Time Supplement

This supplement provides background information about many of the topics discussed in both the main Time article and its companion article What Else Science Requires of Time.

Table of Contents

  1. What Are Durations, Instants, Moments, and Points of Time?
  2. What Is an Event?
  3. What Is a Reference Frame?
  4. What Is an Inertial Frame?
  5. What Is Spacetime?
  6. What Is a Minkowski Diagram?
  7. What Are Time’s Metric and Spacetime’s Interval?
  8. How Does Proper Time Differ from Coordinate Time?
  9. Is Time the Fourth Dimension?
  10. Is There More Than One Kind of Physical Time?
  11. How Is Time Relative to the Observer?
  12. What Is the Relativity of Simultaneity?
  13. What Is the Conventionality of Simultaneity?
  14. What are the Absolute Past and the Absolute Elsewhere?
  15. What Is Time Dilation?
  16. How Does Gravity Affect Time?
  17. What Happens to Time near a Black Hole?
  18. What Is the Solution to the Twins Paradox?
  19. What Is the Solution to Zeno’s Paradoxes?
  20. How Are Coordinates Assigned to Time?
  21. How Do Dates Get Assigned to Actual Events?
  22. What Is Essential to Being a Clock?
  23. What Does It Mean for a Clock to Be Accurate?
  24. What Is Our Standard Clock?
  25. Why Are Some Standard Clocks Better than Others?
  26. What Is a Field?

1. What Are Durations, Instants, Moments, and Points of Time?

A duration is a measure of elapsed time. It is a number with a unit. The second is the agreed-upon standard unit for the measurement of duration in the S.I. system (the International Systems of Units, that is, Le Système International d’Unités). How to define a second is discussed later in this supplement.

Geologists prefer to mark off durations in larger units than seconds, such as epochs, periods, eras, and, largest of all, eons. Some physicists might prefer a unit much smaller than a second, such as a nanosecond, which is a billionth of a second, or a jiffy, which is the time it takes light to travel one centimeter in a vacuum.

In informal conversation, an instant or moment is a very short duration. In physics, however, an instant is even shorter. It is instantaneous; it has zero duration. This is perhaps what the poet T.S. Eliot was thinking of when he said, “History is a pattern of timeless moments.” Instants do not last long enough to have a finite duration.

The interval of time or period of time between two events is the elapsed time between the two events. The measure of this interval is called the duration. A duration always needs a unit. “4” is not a duration, but “4 seconds” is. The term interval in the phrase spacetime interval is a different kind of interval, although they are related; this is discussed in a later section. Two events that occur very far apart in space but close to the same time have a small time interval but a large spacetime interval.

There is another sense of the words instant and moment which means, not a very short duration, but rather a time, as when we say it happened at that instant or at that moment. Midnight could be such a moment. This is the sense of the word moment meant by a determinist who says the state of the universe at one moment determines the state of the universe at another moment.

It is assumed in physics (except in esoteric, unconfirmed theories of quantum gravity) that any interval of time is a linear continuum of the points of time that compose it, but it is an interesting philosophical question to ask how physicists know it is a continuum. Nobody could ever measure time that finely, even indirectly.  Points of time cannot be detected. But given what we know about time, we should not be trying to detect them.

Belief in the existence of points of time is justified holistically by appealing to how they contribute to scientific success, that is, to how the points give our science extra power to explain, describe, predict, and enrich our understanding. But, to justify belief in the existence of points, we also need confidence that our science would lose too many of these virtues without the points.

Consider what a point in time really is. Any interval of time is a real-world model of a segment of the real numbers in their normal order. So, each instant corresponds to just one real number and vice versa. To say this again in other words, time is a line-like structure on sets of point events. Just as the real numbers are an actually infinite set of decimal numbers that can be linearly ordered by the less-than-or-equal relation, so time is an actually infinite set of instants or instantaneous moments that can be linearly ordered by the happens-before-or-at-the-same-time-as relation in a reference frame. An instant can be thought of as a set of simultaneous events in a reference frame.

There is a deep philosophical dispute about whether points of time actually exist, just as there is a similar dispute about whether spatial points actually exist. The dispute began when Plato said, “[T]his queer thing, the instant, …occupies no time at all….” (Plato 1961, p. 156d). Some philosophers wish to disallow point-events and point-times. They want to make do with intervals, and want the word instant always to have a positive duration. It is definitely the case that there is no physically possible way to measure that the time is exactly noon even if it is true that the time is noon. Noon is 12 to an infinite number of decimal places, but no measuring apparatus is infinitely precise.

The philosopher Michael Dummett, in (Dummett 2000), said time is not made of point instants but rather is a composition of overlapping intervals, that is, non-zero durations. Dummett required the endpoints of those intervals to be the initiation and termination of actual physical processes. This idea of treating time without instants develops a 1936 proposal of Bertrand Russell and Alfred North Whitehead. The central philosophical issue about Dummett’s treatment of motion is whether its adoption would negatively affect other areas of mathematics and science. It is likely that it would. For the history of the dispute between advocates of instants and intervals, see (Øhrstrøm and Hasle 1995).

Another issue about points of time reflects the dispute between proponents of the A-theory and the B-theory mentioned in the main Time article. If x and y are points in time, could they change temporal locations? Could one have been where the other is? Obviously not, says Peter Van Inwagen; obviously yes, says the typical B-theorist.

2. What Is an Event?

In ordinary discourse, an event is a happening lasting a finite duration during which some object changes its properties. For example, this morning’s event of buttering the toast is the toast’s changing from having the property of being unbuttered this morning to having the property of being buttered.

The philosopher Jaegwon Kim suggested that an event should be defined as an object’s having a property at a time. So, two events are the same if they are both events of the same object having the same property at the same time. This suggestion captures much of our informal concept of event, but with Kim’s suggestion it is difficult to make sense of the remark, “The vacation event could have started an hour earlier.” On Kim’s analysis, the vacation event could not have started earlier because, if it did, it would be a different event. A possible-worlds analysis of events might be the way to solve this problem of change.

Physicists have a different notion of event. They prefer to speak of point-events. The physical laws, other than those of quantum mechanics, are written in terms of point-events. Point-events are events located at a point of spacetime. A point-event is either simply the spacetime point itself or, more often, a point plus the value of some property at the point, such as mass or velocity or charge. A point of spacetime is normally specified uniquely by its four independent coordinate numbers, three spatial coordinates and one time coordinate. The word independent implies that knowing one coordinate gives no information about any other coordinate. The point-event is fundamental in the sense that, to a non-quantum physicist, any object is just a series of its point-events and the values of its properties at those points. For example, the process of a ball’s falling down is a continuous, infinite series of point-events, each of which is the ball existing at those spacetime locations. The reason for the qualification about “quantum” is discussed later in this section.

A physical space is different from a mathematical space. Mathematical space is a collection of points, and these points need not represent points in any real, physical space. Depending on the mathematical space, a point might represent anything. For example, a point in a two-dimensional mathematical space might be an ordered-pair consisting of an item’s sales price in dollars and a salesperson’s name.

The physicists’ notion of point-event in physical space, rather than mathematical space, is metaphysically unacceptable to some philosophers, in part because it deviates so much from the way the word event is used in ordinary language and in our manifest image. For other philosophers, it is unacceptable because of its size, its infinitesimal size. In 1936, in order to avoid point-events altogether in physical space, Bertrand Russell and A. N. Whitehead developed a theory of time that is based on the assumption that all events in spacetime have a finite, non-zero duration. They believed this definition of an event is closer to our common sense, our manifest image, our informal beliefs. Unfortunately, they had to assume that any finite part of an event is an event, and this assumption indirectly appeals to the concept of the infinitesimal and so is no closer to common sense than the physicist’s assumption that all events are composed of point-events.

McTaggart argued early in the twentieth century that events change. For example, he said the event of Queen Anne’s death is changing because it is receding ever farther into the past as time goes on. Many other philosophers (those of the so-called B-camp) believe it is improper to consider an event to be something that can change, and that the error is in not using the word change properly. This is still an open question in philosophy, but physicists generally use the term event as the B-theorists do, namely as something that does not change.

In non-quantum physics the state of a physical system of, say, a system of particles at a time is given by all the events occurring at all the positions in space. So, the events involve the positions and velocities of each of the system’s particles at that time. Not so in quantum mechanics. An event of this sort is not fundamental in quantum mechanics. The simultaneous position and velocity of a particle—the key ingredients of an event—do not exist according to quantum physics. Instead, what exists is a wave function that tells us the probability of the event occurring if a measurement were to be made.

More than half the physicists in the first quarter of the 21st century believe that a theory of quantum gravity will require quantizing time, and may also require that there be a finite maximum number of events that can occur in a finite volume. Current relativity theory and quantum theory allow an infinite number.

The ontology of quantum physics is very different than that of non-quantum physics. The main Time article intentionally overlooks this.

For a more discussion of what an event is, see the article on Events.

3. What Is a Reference Frame?

A reference frame is a standard point of view or a perspective that is usually intended to display quantitative measurements about places of interest in a space and the phenomena that take place there. To be suited for this purpose, a reference frame needs to include a coordinate system that is given an origin and orientation in the space and that provides names of points. Reference frames can be created for physical space, or for time, or for both, or for things having nothing to do with real space and time, including non-physical things such as the price of rice in China. Every reference frame applies to some space or other, but, even if the space is real physical space, its coordinates are never physically real. The notion of a reference frame on a space is modern; Newton did not know about reference frames.

Here is a reference frame fixed to a 3-dimensional solid ball representing the Earth. The origin of the coordinate system is at the center of Earth. Two of the three coordinate axes intersect the blue equator:

Reference Frames — kRPC 0.4.8 documentation

Coordinate systems assign a set of labels to each point in space. It names the points. Normally in n-dimensional space, a point is identified by an ordered n-tuple. For 3-D space, the best labels are usually triples of real numbers. For example, we might say an object of interest is located at <3.0,3.2,0>, where, in this ordered triple of real numbers, it is assumed all the numbers have the same units, such as meters. It is customary in a three-dimensional space to label the three coordinates as x, y, and z, in that order, and for <3.0,3.2,0> to mean that 3 meters is the x-coordinate of the point, 3.2 meters is the y-coordinate of the same point, and 0 meters is the z-coordinate of the point. The center of the Earth in this diagram is at <0,0,0>. Mathematical physicists occasionally suppress talk of the units and speak of 3.2 being the y-coordinate, although strictly speaking the y-coordinate is 3.2 meters.

Changing from one reference frame to another does not change any phenomena in the world being described with the reference frame, but is merely changing one’s perspective on the phenomena. If an object has certain coordinates in one reference frame, it usually will have different coordinates in a different reference frame.

A frame for the physical space in which you have zero velocity is called your rest frame or proper frame. (The word reference is often dropped from the phrase reference frame.) Whenever a scientist speaks of an observer measuring this or that, the implicit assumption is that the observer is using his or her rest frame, and, unless stated or implied otherwise, the observer is at the origin in that frame. The origin is always where the axes intersect. Relativity does not allow reference frames in which a photon is at rest.

When choosing to place a frame upon a space, there are an infinite number of legitimate choices, if only because an infinite number of lines (paths) can go through any location chosen to be the origin. Choosing a frame carefully can make a situation much easier to describe.  The most common reference frame in daily life is one that fixes the origin somewhere on Earth, extends its axes in three mutually perpendicular directions and starts its time axis from time zero while using the ticks of the standard clock for designating successive units of time along the time axis. But this frame would not be a good one to choose if you were trying to describe events only on a spinning carousel. It would be better to select a reference frame in which the carousel is at rest in the frame and the world beyond the carousel is spinning. But both those frames could use similar time axes with equal convenience.

Although there are an infinite number of legitimate choices of frames for a space, a frame with a time dimension in which your shooting a gun is simultaneous with your bullet hitting a distant target is not legitimate. Frames need to honor cause and effect if they are to be perspectives on real events or physically possible ones. There are other limitations in choosing frames. For example, if the space you are coordinating or spanning does not have the proper topological structure, then you cannot use a coordinate system in which the axes are mutually perpendicular. A Euclidean space has the proper topological structure to allow Euclidean coordinate systems, the kind of coordinate system invented by Descartes and also called Cartesian coordinate systems.

A coordinate system for physical space is (or almost always should be, if at all possible) a continuous labeling of the points so that nearby points have nearby coordinate numbers and so that mathematical physics does not become byzantine. For a region of interest in three-dimensional space, often the simplest coordinate system to choose is Cartesian. It is also called Euclidean, or rectangular, or orthogonal. In this kind of coordinate system, customarily called E3, there are three mutually perpendicular space axes, customarily called x, y, and z that intersect at the origin, and all the axes have a certain fixed orientation relative to some direction or to some pair of physical objects. For example, we might orient the z-axis by saying it points  up away from the center of Earth, while the x-axis points forward along the highway, and the y-axis is perpendicular to the other two axes and points across the highway.

To explain a bit more about how choices of coordinate systems can lead to byzantine difficulties in doing physics, in principle the coordinates of a reference frame’s coordinate system could be chosen to be finite strings of letters of the alphabet. A coordinate value such as bmaarirc for a specific point could successfully name that point, but it would require a ridiculously complicated metric; that is, it would contain no easily recovered information about where one point is located in relation to another point, nor how far away one point is from another. A better naming operation can provide this information. Regardless of the number of dimensions, if we want to do measuring, then we require of our reference frame that nearby points be named with nearby tuples of numbers, one number for each of the dimensions, and that any continuous or smooth change along a path between two points be reflected in a continuous or smooth change of the coordinates of those points, and vice versa. That is why we require that the names of points be real numbers—more specifically an ordered n-tuple of real numbers for a point in a space of n dimensions. Assuming the geometry of the space allows it, we prefer that the coordinate curves along one dimension be straight and at right angles to coordinate lines along all other dimensions, so that we can make use of the Pythagorean Theorem in computations of distances and otherwise have a simple metric; thus we prefer the familiar Cartesian coordinate system for 3D Euclidean space. Reference frames may be global or local, depending upon our interests. Polar or hyperspherical or other coordinate systems are not discussed in this article.

If we are dealing with spacetime rather than merely space, then we add a time coordinate, and say t = 0 when a certain noteworthy event occurs, such as the big bang or the conventional birth of Jesus. A second along this t-axis is required to be congruent to a second shown on our civilization’s standard clock. There are important constraints on the choice of coordinate system for a reference frame involving time. Simultaneous events must be assigned the same time coordinate. If two events have values of their coordinates that are very close together mathematically, then the events themselves occur very close in time.

Treating time as a special dimension is called spatializing time, and doing this is what makes time precisely describable mathematically in a way that treating time only as becoming does not. It is a major reason why mathematical physics can be mathematical.

For a one-dimensional Euclidean space, customarily called E1 or the mathematical line, the intended coordinate system assigns real numbers to the points. That is, there is a one-to-one correspondence between points of E1 and the real numbers in their natural order, customarily called  R1.  It is often not appreciated that R1 adds considerable structure that does not actually exist in E1. The extra structure is usually called a mathematical artifact. For example, two elements of R1 can be added to each other, but two elements of E1 cannot be. The real line R1 is asymmetric, but the elements of  E1 are not. One needs to be careful not to confuse the features of time with the features of the mathematics used to describe time. Einstein admitted in (Einstein 1982, p. 67) that even he often made this mistake of failing to distinguish the representation from the object represented, and it added years to the time it took him to create his general theory of relativity.

Practically in engineering projects on Earth, a reference frame for physical space is usually specified by selecting a solid object that does not normally change its size and location with respect to nearby objects and by saying that the reference frame’s origin is fixed to the object. This is equivalent to saying the object is stationary. We might select a reference frame fixed to the Rock of Gibraltar, and say the rock is at the origin where the axes cross each other at <0,0,0>. Another object is said to be at rest in this reference frame if it remains at a constant distance in a fixed direction from the Rock of Gibraltar.

When one speaks of a reference frame of an observer, one means some intended frame in which the observer’s speed is zero. Depending on the context, the remark might also imply that the  observer’s spatial position is at the origin <0,0,0>.

A smooth space of any number of dimensions is called a manifold. Newtonian mechanics, special relativity, general relativity, and quantum mechanics all require the set of all events to form a four-dimensional manifold. Informally, what it means to be four-dimensional is that events need to be specified with four independent, real numbers. The actual technical definition of dimension is not so simply specified.

When we say the Sun rose this morning, we are implicitly choosing a reference frame fixed to the Earth’s surface. The Sun is not at rest in this reference frame, but the Earth is. A reference frame fixed to the surface of the Earth cannot be Euclidean because the surface curves. Spaces with a curved geometry require curvilinear coordinate systems in which the axes are not straight but rather curve (as seen from a higher dimensional Euclidean space in which the space is embedded).

If the space curves, then the Pythagorean Theorem fails to apply to the coordinates. Only Euclidean space can have Cartesian coordinates everywhere and can use the Pythagorean Theorem for specifying the distance between two points. A real, physical space obeying general relativity will be curved and so cannot have a Cartesian coordinate system globally, but it must have one locally, that is, infinitesimally. These remarks about global vs. local are technical terminology for saying the deviations from Euclidean geometry get smaller as the region of space gets smaller. A global frame describes motion over all the space;  it spans the space. A local frame describes only a small region. If somewhere within a region of space some of the triangles are odd because the sum of their interior angles is not exactly 180 degrees, then this is a sure sign the space curves there.

In a space satisfying the special theory of relativity, space is Euclidean but spacetime is not; it is Minkowskian. In general relativity with spacetime curving, then neither space nor spacetime is Euclidean globally.

A curved coordinate system is used for curved spacetime—assuming we wish to have our coordinate axes lie completely within the space. We did not care about this in the Euclidean/Cartesian coordinate system used in the example at the beginning of this section. But if the entire space were the two-dimensional surface of a ball, and we wanted our coordinate axes to lie wholly within the two-dimensional space, then we would be required to select curvilinear coordinate system in which the axes curve [as viewed from a higher-dimensional Euclidean space]. To cover all of a curved four-dimensional spacetime that has different curvature in different regions of spacetime, one must make do with covering different regions with different coordinate patches (called charts) that are “knitted together” where one patch meets another. The result is called an atlas of the charts. Any curved spacetime can be covered in this exotic way with a single, global coordinate system in which every point is uniquely identified with a set of four numbers in a continuous way.

Informally, to find out how many dimensions space has, one would identify the maximum number of sticks that can be made mutually perpendicular within the space. A dimension of a space is a kind of path in a certain direction in that space, and a coordinate for that dimension is a number that serves as a location along that path. In creating reference frames for n-dimensional spaces, the usual assumption is that in order to specify a location we should supply n independent numbers, where n is a positive integer. This is usual but not required; instead, we could exploit the idea that there are space-filling curves that permit a single continuous curve to completely fill, and thus coordinatize, a region of any dimension higher than one. For this reason (namely, that each point in n-dimensional space does not always need n numbers to uniquely name the point), the contemporary definition of “dimension” must be rather exotic and is not explained in this article. Choosing a space-filling curve as a coordinate axis is almost always a bad choice because nearby points will not usually have nearby coordinates, and the usual tools of mathematical physics willl not be applicable.

Given an event, it may have one coordinate in one coordinate system, but a different coordinate in a different coordinate system. If there exist equations telling how points change their coordinates between the two different reference frames, then there is said to exist transformation equations for the pair of coordinate systems. One other requirement that limits what counts as a legitimate reference frame is that, if you are choosing two coordinate systems and both are to be used to describe events satisfying the special theory of relativity, then translations of points in one frame to the other frame must satisfy the Lorentz transformation equations, assuming both frames have the same origin and both use the same scale or units of the coordinates.

Physicists distinguish the past from the absolute past. Being in the absolute past is a frame-independent notion, but merely being in the past is not. Event x is in the past of event y iff (an abbreviation of if and only if) x happens before y. Event x is in the absolute past of event y iff, in all frames of reference, x happens before y. Event x is in the absolute past of y iff x could have causally influenced y iff an unhindered light beam from x could have reached y. According to relativity theory, if in some reference frame two different events are simultaneous, then there is another frame in which they are not simultaneous.

Section 20 offers more discussion of reference frames, and so does the next section on inertial frames.

4. What Is an Inertial Frame?

Any spacetime obeying the general theory of relativity obeys special relativity in infinitesimal regions where reference frames are inertial. Special relativity requires space to be Euclidean  and spacetime to be Minkowskian.

Think of the word “inertial” as being “Newtonian.” In general relativity it is very convenient to describe phenomena using an inertial frame if this can be done without too much error. In an inertial frame, every object that is isolated from external forces, including gravity, will always move at a constant velocity, that is, a constant speed in the same direction. Any frame in which Newton’s laws of motion hold is an inertial frame because Newton’s first law says an isolated object moves at constant velocity. In an inertial frame, any two moving objects that move in parallel and coast along with no outside forces on them, will remain parallel forever. Not so for non-inertial frames because of space’s curvature. A reference frame moving at constant velocity relative to an inertial frame is also an inertial frame.

Inertial reference frames do not exist for the whole of our real, physical spacetime, but some limited regions of reality can have frames that are almost inertial frames. A coordinate frame fixed on the distant stars and being used by physicists only to describe phenomena far from any of those stars, and far from planets, and from other massive objects, is very nearly an inertial frame. Using the laws of physics in this frame will be easier than using them in non-inertial frames.

5. What Is Spacetime?

Spacetime can be considered to be the set of locations of all events, or it can be considered to be a field where events are located. Either way, it is a combination of space and time. A four-dimensional spacetime has a single time dimension and three space dimensions. According to relativity theory, spacetime’s geometry can be non-Euclidean, and spacetime is said to curve wherever it deviates from having a Euclidean geometry.

Hermann Minkowski, in 1908, was the first person to say that spacetime is fundamental and that space and time are just aspects of spacetime. And he was the first to say different reference frames will divide spacetime differently into a time part and a space part, yet no reference frame is any more correct than another.

The force of gravity over time is actually manifested as the curvature of spacetime:

Gravity is not a force that propagates through space but a feature of spacetime itself. When you throw a ball high into the air, it arcs back to the ground because Earth distorts the spacetime around it, so that the paths of the ball and the ground intersect again. — George Musser, physicist

Spacetime is dynamic and not static; that is, its structure, such as its geometry, changes over time as the distribution of matter-energy changes. In special relativity and in Newton’s theory, spacetime is not dynamic.

There have been serious attempts to construct theories of physics in which spacetime is a product of more basic entities. The primary aim of these new theories is to unify relativity with quantum theory. So far these theories have not stood up to any empirical observations or experiments that could show them to be superior to the presently accepted theories. So, for the present, the concept of spacetime remains fundamental.

The metaphysical question of whether spacetime is a substantial object or a relationship among events, or neither, is considered in the discussion of the relational theory of time. For other philosophical questions about what spacetime is, see What is a Field?

6. What Is a Minkowski Diagram?

A spacetime diagram is a graphical representation of the point-events in spacetime. One dimension or axis is for time. The others are for space. A Minkowski spacetime diagram is a special kind of spacetime diagram, one that obeys the laws of special relativity and allows no curvature of spacetime itself, though objects themselves can have curving paths in space. Any object with a curving path in space also is an accelerating object.

Here is an example of a three-dimensional Minkowski spacetime diagram containing two spatial dimensions (axes) and a vertical time dimension (axis) with the forward and backward light cones meeting at the event of a point-sized OBSERVER at one point in time:

A 3D Minkowski diagram

Attribution:Stib at en.wikipedia, CC BY-SA 3.0, Link

In a Minkowski spacetime diagram, normally a rectangular coordinate system is used, the time axis is shown vertically, and one or two of the spatial axes are suppressed (that is, not included). Nevertheless, there is nothing objective about the choice of the angle of the hypersurface of the present relative to the time axis.

A flash of light in a vacuum has a perfectly straight-line representation if the Minkowski diagram has only one spatial dimension, but it is has a cone-shaped representation if the Minkowski diagram has two spatial dimensions. Normally, the units of the time coordinate are years, and the units of any spatial coordinates are light-years. The speed of light is one light-year per year. A light-year is not a time; it is a very long distance. The choice of units for the axes is important because, if the units for distance were meters instead of light-years, all those light cones would look too flat to be informative.

Below is an example of a Minkowski diagram having only one space dimension, so any forward light cone is shaped like the letter V:Minkows3

The Minkowski diagram above represents a point-sized Albert Einstein standing still midway between two special places, places where there is an instantaneous flash of light. The directed arrows represent the path of the four light rays from the flashes. In a Minkowski diagram, a physical point-object is not represented as occupying a point but as occupying a line containing all the spacetime points at which it exists. That line is called the  worldline of the object. Accelerating objects have worldlines that are not straight. A worldline of any point-object is a continuous, one-dimensional curve in spacetime.

Events on the same horizontal line of the Minkowski diagram are simultaneous in the reference frame. The more tilted an object’s worldline is from the vertical, the faster the object is moving. Given the units chosen for the diagram, no worldline can tilt up more than 45 degrees, which is the worldline of a photon, or else it would be a tachyon. A tachyon is an object that moves faster than the cosmic speed limit c, the speed of light in a vacuum.

In the above diagram, Einstein’s worldline is straight, indicating no total external force is acting on him. If an object’s worldline meets another object’s worldline, then the two objects collide.

The set of all possible photon histories or light-speed worldlines going through a specific point-event defines the two light cones of that event: its past light cone and its future light cone. The future cone or forward cone is called a cone because, if the spacetime diagram were to have two space dimensions, then light emitted from a flash would spread out in the two dimensions of space in a circle of ever-growing diameter, producing a cone shape. In a diagram for three-dimensional space, the light wavefront is an expanding sphere and not an expanding cone, but sometimes physicists still will informally still speak of the cone. Every different point in spacetime has its own pair of light cones. The light cone structure is an objective feature of spacetime, unlike such things as simultaneity and duration, which are relative to the choice of a reference frame.

The future light cone of the single flash event is defined to be all the spacetime events reached by the light emitted from the flash. A pair of events inside the same light cone are events such that in principle the earlier one could have affected the later one; we say the events are causally-connectible, and the relation between the events is said to be timelike. This means that a body could travel between the two events without ever exceeding the speed of light. If you were once located in spacetime at, say <x,y,z,t>, then for the rest of your life you cannot affect or participate in any event that occurs outside of the light cone whose apex is at <x,y,z,t>. Light cones are a helpful tool because different observers or different frames of reference will agree on the light cone of any event, and they will agree on which events are in which light cones. The light-cone structure of spacetime is not affected by a change of reference frame.

Freefall, that is, coasting or inertial motion, produces a straight worldline. If at some time Einstein were to jump on a train moving by at constant speed, then his worldline would, from that time onward, not be straight. It would tilt away from the vertical and form some angle less than 45 degrees with the time axis.

Special relativity does not allow a worldline to be circular, or to be a closed curve, because the traveler would have to approach infinite speed at various places along the curve. General relativity does not obviously prevent circular worldlines, although experts are not positive that this is true.

Not all spacetimes can be given Minkowski diagrams, but any spacetime satisfying Einstein’s Special Theory of Relativity can. Einstein’s Special Theory applies to mass but falsely presupposes that physical processes, such as gravitational processes, have no effect on the structure of spacetime. When attention needs to be given to the real effect of these processes on the structure of spacetime, that is, when general relativity needs to be used, then Minkowski diagrams become inappropriate for spacetime. General relativity assumes that the geometry of spacetime is locally Minkowskian but not globally. That is, spacetime is locally flat in the sense that in any infinitesimally-sized region one always finds spacetime to be 4-D Minkowskian (which is 3-D Euclidean for space but not 4-D Euclidean for spacetime). When we say spacetime is curved and not flat, we mean it deviates from 4-D Minkowskian geometry.

A Minkowski spacetime with three spatial dimensions and a single time dimension does its best to treat time as a dimension of space, but Minkowski spacetime is radically different than a Euclidean space with four dimensions. This difference shows up in the fact that its metric (and the topology based on the metric) is very unlike that of the metric of a Euclidean four-space because its time dimension is in many ways not like a space dimension, as is shown in the next section.

7. What Are Time’s Metric and Spacetime’s Interval?

A metric for a space is an equation that says how to compute any distance in that space. In two-dimensional plane satisfying Euclidean geometry, the equation for the metric is:

d2 = (x1 – x2)2+ (y1 – y2)2

and it defines what is meant by the distance d between the point with the Cartesian coordinates (x1 , x2) and the point with the Cartesian coordinates (y1 , y2), provided all the units are the same, such as meters. The x numbers are values in the x dimension, that is, parallel to the x-axis, and the y numbers are values in the y dimension. The above equation is essentially the Pythagorean Theorem of plane geometry. Here is a visual representation of this for the two points:       The equation d2 = (x1 – x2)2+ (y1 – y2)2 is often expressed as a difference equation using the delta symbol Δ to produce:

(Δd)2 = (Δx)2+ (Δy)2

where Δx = x1 – x2 and Δy = y1 – y2. The delta symbol Δ is not a number but rather is an operator on two numbers. If the differences are extremely small, infinitesimally small, then they are called differentials instead of differences, and Δx becomes dx, and Δy becomes dy, and we have entered the realm of differential calculus. The letter d in a differential stands for an infinitesimally small delta, and it is not the d in the diagram above.

Let’s generalize this idea about 2D-space to 4D-spacetime. Although there is neither a duration between New York City and Paris, nor a spatial distance between noon and midnight, nevertheless there is a spacetime interval between New York City at noon and Paris at midnight.  This interval is distance-like, but it is not a spatial distance. Two events that occur far apart but very close to the same time have a very small time interval but a large spacetime interval.

The interval is objective in the sense that, unlike temporal durations and spatial distances, it is not relative to a reference frame. Physicists require that objective magnitudes be frame-free. All observers measure the same value for an interval, assuming they measure it correctly.

Any space’s metric says how to go about computing the value of the interval or separation s between any two points in that space. In the four-dimensional space called spacetime that obeys the laws of special relativity, the metric, called a pseudo-Riemannian metric,  is defined between two infinitesimally close points of spacetime to be:

ds2 = c2dt2 dx2

where ds is an infinitesimal interval (or a so-called differential displacement of the spacetime coordinates) between two nearby point-events in the spacetime; c is the speed of light; the differential dt is the infinitesimal duration between the time coordinates of the two events; and dx is the infinitesimal spatial distance between the events. Because there are three dimensions of space in a four-dimensional spacetime satisfying the special theory of relativity, namely dimensions 1, 2, and 3, the differential spatial distance dx is defined to be:

dx2 = dx12 + dx22 + dx32

The differential dx1 is the displacement along dimension 1 of the three dimensions. This is about spatial distance, not the interval. That is, ds is not identical to dx unless the two events occur at almost the same time. The equation is obtained in Cartesian coordinates by using the Pythagorean Theorem for three-dimensional space. (If the spacetime does not obey the special theory of relativity, the above equation requires replacement with a much more complicated one.)

The techniques of calculus can then be applied to these differential equations to find the interval between any two point-events even if they are not nearby in spacetime, so long as we have the information about the worldline s, such as its equation in the coordinate system..

In special relativity, the interval between two events that occur at the same place such as the place where the clock is sitting is very simple. Since dx = 0, the interval is just the duration between the events. That is, time’s metric says the duration t between point-event a with time coordinate t(a) and event b with time coordinate t(b) is t(a,b) where:

t(a,b) = |t(b) – t(a)|.

This is the absolute value of the difference between the real-valued time coordinates, assuming all times are specified in the same units, say, seconds.

This equation shows how one should use a clock to tell the duration between any two events a and b. For example, the duration between the event of the clock displaying two and the event of the same clock’s next display of five is |5 – 2|, namely 3. There are no units. 3 what? The units need to be specified and be the same for both numbers before the subtraction process is carried out.

Now let us generalize this notion of how to use a clock in special relativity to measure proper time. The infinitesimal proper time dτ, rather than the differential coordinate-time dt, is the duration shown by a clock carried along the infinitesimal interval ds. It is defined in any spacetime obeying special relativity to be:

2= ds2/c2.

In general, dτ ≠ dt. They are equal only if the two point-events have the same spatial location so that dx = 0. Recognizing this difference between proper time and coordinate time is the key to solving the twins paradox.

The interval is sometimes helpfully thought of as being like spatial distance  because it is a measure of the separation between any two point-events, and the units of the interval are spatial units such as meters. But because these spacetime “distances” can be negative, and because the spacetime interval between two different events can be zero even when the events are far apart in spatial distance (but reachable by a light ray if intervening material were not an obstacle), the term interval here is not what is normally meant by the term distance. To repeat an important point, the interval between two points of spacetime is the same for all reference frames, so it is objective and not relative, unlike the duration between the two.

There are three kinds of spacetime intervals: timelike, spacelike, and null. In spacetime, if two events are in principle connectable by a signal moving from one event to the other at less than light speed, the interval between the two events is called timelike, which means there is no reference frame in which they occur simultaneously, so the two events must occur at different times—thus the name timelike. The interval is spacelike if there is no reference frame in which the two events occur at the same place, so they must occur at different places and be some spatial distance apart—thus the choice of the word spacelike. That is, the two events would be connectable only by a signal that moves faster than light speed, so the signaling particle would be a tachyon. Two events connectable by a signal moving exactly at light speed are separated by a null interval, an interval of magnitude zero.

Here is an equivalent way of describing the three kinds of spacetime interval. If one of the two events occurs at the origin of a lightcone, and the other event is within the forward lightcone or backward lightcone, then the two events have a timelike interval. If the other event is outside the light cones, then the two events have a spacelike interval, and if the two events lie on the same light cone, then their interval is null or zero.

The spacetime interval between any two events in a human being’s life must be a timelike interval. No human being can do anything that will allow them to affect events outside their light cone. Such is the human condition in relativity theory.

The information in the metric also enables you to compute the curvature at any point. The technical name for all this information is the Riemannian metric tensor field. This is what you know when you know the metric of spacetime.

The equation t(a,b) = |t(b) – t(a)| is the standardly accepted way to compute durations when curvature is not involved, but philosophers have asked whether one could just as well have used half that absolute value, or the square root of the absolute value. More generally, is one definition of the metric better than another? Philosophers are interested in the underlying issue of whether the choice of a metric is natural in the sense of being objective or whether its choice is a matter of convention.

A space’s metric provides a complete description of the local properties of the space, regardless of whether the space is a physical space or a mathematical space representing spacetime. By contrast, the space’s topology provides a complete description of the global properties of the space.

The metric in general relativity normally is expressed in terms of action on displacements and is much more complicated than the metric for special relativity. The metric is not the same across space and time; it can change its character in exotic ways from one spacetime point to the next due to the distribution over time of matter and energy in the universe. The mathematical intricacies of this are not pursued in this article.

The discussion of the metric continues in the discussion of time coordinates. For a helpful and more detailed presentation of the spacetime interval and the spacetime metric, see (Maudlin 2012), especially chapter 4.

8. How Does Proper Time Differ from Coordinate Time?

Under normal circumstances where relativity theory is not needed, there is no difference between proper time and coordinate time. Consider two point events. The coordinate time between them is the time elapsed between them as represented along the time coordinate of the coordinate system. A proper time between them is the time along the world line of a clock transported between the two events. Because there are many physically possible ways to do the clock transporting, for example at slow speed or high speed, there are many proper times for the two events. The slowest transport method takes the most time, and this is the coordinate time that elapses between the two events.

To speak informally, proper time is personal and coordinate time is public. Every properly functioning clock measures its own proper time, the time along its own worldline, no matter how the clock is moving or what forces are acting upon it.  If a clock is stationary in the coordinate system and not influenced by gravity, then the clock also measures coordinate time.

Each reference frame has its own way of splitting up spacetime into its space part and its time part, so the coordinate time of one frame can be very different from the coordinate time of another frame in the sense that their coordinate clocks will disagree with each other about what time it is and how long some event lasted. The proper time between two events is objective and does not depend upon what reference frame is chosen.

Here is a way to maximize the difference between proper time and coordinate time. If you and your clock pass through the event horizon of a black hole and fall toward the hole’s center, you won’t notice anything unusual about your proper time, but external observers using Earth’s standard coordinate time will never be able to record you even reaching the event horizon. In principle it takes you an infinite amount of Earth time to reach the horizon.  Since you do pass through the horizon, so you will live for longer than an infinite amount of Earth time.

Authors and speakers who use the word time often do not specify whether they mean proper time or coordinate time. They assume the context is sufficient to tell us what they mean. So, we readers and listeners need to be alert.

See the article Proper Time for a deeper discussion of proper time.

9. Is Time the Fourth Dimension?

Yes and no; it depends on what is meant by the question. Time is the fourth dimension of 4-d spacetime, but time is not the fourth dimension of physical space because that space has only three dimensions. In 4-d spacetime, the time dimension is special and differs in a fundamental way from the other three dimensions.

Mathematicians have a broader notion of the term space than the average person. In their sense, a space need not contain any geographical locations nor any times. Such a space might be two-dimensional and contain points for the ordered pairs in which a pair’s first member is the name of a voter in London and its second member is the income of that voter. Not paying attention to the two meanings of the term space is the source of all the confusion about whether time is the fourth dimension.

Newton treated space as three dimensional and treated time as a separate one-dimensional space. He could have used Minkowski’s 1908 idea, if he had thought of it, namely the idea of treating spacetime as four-dimensional.

The mathematical space used by mathematical physicists to represent physical spacetime that obeys the laws of relativity is four-dimensional; and in that mathematical space, the space of places is a 3D sub-space, and time is another sub-space, a 1D one. The mathematician Hermann Minkowski was the first person to construct such a mathematical space, although in 1895 H. G. Wells treated time informally as the fourth dimension in his novel The Time Machine.

In 1908, Minkowski remarked that “Henceforth space by itself, and time by itself, are doomed to fade away into mere shadows, and only a kind of union of the two will preserve an independent reality.” Many people mistakenly took this to mean that time is partly space, and vice versa. The philosopher C. D. Broad countered that the discovery of spacetime did not break down the distinction between time and space but only their independence or isolation.

The reason why time is not partly space is that, within a single frame, time is always distinct from space. Another way of saying this is to say time always is a distinguished dimension of spacetime, not an arbitrary dimension. What being distinguished amounts to, speaking informally, is that when you set up a rectangular coordinate system on a spacetime with an origin at, say, some important event, you may point the x-axis east or north or up or any of an infinity of other directions, but you may not point it forward in time—you may do that only with the t-axis, the time axis.

For any coordinate system on spacetime, mathematicians of the early twentieth century believed it was necessary to treat a point-event with at least four independent numbers in order to account for the four dimensionality of spacetime. Actually this appeal to the 19th-century definition of dimensionality, which is due to Bernhard Riemann, is not quite adequate because mathematicians have subsequently discovered how to assign each point on the plane to a point on the line without any two points on the plane being assigned to the same point on the line. The idea comes from the work of Georg Cantor. Because of this one-to-one correspondence between the plane’s points and the line’s points, the points on a plane could be specified with just one number instead of two. If so, then the line and plane must have the same dimensions according to the Riemann definition of dimension. To avoid this result, and to keep the plane being a 2D object, the notion of dimensionality of space has been given a new, but rather complex, definition.

10. Is There More Than One Kind of Physical Time?

Every reference frame on physical spacetime has its own physical time, but the question is intended in another sense. At present, physicists measure time electromagnetically. They define a standard atomic clock using periodic electromagnetic processes in atoms, then use electromagnetic signals (light) to synchronize clocks that are far from the standard clock. In doing this, are physicists measuring “electromagnetic time” but not also other kinds of physical time?

In the 1930s, the physicists Arthur Milne and Paul Dirac worried about this question. Independently, they suggested there may be very many time scales. For example, there could be the time of atomic processes and perhaps also a time of gravitation and large-scale physical processes. Clocks for the two processes might drift out of synchrony after being initially synchronized, yet there would be no reasonable explanation for why they do not stay in synchrony. Ditto for clocks based on the pendulum, on superconducting resonators, on the spread of electromagnetic radiation through space, and on other physical principles. Just imagine the difficulty for physicists if they had to work with electromagnetic time, gravitational time, nuclear time, neutrino time, and so forth. Current physics, however, has found no reason to assume there is more than one kind of time for physical processes.

In 1967, physicists did reject the astronomical standard for the atomic standard because the deviation between known atomic and gravitation periodic processes such as the Earth’s rotations and revolutions could be explained better assuming that the atomic processes were the most regular of these phenomena. But this is not a cause for worry about two times drifting apart. Physicists still have no reason to believe a gravitational periodic process that is not affected by friction or impacts or other forces would ever drift out of synchrony with an atomic process such as the oscillations of a quartz crystal, yet this is the possibility that worried Milne and Dirac.

This happy result shows that time is a feature that reaches across all processes. We can add that it reaches across all processes at any time because all fundamental physical laws satisfy time translation invariance. That is, replacing its time variable t everywhere in a law by t + 4 (or instead t – 4) does not change what processes are allowed by the law. So, the duration of a particular process is the same whether it occurs yesterday, today, or tomorrow, all other things being equal.

Finally, we can say time is a feature that reaches across all processes at any time anywhere, because replacing spatial position x everywhere in a fundamental law by x +4 makes no difference to the lawfulness of the process, all other things being equal.

11. How Is Time Relative to the Observer?

Physical time is relative to an observer. An observer in physics is an ideal point particle or point-person. An observer is always accompanied, in principle, by an ideal, point-sized, massless, perfectly functioning clock.

Physical time is not relative to any observer’s state of mind. Wishing time will pass does not affect the rate at which the observed clock ticks. On the other hand, physical time is relative to the observer’s reference system—in trivial ways and in a deep way discovered by Albert Einstein.

In a trivial way, time is relative to the chosen coordinate system on the reference frame. For example, it depends on the units chosen as when the duration of some event is 34 seconds if seconds are defined to be a certain number of ticks of the standard clock, but is 24 seconds if seconds are defined to be a different number of ticks of that standard clock. Similarly, the difference between the Christian calendar and the Jewish calendar for the date of some event is due to a different unit and origin. Also trivially, time depends on the coordinate system when a change is made from Eastern Standard Time to Pacific Standard Time. These dependencies are taken into account by scientists but usually never mentioned. For example, if a pendulum’s approximately one-second swing is measured in a physics laboratory during the autumn night when the society changes from Daylight Savings Time back to Standard Time, the scientists do not note that one unusual swing of the pendulum that evening took a negative fifty-nine minutes and fifty-nine seconds instead of the usual one second.

Is time relative to the observer’s coordinate system in the sense that in some reference frames there could be fifty-nine seconds in a minute? No, due to scientific convention, it is absolutely certain that there are sixty seconds in any minute in any reference frame. How long an event lasts is relative to the reference frame used to measure the time elapsed, but in any reference frame there are exactly sixty seconds in a minute because this is true by definition. Similarly, you do not need to worry that in some reference frame there might be two gallons in a quart.

In a deeper sense, time is relative, not just to the coordinate system, but to the reference frame itself. Einstein’s idea is that without reference to the frame, there is no fixed time interval between two events, no ‘actual’ duration between them. This idea was philosophically shocking as well as scientifically revolutionary.

12. What Is the Relativity of Simultaneity?

In our ordinary lives, we can neglect the time required for signals from sources or events to reach our clocks, our eyes, and our consciousness.  And we can neglect whether those signals come from stationary sources or moving sources. Not so, in principle.

The relativity of simultaneity is the feature of spacetime in which two different reference frames moving relative to each other will disagree on which events are simultaneous. A large percentage of both physicists and philosophers of time suggest that this implies simultaneity is not objectively real, and they conclude also that the present is not objectively real. These arguments are discussed in the main Time article, but a bit more detail on the subject is added here.

Consider the question: How do we tell the time of occurrence of an event that is very far away from us? We assign the time of the distant event by subtracting, from the time when we first detect the event, the time it took the signal to travel to us.

For example, we see a flash of light at time t arriving from a distant place P. When did the flash occur back at P? Let’s call that time tp. Here is how to compute tp. Suppose we know the distance x from us to P. Then the flash occurred at t minus the travel time for the light. That travel time is x/c. So,

tp = t – x/c.

For example, if we see an explosion on the Sun at t, then we know to say it really occurred about eight minutes before, because x/c is approximately eight minutes, where x is the distance from Earth to the Sun. In this way, we know what events on the distant Sun are simultaneous with what clicks on our Earth clock.

The deeper problem is that other observers will not agree with us that the event on the Sun occurred when we say it did. The diagram below illustrates the problem. Let’s assume that our spacetime obeys the special theory of relativity.

There are two light flashes that occur simultaneously, with Einstein at rest midway between them in this diagram.


The Minkowski diagram represents Einstein sitting still in the reference frame (marked by the coordinate system with the thick black axes) while Lorentz is not sitting still but is traveling rapidly away from him and toward the source of flash 2. Because Lorentz’s worldline is a straight line, we can tell that he is moving at a constant speed. The two flashes of light arrive at Einstein’s location simultaneously, creating spacetime event B. However, Lorentz sees flash 2 before flash 1. That is, the event A of Lorentz seeing flash 2 occurs before event C of Lorentz seeing flash 1. So, Einstein will readily say the flashes are simultaneous, but Lorentz will have to do some computing to figure out that the flashes are simultaneous in the Einstein frame because they will not “look” simultaneous to Lorentz. However, if we’d chosen a different reference frame from the one above, one in which Lorentz is not moving but Einstein is, then Lorentz would be correct to say flash 2 occurs before flash 1 in that new frame. So, whether the flashes are or are not simultaneous depends on which reference frame is used in making the judgment. It’s all relative.

13. What Is the Conventionality of Simultaneity?

The relativity of simultaneity is philosophically less controversial than the conventionality of simultaneity. To appreciate the difference, consider what is involved in making a determination regarding simultaneity. Given two events that happen essentially at the same place, physicists assume they can tell by direct observation whether the events happened simultaneously. If we cannot detect that one of them happening first, then we say they happened simultaneously, and we assign them the same time coordinate in our reference frame. The determination of simultaneity is more difficult if the two happen at separate places, especially if they are very far apart. One way to measure (operationally define) simultaneity at a distance is to say that two events are simultaneous in a reference frame if unobstructed light signals from the two events would reach us simultaneously when we are midway between the two places where they occur, as judged in that frame. This is the operational definition of simultaneity used by Einstein in his theory of special relativity.

The midway method described above has a significant presumption: that the light beams travel at the same speed regardless of direction. Einstein and the philosophers of time Hans Reichenbach and Adolf Grünbaum have called this a reasonable convention because any attempt to experimentally confirm it presupposes that we already know how to determine simultaneity at a distance. Suppose the event of our here-and-now is A, and suppose some distant event B is in our absolute elsewhere. Einstein noticed that there is no physical basis for judging the simultaneity or lack of simultaneity between A and B without presupposing that light travels at the same speed from A to B as from B to A. The presumption of the equality of speeds is a convention.

Hilary Putnam, Michael Friedman, and Graham Nerlich object to calling it a convention—on the grounds that to make any other assumption about light’s speed would unnecessarily complicate our description of nature, and we often make choices about how nature is on the basis of simplification of our description.

To understand the dispute, notice that the midway method above is not the only way to define simultaneity. Consider a second method, the mirror reflection method. Select an Earth-based frame of reference, and send a flash of light from Earth to Mars where it hits a mirror and is reflected back to its source. The flash occurred at 12:00 according to an Earth clock, let’s say, and its reflection arrived back on Earth 20 minutes later. The light traveled the same empty, undisturbed path coming and going. At what time did the light flash hit the mirror? The answer involves the so-called conventionality of simultaneity. All physicists agree one should say the reflection event occurred at 12:10. It took ten minutes going to Mars, and ten minutes coming back. The controversial philosophical question is whether this way of calculating the ten minutes is really a convention. Einstein pointed out that there would be no inconsistency in our saying that the flash hit the mirror at 12:17, provided we live with the awkward consequence that light was relatively slow getting to the mirror, but then traveled back to Earth at a faster speed.

Suppose we want to synchronize a Mars clock with our clock on Earth. Let’s draw a Minkowski diagram of the situation and consider just one spatial dimension in which we are at location A with the standard clock for the reference frame. The distant clock we want to synchronize is at location B. See the following diagram.

conventionality of simultaneity graph

The fact that the worldline of the B-clock is parallel to the time axis shows that the clock there is stationary. We will send light signals in order to synchronize the two clocks. Send a light signal from A at time t1 to B, where it is reflected back to us, arriving at time t3. Then the reading tr on the distant clock at the time of the reflection event should be t2, where:

t2 = (1/2)(t3 + t1).

If tr = t2, then the two clocks are synchronized.

Einstein noticed that the use of the fraction 1/2 in the equation t2 = (1/2)(t3 + t1) rather than the use of some other fraction implicitly assumes that the light speed to and from B is the same. He said this assumption is a convention, the so-called conventionality of simultaneity, and is not something we could check to see whether it is correct. If t2 were (1/3)(t3 + t1), then the light would travel to B faster and return more slowly. If t2 were (2/3)(t3 + t1), then the light would travel to B relatively slowly and return faster. Either way, the average travel speed to and from would be c. Only with the fraction (1/2) are the travel speeds the same going and coming back.

Notice how we would check whether the two light speeds really are the same. We would send a light signal from A to B, and see if the travel time was the same as when we sent it from B to A. But to trust these times we would already need to have synchronized the clocks at A and B. But that synchronization process will use the equation t2 = (1/2)(t3 + t1), with the (1/2) again, so we are arguing in a circle here.

As noted, not all philosophers of science agree with Einstein that the choice of (1/2) is a convention, nor with those philosophers such as Putnam who say the messiness of any other choice shows that the choice of 1/2 must be correct. Everyone does agree, though, that any other choice than (1/2) would make for messy physics.

However, some researchers suggest that there is a way to check on the light speeds and not simply presume they are the same. Transport one of the clocks to B at an infinitesimal speed. Going this slow, the clock will arrive at B without having its own time deviate from that of the A-clock. That is, the two clocks will be synchronized even though they are distant from each other. Now the two clocks can be used to find the time when a light signal left A and the time when it arrived at B. The time difference can be used to compute the light speed. This speed can be compared with the speed computed for a signal that left B and then arrived at A. The experiment has never been performed, but the recommenders are sure that the speeds to and from will turn out to be identical, so they are sure that the (1/2) in the equation t2 = (1/2)(t3 + t1) is correct and not a convention. For more discussion of this controversial issue of conventionality in relativity, see (Callender 2017, p. 51) and pp. 179-184 of The Blackwell Guide to the Philosophy of Science, edited by Peter Machamer and Michael Silberstein, Blackwell Publishers, Inc., 2002.

14. What are the Absolute Past and the Absolute Elsewhere?

What does it mean to say the human condition is one in which you never will be able to affect an event outside your forward light cone? With any action you take, the speed of transmission of your action to its effect cannot move faster than c. This c is the c in E = mc2. It is the maximum speed in any reference frame. It is the speed of light and the speed of anything else with zero rest mass; it is also the speed of any electron or quark at the big bang before the Higgs field appeared and slowed them down.

Here is a visual representation of the human condition according to the special theory of relativity, whose spacetime can always be represented by a Minkowski diagram of the following sort:


The absolutely past events (the green events in the diagram above) are the events in or on the backward light cone of your present event, your here-and-now. The backward light cone of event Q is the imaginary cone-shaped surface of spacetime points formed by the paths of all light rays reaching Q from the past.

The events in your absolute past are those that could have directly or indirectly affected you, the observer, at the present moment. The events in your absolute future are those that you could directly or indirectly affect.

An event’s being in another event’s absolute past is a feature of spacetime itself because the event is in the point’s past in all possible reference frames. This feature is frame-independent. For any event in your absolute past, every observer in the universe (who is not making an error) will agree the event happened in your past. Not so for events that are in your past but not in your absolute past. Past events not in your absolute past are in what Eddington called your absolute elsewhere. The absolute elsewhere is the region of spacetime containing events that are not causally connectible to your here-and-now. Your absolute elsewhere is the region of spacetime that is neither in nor on either your forward or backward light cones. No event here and now, can affect any event in your absolute elsewhere; and no event in your absolute elsewhere can affect you here and now.

A single point’s absolute elsewhere, absolute future, and absolute past partition all of spacetime beyond the point into three disjoint regions. If point-event A is in point-event B’s absolute elsewhere, the two events are said to be spacelike related. If the two are in each other’s forward or backward light cones they are said to be time-like related or to be causally connectible. The order of occurrence of a space-like event (before or after or simultaneous with your here-and-now) depends on the chosen frame of reference, but the order of a time-like event and your here-and-now does not. Another way to make the point is to say we have a free choice about the time order of two events that are space-like related, but we have no freedom when it comes to two events that are time-like related because the causal order determines their time order. That is why the absolute elsewhere is also called the extended present. There is no fact of the matter about whether a point in your absolute elsewhere is in your present, your past, or your future.

For any two events in spacetime, they are time-like, space-like, or light-like separated, and this is an objective feature of the pair that cannot change with a change in the reference frame. This is another implication of the fact that the light-cone structure of space-time is real and objective, unlike features such as durations and lengths.

The past light cone looks like a cone in small regions. However, the past light cone is not cone-shaped in a large cosmological region, but rather has a pear-shape because all very ancient light lines must have come from the infinitesimal volume at the big bang.

15. What Is Time Dilation?

Time dilation occurs when two synchronized clocks get out of synchrony due either to their relative motion or due to their being in regions of different gravitational field strengths.

According to special relativity, if you are in the center of the field of a large sports stadium filled with spectators, and you suddenly race to the exit door at constant, high speed, everyone else in the stadium will get thinner (in the frame fixed to you now) than they were originally (in the frame fixed to you before you left for the exit).

Here is a picture of the visual distortion of moving objects described by special relativity:

rolling wheel
Image: Corvin Zahn, Institute of Physics, Universität Hildesheim,
Space Time Travel (http://www.spacetimetravel.org/)

The picture describes the same wheel in different colors: (green) rotating in place just below the speed of light; (blue) moving left to right just below the speed of light; and (red) remaining still.

16. How Does Gravity Affect Time?

According to the general theory of relativity, gravitational differences affect time by dilating it. Observers in a less intense gravitational potential field find that clocks in a more intense gravitational potential field run slow relative to their own clocks. People in ground floor apartments outlive their twins in penthouses, all other things being equal. Basement flashlights will be shifted toward the red end of the visible spectrum compared to the flashlights in attics. All these phenomena are the effects of gravitational time dilation.

Spacetime in the presence of gravity is curved. So, time is curved, too. When time curves, clocks do not bend in space or run backward, but a clock can be used to detect the curvature of time by detecting gravitational time dilation. This curvature shows up in spacetime diagrams because the diagram needs curvilinear coordinates instead of rectangular coordinates in order to obey general relativity.

17. What Happens to Time near a Black Hole?

A black hole is a very special region of extremely warped spacetime. Here is a 2019 “photo” of one. It is surrounded by a red and yellow halo and weighs about 6.5 billion times more than our Sun:

photo of black hole
Taken by the European Southern Observatory

Any black hole is highly compressed matter-energy whose gravitational field strength out to a certain distance, called the event horizon, is strong enough that it warps spacetime so severely that no object or radiation coming from inside the horizon can escape, making the hole look black to outsiders, according to general relativity.

The event horizon is a surface separating the inside from the outside of the black hole. If you were unlucky enough to fall through the event horizon, you could see out, but you could not send a signal out, nor could you yourself escape. You would be crushed to death. The more mass that falls in, the greater the diameter of the horizon. According to general relativity, at the horizon there is no unusual curvature or radical change in any measurable quantity. According to quantum theory, there may be a measurable firewall just outside the event horizon that is hot enough to incinerate most anything falling in, and so the black hole would not look black.

Relativity theory implies the black hole’s center has a singularity of infinite density and infinite spacetime curvature where all its infalling matter has been crushed to a point, but quantum theory disallows this singularity and implies the center is just very tiny. Either way, with or without the singularity, the black hole has the odd geometric feature that its diameter is very much larger than its circumference.

If you were in a spaceship approaching a black hole and getting near its event horizon, then your time warp would become very significant as judged by observers back on Earth using Earth time. The warp would be more severe the longer you stayed in the vicinity and also the closer you got to the event horizon. As judged in a reference frame fixed to your spaceship, if you fell through the event horizon at 12:00 on your spaceship’s clock, then your SOS signal sent at that time or later would never escape the black hole. Viewed from a telescope on Earth, as the same spaceship approached the horizon, your spaceship clock would be seen to slow down and progressively approach 12:00, but would never quite reach 12:00. You would be almost frozen near the horizon, and your signals sent back to the Earth astronomer would become dimmer and lower in frequency as your spaceship slowed its speed. From an Earth astronomer’s perspective, nothing has ever had enough time to fall into a black hole. These are counterintuitive truths, but they do follow from the laws of general relativity.

Any macroscopic object can become a black hole if sufficiently compressed to a size called the Schwarzschild radius. If our Earth were somehow compressed until its radius is less than 1.5 centimeters, it would become a black hole. The black hole at the center of the Milky Way has a mass of four million of our suns.

A white hole behaves like a time-reversed black hole. Outside of a white hole, objects could be observed radiating away from the hole. This would look as if something is coming from nothing. The big bang is almost a white hole except that white holes have event horizons with an inside and an outside, but the big bang did not have that feature (so far as is known). No white holes have been detected in our universe. They remain a mere physical physical possibility.

According to relativity theory, if a black hole is turning or twisting, as most are, then inside the event horizon there inevitably will be closed time-like curves, and so objects in the black hole can undergo past time travel, although they cannot escape the black hole by going back to a time before they were within the black hole.

Perhaps an even odder temporal feature of turning black holes is that it is better to think of a person or object, once it falls inside the black hole’s event horizon, as aging toward the center rather than as spatially falling toward the center. This is because inside the horizon the roles of time and space are switched. The center is not a place in space; it is a moment when time ends. After falling in, trying to avoid the center region by switching on extra rocket power is as pointless as getting in a car here on Earth and driving faster in order to avoid tomorrow afternoon. For more discussion of why time and space switch roles inside a black hole, see https://www.youtube.com/watch?v=KePNhUJ2reI.

There are equally startling visual effects. A light ray can circle a black hole once or many times depending upon its angle of incidence to the event horizon. A light ray grazing a black hole can leave at any angle, so a person viewing a black hole from outside can see multiple copies of the rest of the universe at various angles. See http://www.spacetimetravel.org/reiseziel/reiseziel1.html for some of these visual effects.

Quantum theory applied to black holes implies (1) they do not have singularities at their centers, (2) they are not totally black, and (3) information falling in must get back out, although in a radically transformed manner.

Regarding point (2) above, as seen from a stationary observer back on Earth, as the size of the hole gets smaller and its evaporation process continues, its Bekenstein-Hawking Radiation coming from the event horizon rises in frequency. When the hole is very tiny, about the size of a bacterium, its outgoing radiation becomes white-colored, producing a white black hole. At the very last instant of its life, it evaporates as it explodes in a flash of extremely high-energy particles. During the last tenth of a second the tiny black hole releases this energy at a rate of 1029 erg/s .

Regarding point (3), if an encyclopedia were to fall into a black hole, all of its information eventually would leak back out by being encoded in the Bekenstein-Hawking radiation that is created at the event horizon. Eventually, the hole will evaporate and disappear unless new material keeps falling in. The bigger the hole, the longer it takes to evaporate.

Although the curvature of spacetime near Earth is very small compared to that near a black hole, it is significant enough that gravitational time dilation must be accounted for in clocks that are part of the Global Positioning System Satellites. This dilation plus the time dilation due to speed makes time in the satellite run about seven microseconds faster compared to Earth’s surface time. Therefore, these GPS satellites are launched with their clocks adjusted ahead of Earth clocks and then are periodically readjusted ahead so that they stay synchronized with Earth’s standard time. Because relativity theory can be used to accurately predicate the dilation of the satellite clocks, every time you use your smart phone to get directions you are confirming the theory of relativity.

The term “black hole” was coined by a student of John Wheeler during a lecture in 1967. Wheeler promoted use of the term. In 1958, David Finkelstein had first proposed that relativity implies there could be dense regions of space from which nothing can escape. In 1783, John Michell proposed that there may be a star with a large enough diameter that the velocity required to escape its gravitational pull would be so great that not even Newton’s particles of light could escape. He called them “dark stars.”

18. What Is the Solution to the Twins Paradox?

The paradox is an argument about time dilation that uses the theory of relativity to produce an apparent contradiction. Before giving that argument, let’s set up the situation. Consider two twins at rest on Earth with their clocks synchronized. One twin climbs into a spaceship, and flies far away at a high, constant speed, then stops, reverses course, and flies back at the same speed. An application of the equations of special relativity theory implies that because of time dilation the twin on the spaceship will return and be younger than the Earth-based twin. Now that the situation has been set up, the (faulty) argument for the twins paradox is that either twin could regard the other as the traveler. If the spaceship were considered to be stationary, then would not relativity theory imply that the Earth-based twin could race off (while attached to the Earth) and return to be the younger of the two twins? If so, then when the twins reunite, each is younger than the other. That result is paradoxical.

In brief, the solution to this paradox is that the two situations are not sufficiently similar, and that in both situations, for reasons to be explained in a moment, the twin who stays home outside of the spaceship maximizes his or her own time (that is, proper time) and so is always the older twin when the two reunite. This solution to the paradox has nothing to do with a proper or improper choice of the reference frame; and it has nothing to do with acceleration although a twin does accelerate in the situation; it has instead to do with the fact that some paths in spacetime must take more proper time to complete than do other paths.

Herbert Dingle was the President of London’s Royal Astronomical Society in the early 1950s. He famously argued in the 1960s that the twins paradox reveals an inconsistency in special relativity. Almost all philosophers and scientists now agree that it is not a true paradox, in the sense of revealing an inconsistency within relativity theory, but is merely a complex puzzle that can be adequately solved within relativity theory.

There have been a variety of suggestions on how to understand the paradox. Here is one, diagrammed below.

twin paradox

The principal suggestion for solving the paradox is to note that there must be a difference in the time taken by the twins because their behaviors are different, as shown by the number of nodes along their two worldlines above. The coordinate time, that is, the time shown by clocks fixed in space in the coordinate system is the same for both travelers. Their personal times are not the same. The key idea for resolving the paradox is not that one twin accelerates and the other does not, though that does happen. It’s that their worldlines in spacetime have different proper times. Relativity theory requires that for two paths that begin and end at the same point, the longer the path in space, and thus the longer the worldline in the spacetime diagram, the shorter the elapsed proper time along that path. That is counterintuitive but well-confirmed by experiment.

A free-falling clock ticks faster and more often than any other clock that is used to measure the duration between two events such as the event of when the twins leave each other and the event of their reunion. This is illustrated graphically by the fact that the longer worldline in the graph represents a greater distance in space and a greater interval in spacetime but a shorter duration along that worldline. The number of dots in the line is a measure of the time taken by the traveler. The spacing of the dots represents a tick of a personal clock along that worldline and thus represents the time elapsed along the worldline. If the spaceship approached the speed of light, that twin would cover an enormous amount of space before the reunion, but that twin’s clock would hardly have ticked at all before the reunion event.

To repeat this solution in other words, the diagram shows how sitting still on Earth is a way of maximizing the time during the trip, and it shows how flying near light speed in a spaceship away from Earth and then back again is a way of minimizing the time for the trip, even though if you paid attention only to the shape of the worldlines in the diagram and not to the dot spacing within them you might mistakenly think just the reverse. This odd feature of the geometry is one reason why Minkowski geometry is different from Euclidean geometry. So, the conclusion of the analysis of the paradox is that its reasoning makes the mistake of supposing that the situation of the two twins can properly be considered to be essentially the same.

Richard Feynman famously, but mistakenly, argued in 1975 that acceleration is the key to the paradox. As (Maudlin 2012), argues, the acceleration that occurs in the paths of the example above is not essential to the paradox because the paradox could be expressed in a spacetime obeying special relativity in which neither twin accelerates yet the twin in the spaceship always returns younger. The paradox can be described using a situation in which spacetime is compactified in the spacelike direction with no intrinsic spacetime curvature, only extrinsic curvature. Imagine this situation: All of Minkowski spacetime is like a very thin, flat cardboard sheet. Then roll it into a cylinder, like the tube you have after using the last paper towel on the roll. Do not stretch, tear, or otherwise deform the sheet.  Let the time axis be parallel to the tube length and the (one-dimensional) space axis be a circular cross-section of the tube. The universe is flat intrinsically, as required by special relativity, but curved extrinsically (which is allowed by special relativity). The travelling twin’s spaceship circles the universe at constant velocity. The stay-at-home twin sits still. The twin who circles the closed universe is travelling in a spiral as viewed from a higher dimensional Euclidean space in which the tube is embedded. Neither twin accelerates. There need be no Earth nor any mass for either twin. The twin who circles the universe comes back younger.

More time elapses for the stay-at-home twin, so when the two reunite, the stay-at-home twin will have read farther in the book they were both reading, all other things being equal. The moral: If you wish to be more productive, then stay at home.

For more discussion of the paradox, see (Maudlin 2012), pp. 77-83, and p. 157.

19. What Is the Solution to Zeno’s Paradoxes?

See the article “Zeno’s Paradoxes” in this encyclopedia.

20. How Are Coordinates Assigned to Time?

The answer to this question presupposes the reader has understood the section above on what the term reference system means, and how it is used to give time coordinates to times. When coordinate systems are assigned to spaces, coordinates are assigned to points. The space can be physical space, mathematical space, or the space of times. The coordinates hopefully can be assigned in a way that a metric can be defined for the space, so that there is a precise way to compute the distances between points, or, in the case of time, the duration between any two instantaneous times. Points cannot be added, subtracted, or squared, but their coordinates can be. Coordinates applied to the space are not physically real; they are tools used by the analyst, the physicist. In other words, they are invented, not discovered.

Technically, the question, “How do time coordinates get assigned to points in spacetime?” is asking how we coordinatize the four-dimensional manifold, namely spacetime. The manifold is a collection of points (technically, a topological space) which behaves as a Euclidean space in neighborhoods around any point. The focus in this section is on time coordinates.

Every event on the world-line of the standard clock is assigned a t-coordinate by the clock. This is the time axis the coordinate system. The clock can be used to measure a duration between two point events that occur along the coordinate line. In order to extend the t-coordinate to events that do not occur where the standard clock is located, we imagine having a stationary, calibrated, and synchronized clock at every other point in the space part of spacetime at t = 0, use those clocks to tell the time along their worldlines. In practice we do not have so many accurate clocks, so the details for assigning time to these events is fairly complicated and is not discussed here.

Isaac Newton conceived of points of space and time as absolute in the sense that they retained their identity over time. Modern physicists do not have that conception of points; points are identified relative to objects, for example, the halfway point between this object and that object, ten seconds after that event.

In the late 16th century, the Italian mathematician Rafael Bombelli interpreted real numbers as lengths on a line and interpreted addition, subtraction, multiplication, and division as “movements” along the line. His work eventually led to our assigning real numbers to instants and to longer durations.

To assign numbers to times (the numbers being the time coordinates or dates), we use a system of clocks and some calculations, and the procedure is rather complicated. For some of the details, the reader is referred to (Maudlin 2012), pp. 87-105. On pp. 88-89, Maudlin says:

Every event on the world-line of the master clock will be assigned a t-coordinate by the clock. Extending the t-coordinate to events off the trajectory of the master clock requires making use of…a collection of co-moving clocks. Intuitively, two clocks are co-moving if they are both on inertial trajectories and are neither approaching each other nor receding from each other. …An observer situated at the master clock can identify a co-moving inertial clock by radar ranging. That is, the observer sends out light rays from the master clock and then notes how long it takes (according to the master clock) for the light rays to be reflected off the target clock and return. …If the target clock is co-moving, the round-trip time for the light will always be the same. …[W]e must calibrate and synchronize the co-moving clocks.

The master clock is the standard clock. Co-moving inertial clocks do not generally exist, according to general relativity, so the issue of assignments of time coordinates is complicated in the real world. This article highlights only a few aspects of the assignment process, and it repeats and elaborates on some points made above in section 3.

Here is a principal reason for the complications. The main point of having a time coordinate is to get agreement from others about which values of time to use. Relativity theory implies every person and even every object has their so-called proper time, which is the time of the clock they are “carrying,” and these do not stay in synchrony with other clocks. If you were to synchronize two perfect clocks and give one of them a speed relative to the other, then the two clocks readings must differ, so once you’ve moved it away from the standard clock you can no longer trust the clock to report the correct coordinate time at its new location.

The process of assigning time coordinates assumes that the structure of the set of instantaneous events is the same as, or is embeddable within, the structure of our time numbers. Showing that this is so is called solving the representation problem for our theory of time measurement. The problem has been solved. This article does not go into detail on how to solve this problem, but the main idea is that the assignment of coordinates should reflect the structure of the space of instantaneous times, namely its geometrical structure, which includes its topological structure, differential structure, affine structure, and metrical structure. It turns out that the structure of our time numbers is adequately represented by the structure of the real numbers.

If the space has a certain geometry, then the procedure of assigning numbers to time must reflect this geometry. If event A occurs before event B, then the time coordinate of event A, namely t(A), must be less than t(B). If event B occurs after event A but before event C, then we should assign coordinates so that t(A) < t(B) < t(C).

Consider a space as a class of fundamental entities: points. The class of points has “structure” imposed upon it, constituting it as a geometry—say the full structure of space as described by Euclidean geometry. [By assigning coordinates] we associate another class of entities with the class of points, for example a class of ordered n-tuples of real numbers [for a n-dimensional space], and by means of this “mapping” associate structural features of the space described by the geometry with structural features generated by the relations that may hold among the new class of entities—say functional relations among the reals. We can then study the geometry by studying, instead, the structure of the new associated system [of coordinates]. (Sklar, 1976, p. 28)

The goal in assigning coordinates to a space is to create a reference system; this is a reference frame plus (or that includes [the literature is ambiguous on this point]) a coordinate system. For 4-d spacetime obeying special relativity with its Lorentzian geometry, a Lorentzian coordinate system is a grid of smooth timelike and spacelike curves on the spacetime that assigns to each point three space-coordinate numbers and one time-coordinate number. No two distinct points can have the same set of four coordinate numbers. Technically, being continuous is a weaker requirement than being smooth, but the difference won’t be of concern here.

As we get more global, we have to make adjustments. Consider two coordinate systems in adjacent regions. For the adjacent regions, we make sure that the ‘edges’ of the two coordinate systems match up in the sense that each point near the intersection of the two coordinate systems gets a unique set of four coordinates and that nearby points get nearby coordinate numbers. The result is an atlas on spacetime. Inertial frames can have global coordinate systems, but in general, we have to use atlases. If we are working with general relativity where spacetime can curve and we cannot assume inertial frames, then the best we can do without atlases is to assign a coordinate system to a small region of spacetime where the laws of special relativity hold to a good approximation. General relativity requires special relativity to hold locally, and thus for spacetime to be Euclidean locally. That means that locally the 4-d spacetime is correctly described by 4-d Euclidean solid geometry.

For small regions of curved spacetime, we create a coordinate system for a small region by choosing a style of grid, say rectangular coordinates, fixing a point as being the origin, selecting one timelike and three spacelike lines to be the axes, and defining a unit of distance for each dimension. The definition of coordinate system requires us to assign our real numbers in such a way that numerical betweenness among the coordinate numbers reflects the betweenness relation among points. For example, if we assign numbers 17, pi, and 101.3 to instants, then every interval of time that contains the pi instant and the 101.3 instant had better contain the 17 instant. When this feature holds everywhere, the coordinate assignment is said to be monotonic or to “obey the continuity requirement.”

The metric for a space is what specifies what is meant by distance in that space. The metric for spacetime defines the spacetime interval between two spacetime locations, and it is more complicated than the metric for time alone. The spacetime interval between any two events is invariant or unchanged by a change to any other reference frame. More accurately, in the general theory of relativity, only the infinitesimal spacetime interval between two neighboring points needs to be invariant.

There are still other restrictions on the assignments of coordinate numbers. The restriction called the conventionality of simultaneity fixes what time-slices of spacetime can be counted as collections of simultaneous events. An even more complicated restriction is that coordinate assignments satisfy the demands of general relativity. The metric of spacetime in general relativity is not global but varies from place to place due to the presence of matter and gravitation. Spacetime cannot be given its coordinate numbers without our knowing the distribution of matter and energy. That is the principal reason why the assignment of time coordinates to times is so complicated.

The features that a space has without its points being assigned any coordinates whatsoever are its topological features, its differential structures, and its affine structures. The topological features include its dimensionality, whether it goes on forever or has a boundary, and how many points there are. The affine structure is about lines, the geodesic lines.

To approach the question of the assignment of coordinates to spacetime points more philosophically, consider this challenging remark:

Minkowski, Einstein, and Weyl invite us to take a microscope and look, as it were, for little featureless grains of sand, which, closely packed, make up space-time. But Leibniz and Mach suggest that if we want to get a true idea of what a point of space-time is like we should look outward at the universe, not inward into some supposed amorphous treacle called the space-time manifold. The complete notion of a point of space-time in fact consists of the appearance of the entire universe as seen from that point. Copernicus did not convince people that the Earth was moving by getting them to examine the Earth but rather the heavens. Similarly, the reality of different points of space-time rests ultimately on the existence of different (coherently related) viewpoints of the universe as a whole. Modern theoretical physics will have us believe the points of space are uniform and featureless; in reality, they are incredibly varied, as varied as the universe itself.
—From “Relational Concepts of Space and Time” by Julian B. Barbour, The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, Vol. 33, No. 3 (Sep., 1982), p. 265.

For a sophisticated and philosophically-oriented approach to assigning time coordinates to times, see Philosophy of Physics: Space and Time by Tim Maudlin, pp. 24-34.

21. How Do Dates Get Assigned to Actual Events?

The following discussion presupposes the discussion in the previous section. Ideally for any reference frame, we would like to partition the set of all actual events into simultaneity equivalence classes by some reliable method. All events in one equivalence class happen at the same time in the frame, and every event is in some class or other.

Can this be done, and if so, how do we go about doing it? We should be able to say what event near the supergiant star Betelgeuse is happening now (at the same time as our now). To answer this difficult question, let’s begin with some easier questions.

What is happening at time zero in our coordinate system? Well, that was a very long time ago, and the traces of the events, such as historical records, will be unavailable for almost all of the events.  Luckily we need only one event. There is no way to select one point of spacetime and call it the origin of the coordinate system except by reference to actual events that can be measured. In practice, we usually make the origin be the location of a very special event. For one frame, we use the big bang. For another frame, we might use the birth of Jesus or the entrance of Mohammed into Mecca. For another coordinate system, we might be happy to say the time at the origin is when the referee’s starter pistol is fired.

Our purpose in choosing a coordinate system or atlas is to express  time-order relationships (Did this event occur between those two?) and magnitude-duration relationships (How long after A did B occur?) and date-time relationships (When did event A itself occur?). The date of a (point) event is the time coordinate number of the spacetime location where the event occurs. We expect all these assignments of dates to events to satisfy the requirement that event A happens before event B iff t(A) < t(B), where t(A) is the time coordinate of A, namely its date. The assignments of dates to events also must satisfy the demands of our physical theories, and in this case we face serious problems involving inconsistency if a geologist gives one date for the birth of Earth, an astronomer gives a different date, and a theologian gives yet another date.

It is a big step from assigning numbers to points of spacetime to assigning them to real events. Here are some of the questions that need answers. How do we determine whether a nearby event and a very distant event occurred simultaneously? Assuming we want a second to be the standard unit for measuring the time interval between two events, how do we operationally define the second so we can measure whether one event occurred exactly one second later than another event? A related question is: How do we know whether the clock we have is accurate when it reports that one second has elapsed since some earlier event? Less fundamentally, attention must also be paid to the dependency of dates due to shifting from Standard Time to Daylight Savings Time, to crossing the International Date Line, to switching from the Julian to the Gregorian Calendar, and to recognizing leap years and leap seconds.

Let’s design a coordinate system for time. Suppose we have already assigned a date of zero to the event that we choose to be at the origin of our coordinate system. To assign dates (that is, time coordinates) to other events, we first must define a standard clock or master clock and declare that the time intervals between any two consecutive ticks of that clock are the same. The second is our conventional unit of time measurement, and it is defined to be the duration required for a specific number of ticks of the standard clock. We then synchronize other clocks with the standard clock so the clocks show equal readings at the same time. The time or date at which a point-event occurs is the number reading on the clock at rest there. If there is no clock there, the assignment process is more complicated. One could transport a synchronized clock to that place, but any clock speed or influence by a gravitational field during the transport will need to be compensated for. If the place is across the galaxy, then any transport is out of the question, and other means must be used.

Because we want to use clocks to assign a time coordinate even to very distant events, not just to events in the immediate vicinity of the clock, and because we want to do this correctly, some appreciation of Einstein’s theory of relativity is required. A major difficulty is that two nearby synchronized clocks, namely clocks that have been calibrated and set to show the same time when they are next to each other, will not in general stay synchronized if one is transported somewhere else. If they undergo the same motions and gravitational influences, they will stay synchronized; otherwise, they will not. There is no privileged transportation process that we can appeal to. For more on how to assign dates to distant events, see the discussions of the relativity of simultaneity and the conventionality of simultaneity.

As a practical matter, dates are assigned to events in a wide variety of ways. The date of the birth of the Sun is assigned very differently from dates assigned to two successive crests of a light wave in a laboratory laser. For example, there are lasers whose successive crests of visible light waves pass by a given location in the laboratory every 10-15 seconds. This short time is not measured with a stopwatch. It is computed from measurements of the light’s wavelength. We rely on electromagnetic theory for the equation connecting the periodic time of the wave to its wavelength and speed. Dates for other kinds of events, such as the birth of Mohammad or the origin of the Sun, are computed from historical records rather than directly measured with a clock.

22. What Is Essential to Being a Clock?

Clocks designed to measure and report to external observers what time it is are required to count recurring events. More specifically, such a clock always has two internal processes. (1) There is a regular cyclic process: tick, tock, tick, tock, and so forth. Each cycle of the clock is like the previous one in the sense that their durations are congruent, or sufficiently congruent. This point is sometimes expressed by saying the clock’s frequency is constant or sufficiently constant. (2) Also, there is a process that counts these ticks in order to produce an output display regarding time.

A calendar is not a (whole) clock in this sense because it has no cyclic process. A pendulum is not a (whole) clock because it has no counting. In almost all the sections of the current article about time, the term clock refers to clocks designed to measure physical time by counting regular events and displaying the count. Stopwatches, timers, psychological clocks and biological clocks are not of this sort. A stopwatch is a clock designed to display only the duration between when it is turned on and turned off. A timer is a clock-like mechanism designed only to measure a given duration, usually by counting down. A fuse on a bomb is a clock-like time mechanism that does not use counting. Clock-like systems used by organisms to naturally measure psychological time and biological time are not built. They use no display of the time intended for external observers, and they involve no counting of recurring cycles.

Turning to repetitive processes for clocks designed to measure physical time, here are some examples of those processes: the swings of a pendulum, repeated sunrises, daily movements of a shadow in a sundial, the falling of all the sand inside an hourglass each time it is turned over, bouncing mechanical springs, vibrations of a quartz crystal, radioactive decay that occurs at a predictable rate, and repeated bounces of a photon between relatively stationary mirrors. Regularity of the repetitive process is essential because we want a second today to be equal to a second tomorrow, although as a practical matter we have to accept some margin of error or frequency drift.

The larger enterprise of practical time-keeping for our civilization requires that clock readings be available throughout the world. This availability can be accomplished in various ways. The readings of a sundial are available all over the Earth during the daylight. A standard clock sitting in a room in Paris is a practical standard only if either its times can be broadcast quickly throughout the world, or the clock can be copied and calibrated so that the copies stay adequately synchronized even though they are transported to different places throughout the world. If the copies cannot always stay sufficiently synchronized (calibrated) with the clock back in Paris, then we’d like to know how we can compensate for this deviation from synchrony. It wasn’t until the invention in the late nineteenth-century of a special clock that could survive long sea voyages and stay adequately synchronized with clocks back on land that Earth’s mariners could determine their longitude while at sea and thus know where their ship was located.

The count of a clock’s ticks is normally converted and displayed in seconds or in some other standard unit of time such as nanoseconds, hours, or years. This counting can be difficult if there are very many ticks per second, such as in our civilization’s early 21st century standard clock== that ticks 9,192,631,770 times per second.

It is an arbitrary convention that we design clocks to count up to higher numbers rather than down to lower numbers. It is also a convention that we re-set our clock by one hour as we move across a time-zone on the Earth’s surface, or that we add leap days and add or subtract leap seconds. However, it is no convention that the duration from instantaneous event A to instantaneous event B plus the duration from B to instantaneous event C is equal to the duration from A to C. It is one of the objective characteristics of time, and failure for this to work out numerically for your clock is a sure sign your clock is faulty.

We also desire our clocks to be as accurate as is practical. What that means is discussed in the next section.

23. What Does It Mean for a Clock to Be Accurate?

If four clocks read exactly thirteen minutes slow compared to the standard clock, then the four are very precise, but they all are inaccurate by thirteen minutes. An accurate clock is one that achieves its goal. The normal goal is to be in synchrony with the standard clock.

The standard clock reports the coordinate time of the standard coordinate system. The temporal origin of that system, namely the zero of the time axis, is the conventional birthdate of Jesus. The standard clock is at rest at the origin of that coordinate system. Coordinate time is the time along the time-axis of the coordinate system.

Relativity theory implies an accurate clock becomes inaccurate if it is moved relative to the standard clock or if it undergoes different gravitational forces from that of the standard clock. So, nearly all the world’s clocks are inaccurate, given the goal mentioned above. If  the goal of a clock is simply to give an accurate report of its own proper time, then if that clock were ever to be transported to be coincident with the standard clock, the two should agree on the time number they display for the coincidence event.

One philosophical issue is whether the standard clock itself is accurate. Realists will say that the standard clock is our best guess as to what time it really is, and we can make incorrect choices for our standard clock. Anti-realists will say that the standard clock cannot, by definition, be inaccurate, so any choice of a standard clock, even the choice of the president’s heartbeat as our standard clock, will yield a standard clock that is accurate. Leibniz would qualify as an anti-realist because he said the best we can do in setting our clocks is to place them in synchrony with each other. Newton would disagree and say that for the standard clock to be accurate it must tick in synchrony with time itself.

What is meant by accurate is agreeing with the average of the many standard clocks, about 200 of them. Any one of the 200 could fail to stay in sync with the average, and when this happens it is re-set (that is, re-calibrated, or re-synchronized with the average). The re-setting occurs about once a month.

In light of this, reconsider the answer to the question: Can the time shown on a standard clock be inaccurate? Here are some competing suggestions for how to answer to this question.

  1. No, because the goal for accuracy is to find the best clock, and that is just the average of our current standard clocks.
  2. Yes, because the goal for accuracy is absolute time.
  3. Yes, because the goal for accuracy is the best possible clock, and we do not know what that is yet; we would need to see into the future.

Of the three answers, most physicists prefer answer (1).

Because clocks are intended to be used to measure events external to themselves, another goal in clock building is to ensure there is no difficulty in telling which clock tick is simultaneous with which far away events. For most nearby situations and nearby clocks, the sound made by the ticking helps us make this determination. We hear the tick just as we see the event occur that we desire to measure. Using this procedure for synchronization presupposes that we can ignore the difference between the speed of sound and the speed of light.

In our discussion so far, we have assumed that the clock is very small, that it can count any part of a second, and that it can count high enough to provide information for our calendars and longer-term records. These aren’t always good assumptions. Despite those practical problems, there is the theoretical problem of there being a physical limit to the shortest duration measurable by a given clock because no clock can measure events whose duration is shorter than the time it takes light to travel between the components of that clock, the components in the part that generates the sequence of regular ticks. This theoretical limit places a lower limit on the margin of error of any measurement made with that clock.

Every physical motion of every clock is subject to disturbances. So, to be an accurate clock, one that is in synchrony with the standard clock, we want our clock to be adjustable in case it drifts out of synchrony a bit. To achieve this goal, it helps to keep the clock isolated from environmental influences such as heat, dust, unusual electromagnetic fields, physical blows (such as dropping the clock), and immersion in liquids. And it helps to be able to predict how much a specific influence affects the drift out of synchrony so that there can be an adjustment for this influence, a recalibration.

24. What Is Our Standard Clock?

Our standard clock or master clock is the clock that other clocks are synchronized with. The standard clock reports coordinate time, the time along the time-axis of the standard coordinate system. We want to select as our standard clock a clock that we can be reasonably confident will tick regularly in the sense that all periods between adjacent ticks are congruent (that is, the same duration). Choosing a standard clock that is based on the beats of the president’s heart would be a poor choice because stationary clocks everywhere would go out of synchrony with the standard clock when the president goes jogging.

Almost all nations agree on what clock is the standard clock. The international time standard is called Coordinated Universal Time (or U.T.C. time, for the initials of the French name). This conventional standard time is not based on only a single device; it is the single report based on the average of a large group of relatively stationary atomic clocks in designated laboratories that are distributed around the Earth.

The benefits of using an atomic clock over other kinds of clocks are that the:

resonant frequencies are natural properties (not human-made) and that they are very high frequencies, in the billions of Hertz. If an atomic clock was off by 1 Hz and the frequency was 1 GHz (1 billion Hz), then it would be off by one second in 31.7 years or, roughly, 86 microseconds (0.000086 s) per day.  The best cesium oscillators (such as NIST-F1) can produce frequency with an uncertainty of about 3 x 10-16, which translates to a time error of about 0.03 nanoseconds per day, or about one second in 100 million years (U.S. National Institute of Standards and Technology).

Coordinated Universal Time or U.T.C. time is, by agreement, the time at the Prime Meridian, the longitude that runs through Greenwich England. The time is reported from Paris, not Greenwich England. U.T.C. time is informally called Zulu Time, and it is the time used by the Internet and by the aviation industry throughout the world. It is also used for a government’s official time, but a single government’s official time is often different from U.T.C. time because of there being time zones across the Earth. In the U.S.A., for example, the U.S. government time is U.T.C. time minus the hourly offsets for the appropriate time zones of the U.S.A. including whether daylight savings time is observed.

U.T.C. time is produced from T.A.I. time by adding or subtracting some appropriate integral number of leap seconds. Before explaining T.A.I. time, let’s explain A.T. time. Atomic Time or A.T. time is the time of a standard cesium-based atomic fountain clock in Paris France. A.T. time is reported in seconds. Those seconds are the S.I. seconds or Système International seconds (or, more precisely, the second of the International Systems of Units, that is, Le Système International d’Unités, and thus the term S.I.). The S.I. second is defined to be the time it takes for a motionless (relative to the Earth) standard cesium atomic clock to emit exactly 9,192,631,770 cycles of radiation of a certain color of light that is emitted from the clock’s cloud of cesium-133 atoms during their transition between the two hyperfine levels of the ground state of the atom. This microwave frequency is very stable. All Cs-133 atoms of this isotope are exactly alike. Two pendulum clocks are never so much alike. More details about this process are offered below.

For even more precise timekeeping, the T.A.I. time scale is used rather than the A.T. scale. The T.A.I. scale does not use merely a single standard cesium clock in Paris but rather a calculated average of the readings of about 200 official standard cesium atomic clocks that are distributed around the world in about fifty selected laboratories, all reporting to Paris. One of those laboratories is the National Institute of Standards and Technology in Boulder, Colorado, U.S.A. This calculated average time of the 200 reports is called T.A.I. time, the abbreviation of the French phrase for International Atomic Time. The International Bureau of Weights and Measures (BIPM) near Paris performs the averaging about once a month. If your laboratory in the T.A.I. system had sent in your clock’s reading for certain events that occurred in the previous month, then in the present month the Bureau calculates the average answer for the 200 clock readings and sends you a report of how inaccurate your report was from the average, so you could make adjustments to your clock.

A.T. time, T.A.I. time, and U.T.C. time are not kinds of physical time but rather are kinds of measurements and reports of physical time.

At the 13th General Conference on Weights and Measures in 1967, the definition of a second was changed from a certain fraction of a solar day to a specific number of periods of radiation produced by an atomic clock (or by the average of the 200 standard atomic clocks). This new second is the so-called standard second or the S.I. second. It is now defined to be the duration of 9,192,631,770 periods (cycles, oscillations, vibrations) of a certain kind of microwave radiation emitted in the standard cesium atomic clock. More specifically, the second is defined to be the duration of 9,192,631,770 periods of the microwave radiation required to produce the maximum fluorescence of a small cloud of cesium-133 atoms (that is, their radiating a specific color of light) as the single outer-shell electron in the atom makes a transition between two specific hyperfine energy levels of the ground state of the atom. This is the internationally agreed-upon unit for atomic time (in the T.A.I. system). The old astronomical system (Universal Time 1 or UT1) defined a second to be 1/86,400 of an average solar day.

For this “atomic time,” or time measured atomically, the atoms of cesium gas are cooled to near absolute zero and given a uniform energy while trapped in an atomic fountain or optical lattice and irradiated with microwaves. The frequency of the microwave radiation is tuned until maximum fluorescence is achieved. That is, it is adjusted until the maximum number of cesium atoms flip from one energy level to another, showing that the microwave radiation frequency is precisely tuned to be 9,192,631,770 vibrations per second. Because this frequency for maximum fluorescence is so stable from one experiment to the next, the vibration number is accurate to this many significant digits. For more details on how an atomic clock works, see (Gibbs, 2002).

The meter depends on the second, so time measurement is more basic than space measurement. It does not follow, though, that time is more basic than space. After 1983, scientists agreed that the best way to define and to measure length between any two points A and B is to do it via measuring the number of periods of a light beam reaching from A to B. This is for three reasons: (i) light propagation is very stable or regular; its speed is either constant, or when not constant (such as its moving through water of different density or moving at 38 miles per hour through a Bose-Einstein condensate) we know how to compensate for the influence of the medium; (ii) a light wave’s frequency can also be made very stable; and (iii) distance cannot be measured more accurately in other ways.

In 1999, the meter was defined in terms of the (pre-defined) second as being the distance light travels in a vacuum in an inertial reference frame in exactly 0.000000003335640952 seconds, or 1/299,792,458 seconds. That number is picked by convention so that the new meter is very nearly the same distance as the old meter that was once defined to be the distance between two specific marks on a platinum bar kept in the Paris Observatory.

Time can be measured not only more accurately than distance but also more accurately than voltage, temperature, mass, or anything else.

So why bother to improve atomic clocks? The duration of the second can already be measured to 14 or 15 decimal places, a precision 1,000 times that of any other fundamental unit. One reason to do better is that the second is increasingly the fundamental unit. Three of the six other basic units—the meter, lumen and ampere—are defined in terms of the second. (Gibbs, 2002)

So is the volt. One subtle implication of the standard definition of the second and the meter is that they fix the speed of light in a vacuum in all inertial frames. The speed is exactly one meter per 0.000000003335640952 seconds or 299,792,458 meters per second. There can no longer be any direct measurement to check whether that is how fast light really moves; it is defined to be moving that fast. Any measurement that produced a different value for the speed of light would be presumed initially to have an error. The error would be in, say, its measurements of lengths and durations, or in its assumptions about being in an inertial frame, or in its adjustments for the influence of gravitation and acceleration, or in its assumption that the light was moving in a vacuum. This initial presumption of where the error lies comes from a deep reliance by scientists on Einstein’s theory of relativity. However, if it were eventually decided by the community of scientists that the speed of light should not have been fixed as it was, then the scientists would call for a new world convention to re-define the second.

Leap years (with their leap days) are needed as adjustments to the standard clock’s counting of elapsed time in order to account for the fact that the number of the Earth’s rotations per Earth revolution does not stay constant from year to year. The Earth is spinning slower every day. Without an adjustment, our midnights will eventually drift into the daylight. Leap seconds are needed for another reason. The Earth’s period changes irregularly due to earthquakes and hurricanes. This effect is not practically predictable, so, when the irregularity occurs, a leap second is added or subtracted every six months as needed.

As physics research continues to improve on time’s measurement, the standard use of the cesium clock is likely to be changed by convention to clocks with higher and even more stable frequencies, such as optical lattice clocks and quantum-logic clocks.

25. Why Are Some Standard Clocks Better than Others?

Other clocks ideally are calibrated by being synchronized to “the” standard clock, but some choices of standard clock are better than others. Some philosophers of time believe one choice is better than another because it is closer to what time it really is. Other philosophers of time argue that there is no access to what time it really is except by first having selected the standard clock.

Let’s consider the various goals we want to achieve in choosing one standard clock rather than another. One goal is to choose a clock that does not drift very much. That is, we want a clock that has a very regular period—so the durations between ticks are congruent. Many times throughout history, scientists have detected that their currently-chosen standard clock seemed to be drifting. In about 1700, scientists discovered that the time from one day to the next, as determined by the duration between sunrises, varied throughout the year. The year did not seem to vary, so they began to speak of the duration of the year and the mean day throughout the year. Before the 1950s, the standard clock was defined astronomically in terms of the mean rotation of the Earth upon its axis (solar time). For a short period in the 1950s and 1960s, the standard clock was defined in terms of the revolution of the Earth about the Sun (ephemeris time). The second was defined to be 1/86,400 of the mean solar day, which is the average throughout the year of the rotational period of the Earth with respect to the Sun. But all these clocks were soon discovered to drift.

To solve these drift problems, physicists chose a certain kind of atomic clock (which displays so-called atomic time). It was discussed in the previous section of this Supplement. All atomic clocks measure time in terms of the natural resonant frequencies of certain atoms or molecules. The dates of adoption of these standard clocks is omitted in this paragraph because different international organizations adopted different standards in different years. The U.S.A.’s National Institute of Standards and Technology’s F-1 atomic fountain clock, that is used for reporting standard time in the U.S.A.  (after adjustment so it reports the average from the other laboratories in the T.A.I. network), is so accurate that it drifts by less than one second every 30 million years. We know there is this drift because it is implied by the laws of physics, not because we have a better clock that measures this drift. With engineering improvements, the 30 million number may improve either with the cesium clock or with a new standard optical lattice clock.

The most accurate optical lattice clock as of 2020 has an error rate of less than one second in 15 billion years, which is the approximate age of the universe since the big bang.

To achieve the goal of restricting drift, any clock chosen to become the standard clock should be maximally isolated from outside effects. That is, a practical goal in selecting a standard clock is to find a clock that can be well insulated from environmental impacts such as comets impacting the Earth, earthquakes, stray electric fields, and the presence of dust within the clock. The clock can be shielded from electrical fields, for example, by enclosing it in a metal box. If not insulation, then compensation. If there is some theoretically predictable effect of an environmental influence upon the standard clock, then the clock can be regularly adjusted to compensate for this effect.

Consider the insulation problem we would have if we were to use as our standard clock the mean yearly motion of the Earth around the Sun. Can we compensate for all the relevant disturbing effects on the motion of the Earth around the Sun? Not easily. The problem is that the Earth’s rate of spin varies in a practically unpredictable manner. Meanwhile, we believe that the relevant factors affecting the spin (mainly friction caused by tides rubbing on continental shelves, but also shifts in winds, comet bombardment, earthquakes, and convection in Earth’s molten core) are affecting the rotational speed and period of revolution of the Earth, but not affecting the behavior of the atomic clock.

We add leap days and seconds in order to keep our atomic-based calendar in synchrony with the rotations and revolutions of the Earth. We want to keep atomic-noons occurring on astronomical-noons and ultimately to prevent Northern hemisphere winters from occurring in some future July, so we systematically add leap years and leap seconds and leap microseconds in the counting process. These changes do not affect the duration of a second, but they do affect the duration of a year because, with leap years, not all years last the same number of seconds. In this way, we compensate for the Earth-Sun clocks falling out of synchrony with our standard clock.

Another desirable feature of a standard clock is that reproductions of it stay in synchrony with each other when environmental conditions are the same. Otherwise, we may be limited to relying on a specifically-located standard clock that can not be trusted elsewhere and that can be stolen. Cesium clocks in a suburb of Istanbul work just like cesium clocks in New York City.

The principal goal in selecting a standard clock is to reduce mystery in physics by finding a periodic process that, if adopted as our standard, makes the resulting system of physical laws simpler and more useful, and allows us to explain phenomena that otherwise would be mysterious. Choosing an atomic clock as standard is much better for this purpose than choosing the periodic dripping of water from our goatskin bag or even the periodic revolution of the Earth about the Sun. If scientists were to have retained the Earth-Sun clock as the standard clock and were to say that by definition the Earth does not slow down in any rotation or in any revolution, then when a comet collides with Earth, tempting the scientists to say the Earth’s period of rotation and revolution changed, the scientists instead would be forced instead to alter, among many other things, their atomic theory and say the frequency of light emitted from cesium atoms mysteriously increases all over the universe when comets collide with Earth. By switching to the cesium atomic standard, these alterations are unnecessary, and the mystery vanishes. To make this point a little more simply, suppose the President’s heartbeats were chosen as our standard clock and so the count of heartbeats always showed the correct time, then it would be a mystery why pendulums (and cesium radiation in atomic clocks) changed their frequency whenever the President went jogging, and scientists would have to postulate some new causal influence that joggers have on pendulums across the globe.

To achieve the goal of choosing a standard clock that maximally reduces mystery, we want the clock’s readings to be consistent with the accepted laws of motion, in the following sense. Newton’s first law of motion says that a body in motion should continue to cover the same distance during the same time interval unless acted upon by an external force. If we used our standard clock to run a series of tests of the time intervals as a body coasted along a carefully measured path, and we found that the law was violated and we could not account for this mysterious violation by finding external forces to blame and we were sure that there was no problem otherwise with Newton’s law or with the measurement of the length of the path, then the problem would be with the clock. Leonhard Euler (1707-1783) was the first person to suggest this consistency requirement on our choice of a standard clock. A similar argument holds today but with using the laws of motion from Einstein’s theory of relativity.

What it means for the standard clock to be accurate depends on your philosophy of time. If you are a conventionalist, then once you select the standard clock it can not fail to be accurate in the sense of being correct. On the other hand, if you are an objectivist, you will say the standard clock can be inaccurate. There are different sorts of objectivists. Suppose we ask the question, “Can the time shown on a properly functioning standard clock ever be inaccurate?” The answer is “no” if the target is synchrony with the current standard clock, as the conventionalists believe, but “yes” if there is another target. Objectivists can propose at least three other distinct targets: (1) absolute time (perhaps in Isaac Newton’s sense that he proposed in the 17th century), (2) the best possible clock, and (3) the best-known clock. We do not have a way of knowing whether our current standard clock is close to target 1 or target 2. But if the best-known clock is known not yet to have been chosen to be the standard clock, then the current standard clock can be inaccurate in sense 3.

When you want to know how long a basketball game lasts, why do you subtract the start time from the end time? The answer is that we accept a metric for duration in which we subtract the two time numbers. Why do not we choose another metric and, let’s say, subtract the square root of the start time from the square root of the end time? This question is implicitly asking whether our choice of metric can be incorrect or merely inconvenient.

Let’s say more about this. When we choose a standard clock, we are choosing a metric. By agreeing to read the clock so that a duration from 3:00 to 5:00 is 5-3 hours, and so 2 hours, we are making a choice about how to compare any two durations in order to decide whether they are equal, that is, congruent. We suppose the duration from 3:00 to 5:00 as shown by yesterday’s reading of the standard clock was the same as the duration from 3:00 to 5:00 on the readings from two days ago and will be the same for today’s readings and tomorrow’s readings.

Philosophers of time continue to dispute the extent to which the choice of metric is conventional rather than objective in the sense of being forced on us by nature. The objectivist says the choice is forced and that the success of the standard atomic clock over the standard solar clock shows that we were more accurate in our choice of the standard clock. An objectivist disagrees and believes that whether two intervals of time are really equivalent is an intrinsic feature of nature, so choosing the standard clock is not any more conventional than our choosing to say the Earth is round rather than flat. Taking the conventional side on this issue, Adolf Grünbaum argued that time is metrically amorphous. It has no intrinsic metric. Instead, we choose the metric we do in order only to achieve the goals of reducing mystery in science, but satisfying those goals is no sign of being correct.

The conventionalist, as opposed to the objectivist, would say that if we were to require by convention that the instant at which Jesus was born and the instant at which Abraham Lincoln was assassinated are to be only 24 seconds apart, whereas the duration between Lincoln’s assassination and his burial is to be 24 billion seconds, then we could not be mistaken. It is up to us as a civilization to say what is correct when we first create our conventions about measuring duration. We can consistently assign any numerical time coordinates we wish, subject only to the condition that the assignment properly reflects the betweenness relations of the events that occur at those instants. That is, if event J (birth of Jesus) occurs before event L (Lincoln’s assassination) and this, in turn, occurs before event B (burial of Lincoln), then the time assigned to J must be numerically less than the time assigned to L, and both must be less than the time assigned to B so that t(J) < t(L) < t(B). A simple requirement. Yes, but the implication is that this relationship among J, L, and B must hold for events simultaneous with J, and for all events simultaneous with K, and so forth.

It is other features of nature that lead us to reject the above convention about 24 seconds and 24 billion seconds. What features? There are many periodic processes in nature that have a special relationship to each other; their periods are very nearly constant multiples of each other, and this constant stays the same over a long time. For example, the period of the rotation of the Earth is a fairly constant multiple of the period of the revolution of the Earth around the Sun, and both these periods are a constant multiple of the periods of a swinging pendulum and of vibrations of quartz crystals. The class of these periodic processes is very large, so the world will be easier to describe if we choose our standard clock from one of these periodic processes. A good convention for what is regular will make it easier for scientists to find simple laws of nature and to explain what causes other events to be irregular. It is the search for regularity and simplicity and removal of mystery that leads us to adopt the conventions we do for the numerical time coordinate assignments and thus leads us to choose the standard clock we do choose. Objectivists disagree and say this search for regularity and simplicity and removal of mystery is all fine, but it is directing us toward the intrinsic metric, not simply the useful metric.

For additional discussion of some of the points made in this section, including the issue of how to distinguish an accurate clock from an inaccurate one, see chapter 8 of (Carnap 1966).

26. What Is a Field?

A field in physics is not the field of physics. The latter is an academic discipline. A field in physics is something filling the universe that takes on a value everywhere. The value is a number or ordered set of numbers, with units. The field is somewhat like a colored fluid filling all space, with different fields having different colors. Think of a room filled with air as having an air density field, with sound waves in the room being oscillations of this field due to changing air density in different places at different times.

We just said fields take on a value everywhere, meaning all places. This is true, at least for the fundamental fields of physical science, but a more sophisticated treatment would say fields exist at all points of spacetime, not just space. This implies that fields have values at all times, too.

Forces are not ontologically fundamental; fields are. Field theory has the advantage that, if you want to know what will happen next at a nearby place, you do not have to consider the influence of everything everywhere in the universe, but only the field values adjacent to the place and the rates of change of those values. For example, to figure out what happens to a thrown ball that is influenced only by gravity, Newton’s classical theory of gravity requires consideration of gravitational forces on the ball from all the other matter in the universe at the instant the ball is thrown. In the corresponding Newtonian field theory, one need only consider the gravitational field at the ball’s location. Unlike with Newton’s mechanics, two distant objects do not act on each other directly, but only via the field between them. However, Newton’s theory of gravity without fields is often more practical to use because gravitational forces get weaker with distance, so in most calculations that do not require extreme accuracy, one can ignore the very distant objects and consider only the large nearby objects.

The other principal advantage of fields is that in so many theories the fields obey equations that enable physicists to calculate the future field values from the present ones without having to consider the past values.

This field idea originated with Pierre-Simon Laplace (1749-1827) who suggested treating Newton’s theory of gravity as a field theory. Newton would have been happy with the idea of a field because Newton himself always doubted that gravity worked by direct action at a distance. In a letter to Richard Bentley, he said:

It is inconceivable that inanimate brute matter should, without the intervention of something else which is not material, operate upon and affect other matter, and have an effect upon it, without mutual contact.

But Newton still would have been unhappy with Laplace’s field theory because it required any gravitational force or any change in a gravitational force to be propagated instantaneously throughout all space. Newton wished to avoid instantaneous actions. These were first removed from gravitational theory in Einstein’s general theory of relativity. According to Einstein,

As the Earth moves, the direction of its gravitational pull does not change instantly throughout the universe. Rather, it changes right where the Earth is located, and then the field at that point tugs on the field nearby, which tugs on the field a little farther away, and so on in a wave moving outward at the speed of light. (Carroll 2019, p. 249)

James Clerk Maxwell in the mid-1800s was the first person to successfully treat electricity and magnetism and being aspects of a single field, the electromagnetic field. The ripples of this field always travel at light speed.

Fields obey laws, and these laws usually are systems of partial differential equations that hold at each point. Quantum field theory of the Standard Model of Particle Physics is a very well-confirmed theory that treats a material particle as a localized vibration in a field. For example, an electron is a localized vibration in the electron field. The anti-electron is also a vibration in this field. A photon is a localized vibration in the electromagnetic field. The vibration (the technical term is excitation or oscillation) is a fuzzy bundle of quantized energy occupying a region of space bigger than a single point. The propagation of basic particles from one place to another is due to the fact that any change in the field values induces nearby changes a little later. Think of points in the field as interacting only with their nearest neighbors, which in turn interact with their own neighbors, and so forth. The particles (the excitations of the field) move, but the field itself does not.

Our universe is basically made of fields and not particles, but it does not follow from this that particles are not real. Although any particle, such as an electron, does have a greater probability of being detected at some places than at others over a “fuzzy” region that ultimately extends over all of space, in any single detection the electron is detected only at a point, not a region. What does follow from the fact that our universe is basically made of fields and not particles is that, even though there are points of space and points of time, there are no point particles. The electron is actually a packet of waves that spread throughout space, though the higher amplitude parts of the wave are fairly localized.  The electron is physically basic, though, in the sense that it has no sub-structure. The proton is not basic because it does have substructure; it is made of quarks and gluons. Particles with no sub-structure are called elementary particles.

Physicists accept the principle of general covariance: what is real is not dependent on which reference frame is used in its description. This assumption was introduced by Einstein in his general theory of relativity. The principle:

[T]ells us not only that there are to be no preferred coordinates, but also that, if we have two different spacetimes, representing two physically distinct gravitational fields, then there is to be no naturally preferred pointwise identification between the two—so we cannot say which particular spacetime point of one is to be regarded as the same point as some particular spacetime point of the other! (Penrose 2004, p. 459).

There are many basic quantum fields that exist together. There are four basic matter fields. These are the four fermion fields, two of which are the electron field and the field for quarks having a charge of +2/3. There are five basic force-carrying fields. These are the five boson fields such as the electromagnetic field, the gravitational field, and the Higgs field. All physicists believe there are more, as yet unknown, fields. There might be a dark matter field, for example. Depending upon the field, a field’s value at a point in space might be a simple number (as in the Higgs field), or a vector (as in the classical electromagnetic field), or a tensor (as in Einstein’s gravitational field), or a matrix. The units on the values will change accordingly.

All fields interact with others. For example, the electromagnetic field interacts with the electron field whenever an energetic photon transitions into an electron and a positron.

According to quantum field theory, once one of these basic fields comes into existence it cannot be removed from existence; the field exists everywhere. Magnets create magnetic fields, but if you were to remove all the magnets there would still be a magnetic field. Sources of fields are not essential for the existence of fields.

Because of the Heisenberg Uncertainty Principle, even when a field’s value is the lowest possible (called the vacuum state or unexcited state) in a region, there is always a non-zero probability that its value will spontaneously deviate from that value in the region. The most common way this happens is via a particle and its anti-particle spontaneously coming into existence in the region, then rapidly annihilating each other in a small burst of energy. You can think of space at its basis being a churning sea, a sea of pairs of these particles and their anti-particles that are continually coming into existence and then being rapidly annihilated. So, even if all universe’s fields were to be at their lowest state, empty space always would have some activity and energy. This energy of the vacuum state is inaccessible to us; we can never use it to do work. Clearly, the empty space of physics is not the metaphysician’s nothingness. So, there is no region of empty space where there could be empty time or changeless time in the sense meant by a Leibnizian relationist.

Because all these fields are quantum fields, their excitations can occur only in quantized chunks, namely integer multiples of some baseline energy, the so-called zero-point energy, which is the lowest possible positive energy. It is these chunks that make the theory be a quantum theory.

What is the relationship between spacetime and these fields? Are the fields in space or, as Einstein once said, properties of space; or is there a different relationship? One popular belief among physicists, especially the advocates of the theory of loop quantum gravity, is that spacetime is the gravitational field itself; so it is a mistake, they say, to think of the gravitational field as existing within space or within spacetime. String theory, on the other hand, usually treats strings, the basic constituents of all particles, as moving within a pre-existing spacetime, rather than as constituting the spacetime.

It is not clear that a distinction can be maintained between spacetime and the other fields because the energy contained in the matter fields of spacetime cannot be clearly separated from the gravitational energy of spacetime itself. Gravitational energy can be transformed into the energy of the matter fields, and vice versa. There are significant metaphysical implications for this breakdown of the common distinction. Many physicists believe that the universe is not composed of various fields; it is composed of a single entity, the quantum field, which has such a character that it appears as if it is composed of various different fields.

In classical physics, the state of a system at a time is the simultaneous positions and velocities of the system’s component particles. In relativity theory, the state also involves the geometry of space. In quantum field theory, the state of the system at a time is a particular value for every field at every point in space at that time. Classical, relativistic, and quantum states change in time deterministically. Regarding the wave function, there is nothing that waves; it represents all of reality, so there is nothing else for it to act upon.

For an elementary introduction to quantum fields, see the video https://www.youtube.com/watch?v=X5rAGfjPSWE.

Back to the main “Time” article for references.


Author Information

Bradley Dowden
Email: dowden@csus.edu
California State University Sacramento
U. S. A.