winner Frank Wilczek said:

[T]he Core has such a proven record of success over an enormous range of applications that I can’t imagine people will ever want to junk it. I’ll go further: I think the Core provides a complete foundation for biology, chemistry, and stellar astrophysics that will never require modification. (Well, “never” is a long time. Let’s say for a few billion years.)

Table of Contents

  1. Relativity Theory and Quantum Theory
  2. The Big Bang
    1. Inflation
    2. Eternal Inflation and the Multiverse
  3. Infinite Time

1. Relativity Theory and Quantum Theory

EinsteinThe field of physics tries to explain the observed varieties of phenomena by appeal to universal laws. Hopefully, these are laws that are simple for humans to understand and describe, but there is no guarantee here. These laws are expected to be the products of one or more theories of physics. Think of theories as special groups of laws.

When the term relativity theory is used, sometimes it means the special theory of relativity, sometimes the general theory of relativity, and sometimes both. The relationship between the two is a bit complicated. General Relativity (GR) is a specific theory of gravity and curvature of spacetime. Special relativity (SR) is not a specific theory but rather a framework for theories, and it is not a specific version of GR. General Relativity is not a generalization of special relativity, but the principle of special relativity holds in any very small region of spacetime allowed by general relativity; in that small region its curvature can be ignored and its spatial geometry is Euclidean and its spacetime geometry is Minkowskian.

The broad term “quantum mechanics,” or equivalently, “quantum theory,” includes both quantum field theory [which is quantum mechanics applied to fields] and the standard model of particle physics. The standard model is our best theory of matter even though it is really a very loose collection of theories about different particle fields. It describes the thirteen known subatomic particles—six quarks, six leptons, and the Higgs-Boson.

In the Core Theory and all three of the fundamental theories, time is treated somewhat like a dimension of space. More specifically, time is treated as being a special dimension of spacetime. Space is what mathematicians call the space of all possible positions or locations, and spacetime is the space of all possible events, point-events. That is, spacetime is a collection of points called spacetime locations where the universe’s physical events and processes occur. The usual spacetime is four-dimensional and also a continuum. Time is a distinguished, one-dimensional sub-space of this continuum. Because the time dimension is so different from a space dimension, physicists very often speak of (3+1)-dimensional spacetime rather than 4-dimensional spacetime. Technically, any spacetime, no matter how many dimensions it has, is required to be a differentiable manifold with a metric tensor defined on it, but that requirement is not explained in this article.

Placing a reference frame such as a coordinate system on spacetime, makes a choice about which part of spacetime is the space part and which the time part. When Einstein and Minkowski say spacetime can be divided up like this in many different ways, there are limits. Not anything goes. The division must be such that there is Lorentz Invariance in the equations describing the transformation of the coordinate numbers between any two legitimate frames of reference. More specifically, in general relativity, in any infinitesimal region of spacetime, the laws of special relativity must hold and all laws of physics must be invariant under a Lorentz transformation between any two coordinate frames moving at constant velocity relative to each other. Lorentz discovered his transformation equations before Einstein created his special theory of relativity so, although Einstein was a giant, he stood on the shoulders of giants.

Time, as so described by our three most fundamental physical theories, is smooth and not quantized. What does that mean? In mathematical physics, the ordering of instants by the happens-before relation of temporal precedence is complete in the sense that there are no gaps in the sequence of instants. Any duration or interval of time is smooth; the technical term is that the intervals are continuous; the points of time form a linear continuum. Unlike physical objects, physical time is believed to be infinitely divisible—that is, divisible in the sense of the actually infinite, not merely in Aristotle’s sense of potentially infinite. Regarding the density of instants, the ordered instants are so densely packed that between any two there is a third so that no instant has a next instant. Regarding continuity, time’s being a linear continuum implies that there is a nondenumerable infinity of instants between any two non-simultaneous instants. The rational number line does not have so many points between any pair of different points; it is not continuous the way the real number line is, but rather contains many gaps. The real numbers such as pi, which is not a rational number, fill the gaps.

The actual temporal structure of events can be embedded in the real numbers, but how about the converse? That is, to what extent is it known that the real numbers can be adequately embedded into the structure of the instants? This question is asking for the justification of saying time is not discrete or atomistic. The problem here is that for times shorter than about 10-43 second, science has no experimental grounds for the claim that between any two events there is a third. Instead, the justification of saying the reals can be embedded into an interval of instants is (i) that the assumption of continuity is so convenient and useful [for example, it allows the mathematical methods of calculus to be used in physics]; (ii) that there are no known inconsistencies due to making this assumption; and (iii) that there are no better theories available (yet). Nevertheless, one can imagine what sort of empirical test would show time’s discreteness if it were discrete—experimentally detecting a small breakdown of Lorentz invariance. But if this experimental result is going to resist being treated as a mere anomaly, perhaps due to error in the measurement apparatus, it should be backed up with a confirmed theory that implies there is this kind of discreteness that was experimentally detected instead of some other kind of discreteness.

Leibniz’s Principle of Sufficient Reason implies any single event happens for a reason, but quantum theory implies that when a single nucleus of radioactive uranium decays at a specific time, there is no determining cause or reason for the decay; the best our quantum theory can say is that there was a certain probability of the decay occurring at that time. The statistical veil of quantum theory cannot be penetrated. Quantum theory is, in this way radically unintuitive. Lee Smolin’s reaction to quantum theory’s being so mysterious is to say, “we can’t make sense of it simply because it isn’t true” (Smolin 2013, p. 141).

All physicists believe that relativity and quantum theory (including the standard model of particles) are logically contrary and need to be replaced with a Core Theory containing a theory of quantum gravity that is “more fundamental.” It is usually not made clear what it is that makes a fundamental theory be fundamental, but the overall idea is that a fundamental theory should not leave anything clearly in need of explanation. For more discussion of what we mean or should mean by “fundamental theory” and “more fundamental theory” and “final theory,” see (Crowther 2019). Regardless of this fine philosophical point, a successful theory of quantum gravity may have radical implications for our understanding of time. Two prominent suggestions of what those implications might be are that (i) time will be understood to be quantized, that is, to be discrete rather than continuous, and (ii) time will be seen to emerge from more basic or fundamental entities. Because there is no well-accepted theory of quantum gravity, so far the best game in town says time is not discrete and does not emerge from a fundamental timeless entity.

Let’s focus on relativity. The general theory of relativity was co-discovered independently by the physicist Albert Einstein and the mathematician David Hilbert. Because Einstein published slightly sooner, it is usually called Einstein’s general theory of relativity. The theory has become very well accepted. With its implication that there are many valid perspectives or reference frames, scientists also have come to believe that any objective description of the world can be made only with statements that are invariant under changes in the reference frame. So, saying it is 8:00 does not have a truth value unless it is proper to assume a specific reference frame, such as one fixed to Earth with time counted by our civilization’s standard clock. This relativity of time to reference frames is behind the common remark that time itself is not objectively real but spacetime is.

Isaac Newton did not actually use the concept of a reference frame, but it is helpful to use it to succinctly describe his beliefs. Newton assumed that if event 1 lasts just as long as event 2 in one frame, then it does so in all other frames. Newton also assumed that, if you are five feet tall in one reference frame, then you are that tall in all other frames. Einstein undermined these two Newtonian assumptions.

Einstein said, “Time is relative.” This means some, but not all, aspects of time are relative to the chosen reference frame. Relative to in the sense of depending upon. Newton would say that if you are seated in a moving vehicle, then your speed relative to the vehicle is zero, but your speed relative to the road is not zero. Einstein would agree. However, he would surprise Newton by saying the length of your vehicle is slightly different in the two reference frames. Equally surprising to Newton, the duration of your drinking a cup of coffee while in the vehicle is slightly different in those two reference frames. These effects are called space contraction and time dilation, respectively. So, both length and duration are frame dependent and, for that reason, not objectively real characteristics of things.

With space contraction and time dilation, namely with the relativity of length and of duration, Einstein’s theory is requiring a mixing of space and time. Spacetime divides into its space part and its time part differently for two reference frames that move relative to each other. Because there are infinitely many frames that could be chosen, to claim that an event lasted three minutes without giving even an implicit indication of the reference frame is to make a very ambiguous claim.

Because there is no single correct frame to use for specifying which events are present and which are past, one philosophical implication of the relativity of time is that it seems to be more difficult to defend McTaggart’s A-theory that says temporal properties of events such as “is happening now” or “happened in the past” are frame-free properties of those events.

Another profound implication of relativity theory is that two accurate, synchronized clocks do not usually stay synchronized if they move relative to each other or undergo different gravitational forces. So, each clock has its own personal time. So does any other physical object. Personal time for an object is the physical time that would be shown by a very small clock if it were attached to the object as the object travels about. In the technical terminology of relativity theory, we adopt the “clock hypothesis” that any correct clock gives the elapsed time along its own world line. A correct clock’s time depends on the clock’s history, its history of speed and gravitational influence; but the clock’s time readings are not influenced by other forces, such as an electromagnetic force. In short, speed and the presence of matter (and thus gravity) affect the behavior of clocks.

One noteworthy philosophical point here is that, according to general relativity, although the presence of gravity arising from a mass (or energy) implies spacetime has intrinsic curvature, not all spacetime curvature implies the presence of mass or energy. Spacetime containing no mass-energy can still have curvature; therefore, the geometry of spacetime is influenced by, but not always determined by, the behavior of its matter-energy. This point has been interpreted by many philosophers as a good reason to reject Leibniz’s classical relationism. The point was first mentioned by Arthur Eddington in his analysis of the de Sitter solution to the equations of relativity theory.

Relativity theory challenges a great many of our intuitive beliefs about time. For two events A and B occurring at the same place but at different times, relativity theory implies their temporal order is absolute in the sense of being independent of the frame of reference, and this agrees with common sense and thus the manifest image of time, but if they are distant from each other and occur close enough in time to be within each other’s absolute elsewhere (that is, for two events that are space-like relative to each other), then event A can occur before event B in one reference frame, but after B in another frame, and simultaneously with B in yet another frame.

To give an example, first remember that speed depends on the chosen reference frame. If a car is speeding down the road, then it does so at some speed relative to you who are standing beside the road; but if you are judging, not from the road, but from inside the car, then the car is not speeding relative to you. So, the car is speeding and not speeding; it all depends on your perspective or frame of reference.

Now, for a deeper example, one suggested by Einstein himself. Suppose you are sitting still exactly in the middle of a moving train when lightning strikes simultaneously in the front and back of the train, as judged by you in a reference frame in which the train is not moving. You will know the strikes were simultaneous if the light rays from the two strikes reach you at the same time. However, in the reference frame of a person standing still on the ground outside the train, the lightning strike at the back of the train happened first because the center of the train is speeding away from the strike point. Yes, as judged in a frame fixed to a fast plane flying overhead in the same direction as the train and toward the front of the train, then the lightning strike at the back of the train really happened second. It was Einstein’s original idea that all three judgments about time order are correct. The event at the back of the train really did happen first, and it really did happen second, and it really did happen simultaneously with the event at the back. It’s all a matter of which reference frame is used to make the judgment. This ambiguity example can work only because the two events of the lightning strikes are in each other’s absolute elsewhere.

In any reference frame, the speed of light is a certain value, customarily called “c”. However, in relativity theory there is no allowable reference frame fixed to a photon from which one can ask about the speed of another photon.

Special relativity implies there is time dilation between one frame and another moving one. For example, the faster a clock moves, the slower it runs, relative to stationary clocks. But this does not work just for clocks. If a human being moves fast, the human being also ages more slowly than his or her stationary twin. Time dilation effects occur for tiny protons, too, but protons do not show the effects of their aging the way human bodies and clocks do. Tiny radioactive particles with measurably finite lifetimes, on the other hand, do show their aging because their half-life increases with increasing speed, as measured by a stationary clock. The faster they go, the longer they live.

Time dilation also shows itself when a speeding twin returns to find that his (or her) Earth-bound twin has aged more rapidly. This surprising dilation result once caused some philosophers to question the consistency of relativity theory by arguing that, if motion is relative, then we could call the speeding twin “stationary” and it would follow that this twin is now the one who ages more rapidly. If each twin ages more rapidly than the other twin, then we have arrived at a contradiction. This argument for a contradiction is called the twins paradox. Experts now are agreed that the mistake is within the argument for the paradox, not within relativity theory.

Special relativity’s time dilation is due to speed; general relativity’s time dilation is due either to speed or to gravitational fields (and accelerations). Two ideally synchronized clocks do not stay in synchrony if they undergo different gravitational forces. This gravitational time dilation would be especially apparent if one, but not the other, of the two clocks were to approach a black hole. The time shown on the clock approaching the black hole slows upon approach to the horizon of the hole—relative to time on a clock that remains safely back on Earth. This leads to strange visual effects because two observers in relative motion ascribe different directions to the same light ray.

The microstructure of spacetime near the Planck time and the Planck length (about 1.6 x 10-35 meters) very probably turns into a quantum foam of rapidly changing curvature of spacetime, with black holes and perhaps wormholes rapidly forming and dissolving. The terms Planck length and Planck time are inventions of Max Planck in the early twentieth-century during his quest to find basic units of length and time that could be expressed in terms only of universal constants. He defined the Planck unit of time algebraically as


is the square root symbol. ħ is Planck’s constant in quantum theory divided by 2π; G is the gravitational constant in Newtonian mechanics; c is the speed of light in relativity theory. Three theories of physics are tied together in one expression. The numerical value of the Planck time turns out to be about 5.4 x 10-44 seconds. This is a theoretically interesting unit of time, but not a practical one. No known experimental procedure can detect events that are this brief.

The term time does not become meaningless at this small scale, but it becomes not at all well understood at this scale because this is where quantum theory and general relativity theory do not agree with each other, and there is no agreement among the experts on how to resolve the disagreement.

The general theory of relativity theory has additional implications for time. In 1948, the logician Kurt Gödel discovered radical solutions to Einstein’s equations, solutions in which there are closed time-like curves due to the rotation of the universe’s matter, so that as one progresses forward in time along one of these curves one arrives back at one’s starting point. Gödel drew the conclusion that if matter were distributed so that there is Gödelian spacetime like this (that is, with a preponderance of galaxies rotating in one direction rather than another), then the universe would have no linear time. Fortunately, there is no empirical evidence that our universe has this rotation.

The remark that according to relativity theory nothing can go faster than light speed needs some clarification, else it is incorrect. (1) First, the theory is about a specific, constant rate c, the speed which light moves in a vacuum. Light itself will move at speed c in a vacuum but at less than c when it goes through air or crystals or certain other materials. Muons travel faster than light does inside ice crystals. (2) Second, the limit c applies only to objects within space relative to other objects within space, but relativity theory places no restrictions on how fast space itself can expand. Two objects in free fall can increase the distance between them faster than light speed if space itself expands fast enough, as it actually does for objects extremely far from Earth. But during this expansion, no object passes another object at faster than c. (3) Third, even though relativity theory places a speed limit c on how fast a causal influence can propagate through space, classical quantum mechanics does not have this limit. In fact, via quantum entanglement, it is claimed by some physicists that a measurement of one member of an entangled pair of particles will instantaneously determine the value of any similar measurement to be made on the other member of the pair. This is philosophically significant because, in 1935, E. Schrodinger had said:

Measurements on (spatially) separated systems cannot directly influence each other—that would be magic.

Entangled pairs of particles are not well understood. There are no-go theorems that imply entangled particles cannot be used to send messages from one place to another instantaneously, although this does not rule out instantaneous, coordinated behavior across great distances. Also, with entanglement, there are not two particles separated by a distance, but rather a single extended particle-like system. Some speculate that the two particles in this system are connected in a higher dimension by a wormhole.

2. The Big Bang

The classical hot big bang theory declares that the universe was once in a very small, very compressed, and very hot state. The universe suddenly exploded and has been expanding and cooling ever since. The explosion was an explosion of space, not merely an explosion of material within an already existing space. The explosion began about 13.8 billion years ago, and the explosive process created, and is still creating, new space. The big bang theory in some form or other is accepted by the vast majority of astronomers, astrophysicists, and philosophers of physics; but it is not as firmly accepted as is the theory of relativity.

In 1922, the Russian physicist Alexander Friedmann discovered that the theory of general relativity allows an expanding universe. Einstein reacted by saying this was a mere physical possibility but not a correct description of the actual universe. The Belgian physicist Georges Lemaître independently suggested in 1927 that there is some evidence the universe is expanding, and he defended his claim using previously published measurements to show a lawlike relationship between the distances of galaxies from Earth and their velocities away from Earth, which he calculated from their Doppler shifts. In 1929, the American astronomer Edwin Hubble observed clusters of galaxies mostly expanding away from each other, and this observation was very influential in causing scientists to accept what is now called the big bang theory of the universe’s expansion. It suggest that, if time were reversed, all those galaxies would merge into a single point. And in the late 1960s, the physicists Stephen Hawking and Roger Penrose deduced from general relativity theory that there must have been a singularity in the universe’s past.

The term big bang does not have a precise definition. It does not always refer to a single, first event; rather, it often refers to a brief range of early events as the universe underwent a rapid expansion that continues today. Actually, the big bang theory itself is not a specific theory, but rather is a framework for more specific big bang theories. [Quantum mechanics and special relativity are theory frameworks, but general relativity is a specific theory.]

Looking back toward times when the universe was smaller, let’s call the time t = 0 the time when it might have had a zero volume. There is a great deal of agreement among cosmologists about the character of the universe after t = 1 second, but much less so earlier than that.

Let’s return now to the classical theory of the big bang. At any earlier moment, the universe was more compact. Projecting to earlier and earlier times, and assuming that gravitation is the main force at work, the astronomers now conclude that 13.8 billion years ago our universe was smaller than an atom and outrageously dense with extremely low entropy. Because all substances cool when they expand, physicists believe that the universe once was extremely hot.

However, the expansion rate has not been uniform because there is a second source of expansion, the repulsion of dark energy. The influence of dark energy was initially insignificant, but its key feature is that it does not dilute as the space it is within undergoes expansion. So, finally, after about eight or nine billion years of space’s expanding, the dark energy became an influential factor in accelerating this expansion, and it is becoming more and more significant. Dark energy goes by other names: vacuum energy and the cosmological constant. It is not known whether it is the energy of space itself or of a particle within space.

The initial evidence for this dark energy came from observations in 1998 of Doppler shifts of supernovas. These are best explained by the assumption that distances between supernovas are increasing at an accelerating rate. Because of this rate increase, it is estimated that the volume of the universe will double every 1010 years, and any galaxy cluster that is now 100 light-years away from our Milky Way will, in another 13.8 billion years, be more than 200 light-years away and will be moving much faster away from us. Eventually, it will be moving so fast away from us that it will become invisible. In enough time, all galaxies other than the Milky Way will become invisible. Eventually, all the stars in the Milky Way will become invisible. Astronomers are never going to see more than they see now.

Regarding the universe’s expansion, it should be noted that atoms are not currently expanding. They are held together tightly by the electromagnetic force and strong force (with a little help from the weak force and gravity) which overpower the repulsive force of dark energy or whatever it is that is causing the expansion of space. What is expanding now is the average distances between clusters of galaxies. It is as if the clusters are exploding away from each other, and, in the future, they will be very much farther away from each other. Eventually, though, if the rate of expansion of space were to increase fast enough, then galaxies will be torn apart, then all solar systems, and ultimately even molecules and atoms and all other systems of elementary particles. This futuristic scenario is called the Big Rip.

Why does the big bang theory say space exploded instead of saying matter-energy exploded into a pre-existing space? This is a subtle issue. If it had said matter-energy exploded but space did not, then there would be uncomfortable questions: Where is the point in space that it exploded from, and why that point? Picking one would be arbitrary. And there would be these additional uncomfortable questions: How large is this pre-existing space? When was it created? During the big bang’s explosion, experimental observations clearly indicate that the clusters of galaxies separate from each other faster than the speed of light, but adding that they do this because they are moving that fast within a pre-existing space would require an ad hoc change to the theory of relativity to make exceptions to Einstein’s speed limit. So, it is much more “comfortable” to say the big bang is an explosion of space or spacetime, not of matter-energy.

Because the big bang is an explosion of space and not of matter-energy into a pre-existing space, and because an expansion of space carries all its objects with it, the separation between some galaxies after the big bang surely increased faster than the speed of light. Even today, the separation between the Milky Way and some other galaxies is increasing faster than the speed of light. Nevertheless, in our universe, nothing is passing, or ever has passed, or will pass anything at faster than the speed of light; so, in that sense, light speed is still our cosmic speed limit.

Regarding this speed limit, if two firecrackers pass each other at nearly the speed of light and ignite just as they pass, their flashes will reach any other place in the universe at the same time, although the flashes will arrive with different colors.

The term “our observable universe” and the synonymous term “our Hubble bubble,” refer to everything that a person on Earth could in principle observe. However, there are distant places in our observable universe in which an astronomer there could see things that we Earth astronomers could not see, because they are closer to those objects than we are. Physicists are agreed that, because of this reasoning, there exist objects that are in the universe but not in our observable universe. Because those unobservable objects are the product of our big bang, cosmologists assume that the unobservable objects are similar to the observable objects—that those objects form atoms and galaxies, and that time behaves there as it does here. But there is no guarantee this convenient assumption is a correct assumption. If the multiverse theory were to be correct, then there would be bubbles beyond the observable universe that are very different than our Hubble bubble.

Because the big bang happened about 14 billion years ago, you would think at first that no visible object can be more than 14 billion light-years from Earth, but this would be a mistake. Spatial separation in the universe is allowed to be faster than the speed of light, despite relativity theory. The increasing separation of clusters of galaxies over the last 14 billion years is why astronomers can see about 45 billion light-years in any direction and not just 14 billion light-years.

When contemporary physicists speak of the age of our universe and of the time since our big bang, they are implicitly referring to cosmic time in the cosmic frame. This is time measured in a unique reference frame in which the average motion of the galaxies is stationary. [Other assumptions are that a clock measuring cosmic time is experiencing the typical gravitational field of the universe, and that the observable universe, including all the galaxies and the background microwave radiation from the big bang, is approximately the same everywhere (that is, it is homogeneous) and the same in any direction (that is, it is isotropic at the spatial origin of the frame).] This frame is not one in which the Earth is stationary. To say all this more simplistically, cosmic time is time as measured locally by a clock that is sitting as still as possible while the universe expands around it.

Let’s expand a bit more on the nature of cosmic time. It is very helpful in doing physics to adopt a convention that allows for a single reference frame in which any two events are forced either to be simultaneous or to be such that one of them happens before the other. For some spacetimes obeying the laws of general relativity, it is not always possible to do this. But with a spacetime having well-behaved curvature, it is possible to find a global reference frame, although it will be unusual. This special coordinate system needs to be very curvilinear as opposed to rectilinear and to be “patched” (in analogy to a quilt made of patches of cloth). In that reference system, curved spacetime is exhaustively partitioned into non-intersecting but “bumpy” (or curvy) three-dimensional sheets of simultaneous events, where each sheet is locally perpendicular to time-like geodesics. (Geodesics in spacetime are the free-fall worldlines.) The bumps are due to curvature associated with the presence of matter and energy. Using one of these very special coordinate systems, all the events in each, single sheet throughout the universe happen simultaneously—by convention. This sort of unusual reference system is usually adopted by cosmologists when they treat very distant events in space or time. It is called the cosmic frame.

For doing cosmology, the cosmic frame is the most useful frame. It fixes the spatial origin at a place where the light generated by the big bang arrives with about the same intensity and temperature from all directions. This light, which has been downgraded to heat by the time it reaches our solar system, is called the Cosmic Microwave Background Radiation. It first lit up the universe 380,000 years after the big bang. The cosmic frame’s temporal origin of t = 0 is at the beginning of the big bang event. Its cosmic time or cosmic coordinate time is the proper time elapsed along the worldline of a hypothetical object at rest in the frame. If an object is at rest at the origin in this frame, then the Cosmic Microwave Background Radiation looks about the same in any direction, and at a large scale the universe’s matter seems about uniformly distributed. It’s as if the galaxies are dust particles floating in a large room, and at the center of the room the distribution of dust in one direction is the same as in any other direction, and in any region of the room there is as much dust as in any other region.

The cosmic frame’s spatial origin point is described as follows:

In fact, it isn’t quite true that the cosmic background heat radiation is completely uniform across the sky. It is very slightly hotter (i.e., more intense) in the direction of the constellation of Leo than at right angles to it…. Although the view from Earth is of a slightly skewed cosmic heat bath, there must exist a motion, a frame of reference, which would make the bath appear exactly the same in every direction. It would in fact seem perfectly uniform from an imaginary spacecraft traveling at 350 km per second in a direction away from Leo (towards Pisces, as it happens)…. We can use this special clock to define a cosmic time…. Fortunately, the Earth is moving at only 350 km per second relative to this hypothetical special clock. This is about 0.1 percent of the speed of light, and the time-dilation factor is only about one part in a million. Thus to an excellent approximation, Earth’s historical time coincides with cosmic time, so we can recount the history of the universe contemporaneously with the history of the Earth, in spite of the relativity of time.

Similar hypothetical clocks could be located everywhere in the universe, in each case in a reference frame where the cosmic background heat radiation looks uniform. Notice I say “hypothetical”; we can imagine the clocks out there, and legions of sentient beings dutifully inspecting them. This set of imaginary observers will agree on a common time scale and a common set of dates for major events in the universe, even though they are moving relative to each other as a result of the general expansion of the universe…. So, cosmic time as measured by this special set of observers constitutes a type of universal time… (Davies 1995, pp. 128-9).

It is a convention that cosmologists agree to use the cosmic time of this special reference frame, but it is an interesting fact and not a convention that our universe is so organized that there is such a useful cosmic time available to be adopted by the cosmologists. Not all physically possible spacetimes obeying the laws of general relativity can have such a cosmic time.

a. Inflation

According to one of the more popular non-classical big bang theories, the so-called eternal inflation theory, the universe underwent an inflationary expansion soon after t = 0. It was a sudden expansion with an exponentially increasing rate for a very short time. It began for some unknown reason, perhaps due to quantum fluctuations of an inflaton field, and it stopped in our universe while continuing to inflate elsewhere. The inflation stopped, but the expansion did not; it continued at a slower rate. The universe today continues to expand as a consequence of this inflationary beginning.

During the first three-quarters of the twentieth century, it was commonly believed that the entire universe was created in the big bang, and time itself came into existence then. So, the day of the big bang was a day without a yesterday. Questions about what happened before the big bang were considered to be unscientific, like asking, “Which way is north of the North Pole?” However, with the appearance of the big bang theory of eternal inflation in the late 20th century, the question of what happened before our big bang has been resurrected as scientifically legitimate. Nevertheless, there is no consensus among cosmologists as to exactly what happened before the big bang.

The big bang theory is considered to be confirmed in astronomy, but the version called the theory of inflation is still unconfirmed. Here is the argument in favor of it, followed by an elaboration of its details. The cosmic microwave background radiation reaching Earth from all directions is on average the same cold temperature everywhere, about 2.725 degrees Kelvin or about minus 455 degrees Fahrenheit, but with small temperature differences in different directions on the order of a hundred-thousandth of a degree. Room temperature, by comparison, is 300 degrees Kelvin. The classical big bang theory can account for the number 2.725 but not for temperature’s uniformity in all directions at the largest scale nor for the slight deviations in uniformity in temperature on the order of a hundred-thousandth of a degree. The big bang theory of inflation can account for these cosmological features, and in the early 21st century, the vast majority of cosmologists say there are no better accounts. The claim that there are no better accounts is challenged in (Ijjas, et. al., 2017).

The theory of inflation postulates that extremely early in the big bang process there was exponential inflation of space, or perhaps a small patch of space, due to the presence of a gram of very dense material having negative pressure.

The primeval explosion was powered by energy that was predominantly negative and repulsive, perhaps the vacuum energy. Newton-style gravity (or energy) cannot be repulsive, but Einstein’s theory does not rule out repulsive gravity. The addition by Einstein of the so-called cosmological term to his equations allows for repulsive gravity. Einstein, however, did not consider the possibility of inflation.

Assuming the big bang began at time t = 0, then the epoch of inflation (the epoch of repulsive gravity or anti-gravity) began at about 10−36 seconds later and lasted until about t = 10−33 seconds, during which time the volume of space increased by a factor of at least 1078, and any initial unevenness in the distribution of energy was almost all smoothed out. Inflation does not violate Einstein’s general theory of relativity despite space’s expanding faster than the speed of light.

At the end of that inflationary epoch, the explosive material decayed for some unknown reason and left only normal matter with attractive gravity. This began the period of the so-called quark soup. At this time, our universe continued to expand, although now less rapidly. It went into its “coasting” phase. Regardless of any previous curvature in our universe, by the time the inflationary period ended, the overall structure of space had very little curvature, so it was extremely homogeneous, as is the universe we observe today in its largest scale. But at the very beginning of the inflationary period, there were some very tiny imperfections due to quantum fluctuations. The densest of these quantum fluctuations turned into what would eventually become galaxies, and these fluctuations have left their traces in the very slight hundred-thousandth of a degree differences in the temperature of the cosmic background radiation in different places.

Before inflation began, for some unknown reason the universe contained an unstable inflaton field or false vacuum field. This field underwent a spontaneous phase transition (somewhat analogous to superheated liquid water suddenly and spontaneously expanding into steam) causing its region of highly repulsive material to hyper-inflate exponentially in volume for a very short time. During this primeval inflationary epoch, the gravitational field’s stored, negative gravitational energy was rapidly released, and all space wildly expanded. At the end of this early inflationary epoch, the highly repulsive material decayed for some as yet unknown reason into ordinary matter and energy, and the universe’s expansion rate settled down to just below the rate of expansion observed in the universe today.

Guth described the inflationary period this way:

There was a period of inflation driven by the repulsive gravity of a peculiar kind of material that filled the early universe. Sometimes I call this material a “false vacuum,” but, in any case, it was a material which in fact had a negative pressure, which is what allows it to behave this way. Negative pressure causes repulsive gravity. Our particle physics tells us that we expect states of negative pressure to exist at very high energies, so we hypothesize that at least a small patch of the early universe contained this peculiar repulsive gravity material which then drove exponential expansion. Eventually, at least locally where we live, that expansion stopped because this peculiar repulsive gravity material is unstable; and it decayed, becoming normal matter with normal attractive gravity. At that time, the dark energy was there, the experts think. It has always been there, but it’s not dominant. It’s a tiny, tiny fraction of the total energy density, so at that stage at the end of inflation the universe just starts coasting outward. It has a tremendous outward thrust from the inflation, which carries it on. So, the expansion continues, and as the expansion happens the ordinary matter thins out. The dark energy, we think, remains approximately constant. If it’s vacuum energy, it remains exactly constant. So, there comes a time later where the energy density of everything else drops to the level of the dark energy, and we think that happened about five or six billion years ago. After that, as the energy density of normal matter continues to thin out, the dark energy [density] remains constant [and] the dark energy starts to dominate; and that’s the phase we are in now. We think about seventy percent or so of the total energy of our universe is dark energy, and that number will continue to increase with time as the normal matter continues to thin out.

World Science U Live Session: Alan Guth, published November 30, 2016 at https://www.youtube.com/watch?v=IWL-sd6PVtM.

Cosmologists actually know a bit more about the sequence of events at times close to t = 0. For example, before about t = 10-46 seconds, there was a single basic force rather than what we have now which are four separate basic forces: gravity, the strong nuclear force, the weak force, and the electromagnetic force. At about t = 10-46 seconds, the energy density of the primordial field was down to about 1015 GEV, which allowed spontaneous symmetry breaking (analogous to the spontaneous phase change in which steam cools enough to spontaneously change to liquid water); this phase change created the gravitational force as a separate basic force. The other three forces had not yet appeared as separate forces.

During the period of inflation, the universe (our bubble) expanded from the size of a proton to the size of a marble. Later at t = 10-12 seconds, there was more spontaneous symmetry breaking. First the strong nuclear force, and then the weak nuclear force and electromagnetic forces became separate forces. For the first time, the universe now had exactly four separate forces. At t = 10-10 seconds, the Higgs field turned on (that is, came into existence), and particles that now have mass began interacting with the field, which slowed these particles down from their previous light speed and thereby made them have mass.

Much of the considerable energy left over at the end of the inflationary period was converted into matter, antimatter, and radiation, such as quarks, antiquarks, and photons. The universe’s temperature escalated with this new radiation, and this period is called the period of cosmic reheating. Matter-antimatter pairs of particles combined and annihilated, removing the antimatter from the universe, and leaving a small amount of matter and even more radiation. At t = 10-6 seconds, quarks combined together and thereby created protons and neutrons. After t = 3 minutes, the universe had cooled sufficiently to allow these protons and neutrons to start combining strongly to produce hydrogen, deuterium, and helium nuclei. At about t = 380,000 years, the temperature was low enough for these nuclei to capture electrons and to form the initial hydrogen, deuterium, and helium atoms of the universe. With these first atoms coming into existence, the universe became transparent in the sense that light was now able to travel freely without always being absorbed very soon by surrounding particles. Due to the expansion of the universe, this early light is today much lower in frequency than it was 380,000 years ago; and so it is detected on Earth as the cosmic microwave background radiation and not as ordinary light. This microwave radiation is almost homogenous and almost isotropic. The energy is still arriving at the Earth’s surface from all directions.

In the literature in both physics and philosophy, descriptions of the big bang often speak of it as if it were the first event, but the theory does not require there to be a first event. This description mentioning the first event is a philosophical position, not something demanded by the scientific evidence. Physicists James Hartle and Stephen Hawking considered the past cosmic time-interval to be open rather than closed at t = 0. This means that looking back to the big bang is like following the positive real numbers back to ever-smaller positive numbers without ever reaching the smallest positive one. If Hartle and Hawking are correct that time is actually like this, then the big bang had no initial point event or initial time.

The classical big bang theory is based on the assumption that the universal expansion of clusters of galaxies can be projected all the way back to a singularity, a zero volume, at t = 0. Yet physicists agree that the projection must become untrustworthy in the Planck epoch before exponential expansion began. Current science cannot speak with confidence about the nature of time within this tiny Planck epoch nor before t=0. If a theory of quantum gravity does get confirmed, it is expected to provide more reliable information about the Planck epoch, and it may even allow physicists to answer the questions, “What caused the big bang?” and “Did anything happen before then?”

b. Eternal Inflation and the Multiverse

Most of the big bang inflationary theories are theories of eternal inflation, of the eternal creation of more and more expanding bubbles of earlier material, each bubble being a universe. Our own bubble is called the Hubble Bubble. Our visible universe is just one of these expanding bubbles. This is the multiverse theory of eternal inflation. The original theory of inflation was created by Guth in 1981, and the multiverse theory of eternal inflation was created by Gott, Linde, and Vilenkin in the early 1980s. These theories are controversial.

According to the multiverse theory, because most pairs of universes usually occur space-like separated from each other, it is not strictly correct to say the multiple bangs are ordered in time. We cannot make clear sense of these universes occurring before or after each other within the multiverse, although this way of speaking is compelling. Also, in some of these universes, there is no time dimension at all.

Could the expansion of our universe eventually slow down? Yes. Could the expansion of the multiverse eventually slow down? No. The primordial or earlier explosive material in any single universe decays quickly, but as it decays the part that has not decayed becomes much larger and so the expansion of the multiverse continues. The rate of creation of new bubble universes is increasing exponentially.

Other implications of eternal inflation are that (i) everything that can happen will happen, (ii) the multiverse can have no maximum entropy, and (iii) the universe is never a fixed, finite system of particles so there are no Poincaré cycles requiring the universe to return infinitesimally close to every one of its earlier states.

More speculatively, perhaps the theory of inflation is incorrect because our universe never underwent a period of early hyperinflation but instead is almost a mirror image of an antimatter universe extending backward in time before the big bang.

Because of the lack of experimental evidence for this mirror theory, and the multiverse theories, and the theory of inflation, many physicists complain that their fellow physicists who are developing these theories are doing technical metaphysical speculation, not physics. However, physics is whatever physicists do; and experimental evidence might someday be obtainable since the theory is in principle falsifiable.

3. Infinite Time

clockIs time infinitely divisible? Yes, because general relativity theory and quantum theory require time to be a continuum. But this answer will change to “no” if these theories are eventually replaced by a Core Theory that quantizes time. “Although there have been suggestions that spacetime may have a discrete structure,” Stephen Hawking said in 1996, “I see no reason to abandon the continuum theories that have been so successful.” Two decades later, physicists were much less sure.

Will there be an infinite amount of time in the future and was there an infinite amount in the past? Scientists are not sure.

Inside any black hole, future time ends; see the supplement to the main “Time” article for details. But what about outside all black holes in the normal part of the universe? According to a popular cosmological theory, the Big Chill Theory, the universe’s expansion will continue forever because the dark energy will not disappear, and it is what causes the expansion of the universe. So, forever there will be new events produced from old events. But there is no solid consensus on this. According to the Big Chill Theory, the last star will burn out in 1015 years. Then all the stars and dust in each galaxy will fall into black holes, and then the material between galaxies will fall in as well, and finally in about 10100 years all the black holes will evaporate, leaving only a soup of elementary particles that gets “chillier” and less dense as the universe’s expansion continues. Future space will look more and more like empty space, but because of vacuum energy, the temperature will only approach, but never reach, zero (on the Kelvin scale).

Regarding past time, the classical big bang theory implies the universe began a finite time ago at a singularity called the big bang. The idea of such a singularity is inconsistent with quantum mechanics. The big bounce theory implies that there was time before immediately before the supposed singularity during which the universe was compressing until, when it got small enough, bounced into an expansion state, and this point is what we call our big bang event. There is no consensus about whether this prior time was finite or infinite, but there has been much interesting speculation. Here is a taste:

Alan Guth believes the universe is eternal and had no beginning because there was and will be an infinite series of big bounces followed by big bangs.

According to (Carroll 2016, pp. 197-199),

If the universe had a nonzero amount of some conserved quantity like energy or charge, it couldn’t have an earliest moment in time—and still obey the laws of physics. The first moment of such a universe would be one in which energy or charge existed without any previous existence, which is against the rules.

What if, instead, the total is exactly zero? In this second scenario, the energy of all the gravitational forces is negative and could exactly cancel the positive energy of the universe’s mass. In this scenario, temporal change is not fundamental but is a higher-level emergent feature. The universe in this zero-sum scenario is fundamentally a superposition of all individual moments as described by the timeless version of the Schrödinger equation, namely the Wheeler-DeWitt equation. Probably there are only a finite number of these moments, and this implies that the past and future are finite. Experts disagree on which of the two scenarios is the most likely, but there is a bit more support for the nonzero-sum scenario, which requires time to be infinite.

Here is more commentary about this from Carroll (2016, pp. 197-8):

There are two possibilities: one where the universe is eternal, one where it had a beginning. That’s because the Schrodinger equation of quantum mechanics turns out to have two very different kinds of solutions, corresponding to two different kinds of universe.

One possibility is that time is fundamental, and the universe changes as time passes. In that case, the Schrödinger equation is unequivocal: time is infinite. If the universe truly evolves, it always has been evolving and always will evolve. There is no starting and stopping. There may have been a moment that looks like our Big Bang, but it would have only been a temporary phase, and there would be more universe that was there even before the event.

The other possibility is that time is not truly fundamental, but rather emergent. Then, the universe can have a beginning. The Schrödinger equation has solutions describing universes that don’t evolve at all: they just sit there, unchanging.

…And if that’s true, then there’s no problem at all with there being a first moment in time. The whole idea of “time” is just an approximation anyway.

Back to the main “Time” article.

Author Information

Bradley Dowden
Email: dowden@csus.edu
California State University, Sacramento
U. S. A.