This supplement reveals more about what science requires of physical time, and it provides background information about many of the topics discussed in the Time article.
Table of Contents
- What Are Durations, Instants, Moments, and Points of Time?
- What Is an Event?
- What Is a Reference Frame?
- What Is an Inertial Frame?
- What Is Spacetime?
- What Is a Minkowski Diagram?
- What Are Time’s Metric and Spacetime’s Interval?
- Does the Theory of Relativity Imply Time Is Partly Space?
- Is Time the Fourth Dimension?
- Is There More Than One Kind of Physical Time?
- How Is Time Relative to the Observer?
- What Is the Relativity of Simultaneity?
- What Is the Conventionality of Simultaneity?
- What Is the Difference between the Past and the Absolute Past?
- What Is Time Dilation?
- How Does Gravity Affect Time?
- What Happens to Time near a Black Hole?
- What Is the Solution to the Twins Paradox (the Twin Paradox)?
- What Is the Solution to Zeno’s Paradoxes?
- How Do Time Coordinates Get Assigned to Points of Spacetime?
- How Do Dates Get Assigned to Actual Events?
- What Is Essential to Being a Clock?
- What Does It Mean for a Clock to Be Accurate?
- What Is Our Standard Clock?
- Why Are Some Standard Clocks Better than Others?
- What Is a Field?
A duration is a measure of elapsed time. It is a number with a unit. The second is the agreed-upon standard unit for the measurement of duration in the S.I. system (the International Systems of Units, that is, Le Système International d’Unités). How to define a second is discussed later in this supplement.
Geologists prefer to mark off durations in larger units than seconds, such as epochs, periods, eras, and, largest of all, eons. Some physicists might prefer a unit much smaller than a second, such as a nanosecond, which is a billionth of a second, or a jiffy, which is the time it takes light to travel one centimeter in a vacuum.
In informal conversation, an instant or moment is a very short duration. In physics, however, an instant is even shorter. It is instantaneous; it has zero duration. This is probably what the poet T.S. Eliot was thinking of when he said, “History is a pattern of timeless moments.” Instants don’t last long enough to have a finite duration.
We correctly speak of a segment of a line and an interval of numbers, but not a segment of numbers. Regarding time, there is no standard terminology about whether to say interval of time or period of time, although the latter is more popular. The measure of a period of time is called a “duration” and it always needs a unit. “4” is not a duration, but “4 hours” is. The term “interval” in the phrase “spacetime interval” is a different kind of interval.
There is another sense of the word “instant” and of “moment” which means, not duration, but rather a time, as when we say it happened at that instant or at that moment. Midnight could be such an instant or moment. In this sense of the word “moment,” a determinist will say the state of the universe at one moment determines the state of the universe at another moment.
It is assumed in physics that any duration is always a linear continuum of the points of time that compose it; but it is an interesting philosophical question to ask how physicists know it is a continuum. Nobody could ever measure time that finely, even indirectly. Points of time cannot be detected. But given what we know about time, we should not be trying to detect them.
Belief in the existence of points of time is justified holistically by appealing to how they contribute to scientific success, that is, to how the points give our science extra power to explain, describe, predict, and enrich our understanding. But, to justify belief in the existence of points, we also need confidence that our science would lose too many of these virtues without the points.
Consider what a point in time really is. Any interval of time is a physical model of a segment of the real numbers in their normal order. So, each instant corresponds to just one real number and vice versa. To say this again in other words, time is a line-like structure on sets of events. Just as the real numbers are an actually infinite set of decimal numbers that can be linearly ordered by the less-than relation, so time is an actually infinite set of instants or instantaneous moments that can be linearly ordered by the happens-before relation in a reference frame. An instant can be thought of as a set of simultaneous events in a reference frame.
There is a deep philosophical dispute about whether points of time actually exist, just as there is a similar dispute about whether spatial points actually exist. The dispute began when Plato said, “[T]his queer thing, the instant, …occupies no time at all….” (Plato 1961, p. 156d). Some philosophers wish to replace instants and points with intervals. It is definitely the case that there is no physically possible way to measure that the time is exactly noon even if it is true that the time is noon. Noon is 12 to an infinite number of decimal places, but no measuring apparatus is infinitely precise.
The philosopher Michael Dummett, in (Dummett 2000), said time is not made of point instants but rather is a composition of overlapping non-zero intervals. Dummett required the endpoints of those intervals to be the initiation and termination of actual physical processes. This idea of treating time without instants develops a 1936 proposal of Bertrand Russell and Alfred North Whitehead. The central philosophical issue about Dummett’s treatment of motion is whether its adoption would negatively affect other areas of mathematics and science. It is likely that it would. For the history of the dispute between advocates of instants and intervals, see (Øhrstrøm and Hasle 1995).
Another issue about points of time reflects the dispute between the A-theorists and the B-theorists mentioned in the main Time article. If x and y are points in time, could they change temporal locations? Or could each always have been when the other is? Obviously not, says Peter Van Inwagen; obviously yes, says the typical B-theorist.
In ordinary discourse, an event is a happening lasting a finite duration during which some object changes its properties. For example, this morning’s event of buttering the toast is the toast’s changing from having the property of being unbuttered to having the property of being buttered.
The philosopher Jaegwon Kim suggested that an event should be defined as an object’s having a property at a time. So, two events are the same if they are both events of the same object having the same property at the same time. This suggestion captures much of our informal concept of event, but with Kim’s suggestion it is difficult to make sense of the remark, “The vacation event could have started an hour earlier.” On Kim’s analysis, the vacation event could not have started earlier because, if it did, it would be a different event. A possible-worlds analysis of events might be the way to solve this problem of change.
Physicists prefer to speak of point events. These are events located at a point of spacetime. A point event is the value of some property such as mass or velocity at a point in spacetime. A point of spacetime is specified uniquely by its four coordinate numbers, three spatial coordinates and one time coordinate. The point event is fundamental in the sense that, to a physicist, any object is just a series of its point events. To a physicist, the process of a ball’s falling is an infinite series of point events each of which is the ball’s having a certain height.
Let’s distinguish a physical space from a mathematical space. Mathematical space is a collection of points, and these points need not represent points in any real, physical space. Depending on the mathematical space, a point might represent anything. For example, a point in a two-dimensional mathematical space might be an ordered-pair consisting of an item’s sales price in dollars and a salesperson’s name. This is not a continuous space; the fundamental theories of physics imply physical space is continuous.
The physicists’ notion of point event is metaphysically unacceptable to some philosophers, in part because it deviates so much from the way the word “event” is used in ordinary language (and in our manifest image). For other philosophers, it is unacceptable because of its size, its infinitesimal size. In 1936, in order to avoid point events altogether, Bertrand Russell and A. N. Whitehead developed a theory of time that is based on the assumption that all events in spacetime have a finite, non-zero duration. They believed this definition of an event is closer to our common sense, our manifest image, our informal beliefs. Unfortunately, they had to assume that any finite part of an event is an event, and this assumption indirectly appeals to the concept of the infinitesimal and so is no closer to common sense than the physicist’s assumption that all events are composed of point events.
McTaggart argued early in the twentieth century that events change. For example, he said the event of Queen Anne’s death is changing because it is receding ever farther into the past as time goes on. Many other philosophers (those of the so-called B-camp) believe it is improper to consider an event to be something that can change, and that the error is in not using the word “change” properly. This is still an open question in philosophy, but physicists generally use the term “event” as the B-theorists do, namely as something that does not change.
For a more detailed discussion of what an event is, see the article on Events.
The notion of a reference frame is modern; Newton did not know about reference frames. A reference frame is a standard point of view or a perspective that is usually intended to be used for making quantitative measurements and judgments about places in the space and the phenomena that take place there. To be suited for these purposes, a reference frame needs to be specified by (or augmented by—the experts are ambiguous about this) choosing a coordinate system and by specifying its origin and orientation in the space. Coordinate systems assign a set of labels to each point in space. The best labels are usually real numbers, or, if the spacetime has two dimensions, then ordered pairs of real numbers, and if three dimensions, then ordered triples of real numbers, and so forth.
You, yourself, are not in all reference frames. You are not in the reference frame of the two-dimensional abstract space that maps the price of rice in China against years of the 19th century. Let’s focus, though, on the reference frames for physical space and physical spacetime. A frame for the physical space in which you have zero velocity is called your rest frame or proper frame. (The word reference is often dropped from the phrase reference frame.)
When choosing to place a frame upon a space, there are an infinite number of legitimate choices, but choosing a good frame can make a situation much easier to describe. For example, if you are trying to describe the motion of a car down a fairly straight highway, you would not want to choose a frame in which a carousel spinning next to the road is considered to be motionless in the frame. Instead, choose a frame fixed to the highway or else fixed to the car. Choosing a reference frame attached to the carousel would not be incorrect, just very inconvenient.
There are an infinite number of legitimate choices of frames, but a frame in which your shooting a gun is simultaneous with the bullet hitting a target is not legitimate. Frames need to honor cause and effect.
A coordinate system for physical space is (normally) a continuous labeling of the points. For our region of interest in three-dimensional space, often the simplest coordinate system to choose is Cartesian. In a Cartesian coordinate system there are three mutually perpendicular space axes x, y, and z intersecting at a certain place, called the origin, and all the axes have a certain fixed orientation relative to some direction or to some pair of physical objects. For example, we might orient the z axis by saying it points up, while the x axis points forward along the highway, and the y axis is perpendicular to the other two axes and points across the highway.
If we are dealing with spacetime rather than merely space, then we would add a t axis for the time coordinates, and say t=0 when a certain noteworthy event occurs such as the firing of a starter pistol, and we would orient the t axis by saying the value of t along the axis is, say, the value shown on our civilization’s standard clock with its origin event that occurs at t=0. There are two important constraints on the choice of coordinate system for a reference frame involving time. Simultaneous events must be assigned the same time coordinate. If two events have values of their coordinates that are very close together mathematically, then the events themselves occur very close in time. Treating time this way as a special dimension is called spatializing time, and doing this is what makes time precisely describable in a way that treating time only as becoming does not. It is a major reason why mathematical physics can be mathematical.
Practically, a reference frame for a physical space is often specified by selecting a solid object that does not normally change its size and by saying that the reference frame’s origin is fixed to the object—which is equivalent to saying the object is stationary. We might select a reference frame fixed to the Rock of Gibraltar, and say the rock is at the origin where the axes cross each other at <0,0,0,0>. Another object is said to be at rest in this reference frame if it remains at a constant distance in a fixed direction from the Rock of Gibraltar. When we say the Sun rose this morning, we are implicitly choosing a reference frame fixed to the Earth’s surface. The Sun is not at rest in this reference frame, but the Earth is.
When one speaks of “the” reference frame of an observer, one means some intended frame in which the observer’s speed is zero.
The reference frame will specify locations, and this is normally done by choosing a coordinate system that spans the space, that is, assigns coordinate numbers to all points of the space. These are names of the points.
Reference frames may be global or local. A global frame describes motion over all of the spacetime; a local frame describes spacetime only close to the center of the frame. A global frame spans the space.
To keep track of four-dimensional events rather than simply three-dimensional objects, the analyst will replace a three-dimensional mathematical space with a four-dimensional mathematical space in which two point-events are identical if they occur at the same point place and also at the same point of time. Polar or hyperspherical or other coordinate systems are not discussed in this article.
The coordinates of a reference frame’s coordinate system could be finite strings of letters of the alphabet, but real numbers are usually the best choice if the purpose of the coordinate system is to allow measurement. A coordinate such as “bmaaarirc” for a specific point would name or specify the point, but would contain no information about where one point is located in relation to another point, nor how far away one point is from another. A better naming operation can provide this information. Regardless of the number of dimensions, if we want to measure, then we should require of our reference frame that nearby points be named with nearby tuples of numbers, one number for each of the dimensions, and that any continuous change along a path between two points be reflected in a continuous change of the coordinates of those points. That is why we require that the names of points be real numbers—more specifically an ordered n-tuple of real numbers for a space of n dimensions. Often we prefer rectilinear coordinates to curvilinear coordinates; that is, we prefer that the coordinate curves along one dimension be straight and at right angles to coordinate lines along all other dimensions, so that we can make use of the Pythagorean Theorem in computations of distances; thus we prefer the familiar Euclidean coordinate system for 3D space when we can.
A smooth space of any number of dimensions is called a manifold. Newtonian mechanics, special relativity, general relativity, and quantum mechanics assume the set of all events forms a four-dimensional manifold. What it means to be four-dimensional is that events can be specified with four independent, real numbers. If the space curves, then the structure of these quadruples of numbers cannot be described with a Cartesian coordinate system. The Pythagorean Theorem fails. Only Euclidean space can have Cartesian coordinates everywhere. A real, physical space obeying general relativity will be curved and so cannot have a Cartesian coordinate system except infinitesimally, in the sense that the deviations from Euclidean geometry get smaller as the region gets smaller. It follows that one can always find a local inertial frame in curved spacetime, but not a global one. Also, if somewhere within a region of space some of the triangles are odd because the sum of their interior angles is not exactly 180 degrees, then this is a sure sign the space curves there.
In special relativity, space is Euclidean and spacetime is not Euclidean; it is Minkowskian. In general relativity with masses existing and spacetime and space both curving, then neither space nor spacetime is Euclidean.
A curved coordinate system is used for curved spacetime. A sphere’s surface is a two-dimensional space that requires selecting a curvilinear coordinate system in which the axes curve [as viewed from a higher-dimensional space] and so are not Cartesian. To cover all of curved four-dimensional spacetime which can have different curvature in different regions, one must make do with covering different regions of spacetime with different coordinate patches (called charts) that are “knitted together” where one patch meets another. Any curved spacetime can be covered in this way with a single, global coordinate system in which every point is uniquely identified with a set of four numbers in a continuous way.
Informally, to find out how many dimensions space has, one would identify the maximum number of sticks that can be made mutually perpendicular. A dimension of a space is a kind of path in a certain direction in that space, and a coordinate for that dimension is a number that serves as a location along that path. In creating reference frames for n-dimensional spaces, the usual assumption is that in order to specify a location we should supply n independent numbers, where n is a positive integer. This is usual but not required; instead, we could exploit the idea that there are space-filling curves that permit a single continuous curve to completely fill, and thus coordinatize, a region of any dimension higher than one. For this reason (namely, that each point in n-dimensional space does not always need n numbers to uniquely name the point), the contemporary definition of “dimension” must be rather exotic and is not explained in this article. Choosing a space-filling curve as a coordinate axis is almost always a bad choice because nearby points won’t usually have nearby coordinates, and the usual tools of mathematical physics won’t be applicable.
Given an event, it may have one coordinate in one coordinate system, but a different coordinate in a different coordinate system. If there exist equations telling how points change their coordinates between the two different reference frames, then there exist “transformation equations” for the pair of systems.
Physicists distinguish the past from the absolute past. Being in the absolute past is a frame-independent notion, but merely being in the past is not. Event x is in the past of event y if and only if (abbreviated “iff”) x happens before y. Event x is in the absolute past of event y iff, in all frames of reference, x happens before y. Event x is in the absolute past of y iff x could have causally influenced y iff an unhindered light beam from x could have reached y. According to relativity theory, if in some reference frame two different events x and y are simultaneous, then there is another frame in which they are not simultaneous.
Section 20 offers more discussion of reference frames. Inertial frames are very special reference frames.
Inertial reference frames do not exist for the whole of our spacetime, but some limited regions of reality can have frames that are almost inertial frames. In an inertial frame, any two moving objects that move in parallel and coast along with no outside forces on them, will remain parallel forever. Not so for non-inertial frames because of space’s curvature. A reference frame moving at constant velocity relative to an inertial frame is also an inertial frame.
Some of the same points above can be made in other words. An inertial frame is a reference frame whose coordinate curves associated with the time variable are straight lines. For example, if points are identified via the four coordinates (x,y,z,t), and the values of the spatial coordinates x, y and z are fixed while t varies, then the resulting curve in the coordinate system is straight. A reference frame for the whole universe could be an inertial frame if the universe were empty of mass and energy, or if these had a highly symmetrical distribution. The real universe does not have these features.
If you want to describe correctly the behavior of a car driving along a straight road, then you will have to introduce strange forces if you select a reference frame fixed to a spinning top, or a reference frame accelerating in relation to the road, because these reference frames are not inertial. It is much better to choose a frame fixed to the road or fixed to the car because those frames can be considered to be inertial frames if the region is small enough and the car’s speed is slow compared to light speed. For descriptions in outer space, a coordinate frame fixed on the distant stars and describing phenomena far from any of those stars, and far from planets, or other massive objects, is very nearly an inertial frame, too.
Any spacetime obeying the general theory of relativity will be locally Minkowskian, which implies that any infinitesimal region of spacetime has an inertial frame obeying the principles of special relativity. But larger regions won’t have an inertial frame, and this makes doing accurate physics more complicated.
Spacetime can be considered to be the set of locations of all events, or it can be considered to be a field where events are located. Either way, it is a combination of space and time. A four-dimensional spacetime has a single time dimension and three space dimensions. According to relativity theory, spacetime’s geometry can be non-Euclidean, and spacetime is said to curve wherever it deviates from having a Euclidean geometry.
Hermann Minkowski, in 1908, was the first person to say that spacetime is fundamental and that space and time are just aspects of spacetime. And he was the first to say different reference frames will divide spacetime differently into a time part and a space part, yet no reference frame is any more correct than another.
The force of gravity over time is actually manifested as the curvature of spacetime:
Gravity is not a force that propagates through space but a feature of spacetime itself. When you throw a ball high into the air, it arcs back to the ground because Earth distorts the spacetime around it, so that the paths of the ball and the ground intersect again. — George Musser, physicist
Spacetime is dynamic and not static; that is, its structure, such as its geometry, changes over time as the distribution of matter-energy changes. In special relativity and in Newton’s theory, spacetime is not dynamic.
There have been serious attempts to construct theories of physics in which spacetime is a product of more basic entities. The primary aim of these new theories is to unify relativity with quantum theory. So far these theories have not stood up to any empirical observations or experiments that could show them to be superior to the presently accepted theories. So, for the present, the concept of spacetime remains fundamental.
The metaphysical question of whether spacetime is a substantial object or a relationship among events, or neither, is considered in the discussion of the relational theory of time. For other philosophical questions about what spacetime is, see What is a Field?
A spacetime diagram is a graphical representation of the point-events in spacetime. These diagrams can be used for Newtonian mechanics just as well as for special or general relativity theory. A Minkowski spacetime diagram is a representation of a spacetime obeying the laws of special relativity (but not necessarily general relativity). All three theories have different geometries. Only in the geometry of general relativity can spacetime curve.
Here is an example of a three-dimensional Minkowski spacetime diagram containing two spatial dimensions (axes) and a vertical time dimension (axis) with the forward and backward light cones meeting at the event of a point-sized OBSERVER at one point in time:
Attribution: Stib at en.wikipedia, CC BY-SA 3.0, Link
In a Minkowski spacetime diagram, normally a rectangular coordinate system is used, the time axis is shown vertically, and one or two of the spatial axes are suppressed (that is, not included). A flash of light in a vacuum has a perfectly straight-line representation if the diagram has only one spatial dimension, but it is has a cone-shaped representation if the diagram has two spatial dimensions. Normally, the units of the time coordinate are years, and the units of any spatial coordinates are light-years. The speed of light is one light-year per year. A light-year is not a time; it is a very long distance. The choice of units for the axes is important because, if the units for distance were meters instead of light-years, all those light cones would look like thin, horizontal pancakes.
Below is an example of a Minkowski diagram having only one space dimension, so any forward light cone is shaped like the letter “V”:
The Minkowski diagram above represents a point-sized Albert Einstein standing still midway between two special places, places where there is an instantaneous flash of light. The directed arrows represent the path of the four light rays from the flashes. In a Minkowski diagram, a physical point-object is not represented as occupying a point but as occupying a line containing all the spacetime points at which it exists. That line is called the worldline of the object. Accelerating objects have worldlines that are not straight. A worldline of any point-object is a continuous, one-dimensional curve in spacetime.
Events on the same horizontal line of the Minkowski diagram are simultaneous in the reference frame. The more tilted an object’s worldline is from the vertical, the faster the object is moving. Given the units chosen for the diagram, no worldline can tilt up more than 45 degrees, which is the worldline of a photon, or else it would be a tachyon. A tachyon is an object that moves faster than the cosmic speed limit c, which is also the speed of light in a vacuum.
In the above diagram, Einstein’s worldline is straight, indicating no total external force is acting on him. If an object’s worldline meets another object’s worldline, then the two objects collide.
The set of all possible photon histories or light-speed worldlines going through a specific point event defines the two light cones of that event: its past light cone and its future light cone. The future cone is called a “cone” because, if the spacetime diagram were to have two space dimensions, then light emitted from a flash would spread out in the two dimensions of space in a circle of ever-growing diameter, producing a cone shape. In a diagram for three-dimensional space, the light wavefront is an expanding sphere and not an expanding cone, but sometimes physicists will informally still speak of the “cone.” Every different point in spacetime has its own two light cones. The light cone structure is an objective feature of spacetime, unlike such things as simultaneity and duration, which are relative to the choice of a reference frame.
The future light cone of the single flash event is defined to be all the spacetime events reached by the light emitted from the flash. A pair of events inside the same light cone are events such that in principle the earlier one could have affected the later one; we say the events are causally-connectible, and the relation between the events is said to be time-like. This means that a body could travel between the two events without ever exceeding the speed of light. If you were once located in spacetime at, say <x,y,z,t>, then for the rest of your life you cannot affect or participate in any event that occurs outside of the light cone whose apex is at <x,y,z,t>. Light cones are a helpful tool because different observers or different frames of reference will agree on the light cone of any event, and they will agree on which events are in which light cones. The light-cone structure of spacetime is not affected by a change of reference frame.
Inertial motion produces a straight worldline. If at some time Einstein were to jump on a train moving by at constant speed, then his worldline would, from that time onward, tilt away from the vertical and form some angle less than 45 degrees with the time axis.
Special relativity does not allow a worldline to be circular, or a closed curve, since the traveller would have to approach infinite speed at the top of the circle and at the bottom.
Not all spacetimes can be given Minkowski diagrams, but any spacetime satisfying Einstein’s Special Theory of Relativity can. Einstein’s Special Theory falsely presupposes that physical processes, such as gravitational processes, have no effect on the structure of spacetime. When attention needs to be given to the real effect of these processes on the structure of spacetime, that is, when general relativity needs to be used, then Minkowski diagrams become inappropriate for spacetime. General relativity assumes that the geometry of spacetime is locally Minkowskian but not globally. That is, spacetime is locally flat in the sense that in any very small region one always finds spacetime to be 4-D Minkowskian (which is 3-D Euclidean for space but not 4-D Euclidean for spacetime). When we say spacetime is curved and not flat, we mean it deviates from 4-D Minkowskian geometry.
A Minkowski spacetime with three spatial dimensions and a single time dimension does its best to treat time as a dimension of space, but Minkowski spacetime is radically different than a Euclidean space with four dimensions. This difference shows up in the fact that its metric (and the topology based on the metric) is very unlike that of the metric of a Euclidean four-space because its time dimension is in many ways not like a space dimension, as is shown in the next section.
A spacetime interval is a measure of separation in spacetime between two point-events. The metric is the interval between any pair of point events that are infinitesimally close to each other. The interval between two points can be zero even when the two points are very far from each other.
Think of the metric as a very special field on the manifold (that is, the space), that tells you at each point, if you had an infinitesimally small segment there, how long it is. Then you can use this information and some calculus manipulations to compute the interval between any two points in the manifold even if the two are not infinitesimally close to each other. The fancy name for this very special field is the Riemannian metric tensor field. That is what you know when you know the metric of spacetime. The information in the metric also will tell you how to compute the curvature at any point.
Below, we will look at a simple metric in flat space obeying the laws of the special theory of relativity. We will not mention tensors or curvature. The special theory of relativity does not allow space to curve; that is why our space is flat space.
The metric for a spacetime says how infinitesimal increments of the interval are determined by coordinate differentials. Specifically, if the coordinate differences are written as the 4-tuple (dt, dx, dy, dz), then the metric ds is a spacetime obeying the special theory of relativity is defined to be
ds2 = dt2 − (dx2 + dy2 + dz2).
ds2 is a standard abbreviation for (ds)2.
The interval for time rather than spacetime is called the duration, and is the interval between time coordinates. It tells us how much time there is between one point of time and another. If two point-events occur in the same place, then dx, dy, and dz are zero. Using the metric information, then taking the square root of both sides of the equation, and using a bit of calculus, we can compute the time interval between two points a and b. Here is the duration t between time coordinate a and time coordinate b:
t(a,b) = |b – a|
|b – a| is the absolute value of the difference between the real-valued time coordinates b and a, assuming all times are specified in the same units, say, seconds.
This equation shows how one should use a clock to tell the duration between any two events that occur at the same place. For example, the duration between the event of the clock displaying two and the event of the clock displaying five is |5 – 2|, namely 3. There are no units. 3 what? The units need to be specified, and this will depend on whether the clock readings are taken for, say, the second hand, the minute hand, or the hour hand.
The metric m(a,b) = |b – a| is the standardly accepted metric for time, but could we just as well have used half that absolute value, or the square root of the absolute value? Is one definition of the metric better than another? Philosophers are interested in the underlying issue of whether the choice of a metric is natural in the sense of being objective or whether its choice is a matter of convention.
Einstein’s theory requires that every non-accelerating observer agree on the same interval for every pair of point events, but there will not be general agreement on distances and durations. The fact that the interval is sensitive to both space and time is reflected in our comment earlier that, for any pair of point events happening in the same place, the interval is just the time duration between them, but for any pair of point events happening at the same time, the interval is the spatial distance between them. That is why distance in a Minkowski diagram usually does not correspond directly to distance in the space. Finally, any correct clock measures the interval along its spacetime trajectory. Two synchronized clocks will give the same reading if they are both stationary, but otherwise not. And the difference in their readings is said to be due to time dilation.
Because the spacetime interval between two different events can be zero even when the events are far apart in distance, the term “interval” is unlike what we normally mean by the term “distance.”
What if we turn now from special relativity to general relativity? Adding space and time dependence (particularly the values of mass-energy and momentum at points) to every term of the Lorentzian metric produces the metric for general relativity. That metric requires more complex tensor equations; these put a multiplication factor g in front of each of the products of the differential displacements such as (x’ – x)2 and (x’ – x)(y’ – y), and the mathematical difficulty of the description escalates.
For a helpful and more detailed presentation of the interval and the metric, see (Maudlin 2012), especially chapter 4.
In 1908, the mathematician Hermann Minkowski remarked that “Henceforth space by itself, and time by itself, are doomed to fade away into mere shadows, and only a kind of union of the two will preserve an independent reality.” Many people took this to mean that time is partly space, and vice versa. The philosopher C. D. Broad countered that the discovery of spacetime did not break down the distinction between time and space but only their independence or isolation. He argued that their lack of independence does not imply a lack of reality.
Nevertheless, there is a deep sense in which time and space are “mixed up” or linked. This is evident from the Lorentz transformations of special relativity that connect the time t in one inertial frame with the time t’ in another frame that is moving in the x-direction at a constant speed v. In this Lorentz equation, t’ is dependent upon the space coordinate x and the speed. In this way, time is not independent of either space or speed. Each frame has its own way of splitting up spacetime into its space part and its time part.
The reason why time is not partly space is that, within a single frame, time is always distinct from space. Time is a distinguished dimension of spacetime, not an arbitrary dimension. What being distinguished amounts to, speaking informally, is that when you set up a rectangular coordinate system on a spacetime with an origin at, say, some important event, you may point the x-axis east or north or up, but you may not point it forward in time—you may do that only with the t-axis, the time axis.
Yes and no; it depends on what you are talking about. Time is the fourth dimension of 4-d spacetime, but time is not the fourth dimension of physical space because that space has only three dimensions. In 4-d spacetime, the time dimension is special and differs from the other three dimensions because, to give just one reason, the time dimension has a direction and a space dimension does not.
Mathematicians have a broader notion of the term “space” than the average person. In their sense, a space need not consist of geographical locations. Not paying attention to the two meanings of the term “space” is the source of all the confusion about whether time is the fourth dimension.
Newton treated space as three dimensional and treated time as a separate one-dimensional space. He could have used Minkowski’s 1908 idea, if he had thought of it, namely the idea of treating spacetime as four-dimensional.
The mathematical space used by mathematical physicists to represent physical spacetime that obeys the laws of relativity is four-dimensional; and in that mathematical space, the space of places is a 3D sub-space, and time is another sub-space, a 1D one. Minkowski was the first person to construct such a mathematical space, although in 1895 H. G. Wells treated time informally as the fourth dimension in his novel The Time Machine.
For any coordinate system on spacetime, mathematicians of the early twentieth century believed it was necessary to treat a point event with at least four independent numbers in order to account for the four dimensionality of spacetime. Actually this appeal to the 19th-century definition of dimensionality, which is due to Bernhard Riemann, is not quite adequate because mathematicians have subsequently discovered how to assign each point on the plane to a point on the line without any two points on the plane being assigned to the same point on the line. The idea comes from the work of Georg Cantor. Because of this one-to-one correspondence between the plane’s points and the line’s points, the points on a plane could be specified with just one number instead of two. If so, then the line and plane must have the same dimensions according to the Riemann definition of dimension. To avoid this result, and to keep the plane being a 2D object, the notion of dimensionality of space has been given a new, but rather complex, definition.
Every reference frame on physical spacetime has its own physical time, but the question is intended in another sense. At present, physicists measure time electromagnetically. They define a standard atomic clock using periodic electromagnetic processes in atoms, then use electromagnetic signals (light) to synchronize clocks that are far from the standard clock. In doing this, are physicists measuring “electromagnetic time” but not other kinds of physical time?
In the 1930s, the physicists Arthur Milne and Paul Dirac worried about this question. Independently, they suggested there may be very many time scales. For example, there could be the time of atomic processes and perhaps also a time of gravitation and large-scale physical processes. Clocks for the two processes might drift out of synchrony after being initially synchronized, yet there would be no reasonable explanation for why they do not stay in synchrony. Ditto for clocks based on the pendulum, on superconducting resonators, on the spread of electromagnetic radiation through space, and on other physical principles. Just imagine the difficulty for physicists if they had to work with electromagnetic time, gravitational time, nuclear time, neutrino time, and so forth. Current physics, however, has found no reason to assume there is more than one kind of time for physical processes.
In 1967, physicists did reject the astronomical standard for the atomic standard because the deviation between known atomic and gravitation periodic processes such as the Earth’s rotations and revolutions could be explained better assuming that the atomic processes were the most regular of these phenomena. But this is not a cause for worry about two times drifting apart. Physicists still have no reason to believe a gravitational periodic process that is not affected by friction or impacts or other forces would ever drift out of synchrony with an atomic process such as the oscillations of a quartz crystal, yet this is the possibility that worried Milne and Dirac.
Physical time is not relative to any observer’s state of mind. Wishing time will pass does not affect the rate at which the observed clock ticks. On the other hand, physical time is relative to the observer’s reference system—in trivial ways and in a deep way discovered by Albert Einstein.
In a trivial way, time is relative to the chosen coordinate system on the reference frame. For example, it depends on the units chosen as when the duration of some event is 34 seconds if seconds are defined to be a certain number of ticks of the standard clock, but is 24 seconds if seconds are defined to be a different number of ticks of that standard clock. Similarly, the difference between the Christian calendar and the Jewish calendar for the date of some event is due to a different unit and origin. Also trivially, time depends on the coordinate system when a change is made from Eastern Standard Time to Pacific Standard Time. These dependencies are taken into account by scientists but usually never mentioned. For example, if a pendulum’s approximately one-second swing is measured in a physics laboratory during the autumn night when the society changes from Daylight Savings Time back to Standard Time, the scientists do not note that one unusual swing of the pendulum that evening took a negative fifty-nine minutes and fifty-nine seconds instead of the usual one second.
Is time relative to the observer’s coordinate system in the sense that in some reference frames there could be fifty-nine seconds in a minute? No, due to scientific convention, it is absolutely certain that there are sixty seconds in any minute in any reference frame. How long an event lasts is relative to the reference frame used to measure the time elapsed, but in any reference frame there are exactly sixty seconds in a minute because this is true by definition. Similarly, you do not need to worry that in some reference frame there might be two gallons in a quart.
In a deeper sense, time is relative, not just to the coordinate system, but to the reference frame itself. That is Einstein’s principal original idea about time. Einstein’s idea is that without reference to the frame, there is no fixed time interval between two events, no ‘actual’ duration between them. This idea was philosophically shocking as well as scientifically revolutionary.
The relativity of simultaneity is the feature of spacetime in which two different reference frames moving relative to each other will disagree on which events are simultaneous. A large percentage of both physicists and philosophers of time suggest that this implies simultaneity is not objectively real, and they conclude also that the present is not objectively real. These arguments are discussed in the main Time article, but a bit more detail on the subject can be added here.
Consider the question: How do we tell the time of occurrence of an event that is very far away from us? We assign the time of the distant event by subtracting, from the time when we first detect the event, the time it took the signal to travel to us.
For example, we see a flash of light at time t arriving from a distant place P. When did the flash occur back at P? Let’s call that time tp. Here is how to compute tp. Suppose we know the distance x from us to P. Then the flash occurred at t minus the travel time for the light. That travel time is x/c. So,
tp = t – x/c.
For example, if we see an explosion on the Sun at t, then we know to say it really occurred about eight minutes before, because x/c is approximately eight minutes, where x is the distance from Earth to the Sun. In this way, we know what events on the distant Sun are simultaneous with what clicks on our Earth clock.
The deeper problem is that other observers will not agree with us that the event on the Sun occurred when we say it did. The diagram below illustrates the problem. Let’s assume that our spacetime obeys the special theory of relativity.
There are two light flashes that occur simultaneously, with Einstein at rest midway between them in this diagram.
The Minkowski diagram represents Einstein sitting still in the reference frame (marked by the coordinate system with the thick black axes) while Lorentz is not sitting still but is traveling rapidly away from him and toward the source of flash 2. Because Lorentz’s worldline is a straight line, we can tell that he is moving at a constant speed. The two flashes of light arrive at Einstein’s location simultaneously, creating spacetime event B. However, Lorentz sees flash 2 before flash 1. That is, the event A of Lorentz seeing flash 2 occurs before event C of Lorentz seeing flash 1. So, Einstein will readily say the flashes are simultaneous, but Lorentz will have to do some computing to figure out that the flashes are simultaneous in the Einstein frame because they won’t “look” simultaneous to Lorentz. However, if we’d chosen a different reference frame from the one above, one in which Lorentz is not moving but Einstein is, then Lorentz would be correct to say flash 2 occurs before flash 1 in that new frame. So, whether the flashes are or are not simultaneous depends on which reference frame is used in making the judgment. It’s all relative.
The relativity of simultaneity is philosophically less controversial than the conventionality of simultaneity. To appreciate the difference, consider what is involved in making a determination regarding simultaneity. Given two events that happen essentially at the same place, physicists assume they can tell by direct observation whether the events happened simultaneously. If we do not see one of them happening first, then we say they happened simultaneously, and we assign them the same time coordinate. The determination of simultaneity is more difficult if the two happen at separate places, especially if they are very far apart. One way to measure (operationally define) simultaneity at a distance is to say that two events are simultaneous in a reference frame if unobstructed light signals from the two events would reach us simultaneously when we are midway between the two places where they occur, as judged in that frame. This is the operational definition of simultaneity used by Einstein in his theory of special relativity.
The “midway” method described above has a significant presumption: that the light beams travel at the same speed regardless of direction. Einstein and the philosophers of time Hans Reichenbach and Adolf Grünbaum have called this a reasonable “convention” because any attempt to experimentally confirm it presupposes that we already know how to determine simultaneity at a distance. Suppose the event of our here and now is A, and suppose some distant event B is in our absolute elsewhere. Einstein noticed that there is no physical basis for judging the simultaneity or lack of simultaneity between A and B without presupposing that light travels at the same speed from A to B as from B to A. The presumption of the equality of speeds is a convention.
Hilary Putnam, Michael Friedman, and Graham Nerlich object to calling it a convention—on the grounds that to make any other assumption about light’s speed would unnecessarily complicate our description of nature, and we often make choices about how nature is on the basis of simplification of our description.
To understand the dispute, notice that the “midway” method above is not the only way to define simultaneity. Consider a second method, the “mirror reflection” method. Select an Earth-based frame of reference, and send a flash of light from Earth to Mars where it hits a mirror and is reflected back to its source. The flash occurred at 12:00 according to an Earth clock, let’s say, and its reflection arrived back on Earth 20 minutes later. The light traveled the same empty, undisturbed path coming and going. At what time did the light flash hit the mirror? The answer involves the so-called conventionality of simultaneity. All physicists agree one should say the reflection event occurred at 12:10. It took ten minutes going to Mars, and ten minutes coming back. The controversial philosophical question is whether this way of calculating the ten minutes is really a convention. Einstein pointed out that there would be no inconsistency in our saying that the flash hit the mirror at 12:17, provided we live with the awkward consequence that light was relatively slow getting to the mirror, but then traveled back to Earth at a faster speed.
Suppose we want to synchronize a Mars clock with our clock on Earth. Let’s draw a Minkowski diagram of the situation and consider just one spatial dimension in which we are at location A with the standard clock for the reference frame. The distant clock we want to synchronize is at location B. See the following diagram.
The fact that the worldline of the B-clock is parallel to the time axis shows that the clock there is stationary. We will send light signals in order to synchronize the two clocks. Send a light signal from A at time t1 to B, where it is reflected back to us, arriving at time t3. Then the reading tr on the distant clock at the time of the reflection event should be t2, where:
t2 = (1/2)(t3 + t1).
If tr = t2, then the two clocks are synchronized.
Einstein noticed that the use of the fraction “(1/2)” in the equation t2 = (1/2)(t3 + t1) rather than the use of some other fraction implicitly assumes that the light speed to and from B is the same. He said this assumption is a convention, the so-called conventionality of simultaneity, and is not something we could check to see whether it is correct. If t2 were (1/3)(t3 + t1), then the light would travel to B faster and return more slowly. If t2 were (2/3)(t3 + t1), then the light would travel to B relatively slowly and return faster. Either way, the average travel speed to and from would be c. Only with the fraction (1/2) are the travel speeds the same going and coming back.
Notice how we would check whether the two light speeds really are the same. We would send a light signal from A to B, and see if the travel time was the same as when we sent it from B to A. But to trust these times we would already need to have synchronized the clocks at A and B. But that synchronization process will use the equation t2 = (1/2)(t3 + t1), with the (1/2) again, so we are arguing in a circle here.
As noted, not all philosophers of science agree with Einstein that the choice of (1/2) is a convention, nor with those philosophers such as Putnam who say the messiness of any other choice shows that the choice of 1/2 must be correct. Everyone does agree, though, that any other choice than (1/2) would make for messy physics.
However, some researchers suggest that there is a way to check on the light speeds and not simply presume they are the same. Transport one of the clocks to B at an infinitesimal speed. Going this slow, the clock will arrive at B without having its own time deviate from that of the A-clock. That is, the two clocks will be synchronized even though they are distant from each other. Now the two clocks can be used to find the time when a light signal left A and the time when it arrived at B. The time difference can be used to compute the light speed. This speed can be compared with the speed computed for a signal that left B and then arrived at A. The experiment has never been performed, but the recommenders are sure that the speeds to and from will turn out to be identical, so they are sure that the (1/2) in the equation t2 = (1/2)(t3 + t1) is correct and not a convention. For more discussion of this controversial issue of conventionality in relativity, see pp. 179-184 of The Blackwell Guide to the Philosophy of Science, edited by Peter Machamer and Michael Silberstein, Blackwell Publishers, Inc., 2002.
What does it mean to say the human condition is one in which you never will be able to affect an event outside your forward light cone? With any action you take, the speed of transmission of your action to its effect cannot move faster than c. This c is the c in E = mc2. It is the maximum speed in any reference frame. It is the speed of light and the speed of anything else with zero rest mass; it is also the speed of any electron or quark at the big bang before the Higgs field appeared and slowed them down.
Here is a visual representation of the human condition according to the special theory of relativity, whose spacetime can always be represented by a Minkowski diagram of the following sort:
The absolutely past events (the green events in the diagram above) are the events in or on the backward light cone of your present event, your here-and-now. The backward light cone of event Q is the imaginary cone-shaped surface of spacetime points formed by the paths of all light rays reaching Q from the past.
The events in your absolute past are those that could have directly or indirectly affected you, the observer, at the present moment. The events in your absolute future are those that you could directly or indirectly affect.
An event’s being in another event’s absolute past is a feature of spacetime itself because the event is in the point’s past in all possible reference frames. The feature is frame-independent. For any event in your absolute past, every observer in the universe (who is not making an error) will agree the event happened in your past. Not so for events that are in your past but not in your absolute past. Past events not in your absolute past will be in what Eddington called your “absolute elsewhere.” The absolute elsewhere is the region of spacetime containing events that are not causally connectible to your here-and-now. Your absolute elsewhere is the region of spacetime that is neither in nor on either your forward or backward light cones. No event here now, can affect any event in your absolute elsewhere; and no event in your absolute elsewhere can affect you here and now.
A single point’s absolute elsewhere, absolute future, and absolute past partition all of spacetime beyond the point into three disjoint regions. If point-event A is in point-event B’s absolute elsewhere, the two events are said to be “spacelike related.” If the two are in each other’s forward or backward light cones they are said to be “time-like related” or “causally connectible.” The order of occurrence of a space-like event (before or after or simultaneous with your here-and-now) depends on the chosen frame of reference, but the order of a time-like event and your here-and-now does not. Another way to make the point is to say we have a free choice about the time order of two events that are space-like related, but we have no freedom when it comes to two events that are time-like related because the causal order determines their time order. That is why the absolute elsewhere is also called the extended present. There is no fact of the matter about whether a point in your absolute elsewhere is in your present, your past, or your future.
For any two events in spacetime, they are time-like, space-like, or light-like separated, and this is an objective feature of the pair that cannot change with a change in the reference frame. This is another implication of the fact that the light-cone structure of space-time is real and objective, unlike features such as durations and lengths.
The past light cone looks like a cone in small regions. However, the past light cone is not cone-shaped in a large cosmological region, but rather has a pear-shape because all very ancient light lines must have come from the infinitesimal volume at the big bang.
Time dilation occurs when two synchronized clocks get out of synchrony due either to their relative motion or due to their being in regions of different gravitational field strengths.
According to special relativity, if you are in the center of the field of a large sports stadium filled with spectators, and you suddenly race to the exit door at constant, high speed, everyone else in the stadium will get thinner (in the frame fixed to you now) than they were originally (in the frame fixed to you before you left for the exit).
Here is a picture of the visual distortion of moving objects described by special relativity:
The picture describes the same wheel in different colors: (green) rotating in place just below the speed of light; (blue) moving left to right just below the speed of light; and (red) remaining still.
According to the general theory of relativity, gravitational differences affect time by dilating it. Observers in a less intense gravitational potential find that clocks in a more intense gravitational potential run slow relative to their own clocks. People in ground floor apartments outlive their twins in penthouses, all other things being equal. Basement flashlights will be shifted toward the red end of the visible spectrum compared to the flashlights in attics. This effect is known as the gravitational redshift.
Spacetime in the presence of matter or energy is curved. So, time is “curved,” too, and one sees this curvature as time dilation effects in which clocks run slower in high gravitational fields compared to clocks in low gravitational fields.
A black hole is a very special region of extremely warped spacetime. It is highly compressed matter-energy whose gravitational field strength is strong enough that it warps spacetime so severely that any object falling into the hole cannot get back out (at least in an intact form). According to general relativity, black holes are black because no light or other radiation from inside can escape; but according to quantum theory, they are not black. The points of no return compose the “event horizon” which is the surface separating the inside from the outside of the black hole. The surface is made of empty space. Relativity theory implies the black hole’s center has a singularity of infinite density and infinite spacetime curvature, but quantum theory disallows this.
A quasar is a kind of black hole that sends two gigantic rays of light away from itself in opposite directions, like a searchlight in a lighthouse along the ocean’s coast. The quasar’s light is created from material falling toward the hole, not from any material inside the hole.
If you were in a spaceship approaching a black hole from outside its event horizon, your time warp would become significant for observers back on Earth. It would be more severe the longer you stayed in the vicinity and also the closer you got to the event horizon. In a reference frame fixed to your spaceship, if you fell through the event horizon at 12:00, your SOS signal sent at that time or later would never escape the black hole. In a reference frame in which Earth is stationary, your clock would slow down and progressively approach 12:00, but would never quite reach 12:00. You would be almost frozen near the horizon, and your signals sent back toward Earth would become dimmer and lower in frequency as your spaceship slowed its speed. From an Earth astronomer’s perspective, nothing has enough time to fall into a black hole.
Any object can become a black hole if sufficiently compressed. If the Earth were somehow compressed, it would become a star. If it were compressed even more until its radius is less than 1.5 centimeters, then it would become a black hole.
According to relativity theory, if a black hole is turning or twisting, as most are, then inside the event horizon there inevitably will be closed time-like curves, and so objects in the black hole can undergo past time travel, although they cannot escape the black hole by going back to a time before they were within the black hole.
Perhaps an even odder temporal feature is that it is better to think of a person or object, once it arrives inside the black hole’s event horizon, as aging toward the center rather than as spatially falling toward it. This is because inside the horizon the roles of time and space are switched. The center is not a place in space; it is a moment when time ends. Trying to avoid the center, once you’ve fallen past the event horizon by switching on extra rocket power will be as pointless as getting in a car here on Earth and driving extra fast in order to avoid tomorrow afternoon. For more on why time and space switch roles inside the black hole, see https://www.youtube.com/watch?v=KePNhUJ2reI.
There are equally startling visual effects. A light ray can circle a black hole once or many times depending upon its angle of incidence to the event horizon. A light ray grazing a black hole can leave at any angle, so a person viewing a black hole from outside can see multiple copies of the rest of the universe at various angles. See http://www.spacetimetravel.org/reiseziel/reiseziel1.html for some of these visual effects.
Quantum theory applied to black holes implies they are not totally black because whatever material does fall in eventually can get back out, though in a radically transformed manner. The infalling matter very slowly leaks back out as Bekenstein-Hawking radiation that is created at the event horizon. Eventually, the hole will evaporate and disappear unless new material keeps falling in. The bigger the hole, the longer it takes to evaporate. Any black hole more massive than Mt. Everest will take longer than eighteen billion years to evaporate even if nothing new falls in. A black hole having the mass of our Sun would take 1067 years to evaporate.
As the size of the hole gets smaller, its Bekenstein-Hawking Radiation rises in frequency. When the hole is very tiny, about the size of a bacterium, its outgoing radiation becomes white-colored, producing a white black hole. At the very last instant of its life, it explodes in a flash of extremely high-energy particles.
Although the curvature of spacetime near Earth is very small compared to that near a black hole, the difference in curvature at the surface of Earth compared to that in a satellite circling the Earth is significant enough that time dilation must be accounted for in clocks that are part of the Global Positioning System Satellites. Time in the satellite runs slow compared to Earth’s time. Therefore, these GPS satellites are launched with their clocks adjusted and then periodically readjusted so that they stay synchronized with Earth-based clocks.
The paradox is an argument about time dilation that uses the theory of relativity to produce an apparent contradiction. Consider two twins at rest on Earth with their clocks synchronized. One twin climbs into a spaceship and flies far away at a high, constant speed, then reverses course and flies back at the same speed. An application of the equations of relativity theory implies that because of time dilation the twin on the spaceship will return and be younger than the Earth-based twin. The argument for the twin paradox is that it is all relative. That is, either twin could regard the other as the traveler. If the spaceship was considered to be stationary, then would not relativity theory imply that the Earth-based twin could race off (while attached to the Earth) and return to be the younger of the two twins? If so, then when the twins reunite, each will be younger than the other. That is paradoxical.
In brief, the solution to the paradox is that the two situations are not sufficiently similar, and that in both situations, for reasons to be explained in a moment, the twin who stays home outside of the spaceship maximizes his or her own time (that is, proper time) and so is always the older twin when the two reunite (at a common coordinate time). This solution to the paradox has nothing to do with a proper or improper choice of the reference frame; it has instead to do with the fact that some paths in spacetime take longer than others, in analogy to the fact that some paths in space are longer than others. Let’s look at more details of this solution.
Herbert Dingle was the President of London’s Royal Astronomical Society in the early 1950s. He famously argued in the 1960s that the twins paradox reveals an inconsistency in special relativity. Almost all philosophers and scientists now agree that it is not a true paradox, in the sense of revealing an inconsistency within relativity theory, but is merely a complex puzzle that can be adequately solved within relativity theory.
There have been a variety of suggestions in the relativity textbooks on how to understand the paradox. Here is one, diagrammed below.
The principal suggestion for solving the paradox is to note that there must be a difference in the time taken by the twins because their behaviors are different, as shown in their two worldlines above. The coordinate time, that is, the time shown by clocks fixed in space in the coordinate system is the same for both travelers. Their personal times are not the same. The key idea for resolving the paradox is not that one twin accelerates and the other does not. It’s that their path lengths in spacetime are different. Relativity theory requires that the longer the path in space, the shorter the elapsed time along the path.
A free-falling clock ticks faster and more often than any other clock that is used to measure the duration between two events such as the event of when the twins leave each other and the event of their reunion. This is illustrated graphically because the longer line in the graph represents a longer path in space but a shorter duration along that path. The spatial length of the line representing the traveler’s path in spacetime in the above diagram is not a correct measure of the traveler’s time along that path. Instead, the number of dots in the line is a measure of the time for the traveler. The spacing of the dots represents a tick of a clock in that worldline and thus represents the time elapsed along the worldline.
The diagram shows how sitting still on Earth is a way of maximizing the time during the trip, and it shows how flying near light speed in a spaceship away from Earth and then back again is a way of minimizing the time, even though if you paid attention only to the shape of the worldlines in the diagram and not to the dot spacing within them you might think just the reverse. This odd feature of the geometry is one reason why Minkowski geometry of spacetime is not Euclidean geometry of spacetime, even though both geometries are Euclidean in space alone. So, the conclusion of the analysis of the paradox is that its reasoning makes the mistake of supposing that the situation of the two twins can properly be considered to be the same.
One twin’s spacetime trajectory is longer in space, and that is the twin who is younger upon reunion. As our particular example above is set up, only one twin feels the acceleration at the turnaround point, but this is irrelevant to the solution to the paradox. The paradox could be restated in a form that requires both twins to feel the same acceleration. Also, the force felt by the spaceship twin is not what “forces” that twin to be younger. Nothing is forcing the twin to be younger. For more discussion of the paradox, and the criticism of Feynman, see (Maudlin 2012), pp. 77-83, especially p. 81. See the left diagram of his Fig. 30 on p. 157 for how the twins of the twins paradox can reunite with one twin being younger than the other even though neither twin ever accelerated.
See the article “Zeno’s Paradoxes” in this encyclopedia.
Coordinates are assigned to points. Points cannot be added, subtracted, or squared, but their coordinates can be. Coordinates applied to the space are not physically real; they are tools used by the analyst, the physicist. In other words, they are invented, not discovered.
Technically, the question, “How do time coordinates get assigned to points in spacetime?” is asking how we coordinatize the four-dimensional manifold. The manifold is a collection of points (technically, a topological space) which behaves as a Euclidean space in neighborhoods around any point.
Isaac Newton conceived of points of space and time as absolute in the sense that they retained their identity over time. Modern physics does not have that conception of points; points are identified relative to objects, for example, the halfway point between this object and that object.
In the late 16th century, the Italian mathematician Rafael Bombelli interpreted real numbers as lengths on a line and interpreted addition, subtraction, multiplication, and division as movements along the line. This work eventually led to our assigning real numbers to instants and also to durations, which are composed of instants.
To justify the assignment of time numbers (called time coordinates or dates or clock readings) to instants, we cannot literally paste a number to an instant. What we do instead is rather complicated. For some of the details, the reader is referred to (Maudlin 2012), pp. 87-105. On pp. 88-89, Maudlin says:
Every event on the world-line of the master clock will be assigned a t-coordinate by the clock. Extending the t-coordinate to events off the trajectory of the master clock requires making use of…a collection of co-moving clocks. Intuitively, two clocks are co-moving if they are both on inertial trajectories and are neither approaching each other nor receding from each other. …An observer situated at the master clock can identify a co-moving inertial clock by radar ranging. That is, the observer sends out light rays from the master clock and then notes how long it takes (according to the master clock) for the light rays to be reflected off the target clock and return. …If the target clock is co-moving, the round-trip time for the light will always be the same. …[W]e must calibrate and synchronize the co-moving clocks.
Co-moving inertial clocks do not generally exist, according to general relativity, so the issue of assignments of time coordinates becomes quite complicated in the real world. This article highlights only a few aspects of the assignment process.
The assignment process assumes that the structure of the set of instantaneous events is the same as, or embeddable within, the structure of our time numbers. The structure of our time numbers is the structure of real numbers. Showing that this is so is called “solving the representation problem” for our theory of time measurement. This article does not go into detail on how to solve this problem, but the main idea is that the assignment of coordinates should reflect the structure of the space of instantaneous times, namely its geometrical structure, which includes its topological structure, differential structure, affine structure, and metrical structure.
For example, to measure any space, including a one-dimensional space of time, we need a metrification for space. The metrification assigns location coordinates to all points and assigns distances between all pairs of points, when units are added. The method of assigning distances is called the “metric” for the space. A metrification for time assigns dates to the points we call point-instants of time; these assignments are called time coordinates. Normally we use a clock to do this. Point instants get assigned a unique real number coordinate, and the metric or duration between any two of those point instants is found by subtracting their time coordinates from each other. The duration is the absolute value of the numerical difference of their coordinates, that is |t(B) – t(A)| where t(B) is the time coordinate of event B and t(A) is the time coordinate of A, for any pair of events A and B (once units are added to the numbers). For ease of application of calculus to physical change, it is very important that nearby points get assigned nearby numbers so that all the coordinates change continuously as the point changes continuously in the space.
Let’s reconsider the question of metrification in more detail, starting with the assignment of locations to points. Any space is a collection of points. In a space that is supposed to be time, these points are the instants, and the space for time is presumed to be linear locally. Before discussing time coordinates specifically, let’s consider what is meant by assigning coordinates to a mathematical space, one that might represent either physical space, or physical time, or spacetime, or the two-dimensional mathematical space in which we graph the relationship between the price of rice in China and the wholesale price of tulips in Holland. In one-dimensional space, such as a curving line, we assign unique coordinate numbers to points along the line, and we make sure that no point fails to have a coordinate. For a two-dimensional space, we assign ordered pairs of real numbers to points. For a 3D space, we assign ordered triplets of numbers. Why numbers and not letters? If we assign letters instead of numbers, we can not use the tools of mathematics to describe the space.
But even if we do assign numbers, we cannot assign any coordinate numbers we please. There are restrictions. If the space has a certain geometry, then we have to assign numbers that reflect this geometry. If event A occurs before event B, then the time coordinate of event A, namely t(A), must be less than t(B). If event B occurs after event A but before event C, then we should assign coordinates so that t(A) < t(B) < t(C). Here is the fundamental method of this analytic geometry:
Consider a space as a class of fundamental entities: points. The class of points has “structure” imposed upon it, constituting it as a geometry—say the full structure of space as described by Euclidean geometry. [By assigning coordinates] we associate another class of entities with the class of points, for example a class of ordered n-tuples of real numbers [for a n-dimensional space], and by means of this “mapping” associate structural features of the space described by the geometry with structural features generated by the relations that may hold among the new class of entities—say functional relations among the reals. We can then study the geometry by studying, instead, the structure of the new associated system [of coordinates]. (Sklar, 1976, p. 28)
The goal in assigning coordinates to a space is to create a reference system for the space. A reference system is a reference frame plus (or including [the literature is ambiguous on this point]) a coordinate system. For 4-d spacetime obeying special relativity with its Lorentzian geometry, a Lorentzian coordinate system is a grid of smooth timelike and spacelike curves on the spacetime that assigns to each point three space-coordinate numbers and one time-coordinate number. No two distinct points can have the same set of four coordinate numbers. Technically, being continuous is a weaker requirement than being smooth, but the difference won’t be of concern here.
As we get more global, we have to make adjustments. Consider two coordinate systems in adjacent regions. For the adjacent regions, we make sure that the ‘edges’ of the two coordinate systems match up in the sense that each point near the intersection of the two coordinate systems gets a unique set of four coordinates and that nearby points get nearby coordinate numbers. The result is an atlas on spacetime. Inertial frames can have global coordinate systems, but in general, we have to use atlases. If we are working with general relativity where spacetime can curve and we cannot assume inertial frames, then the best we can do is to assign a coordinate system to a small region of spacetime where the laws of special relativity hold to a good approximation. General relativity requires special relativity to hold locally, and thus for spacetime to be Euclidean locally. That means that locally the 4-d spacetime is correctly described by 4-d Euclidean solid geometry.
For small regions of curved spacetime, we create a coordinate system for a small region, a chart of the atlas, by choosing a style of grid, say rectangular coordinates, fixing a point as being the origin, selecting one timelike and three spacelike lines to be the axes, and defining a unit of distance for each dimension. We cannot use letters for coordinates. The alphabet’s structure is too simple. Integers won’t do either, but real numbers are adequate to the task. The definition of “coordinate system” requires us to assign our real numbers in such a way that numerical betweenness among the coordinate numbers reflects the betweenness relation among points. For example, if we assign numbers 17, pi, and 101.3 to instants, then every interval of time that contains the pi instant and the 101.3 instant had better contain the 17 instant. When this feature holds everywhere, the coordinate assignment is said to be “monotonic” or to “obey the continuity requirement.”
Because mathematical spaces, unlike physical spaces, are used for so many different purposes, the unit of distance measurement might be a meter or a second or a price in yen, depending on the space we are working with. The metric for a space is what specifies what is meant by distance in that space.
The natural metric between any two points in a one-dimensional space, such as the time sub-space of our spacetime, is the absolute value of the numerical difference between the coordinates of the two points. Using this metric for time, the duration between an event with the time coordinate 11 and the event with coordinate 7 is 5. The metric for spacetime defines the spacetime interval between two spacetime locations, and it is more complicated than the metric for time alone, as we have discussed elsewhere in this Supplement and the main “Time” article. The spacetime interval between any two events is invariant or unchanged by a change to any other reference frame. More accurately, in the general theory, only the infinitesimal spacetime interval between two neighboring points needs to be invariant.
There are still other restrictions on the assignments of coordinate numbers. The restriction that we called the “conventionality of simultaneity” fixes what time-slices of spacetime can be counted as collections of simultaneous events. An even more complicated restriction is that coordinate assignments satisfy the demands of general relativity. The metric of spacetime in general relativity is not global but varies from place to place due to the presence of matter and gravitation. Spacetime cannot be given its coordinate numbers without our knowing the distribution of matter and energy.
The features that a space has without its points being assigned any coordinates whatsoever are its topological features, its differential structures, and its affine structures. The topological features include its dimensionality, whether it goes on forever or has a boundary, and how many points there are. The affine structure is about lines, the geodesics. Differential structure allows us to use the differential calculus on the manifold.
To approach the question of the assignment of coordinates to spacetime points more philosophically, consider this challenging remark:
Minkowski, Einstein, and Weyl invite us to take a microscope and look, as it were, for little featureless grains of sand, which, closely packed, make up space-time. But Leibniz and Mach suggest that if we want to get a true idea of what a point of space-time is like we should look outward at the universe, not inward into some supposed amorphous treacle called the space-time manifold. The complete notion of a point of space-time in fact consists of the appearance of the entire universe as seen from that point. Copernicus did not convince people that the Earth was moving by getting them to examine the Earth but rather the heavens. Similarly, the reality of different points of space-time rests ultimately on the existence of different (coherently related) viewpoints of the universe as a whole. Modern theoretical physics will have us believe the points of space are uniform and featureless; in reality, they are incredibly varied, as varied as the universe itself.
from “Relational Concepts of Space and Time” by Julian B. Barbour, The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, Vol. 33, No. 3 (Sep., 1982), p. 265.
For a more sophisticated, yet philosophically oriented, approach to coordinate systems on spaces, see Philosophy of Physics: Space and Time by Tim Maudlin, pp. 24-34.
Ideally for any reference frame, we would like to partition the set of all actual events into simultaneity equivalence classes by some reliable method. All events in one equivalence class are said to happen at the same time in the frame, and every event is in some class or other. Consider what event near the supergiant star Betelgeuse is happening now (at the same time as our now). To answer this difficult question, let’s begin with some easier questions.
What is happening at time zero in our coordinate system? There is no way to select one point of spacetime and call it the origin of the coordinate system except by reference to actual events that can be measured. In practice, we make the origin be the location of a special event. For one frame, we use the big bang. For another frame, we might use the birth of Jesus or the entrance of Mohammed into Mecca. For a spherical coordinate system on the surface of Earth that will serve as a spatial coordinate system and not a spacetime coordinate system, we very often use a special location on Earth.
Our purpose in choosing a coordinate system or atlas is to express relationships among actual and possible events. The time relationships we are interested in are time-order relationships (Did this event occur between those two?) and magnitude-duration relationships (How long after A did B occur?) and date-time relationships (When did event A itself occur?). The date of a (point) event is the time coordinate number of the spacetime location where the event occurs. We expect all these assignments of dates to events to satisfy the requirement that event A happens before event B iff t(A) < t(B), where t(A) is the time coordinate of A, namely its date. The assignments of dates to events also must satisfy the demands of our physical theories, and in this case we face serious problems involving inconsistency if a geologist gives one date for the birth of Earth, an astronomer gives a different date, and a theologian gives yet another date.
It is a big step from assigning numbers to points of spacetime to assigning them to real events. Here are some of the questions that need answers. How do we determine whether a nearby event and a very distant event occurred simultaneously? Assuming we want a second to be the standard unit for measuring the time interval between two events, how do we operationally define the second so we can measure whether one event occurred exactly one second later than another event? A related question is: How do we know whether the clock we have is accurate? Less fundamentally, attention must also be paid to the dependency of dates due to shifting from Standard Time to Daylight Savings Time, to crossing the International Date Line, to switching from the Julian to the Gregorian Calendar, and to comparing regular years with leap years.
Let’s design a coordinate system for time. Suppose we have already assigned a date of zero to the event that we choose to be at the origin of our coordinate system. To assign dates (that is, time coordinates) to other events, we first must define a standard clock or master clock and declare that the time intervals between any two consecutive ticks of that clock are the same. The second is our conventional unit of time measurement, and it will be defined to be so many ticks of the standard clock. We then synchronize other clocks with the standard clock so the clocks show equal readings at the same time, when they are all relatively stationary and also not affected differently by gravitational fields. The time or date at which a point event occurs is the number reading on the clock at rest there. If there is no clock there, the assignment process is more complicated. One could transport a synchronized clock to that place, but any clock speed or influence by a gravitational field during the transport will need to be compensated for. If the place is across the galaxy, then any transport is out of the question, and other means must be used.
Because we want to use clocks to assign a time (coordinate) even to very distant events, not just to events in the immediate vicinity of the clock, and because we want to do this correctly, some appreciation of Einstein’s theory of relativity is required. A major difficulty is that two nearby synchronized clocks, namely clocks that have been calibrated and set to show the same time when they are next to each other, will not in general stay synchronized if one is transported somewhere else. If they undergo the same motions and gravitational influences, they will stay synchronized; otherwise, they won’t. There is no privileged transportation process that we can appeal to. For more on how to assign dates to distant events, see the discussion of the relativity and conventionality of simultaneity.
As a practical matter, dates are assigned to events in a wide variety of ways. The date of the birth of the Sun is assigned very differently from dates assigned to two successive crests of a light wave in a laboratory laser. For example, there are lasers whose successive crests of visible light waves pass by a given location in the laboratory every 10-15 seconds. This short time is not measured with a stopwatch. It is computed from measurements of the light’s wavelength. We rely on electromagnetic theory for the equation connecting the periodic time of the wave to its wavelength and speed. Dates for other kinds of events, such as the birth of Mohammad or the origin of the Sun, are computed from historical records rather than directly measured with a clock.
How can you distinguish a clock from something else that also changes with time? Clocks essentially have some regular behavior. Most clocks tick. They count repetitions of some process that is acceptably regular in the sense that each repetition of the process has very nearly the same duration. Other types of clocks do not tick, but their regularity is shown by their having a process that lasts a fixed or predictable amount of time. Three examples of non-ticking clocks are an hourglass, a group of candles that all take the same time to burn, and radioactive decay that occurs at a predictable rate. All this regularity is essential because we want a second today to be equal to a second tomorrow.
There must be more than one clock so that time can be measured in many places. If our world could have only one clock or have clocks that could never be synchronized under any conditions, then clocks would be useless. We want those clocks to stay synchronized even though they are in different places; but, if they cannot always stay synchronized, then we’d like to know how we can compensate for this. Clocks also should be accurate, and what that means is discussed in the next section of this article. A calendar is not a clock.
It is not appropriate for the term “clock” to be used within a fundamental scientific law. “Time,” yes; but not “clock.” But in the laws, no times are more special than others, with the possible exception of a first or last time. Similarly, it is not appropriate to mention a specific spatial location within a fundamental scientific law.
The count of a clock’s ticks is normally converted and displayed in seconds or in some other standard unit of time such as nanoseconds, hours, or years. This counting can be difficult if there are very many ticks per second. Our civilization’s standard clock ticks 9,192,631,770 times per second.
It is an arbitrary convention that we design clocks to count up to higher numbers rather than down to lower numbers. It is also a convention that we re-set our clock by one hour as we move across a time-zone on the Earth’s surface, or that we add leap days and add or subtract leap seconds. However, it is no convention that the duration from instantaneous event A to instantaneous event B plus the duration from B to instantaneous event C is equal to the duration from A to C. It is one of the objective characteristics of time.
An accurate clock is a clock that is in synchrony with the standard clock. When the time measurements of the clock agree with the measurements made using the standard clock, we say the clock is accurate and properly calibrated. A perfectly accurate clock shows that it is time t just when the standard clock shows that it is time t, for all t, provided the two clocks are relatively stationary and not differently affected by gravitational fields. Accuracy is different from precision. If four clocks read exactly thirteen minutes slow compared to the standard clock, then the four are very precise, but they all are inaccurate by thirteen minutes.
Two ticking clocks can be accurate even though they do not tick at the same rate, provided each clock’s ticking is regular. What this means is that, if one clock has a duration d1 between successive ticks, while another clock has a different duration d2 between ticks, this is no problem so long as the ratio d1/d2 is constant over time because that ratio can be used to compensate for the difference in rates.
One philosophical issue is whether the standard clock itself is accurate. Realists will say that the standard clock is our best guess as to what time it really is, and we can make incorrect choices for our standard clock. Anti-realists will say that the standard clock cannot, by definition, be inaccurate, so any choice of a standard clock, even the choice of the president’s heartbeat as our standard clock, will yield a standard clock that is accurate. Leibniz would qualify as an anti-realist because he said the best we can do in setting our clocks is to place them in synchrony with each other. Newton would disagree and say that for the standard clock to be accurate it must tick in synchrony with time itself.
Let’s reconsider the answer to the question: Can the time shown on a standard clock be inaccurate? There are a variety of answers to this question.
- Yes, because what we mean by accurate is the average of the many standard clocks, about 200 of them, and any single one could fail to be in sync with the average. That is why standard clocks get re-set every month.
So, let’s rephrase the question: Can the average time shown on our standard clocks be inaccurate?
- No, because the goal for accuracy is to find the best clock, and that is just the average of our current standard clocks.
- Yes, because the goal for accuracy is absolute time.
- Yes, because the goal for accuracy is the best possible clock, and we do not know what that is yet; we would need to see into the future.
Of the four answers, most physicists prefer answer (2).
A clock measures the time along its own worldline. If the clock is in an inertial frame and not moving relative to the standard clock, then it measures the “coordinate time,” the time we agree to use in the coordinate system. If the spacetime has no inertial frame, then that spacetime cannot have an ordinary, Euclidean coordinate time.
Because clocks are intended to be used to measure events external to themselves, another goal in clock building is to ensure there is no difficulty in telling which clock tick is simultaneous with which far away events. For some situations and clocks, the sound made by the ticking helps us make this determination. We hear the tick just as we see the event occur that we desire to measure. Using this procedure for synchronization presupposes that we can ignore the difference between the speed of sound and the speed of light.
In our discussion so far, we have assumed that the clock is very small, that it can count any part of a second, and that it can count high enough to provide information for our calendars and longer-term records. These aren’t always good assumptions. Despite those practical problems, there is the theoretical problem of there being a physical limit to the shortest duration measurable by a given clock because no clock can measure events whose duration is shorter than the time it takes light to travel between the components of that clock, the components in the part that generates the sequence of regular ticks. This theoretical limit places a lower limit on the error margin of any measurement made with that clock.
Every physical motion of every clock is subject to disturbances. So, to be an accurate clock, one that is in synchrony with the standard clock, we want our clock to be adjustable in case it drifts out of synchrony a bit. It helps to keep it isolated from environmental influences such as heat, dust, unusual electromagnetic fields, physical blows (such as dropping the clock), and immersion in liquids. And it helps to be able to predict how much a specific influence affects the drift out of synchrony so that there can be an adjustment for this influence.
Our standard clock or master clock is the clock that other clocks are synchronized with. We want to select as our standard clock a clock that we can be reasonably confident will tick regularly in the sense that all periods between adjacent ticks are congruent (that is, the same duration). Choosing a standard clock that is based on the beats of the president’s heart would be a poor choice because stationary clocks everywhere would go out of synchrony with the standard clock when the president goes jogging.
Almost all nations agree on what clock is the standard clock. The international time standard used is called Coordinated Universal Time [or U.T.C. time, for the initials of the French name]. It is not based on only a single standard clock but rather on a large group of relatively stationary atomic clocks that are distributed around the Earth. Researchers are sure that future standard clocks will be based on atomic clocks that work on higher frequencies than microwave frequencies. There has been very little progress, however, on nuclear clocks.
Here are more details about U.T.C. time. Atomic Time or A.T. time is what is produced by a cesium-based atomic fountain clock that counts in seconds, where those seconds are the S.I. seconds or Système International seconds (in the International Systems of Units, that is, Le Système International d’Unités). The S.I. second is defined to be the time it takes for a motionless standard cesium atomic clock to emit exactly 9,192,631,770 cycles of radiation of a certain color of light that is emitted from the clock’s cloud of cesium 133 atoms during a transition between the two hyperfine levels of the ground state of the atom. This microwave frequency is very stable. More details about this process are offered below. As physics research continues to improve time measurement, the standard use of the cesium clock is likely to be changed by convention to clocks with higher and even more stable frequencies, such as optical lattice clocks and quantum-logic clocks.
Actually, for more precise timekeeping, the T.A.I. time scale is used rather than the A.T. scale. The T.A.I. scale does not use merely a single standard cesium clock but rather a calculated average of the readings of about 200 official cesium atomic clocks that are distributed around the world in about fifty selected laboratories. One of those laboratories is the National Institute of Standards and Technology in Boulder, Colorado, U.S.A. This calculated average time is called T.A.I. time, the abbreviation of the French phrase for International Atomic Time. The International Bureau of Weights and Measures near Paris performs the averaging about once a month. If your laboratory in the T.A.I. system had sent in your clock’s reading for certain events that occurred in the previous month, then in the following month, the Bureau would calculate the average answer for the clock readings, then send you a report of how inaccurate your guess was from the average, so you could make adjustments to your clock.
Coordinated Universal Time or U.T.C. time is T.A.I. time plus or minus some integral number of leap seconds. U.T.C. is, by agreement, the time at the Prime Meridian, the longitude that runs through Greenwich England. The official government time is different in the time zones in different countries. In the U.S.A., for example, the government time is U.T.C. time minus the hourly offsets for the appropriate time zones of the U.S.A. including whether daylight savings time is observed. U.T.C. time is informally called Zulu Time, and it is the time used by the Internet and the aviation industry throughout the world.
A.T. time, T.A.I. time, and U.T.C. time are not kinds of physical time but rather kinds of measurements of physical time. So, this is another reason why the word “time” is ambiguous; sometimes it means unmeasured time, and sometimes it means the measure of that time. Speakers rarely take care to say explicitly how they are using the term, so readers need to stay alert.
At the 13th General Conference on Weights and Measures in 1967, the definition of a second was changed from a certain fraction of a solar day to a specific number of periods of radiation produced by an atomic clock. This new second is the so-called “standard second” or S.I. second. It is now defined to be the duration of 9,192,631,770 periods (cycles, oscillations, vibrations) of a certain kind of microwave radiation emitted in the standard cesium atomic clock. More specifically, the second is defined to be the duration of 9,192,631,770 periods of the microwave radiation required to produce the maximum fluorescence of a small cloud of cesium 133 atoms (that is, their radiating a specific color of light) as an electron in the atom makes a transition between two specific hyperfine energy levels of the ground state of the atom. This is the internationally agreed-upon unit for atomic time [the T.A.I. system]. The old astronomical system [Universal Time 1 or UT1] defined a second to be 1/86,400 of an average solar day.
For this “atomic time,” or time measured atomically, the atoms of cesium gas are cooled to near absolute zero and given a uniform energy while trapped in an atomic fountain or optical lattice and irradiated with microwaves. The frequency of the microwave radiation is tuned until maximum fluorescence is achieved. That is, it is adjusted until the maximum number of cesium atoms flip from one energy level to another, showing that the microwave radiation frequency is precisely tuned to be 9,192,631,770 vibrations per second. Because this frequency for maximum fluorescence is so stable from one experiment to the next, the vibration number is accurate to this many significant digits. For more details on how an atomic clock works, see (Gibbs, 2002).
The meter depends on the second, so time measurement is more basic than space measurement. It does not follow, though, that time is more basic than space. After 1983, scientists agreed that the best way to define and to measure length between any two points A and B is to do it via measuring the number of periods of a light beam reaching from A to B. This is for three reasons: (i) light propagation is very stable or regular; its speed is either constant, or when not constant such as its moving through water of different density or moving at 38 miles per hour through a Bose-Einstein condensate, we know how to compensate for the influence of the medium; (ii) a light wave’s frequency can also be made very stable; and (iii) distance can not be measured more accurately.
In 1999, the meter was defined in terms of the (pre-defined) second as being the distance light travels in a vacuum in an inertial reference frame in exactly 0.000000003335640952 seconds, or 1/299,792,458 seconds. That number is picked by convention so that the new meter will be very nearly the same distance as the old meter that was once defined to be the distance between two specific marks on a platinum bar kept in the Paris Observatory.
Time can be measured not only more accurately than distance but also more accurately than voltage, temperature, mass, or anything else.
So why bother to improve atomic clocks? The duration of the second can already be measured to 14 or 15 decimal places, a precision 1,000 times that of any other fundamental unit. One reason to do better is that the second is increasingly the fundamental unit. Three of the six other basic units—the meter, lumen and ampere—are defined in terms of the second. (Gibbs, 2002)
One subtle implication of the standard definition of the second and the meter is that they fix the speed of light in a vacuum in all inertial frames. The speed is exactly one meter per 0.000000003335640952 seconds or 299,792,458 meters per second. There can no longer be any direct measurement to check whether that is how fast light really moves; it is defined to be moving that fast. Any measurement that produced a different value for the speed of light would be presumed initially to have an error. The error would be in, say, its measurements of lengths and durations, or in its assumptions about being in an inertial frame, or in its adjustments for the influence of gravitation and acceleration, or in its assumption that the light was moving in a vacuum. This initial presumption of where the error lies comes from a deep reliance by scientists on Einstein’s theory of relativity. However, if it were eventually decided by the community of scientists that the speed of light should not have been fixed as it was, then the scientists would call for a new world convention to re-define the second.
Leap years (with their leap days) are needed as adjustments to the standard clock’s counting of elapsed time in order to account for the fact that the number of the Earth’s rotations per Earth revolution does not stay constant from year to year. The Earth is spinning slower every day. Without an adjustment, our midnights will eventually drift into the daylight. Leap seconds are needed for another reason. The Earth’s period changes irregularly due to earthquakes and hurricanes. This effect is not practically predictable, so, when the irregularity occurs, a leap second is added or subtracted every six months as needed.
Other clocks ideally are calibrated by being synchronized to “the” standard clock, but some choices of standard clock are better than others. Some philosophers of time believe one choice is better than another because it is closer to what time it really is. Other philosophers of time argue that there is no access to what time it really is except by first having selected the standard clock.
Let’s consider the various goals we want to achieve in choosing one standard clock rather than another. One goal is to choose a clock that does not drift very much. That is, we want a clock that has a very regular period—so the durations between ticks are congruent. Many times throughout history, scientists have detected that their currently-chosen standard clock seemed to be drifting. In about 1700, scientists discovered that the time from one day to the next, as determined by the duration between sunrises, varied throughout the year. The year did not seem to vary, so they began to speak of the duration of the year and the mean day throughout the year. Before the 1950s, the standard clock was defined astronomically in terms of the mean rotation of the Earth upon its axis [solar time]. For a short period in the 1950s and 1960s, the standard clock was defined in terms of the revolution of the Earth about the Sun [ephemeris time]. The second was defined to be 1/86,400 of the mean solar day, which is the average throughout the year of the rotational period of the Earth with respect to the Sun. But all these clocks were soon discovered to drift.
To solve these drift problems, physicists close a certain kind of atomic clock [which displays “atomic time”]. It was discussed in the previous section of this Supplement. All atomic clocks measure time in terms of the natural resonant frequencies of certain atoms or molecules. (The dates of adoption of these standard clocks is omitted in this paragraph because different international organizations adopted different standards in different years.) The U.S.A.’s National Institute of Standards and Technology’s F-1 atomic fountain clock, that is used for reporting standard time in the U.S.A. (after adjustment so it reports the average from the other laboratories in the T.A.I. network), is so accurate that it drifts by less than one second every 30 million years. We know there is this drift because it is implied by the laws of physics, not because we have a better clock that measures this drift. With engineering improvements, the “30 million” number may improve either with the cesium clock or with a new standard optical lattice clock.
The most accurate optical lattice clock as of 2020 has an error rate of less than one second in 15 billion years, which is the approximate age of the universe since the big bang.
To achieve the goal of restricting drift, any clock chosen to become the standard clock should be maximally isolated from outside effects. That is, a practical goal in selecting a standard clock is to find a clock that can be well insulated from environmental impacts such as comets impacting the Earth, earthquakes, stray electric fields, and the presence of dust within the clock. The clock can be shielded from electrical fields, for example, by enclosing it in a metal box. If not insulation, then compensation. If there is some theoretically predictable effect of an environmental influence upon the standard clock, then the clock can be regularly adjusted to compensate for this effect.
Consider the insulation problem we would have if we were to use as our standard clock the mean yearly motion of the Earth around the Sun. Can we compensate for all the relevant disturbing effects on the motion of the Earth around the Sun? Not easily. The problem is that the Earth’s rate of spin varies in a practically unpredictable manner. Meanwhile, we believe that the relevant factors affecting the spin (such as shifts in winds, comet bombardment, earthquakes, the ocean’s tides and currents, convection in Earth’s molten core) are affecting the rotational speed and period of revolution of the Earth, but not affecting the behavior of the atomic clock. We do not want to be required to say that an earthquake on Earth or the melting of Greenland ice caused a change in the frequency of cesium emissions throughout the galaxies.
We add leap days and seconds in order to keep our atomic-based calendar in synchrony with the rotations and revolutions of the Earth. We want to keep atomic-noons occurring on astronomical-noons and ultimately to prevent Northern hemisphere winters from occurring in some future July, so we systematically add leap years and leap seconds and leap microseconds in the counting process. These changes do not affect the duration of a second, but they do affect the duration of a year because, with leap years, not all years last the same number of seconds. In this way, we compensate for the Earth-Sun clocks falling out of synchrony with our standard clock.
Another desirable feature of a standard clock is that reproductions of it stay in synchrony with each other when environmental conditions are the same. Otherwise, we may be limited to relying on a specifically-located standard clock that can not be trusted elsewhere and that can be stolen. Cesium clocks in a suburb of Istanbul work just like cesium clocks in an airplane over New York City.
The principal goal in selecting a standard clock is to reduce mystery in physics by finding a periodic process that, if adopted as our standard, makes the resulting system of physical laws simpler and more useful, and allows us to explain phenomena that otherwise would be mysterious. Choosing an atomic clock as standard is much better for this purpose than choosing the periodic dripping of water from our goatskin bag or even the periodic revolution of the Earth about the Sun. If scientists were to have retained the Earth-Sun clock as the standard clock and were to say that by definition the Earth does not slow down in any rotation or in any revolution, then when a comet collides with Earth, tempting the scientists to say the Earth’s period of rotation and revolution changed, the scientists instead would be forced instead to alter, among many other things, their atomic theory and say the frequency of light emitted from cesium atoms mysteriously increases all over the universe when comets collide with Earth. By switching to the cesium atomic standard, these alterations are unnecessary, and the mystery vanishes. To make this point a little more simply, suppose the President’s heartbeats were chosen as our standard clock and so the count of heartbeats always showed the correct time, then it would be a mystery why pendulums (and cesium radiation in atomic clocks) changed their frequency whenever the President went jogging, and scientists would have to postulate some new causal influence that joggers have on pendulums across the globe.
To achieve the goal of choosing a standard clock that maximally reduces mystery, we want the clock’s readings to be consistent with the accepted laws of motion, in the following sense. Newton’s first law of motion says that a body in motion should continue to cover the same distance during the same time interval unless acted upon by an external force. If we used our standard clock to run a series of tests of the time intervals as a body coasted along a carefully measured path, and we found that the law was violated and we could not account for this mysterious violation by finding external forces to blame and we were sure that there was no problem otherwise with Newton’s law or with the measurement of the length of the path, then the problem would be with the clock. Leonhard Euler [1707-1783] was the first person to suggest this consistency requirement on our choice of a standard clock. A similar argument holds today but with using the laws of motion from Einstein’s theory of relativity.
What it means for the standard clock to be accurate depends on your philosophy of time. If you are a conventionalist, then once you select the standard clock it can not fail to be accurate in the sense of being correct. On the other hand, if you are an objectivist, you will say the standard clock can be inaccurate. There are different sorts of objectivists. Suppose we ask the question, “Can the time shown on a properly functioning standard clock ever be inaccurate?” The answer is “no” if the target is synchrony with the current standard clock, as the conventionalists believe, but “yes” if there is another target. Objectivists can propose at least three other distinct targets: (1) absolute time (perhaps in Isaac Newton’s sense that he proposed in the 17th century), (2) the best possible clock, and (3) the best-known clock. We do not have a way of knowing whether our current standard clock is close to target 1 or target 2. But if the best-known clock is known not yet to have been chosen to be the standard clock, then the current standard clock can be inaccurate in sense 3.
When you want to know how long a basketball game lasts, why do you subtract the start time from the end time? The answer is that we accept a metric for duration in which we subtract the two time numbers. Why do not we choose another metric and, let’s say, subtract the square root of the start time from the square root of the end time? This question is implicitly asking whether our choice of metric can be incorrect or merely inconvenient.
Let’s say more about this. When we choose a standard clock, we are choosing a metric. By agreeing to read the clock so that a duration from 3:00 to 5:00 is 5-3 hours, and so 2 hours, we are making a choice about how to compare any two durations in order to decide whether they are equal, that is, congruent. We suppose the duration from 3:00 to 5:00 as shown by yesterday’s reading of the standard clock was the same as the duration from 3:00 to 5:00 on the readings from two days ago and will be the same for today’s readings and tomorrow’s readings.
Philosophers of time continue to dispute the extent to which the choice of metric is conventional rather than objective in the sense of being forced on us by nature. The objectivist says the choice is forced and that the success of the standard atomic clock over the standard solar clock shows that we were more accurate in our choice of the standard clock. An objectivist disagrees and believes that whether two intervals of time are really equivalent is an intrinsic feature of nature, so choosing the standard clock is not any more conventional than our choosing to say the Earth is round rather than flat. Taking the conventional side on this issue, Adolf Grünbaum argued that time is “metrically amorphous.” It has no intrinsic metric. Instead, we choose the metric we do in order only to achieve the goals of reducing mystery in science, but satisfying those goals is no sign of being correct.
The conventionalist, as opposed to the objectivist, would say that if we were to require by convention that the instant at which Jesus was born and the instant at which Abraham Lincoln was assassinated are to be only 24 seconds apart, whereas the duration between Lincoln’s assassination and his burial is to be 24 billion seconds, then we could not be mistaken. It is up to us as a civilization to say what is correct when we first create our conventions about measuring duration. We can consistently assign any numerical time coordinates we wish, subject only to the condition that the assignment properly reflects the betweenness relations of the events that occur at those instants. That is, if event J (birth of Jesus) occurs before event L (Lincoln’s assassination) and this, in turn, occurs before event B (burial of Lincoln), then the time assigned to J must be numerically less than the time assigned to L, and both must be less than the time assigned to B so that t(J) < t(L) < t(B). A simple requirement. Yes, but the implication is that this relationship among J, L, and B must hold for events simultaneous with J, and for all events simultaneous with K, and so forth.
It is other features of nature that lead us to reject the above convention about 24 seconds and 24 billion seconds. What features? There are many periodic processes in nature that have a special relationship to each other; their periods are very nearly constant multiples of each other, and this constant stays the same over a long time. For example, the period of the rotation of the Earth is a fairly constant multiple of the period of the revolution of the Earth around the Sun, and both these periods are a constant multiple of the periods of a swinging pendulum and of vibrations of quartz crystals. The class of these periodic processes is very large, so the world will be easier to describe if we choose our standard clock from one of these periodic processes. A good convention for what is regular will make it easier for scientists to find simple laws of nature and to explain what causes other events to be irregular. It is the search for regularity and simplicity and removal of mystery that leads us to adopt the conventions we do for the numerical time coordinate assignments and thus leads us to choose the standard clock we do choose. Objectivists disagree and say this search for regularity and simplicity and removal of mystery is all fine, but it is directing us toward the intrinsic metric, not simply the useful metric.
A field in physics is something filling the universe that takes on a value everywhere; it is somewhat like a colored fluid filling all space, with different fields having different colors. You can think of a room filled with air as having an air density field, with sound waves in the room being oscillations of this field due to changing air density in different places at different times.
Field theory has the advantage that, if you want to know what will happen next at a place, you do not have to consider the influence of everything everywhere in the universe, but only the field values adjacent to the place and the rates of change of those values. For example, to figure out what happens to a thrown ball that is influenced only by gravity, Newton’s classical theory of gravity requires consideration of gravitational forces on the ball from all the other matter in the universe at the instant the ball is thrown. In the corresponding Newtonian field theory, one need only consider the gravitational field at the ball’s location. Two distant objects do not act on each other directly, but only via the field between them. However, Newton’s theory of gravity without fields is often more practical to use because gravitational forces get weaker with distance, so in most calculations that do not require extreme accuracy, one can ignore the very distant objects and consider only the large nearby objects.
The other principal advantage of fields is that in so many theories the fields obey equations that enable physicists to calculate the future field values from the present ones without having to consider the past values.
This field idea originated with Pierre-Simon Laplace (1749-1827) who suggested treating Newton’s theory of gravity as a field theory. Newton would have been happy with the idea of a field because Newton himself always doubted that gravity worked by direct action at a distance. In a letter to Richard Bentley, he said:
It is inconceivable that inanimate brute matter should, without the intervention of something else which is not material, operate upon and affect other matter, and have an effect upon it, without mutual contact.
But Newton still would have been unhappy with Laplace’s field theory because it required any gravitational force or any change in a gravitational force to be propagated instantaneously throughout all space. Newton wished to avoid instantaneous actions. These were first removed from gravitational theory in Einstein’s general theory of relativity. According to Einstein,
As the Earth moves, the direction of its gravitational pull does not change instantly throughout the universe. Rather, it changes right where the Earth is located, and then the field at that point tugs on the field nearby, which tugs on the field a little farther away, and so on in a wave moving outward at the speed of light. (Carroll 2019, p. 249)
James Clerk Maxwell in the mid-1800s was the first person to successfully treat electricity and magnetism and being aspects of a single field, the electromagnetic field. The ripples of this field always travel at light speed.
Fields obey laws, and these laws usually are systems of partial differential equations that hold at each point. Quantum field theory of the Standard Model of Particle Physics is a very well-confirmed theory that treats a material particle as a localized vibration in a field. For example, an electron is a localized vibration in the electron field. The anti-electron is also a vibration in this field. A photon is a localized vibration in the electromagnetic field. The vibration (the technical term is “excitation” or “oscillation”) is a fuzzy bundle of quantized energy occupying a region of space bigger than a single point. The propagation of basic particles from one place to another is due to the fact that any change in the field values induces nearby changes a little later. Think of points in the field as interacting only with their nearest neighbors, which in turn interact with their own neighbors, and so forth. By the way, the particles (the excitations of the field) move, but the field itself does not.
Our universe is basically made of fields and not particles, but it does not follow from this that particles are not real. Although any particle, such as an electron, does have a greater probability of being detected at some places than at others over a “fuzzy” region that ultimately extends over all of space, in any single detection the electron is detected only at a point, not a region. What does follow from the fact that our universe is basically made of fields and not particles is that, even though there are points of space and points of time, there are no point particles. The electron is actually a packet of waves that spread throughout space, though the higher amplitude parts of the wave are fairly localized. The electron is physically basic, though, in the sense that it has no sub-structure. The proton is not basic because it does have substructure; it is made of quarks and gluons. Particles with no sub-structure are called elementary particles.
Physicists are especially interested in generally covariant fields, which are fields whose physical behavior is independent of the coordinate systems used to describe the fields. One of their central metaphysical assumptions is that what is real is generally covariant.
There are many basic quantum fields that exist together. There are four basic matter fields. These are the four fermion fields, two of which are the electron field and the field for quarks having a charge of +2/3. There are five basic force-carrying fields. These are the five boson fields such as the electromagnetic field, the gravitational field, and the Higgs field. All physicists believe there are more, as yet unknown, fields. There might be a dark matter field, for example. Depending upon the field, a field’s value at a point in space might be a simple number (as in the Higgs field), or a vector (as in the classical electromagnetic field), or a tensor (as in Einstein’s gravitational field), or a matrix. The units on the values will change accordingly.
All fields interact with others. For example, the electromagnetic field interacts with the electron field whenever an energetic photon transitions into an electron and a positron.
According to quantum field theory, once one of these basic fields comes into existence it cannot be removed from existence; the field exists everywhere. Magnets create magnetic fields, but if you were to remove all the magnets there would still be a magnetic field. Sources of fields are not essential for the existence of fields.
Because of the Heisenberg Uncertainty Principle, even when a field’s value is the lowest possible (called the “vacuum state” or “unexcited state”) in a region, there is always a non-zero probability that its value will spontaneously deviate from that value in the region. The most common way this happens is via a particle and its anti-particle spontaneously coming into existence in the region, then rapidly annihilating each other in a small burst of energy. You can think of space at its basis being a churning sea, a sea of pairs of these particles and their anti-particles that are continually coming into existence and then being rapidly annihilated. So, even if all universe’s fields were to be at their lowest state, empty space always would have some activity and energy. This energy of the vacuum state is inaccessible to us; we can never use it to do work. Clearly, the empty space of physics is not the metaphysician’s nothingness. So, there is no region of empty space where there could be empty time or changeless time in the sense meant by a Leibnizian relationist.
Because all these fields are quantum fields, their excitations can occur only in quantized chunks, namely integer multiples of some baseline energy, the so-called zero-point energy, which is the lowest possible positive energy. It is these chunks that make the theory be a quantum theory.
What is the relationship between spacetime and these fields? Are the fields in space or, as Einstein once said, properties of space; or is there a different relationship? One popular belief among physicists, especially the advocates of the theory of loop quantum gravity, is that spacetime is the gravitational field itself; so it is a mistake, they say, to think of the gravitational field as existing within space or within spacetime. String theory, on the other hand, usually treats strings, the basic constituents of all particles, as moving within a pre-existing spacetime, rather than as constituting the spacetime.
It is not clear that a distinction can be maintained between spacetime and the other fields because the energy contained in the matter fields of spacetime cannot be clearly separated from the gravitational energy of spacetime itself. Gravitational energy can be transformed into the energy of the matter fields, and vice versa. There are significant metaphysical implications for this breakdown of the common distinction. Many physicists believe that the universe is not composed of various fields; it is composed of a single entity, the quantum field, which has such a character that it appears as if it is composed of various different fields.
In classical physics, the state of a system at a time is the simultaneous positions and velocities of the system’s component particles. In relativity theory, the state also involves the geometry of space. In quantum field theory, the state of the system at a time is a particular value for every field at every point in space at that time. Classical, relativistic, and quantum states change in time deterministically. Regarding the wave function, there is nothing that waves; it represents all of reality, so there is nothing else for it to act upon.
For an elementary introduction to quantum fields, see the video https://www.youtube.com/watch?v=X5rAGfjPSWE.
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