Divine Simplicity

Divine simplicity is central to the classical Western concept of God. Simplicity denies any physical or metaphysical composition in the divine being. This means God is the divine nature itself and has no accidents (properties that are not necessary) accruing to his nature. There are no real divisions or distinctions in this nature. Thus, the entirety of God is whatever is attributed to him.  Divine simplicity is the hallmark of God’s utter transcendence of all else, ensuring the divine nature to be beyond the reach of ordinary categories and distinctions, or at least their ordinary application. Simplicity in this way confers a unique ontological status that many philosophers find highly peculiar.

Inspired by Greek philosophy, the doctrine exercised a formative influence on the development of Western philosophy and theology. Its presence reverberates throughout an entire body of thought. Medieval debates over simplicity invoked fundamental problems in metaphysics, semantics, logic, and psychology, as well as theology. For this reason, medieval philosopher-theologians always situate the doctrine within a larger framework of concepts and distinctions crafted to deal with its consequences. An inadequate grasp of this larger framework continues to hamper the modern debates. Detractors and proponents frequently talk past each other, as this article will show. Reconstructing this larger context is not feasible here. But it will be necessary to refer to its main outlines if one is to capture the basic sense of the doctrine in its original setting.

The following overview begins with a look at some high watermarks of the doctrine. Next it  looks at what has motivated the doctrine throughout its long career. A look at the origins and motives is followed by some representative objections. The bulk of the rest of the article  sketches some common responses to these objections. The responses invoke aspects of the doctrine’s original context to further understanding of it. This treatment will mainly discuss objections to the doctrine’s internal coherence. Problems involving the compatibility of simplicity with another particular teaching generally require highly individual treatment beyond the present scope; this is also so with revealed matters such as the Trinity or Incarnation. However, some general considerations will prove applicable to these individual issues. Progress on the systematic issues seems tied to  understanding the intrinsic claims of the doctrine. A separate article examines God’s immutability, though again some considerations here could prove applicable. The following discussion will suggest that disagreements over simplicity tend to reflect prior theological disagreements over  the fundamental character of God and  what language about God can or cannot imply.

Table of Contents

  1. Origins
  2. Doctrine and Implications
  3. Motives
  4. Difficulties
  5. Responses
    1. Ontology
    2. Persons
    3. Negations
    4. Multiple Predicates
    5. Existence
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Origins

Classic statements of the doctrine of divine simplicity are found in Augustine (354–430), Anselm (1033– 1109), and Aquinas (1225–74). Aquinas is often thought to represent the historical peak of the doctrine’s articulation and defense. Modern discussions usually reference his version as a standard, however, the roots of simplicity go back to the Ancient Greeks, well before its formal defense by representative thinkers of the three great monotheistic religions— Judaism, Christianity, and Islam. (The current English-speaking debates over simplicity usually refer to its Western, Christian developments, which are thus a focus of the present discussion.) Greek philosophers well before Socrates and Plato were fascinated by the idea of a fundamental unity underlying the vast multiplicity of individuals and their kinds and qualities. One idea proposed all things as sharing a common element, a universal substrate providing the stuff of which all things are made. Another idea proposed a being or principle characterized by a profound unity and inhabiting a realm above all else. Thales (640–546 B.C.E.) proposes water to be the common element from which all things in the universe are made. Anaximenes (588–524 B.C.E.) posits all material objects as ultimately constituted by compressed air of varying density. Parmenides (c. 515–c. 450 B.C.E.) presents an early Monism, the idea that all things are of a single substance. He holds that common to all things is their being, taken as a collective undifferentiated mass of all the being in the universe. He further introduces being as possessing an incorruptible perfection. Plato (428–348 B.C.E.) locates unity in the Forms. His metaphysics posits a supreme good constituting a unity beyond all ordinary being. The Platonic idea of a highest principle, combining supreme unity and utter perfection, strongly influenced Jewish and early Christian discussions of God’s supreme unity and perfection. Plato leaves the causal role of the supreme good somewhat vague. Aristotle (384–322 B.C.E.) posits the supreme being to be a subsisting and unchanging form that is also a first mover. Aristotle’s prime mover sits at the top of an efficient causal hierarchy governing all motion and change in the universe. Aristotle’s first mover is a simple, unchanging form that still causally affects other beings: in Aristotle’s case the heavenly spheres would move themselves in imitation of the divine perfection, resulting in the motions of terrestrial beings. Aristotle’s god is still considered ontologically finite by theistic standards and remains only a cosmic mover rather than a creator ex nihilo. The Platonic notion of a supreme perfection at a remove from all things and Aristotle’s causally efficacious, disembodied mind would combine to suggest a powerful model for Western theologians seeking language to describe God’s nature.

The Greek emphasis on a simple first principle figures prominently in the revival of classical Hellenistic philosophy at the close of the ancient world. Christianity is in its infancy when the Jewish theologian Philo of Alexandria (c. 30 B.C.E.–  50 C.E.) observes that it is already commonly accepted to think of God as Being itself and utterly simple. Philo is drawing on philosophical accounts of a supreme unity in describing God as uncomposite and eternal. He identifies this simple first being of the philosophers with the personal God of the Hebrew Scriptures who consciously creates things modeled after the divine ideas. Neoplatonist philosophers Plotinus (205–70) and later Proclus (410–85) will also posit a simple first principle. Plotinus’s Enneads speak of a One that exceeds all of the categories applicable to other things. Consequently it is unknowable and inexpressible (1962, V.3.13, VI.9.3). Plotinus voices an argument for the One’s simplicity that will emerge as a standard line of argument in later thinkers:

Even in calling it The First we mean no more than to express that it is the most absolutely simplex: it is Self-Sufficing only in the sense that it is not of that compound nature which would make it dependent upon any constituent [emphasis added]; it is the Self-Contained because everything contained in something alien must also exist by that alien. (1962, II.9.1)

For the One to have any metaphysical components is for them to account for the existence and character of the composite. Plotinus is working from the idea of a being that is utterly self-explanatory and thus is uncaused. A similar view of the first cause as lacking any internal or external causes will motivate Scholastic accounts of simplicity. Proclus’s Elements of Theology opens its analysis of the first principle by emphasizing its simplicity. (The work actually defends polytheism against the emerging Christianity.) This prioritizing of simplicity in the Elements is imitated in the anonymous Book of Causes and Dionysius’s On the Divine Names, two works that circulate to great effect in the medieval schools.

Christian theological speculation from the beginning views simplicity as essential for preserving God’s transcendence. The second-century Christian apologist Athenagoras of Athens argues that the Christian God by definition has no beginning; thus God is utterly indivisible and unchangeable. The Church Fathers—including Sts. Clement, Basil, and Cyril—see simplicity as preserving God’s transcendence and absolute perfection. St. John Damascene (c. 675–749) in book 3 of his An Exposition of the Orthodox Faith describes the divine nature as a unified single act (energeia) (1899). He allows it can be intellectually conceived under different aspects while remaining a simple being. Dionysius is the sixth-century Christian author of On the Divine Names. He long enjoyed authoritative status in the West after being mistaken for Dionysius of the Areopagus, whom St. Paul mentions in Acts. Unlike St. Augustine’s On the Trinity, Dionysius begins his account of the divine nature with  divine simplicity. Aquinas, in his last great theological synthesis, places simplicity at the head of the divine predicates (Summa theologiae Ia q.3). He first argues that simplicity is part and parcel to being a first cause. Simplicity then becomes a foundation for his account of the other major predicates of God’s nature (Burns 1993; Weigel 2008, ch. 1). However, well before Aquinas’s sophisticated treatment of the doctrine, representative thinkers of all three great monotheistic traditions recognize the doctrine of divine simplicity to be central to any credible account of a creator God’s ontological situation. Avicenna (980–1037), Averroes (1126–98), Anselm of Canterbury, Philo of Alexandria, and Moses Maimonides (1135–1204) all go out of their way to affirm the doctrine’s indispensability and systematic potential.

2. Doctrine and Implications

The doctrine proceeds by denying in God forms of ontological composition that are found in creatures. The forms of composition in question will vary with different ontological systems, particularly so in the modern cacophony of approaches to ontology. For now, it will help to stick with the claims as presented in the classic doctrine. First, God lacks any matter in his being. There are no physical parts. God is also completely independent of matter. Therefore, nothing about God depends on matter to be what it is. Second, the divine nature is not composed with something else. God is the divine nature, so there are no accidental features or other ontological accretions in God. All that God is, he is through and through. The identification of God with his nature is also understood to mean that God exhausts what it is to be divine. For instance, Socrates and Plato do not exhaust what it is to be human because each manifests different ways to be a human being. God cannot be any more divine than he is. This has the further implication that the divine nature is not sharable by multiple beings. Socrates and Plato both possess a human identity. The divine nature, however, is exclusive to God.

Another major tenet is that God is maximal existence. Aquinas calls God ipsum esse subsistens, subsistent existence itself. The Church Fathers from early on affirm God as the absolute Being. Augustine calls God “existence itself” (ipsum esse). God is the ultimate in being. God is not just the best among extant beings. There is no possible being that could be more or better than God is. Hence, God is maximal perfection and goodness. This also means God is infinite. God lacks the ontological limitations creatures have because God has no potentiality to be in a different state than he is. An immediate consequence of simplicity is that classical theism acknowledges severe limits on what created minds can know about God. Human beings can affirm propositions true of God, but no finite mind even approaches comprehending all that God is. A God that is simple is also immutable. A change requires that something in a being undergoes alternation and something else remains continuous. Yet a simple being does not have changeable components, and maximal being cannot be other than it is. There is no temporal unfolding of successive states and God is not subject to place. Thus a simple and immutable God is eternal, not subject to time. As Nicholas Wolterstoff aptly observes, divine simplicity seems to be the ontological basis for “grant[ing] a large number of other divine attributes,” and consequently “one’s interpretation of all God’s other attributes will have to be formed in light of that conviction” (Wolterstorff 1991, 531).

3. Motives

Proponents of the doctrine historically favor two lines of reasoning already mentioned. Classical theism wants to preserve God’s transcendence and also insure God is a genuine first cause. A truly uncaused first cause depends on nothing. Anselm, for instance, holds that God’s supreme perfection precludes division even “by any mind.” Yet in arguing for this state of perfection he uses the idea seen in Plotinus that components determine a composite to be what it is (Proslogion, ch. 19). Internal components are “causes” in the broad sense that the Greeks used [aition] to speak of that which determines something else to exist or be a certain way. (The narrowing of causation to efficient causation comes later.) Aquinas in his Summa theologiae similarly argues for simplicity: “Because every composite is posterior to its components, and depends upon them. However, God is the first being, as shown above [in the arguments for his existence]” (Ia q.3 a.7). Contemporary scholars often refer to God’s independence from all things as his aseity. God is not “self-caused,” as in causing himself to exist by a kind of ontological bootstrapping. Instead, he is a first cause that transcends everything and sustains everything in existence at all moments. This will be the kind of entity for which the question of its own causation or dependence cannot arise. Its nature is self-explanatory.

This idea of a first cause being utterly uncaused has its origin in a model of explanation that sees all things as subject to the principle of sufficient explanation. Everything in existence requires complete explanation for why it exists and why it has the properties it does. Something with a nature that cannot account for its own existence eventually refers back, in this model, to a single, self-explanatory first cause. (It is important to remember that the model here seeks causal explanations of particular entities. Gottfried Leibniz [1646–1716] by contrast defends the principle of a sufficient reason for the truth of all propositions. Some critics argue that this latter model poses the dilemma of having to create necessarily [not freely] or else God would have to create for reasons independent of God.) Philosophers will debate whether this model holds or whether such a first cause exists; however, such discussions fall outside the present scope. The point is that simplicity emerges from a certain view of the world’s causal intelligibility, combined with a strict reading of the unconditioned nature of the first uncaused cause. Marilyn Adams follows how these considerations about a first cause influence the doctrine of simplicity, in her study of simplicity beginning with the writings of Maimonides and ending with William of Ockham (c. 1287–1347) (1987, 930–60).

Classical theism sees simplicity as guaranteeing God’s transcendence. A simple being does not form any mixture or composition with anything else. This rules out pantheistic conceptions of God. God cannot be an aspect of the natural world, such as a world-soul. The Church Fathers, Augustine, and the Scholastics also understand simplicity as maintaining the infinite ontological distance regarded as definitive of transcendence. A complex and mutable being is not something Augustine, Maimonides, or Aquinas would call God. A composite and changeable being they see as much like the rest of creation and not transcending it in any robust sense. Christian ecclesiastical documents reflect similar concerns. Correspondence by Pope St. Leo the Great (reigned 440–61) affirms God’s simplicity and immutability. Simplicity is affirmed in the Council of Lateran IV (1215) and again as recently as Vatican I (1870). One might propose a lesser transcendence that allows for composition and change but that is another discussion. Classical theism remains consistent on the matter. Rising dissatisfaction with a simple and unchanging God in the West parallels the rising popularity of immanent, process-oriented conceptions of the divine nature (Rogers 1996, 165). (See Process Philosophy.) It was just such a dissatisfaction that led philosophers late in the last century to revive modern versions of age-old objections to the doctrine of divine simplicity.

4. Difficulties

Contemporary objections to the intrinsic coherence of the doctrine are interrelated. They rely on similar assumptions about the doctrine and its categories. One line of critique cites the intrinsic claims of the doctrine as incoherent because calling God subsistent existence does not make sense. Another line of critique looks at multiple predicates as introducing divisions in God. The relevant predicates here signify the presence of a positive reality and include such traditional predicates as God is ‘good,’ ‘wise,’ and ‘living.’. Positive divine predicates contrast with negative ones, such as calling God ‘immaterial’ or ‘immutable.’ Here the term’s immediate significance is to deny a reality or situation. In this case the terms signify the absence of matter and change.

Alvin Plantinga’s critique of simplicity in his Does God Have a Nature (1980) has become a touchstone in the contemporary debates. Earlier versions of most of Plantinga’s objections can be found in other authors (Bennett 1969; Ross 1969; LaCroix 1977; Martin 1976; Wainwright 1979). Before that, discussions of simplicity percolated though other traditions, such as in religious schools and seminaries. The recent attention to these issues by analytic philosophers is not as novel as might be thought. Variations of them are probably as old as the doctrine of divine simplicity itself.

One of Plantinga’s major criticisms is that simplicity is incompatible with God appearing to have multiple attributes. According to the doctrine, “[God] doesn’t merely have a nature or essence; he just is that nature, … [and] each of his properties is identical with each of his properties…so that God has but one property.” But this “seems flatly incompatible with the obvious fact that God has several properties; he has power and mercifulness, say, neither of which is identical with the other” (1980, 46–47). Two objections are in play. First, positive predicates normally signify distinct features or aspects in things. Whatever makes Socrates wise differs from what makes him good. Would not God also have distinct properties? Plantinga’s second objection notes that God’s nature is identical  with what is predicated of it. Socrates is not his goodness or wisdom but  God is identical with his properties (which are identical with each other). Yet, no subject is its properties, much less a property, period. Similar versions of this critique are elsewhere (see, for example, Bennett 1969; Mann 1982).

Plantinga sees an even more basic problem here. Plantinga thinks properties and natures are abstract objects: “Still further we have been speaking of [God’s] own properties; but of course there is the rest of the Platonic menagerie—the propositions, properties, numbers, sets, possible worlds, and all the rest” (1980, 35). Properties and natures are abstract objects that neither subsist as individual things, such as oak trees and cats, nor inhere in individuals. This view of properties and natures as abstracta is a common one in the analytic tradition. It flourished during the middle and later decades of the last century and appears still widely held, if less dominant. If Plantinga is right, nothing divine is a property or nature:

No property could have created the world; no property could be omniscient, or, indeed, know anything at all. If God is a property, then he isn’t a person but a mere abstract object; he has no knowledge, awareness, power, love or life. So taken, the simplicity doctrine seems an utter mistake. (47)

Properties in this view are things individuals can exemplify or instantiate, but not actually be. A painted wooden fence, for instance, exemplifies the property of being red. But redness itself is an abstract object separate from the individuals exemplifying it. Variations on this criticism in Plantinga are raised by Richard Gale (1991, 23) and Christopher Hughes (1989, 10–20) among others.

There is an additional line of objection here that commentators often miss. Plantinga takes it for granted God is a person: “If God is a property, then he isn’t a person but a mere abstract object . . .” (1980, 47). Persons are not abstract objects. Moreover, persons are composite and changeable. They have faculties of understanding and volition that involve composition and a temporal sequence of states. So nothing simple can be a person. Yet God is obviously a person, according to Plantinga and others. He is obviously then not simple. David Hume (1711–76) argues along a similar line. A simple and immutable being has no mind, for “a mind whose acts and sentiments and ideas are not distinct and successive . . . has no thought, no reason, no will, no sentiment, no love, no hatred; or in a word, is no mind at all” (1980, part 4). A simple God is not a person, nor could God have the sort of mind persons have.

Another attack on the intrinsic coherence of the doctrine cites the claim that God is Being or existence itself. This basic claim appears early on in the doctrine’s history and is held by contemporary defenders of the doctrine (see, for example, Miller 1996; Davies 2004, 174–75). But detractors find the claim puzzling at best. Christopher Hughes speaks for many in calling it “perhaps the single most baffling claim Aquinas makes about God” (1989, 4). Anthony Kenny’s analysis concludes in even stronger terms by calling the position “nothing but sophistry and illusion” (2002, 194). A. N. Prior criticizes the view as simply ill-formed, that it “is just bad grammar, a combining of words that fails to make them mean—like ‘cat no six’” (1955, 5).

The theological controversy is rooted in a prior philosophical controversy over what it means to predicate existence of objects. According to one prevalent view of existence, saying “Fido exists” adds nothing to Fido. It adds no determinate feature the way predicating ‘hairy’ or ‘four-legged’ does. Existence then is not a real property. If existence is treated as a constituent of things, then there is also a certain paradox involving the denial something exists. To say “Fido does not exist” seems to presuppose Fido is there to be talked about, but then does not exist. This is self-contradictory. Given these apparent oddities, some philosophers decided existence is not predicated of extra-mental things but of concepts. Gottlob Frege (1848–1925) will say that asserting “There exists no four-sided triangle” is just to assign the concept of such a triangle the number zero. C. J. F. Williams echoes the Fregean view in his critique of God as just “to be’” “No doubt the question ‘What is it for x to be?’ is, by Frege’s standards, and they are the right standards, ill formed. To be cannot for anything be the same as to be alive, since the latter is something that can be said of objects, while the former is used to say something of concepts” (1997, 227). This modern analysis of existence goes back to Immanuel Kant’s (1724–1804) critique of Rene Descartes’ (1596–1650) version of the ontological argument. Kant seems to have read Pierre Gassendi’s (1592–1665) analysis of Descartes’ argument. Gassendi holds that existence does not qualify as a property; it is not a property of God or of anything else.  If existence is not really saying anything directly about things, then it is nonsense to say God is literally just existence.

But suppose one allows that existence might be some sort of extra-mental aspect of things. There seem to be other problems in identifying God with existence. Existence never just occurs by itself in some rarefied form. One affirms the existence of dogs and begonias and such. Anthony Kenny notes, “If told simply that Flora is, I am not told whether she is a girl or a goddess or a cyclone, though she may be any of these. But God’s esse is esse which permits no further specification. Other things are men or dogs or clouds, but God is not anything, he just is” (2000, 58). How could existence itself subsist? Even if there could be something like mere existence, then surely God could not be some rarified glob of existence. God would seem to have many other properties. Thus, the problem of calling God subsistent existence returns one to the original problem of predicating multiple properties.

These objections represent the bulk of the objections commonly leveled at the doctrine’s basic coherence. One might summarize them as follows:

(a) God has several properties. Simplicity must deny this.

(b) Multiple properties occur as distinct from each other in things. Simplicity problematically says they are identical in God.

(c) God is a subsisting, individual thing. Properties do not subsist.

(d) In fact, properties, essences, natures are abstracta. God is not an abstract object.

(e) God is a person. Persons are ontologically complex.

(f) Simplicity says God is Being or subsistent existence. Existence is not a property, like being round.

(g) Nothing at all can be just existence.

(h) If God is some kind of rarified existence, this raises the same problem in (a).

These difficulties are hardly exhaustive. Still, together they account for much of the contemporary opposition to simplicity. They also embody certain assumptions other kinds of objections tend to use. What follows can only be a sketch of some common responses to the above objections. Another task will be to demonstrate how proponents of classical simplicity tend to invoke different background assumptions from its critics.

5. Responses

a. Ontology

Looking at the contemporary ontology in which these objections are couched is a good place to start. Plantinga considers natures, properties, essences, and the like to be causally inert abstract objects that are separate from particular individual things. In this scheme, saying God is a nature is a category mistake. It is like referring to someone’s poodle as a prime number.

However, classical simplicity uses a metaphysics that sees the predication of natures and properties differently. Natures, essences, and properties are in this view constituents of things. Nicholas Wolterstorff characterizes this difference in ontological outlook in the following manner:

The theistic identity claims [in simplicity] were put forward by thinkers working within a very different ontological style from ours. They worked within an ontology I shall call constituent ontology. [Contemporary philosophers] typically work within a style that might be called relation ontology….Claims which are baffling in one style will sometimes seem relatively straightforward in another. (1991, 540–41)

Contemporary ontologies of this sort regard natures and properties as abstracta, which individual objects only “have” in the sense of exemplifying or instantiating them. Medieval proponents of simplicity regard such things as natures and properties as entities that actually inhere in the individuals that have them. Wolterstorff observes,

An essence is [for twentieth-century philosophers] an abstract entity. For a medieval, I suggest, the essence of nature was just as concrete as that of which it is the nature….Naturally the medieval will speak of something as having a certain nature. But the having here is to be understood as having as one of its constituents . . . for [contemporary philosophers], having an essence is . . . exemplifying it.” (1991, 541–42)

Many medieval thinkers would say that Socrates and Plato both have a human nature. This means there is an intrinsic set of properties constituting their identity as human beings, instead of being some other kind of natural object. Despite having the same nature, Socrates and Plato are of course distinct individuals. How so? Each individual is made out of a different parcel, or quantity, of matter. Each has different accidental features (non-essential properties). Socrates and Plato are thus two separate composites. Moreover, each has his individual humanity. The nature present in each is individualized or “particularized” in virtue of being in separate lumps of matter, and secondarily by the presence of different accidental, individualized features inhering the individual composite substance. Humanity is not an exact replica in each, in the way new Lincoln pennies might look the same except for being in different places. In this ontological outlook, a mind can form a general concept of human nature in abstraction from its various particularized instances. But this common, abstract humanity is only an object of thought. There is no non-individualized human nature outside of minds producing abstract concepts. For this ontological perspective, there is no Platonic human nature outside of individual human beings. One might give a similar account of various properties Socrates and Plato have. Each has white skin. Each composite is white in its own particular way. One can say here that Socrates’ whiteness inheres in this composite, Plato’s in that one. The way each is white will thus look similar but also slightly different. One can form an abstract, general concept of being white that abstracts from its particular instances. However, the medievals believe such mental abstractions hardly commit one to ontological abstracta apart from minds or individual instances. Consequently, humanity and whiteness are not part of a menagerie of Platonic entities separate from the individual composite beings that exemplify them.

Similarly, classical ontology holds that the divine nature is not an abstract object. The divine nature, or the what-it-is to be God, is not separate from the being that is God. Since simplicity denies matter and accidents in God, here, as Aquinas explains in Summa theologiae, is the extraordinary case where a certain entity just is its own nature:

God is the same as his essence or nature . . . in things composed of matter and form, the nature or essence must differ from the suppositum [that is, the whole subject]….Hence the thing which is a man has something more in it than [its] humanity….On the other hand, in things not composed of matter and form, in which individualization is not due to individual matter…the forms themselves should be subsisting supposita. Therefore suppositum and nature are in them are identified. Since God is not composed of matter and form, he must be his own Godhead, his own life, and whatever else is predicated of him. (Ia q.3 a.3)

Socrates is more than his nature; a human being is a material entity and has non-essential features in addition to his nature. God just is a nature, which does not form a composite with anything else. Such an extraordinary being is difficult to imagine or know much about. But, if natures and properties can be individual components of things, then simplicity hardly makes God an abstract object. Some commentators acknowledge the different approach classical ontology has toward natures and properties, but raise objections to it (for example, Hughes 1989, 12–20). Defenders of simplicity do not find such reservations compelling, and they make the further point that simplicity at bottom never considers God an abstract object (Bergmann and Brower 2006; Leftow 1990, 593–94). The main point is that one’s own ontology might not be that of another age. A technical assessment of these rival approaches to ontology might be left for a longer discussion (Leftow 2003). One should also keep in mind that contemporary defenders of simplicity show a variety of ontological predilections. Some mix historical and contemporary ontological views without seeing incoherence in this (for example, Vallicella 1992; Miller, 1996). Adjudicating among rival ontologies, however, is the substance of a much longer discussion. (For more, see the cited sources in this paragraph.)

b. Persons

Modern authors sometimes speak of God as a person (for example, Plantinga 1980, 47, 57). If God is a person and if simplicity leaves no room for being a person, then simplicity seems incompatible with believing in God. Certainly there are reasons for calling God a person. Classical theism predicates of God such things commonly associated with persons as knowledge and a will. This is not all. Human persons and their cognitive faculties are composite and changeable. So, if persons are the model for God being a person, then simplicity runs into the problems Plantinga and Hume mention above. But then it would be odd if Jewish, Christian, and Islamic thinkers over the centuries momentarily forgot God is like a human person when they affirm God’s simplicity. In fact, referring to God as a person is more complicated than one might think.

Many theists nowadays take it for granted God is a person, albeit a kind of disembodied super-powerful one. Brian Davies observes that the formula ‘God is a person’ “is by no means a traditional one. It does not occur in the Bible. It is foreign to the Fathers and to writers up to and beyond the Middle Ages. Not does it occur in the creeds” (2000, 560).  Judaism believes man is in the image of God because man has understanding and free choice. Yet that is a long way from God actually being a person, much less in the way persons are persons. (Man is in the image of God but not vice versa.) Islam regards the ninety-nine names of Allah as titles of honor and not at all descriptions of God’s essence. The Christian Trinity speaks of three persons of one substance (ousia or substantia). It does not say the Godhead itself is a person, or that God is three persons in one person.

Stanley Rudman argues that thinking of the Godhead itself as a person is a relatively recent development (1998, ch. 8). It is mostly absent from Western theology before the eighteenth century. William Paley (1741–1805) and Friedrich Schleiermacher (1768–1834) provide early examples of trying out the idea. The nineteenth century sees an emphasis on God as a person or personality gain considerable momentum. In the present day, the eminent philosopher of religion Richard Swinburne does not find it particularly controversial to say, “That God is a person yet one without a body seems the most elementary claim of theism” (1999, 99). The difficulty lies in how one understands predicating ‘person.’ The modern sensibility seems to regard God as a person not altogether dissimilar to the way Socrates is a person. God is a disembodied mind that performs discursive thinking and makes a succession of distinct choices.

Far different is how Aquinas sees the predication of ‘person’ to God. He allows one can use the term. But here it signifies in a manner unlike its everyday use (Summa theologiae Ia q.29 a.4). It never applies univocally of God and creatures, but must be differently conceived in each case (q. 29 a.4 ad 4). Aquinas notes that ‘person’ signifies “what is most perfect in all of nature—that is, a subsistent individual of a rational nature.” Working with this general idea, God is called a person because “his essence contains every perfection,” including supreme intelligence, and because “the dignity of the divine nature excels every dignity” (q.29 a.4 ad 2). ‘Person’ thus applies to God in a manner eminently surpassing creatures. The overall context suggests Aquinas regards the term as mainly honorific, in the way God is thought of as a king on account of his rule over creation.

God is not a person if that implies any diminution of his maximal perfection. God does not go from being potentially in another state to acquiring that state. God has a rational nature, but only “if reason be taken to mean, not discursive thought, but in a general sense, an intelligent nature” (q.29 a.4 ad 3). Human persons need not be the definitive model for persons. If they are, God surely is not a person. Predicates God shares with persons, such as intellect and will, apply only by analogy. The predicates must abstract from, or be stripped of, any implication of change, composition, or imperfection. The language of personality applies with the realization that, as Brian Davies notes,

Our language for what is personal (and our primary understanding of this) comes from our knowledge of human beings. And we ought to be struck by a difference between what it takes to be a human being and what it must take to be God. . . . [They do not] reflect a knowledge of God as he is in himself. (2000, 561)

The modern tendency to think of God as a person leads to anthropomorphic interpretations of traditional divine predicates, and this arguably misses the intent of the original proponents of simplicity. A similar problem involves a lack of familiarity with the religious epistemology surrounding the doctrine.

c. Negations

Simplicity traditionally emphasizes God as profoundly unlike created beings. Classical philosophical theology frequently approaches divine predication using negative theology. God is seen as profoundly unknown as he is in himself. Much of what can be affirmed about God expresses what God is not, and in general how unlike and beyond created things God is. This preserves a sense of God’s infinite ontological distance from creatures. It also ensures predicates are not applied as if categories used for persons and everyday objects apply in roughly the same way to God.

Negative predicates such as ‘simple’ and ‘immutable’ signify the removal of features commonly found in created things. Negations should not immediately suggest positive imagery of what God is like. A temptation is to think these terms mean what it would be like for, say, an animate object or a human being to lack such features. Everyday human experience does not associate a lack of complexity with richness and perfection. One imagines dull uniformity, like a bowl of tepid porridge. Aquinas realizes this and follows his presentation of simplicity with God’s unlimited perfection and goodness. Similar caution applies to thinking about God’s immutability. Grace Jantzen observes of an unchangeable God: “A living God cannot be static: life implies change . . . [divine immutability] would preclude divine responsiveness and must rather be taken as steadfastness of character” (1983, 573). However, classical theists will argue that the correct image here should not be that of a static and inert physical object. The historical sources do not suggest this, and often go to great lengths to mitigate against this confusion. God has unlimited perfection, statues and rocks do not. As Brian Davies observes, “living” predicated of God does not mean a literal-minded image of biological life and physical change. Instead it acknowledges God’s independence from things and being a source of change in them (Davies 2004, 165–66).

Classical simplicity maintains that God is beyond knowledge of what he is like in himself. Concepts deriving from everyday experiences of physical objects remain profoundly inadequate to the reality of God. An expert might acquire a good sense of how complicated machinery works. By contrast, Aquinas introduces simplicity by saying it is safer to consider the ways God is unlike the created order, rather than like it: “Now we cannot know how God is, but only how he is not; we must therefore consider the ways in which God does not exist, rather than the ways in which he does” (Summa theologiae Ia q.3 introduction). The context suggests one cannot know the essence of God, or have any direct acquaintance of it the way one knows physical things. Positive predications of the form ”God is A” can allow readers to confuse the semantic distinction between the subject and predicate with a real distinction between God and separate properties. Plotinus operates with a similar caution in denying one can properly even say the One is (1962, V.4.1). This does not mean the One is non-extant. It signals that the One is beyond anything that could be associated with the world of changing and composite beings. Boethius discusses God as a simple being and then qualifies this by saying that God is not to be thought of as a subject. Dionysius (1957) shows an affinity with this position in his On the Divine Names.

Moses Maimonides also displays great caution in his account of simplicity and divine predication. For Maimonides, even positive predicates apply to God with severe qualifications to avoid compromising God’s simplicity (2000, ch. 50–58). Scripture enjoins the believer to affirm God is good, wise, just, and such. Yet positive predicates can only express that (a) God is the ultimate cause of certain good qualities, or (b) the predicate is a disguised negation of something from God. ‘God is good’ might mean God is the cause of good things. ‘God is living’ assures that God is not like something dead or ineffective. Subsequent thinkers will point out difficulties with this view of positive predicates. Saying nothing positive directly about God allows some strange expressions. God is the cause of everything. There are also innumerable things God is not. Thus God might be called a ‘lion’ to avoid the impression of weakness, or ‘quick-witted’ to preclude the impression that God is dull.

Aquinas will cite the Aristotelian dictum (Physics 184a23–184b12) that to affirm something exists is to have at least a very partial and incomplete notion what it is or is like. In addition, some modern commentators point out an agnosticism about God’s essence that can go too far. ‘Simple’ is a negative predicate. But the doctrine implies God is unsurpassed perfection and ultimate being. The absence of something like direct acquaintance with the divine nature could still allow positive things to be affirmed of it. This returns the discussion to the problem of assigning multiple predicates.

d. Multiple Predicates

Multiple predicates differ from each other in meaning. Must they imply multiple properties that are components in God? Maimonides handles this by denying that positive predicates of God actually refer to the divine nature. There is another way. Positive predicates are affirmed of the divine essence, but do not pick out multiple properties in God. God does not have properties, strictly speaking, if one has distinct component features in mind. The undivided reality of God confirms predicates that differ in meaning but all refer to the whole nature. Each predicate corresponds to a way of considering the divine reality. Yet none of these affirmations, taken individually or collectively, imply division. None exhaustively express the maximal perfection to which they all refer. One might use the contemporary distinction between the sense of a predicate, its meaning or conceptual associations, from its reference, the thing or things to which a predicate refers. The divine predicates differ in sense, but share the simple nature as their common referent. (Modern theories of reference differ from medieval theories of signification. But here the basic idea need not do harm.) Aquinas remarks on these predicates:

God, however, as considered in himself is altogether one and simple; but never­theless our intellect knows him by diverse conceptions, because it cannot see him as he is in himself. But, although it understands him under diverse conceptions, it knows that all these conceptions correspond (respondet) [emphasis added] to one and the same simple thing. Therefore, this plurality, which is [a plurality] according to reason, is represented by the plurality of subject and predicate; and the intellect represents the unity by composition. (Summa theologiae, Ia q.13 a.12)

“Good” and “living” are associated with two different concepts. Applied to creatures they signify distinct, inherent properties. Applied to God they are both true, but the ontological basis of their truth is the whole of what God is. The predicates retain their creaturely modes of signifying, where the mind associates the predicate with a limited and accidental property. Aquinas will say each signifies a perfection creatures have in common with God. John Damascene uses the metaphor of God being an infinite ocean of perfection, which can answer to distinctive intellectual conceptualizations while remaining undivided and unlimited in itself.

This does not mean a person grasps what it is about God or “in” God (a misleading expression) corresponding to the predicate. One can say that certain predicates should be affirmed, but claiming to know just what they signify at the level of the divine is another matter. This raises the question of what features inhering in created things would have in common with the divine reality. God’s nature seems to stretch the identity of what is predicated beyond its original significance. Marilyn Adams (1987) has suggested that the real issue with simplicity is not that multiple predicates imply composition. The problem is how the identity of the perfection signified is maintained between its created and divine applications. Aquinas notes that divine perfection differs from created perfection not just in degree. Since God is simple and maximal perfection, an entirely different mode of existence is involved. This is why he will say the predicates apply to God analogously, and not univocally, as “wise” applies to Plato and Socrates. Proponents of simplicity use a variety of solutions to show how the same predicate might refer to God and creatures. Such approaches can widely vary, according to an individual’s views on ontology and religious language (see, for example, Miller 1996; Klima 2001; Teske 1981; Vallicella, 1992; Weigel 2008, ch.6).

e. Existence

Similar considerations about divine predication can make sense of saying God is existence. As noted, contemporary philosophers often deny existence is predicated of things (Williams 1997; Kenny 2002, 110–11). Others question this. They note that the Fregean view of existence originally flourished in response to long-faded controversies in late-nineteenth- and early-twentieth-century theories of quantification and reference (Smith 1961, 118–33; Klima 2001; Knuuttila 1986; Miller 1996, 15–27). Gyula Klima observes that medieval theories of signification predicate existence of things in the world. They also speak of entities that do not exist without generating the obscure paradoxes modern assumptions about reference seem to (2001; Spade 1982). Some philosophers think that predicating existence of objects does say something non-trivial about them. Just because existence is not a determinate property, such as being orange, does not mean its predication to things adds nothing of significance. John Smith argues in this vein that “It is obvious that at least one considerable difference between lions and unicorns is that the former do exist while the latter do not,” and this need not involve some well-defined concept of existence (1961, 123). Philosophers aware of a variety of semantic theories now floating around English-speaking philosophy see the exclusively Fregean interpretation of existence as commanding less assent than it once did.

Fortunately, a sensible reading of the claim can be found without getting philosophers to agree on what existence is. First, God is not the being of all things collectively considered. This is just to have a universal concept of being that abstracts from individual beings and their determinations. But God is no lump sum of existence, which would be pantheistic. Second, saying God is existence does not mean God is some bland, characterless property of existence that one sees as common to cats, trees, and ballpoint pens. Instead, speaking of God as existence itself is a kind of shorthand for God’s ontology. Saying God’s essence is to exist expresses God’s independence from creatures as the uncaused source of all else. God depends on nothing for the being that God is. It also signals God’s supreme perfection. God’s maximal perfection and supreme unity surpass all individual beings and their limitations. Augustine will say in On the Trinity that because God is supreme among all beings, God is said to exist in the highest sense of the expression, “for it is the same thing to God to be, and to be great” (1963, V.10.11). Finally, Aquinas says that God is the full and exhaustive expression of the divine nature (Summa theologiae, Ia q.2 a.3). No other possible being rivals the divine plenitude. So, nothing else can be God. Calling God subsistent existence underscores God as (a) uncaused and independent, (b) maximal perfection, (c) simple, (d) and one.

6. Conclusion

Assessing the doctrine of divine simplicity is far more complicated than lining up objections and replies. The doctrine’s currents run deep in the history of Western philosophical and religious thought,  predating the rise of Jewish and Christian philosophical theology. The doctrine is still regarded by many as an indispensable tenet of classical theism. Simplicity speaks to one’s fundamental understanding of God. Philosophers and theologians will continue to reach widely varying conclusions about simplicity,  and the challenges it poses in a variety of areas insure it will continue to receive much attention for the foreseeable future.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Adams, Marilyn McCord. William Ockham. 2 vols. Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press, 1987.
    • Comprehensive overview of Ockham’s (c. 1287–1347) thought and contrasting medieval positions. Extensive discussion of medieval views of simplicity.
  • Anselm of Canterbury. Monologion. In Anselm of Canterbury: The Major Works, edited and translated by Brian Davies and Gareth Evans, 5–81. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1998.
    • Early medieval account of simplicity and the classic divine predicates.
  • Anselm of Canterbury. Proslogion. In Anselm of Canterbury: The Major Works, edited and translated by Brian Davies and Gareth Evans, 82–104. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1998.
  • Aquinas, Thomas. Summa Theologica. (also Summa theologiae) Translated by the English Dominican Fathers. New York: Benziger Brothers, 1947.
    • A comprehensive medieval defense of simplicity and other classic divine predicates.
  • Aquinas, Thomas. On the Power of God. Translated by the English Dominican Fathers. Westminster, MD: Newman Press, 1952.
    • Extensive treatment of the problem of simplicity and multiple predicates.
  • Augustine. On the Trinity. Translated by Stephen McKenna. Washington, DC: Catholic University of America Press, 1963.
    • His handling of simplicity proves influential in later, medieval accounts.
  • Bennett, Daniel. “The Divine Simplicity.” Journal of Philosophy 69, no. 19 (1969): 628–37.
    • Examines analytic objections to a simple God having multiple properties ascribed.
  • Bergmann, Michael, and Jeffrey Brower. “A Theistic Argument against Platonism (and in Support of Truthmakers and Divine Simplicity)” In Oxford Studies in Metaphysics 2, edited by Dean Zimmerman, 357–86. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2006.
    • Argues against properties having to be abstract objects.
  • The Book of Causes. Anonymous. Translated by Dennis Brand. Milwaukee, WI: Marquette University Press, 1984.
    • Thought to be by an unknown Arabic author abstracting from Proclus’s Elements of Theology.
  • Burns, Peter. “The Status and Function of Divine Simpleness in Summa theologiae Ia, qq.2–13.” Thomist 57, no. 1 (1993): 1–26.
    • Discusses the place and influence of simplicity in Aquinas’s account of the divine nature.
  • Davies, Brian. “A Modern Defence of Divine Simplicity.” In Philosophy of Religion: A Guide and Anthology, edited by Brian Davies, 549–64. Oxford: Oxford Uni­versity Press, 2000.
    • A sympathetic treatment of the compatibility of simplicity with other predicates.
  • Davies, Brian. Introduction to the Philosophy of Religion. 3rd ed. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2004.
  • Dionysius. Dionysius the Areopagite “On the Divine Names” and “The Mystical Theology.” Translated by C. Rolt. London: SPCK, 1957.
    • Influential on later medieval thought about simplicity and the divine nature.
  • Gale, Richard. On the Nature and Existence of God. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991.
    • A critical response to analytic defenses of theism.
  • Hughes, Christopher. On a Complex Theory of a Simple God. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1989.
    • Critiques Aquinas’ account of simplicity and suggests another account.
  • Hume, David. Dialogues concerning Natural Religion. Edited by Richard Popkin. Indianapolis, IN: Hackett, 1980.
    • Historically regarded as a powerful critique of the classic concept of God and arguments for God’s existence.
  • Jantzen, Grace. “Time and Timelessness.” In A New Dictionary of Christianity, edited by Alan Richardson and John Bowden. London: SCM, 1983.
    • Briefly critiques an eternal and immutable God.
  • John of Damascus (John Damascene). An Exposition of the Orthodox Faith. Translated by E.W. Watson and L. Pullan. In Nicene and Post-Nicene Fathers, second series, vol. 9. Edited by Philip Schaff and Henry Wace. Buffalo, NY: Christian Literature, 1899.
    • Systematic discussion of the divine nature and human knowledge of God. Influential precursor to Scholastic discussions.
  • Kenny, Anthony. Aquinas on Being. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2002.
    • Argues for the incoherence of Aquinas’s ontology of existence.
  • Klima, Gyula. “Existence and Reference in Medieval Logic.” In New Essays in Free Logic, edited by Alexander Hieke and Edgar Morscher, 197–226. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic, 2001.
    • Sophisticated technical defense of some medieval theories of existence and predication.
  • Knuuttila, Simo. “Being qua Being in Thomas Aquinas and John Duns Scotus.” In The Logic of Being: Historical Studies, edited by Simo Knuuttila and Jaakko Hintikka, 201–22. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic, 1986.
    • Explanation and defense of Aquinas’s views on existence.
  • LaCroix, Richard. “Augustine on the Simplicity of God.” New Scholasticism 51, no. 4 (1977): 453–69.
    • Critique of Augustine’s account.
  • Leftow, Brian. “Is God an Abstract Object.” Noûs 24, no. 4 (1990): 581–98.
    • Examines the role of theories of properties in accounts of the divine nature.
  • Leftow, Brian. “Aquinas on Attributes.” Medieval Philosophy and Theology 11, no. 1 (2003): 1–41.
    • Explanation and defense of Aquinas on divine predication.
  • Maimonides, Moses ben. The Guide for the Perplexed. Rev. ed. Translated by M. Friedlander. Mineola, NY: Dover, 2000.
    • An early medieval Jewish thinker’s account of the divine nature. Influential in subsequent Scholastic discussions.
  • Mann, William. “Divine Simplicity.” Religious Studies 18 (1982): 451–71.
    • Critique of divine simplicity and often cited in contemporary discussions.
  • Martin, C.B. “God, the Null Set and Divine Simplicity.” In The Challenge to Religion Today, edited by John King-Farlow, 138–43. New York: Science History, 1976.
    • Poses objections to simplicity in an analytic vein.
  • Miller, Barry. A Most Unlikely God: A Philosophical Inquiry into the Nature of God. Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press, 1996.
    • Sympathetic reconstruction of the classic concept of God using analytic philosophy.
  • Morris, Thomas. “On God and Mann: A View of Divine Simplicity.” Religious Studies 21, no. 3 (1985): 299–318.
    • A well-known reply to Mann (1982).
  • Owen, H. P. Concepts of Deity. London: MacMillan, 1971.
    • Comprehensive survey of conceptions of the divine nature. Defends classical monotheism.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. Does God Have a Nature? Milwaukee, WI: Marquette University Press, 1980.
    • A monograph-length analytic critique of divine simplicity and the classic concept of God. The text serves as a touchstone for contemporary philosophical debates over simplicity.
  • Plotinus. Enneads. 3rd ed. Translated by Stephen MacKenna. Revised by B. S. Page. New York: Pantheon Books, 1962.
    • Neoplatonic treatment of the divine nature.
  • Prior, A. N. “Can Religion Be Discussed?” in New Essays in Philosophical Theology, edited by Anthony Flew and Alasdair MacIntyre, 1–11. London: S.C.M. Press, 1955.
    • Critical assessment of some traditional theological positions.
  • Proclus. The Elements of Theology. Translated with a commentary by E. Dodds. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1933.
  • Rogers, Katherin. “The Traditional Doctrine of Divine Simplicity.” Religious Studies 32, no. 2 (1996): 165–86.
    • Survey of some problems classical simplicity raises.
  • Ross, James. Philosophical Theology. New York: Bobbs-Merrill, 1969.
    • Assesses traditional philosophical theology by combining an analytic approach with a grasp of Scholastic positions.
  • Rudman, Stanley. Concepts of Person and Christian Ethics. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
    • Discusses the idea of the Godhead as a person and its recent history.
  • Smith, John. Reason and God: Encounters of Philosophy with Religion. New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, 1961.
    • Examines some traditional and contemporary views in philosophical theology. Defends existence as a valid predicate in theological contexts.
  • Spade, Paul. “The Semantics of Terms.” In The Cambridge History of Later Medieval Philosophy, edited by Norman Kretzmann, Anthony Kenny, and Jan Pinborg, 188–96. New York: Cambridge University Press, 1982.
    • Discussion of medieval semantic theories.
  • Stump, Eleonore, and Norman Kretzmann. “Absolute Simplicity.” Faith and Philosophy 2, no. 4 (1985): 353–82.
    • Defends the compatibility of simplicity with divine power and willing.
  • Swinburne, Richard. The Coherence of Theism. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999.
    • Sympathetic treatment of traditional theistic philosophical positions.
  • Teske, Roland. “Properties of God and the Predicaments in De Trinitate V.” Modern Schoolman 59 (1981): 1–19.
    • Examines multiple predicates of a simple God in Augustine’s work.
  • Vallicella, William. “Divine Simplicity: A New Defense.” Faith and Philosophy 9, no. 4 (1992): 471–78.
    • A contemporary analytic defense of divine simplicity.
  • Wainwright, William. “Augustine on God’s Simplicity: A Reply.” New Scholasticism 53, no. 1 (1979): 124–27.
  • Weigel, Peter. Aquinas on Simplicity: An Investigation into the Foundations of His Philosophical Theology. Frankfurt: Peter Lang, 2008.
    • Examines the ontological background to Aquinas’s account of simplicity and philosophical theology.
  • Williams, C. J. F. “Being.” In A Companion to Philosophy of Religion, edited by Philip Quinn and Charles Taliaferro, 223–28. Oxford: Black­well, 1997.
    • Critique of predicating existence in theological contexts.
  • Wolterstorff, Nicholas. “Divine Simplicity.” In Philosophical Perspectives 5: Philosophy of Religion 1991, edited by James Tomberlin, 531–52. Atascadero, CA: Ridgefield, 1991.
    • A critical assessment of some problems raised by simplicity and often cited in contemporary discussions.

Author Information

Peter Weigel
Email: pweigel2@washcoll.edu
Washington College

Predicative and Impredicative Definitions

The distinction between predicative and impredicative definitions is today widely regarded as an important watershed in logic and the philosophy of mathematics. A definition is said to be impredicative if it generalizes over a totality to which the entity being defined belongs. Otherwise the definition is said to be predicative. In the examples below, (2) and (4) are impredicative.

  1. Let π be the ratio between the circumference and diameter of a circle.
  2. Let n be the least natural number such that n cannot be written as the sum of at most four cubes.
  3. A natural number n is prime if and only if  n > 1 and the only divisors of n are 1 and n itself.
  4. A person x is general-like if and only if, for every property P which all great generals have, x too has P.

Definition (1) is predicative since π is defined solely in terms of the circumference and diameter of some given circle.  Definition (2), on the other hand, is impredicative, as this definition generalizes over all natural numbers, including n itself. Definition (3) is predicative, as the property of being prime is defined without any generalization over properties. By contrast, definition (4) is impredicative, as the property of being general-like is defined by generalization over the totality of all properties.

Impredicative definitions have long been controversial in logic and the philosophy of mathematics. Many prominent logicians and philosophers—most importantly Henri Poincaré, Bertrand Russell, and Hermann Weyl—have rejected such definitions as viciously circular. However, it turns out that the rejection of such definitions would require a major revision of classical mathematics. The most common contemporary view is probably that of Kurt Gödel, who argued that impredicative definitions are legitimate provided one holds a realist view of the entities in question.

Although few theorists any longer reject all impredicative definitions, it is widely recognized that such definitions require stronger theoretical assumptions than do predicative definitions.

Table of Contents

  1. Paradoxes and the Vicious Circle Principle
  2. Impredicativity in Classical Mathematics
  3. Defenses of Impredicative Definitions
  4. References and Further Readings

1. Paradoxes and the Vicious Circle Principle

The notion of predicativity has its origin in the early twentieth century debate between Poincaré, Russell and others about the nature and source of the logical paradoxes. ([Poincaré 1906], [Russell 1908]) So, it will be useful to review some of the most important logical paradoxes.

Russell’s paradox. Let the Russell class R be the class of all classes that are not members of themselves. If R is a member of itself, then it doesn’t satisfy the membership criterion and hence isn’t a member of itself. If, on the other hand, R isn’t a member of itself, then it does satisfy the membership criterion and hence is a member of itself after all. Thus, R is a member of itself iff (if and only if) R is not a member of itself.

The Liar paradox. “This sentence is false.” If this quoted sentence is true, then what it says is correct, which means that the sentence is false. If, on the other hand, the sentence is false, then what it says is correct, which means that the sentence is true. Thus, the sentence is true just in case it is false.

Berry’s paradox. There are only finitely many strings of the English alphabet of less than 200 characters. But there are infinitely many natural numbers. Hence there must be a least integer not nameable in less than 200 characters. But we have just named it in less than 200 characters!

Both Poincaré and Russell argued that the paradoxes are caused by some form of vicious circularity. What goes wrong, they claimed, is that an entity is defined, or a proposition is formulated, in a way that is unacceptably circular. Sometimes this circularity is transparent, as in the Liar paradox. But in other paradoxes there is no explicit circularity. For instance, the definition of the Russell class makes no explicit reference to the class being defined. Nor does the definition in Berry’s paradox make any explicit reference to itself.

However, Poincaré and Russell argued that paradoxes such as Russell’s and Berry’s are guilty of an implicit form of circularity. The problem with the Russell class is said to be that its definition generalizes over a totality to which the defined class would belong. This is because the Russell class is defined as the class whose members are all and only the non-self-membered objects. So one of the objects that needs to be considered for membership in the Russell class is this very class itself. Similarly, the definition in Berry’s paradox generalizes over all definitions, including the very definition in question.

Poincaré’s and Russell’s diagnosis is very general. Whenever we generalize over a totality, we presuppose all the entities that make up this totality. So when we attempt to define an entity by generalizing over a totality to which this entity would belong, we are tacitly presupposing the entity we are trying to define. And this, they claim, involves a vicious circle. The solution to the paradoxes is therefore to ban such circles by laying down what Russell calls the Vicious Circle Principle. This principle has received a bewildering variety of formulations. Here are two famous examples (from ([Russell 1908], p. 225):

Whatever involves all of a collection must not be one of the collection.

If, provided a certain collection has a total, it would have members only definable in terms of that total, then the said collection has no total.

In a justly famous analysis, Gödel distinguishes between the following three forms of the Vicious Circle Principle ([Gödel 1944]):

(VCP1) No entity can be defined in terms of a totality to which this entity belongs.

(VCP2) No entity can involve a totality to which this entity belongs.

(VCP3) No entity can presuppose a totality to which this entity belongs.

The clearest of these principles is probably (VCP1). For this principle is simply a ban on impredicative definitions. This principle requires that a definition not generalize over a totality to which the entity defined would belong.

According to Gödel, the other two principles, (VCP2) and (VCP3), are more plausible than the first, if not necessarily convincing. The tenability of these two principles is a fascinating question but beyond the scope of this survey.

For two other introductions to the question of predicativity, see [Giaquinto 2002] and (a bit more advanced) [Feferman 2005].

2. Impredicativity in Classical Mathematics

Assume Poincaré and Russell are right that impredicative definitions must be banned. What consequences would this ban have? It was soon realized that classical mathematics relies heavily on impredicative definitions. Here are two famous examples. (The examples inevitably involve some mathematics but can be skimmed by less mathematically inclined readers.)

Example 1: Arithmetic

In many approaches to the foundations of mathematics, the property N of being a natural number is defined as follows. An object x has the property N just in case x has every property F which is had by zero and is inherited from any number u to its successor u+1. Or in symbols:

Def-N N(x) ↔ ∀F[F(0) ∀u(F(u) → F(u + 1)) → F(x)]

This definition has the nice feature of entailing the principle of mathematical induction, which says that any property F which is had by zero and is inherited from any number u to its successor u+1 is had by every natural number:

∀F{F(0) ∀u(F(u) → F(u + 1)) → ∀x(N(x) → F(x))}

However, Def-N is impredicative because it defines the property N by generalizing over all arithmetical properties, including the one being defined.

Example 2: Analysis

Assume the rational numbers Q have been constructed from sets. Assume we want to go on and construct the real numbers R as lower Dedekind cuts of rationals. That is, assume we want to represent each real number by an appropriate downward closed set of rationals. An important task will then be to ensure that the Dedekind cuts which we use to represent real numbers have the following property, which plays a key role in many proofs in real analysis:

Least Upper Bound Property. Let X be a non-empty collection of reals with an upper bound. (An upper bound of X is a real number which is larger than any element of X.) Then X has a least upper bound. That is, X has an upper bound which is smaller than or equal to any other upper bound of X.

The standard proof that the class of Dedekind cuts has the Least Upper Bound Property involves the following definition of a Dedekind cut z, which can be seen to be the least upper bound of some given non-empty set X which has an upper bound:

∀q[q ∈ z ↔ ∃y(y ∈ X q ∈ y)]

However, this definition of the Dedekind cut z is impredicative because it generalizes over all Dedekind cuts y.

Responses to impredicativity in classical mathematics

So classical mathematics relies on impredicative definitions. What does this mean for the proposed ban on such definitions? Three different kinds of response have been developed.

  1. Russell and Whitehead’s response in their famous Principia Mathematica was to adopt the Axiom of Reducibility. This axioms says (loosely speaking) that every impredicative definition can be turned into a predicative one. However, this axioms has struck most people as intolerably ad hoc.
  2. Another response was initiated by Hermann Weyl [Weyl 1918] and has more recently been pursued by Solomon Feferman. (See [Feferman 1998] as well as [Feferman 2005] for a survey.) This response is to reconstruct as much of classical mathematics as possible in a way that avoids the use of impredicative definitions. Although this approach is hard to carry out and sometimes rather cumbersome, it has turned out that a surprisingly large amount of mathematics—including most of what is needed for the purposes of empirical science—can be reconstructed in a way that is predicative given the natural numbers.
  3. A third response is associated with Gödel. The fact that classical mathematics uses impredicative definitions should, according to Gödel, be considered a refutation of the vicious circle principle and its ban on impredicative definitions rather than the other way round. In Gödel’s words, we should “consider this rather as a proof that the vicious circle principle is false than that classical mathematics is false.” ([Gödel 1944], p. 135)

3. Defenses of Impredicative Definitions

The response of Gödel’s that we have just considered amounts to a pragmatic defense of impredicative definitions. Since classical mathematics is a scientifically respectable discipline, we have good reason to believe that its core forms of definition are legitimate, including many impredicative ones. But although this pragmatic defense of impredicative definitions has significant force, it would be useful to know why such definitions are legitimate despite their apparent circularity. We will now consider some attempted answers to this question, including one due to Gödel himself.

Our journey begins with Frank Ramsey’s “Foundations of Mathematics” ([Ramsey 1931]), written in 1925 when he was merely 22 years old. Ramsey provides some examples of impredicative definitions which appear to be entirely unproblematic:

(5) Let Julius be tallest person in the room.

(6) Let f(p,q) be the truth-function which is the conjunction of p, q, p v q, and p ∧ q.

(A truth-function is a function from truth-values to truth-values.) These definitions are impredicative because (5) generalizes over all people in the room, including Julius (whoever he or she turns out to be) and because (6) defines the truth-function f(p,q) by generalizing over the four listed truth-functions, one of which is easily seen to be identical to f(p,q), namely p ∧ q.

Ramsey is surely right that these two definitions are harmless. But why is that so? Ramsey isn’t entirely explicit here. His core idea appears to be that an impredicative definition is permissible provided the entity defined can at least in principle be specified or characterized independently of the totality in terms of which it is defined. Indeed, Julius (whoever he or she may be) can be specified by pointing to a person, and f(p,q), by means of a truth tables.

This theme of independent specifiability is developed further in an influential article by Paul Bernays, [Bernays 1935]. Bernays is particularly interested in our conception of sets, which, he argues, does not require all sets to be explicitly definable. Consider first the case of a finite set, say a set S with n elements. By means of what Bernays calls “combinatorial reasoning”—that is, reasoning based on the grouping and selecting objects—we establish that S has 2n subsets. We establish this by observing that all the different subsets of S correspond to all the different ways of making an independent choice as to whether each element of S is to be included in some given subset. There is no need to define all the subsets explicitly.

Much the same goes for infinite sets, according to Bernays. Our conception of infinite sets is “quasi-combinatorial” in the sense that it is based on an analogy with the combinatorial conception of finite sets. For instance, this enables us to establish that the number of subsets of the set N of natural numbers is 2ω, where ω is the cardinality or size of N. Note that this fact is established without any need to provide an explicit definition of all the subsets.

The quasi-combinatorial conception of sets ensures that sets can, at least in principle, be specified independently of their definitions. And this in turn ensures that impredicative definitions of sets are permissible. This is because sets do not depend on their explicit definitions, if any, but rather are tied to their quasi-combinatorial specifications.

Gödel also provides a philosophical defense of impredicative definitions, which supplements his pragmatic defense mentioned above. This philosophical defense has been very influential and is the source of what is probably the dominant contemporary view on the matter. According to Gödel, impredicative definitions are indeed problematic if one believes that mathematical objects are in some sense constructed by us. For:

the construction of a thing can certainly not be based on a totality of things to which the thing to be constructed belongs. ([Gödel 1944], p. 136)

But there is no such problem if instead one holds a realist view of mathematical objects:

If, however, it is a question of objects that exist independently of our constructions, there is nothing in the least absurd in the existence of totalities containing members which can be described […] only by reference to this totality. (ibid.)

Gödel’s view is thus that a ban on impredicative definitions is justified if one holds a constructivist view of the entities concerned but not if one holds a realist view.

This means that Gödel’s analysis differs from Ramsey’s and Bernays’. Gödel bases the legitimacy of impredicative definitions on the independent existence of the entities in question, whereas Ramsey and Bernays base it on these entities’ independent specifiability. Which analysis is more plausible? Examples such as (5) are handled well by both analyses. But other examples are handled much better by the Ramsey-Bernay analysis than by Gödel’s. For instance, it seems unlikely that one has to be a realist about truth-functions in order to accept the legitimacy of Ramsey’s impredicative definition (6). In a similar vein, it seems unlikely that one has to be a realist about fictional characters in order to accept the legitimacy of the following impredicative definition.

(7) Let Julia be the most beautiful character in the story of Cinderella.

Clearly, Julia is identical to Cinderella. And this identification does not require a fictional character to enjoy any real or independent existence.

These considerations suggest that the Ramsey-Bernays analysis has at least as much initial plausibility as Gödel’s. But further investigation will be needed to settle the matter.

4. References and Further Readings

  • Benacerraf, P. and Putnam, H., editors (1983). Philosophy of Mathematics: Selected Readings, Cambridge. Cambridge University Press. Second edition.
  • Bernays, P. (1935). “On Platonism in Mathematics.” Reprinted in (Benacerraf and Putnam, 1983).
  • Ewald, W. (1996). From Kant to Hilbert: A Source Book in the Foundations of Mathematics volume 2. Oxford University Press, Oxford.
  • Feferman, S. (1998). “Weyl Vindicated: Das Kontinuum Seventy Years Laters.” In Feferman’s In the Light of Logic, pages 249-283. Oxford University Press, Oxford.
  • Feferman, S. (2005). “Predicativity.” In Shapiro, S., editor, Oxford Handbook of the Philosophy of Mathematics and Logic, pages 590-624. Oxford University Press, Oxford.
  • Giaquinto, M. (2002). The Search for Certainty: A Philosophical Account of Foundations of Mathematics. Clarendon, Oxford.
  • Gödel, K. (1944). “Russell’s Mathematical Logic.” In (Benacerraf and Putnam, 1983).
  • Poincaré, H. (1906). “Les Mathematiques et la Logique.” Revue de Métaphysique et de Morale, 14:294-317. Translated as “Mathematics and Logic, II” in (Ewald, 1996), pp. 1038-1052.
  • Ramsey, F. (1931). “The Foundations of Mathematics.” In Braithwaite, R., editor, The Foundations of Mathematics and Other Essays. Routledge & Kegan Paul, London.
  • Russell, B. (1908). “Mathematical logic as based on a theory of types.” American Journal of Mathematics, 30:222-262.
  • Weyl, H. (1918). Das Kontinuum. Verlag von Veit & Comp, Leipzig. Translated as The Continuum by S. Pollard and T. Bole, Dover, 1994.

Author Information

Oystein Linnebo
Email: o.linnebo@bbk.ac.uk
Birkbeck, University of London
Great Britain

Altruism and Group Selection

Ever since Darwin created his theory of evolution in the nineteenth century, and especially since the nineteen sixties, scientists and philosophers of science have been intensely debating whether and how selection occurs at the level of the group. The debates over group selection maintain their vitality for several reasons: because group selection may explain the evolution of altruism; because “altruistic” traits ─ traits that reduce an individual’s  fitness while increasing the fitness of another ─ constitute a well-known puzzle for the theory of natural selection; because altruism is a phenomena that one seems to encounter daily in biology and society; and because altruism via group selection may explain some major evolutionary transitions in the history of life (such as the transition from separate molecules into a gene, from individual genes into a chromosome, from individual cells into a multi-cellular organism, and from multi-cellular organisms turning into a social group).

After so many years of unresolved debates, one is prone to ask: Is the group selection debate merely waiting for more data and experimentation, or are there further issues that need clarification? One type of dispute is semantic, requiring examination of the various meanings of “altruism,” “group” and “unit of selection.” Another type of dispute regards heuristic strategies, such as the assumption that phenomena similar in one respect, however dissimilar in other aspects, call for a similar explanation or a similar causal mechanism. This strategy encourages the parties to seek a single evolutionary explanation or a single selection process to drive the evolution of altruistic traits. Finally, there could be values and visual images, historically entrenched in favor of a particular kind of explanation or against it. This article develops some major historical, empirical, conceptual and practical aspects of the debates over group selection.

Table of Contents

  1. The Concept of Altruism
  2. A Chronology of the Debates
  3. Non-Empirical Aspects of the Debates
  4. Empirical Aspects of the Debates
  5. Practices in the Debates: Sociobiology
  6. References and Further Reading

1. The Concept of Altruism

Selection among groups rather than individuals is not a straightforward idea, especially not ontologically. Nonetheless, the notion of group selection is often used in evolutionary discourse, especially for explaining the evolution of altruism or sociality (the tendency to form social groups). The meaning of “altruism” in ordinary language is quite different from its use among evolutionary biologists (Sober and Wilson, 1998, pp. 17-18). An ultimate motivation of assisting another regardless of one’s direct or indirect self-benefit is necessary for it to be altruistic in the ordinary sense ─ for what we might call moral altruism (see psychological egoism). However, motivations and intentions are not accessible to someone studying non-humans. Thus, they are not part of the meaning of “altruism” in the biological sense. Biological altruism is a course of action that enhances the expected fitness of another at the expense of one’s own fitness. Whether altruism occurs depends on several things: on the population’s initial conditions, on the definition of “altruism” as absolute or relative fitness reduction ─ that is, whether one suffers a net loss or not (Kerr et al. 2003) ─ and on the meaning of “fitness” as an actuality or propensity (Mills and Beatty, 1979). Unlike ordinary speech, in biological discourse a trait that carries a cost to the individual, even if relatively small and with no net reduction of fitness, is typically labeled “altruistic” or, equivalently, “cooperative.”

These distinctions between ordinary and technical senses of “altruism” notwithstanding, many scientists often link them in the evolutionary debates over group selection. Connecting biological and moral altruism is typically done without conflating the two, that is, without committing the naturalistic fallacy of “is implies ought.” An example of such a fallacy might be: since group selection is found everywhere in nature, we should act for the benefit of the group. Instead, some scientists argue that the abundance of group selection processes throughout human evolution can explain why humans sometimes hold genuinely altruistic motivations (for example, Darwin, 1871;  Sober and Wilson, 1998, part II). Others argue that moral altruism should be praised with extra vigor, since the process of group selection hardly – if ever – occurs in nature, so human altruism is not “in harmony” with nature but rather a struggle against it (Dawkins, 1976; Williams, 1987). In short, linking “altruism” with “group selection” is historically very common although conceptually not necessary. As we shall see below, a process of group selection can act on non-altruistic traits and the evolution of a cooperative trait need not always require a group selection process. Karl Popper (1945) blamed Plato for the historical identification of the moral concept of altruism with collectivism and for contrasting altruism to individualism:

Now it is interesting that for Plato, and for most Platonists, altruistic individualisms cannot exist. According to Plato, the only alternative to collectivism is egoism; he simply identifies all altruism with collectivism; and all individualism with egoism. This is not a matter of terminology, of mere words, for instead of four possibilities, Plato recognized only two. This has created considerable confusion in speculation on ethical matters, even down to our own day (Popper, 1945, p. 101).

Whether due to Plato or local circumstances within the nineteen-century scientific community, “altruism” and “group selection” have been linked from the origin of evolutionary biology.

2. A Chronology of the Debates

Ever since Darwin, “altruism” and “group selection” are found together (Darwin, 1859, p. 236;  Lustig, 2004). Darwin, in his 1871 book The Descent of Man, pointed to a selection process at the group level as an evolutionary explanation for human altruism:

When two tribes of primeval man, living in the same country, came into competition, if (other things being equal) the one tribe included a great number of courageous, sympathetic and faithful members, who were always ready to warn each other of danger, to aid and defend each other, this tribe would succeed better and conquer the other (Darwin, 1871, p. 113).

Such altruistic behavior seems to raise a problem for a theory of natural selection, since:

It is extremely doubtful whether the offspring of the more sympathetic and benevolent parents, or of those who were the most faithful to their comrades, would be reared in greater numbers than the children of selfish and treacherous parents belonging to the same tribe. He who was ready to sacrifice his life, as many a savage has been, rather than betray his comrades, would often leave no offspring to inherit his noble nature (Darwin,  p. 114).

Given this characterization, one might think that altruistic traits would gradually disappear. Yet such traits appear quite common in nature. Darwin suggests several mechanisms within a single group to explain the puzzle of the evolution of altruism – such as reciprocal reward and punishment – that often benefit the benevolent individual in the long run relative to others in his or her group. In other words, Darwin points to selection at the level of the individual rather than the group, which renders morally praised behavior non-altruistic in the biological sense. Yet Darwin immediately makes it clear that selection between groups is the dominant process selecting for human morality, since whatever forces might act within that tribe, the disparity in accomplishment is greater between tribal groups than within each group:

It must not be forgotten that although a high standard of morality gives but a slight or no advantage to each individual man and his children over the other men of the same tribe, yet that an increase in the number of well-endowed men and an advancement in the standard of morality will certainly give an immense advantage to one tribe over another. A tribe including many members, who from possessing in a high degree the spirit of patriotism, fidelity, obedience, courage and sympathy, were always ready to aid one another, and to sacrifice themselves for the common good, would be victorious over most other tribes; and this would be natural selection (Darwin, 115-116).

Since Darwin, and with a similar naturalistic stance, biologists have continued to try to explain altruism – in humans and non-humans alike – via group selection models. Assuming that group selection does not conflict with individual selection was a common uncritical presumption until World War II (Simpson, 1941). The three decades to follow marked a dramatic change. Historians such as Keller (1988) and Mittman (1992) showed that during the 1950s and 1960s, many Anglo-American researchers came to identify altruism with conformity – and with being a tool of totalitarianism – while viewing conflicts of interests as crucial for the checks and balances of a functioning democracy. Vero C. Wynne Edwards’s  attempt at a grand synthesis of all population dynamics under the process of group selection (Simpson, p. 20) is an example. The attack on group selection, although already a long-standing element of David Lack’s controversy with Wynne-Edwards (Lack, 1956), became the focus of attention largely due to John Maynard Smith’s 1964 paper and George C. Williams’ 1966 book Adaptation and Natural Selection.

Williams (1966) advocated the parsimony of explaining seemingly sacrificial behavior without evoking altruism (in the sense of absolute reduction in fitness) or the mysterious mechanism of selection at the group level, but rather via the fitness benefits to the individual or the gene involved. A “gene’s eye-view,” employed by Maynard Smith and Williams, was given its most general form in William D. Hamilton’s 1964 papers. “Hamilton’s rule,” often used interchangeably with “kin selection” (Frank, 1998, pp. 4, 46-47; Foster et al., 2005), states that an altruistic gene will increase its frequency in a population if the ratio between the donor’s cost (c) and the benefit to the recipient (b) is less than the coefficient of (genetic) relatedness between the donor and recipient (r); that is, r > c / b. In other words, a gene for altruism (that is, an abstract gene type, not a material stretch of DNA nor a specific gene token) will spread in the population if enough organisms with an above average chance to carry that gene – that is, relatives – will be better off due to the altruistic act even if the individual organism must sacrifice its life.  It should be clear that the altruistic “trait,” explained in these “gene’s eye view” models, is no more than a quantified disposition to act altruistically given certain initial circumstances. Such gene centered models offered in the nineteen sixties by Hamilton, Maynard Smith, and Williams, and assembled in the nineteen seventies under Richard Dawkins’s The Selfish Gene (1976) and Edward O. Wilson’s Sociobiology (1975), appeared to have ended the idea of group selection altogether (although Wilson did use “group selection” for his gene-centered synthesis). Finally a single unifying model was offered to solve Darwin’s “difficulty” with no reference to mechanisms at the level of the group.

Both these books quickly became best sellers, though not everyone accepted the gene’s eye-view, either as an actual causal process of selection (Gould, 1980, Ch. 8; Sober and Lewontin, 1982) or as a useful heuristic (Wimsatt, 2007, Ch. 4-5, which reorganize Wimsatt’s 1980 and 1981 papers). Gene selection opponents granted that the outcomes of selection are often conveniently described in genetic terms for the purpose of “bookkeeping” the records of evolution. However, they argued, the gene’s eye-view fails to test the causes that produced such an outcome (Davidson, 2001). In other words, employing a model that only measures average change in gene frequency in a population may be adequate for predicting biological events yet inadequate for explaining why and how they actually occurred. These objections to gene selection are not only heuristic but also metaphysical (Agassi, 1998[1964]), since they guide one’s practice to seek observations of different events rather than differently describe the same events.

The objections to gene selection notwithstanding, throughout the heated controversy over Wilson’s, and to a lesser degree Dawkins’s, book, “group selection” was not a viable alternative (Lewontin et al., 1984). Things began to change only nearing the nineteen eighties, when David S. Wilson (1975), Michael J. Wade (1976, 1978), Dan Cohen and Ilan Eshel (1976) and Carlo Matessi and Suresh D. Jayakar (1976) independently reexamined the theory. D. S. Wilson is perhaps the biologist most closely associated with reviving the idea of group selection. In Wilson’s (1975) trait-group selection model, any set of organisms that interacts in a way that affects their fitness is a group, regardless of how short lived and spatially dissolved this group is. Wilson further demonstrated that even when an altruist loses fitness relative to an egoist within every group, the variance in fitness between groups – favoring those groups with more altruists – can override the variance in fitness within each group – favoring an egotist over an altruist ─ and thus selection at the group level can override selection at the individual level. This variance in group fitness could be inherited in many population structures, including those required for kin selection (Maynard Smith, 1964) and reciprocity (Trivers 1971; Axelrod and Hamilton’s 1981). Thus, Wilson could show that his model incorporates seemingly competing models as instances of group selection.

Cohen and Eshel (1976) and Matessi and Jayakar (1976) models clearly showed how group selection might occur in nature and that it might not be rare at all. In addition to modeling, Wade (1976, 1980) conducted laboratory experiments (mainly on red flower beetles Tribolium castaneum) that demonstrated the strong causal effects of group selection in a given population. Wade compared the evolutionary response of an inter-group selection process (that is, selection between reproductively isolated breeding groups in a population) to a process of kin selection (that is, selection between groups of relatives in a population with random mating within a common pool) to a random process (that is, selection between groups chosen at random) and to a process of individual selection (that is, selection within groups in each of these population structures). His theoretical and empirical results demonstrated the causal importance of the group selection process during evolution. That is, when group selection was taking place it generated an evolutionary response over and above all the other processes, easily detectable even when individual selection or a random process promotes the same trait as group selection, that is, even when affecting a non-altruistic trait (Griesemer and Wade, 1988).

Since the early nineteen eighties, philosophers of biology became involved in the debates surrounding group selection (Hull, 1980; Sober and Lewontin, 1982; Brandon, 1982, 1990; Sober, 1984; Griesemer, 1988; Lloyd, 1988; Sober and Wilson, 1994); and gradually “group selection” (sometimes called “multi-level selection”) became a dominant view in philosophy of science (Lloyd, 2001; Okasha, 2006). One cannot say the same about evolutionary biology, where the gene’s eye-view is still a dominant scientific perspective.

Thirty years after the publication of Sociobiology, however,  E. O. Wilson has revised the importance of kinship in relation to altruism (Wilson and Hölldobler, 2005). Originally, E. O. Wilson thought the answer to “the central theoretical problem” of altruism – in humans and non-humans alike – was all about kinship (Wilson and Hölldobler,  p.3). Now Wilson argues for a minor evolutionary effect, if any, of kin ties in the evolution of high-level social organization (“eusociality”) and commits to D. S. Wilson’s model of trait-group selection (D. S. Wilson and E. O. Wilson, 2007). This disagreement over the evolution of cooperation via group selection is still very much alive in biology and philosophy. Clarifying some of the concepts involved may help understand its dynamics.

3. Non-Empirical Aspects of the Debates

The concept of group selection refers to three different, albeit often overlapping, issues: the first involves selection, the second adaptation, and the third evolutionary transitions. For studying selection, it is necessary to determine whether variations in fitness and in trait frequency between groups exceed those variations within groups (Price, 1972; Sober and Lewontin 1982; Sober and Wilson, 1998), and whether this variance is a mere statistical by-product of selection acting between individuals or an actual causal effect of a selection process that took place at the group level (Sober, 1984; Okasha, 2006).

In addition, for studying group adaptation additional information is required on group-heritability (Lloyd, 1988; Brandon 1990; Wade, 1978, 1985; Okasha, 2006), that is, whether and how does an average trait in a daughter group resemble the average trait in the mother group more than it resembles the population mean? Is this statistical resemblance between mother and daughter group, if found, a result of random or group-structured mating in the population? Is it regularly expected in a given population structure or a product of chance, in the sense of an irregular event?

The third issue concerns how the evolutionary transition from solitary organisms to social groups occurred (Maynard Smith and Szathmáry 1995, Jablonka and Lamb, 2005). That is, it concerns how various cooperative adaptations have combined to bring about systematic altruism, so that individuals have lost their independent reproduction and mate only within the larger encompassing whole or social group. In this third type of question, one cannot assume a group structure already exists in the population in order to explain the evolution of altruism within such population – as did Darwin and many others – nor even assume that a gene for altruism already exists – as did Hamilton and many others; rather, one must explain how societies, phenotypes and genotypes emerge and co-evolve (Griesemer, 2000).

The notions of group selection and group adaptation both rely upon the meaning of a “unit of selection.” A unit of selection shows phenotypic variance, fitness variance, and heritability of traits relating to fitness (Lewontin 1970). Lewontin has shown that multiple structural units – for example, genotype, organism, and group – could hold the conditions of a unit of selection. However, the function of a unit of selection is still under conceptual dispute. Is the function of a unit of selection to replicate itself from generation to generation (Dawkins, 1976) or is it to interact with its environment in a way that causes differential reproduction (Hull 1980). Focusing on the function of a unit of selection as a replicator, means that the gene is the “real” or major unit of selection, since an organism that reproduces sexually replicates only one half of its traits on average, and a group that splits into daughter groups has an even smaller chance to replicate its trait, for example, its frequency of altruists, to the next generation of groups. Alternatively, viewing the “unit of selection” as an interactor means that a single gene cannot be a unit of selection but only whole genomes (that is,, individuals) and perhaps groups could function as such units.

But must one choose a single perspective for explaining the evolution of altruism? Kitcher, Sterelny and Waters (1990) argue for a pluralist view that suggests several equally adequate models one can use for representing the same facts. Kerr and Godfrey-Smith (2002) develop this pluralistic view into a mathematical representation, which fully translates the unit of the group from a mere background for its individuals ─ that is, “group’ as contextual” ─ to an emergent unit as a whole ─ that is, “group” as a “collective” ─ and vice versa. The advantage of pluralism in this case is that one need not decide which process actually took precedent ─ for example group selection or individual selection ─ in  explaining and predicting the evolution of altruism.

Yet pluralism comes with a price if one wishes to understand the evolution of altruism via its evolutionary casual process. In the history of science, translatability of competing models relative to a body of empirical knowledge repeatedly called scientists and philosophers to search for additional observations and/or experiments that will “break the tie” and decide which model to uphold (Agassi, 1998[1964]). In the debates over the evolution of altruism, Lloyd, (2005), Wimsatt (2007, Ch. 10) and Griesemer (2006) argue that in most cases – or at least in the interesting cases where a casual process might be operating at the level of the group – interchangeable abstract models require one to minimize  empirical details about population structure and dynamic, which are necessary for confirming one’s evolutionary explanation. These disputes over the unit of selection’s relevant function or plurality of representation have been at the focus of the philosophical debates over group selection for several decades.

4. Empirical Aspects of the Debates

Semantic disputes notwithstanding, whether or not groups in a certain population actually show heritable variance in fitness is an empirical question (Griesemer 2000). Since Wade has already demonstrated the noticeable evolutionary effects of group selection, whether or not the population is in fact divided into social groups with heritable variance in fitness should be tested in each case, prior to describing these entities as “replicators” or “interactors,” “contextual backgrounds” or “emergent collectives.”

Brandon (1990, 98–116) reviewed the empirical criteria for a process of group selection to take place: when there is no variance in group fitness or when the variance in group fitness does not depend on group structure (for example, when group differential reproduction is independent of the relative frequency of altruists in the group, but instead depends on the frequency of hurricane storms in its environment), a process of selection between groups cannot occur. When both individual selection and group selection processes affect a trait, selection within groups is more effective when variance in the fitness of individuals within each group exceeds variance in the mean fitness between groups or when the variance in a group- trait is not heritable.

“Group trait” in this context need not be a unique holistic trait but rather can be the mean phenotype of individuals in that group; similarly, “group fitness” is the mean fitness of individuals within a group relative to the mean fitness of another group; and “group heritability” traces phenotypic variation among parent-offspring lineages of groups: if the trait of the daughter-group significantly resembles its mother-group compared to the population mean, then realized group heritability is non-zero. This “group trait” describes an individual’s trait within a context of a group-structured population (Heisler and Damuth, 1987); which leads Maynard Smith and Williams to argue that this is not a group trait at all or that describing this trait as an individual trait is more useful (c.f. Okasha, 2006, p. 180). Whatever the verdict on the characterization of “group trait” and “group fitness,” an empirical dimension exists, with regard to a selection process at the level of the group, and empirical criteria to test such a process are available. One might expect multiple field and laboratory tests of the existence of group selection. Natural and laboratory tests exist (Goodnight and Stevens, 1997), yet the common practice in these debates invests relatively little in empirical study. The next section will attempt to describe this practice and suggest a rational explanation for it.

5. Practices in the Debates: Sociobiology

One of the most revealing examples for the practice in the debates over group selection is a recent debate between Wilson, the author of Sociobiology, and Dawkins, the author of The Selfish Gene, who used to employ similar selection models but now deeply disagree over the role of group selection in the evolution of eusociality.

Both sides declare that their models are translatable (Wilson and Wilson 2007, Dawkins, 1982 p. 1), that is, can agree with any set of data the other model agrees with. If this disagreement were purely about terminology, one would expect the scientific community to gradually lose interest in it. This has not happened. Another possibility is that the models agree with all the data but differ greatly in their heuristic value. In that case, one would expect many methodological comparisons of model performance – for example, comparisons of models’ precision, generality, accuracy, complexity, and/or elegance – for various species and social phenomena in the lab and in nature. Yet these are not a central part of the debate either (Sober and Wilson, 1998). Rather, it seems there is no “given” phenomenon both sides use; instead, disputants clash on how to define or describe the phenomenon the models attempt to fit. In short, they disagree over what it is that we see when several ants walk by.

For Wilson and Wilson (2007), as in earlier work by Sober and Wilson (1989), a “group” is any aggregate of individuals that is small compared to the total population to which they belong and where individuals non-randomly interact in a way that affects each other’s fitness. This is an extremely abstract understanding of what constitutes a group: one that fits many kinds of cases and is almost completely unconstrained by any particular population structure, dynamic, duration or size. Nor does it require groups to multiply as anything like cohesive wholes in order to acquire heritable variance in fitness. Indeed, such a broad definition of “group” is central for Wilson and Wilson’s definition of “group selection:” “the evolution of traits based on the differential survival and reproduction of groups” (Wilson and Wilson, p. 329). Such a group selection model need not differ empirically from the similarly broad definition of “kin selection:” “selection affected by relatedness among individuals” (Foster et al. 2005, p.58).”Relatedness” here does not refer only to family descent but to an index of comparison between any set of individuals, including strangers, from the same species.

Similar to Wilson’s and Wilson’s “group selection,” no particular population structure constrains Foster’s et al.’s application of “kin selection.” The difference between the models lies in model structure: whereas the group selection model partitions the overall selection in the population into “within group selection” and “between groups selection” components, the alternative models – for example, kin selection, reciprocity, indirect and network reciprocity (Nowak, 2006) – do not employ such partitioning, since in these models what enhances group fitness always enhances the inclusive fitness of each individual (or rather what Dawkins “only partly facetiously” describes as “that property of an individual organism which will appear to be maximized when what is really maximized is gene survival” (Dawkins 1982, p. 187)).

This theoretical difference in model structure does not necessarily emphasize different causal factors, since the context that can affect the frequency of altruists – population structure and ecology – can be captured according to both Wilson’s and Dawkins’s models (Wilson 2008 and Foster et al. 2005), and does not constrain either model. So, argue Foster et al. (2005), if Wilson’s new group model does not generate facts unattainable otherwise, why accept his definition of “kin selection,” rather than Maynard Smith’s original 1964 definition: “the evolution of characteristics which favor the survival of close relatives of the affected individual” Dawkins, p. 1145) Yet Wilson asks in return, why not go back to Darwin’s explanation of group selection? Thus the debate again seems to be over terminology, this time with a historical twist.

But why should biologists care (as they obviously do)? If the disagreement was mainly about choosing among interchangeable perspectives for the same phenomenon, a choice based on personal taste, historical uses, or the heuristic value of each model, one would expect the scientific debate to gradually dissolve in the first two cases and become pragmatically/methodology based in the third. Since the debate has neither dissolved nor turned pragmatic, and since one can plausibly assume this debate is a rational one, the remaining explanation is the best one: that Wilson and Dawkins disagree over semantics because both hope for their different concepts and models to refer to different evolutionary processes in the world. To use Dawkins’s terms, even when modestly arguing over the flipping picture we receive from a Necker cube (Dawkins, 1982 p. 1) the non-modest aim remains to decipher the picture we see from an east-African mountain: whether the small spots below are insects or buffalos (Dawkins, p. 7).

When Wilson looks at a social group he sees a unit which is a target of selection, while Dawkins sees an illusory by-product of a different selection process, acting at a single level of organization: gene selection. They disagree the way they do because they aim toward representing empirical facts accurately, but since both sides employ overly broad definitions for “group,” “group selection” and “kin selection.” it becomes very difficult to identify a specific fact, for example, a particular population dynamic or structure, to test these models in a particular case (Shavit, 2005). In short, Wilson’s and Dawkins’s concepts might be too broad to hold enough empirical content for scientifically advancing the debate over the evolution of altruism by group selection.

Not all supporters of group selection use such broad concepts. Wade (1978, 1985) defined “group selection” and “kin selection” in accord with different population structures, so his constrained models could clearly refer to distinct selection processes that he and his colleagues then compared in the lab or in the field. Both Dawkins and Wilson may object that Wade’s definitions are too narrow. They would be right in the sense that his definitions do not cover many kinds of cases, yet that does not imply that his definitions do not cover many cases. They do (for example, Wade and Goodnight, 1998 on various taxa; Aviles, 1997 on spiders).  It seems that such narrow definitions – those that restrict the kinds of cases – readily facilitate empirical tools to determine what is and is not happening in a given population, whereas the broad definitions used by Dawkins and Wilson are more likely to talk past each other without resolution. Nonetheless, the use of broad concepts seem to be dominating the field, perhaps partly due to the political images and memories that everyday terms such as “altruism,” “group” and of course “selection” carry into science from society at large (Shavit, 2008). Employing social metaphors laden with multiple conflicting meanings began with Darwin, and, ever since, explaining the evolution of altruism by group selection stubbornly remains “one special difficulty” (Darwin, 1859, p. 236).

6. References and Further Reading

  • Agassi, J.: 1998 [1964], “The Nature of Scientific Problems and Their Roots in Metaphysics,” in Bunge, M. (ed.): The Critical Approach: Essays in Honor of Karl Popper, Free Press, New York 189-211.
  • Avilés, L.: 1997, “Causes and Consequences of Cooperation and Permanent-Sociality in Spiders,” in Choe, J. C. and Crespi, B. J. (eds.): The Evolution of Social Behavior in Insects and Arachnids, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge.
  • Axelrod, R. and Hamilton, W. D.: 1981, “The Evolution of Cooperation,” Science 211, 1390–1396.
  • Mills, S. K. and Beaty, J. H.: 1979, “The Propensity Interpretation of Fitness,” Philosophy of Science 46, 236–286.
  • Brandon, R.: 1982, “The Levels of Selection,” PSA 1982, Vol. 1, eds. P. Asquith and T. Nickles, East Lansing MI., Philosophy of Science Association,  315-323.
  • Brandon, R.: 1990, Adaptation and Environment, Princeton University Press, Princeton, New Jersey.
  • Cohen, D. and Eshel, I.: 1976, “On the Founder Effect and the Evolution of Altruistic Traits,” Theoretical Population Biology 10, 276–302.
  • Darwin, C.: 1859, On the Origin of Species, The Heritage Press, New York, 1963.
  • Darwin, C.: 1871, The Descent of Man, The Heritage Press, New York, 1972.
  • Davidson, D.: 2001, Essays on Actions and Events, Clarendon Press, Oxford.
  • Dawkins, R.: 1976, The Selfish gene, Oxford University Press, Oxford.
  • Dawkins, R.: 1982, The Extended Phenotype, Oxford University Press, Oxford.
  • Foster K. R, Wenseleers T, Ratnieks F. L. M.: 2006, “Kin Selection is the Key to Altruism,” Trends in Ecology and Evolution 21: 57-60.
  • Frank, S. A.: 1998, Foundations of Social Evolution, Princeton University Press, Princeton, New Jersey.
  • Gould, S. J.: 1980, The Panda’s Thumb, W.W. Norton & Company, New York.
  • Griesemer, J.: 2000, “The Units of Evolutionary Transition,” Selection 1, 67–80.
  • Griesemer, J. and M. J. Wade.: 1988, “Laboratory Models, Causal Explanation and Group Selection,” Biology and Philosophy 3, 67–96.
  • Hamilton, W. D.: 1964, “The Genetical Evolution of Social Behavior. I,” Journal of Theoretical Biology 7, 1–16.
  • Hamilton, W. D.: 1964b, “The Genetical Evolution of Social Behavior. II,” Journal of Theoretical Biology 7, 17–52.
  • Heisler, I. L. and Damuth J.: 1987, “A Method for Analyzing Selection in Hierarchically Structured Populations,” American Naturalist 130, 582–602.
  • Hull, D.: 1980, “Individuality and Selection,” Annual Review of Ecology and Systematics 11, 311–332.
  • Jablonka E. and Lamb M.: 2005, Evolution in Four Dimensions, M.I.T. Press, Cambridge Massachusetts.
  • Keller, E. F.: 1988, “Demarcating Public from Private Values in Evolutionary Discourse,” Journal of the History of Biology 21, 195–211.
  • Kitcher, P., Sterelny, K., and Waters, C. K.: 1990,”The Illusory Riches of Sober’s Monism,” The Journal of Philosophy 87, 158—161.
  • Kropotkin, P. (1902). Mutual Aid. London: Heinemann.
  • Lack, D. L.: 1956, Swift in a Tower, Methuen, London.
  • Lewontin, R. C.: 1970, “The Units of Selection,” Annual Reviews of Ecology and Systematics 1, 1–17.
  • Lewontin R. C., Rose S. and Kamin L.: 1984, Not in our Genes, Pantheon, New York.
  • Lloyd, E. A.: 1988, The Structure and Confirmation of Evolutionary Theory, second ed., Princeton University Press, Princeton, 1994.
  • Lloyd, E. A.: 2001, “Units and Levels of Selection: An Anatomy of the Units of Selection Debates,” in R. S. Singh et al. (eds.), Thinking About Evolution, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge.
  • Lloyd, E. A.: 2005, “Why the Gene Will Not Return,” Philosophy of Science 72, 287–310.
  • Lustig, A. J.: 2004, “Ant Utopias and human Dystopias Around World War I,” in F. Vidal and L. Daston (eds.), The Moral Authority of Nature, University of Chicago press, Chicago.
  • Matessi, C. and Jayakar, S. D.: 1976, “Conditions for the Evolution of Altruism Under Darwinian Selection,” Theoretical Population Biology 9, 360–387.
  • Maynard Smith, J.: 1964, “Group Selection and Kin Selection,” Nature 201, 1145–1147.
  • Maynard Smith, J and E. Szathmáry.: 1995, The Major Transitions in Evolution, W.H. Freeman, Oxford.
  • Mitman, G.: 1992, The State of Nature, University of Chicago Press, Chicago.
  • Nowak, M. A.: 2006, “Five rules for the Evolution of Cooperation,” Science 314, 1560–1563.
  • Okasha, S. 2006, Evolution and Levels of Selection, Oxford University Press: Oxford.
  • Popper, K. R.: [1945] 2006, The Open Society and Its Enemies, Routledge, London.
  • Segerstråle, U.: 2000, Defenders of the Truth, Oxford University Press, Oxford.
  • Shavit, A.: 2005, “The notion of ‘Group’ and Tests of Group Selection,” Philosophy of Science 72, 1052–1063.
  • Shavit, A.: 2008, One for All? Facts and Values in the Debates over the Evolution of Altruism, The Magnes Press, Jerusalem.
  • Simpson, G. G.:  1941, “The Role of the Individual in Evolution,” Journal of the Washington Academy of Sciences 31, 1–20.
  • Sober, E.: 1984, “Holism, Individualism, and the Units of Selection,” in E. Sober (ed.) Conceptual Issues in Evolutionary Biology, M.I.T. Press, Cambridge Mass., p. 184–209.
  • Sober, E. and Wilson, D. S.: 1998, Unto Others, Harvard University Press, Cambridge, Mass.
  • Trivers, R.: 1971, “The Evolution of Altruism,” Quarterly Review of Biology 46, 35–57.
  • Wade, M. J.: 1976, “Group Selection Among Laboratory Populations of Tribolium,” Proceedings in the National Academy of Science 73, 4604– 4607.
  • Wade, M. J.: 1978, “A Critical Review of the Models of Group Selection,” Quarterly Review of Biology 53, 101–114.
  • Wade, M. J.: 1980, “An Experimental Study of Kin Selection,” Evolution 34, 844–855.
  • Wade, M. J.: 1985, “Soft Selection, Hard Selection, Kin Selection and Group Selection,” American Naturalist 125, 61–73.
  • Wade, M. J. and Goodnight, C. J.: 1998, “The Theories of Fisher and Wright in the Context of Metapopulations: When Nature Does Many Small Experiments,” Evolution 52, 1537–1553.
  • Williams, G. C.: 1966, Adaptation and Natural Selection, Princeton University Press, Princeton.
  • Williams, G. C.: 1989, “A Sociobiological Expansion of Evolution and Ethics,” in (eds.) J. Paradis and G. C. Williams), Evolution and Ethics, Princeton University Press, Princeton New Jersey.
  • Wilson, D. S.: 1975, “A General Theory of Group Selection,” Proceedings of the National Academy of Sciences 72, 143–146.
  • Wilson D. S. and Wilson E. O.: 2007, “Rethinking the Theoretical Foundation of Sociobiology,” The Quarterly Review of Biology 82: 327–348.
  • Wilson E. O.: 1975, Sociobiology, Harvard University Press, Cambridge Massachusetts.
  • Wilson E. O. and Hölldobler B.: 2005, “Eusociality: Origin and Consequences,” Proceedings of the National Academy of Sciences 102, 13367–13371.
  • Wimsatt, W. C.: 2007, Re-Engineering Philosophy for Limited Beings, Harvard University Press, Cambridge, Massachusetts.
  • Wynne-Edwards, V. C.: 1962, Animal Dispersion, in Relation to Social Behaviour, Oliver and Boyd, Edinburgh, Great Britain.

Author Information

Ayelet Shavit
Email: ashavit@telhai.ac.il
Tel Hai Academic College

Medieval Theories of Practical Reason

Practical reason is the employment of reason in service of living a good life, and the great medieval thinkers all gave accounts of it. Practical reason is reasoning about, or better toward, an action, and an action always has a goal or end, this end being understood to be in some sense good. The medievals generally concurred that it was always in some way directed toward the agent’s ultimate goal or final end (although there were important differences in how the agent’s relation to the final end was conceived).

In every medieval account, we find important roles for the intellect and the will—for the intellect in identifying goods to be honored and pursued, and for the will in tending toward such goods. Medieval accounts always paid attention to the relationship between practical reason and the moral trinity of happiness, law, and virtue. Perhaps the most important difference between these accounts is that some philosophers assign primacy to the intellect but others assign it to the will. This difference has led historians to identify schools of thought called intellectualism and voluntarism.

This article traces some of the main lines of medieval thought about practical reason, from its roots in Aristotle and Augustine through some of its most interesting expressions in Aquinas and Scotus, the ablest exponents, respectively, of intellectualism and voluntarism. The article points out the important differences among theorists, but also highlights the themes common to all the medieval, and it indicates some points of contact with contemporary work on practical reason, including debates about particularism and internalism.

Table of Contents

  1. Precursors: Aristotle and Augustine
    1. Aristotle
    2. Augustine
    3. Intellectualism and Voluntarism
  2. Intellectualist Theory: Aquinas
    1. The Interaction of Intellect and Will in Generating Action
    2. The Practical Syllogism
    3. Happiness, Law, and Virtue
    4. Final Comments
  3. Voluntarist Theory: Scotus
    1. Freedom of the Will
    2. Synderesis, Conscience, and the Natural Law
    3. The Non-Teleological Character of Scotus’ Thought
    4. Note on Ockham
  4. Medieval and Modern
    1. The Current Influence of Aquinas and Scotus
    2. The Medievals and Particularism
    3. The Medievals and Internalism
  5. Conclusion: Common Themes among the Medievals
  6. References and Further Reason
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1.Precursors: Aristotle and Augustine

The two most important influences upon medieval thought about practical reason were Aristotle and St. Augustine, and this first section identifies a few of the key ideas they bequeathed to their successors.

a. Aristotle

Aristotle’s theory is teleological and eudaimonist: All action is undertaken for an end, and our proximate ends, when we act rationally, form a coherent hierarchical structure leading up to our final end of eudaimonia (happiness, flourishing). Although we presuppose rather than reason about our final end formally considered—it is that which we pursue for its own sake, and for the sake of which we pursue all else; it is that which makes life worthwhile—practical reason does help us work out the correct way to think about just what that final end is, and about how to move toward it. Reason does this by means of the practical syllogism: The major premise identifies the end, some good recognized as worthy of pursuit; the minor premise interprets the agent’s situation in relation to the end; the conclusion is characteristically a choice leading directly to action that pursues means to the end (for example, Some pleasant relaxation would be good right now; reading this novel would be pleasant and relaxing; I shall read it (and straightaway I commence reading)). The work practical reason does in formulating the minor premise and identifying the means is called deliberation. While we cannot deliberate about the end identified in the major premise as an end, we can deliberate about it under its aspect as a means to some further end. Thus practical reason can (although seldom will it explicitly do so in practice) take the form of a chain of syllogisms, with the major premise of the first identifying the final end to be pursued, and the conclusion both identifying the means to that end and supplying the major premise of the next (now serving as a proximate end), until we finally reach down to something to be done here and now (the means to the most proximate end). Here is a compressed example: I should flourish as a human being, and my flourishing requires the practice of civic virtue, so I should practice civic virtue; I should practice civic virtue, in my circumstances civic virtue requires me to enlist in the army to defend my city, so I should enlist; I should enlist, and here is a recruiter to whom I must speak in order to enlist; I choose to speak to the recruiter.

Notice that in this syllogism the premises do not mention desire—the majors do not state “I want X,” but rather that X is a good to be pursued. Yet the conclusion does mention desire, or rather is a desire (for that is what choice is, deliberated desire). This is not an oversight on Aristotle’s part. Although he holds that reason and desire work together to produce action, he insists that desire naturally tends to what cognition identifies as good—as he puts it at Metaphysics 1072a29, “desire is consequent upon opinion rather than opinion on desire, for the thinking is the starting point.” Reason serves as the formal cause of action by identifying the actions (determining what “form” our actions should take) leading to the apprehended good, which is the final cause or end of action; desire serves as the efficient cause, putting the man in motion toward the end. So when a prospective end is recognized as good, a desire for it follows. The practical syllogism serves to transmit the desire for the end identified by reason as good down to means identified by reason as the appropriate way to the end.

Yet, because cognition includes sense perception, things other than those identified by reason can be presented to desire as good (as any dieter knows when offered dessert). This allows Aristotle to propose a solution to the problem of akrasia or “weakness of will,” the choosing of something we know to be bad—to put it crudely, we know it is bad, but it looks good. For reasoning to be effectively practical, and for practice to be rational, the desires must be in line with reason; for the desires to be consistently in line with reason, the moral virtues, which “train” the emotions to bring them into line with reason, are necessary. When the moral virtues, together with prudence, are present, Aristotle takes it that reasoning well and acting accordingly will follow naturally (we can speak of virtue as “second nature”).

b.  Augustine

The idea of virtuous action becoming natural is one of the points on which Augustine will disagree with Aristotle. He learns from his own experience (for example, in his robbing of the pear tree recounted in Confessions II) and from his reflections on the sin of the angels (see On Free Choice of the Will III) that the will can choose what the intellect rejects. Although the intellect is required for willing in the sense that it presents objects as good to the will, willing has no cause other than the will itself. Augustine, unlike some later Augustinians, is a eudaimonist, seeing our final end as eternal life in peace, that is, in right relation to and enjoyment of God (see The City of God XIX). Yet it should be noted that, drawing on his own experience and the writings of St. Paul, he identifies “two loves” of the will, love of God and love of self, and holds that the struggle between these two for ascendancy is the key to each human life, and indeed to history. No trace of such a struggle is to be found in Aristotle; nor   is there any such role for faith as we find in Augustine. Both in Confessions XI and in The City of God XIX Augustine chronicles the woes of temporal human existence, and the impossibility of finding peace, our final end, during our life on earth. It is thus in some sense reasonable for us to turn humbly to faith in God as our only hope for salvation. This turning, or conversion, requires an act of willed submission to God. Only after this can the intellect know, by faith, the true character of our final end, and thus only after such willing can practical reason become truly informed as to how to act. The need for conversion brings one more un-Aristotelian idea into the picture, that of obedience to divine law.

c.  Intellectualism and Voluntarism

Aristotle’s account of practical reason could be characterized as intellectualist, not   because he ignores the very important role of desire, but because reason plays the leading role, and desire is naturally inclined to follow reason (“desire is consequent upon opinion … for the thinking is the starting point”). Further, although Aristotle employs the concept of rational wish, there is serious debate as to whether this can rightly be identified with what the medievals, following Augustine, call the will. By contrast, Augustine may be termed a voluntarist, not because reason is unimportant, but because with him it is the will that plays the primary role. As we have seen, even in the absence of passion, the will may choose contrary to the judgment of the intellect, and it is only by willed humility that we can come to know our true final end by faith.

Throughout much of the Christian Middle Ages, Augustine’s influence predominates. And although much important work was done on topics highly relevant to practical reasoning—for example, passages in Peter Lombard’s Sentences, and the work of  St. Anselm on the will and of Abelard on ethics—practical reasoning itself was not generally treated in a rigorous and systematic way. But in the twelfth century, translations of Aristotle’s works, together with Muslim and Jewish commentaries, began to flow into Western Europe, and to gain in influence, eventually rivaling or surpassing the importance of Augustine’s thought. These thinkers do treat practical reasoning in rigorous fashion, and under their influence, so too do the great thinkers of the High Middle Ages. In doing so, all draw on both Aristotle and Augustine, and although it is common practice to identify some as “Aristotelians” and “intellectualists,” and others as “Augustinians” and “voluntarists,” this does run the risk of oversimplifying. The reader should keep in mind that there is no one account of the relation between intellect and will that all intellectualists held, nor one opposed account that all voluntarists held. Instead, scholars sort thinkers according to whether they hold certain characteristic theses concerning such questions as these: Is the intellect or the will the higher power? Is the will a passive power (a “moved mover”) or an active one (a “self-mover”)? What sort of cause does the intellect exert on the will’s choice—does it specify the act of will, or can the will act independently and control its own choices (and can it act contrary to judgment)? A metaphor commonly used by those now classified as voluntarists was that of the Lord and the Lampbearer: The will is the lord, deciding where to go; the intellect contributes to the decision,  but in the same manner as the servant who lights the way (or rather the possible ways) with a lamp (see for example Henry of Ghent, Quodlibet Iq14). Intellectualists, by contrast, would see the intellect as the lord, and the will as the lieutenant or executive officer.

In the intellectualist camp we can probably include St. Albert (see the first McCluskey entry for a discussion) and John of Paris;  in the voluntarist camp, St. Bonaventure and Henry of Ghent. Others, such as Giles of Rome, occupy a position in the disputed middle ground (see Kent for an intellectualist reading of Giles; Eardley for a moderately voluntarist reading). The following sections will focus on the two figures who are arguably the most important and influential thinkers of the High Middle Ages, taking Aquinas as a representative of intellectualism, and Scotus as a representative of voluntarism. But it should be kept in mind that Aquinas treats Augustine as an authority and has a much more robust conception of the will than does Aristotle, and likewise that Scotus draws heavily upon Aristotle and insists upon a very important role for the intellect.

2.  Intellectualist Theory: Aquinas

Like both Aristotle and Augustine, St. Thomas Aquinas (1225-1274) is a eudaimonist; like Augustine he takes seriously both obedience to divine law and the role of the will in the genesis of action; yet like Aristotle he is an intellectualist. (This is generally accepted, but it should be noted that some scholars have argued for more somewhat more voluntarist readings of Aquinas than that offered below. See Eardley and Westberg for sources, discussion, and criticism of these interpretations.) For Aquinas, practical reasoning plays out in a dynamic exchange between intellect and will, an exchange in which intellect always has the first word (reason being the first principle of human action), but in which the will plays a key role and the agent remains free.

a.  The Interaction of Intellect and Will in Generating Action

For Aquinas, the will tends naturally toward the good, but to act it must have the good presented to it by reason in its practical capacity. Further, after apprehending and willing the good, the agent must decide whether and how to pursue it, which involves a process of collaboration between intellect and will. Let us begin with an example, making use of Ralph McInerny’s immortal character, Fifi LaRue. In the midst of a bad day, Fifi sees a travel poster advertising a Roman holiday, apprehends “how nice that would be,” and forms a wish to go. She considers the idea as befitting, and enjoys it. Nothing seems to stand in the way; the trip would be delightful and cause no problems; she forms the intention to go. But she must take counsel as to how she could accomplish it. Due to time constraints, she must fly, but could take a bus or taxi to the airport; she consents to both. Yet the bus would be so crowded … let it be the taxi then, she judges, and so chooses. Here is a taxi; she must hail it by raising her arm. So she commands, and so uses her arm. The taxi pulls up, and off she goes.

This example involves the steps and terms Aquinas spells out in questions 8-17 of the prima secundae (the first part of the second part of the Summa theologiae),  and we should now look at some of the details of this complex discussion: The intellect apprehends something as good and thereby presents it to the will, which then wills or wishes that good as an end—call this simple willing. (Strictly speaking, it would be more proper to say the agent apprehends the good by means of her intellect and simply wills it by means of her will; this is always what Aquinas means, although for convenience he often speaks of the intellect apprehending and so forth.) This does not yet mean that the agent pursues the good; she may decide not to for a variety of reasons—perhaps it is pleasant but sinful, and she immediately rejects it—or may be as yet undecided. She may then continue to consider the good, apprehend it as befitting in some ways, and, in a second act of will regarding the possible end, enjoy it (while we perfectly enjoy only an end possessed, we may imperfectly enjoy or entertain the idea of possessing it). Again, actual pursuit need not follow—perhaps the good is befitting but not currently feasible (Fifi, perhaps, lacks the money). Finally, the agent may actually undertake to pursue this good as an end, to tend toward it, and this act of will Aquinas calls intention (and here again, Aquinas is explicit that an act of reason precedes this act of will; cf. q12a1ad3).

Now intending the good as an end, the agent must determine how best to pursue it—she must decide upon means to the end. When the means are not immediately obvious, the agent deliberates or takes counsel, in which reason seeks out acceptable ways to the end; such ways being found the will then consents to them. Reason must then issue a judgment (q14a1) as to which is preferable, followed by the act of will called choice (q13, q15a3ad3). So, Fifi took counsel as to how to reach the airport, identifies and accepts two ways (bus or taxi), then judges the taxi superior and so chooses that means. But in considering how to get from America to Rome, she is able to skip the counsel/consent stage because the means (flying) are immediately obvious (she has no time for sailing).

The choice having been made, it is time to execute. Here again we see the same pattern of an act of intellect, command, followed by an act of will, use, whereby the will employs faculties of the soul, parts of the body, or material objects to make the choice effective. So when the taxi draws near, Fifi sees that she must wave, and commands “this (waving) is to be done.”  This command informs, or gives exact shape to, her already present will to take a taxi (her choice). Her will then uses her arm, puts it in motion.

Now the process described is a complex one, having as many as twelve steps from the initial apprehension of a good down to use. Do we really go through all of this? Aquinas does not mean that we consciously rehearse all the steps every time we perform an action (just as we do not consciously rehearse rules of grammar in articulating a thought). The twelve-step process is a logical reconstruction of the role of intellect and will in generating action. The steps are those we could consciously rehearse, and perhaps sometimes do (if facing a complicated matter, say, or if doggedly pressed for an explanation or justification of a past action). Usually, our actual practical reasoning will be much more concise. Daniel Westberg and others have argued that we should understand Aquinas to have in mind a streamlined version of the process centered around intention (apprehension and intention), decision (judgment and choice), and execution (command and use), with intellect and will working in unison at each stage. Other acts mentioned by Aquinas, such as counsel and consent, may serve auxiliary roles in complex situations.

Westberg stresses that we should not take Aquinas to mean that at each stage intellect renders its judgment and then the will decides whether or not to follow it—as we will see, this is the way of the voluntarists. Instead, the will naturally tends toward the good presented to it by the intellect at each stage. So for example in discussing whether choice is an act of intellect or of will, Aquinas says choice “is materially an act of the will, but formally an act of the reason” (q13a1)—roughly, the intellect in presenting some particular thing or action as good “forms” or makes specific the will’s general tendency toward the good (Aquinas follows Aristotle in maintaining that, like substances, accidents, including actions, can be analyzed in terms of form and matter). It is because the act of choice is completed by the will (judgment alone is not yet choice) that Aquinas is prepared to call it an act of will. Yet there is a real sense in which the stage Westberg calls “decision” comprises one act of the reasoning agent, an act whose form derives from reason and whose matter is supplied by will.

Voluntarists will charge that here the intellect is determining the will, which is thus not free. Now Aquinas calls that free which “retains the power of being inclined to various things” (Iaq83a1); a subject is free if it has this power. A rock is not free just because it can be inclined to heat or chill by the external power of fire or ice. Aquinas’s implied response to the voluntarist charge in the course of his discussion of choice is that the act of choice is free because the judgment that forms it is free, and the judgment is free because in considering any particular good, reason can focus on how it is good or on how it is lacking in goodness, leading to a judgment for or against it (q13a6). Worth noting, too, is that the will (and those other affective powers, the passions) play a role in attracting or diverting the attention of reason during the counsel it takes prior to judgment. But Aquinas’s more complete response would be that, strictly, it is not the will or reason that is free; the person is free in making the judgment and thus in making the choice the judgment informs. The intellect does not make the judgment, the person—the willing and feeling, as well as thinking, person—makes it by means of his intellect. The person is the subject that “retains the power” of, say, sitting closer to or further from the fire and thus being hot or cold; he exercises this power by means of his faculties of reason and will.

All of this shows how things can in many ways be more complicated, and less mechanical, than the initial description of Fifi’s pursuit of a Roman holiday suggested. One especially important factor, just touched on, is the reflexivity of both intellect and will. The will, for example, uses both intellect and itself throughout the process of deliberation (see q16a4c&ad3). In reaching her judgment, Fifi focused on the bus being crowded, but if her affections were more attuned to saving money, she might have focused instead on its economy. Further, she could at any point consider whether she should deliberate further and decide whether or not to do so. There is a potentially infinite regress here, but not an actual one. In taking counsel, having consented to taking the bus, she could yield to impatience and hop on the bus she sees rather than thinking further and realizing that a taxi would be better. Neither the bus nor the taxi, nor for that matter any other means or particular good in this life, is a perfect good. Thus none of them determine reason in its favor. Our judgment, and thus our choice, remain free. This highlights one reason Aquinas can be called an intellectualist, namely that he identifies reason as the source of freedom (see Iaq59a3: “wherever there is intellect, there is free-will”). But again, if this seems, paradoxically, to locate freedom in reason rather than will, it is well to remember that Aquinas’s talk of the intellect doing this, and the will that, is all shorthand for the person acting by means of each faculty. It is the person, not her faculties, who judges and chooses; and does both freely.

b.  The Practical Syllogism

But how does such reasoning relate to the Aristotelian notion of the practical syllogism Aquinas adopts? The intellectual acts regarding, and the pursuant intention of, the end supply the major premise (say, “I should go to Rome.”). The minor premise is supplied by deliberation, resulting in judgment and choice (“Taking a cab to the airport is the best way to Rome.”). This may take a major premise-minor premise form as above, but often the deliberation of the agent would be better represented as a longer argument with several premises, or as an iterated series of two-premise arguments finally reaching down to the concrete action. In this case, the means to the end initially chosen would then become the object of intention as a proximate end (q12a2), and counsel would be taken as to the means to that end, and so forth, until something that can be done here and now is reached (much as we saw above in the discussion of Aristotle).

Two questions present themselves at this point: What sort of reasoning goes into the formation of intentions, and how is this reasoning, and the reasoning involved in counsel, done well or ill? Sketching an answer to these questions requires a discussion of happiness, law, and virtue.

c.  Happiness, Law, and Virtue

Aquinas agrees with Aristotle that we have a final end, and with Augustine that it is not to be attained in this life (it is not a Roman holiday, unless perhaps in a very metaphorical sense). Using the term “happiness” is a potentially misleading, but common, translation of beatitude. Blessedness or flourishing would be better, for in fact our final end is our completion or perfection. Aquinas takes it that we all agree, or would agree upon reflection, on that. There is neither need nor room for practical reasoning about it. Yet we disagree over that in which it consists: one says wealth, another power, another (Fifi, perhaps) pleasure. And here we can reason: The mere fact that Aquinas wrote the first five questions of the prima secundae shows that he thought so. There he argues that because the will wills the good universally, and only God is universally good, our final end is attained in virtuous activity culminating in the right relation to God (although we may not know that the happiness we seek can be found only in and with God), which consists principally in loving contemplation and secondarily in obedient service. Only this perfects our nature as rational creatures. Although Aquinas agrees with Augustine that this end can be attained, or even adequately understood, only by God’s grace, Aquinas takes it that we do tend naturally (even if inadequately) toward it, and that its attainment fulfills, as well as transcends, our nature (“Grace does not destroy nature but perfects it” Iaq1a8ad2). What reason is able to make out about our final end, then, is reliable and authoritative, even if always incomplete.

There is a long-standing controversy in Aquinas scholarship concerning the relationship between what Aquinas calls imperfect and perfect beatitude: Do we have a natural final end of humanly virtuous activity and a distinct supernatural final end of contemplation of and friendship with God? Or do we have just one final end that is naturally unattainable? Here readers are referred to Bradley for a very thorough discussion of the issues involved.

Because by our nature we have a final end, any other end we have (going to Rome, perhaps) could be reconsidered in its light, and since everything we do is (perhaps unconsciously) done for the sake of the final end (Ia-IIaeq1a6), every other good we pursue, though seen as an end, is also a means to our final end, and under this aspect can be deliberated about, evaluated, and judged appropriate or not. In this sense, ends too are objects of counsel and judgment (q14a2). Fifi might adopt the end of going to Rome capriciously, but she might also stand back and take counsel about it under its aspect of a means to her conception of her final end. That is the sort of reasoning that can go into the formation of intentions. To see how Aquinas thinks such reasoning, as well as the reasoning about means, should be done, we must look at how his discussion of the final end relates to his discussion of the natural law.

As natural creatures, we have a natural inclination (in fact, an ordered set of natural inclinations) toward our perfection as human beings. As rational creatures, we can understand and endorse these inclinations, and articulate them into principles of practical reason, which are at the same time precepts of the natural law. How so? As Pamela Hall and Jean Porter have argued, the process of articulation involves a reflective, and developing, grasp of human nature and its tendencies, including an understanding of it and them as good. This understanding is ultimately founded on the recognition that human nature is created and directed by God, Goodness itself (this recognition can be achieved, however imperfectly, by means of natural knowledge of God). This allows the articulated principles to meet the criteria of law (q90a4): They are ordinances of reason (our own, and ultimately God’s) for the common good (due to our social nature), made by Him who has care of the community (again, God), and promulgated (they are made known, or knowable, to us through our natural inclinations). So although the precepts of the natural law ultimately derive their authority from God, they can be known independently of any knowledge of God—as Bradley puts it, they are “metaphysically theonomous” but “logically autonomous”)—and knowledge of them certainly does not require revelation.

Briefly setting out the inclinations and some of the precepts should illustrate this process of articulation, and at the same time give some indication of how it is connected with our pursuit of our final end. Like all things, we are naturally inclined toward our own good or perfection (good is that which all things seek), and thus as being is the first thing apprehended by reason simply, good is the first thing apprehended by reason as practical, or as directed toward action. And Aquinas takes it that, just as a grasp of the meaning of being and non-being leads naturally to knowledge of the principle of noncontradiction, so a grasp of good and evil leads to knowledge of the first principle of practical reason, good is to be done and pursued, and evil avoided: “All other precepts of the natural law are based upon this: so that whatever the practical reason naturally apprehends as man’s good (or evil) belongs to the precepts of the natural law as something to be done or avoided” (q94a2). And what do we naturally apprehend as good? Those things toward which we are naturally inclined, for good is an end and these are our ends by nature. Aquinas identifies three levels of these inclinations: That common to all substances (the inclination to continue to exist), that shared with other animals (inclinations to reproduce and to educate one’s offspring), and that proper to rational beings (to know the truth, ultimately about God, and to live in society). Phrases such as “and so forth” and “and other such things” occur in this passage, indicating that this is a quick overview rather than an exhaustive statement of the content of the natural law.

How are these inclinations articulated into precepts? This question might take the form of a procedural question concerning how we might move from an inclination to a norm (a version of the concern about moving from is to ought); this is addressed above (the inclinations are directives given by eternal reason—the natural law is a participation in the eternal law in the sense that our natural inclinations have their origin in God’s plan and creative action (q91a2)). But it might also take the substantive form of asking how we move from the inclinations mentioned to particular norms, and this needs to be explained. As we saw, Aquinas holds that as soon as we understand the meaning of the terms “good” and “evil,” we naturally understand that good is to be done and pursued and evil avoided—we have this knowledge by a “natural habit” he calls synderesis, (see q94a1ad2 and Iaq79a12). We know other things in this way too: That we are to fulfill our special obligations to others, and to do evil to no one—these are elucidations of the first principle, and from them flow a number of other principles, which have also been revealed to us in the Decalogue (see Ia-IIaeq100): The command to honor one’s parents functions as a paradigm for honoring one’s indebtedness in general; the commands forbidding murder, adultery, and theft speak to refraining from doing evil to others by deed; the commands forbidding false witness and coveting speak to refraining from doing evil by word or thought.

Aquinas is not as explicit as we might wish about how we acquire this knowledge, and there is some dispute here among commentators. One question is, must we acquire it at all? Does not Aquinas say that the principles grasped by synderesis are self-evident (if that is a good translation of per se nota)? The answer is that, yes, we must acquire it, for there is no innate knowledge; synderesis is a habit and so must be acquired. We do acquire it naturally, in this sense, that once we come to understand the terms employed in the principles, the principles are naturally known to be true. Experience and reflection are needed to grasp the meaning of such terms as good and evil, the proper objects of special obligations, the scope of non-maleficence. In this process our natural inclinations play a role: life, family, social life, and knowledge are good for each, and our social nature further directs us to attend to the common good and the good of our neighbor as well as our own private good. We might sketch the process as follows (although Aquinas never puts it quite this way): Good is to be done and evil avoided. So first, since good is to be done, and special obligations indicate goods owed to others, they are to be fulfilled. Second, since evil is to be avoided, it is to be done to no one (our social inclination here coming into play); we are naturally inclined to life, family, and society, so obtaining these things is good for each and losing them evil; thus murder, adultery, and so forth are evil and so not to be done.

In any event, once we have such principles in hand, as Aquinas takes it we all do, we have also in hand a way of evaluating whether we should allow our simple willings (such as, “how nice a Roman holiday would be”) to pass into intention—would it be good or evil to go now to Rome—is it consistent or otherwise with my flourishing as a rational creature? Would it for example violate any special obligation I am under, or perhaps require stealing? As said above, any proximate end an agent is considering whether to adopt may also be seen as a means to the agent’s final end, and its suitability as such may be judged by its accord with precepts of the natural law—these should serve, we may say, as penultimate major premises, under the first principle of practical reason, of any practical syllogism (or, when stated negatively, as a “filter” for all prospective means or proximate ends).

There is one major piece of the puzzle we have yet to deal with, the role of virtue in all of this. First, how exactly do these three, blessedness, law, and virtue, fit together? As indicated above, the natural law is a participation in the eternal law that resides primarily in our natural inclinations: the rational creature “has a share of the Eternal Reason, whereby it has a natural inclination to its proper act and end: and this participation of the eternal law in the rational creature is called the natural law” (q91a2). Our natural inclinations direct us toward our proper end, that is to say toward beatitudo, and the attainment of it is the fulfillment of our inclinations. But as we have also seen, our blessedness consists in virtuous activity (culminating in the loving contemplation of God). Such being the case, we should expect the natural law to direct us toward virtuous activity, and Aquinas does say explicitly that the natural law prescribes virtuous activity (q94a3, and see Pinckaers for an interesting development of the idea that the natural inclinations are the “seeds of the virtues,” into which they grow through the work of reason and habituation). So natural law, through informing our natural inclinations, provides the direction toward our final end, through the virtues as (constitutive) means to it.

Second, how does virtue play this role? We move toward our end through free, reasoned action, and cannot simply decide to grasp our final end. We must make a series of choices and carry them out, and it is here that virtue plays its principal role. One thing we clearly must do is reason well about how to act; we require excellence in practical reasoning. And that is to say we require prudence, which just is the virtue that applies right reason to action. But we also require the moral virtues such as justice and fortitude, which enable our knowledge of both the ends and means in practical reasoning. Aquinas is clear, as Aristotle was not, that we naturally know the ends we should pursue (this is the role of synderesis; see above, and also IIa-IIaeq47a6), but he also insists that we are rightly disposed toward that end by the moral virtues (Ia-IIaeq65a1)—the moral virtues safeguard us from “forgetting” our ends under the influence of vice, custom, or passion (q94a6)—fortitude, for instance, helps us control our fear of dangers so as to remain committed to the common good. The virtues also enable us to find the right means to the end. This is properly the work of prudence. Looking at how prudence does this work will clarify how the moral virtues play a supporting role in it. Aquinas says prudence has eight “quasi-integral parts” which can be classified as follows: Those that supply knowledge (memory and understanding or an intuitive grasp of the salient features of the present situation), those that acquire knowledge (docility and shrewdness), that which uses knowledge (reasoning, constructing the practical syllogism), and those that apply knowledge in command, the chief act of prudence (foresight directs present actions to the foreseen end, circumspection adjusts means to circumstances, and caution avoids obstacles to realizing the end). Prudence depends on the moral virtues not just to safeguard reason’s grasp of principles, but throughout its reasoning toward action. The parts of prudence just enumerated should make this clear: Docility, for example, requires humility. Also, the identification of the correct means to an intended end involves the understanding, or intuitive grasp, of the situation that helps supply the minor premise in a practical syllogism (see IIa-IIaeq49a2ad1). But this understanding can be corrupted by the intrusion of passion, as in cases of incontinence (Ia-IIaeq77a2), a state to which all are subject, unless fortified by the moral virtues (Fifi’s hopping impatiently on the bus although a cab would have been better presents a very mild case of such incontinence).

d.  Final Comments

So for Aquinas practical reason is our capacity to discover how to move from our present situation toward the attainment of our final end. In successful practical reasoning, synderesis, prudence, and moral virtue work together to ensure that the action meets all of the criteria of a good action (q18aa1-4): suitability of object (what kind of action is this, borrowing or stealing?), due attention to circumstances (might frankness here and now be unduly embarrassing to one’s interlocutor?), and goodness of the end of action (is my goal in giving alms to impress a potential benefactor, or to succor the need of the less fortunate; ultimately, the end is good if and only if it is conducive to the agent’s final end). While practical reasoning presupposes our understanding of our final end as perfection, everything else in our practical lives, including our conception of our final end and to what extent we honor the principles grasped by synderesis, lies within its scope. When practical reasoning is done well leading to good action, the agent at one and the same time pursues her own perfection (the Aristotelian moment) and obeys the eternal law of God (the Augustinian)—the etymological connection between prudence and providence mirrors a metaphysical connection, for our practical reason participates in the eternal reason (q91a2; see also q19a10). Since our perfection is perfection as creatures, there is no tension between it and obedience—for Aquinas, practical reason is not torn between the fulfillment of obligation and the fulfillment of the agent.

3.  Voluntarist Theory: Scotus

The reception of Aristotle and other non-Christian thinkers was never entirely easy, and worries about the influence of Greek and Arabic thought culminated, just after Aquinas’s death, in the Condemnations of 1277. In publishing them, the Bishop of Paris condemned 219 propositions drawn chiefly from Aristotle and his commentators, and while the principal target of these condemnations was the teaching of a “radical Aristotelianism” (or “Latin Averroism”) contrary to the Catholic faith by masters on the Faculty of Arts such as Siger of Brabant, a number of the condemned propositions were drawn from Aquinas’s work, although Aquinas was not named. In their wake the marriage between Greek and Biblical thought, between Aristotle and Augustine we might say, is a stormier one. Among the chief concerns of the Condemnations were divine and human freedom, and later thinkers were especially concerned to safeguard both. Many of them, rejecting Aquinas’s account of human freedom, found it necessary to portray the will itself as free. One way they did this was to stress the will’s independence from determination by nature, including the natural power of the intellect and the second nature imparted by virtues. The will was seen as free rather than as natural, and as nobler than the intellect—thus these thinkers are often called voluntarists.

John Duns Scotus (c. 1266-1308) is the most impressive and influential of the post-1277 thinkers, and his sharp break with eudaimonism in many ways anticipates modern moral theory, especially that of Kant. It should be noted, though, that even in making this break Scotus is working within the medieval tradition, drawing here especially on St. Anselm’s work On the Fall of the Devil;   Scotus is also indebted to his Franciscan predecessors and fellow-travelers such as Henry of Ghent. The following presents some of the main lines of his account of practical reason, but readers should be aware that there are currently some major disputes over how to interpret Scotus; some of these will be mentioned, but readers are invited to consult the secondary sources mentioned for further information.

a.  Freedom of the Will

Scotus emphasizes the freedom of the will in three key ways. The first two are rooted in his (characteristically voluntarist) teaching that the will is a self-mover rather than moved by anything else (an active rather than passive power); the third helps explain this capacity for self-movement. The first, then, lies in his emphasis on the dominance of the will over other powers, including the intellect. Just as in seeing we can focus on an object not in the center of our visual field, so in intellection the will can focus on and enjoy something other than what the intellect directly presents, and thus redirect the intellect (Opus Oxoniense II, dist. 42, qq1-4, nn. 10-11). The moral importance of this is that the will can turn aside from what the intellect presents as good and pursue something else (although   that something else must be good in some respect). Second, he insists that in addition to being able to will or “nil” (velle or nolle), the will always retains the option simply to refrain from willing (non velle). This is important, for Scotus takes it that if we necessarily will something, we are not free. Scotus allows that the will is unable to nil beatitude, but holds that it can refrain from willing it, and so remains free (Ordinatio IV, suppl., dist. 49, qq9-10). This points up an important difference between his account and that of an intellectualist like Aquinas, who maintains that when the intellect has perfect vision of a perfect good (as it does only in the beatific vision), the intellect sees it as good, and the will adheres to that good, both from natural necessity. Scotus denies the necessity of willing the good presented by the intellect even here. The third point concerns his adoption of Anselm’s notion of the two affections of the will (which itself draws on Augustine’s account of the two loves of the will). The will’s tendency toward the agent’s perfection is called the affectio commodi, the natural appetite of the will that prohibits us from nilling perfection. It is similar to the will, simply, as it is understood by eudaimonist thinkers like Aquinas. See (Williams 1995) for an argument that it is identical to the will so understood; see (Toner 2005) for an argument that it is not. But it does not exhaust the will for Scotus, nor does it necessitate the willing of happiness, due to the affectio iustitiae, the tendency of the will to love things in accordance with their goodness, and not simply as means to or constituents of our own happiness. It is this affection, for Scotus, that grants the will its “native liberty.”

It also renders his account of practical reason more complicated, for now we see two distinct ways in which reason can present something as good to the will: First, something may be judged to be conducive to our happiness or perfection as rational agents (attracting the affectio commodi); second, something may be judged to be morally good or right or just (appealing to the affectio iustitiae). Thus, we can reason about how to attain happiness, or how to act justly. And although these will come together in our final union with God, they are always formally distinct and will often pull apart in this life. There is a hint here of what Sidgwick would much later call a dualism of practical reason, a dualism which in various forms characterizes most modern moral systems, Kantian or utilitarian.  Scotus’ response to this situation also anticipates modern moral thinking (see Toner on this)—the pursuit of happiness must be moderated by justice; as Scotus puts it, the affection for justice acts as a “checkrein” (moderatrix) on the affection for happiness (Ordinatio II, dist. 6, q2). If the pursuit is not so moderated, it will be bad or at best morally indifferent. A crucial, and characteristically voluntarist, implication follows: Once the intellect has judged an act to be good (in either broad sense), the will remains free to follow the judgment or not, according to which affection it acts on. It may refuse to pursue a good conducive to happiness because doing so conflicts with a requirement of justice; it may turn from a good required by justice in order to pursue happiness instead (in the Ordinatio passage just cited, Scotus accounts for the sin of the angels along these lines). For better or worse, depending upon what one takes freedom to involve, Aquinas’s moderately intellectualist view that reason and will concur in free choice has been replaced by the voluntarist view that once reason has done its work, the will must independently make its free choice.

Here we touch on a controversial area. None of the voluntarists held that reason could be dispensed with, or was unimportant. At the least, reason must present options (and recommendations) to the will for it to be able to choose. Henry of Ghent had maintained that this was the extent of reason’s contribution to free choice (that it was merely a causa sine qua non—a necessary pre-condition of willing, but not properly a cause of it). Scotus at one point held a more moderate view, that reason served as a partial efficient cause of willing. Some Scotus scholars argue that he later moved further in the voluntarist direction, coming to accept something close to Henry’s view (or at least acknowledging it as an account just as persuasive as his own earlier view; see (Dumont 2001) for a detailed discussion). Whatever the correct view of  Scotus’ mature position, however, the point about the will’s independence from reason should not be taken to be a denial of reason’s important role leading up to choice.

It would be an even greater mistake to think that, because Scotus is a voluntarist, he downplays reason’s contribution to choosing morally good actions. In fact, Scotus insists as firmly as Aquinas that to be morally good, an action must be willed in accordance with right reason (Quodlibet, q18). What does this involve for Scotus?

b.  Synderesis, Conscience, and the Natural Law

Scotus follows tradition in invoking the notions of synderesis and conscience (Ordinatio II, dist. 39): Conscience is the habit of drawing the right conclusions about what is to be done by means of the practical syllogism. As such it depends upon knowledge of the first principles of practical reason, and synderesis is the habit of knowing these. What are they? Like Aquinas, Scotus takes them to be precepts of the natural law, but his handling of these precepts is quite different. His treatment of natural law makes no reference to natural inclinations—instead of being articulations of the directedness of human nature, the precepts are rules that are self-evident to reason because their denials lead to contradictions. For example, since good is the object of love and God is infinite goodness itself, the first principle of practical reason is that God is to be loved or, most strictly, God is not to be hated (Ordinatio III, suppl., dist. 37), for “goodness itself is to be hated” is self-contradictory. Scotus also relates the natural law to the Decalogue, and holds that from this first principle we may conclude that the precepts of the First Table (relating to God) follow and belong to the natural law strictly speaking. The precepts of the Second Table (relating to neighbor), however, belong to the natural law only broadly speaking—they are consonant with the principles known to be true analytically, but do not follow from them necessarily. In this passage, Scotus also distinguishes the precepts of the First and Second Tables, the precepts that belong to the natural law strictly and only broadly speaking, as follows: It is, in the abstract, possible for us to attain our final end of loving God without following the precepts of the Second Table (although not in the concrete, given that God actually has issued these commands), but is absolutely impossible for us to attain it while disobeying the precepts of the First. Thus, practical reason by itself is sufficient to tell us that if God exists, we must not hate Him, must have no other gods before Him. Scotus does not think we are left with theoretical possibilities and unaided practical reason—we know from Revelation that God has ordained the precepts of the Second Table, which are thus binding (for having been commanded, they move beyond being merely consonant with the love of God). Still, strictly speaking they are contingent and could be set aside or altered by God’s absolute power. Indeed Scotus thinks that in certain cases God has actually dispensed from them (see Ordinatio III, suppl., dist. 37; there is dispute among scholars as to how malleable the content of moral principles concerning love of neighbor is, and how open to rational investigation; see for example Wolter, Williams 1995, and Mohle’s contribution to Williams 2003).

To illustrate the relationship of consonance, Scotus gives us an example of the analogous relationship in positive law between “the principle of positive law,” that life in community should be peaceful, and secondary legal principles concerning private property. The institution of private property is not absolutely required to preserve peace, but given the infirmities of human nature, the common holding of property is likely to result in dispute and neglect. Thus allowing people to have their own possessions is “exceedingly consonant with peaceful living.” Likewise, although failing to love one’s neighbor is not strictly inconsistent with loving God (nor rejecting precepts stated in the Second Table strictly inconsistent with loving one’s neighbor), there is a harmony or consonance at both points (between love of God and neighbor, and between love of neighbor and honoring these precepts), for God has created us as social creatures and the precepts of the Second Table are conducive to social life. Although Scotus is not explicit, we may surmise that the principle that life in community ought to be peaceful belongs to the natural law in this broad sense, as peaceful life with God’s other rational creatures seems “exceedingly consonant” with love of God. As we will see, Scotus does explicitly say elsewhere that the “Silver Rule” belongs to the law of nature (broadly speaking). Prohibitions against murder, adultery, false witness and so forth follow from these pretty clearly, by way of consonance if not strict logical necessity.

So right practical reason begins from the precepts of the natural law, but how does it move to the judgment of conscience? Let us look at a case of deciding what to say when asked about one’s role in a certain affair, perhaps when lying might keep the agent out of some trouble. Scotus takes it that reason can grasp the wrongness of lying on the following basis: The Silver Rule, “Do not do to others what you would not want them to do to you,” is not only a commandment but a law of nature, at least in the broad sense; no one would want to be deceived by his neighbor; therefore, …. (Ordinatio III, suppl., dist. 38). With this principle in hand, how is one to act? It will depend on the particulars of the situation. The agent should now know that he should not deceive, but should tell the truth (or perhaps remain silent, if, say, the person asking is a gossip with no real stake in the matter; let us assume such is not the case). This much is clear from reason’s grasp of the principle and its understanding of the agent himself as a rational being, the action as speaking to another rational being, and the object as telling the truth (Scotus gives an example with the agent under the description of (rational) animal, the action as eating, and the object as nourishing food; Quodlibet, q18). But practical reason still has work to do: It must discern the right manner in which to tell the truth (say, calmly and straightforwardly rather than aggressively or evasively), and the right time and place (later in private, rather than now in company, say). Most importantly, it must place the act in service of a “worthy purpose,” direct it to an appropriate end (one that is just rather than merely advantageous—for acts that proceed solely from the affectio commodi will not be fully in accordance with right reason, since they focus only on the value of their objects to the agent, ignoring what intrinsic value they may have—thus Scotus holds that they are at best morally indifferent).

c.  The Non-Teleological Character of Scotus’ Thought

Much of the detail above is similar to what Aquinas says about the moral goodness of action, which should not be surprising because both are drawing on Aristotle and Christian tradition, but there is an important difference as to the goodness of the ends of particular actions. Aquinas takes it that in intending, the will (and its proximate ends) should be ordered to the final end or highest good. This final end is the perfection of the agent, which itself consists in the right relation to God. In principle, the agent could articulate this ordering as a series of syllogisms in which practical reason clarified the way the pursuit of this proximate end is linked to the pursuit of the agent’s final end as set by her nature as a rational creature. A metaphorical way of putting this: Actions can be seen as episodes in a story that the agent, by means of her practical reason, is writing (or co-authoring, given God’s providential role). In the well-written story (the practically rational life blessed by grace), the episodes successfully lead up to the happy ending, in which the agent is united with her true love and, quite literally, lives happily ever after.

For Scotus, this teleological character largely (though not entirely) disappears. Actions must still be related to God, whom Scotus is happy to refer to as our final end. But now God in a way serves less as final end than as first cause, in the sense of author of the moral law or of dispensations from it; God is not so much sought after as an end, as honored and obeyed as source. At least in those actions that have creatures as their object (that is, most actions we perform in this life)—and which are therefore only contingently related to our attainment of God as our final end—practical reason does not identify the right way to act by discerning how the prospective actions contribute to a series leading up to the right relation to God (it does not construct a series of syllogisms in the way just mentioned). Instead, each prospective action is judged separately, as to whether it honors God appropriately, expresses love of God and obeys His commands (although such thoughts need not be always present in the agent’s mind). Actions may still be teleologically ordered, for a number of actions may be ordered to the accomplishment of a moral end. But it is no longer the case that all actions and their ends must be organized into a pattern or narrative completed only in the agent’s attainment of her final end, and that they can be fully assessed only in light of their place in such a pattern. Instead, each action (or course of action) stands alone as a complete work, and the ends of actions may be judged in light of their fit with the situation and their accord or discord with precepts of the natural law or other authoritative source (revealed commands, a divine dispensation). Picking up the author metaphor again, life is not so much a novel as a collection of epigrams and short stories, dedicated with love to God. This deep difference between Aquinas and Scotus is reflected in—indeed is a consequence of—their different formulations of the first principle of practical reason: “Good is to be done and pursued, and evil avoided” (Aquinas); “God is to be loved, and never hated” (Scotus). The one focuses on pursuit of the good (relationship with God); the other on the expression of love for God.

Related to this is  Scotus’ reduced role for the moral virtues: He holds that prudence can exist without moral virtue, that as free we always have what we need to do the right action here and now; it need not be part of a larger pattern involving the development of character (Ordinatio III, suppl., dist. 36). Yet, Scotus has no wish to deny that the virtues are important: they can help turn the will from evil (the willing of which can blind the intellect to the truth by turning it away for a time), can help facilitate the will’s choosing in accordance with the right judgment of prudence, and can also help the act to be done in the right manner. Moral virtue assists us, then, both in reasoning about action and in making that reasoning effectively practical, but it is not essential to performing morally good actions.

d.  Note on Ockham

Now it is perhaps these non-teleological aspects of  Scotus’ thought, more than any other, that mark him out as a transitional figure. It is thus worth noting that it is concerning this feature of his thought that some of the disputes mentioned above are taking place. Williams (1995) and MacIntyre (1990) stress the role of obligation and divine commands in his theory; Hare and Ingham stress instead the role of love and the goal of relationship with God—views perhaps susceptible of some kind of teleological interpretation after all. However in the end Scotus should be read on this, it does seem fair to say, at the least, that divine commands, and the related notions of obligation and obedience, play a more prominent role in his thinking than they do in that of Aquinas.

And in any event, the later Franciscan William of Ockham will leave little doubt that he is a divine command theorist (but, see Osborne and the noted selections in Spade for a recent exchange on this). This does not mean that he is not concerned with practical reason; he still insists that the morally good action is the one dictated by right reason and willed because so dictated (Quodlibet IIIq15). But practical reason now operates within the framework of God’s ordained power, wholly constructed by God’s sovereign will. Knowledge of what God’s power has actually ordained, and thus of how we should act, is now even more dependent upon revelation; God could, by his absolute power, command us even to hate him, and it would then be right for us to do so. Here we have moved from  Scotus’ moderate voluntarism to an extreme form in which morality consists in the obligation impressed by the commanding divine will upon the obedient (or otherwise) human will, and in which practical reason serves merely to help articulate what has been commanded and how to carry it out. The prevailing order, for Ockham, is one in which familiar concepts have application (prudence, the moral virtues, the Decalogue), but the radical contingency hanging about the whole is novel.

4.  Medieval and Modern

This section briefly examines the influence of these two theorists on contemporary practical reasoning theory, and also explores the relation between their views of practical reason and some common positions in current debates (those between Generalists and Particularists, and between Internalists and Externalists).

a.  The Current Influence of Aquinas and Scotus

The two figures focused on above are the two who seem most relevant to contemporary theorizing about practical reason. Aquinas’s influence is widespread: In Anglophonic moral philosophy Alasdair MacIntyre is perhaps the best-known among his many followers, developing Aquinas’s thought in ways more sensitive to the context of culture and tradition. Candace Vogler develops a broadly Thomistic theory of practical reason, exploring both his account of the capital vices and his division of the good into befitting, pleasurable, and useful (See (Toner 2005) for a short look at this division, and (Vogler 2002) for a very thorough treatment), concluding that in an atheistic context, it will be reasonable for some agents to be vicious. In general, the relevance of Aquinas’s thought as a development of Aristotle makes him a likely source for anyone working on practical reasoning or moral theory in this tradition, a fact not missed by some prominent moral theorists, most notably Philippa Foot and Rosalind Hursthouse. As for Scotus, his affinity with, and likely indirect influence upon, Kant, has been remarked by friends and foes alike (Williams and MacIntyre, for example). His direct influence on current thinking has not been great, but if the continuing progress on the critical edition of his works and the proliferation of Scotus scholarship are any indication, this may be beginning to change. In mainstream English philosophy, John Hare is perhaps the most prominent theorist so far to develop positions deeply indebted to Scotus.  Scotus’ combination within his moral theory of deontological and virtue elements should make his thinking of interest to Kantian or other deontological theorists intent on appropriating broadly Aristotelian notions of virtue. Also, his subtle treatment of the relations between reason, divine and human freedom, and the absolute and ordained powers of God, should make him of great interest to contemporary divine command theorists (Hare provides one example of this).

b. The Medievals and Particularism

Turning to the first of the current debates concerning practical reason: Let generalism be the view that the presence of some features of action (say that it causes pleasure, or is unkind) always tends to make the action right (or wrong)—such features have invariable “deontic valence.” This may come in forms “thin” (some natural features of action, say conduciveness to pleasure, always have a positive valence) or “thick” (while there are no such natural features, there are certain thick features, like kindness or fairness or spitefulness, that have invariable valence). Particularism, then, is the denial of this. We may speak of thin or thick forms particularism, being denials of the corresponding forms of generalism (one may, then, be at the same time a thick generalist and thin particularist). Where do the medievals fall along this spectrum? They tend toward thick generalism, indeed, we might say toward thick absolutism, a form of generalism maintaining that there are some features of action that not only tend to make an action right or wrong, but always succeed in doing so. For Aquinas, for example, the fact that any action was vicious, or violated any precept of the natural law, would make it wrong. This is thick rather than thin generalism because the precepts have evaluative content that cannot be reduced to merely “natural” or thin terms (for example, while the precept against murder is certainly not just the claim that “wrongful killing is wrong,” it is the claim that “intentional killing of the innocent is wrong,” and “innocence” cannot be reduced to thin, non-evaluative language). For Scotus, things look quite similar, within the framework of God’s ordained power. But because dispensations are possible by God’s absolute power, the features picked out by natural law precepts relevant to the Second Table are not of invariable valence (that Isaac was innocent may actually tend to make sacrificing him right, given God’s command to Abraham). Still, there are some absolutes for Scotus, those pertaining to the love of God in the First Table. Ockham comes the closest to particularism, leaving just one feature of actions that has invariably positive valence, its having been commanded by God. Ockham also maintains that, when possible, loving God above all things is always right, subtly reconciling this with his claim that God could command us not to love Him (on the grounds that given such a command it would be impossible to love Him above all things; see Quodlibet IIIq14).

c. The Medievals and Internalism

Let us turn to reasons for action and their connection to motivation. Internalism comes in many forms, but common to them is the claim that if an agent has a reason to do some action A, she also has a motive to A (the denial of this—the assertion that an agent may have a reason to A but have no motive to A—is called “externalism”). One characteristic form of internalism, often referred to as “Humean,” is the claim that if R is a reason for S to do A, then A must serve some desire that S actually has. The medievals were not internalists in this sense. A Thomistic agent, for example, has a reason to pursue a good perfective of him even if he has no desire for it at present. But, does not the agent have another desire the good serves, namely for perfection? Actually no. It is the will that naturally aims at what is perfective of the agent, and the will is a power, not a standing desire. But the will is naturally inclined to pursue such goods, so perhaps a modified internalism, that cited not just actual but also counterfactual desires (the agent would desire it if suitably informed and so forth)? Perhaps so, but details aside, there is one more critical qualification to make: Although internalism strictly requires only a connection between reason and motivation, it is usually also held that the latter has priority, that the explanatory direction is from desire to reason for action. For Aquinas, the direction is instead from reason to desire (the various acts of reason serving as the formal causes of the corresponding acts of will). Allowing for this, and given careful specifications of the counterfactual conditions, Aquinas and other intellectualists could probably be brought under some fold or other of the big tent of internalism.

For Scotus and other (sometimes more thoroughgoing) voluntarists, things are harder to see. The relation between intellect and will is looser, but still it is not held that the will’s desiring something can create a reason for the agent to act; instead, reason serves as a sort of necessary condition of the will’s act of desire (as mentioned above, perhaps a partial efficient cause as Scotus held at one point, perhaps as a causa sine qua non as Henry of Ghent held and—some argue—Scotus later held). If the will is the total cause of its own willing, or at least the primary cause, it can refrain from willing in accordance with the judgment presented by right practical reason (recall  Scotus’ point about non velle). Scotus even, following Anselm, performs a thought experiment concerning an angel created without the affectio iustitiae, maintaining that it could then only pursue its own happiness, and not what is intrinsically just. He does not explicitly say that it correctly identifies the right reasons for action, but given the independence of prudence from the moral virtues, it seems likely it could (“God is not to be hated” is, after all, supposed to be self-evidently true; and such an angel could understand the content of God’s revealed commands). If so, it could have reasons (not to hate God, not to commit or encourage lying or murder) with no corresponding desires (since it lacks the affectio iustitiae that would motivate it to follow these precepts even in cases in which doing so is not instrumental to its own happiness).

It is dangerous to sort philosophers according to distinctions they themselves do not have in mind (notice my hesitant language about Aquinas’s internalism above), but it seems that Scotus and other voluntarists would likely be externalists. This can be said more confidently—neither intellectualist nor voluntarist agents look much like the internalist and externalist agents one typically meets in the contemporary literature. But perhaps this is an advantage, for the medievals develop options largely ignored in much current discussion. And, it may be that the presence of more angels—falling, deformed, whole, and standing firm—would make for much livelier discussion.

5. Conclusion: Common Themes among the Medievals

So far this article has emphasized differences between the medieval accounts of practical reason, and their connections with some points in current theorizing. It is worth bringing out a few features that bring the medievals together while distinguishing them as a group from most current theorists. First, there is the shared Aristotelian and Augustinian heritage, already mentioned above. With this comes an agreement that our final end is the right relationship with God, a union with God by means of intellect and will. This is perfectly clear in intellectualists like Aquinas, but also holds for voluntarists. Scotus, for example, agrees that God is our final end; the initially open question is how to relate to Him: qua object of the affectio commodi (as the source of our perfection), or qua object of the affectio iustitiae (as perfect in Himself). And for all of the medievals, the good life consists in the successful attempt to achieve this union, to find, we might say, one’s proper place in Creation. In The City of God XIX.13, Augustine defines peace—our final end on his account—as the tranquillity of order, where order is the arrangement of things in which each finds its proper place in relation to the others, under God.

None of this is intended to paper over important differences, for example about just how to characterize that proper place, or whether the attempt to find it is best seen as a unified narrative or as a set of independent courses of action (whether life is a novel, we might say, or an anthology of short stories). It is intended only to stress the broad and important agreement underlying the differences in their accounts of practical reason. This is an agreement we should not find surprising given their shared belief, based on both philosophical argument and on faith, in a providential Creator, who is both Reason and Goodness. And it is an agreement whose importance we can recognize when we note that no medieval ever held that right practical reason could recommend an immoral course of action as, if Vogler is right, it can often do in an atheistic context.

6. References and Further Reason

a. Primary Sources

  • Anselm, On the Fall of the Devil, translated by Ralph McInerny in Anselm of Canterbury: The Major Works, edited by Brian Davies and Gillian Evans (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1998).
  • Aristotle, The Nicomachean Ethics, translated by Terence Irwin (Indianapolis: Hackett Press, second edition 1999).
  • Aristotle, On the Soul, translated by J.A. Smith in The Complete Works of Aristotle, volume 1, edited by Jonathan Barnes (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1984).
  • Aristotle, Metaphysics, translated by W.D. Ross in The Complete Works of Aristotle, volume 1, edited by Jonathan Barnes (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1984).
  • Augustine, On Free Choice of the Will, translated by Thomas Williams (Indianapolis: Hackett Press, 1993).
  • Augustine, Confessions, translated by R.S. Pine-Coffin (London: Penguin Classics, 1961).
  • Augustine, The City of God against the Pagans, translated by R.W. Dyson (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998).
  • Henry of Ghent, Quodlibetal Questions on Free Will, translated by Roland Teske (Milwaukee: Marquette University Press, 1993).
  • Ockham (Occam), William of. Quodlibetal Questions, translated by Alfred Freddoso and Francis Kelley (New Haven: Yale University Press, 1998).
  • Scotus, John Duns. Duns Scotus on the Will and Morality, selections made and translated by Allan Wolter (Washington: The Catholic University of America Press, 1997).
    • Many of  Scotus’ writings are divided in much the way described below for Aquinas. One further subdivision often included in works commenting on Peter Lombard’s Sentences (such as  Scotus’ Ordinatio), the distinctio, is noted as “dist.”
  • Thomas Aquinas, Summa theologiae, translated by the Fathers of the English Dominican Province (Allen, TX: Christian Classics, 1981).
    • This work is divided into three parts, with the second itself sub-divided into two parts. The parts are further broken up into questions, and the questions into articles. The articles themselves comprise objections to the position Aquinas will take, a claim “to the contrary,” Aquinas’s argument for his position, and replies to the objections. Parts are customarily referred to as follows: Ia, IIa, IIIa (from the Latin prima, secunda, and tertia); the parts of the second part as Ia-IIae and IIa-IIae (from prima secundae and secunda secundae—first of the second, second of the second). Questions are denoted simply by “q,” articles by “a,” and replies to objections by “ad” or toward. If not otherwise noted, the reference is to the body of the article or corpus (“c”), Aquinas’s argument for his position. So for instance, Ia-IIaeq13a1ad3 refers to the first part of the second part, question 13, article 1, reply to the third objection.
  • Thomas Aquinas, Commentary on Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics, translated by C.I. Litzinger (Notre Dame: Dumb Ox Books, 1993).

b. Secondary Sources

  • Bradley, Denis. Aquinas on the Twofold Human Good (Washington: The Catholic University of America Press, 1997).
  • Cross, Richard. Duns Scotus (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999).
  • Dahl, Norman. Practical Reason, Aristotle, and Weakness of the Will (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1984).
  • Dumont, Stephen. “Did Duns Scotus Change His Mind on the Will?” in Nach der Verurteilung von 1277, edited by Jan Aersten, Kent Emery, and Andreas Speer (Berlin: Walter de Gruyter, 2001), 719-794.
  • Eardley, P.S. “Thomas Aquinas and Giles of Rome on the Will,” The Review of Metaphysics 56 (2003): 835-862.
  • Gallagher, David. “Thomas Aquinas on the Will as Rational Appetite,” Journal of the History of Philosophy 29 (1991), 559-584.
  • Hall, Pamela. Narrative and the Natural Law: An Interpretation of Thomistic Ethics (Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1994).
  • Hare, John. “Scotus on Morality and Nature,” Medieval Philosophy and Theology 9 (2000), 15-38.
  • Hare, John. God’s Call (Grand Rapids: Eerdman’s, 2000).
  • Ingham, Mary Beth. “Duns Scotus, Morality and Happiness: A Reply to Thomas Williams,” American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly 74 (2000), 173-195.
  • Ingham, Mary Beth and Mechthild Dreyer. The Philosophical Vision of John Duns Scotus (Washington: The Catholic University of America Press, 2004).
  • Kent, Bonnie. Virtues of the Will (Washington: The Catholic University of America Press, 1995).
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. Whose Justice? Which Rationality? (Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1988).
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. Three Rival Versions of Moral Enquiry (Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1990).
  • MacDonald, Scott. “Ultimate Ends in Practical Reasoning: Aquinas’s Aristotelian Moral Psychology and Anscombe’s Fallacy,” The Philosophical Review 100 (1991): 31-65.
  • MacDonald, Scott and Eleonore Stump. (editors), Aquinas’s Moral Theory: Essays in Honor of Norman Kretzmann (Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1999).
  • McCluskey, Colleen. “Worthy Constraints in Albertus Magnus’s Theory of Action,” Journal of the History of Philosophy 39 (2001): 491-533.
  • McCluskey, Colleen. “Medieval Theories of Free Will,” Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
  • McInerny, Ralph. Aquinas on Human Action (Washington: The Catholic University of America Press, 1992).
  • Osborne, Thomas. “Ockham as a Divine-Command Theorist,” Religious Studies 41 (2005): 1-22.
  • Pinckaers, Servais. The Sources of Christian Ethics, translated by Sister Mary Thomas Noble (Washington: The Catholic University of America Press, 1995).
  • Porter, Jean. Nature as Reason: A Thomistic Theory of the Natural Law (Grand Rapids: Eerdmans, 2005).
  • Rist, John. Augustine: Ancient Thought Baptized (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996).
  • Spade, Paul Vincent. (editor), The Cambridge Companion to Ockham (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999).
    • See especially the essays by King and McCord Adams.
  • Toner, Christopher. “Angelic Sin in Aquinas and Scotus and the Genesis of Some Central Objections to Contemporary Virtue Ethics,” The Thomist 69 (2005): 79-125.
  • Vogler, Candace. Reasonably Vicious (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 2002).
  • Westberg, Daniel. Right Practical Reason (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1994).
  • Williams, Thomas. “How Scotus Separates Morality from Happiness,” American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly 69 (1995), 425-445.
  • Williams, Thomas. (editor), The Cambridge Companion to Duns Scotus (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003).
    • See especially the essays by Mohle, Williams, and Kent.
  • Wolter, Allan. “Native Freedom of the Will as a Key to the Ethics of Scotus” in The Philosophical Theology of John Duns Scotus, edited by Marilyn McCord Adams (Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1990).

Author Information

Christopher Toner
Email: christopher.toner@stthomas.edu
University of St. Thomas
U. S. A.

Rudolph Hermann Lotze (1817–1881)

Hermann Lotze was a key figure in the philosophy of the second half of the nineteenth century, influencing practically all the leading philosophical schools of the late nineteenth and the coming twentieth century, including (i) the neo-Kantians; (ii) Brentano and his school; (iii) The British idealists; (iv) William James’s pragmatism; (v) Husserl’s phenomenology; (vi) Dilthey’s philosophy of life; (vii) Frege’s new logic; (viii) the early Cambridge analytic philosophy.

Lotze’s main philosophical significance is as a contributor to an anti-Hegelian objectivist movement in German-speaking Europe. The publication of the first editions of his Metaphysics (1841) and Logic (1843) constituted the third wave of this movement. The first came in 1837, in the form of Bolzano’s Wissenschaftslehre. The second came three years later, in 1840, when Friedrich Adolf Trendelenburg published his Logische Untersuchungen. Lotze’s early works furthered this objectivist line of thought. And when a new surge of philosophical objectivism crested again in the 1870s, Lotze used the opportunity to restate his position in the second editions of his Logic (1874) and of his Metaphysics (1879).

Closely following Trendelenburg, Lotze advanced an objectivist philosophy that did not start from the subject-object opposition in epistemology. He insisted that this opposition  is based on a metaphysical relation that is more fundamental (Schnädelbach 1983, p. 219). In this way, the very possibility for philosophical subjectivism was suspended.

Lotze promoted the “universal inner connection of all reality” by uniting all objects and terms in a comprehensive, ordered arrangement . Especially important to Lotze’s theories of order is the concept of relation.  A favorite saying of his illustrates this point.  “The proposition, ‘things exist’,” he repeatedly said, “has no intelligible meaning except that they stand in relations to each other.”

The priority of orderly relations in Lotze’s ontology entailed that nature is a cosmos, not chaos. Furthermore, since the activity that is typical for humans—thinking—is an activity of relating, man is a microcosm. This point convinced Lotze to jointly study microcosm and macrocosm, a conviction which found expression in his three-volume book on Microcosm (1856/64).

The distinction between the universe as macrocosm and humanity as microcosm gave rise to another central component of Lotze’s philosophy: his anthropological stance.  According to Lotze, the fundamental metaphysical and logical problems of philosophy are to be discussed and answered through the lens of the microcosm, that is, in terms of the specific perceptual and rational characteristics of human beings.  There is no alternative access to them.

Lotze’s philosophical work was guided by his double qualification in medicine and philosophy. While he chose academic philosophy as his profession, his medical training was an ever-present influence on his philosophical thought, in two respects. First, his overall philosophy was characterized by a concern for scientific exactness; he criticized any philosophical doctrine that discards the results of science. Second, he devoted many academic years to (more or less philosophical) studies in medicine and physiology. His efforts in this direction resulted in foundational works in psychology, in virtue of which there is reason to count him among psychology’s founding fathers.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
    1. Biography
    2. Influences and Impacts
    3. Works
  2. Philosophical Principles and Methods
    1. Rigorous, Piecemeal Philosophy
    2. The Principle of Teleomechanism
    3. Regressive Analysis
    4. Anthropology as Prima Philosophia
    5. Methods: Eclecticism and Dialectics
  3. Theoretical Philosophy
    1. Ethics
    2. Ontology and Metaphysics
    3. Epistemology
    4. Logic
    5. Philosophy of Mind
    6. Philosophy of Nature
    7. Philosophy of Language
  4. Philosophy and Life
    1. Anthropology
    2. Social Philosophy
    3. Philosophy of History
    4. Political Philosophy
    5. Philosophy of Religion
    6. Religious Practice
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources
    3. Bibliographies
    4. Biographies
    5. Further Reading

1. Life and Works

a. Biography

Rudolph Hermann Lotze was born in Bautzen (Saxony) on May 21, 1817, the third child of a military medical doctor. Two years later the family moved to nearby Zittau.

Lotze’s father died in 1827, when Hermann was 12. Soon thereafter, the family got into serious financial troubles.  This series of events shaped Lotze’s character in significant ways. He was independent, ambitious, serious and thrifty, but also melancholic, reserved, even shy.

Between 1828 and 1834 Hermann attended the local High School (Gymnasium). In 1834 he registered at the University of Leipzig.  He wanted to study philosophy—a wish nourished by his love of art and poetry—and he did. However, his experience with financial hardship urged him to simultaneously pursue a degree in the more practical and lucrative field of medicine. Four years later, in 1838, he received doctorates in both disciplines.

After practicing medicine for a year in Zittau, Lotze joined the University of Leipzig as an adjunct lecturer in the Department of Medicine in 1839, and in the Department of Philosophy in 1840. In 1840 Lotze achieved dual degrees, based on post-doctoral dissertations (Habilitation), in medicine and philosophy. As a result, he received a license to teach (venia legendi) at German universities in these two fields.

In 1839, Lotze became engaged to Ferdinande Hoffmann of Zittau (b. 1819), and they were married in 1844.  The marriage produced four sons.  Lotze was deeply attached to his wife, and her death in 1875 was a loss from which he never recovered. One of his numerous British students, Richard Haldane (who later became Lord Chancellor), described him after his wife’s death as one who “seldom sees people, as he lives a sort of solitary life in the country where his home is, about half a mile from Göttingen, and is looked upon as unsociable” (Kuntz 1971, p. 50).

In the year of his marriage, 1844, Lotze was named Herbart’s successor as Professor of Philosophy at the University of Göttingen. He remained at Göttingen until 1880, when he was named Professor of Philosophy at the University of Berlin. A few months later (on July 1, 1881) he died of a cardiac defect that he had suffered from all his life. He was succeeded in the Berlin Chair by Wilhelm Dilthey.

b. Influences and Impacts

Among Lotze’s teachers were Gustav Theodor Fechner, from whom he learned the importance of quantitative experiment, and Christian Weiße, who helped the young Hermann to see the philosophy of German idealism from its aesthetic perspective. Lotze was especially influenced by Kant, Hegel, Herbart, Schelling and Fries. He was personally introduced to Fries—who at the time was a Professor in Jena—by his friend and Fries’ student Ernst Friedrich Apelt.

Some philosophers believe that Lotze was also influenced by his countryman Leibniz (Leibniz was born and raised in Leipzig, Saxony).  Indeed, there are some common points between these two philosophers. But Lotze himself denied such an influence. A hidden influence (seldom discussed in the literature) came from Schleiermacher—via Trendelenburg—who had insisted against the Kant–Drobisch idea of formal logic that logic must be developed together with metaphysics.

Many British and American philosophers of the 1870s and 1880s admired Lotze. William James considered him “the most exquisite of contemporary minds” (Perry 1935, ii., p. 16). Josiah Royce, James Ward and John Cook Wilson studied under him in Göttingen.  Oxford’s T. H. Green was so enthusiastic about Lotze that in 1880 he began the large project of translating his System of Philosophy. The project was incomplete two years later at the time of Green’s death, but it was continued by a team under the guidance of Bernard Bosanquet. Besides Green and Bosanquet, A. C. Bradley (brother of F. H. Bradley), R. L. Nettleship and J. Cook Wilson took part in the general editing. The translation appeared in 1884. In parallel, James Ward and Henry Sidgwick at Cambridge were instrumental in preparing the translation of Lotze’s Microcosm by Elizabeth Hamilton (daughter of William Hamilton) and E. E. Constance Jones, which was published in 1885.

c. Works

Lotze’s first publications were his “lesser” Metaphysics (1841) and “lesser” Logic (1843), in which he charted his philosophical program. His Habilitation in medicine was published in 1842 under the title Allgemeine Pathologie und Therapie als mechanische Naturwissenschaften.

Over the next ten years, Lotze worked on problems at the intersection of medicine and philosophy, in particular the relation between soul and body. The result of these studies were published in two books: Allgemeine Physiologie des körperlichen Lebens (1851) and Medicinische Psychologie oder Physiologie der Seele (1852). During this period, Lotze also published extensive essays on “Leben. Lebenskraft” (1843), “Instinct” (1844), and “Seele und Seelenleben” (1846). In the late 1840s he published important works on aesthetics: “Über den Begriff der Schönheit” (1845), “Über Bedingungen der Kunstschönheit” (1847), and “Quaestiones Lucretianae” (1852).

Microcosm (published in 3 volumes between 1856 and 1864) marked a new period in Lotze’s philosophical development. In this monumental work, he synthesized his earlier ideas: the logico-metaphysical ideas of 1841–3, his psychological ideas of 1842–52, and his aesthetic ideas of 1845–52. Despite some interpretations to the contrary, the book was not only a popular treatise. It also developed technical logical and metaphysical ideas in a form that was unknown from his earlier work.

Shortly after Lotze finished Microcosm, he started his System of Philosophy which consisted of his “greater” Logic (1874), and “greater” Metaphysic (1879).  A third part of the system, on Ethics, Aesthetics and Religious Philosophy, remained unfinished at the time of his death.  Briefly, the difference between Microcosm and System of Philosophy can be put this way: while Microcosm was something of an encyclopedia of philosophical deliberations on human life, private and public, the System was an encyclopedia of the philosophical disciplines.

Lotze possessed an extraordinary ability for studying languages. Many of his papers were written in French, some of them in Latin (e.g., “Quaestiones lucretianae”). Lotze also published a volume of his poetry (Lotze 1840).

2. Philosophical Principles and Methods

a. Rigorous, Piecemeal Philosophy

It will come as no surprise, given his medical training, that Lotze was a scientifically oriented philosopher.  His credo was that no philosophical theory should contradict scientific results. In his medical writings, and above all in the programmatic Allgemeine Pathologie of 1842, he rejected all forms of vitalism (which claims that organismic life is explained by causes other than biochemical reactions) more radically than anyone before him.

Lotze was not a lonely pioneer in embracing the scientific orientation in philosophy. In this he followed his teacher and friend, the early experimental psychologist Gustav Fechner, as well as Hegel’s contemporaries and rivals, Fries and Herbart.  However, he was unique insofar as he introduced a method for recasting particular problems of German Idealism in a refined, philosophical–logical form that was science-friendly. A typical example in this respect was his approach to studying thinking. Lotze connected thinking to two “logically different” domains, valuing and becoming (see section 3.d, below), and considered each of them to be explored by a special science: logic investigates the validity of thinking, and psychology investigates the development of thinking.

Lotze’s new method disciplined metaphysics and ethics on the one hand, and enriched logic on the other.  In other words, it made  metaphysics and ethics more exact, formal disciplines, while making logic more philosophical.

One of Lotze’s motives for embracing this approach was his desire to eliminate the radical disagreements that traditionally had characterized philosophical theorizing—a main source of philosophy’s developing reputation for being unscientific. Lotze believed that the formal (logical) presentation of philosophical theories eliminates their subjective side—the principal source of philosophical animus—and that, thus purified, even seemingly contradictory systems could be shown consistent with one another (Misch 1912, p. xxii).

Lotze’s commitment to this approach led to radical changes in his philosophical practice. In particular, he started to investigate philosophical problems bit by bit, piecemeal, so that a later discovery of a mistake in his investigation did not made his overall philosophy false. (This practice was later followed by Russell (cf. Russell 1918, p. 85) and became central to analytic philosophy.) Lotze’s piecemeal philosophy was facilitated by the introduction—or in some cases the revival—of many concepts which are still widely discussed today, including: (i) the concept of value in logic (its best known successor was the concept of truth-value); (ii) the context principle; (iii) the idea of concept/judgment as a function; (iv) the metaphors of coloring expressions and of saturated–unsaturated expressions; (v) the objective content of perception or the concept of the given (its best known successor was the concept of sense-data); (vi) the objective content of judgments; and (vii) anti-psychologism in logic.  These concepts proved to be seminal to a certain line of German-language philosophy: in various combinations, they play central roles in the thought of Frege, Brentano, Husserl, and those associated with their schools.

In short, Lotze introduced a several  philosophical–logical problems and theses which could be further investigated independently of his overall system. In this sense he instructed his readers to regard his philosophy as “an open market, where the reader may simply pass by the goods he does not want” (Lotze 1874, p. 4). Among other things, this characteristic of Lotze’s philosophy made him the most “pillaged” philosopher of the nineteenth century (Passmore 1966, p. 51). Many of his theses were embraced without crediting him.

b. The Principle of Teleomechanism

A central principle of Lotze’s philosophy was that all processes and movements—physical, biological, psychological, bodily, social, ethical, cultural—are accomplished in a way that can best be called mechanical. This “Principle of Mechanism” helped Lotze to avoid references to deep, metaphysical causes, such as vitalism in the philosophy of biology. In contrast, he insisted that, when theorizing, we are obliged to look to reality as revealed by experiment. On this point, he was clearly influenced by his education as a medical doctor.

At the same time, however, Lotze believed that there were features of experience—such as life, mind, and purpose (telos)—that could not be explained mechanistically. Lotze took these limitations on mechanistic explanation to indicate—even delineate—a “higher and essential being”, reference to which was necessary in order to make mechanistic explanations fully intelligible.  For instance, Lotze thought that our ideas of forces and natural laws describe but do not explain how things work in nature. To understand this, we must connect them with the realm of the trans-sensual (Übersinnliche, 1856b, p. 306).  Only by making this connection can we understand the processes carried out through these mechanisms.

At first glance, this move to teleology as a necessary explanatory category may seem incompatible with Lotze’s own Principle of Mechanism.  He did not think so, however, and part of Lotze’s achievement was the way in which he sought to show these prima facie contrary categories compatible.

Lotze’s solution was to declare the Principle of Mechanism not a metaphysical principle, but a purely methodological principle belonging mainly to the natural sciences.  That is, the principle does not imply that reality is, at bottom, mechanistic.  Rather, it only prescribes a methodology and a mode of interpretation or description as means to achieving a useful understanding of the processes of our environment.  As purely methodological, Lotze’s “Principle of Mechanism” does not claim to capture the full nature of those processes, nor even to begin to describe their sources.  Nor does it claim to explain—or explain away—life, mind, and purpose.  To the contrary, it is consistent with the view that mechanistic processes are the means by which purposes are realized in the world.

Thus, ultimately, Lotze’s position required seeking both mechanistic descriptions of natural processes and teleological explanations of those processes.  Lotze called this hybrid position, “teleomechanism,” or “teleological idealism.”

In Lotze’s hands, the “Principle of Teleomechanism” (i.e., that ultimate explanations should have the hybrid form described above) shapes logic, metaphysics and science through what he calls idealities (Orth 1986, p. 45)- the fundamental orienting concepts of these fields. Among the idealities are ethical values, logical validities and aesthetic worth. In science and metaphysics, the idealities of spatial and temporal order, the principle of atomicity (cf. section 3.a,e) and the aforementioned relationism (cf. the opening summary at the head of this article), play a central role.

c. Regressive Analysis

The declared objective of Lotze’s philosophy was a “reflection on the meaning of our human being [Dasein]” (1856b, p. 304). The urgency of this task was a consequence of the scientific and industrial revolution of the beginning and the middle of the nineteenth century. That revolution dramatically changed the way in which humans see the cosmos and universe. It eroded the unity of God and humanity; traditional mythology proved inconsistent. As a consequence, the world started to seem alien, cold, immense. A substantial weakening in religious belief followed. Lotze saw danger in the numerous attempts (on the side of the mechanic philosopher-scientists like Georg Büchner, Heinrich Czolbe, Franz Fick, Jacob Moleschott and Karl Vogt) to prove that the microcosm of human beings is merely mechanical, or materialistic. His objective was to disprove such attempts and to make people feel at home in the world again.

Contrary to the trends in then-current anthropology, Lotze did not seek to explain humanity in terms of the technologies it produced. Rather, he thought, the keys for understanding the human race are found in the results of human education and schooling (Bildung), as they have been developed in history. This meant that his philosophical investigations began not simply with the elements of human culture, but with developed human cultures taken as wholes, and indeed the history of such cultures taken as a whole. From these wholes, he then worked “backwards”, analyzing their “parts”, such as logic, metaphysics, science and mathematics. This is the approach of regressive analysis (1874, § 208; 1879, pp. 179 ff.).

Lotze believed that the main educational goods (Bildungsgüter) of human culture are usually conveyed by poetry and religion. They provide a “higher perspective on things,” the “point of view of the heart.” This means that the mechanistic processes upon which science focuses are not the only key to understanding the world; they are not even the most important key. To the contrary, science becomes intelligible and useful for humans only in connection with the historically developed values and forms of schooling and education characteristic of a developed human culture (cf. Lotze’s Principle of Teleomechanism, in section 2.b, above). This point is clearly seen in the fact that we have a priori notions neither of bad and good, nor of blue or sweet(1864, p. 241).

But how exactly can the history of culture command the shape of logic, metaphysics and science? Lotze’s answer in brief is: through the  idealities they produce. As magnitudes identifiable in experience, these idealities serve as orientating concepts for all academic disciplines, giving them direction and purpose within the context of a unified human life in a developed human culture.

Following Kant, Lotze claimed that idealities pertain to mental, not material, reality. However, they require matter in order to be exemplified or articulated by human beings. We understand idealities only in experience. To be more specific, we find them at work above all in our sensual life and in our feelings of pleasure and displeasure. We find them further in ethics, aesthetics, science, mathematics, metaphysics and logic. The spatial order, for example, is such an ideality: it is revealed via the matrix of discrete material entities in their dimensional magnitude and in the spaces between them, but it is not given as another thing among things. Rather, it is mentally “noticed” as a necessary “backdrop” to, a “condition of the possibility of”, the matrix of material things. (This conception was adopted by Bertrand Russell in his Essays on the Foundations of Geometry; cf. Milkov 2008)

Given his views on the relation of the material to the ideal, Lotze was convinced that the quarrel between materialism and idealism was misguided. . It was a quarrel about meaning: Idealists see too much meaning (borne by ideal entities) in reality, while materialists see no meaning in it at all.  Fearing that the characteristically vague aesthetic elements of human experience would undermine exact science, the materialists attempted to extract  all humanistic meaning from reality by sanctioning only mathematical descriptions of mechanically-construed natural processes (the likes of which we see in scientific formulae, such as F=MA in physics).  But Lotze thought such fears were in vain.  Just as mechanism was compatible with teleology, so Lotze thought that aesthetics (poetry) and religion (revealed truth) were compatible with the mathematics and calculation preferred by the materialists. By the same token, the acceptance of mechanism as a purely methodological principle in science did not invalidate the belief in free will.  On the contrary: since mechanism made the spiritual effort to achieve the trans-sensual more strenuous, it only “increased the poetical appeal of the world”(1856b, p. 306).

d. Anthropology as Prima Philosophia

Lotze’s main objective was the investigation of the concrete human being with her imaginings, dreams and feelings. He considered these elements—as expressed in poetry and art—as constitutive of a human person and her life. This explains the central role that the concept of home (Heimat) plays in his metaphysics. The related concept in his philosophy of mind is feeling and heart (Gemüt), as different from mind (Geist) and soul (Seele). Indeed, Lotze introduced the concept of heart in the wake of German mysticism (e.g., Meister Eckhart); however, he used it in a quite realistic sense. Heart is what makes us long for home. The longing itself is a result of our desires which we strive to satisfy. Life consists, above all, in consuming (geniesen) goods, material and ideal. This conception of human life is, of course, close to hedonism. (cf. section 3.a)

Lotze did not introduce anthropological investigation in philosophy. Rather, it was started in the sixteenth century, in an effort to renovate theology. During the next three centuries, anthropology became a favorite subject among German university philosophers—including Kant. In his anthropology, however, Lotze did not follow Kant. Kant distinguished between theoretical philosophy and mundane philosophy, with anthropology following in the latter category.  But Lotze abolished Kant’s distinction between the theoretical and mundane (1841a, p. 17), and he developed his “theoretical anthropology” exactly in order to merge the two philosophical disciplines into one.

The conclusion Lotze made was that Kant’s question “what can I know?” cannot be answered in the abstract; it can be only answered in terms of embodied persons in concrete socio-historical situations. Only when we embrace this perspective, Lotze thought, can we also grasp the depth and the importance of metaphysical problems.

This point brings us to the most important characteristic of Lotze’s philosophy. Lotze did not simply shift from metaphysics to anthropology. Rather, his anthropology became philosophy proper (Orth 1986, p. 43).

e. Methods: Eclecticism and Dialectics

From the very beginning of his career, Lotze’s subscribed to the view that, “When we cannot necessarily join one of the dominating parties, we [shall …] stay in the middle via free eclecticism” (Lotze 1843, p. 1). Today the word “eclecticism” is used mainly in a pejorative sense, but this was not true for Lotze. To the contrary, he thought eclecticism a most useful method in philosophy, and in 1840 even lauded it in a poem entitled “Eclecticism” (Kroneberg 1899, p. 218).

Lotze’s eclecticism was characterized by his logical turn in metaphysics. Indeed, as seen in section 2.a, the latter made his philosophy a rigorous science, enabling him to compress many of the problems of generations of philosophers into a unified theory. This point explains the astonishing success with which Lotze employed his eclecticism. It enabled him to look past the differences of philosophers like Kant, J. G. Fichte, Schelling, and Hegel, and to focus on what he took to be the most valuable ideas common to them.  Distilling their thought, he frequently reformulated their views in logically exact expressions.

Consistent with his eclecticism, Lotze also used something approaching Hegel’s dialectical method (Lotze, 1841a, p. 320). This is why “there are some passages [in Lotze’s writings] in which he does seem conscious of the contradictions and [nevertheless] attempts to mediate between the two,” rather than eliminating one of them. (Kuntz 1971, p. 34).

Some authors have a negative view of these Hegelian tendencies in Lotze. For example, Eduard von Hartmann complains that “there is scarcely a ‘yes’ by Lotze, which is not undermined at another place by a ‘no’” (Hartmann 1888, p. 147). Yet other philosophers, like George Santayana, have recognized that, despite the apparent contradictions, Lotze’s system remained very consistent overall.  Careful attention reveals that most of the supposed contradictions are apparent only, and result from the failure to note the varying perspectives from which Lotze conducted his philosophical research.

For instance, as discussed in section 2.b., Lotze insisted that mechanistic descriptions were appropriate and indeed required in science, but inappropriate in metaphysics, where teleological explanations are required.  It is easy to see this double-demand for mechanism and teleology as contradictory, so long as one fails to recognize that each demand is a “methodological” demand only, made by the requirements of two disciplines with differing norms and purposes.  Similarly, the idealistic tendencies of his system were part of a psychological description of reality, “a personal manner of reading things, a poetic intuition of the cosmic life” (Santayana 1889, 155).  Other aspects of his system—like his atomism—were radically objectivistic, suited only to the demands of scientific description and scientific work.

Lotze’s perspectivalism—his tendency to treat some views as “merely methodological” from within a given disciplinary perspective—can make him difficult to follow.  The problem is compounded by his tendency to, on occasion, switch perspectives in the course of a single work.  For instance, he begins his ontological investigations with pluralistic realism only to end it with monistic idealism. As a result, Lotze’s views are frequently difficult to state, and also difficult to criticize.

Lotze also introduced a specific method of discussing different views (Ansichten) on the subject under scrutiny. He was against the hasty satisfaction of our theoretical needs and expectations through one-sided theories. Furthermore, Lotze claimed that his final solutions were merely views which satisfy “needs of the heart”. Incidentally, this point can be comfortably interpreted in the sense of FreudWittgenstein: philosophical puzzles are similar to mental neuroses, which can be treated by changing the perspective.

3. Theoretical Philosophy

a. Ethics

Lotze’s ethics were influenced by J.F. Herbart, who preceded Lotze as the Philosophy Chair in Gottingen.  The starting point of philosophical exploration for J.F. Hebart begins with the analysis of the objects immediately given in inner and outer experience. (Pester 1997, p. 119). Being was for Herbart real—beyond and independent from the world of ideas. From here followed a strict division between theoretical and practical philosophy—reality and values, being and obligation, are independent one from another.

Lotze agreed with Herbart that we cannot draw conclusions about value from facts about reality, but he insisted that we can do the reverse; that is, we can draw conclusions about reality from facts about values. He expressed this belief in the claim that both logic and metaphysics are ultimately based on ethics. Lotze already declared this idea in his first philosophical work, his lesser Metaphysics, where he claimed that “the beginning of metaphysics lies not in itself but in ethics” (1841a, p. 329). Two years later he postulated that “the logical forms cannot be independent from metaphysical presupposition, and they also cannot be totally detached from the realm of morality” (1843, p. 7).

Of course, ethics is not presented in metaphysics in propositional form. Rather, ethics enters metaphysics in judgments about which possibilities for ordering facts correspond to an ideally presupposed order or to Lotze’s idealities (see section 2.c, above). In this sense, there is no knowledge without ethical presuppositions.

Lotze’s idealities found expression above all in the concept of value. More especially, Lotze claimed that “values are the key for the world of forms” (1857, p. 22). This position explains why in the literature, he is widely considered to be the philosopher who introduced the concept of “values” in philosophy.

Lotze was adamant that the measure of values is only the “satisfaction of the sentimental needs [Gemütsbedürfnisse]” (1852, p. 242). The most natural of these satisfactions is pleasure. This means that moral principles are to be founded on the principle of delight (Lustprincip). This is an  empirical solution to  the problems of ethics which is clearly related to Epicurean hedonism.

This position explains why Lotze avoided Kant’s formalism of the categorical imperative. Instead, following Fries, he accepted a psychological basis of the maxims of ethics, claiming that we draw our moral principles from the immediate certainty with which we consider something as true or good (1858, p. 287).

The point which unites the subjectivism of this position with Lotze’s idiosyncratic objectivism (cf. the summary) is that, despite assuming values to be recognized via delight, he does not limit them to persons only. Rather, Lotze understands values—by way of being idealities—also as crucial for apprehension of physical facts: they constitute the “meaning of the world in general—as a universal method for speculative expansion of all appearances” (Misch 1912, p. lxv).

b. Ontology and Metaphysics

According to Lotze’s metaphysics, the world consists of substances in relation, and so of substances and relations.  Let’s examine these categories, beginning with substances.

In the Aristotelian tradition, only wholes exhibiting an organic unity, such as a particular human being or a particular horse, can count as substances—arbitrary collections of things, like a heap of sand or the random assortment of items in a person’s pocket, do not count.

Lotze does not embrace either of these two conceptions of substance. Instead, he defends a constructivist position which assumes that substance is a whole composed of parts that hang together in a particular relation of dependence. More especially, the elements of the substance (the whole) stand to one another in a relation in which the elements effect each other reciprocally, binding each other together into the whole that they constitute.

In order to specify this kind of relation, Lotze borrowed from Ammonius (28,1,14) the term effectus transeunt (“action in passing”, or “cursory action”).  Effectus transeunt is the minimal effect that elements A and B exercise on each other in the substance M, in virtue of which they stay in M. Through effectus transeunt, the otherwise independent elements of the substance became interdependent. To put this in other words, effectus transeunt produces the “ontological glue” that binds elements into organic wholes.

Formally, we can describe the construction of a substance this way. The elements of a substance (a whole) stand to one another in a reciprocal relation and in a unique order (Folge)(Lotze 1879, § 69). Furthermore, if we call the whole (the substance) M, and its elements A, B, and R (A and B are particular elements which are in the focus of our attention, and R designates the sum of all unspecified elements which can occur in the whole), we can denote the whole with the formula M=φ[A B R], where φ stands for the connection between the elements. The type of connection is a resultant of the specific relations and positions of the elements of the substance, as well as of their order in it (§ 70). In fact, this is the structure of the minimal composite unity.

In general, relations play a central role in Lotze’s ontology. One of his slogans was: “It belongs to the notion and nature of existing [object] to be related” (Lotze 1885, ii. p. 587). Lotze was interested in what Bertrand Russell has later called “internal” relations, or relations between the elements in the substances. The substances themselves stay in “external” relations to one another.

The external relations are of various kinds, each of which has its idiosyncratic type of coordinate. For example, the system of geometrical relations and the system of colors are two networks of relations essential to the material world, but not to the world of art, or to the spiritual world of men. There are also other kinds of relation-networks (see Lotze 1856a, pp. 461–2; Lotze 1885 ii. p. 575). For instance, from the perspective of the subject, Lotze’s universe has at least two further relation-networks:

  1. that of perception; this network is the universe of what he calls “local-signs” (see section 3.e);
  2. that of judgments and concepts; this network is the universe of states of affairs. (see section 3.d)

In metaphysics proper, Lotze transformed the Hegelian dichotomy between being and becoming to the trichotomy being, becoming, value. The given is; it is opposed to both what happens (e.g. changes) and to the validities. The transition between these three is impossible.

From the perspective of his conception of values, Lotze also suggested a new interpretation of Plato’s theory of ideas. Ideas have two characteristics: (i) they have their own autonomous being; (ii) in the same time, ideas have properties, similar to those of the objects of reality. Lotze’s claim was that these two conditions are only fulfilled by values. In fact, Plato’s ideas are validities of truths. Plato misrepresented them as “ideas” only because in Greek there is no expression for things which have no being: and values are just such things (1874, § 317). The fact that Plato’s ideas are validities, Lotze argues further, explains why they are beyond space and time, beyond things and minds, remaining at that atomistic. Lotze’s interpretation of Plato’s ideas was further developed by Paul Natorp (Natorp 1902).

c. Epistemology

Lotze’s task in epistemology was to secure knowledge which is to be extracted, and separated, from perception. The main characteristic of knowledge is that it is true. To Lotze, this means that it, and only it, presents the things as they really are—and, in fact, that is what is expected from thinking as a result.

The difference between perception and knowledge (or thinking; in identifying thinking and knowledge Lotze was followed by Frege) can be set out in the following way.  Perception (including imagining, daydreaming, etc.) notes accidental relations of ideas, but knowledge asserts a natural fit (a “necessary connection”) among these ideas: they belong together (zusammengehören).  In other words, the perceiving mind conceives “kaleidoscopically” a multiplicity of contingent pictures (Bilder) (1843, p. 72). Only then comes thinking, which consists in going through the ideas a second time, producing in this way “secondary thoughts” (Nebengedanken). The latter connect only those ideas which intrinsicallybelong together.

Lotze describes his “secondary thoughts” as constituting “a critical stand towards an idea.” This conception assumes that we have a kind of intuition that helps us to judge is the connection of ideas that lie before us—in our perception—true, or false.

Some authors have claimed that this idea is a further transformation of Hegel’s method of dialectical self-development of the truth (Misch 1912, p. xxvii). But it would be more correct to say that Lotze’s secondary thoughts are an incorporation into logic of the old Platonic–Aristotelian idea of peirastic (tentative, experimental) inquiry that tests different opinions and decides which connection of ideas they make is true and which false. (This interpretation was supported by Lotze’s pupils, Julius Bergmann and Wilhelm Windelband.) Indeed, Lotze is adamant that “this inner regularity of the content sought-after, being unknown yet, is not open to us in specific realistic definitions of thought. However, being present in the form of opinion, it really has […] the defensive [intuitive] force to negotiate what is not suitable to her” (Lotze 1841a, p. 33).

d. Logic

The concept of the judgment and its content (Urteilsinhalt) played a central role in Lotze’s logic.  He claimed that the content of judgment is not an interrelation of ideas, as Hume and Mill believed, but an interrelation of objective contents, or things: it is a state of affairs (a concept introduced by Lotze and later also used by Husserl and Wittgenstein—cf. Milkov 2002). Since there is no difference between the content of judgments and reality, the state of affairs has the structure of the substance or of the minimal composite unity. This position was another expression of Lotze’s objectivism (see the summary).

But the content of judgment has also two other dimensions which have little to do with its structural characteristics:

First, the content of the judgment is asserted by the judgment.  Thus, the judgment has an assertoric quality, and what Lotze calls its affirmation (Bejahung), or “positing” (Setzung).  For Lotze, this is the ultimate quality of a judgment—it is what makes a judgment a judgment, as opposed to complex of terms. Later, this conception was also adopted by Frege who assumed that the judgment acknowledges the truth of its content so that only this acknowledgement makes the combination of ideas a judgment. In other words, the judgment is an acceptance, or assumption of content as true, or rejecting it as false.

This characteristic of judgment was connected with a variant of the context principle, according to which a word has a meaning not in isolation but in the context of a proposition in which it occurs: “The affirmation of a single notion has no meaning which we can specify; we can affirm nothing but a judgment in which the content of one notion is brought into relation with that of another” (Lotze 1864, p. 465; Lotze 1885 ii. p. 582).Frege followed Lotze also on this point.

Second, the content of judgment has a value: this is a point that connects Lotze’s logic with his ethics(cf. section 2.c, above). To be more specific, Lotze claimed that concepts have meaning (Bedeutung), but not value. They can have a value only through the proposition in which they occur—in its context (Lotze 1874, § 321). In 1882 Lotze’s closest pupil, Wilhelm Windelband, introduced the concept of truth-value in the wake of this idea. Nine years later, this concept was also embraced by Frege in his “Function and Concept.”

Following Herbart, and developing further the idea of content of judgment, Lotze also explored the idea of the “given” (Gegebene) in philosophy.  More especially, Lotze understood the given as an “experienced content of perception” that was different from the content of judgment, or the state of affairs. Later this conception of the given was instrumental by coining the concept of sense-data (see Milkov 2001).

e. Philosophy of Mind

As was shown in the explanation  of the principle of teleomechanism (section 2.b), Lotze was adamant that the way in which phenomena are explained in physics is not appropriate for the mental or psychical world.  For instance, mechanical descriptions do not explain why we experience the effects of light-waves as color, or of sound-waves as tones. In this regard, Lotze criticized Herbart’s view that the interaction of ideas in a person’s mind (such as how ideas compete to capture a person’s attention or compel belief) is to be explained on analogy with the physical conception of force.  On Lotze’s view, the content of ideas is more important than their intensity(1856a, pp. 238 ff.).

Concerning the relation between soul and body, the so-called “mind-body problem,” Lotze did not offer a positive theory—in fact, he denies that we can understand this relation—but adopted a version of occasionalism.  Occasionalism is the view that events in the mental realm are synchronized with events in the material realm in such a way that it seems that the two realms are interacting, even though they do not in fact interact.  To adopt this as a methodological stance was Lotze’s way of saying that, even though the two realms may interact, we do not need to understand how they do in order to have a perfectly good, practical theory about the relation between mind and body  (1852, pp. 77 f.).

To the extent that Lotze develops a solution to the “mind-body problem,” he does so by introducing his famous conception of local-signs (Localzeichen), which explains the relation between mind and matter in terms of our perception of space and movement. According to Lotze, what we directly see when perceiving a movement are only patches of color. What helps us to perceive the fact of movement is the effort that we ourselves make in perceiving the movement. Lotze calls this stimulus a “local-sign.” It is a means of transforming sense-perceptions into space-values.

This means that our knowledge of the connection of mind to matter is not a fruit of reflection but of activity (in this assumption Lotze followed J. G. Fichte); it is not simply a matter of grasping. Indeed, the process of space-perceiving is an activity of construction of the external objects, and events, in consciousness (1856a, pp. 328 f.). This conception was another critique of  the purely mechanical understanding in philosophy.

Lotze’s theory of logical signs was further developed by Hermann von Helmholtz in the conception that sense-organs do not supply isomorphic pictures of the outer world, but only signals which perception transforms further into pictures. Helmholtz’s theory, in turn, was later embraced by the logical empiricists Moritz Schlick and Hans Reichenbach.

Lotze further claimed that thoughts are tools (organa) for deciphering messages of reality. This deciphering takes place in realizing of values. The aim of human thought is not to serve as a lens for immediate grasping reality, but to be valid. This means that the structure of thoughts has scarcely anything to do with the structure of the facts. Nevertheless, their effects coincide (1874, § 342). Thus, despite the fact that there are no general ideas in reality, we understand reality  only through  general ideas.

Lotze did not believe that this conception leads to epistemological pessimism. It is true that “reality may be more extensive than our capacities for representing it (whether by knowledge, feeling, etc.)” can assimilate (Cuming 1917, p. 163). Lotze insisted, however, that these features of reality are beyond the interests of philosophers, since beyond their (human) reach (in essence, along the lines of the saying: “what the eye does not see, the heart does not grieve over”).

f. Philosophy of Nature

As a young man Lotze was befriended with Ernst Friedrich Apelt, a pupil of Fries. (cf. section 1.b) Through Apelt, Lotze became familiar with Friesian philosophy, which he later used as a convenient foil in the development of some of his own views. Fries’ philosophy followed Kant formally, but in fact was more mechanical and calculative than Kant’s. In truth, it was even more mechanical and calculative than the philosophy of Herbart, who himself was a well-known mechanistic Kantian.

Lotze criticized Fries for being too formal and forgetting the “deep problems” of philosophy. Specifically, Lotze attacked Fries’ (and arguably Kant’s) dynamic understanding of matter, which represents it as simply the interplay of powers. Thus construed, the standard, empirical properties of matter (such as extension, solidity, place, and so on) disappear. Against this conception, Lotze embraced a form of atomism, which he saw as necessary for the individuation of material objects. Indeed, humans understand something only when the content of their judgment is articulated, and there cannot be an articulation without individuation; furthermore, individuation is best carried out when we accept that there are atoms. Besides, Lotze was convinced that the order in the world cannot come into being from a purposeless and planless beginning—from what today is called an “atomless gunk.” The point is that the order  presupposes an articulation and individuation: it is order between individuals—between Lotze’s variables A, B, and R (cf. section 3.b).

Apparently, Lotze did not understand atoms as they were understood in antiquity: as ultimate elements of reality which have different forms, but the same substance .  He did conceive of them as the ultimate building blocks of the material world, but he saw them as idiosyncratic and as remaining unmodified in all compositions and divisions. In other words, whereas the ancient atomism saw each atom as made out of the same kind of substance , Lotze saw each atom as being made of a unique kind of substance , so that each atom is sui generis.

Further difference with the atomism of the antiquity was that Lotze’s atoms were punctual (i.e., point-like), without extension (unräumlich).  Indeed, extension is possible only where there are many points which can be easily identified and differentiated. The extensionless atoms find their mutual place in space through their powers. To be more specific, we conceive of them as impermeable, filling up the space, only because of their demonstrated reciprocal resistance (1856a, p. 402).

An important characteristic of matter is its passivity, i.e. its ability to be affected from the outside. True to his anthropological stance, Lotze accepted that only if two essences mutually produce their respective “sufferings” (Leiden) can they be their respective interacting causes. (1864, p. 574) (The concept of “suffering” shows influence on Lotze of his countryman Jacob Böhme – both were born in Upper Lusatia, Saxony.) At the same time, Lotze was adamant that the concepts of suffering, effecting, and interaction are only—although inescapable—scientific metaphors. We must not conceive of them literally. However, they help us to grasp the nature of the problem.

In questions of space, Lotze used his teacher Weiße, rather than Fries, as a foil. Weiße had distinguished between space and interaction (Wechselwirkung) of substance. Moreover, for Weiße, interaction is the condition of space. (2003, pp. 85 f.) In contrast, Lotze differentiated, not between interaction and space (he was convinced that the two coincide), but between extension and place. “Extension” refers to an infinite multiplicity of directions. Only place, however, makes these possibilities concrete, putting them into three coordinated directions (Pester 1997, p. 110).

g. Philosophy of Language

Starting with his lesser Logic, Lotze made great efforts to elaborate a convincing philosophy of language. His first step in this direction was to connect language with logic by claiming that logic begins with exploring language forms (1843, p. 40). The reason for this assumption was that the living, unconscious “spirit of [ordinary] language” makes a connection between what one experiences concretely in sense perception, and the abstract forms that one extracts from sense perception (p. 82).  (This idea was also adopted—via Frege—in Wittgenstein’s Tractatus, 3.1: “In a proposition a thought finds expression that can be perceived by the senses.”) Indeed, our language functions on the level of perceptions. This, however, is not a hindrance to our using it to convey truths of a higher order: truths of science, mathematics, logic, etc (1856a, p. 304).

Lotze criticized the idea that language has meaning by picturing reality. According to Lotze, not even the pictures formed by perceiving are pictures proper (cf. section 3.e, above)—much less, therefore, pictures supposedly embedded in the structures of language.  Rather than performing a picturing function, language provides something of a method.  To be more specific, it provides rules for transforming signals from the sensual world into the phenomena of our mental world, and vice-versa: from our perception into the meanings we formulate and communicate with the help of the language.  In fact, the whole relation between microcosm and macrocosm was understood by Lotze in this way. The microcosm can be characterized as a “language of the macrocosm”, and at the same time, a place for understanding the possibilities of speaking about the macrocosm (Orth 1986, p. 48).

4. Philosophy and Life

a. Anthropology

Lotze was adamant that we cannot prefer logical forms over facts, as Hegel had once done. In particular, he criticized Hegel’s ladder-model of natural history, which claimed that we can deduce the value and importance of every particular species from its place on the ladder of evolution. Instead of formal (logical) rankings of living species, Lotze promoted a comparison of their natural figures (Gestalten). (From this perspective he also criticized Darwin’s evolution theory.) The difference between the mind of animals and that of man arises not because of a difference in the elements which they contain; in fact, here and there the same building blocks, or “mosaic-stones” (Mosaikstifte), enter into the scene. (Rather, that variation results from the way in which they are combined and used (1858, p. 266).

Lotze also criticized the intellectualism of the German Idealists. Instead, he sided with the German Enlightenment’s tendency to emphasize the importance of sensuality, of feelings and imagination (Phantasie). In this key, he classified animals not according to their capacity to think (as Herder did), but according to their physical performance and forms of consumption (genießen). On this point he was criticized by many of his contemporaries, including his friends, the “speculative theists” I. H. Fichte and C. H. Weiße. These two found in the Microcosm too little idealism and too much realism (Weiße 1865, pp. 289 ff.).

This reproach was scarcely justified; for Lotze endorsed the essential difference between the human mind and that of other animals.  The difference was that all human thought has reference to, or is at least formed from within, traditions: in language, science, skills, morals, as well as in practical habits and in judgments of everyday life (1858, p. 262). Moreover, Lotze claimed that “to know man means, above all, to know his vocation [Bestimmung], the means which he has in disposition to achieve it, as well as the hindrances that he must overcome in this effort” (p. 72). In this kind of anthropology, the ability to use the arm, and later also instruments was most important.

b. Social Philosophy

Lotze treated every epoch of human culture as developed around a particular value: (i) the Orient developed a taste for the colossal, (ii) the Jews for the elevated, (iii) the Greeks for the beautiful, (iv) the Romans for dignity and elegance, (v) the Middle Ages for the fantastic and emblematic, and (vi) Modernity for the critical and inventive. These orientations and achievements are on a par with one another (1864, pp. 124 ff.). The acceptance of the plurality of values was unique in German philosophy at the time: for instance, whereas we can easily find anti-Semitic judgments from Herder and Kant, not so from Lotze.

According to Lotze, achieving social progress is not a matter of quantitative growth but of reaching a “systematic complete harmony” in this or that particular culture. This state could be attained, for example, if the rules of social conduct are conceived of as a system of rights and duties of an objective spiritual (geistiges) organism (p. 424). Such a society could be considered a work of Nature, “or rather not simply of Nature, but of the Moral World Order [sittliche Weltordnung] which is independent of the individual” (p. 443).

Lotze was not convinced that the scientific and technological progress of the human race through the first half of the nineteenth century had increased its humaneness.  For, the increase in humanity’s power over nature was accompanied by a proportional increase in our dependence upon it.  The new ways of life afforded by developing technologies created new consumption needs, but many of these new needs were superfluous—not needs at all, but only desires—and some of them could be positively harmful.  Thus it is not unreasonable to think that we might have been better-off without the technologies that, although they enabled humanity to solve certain practical problems, created others that were previously unknown.

However, such felt-needs/desires cannot be eliminated through mere insight into truth, e.g., by recognizing that they are superfluous and harmful. The disapproving stance on this matter, taken by Diogenes of Sinope or Rousseau, is attractive and plausible mainly as a critique. Indeed, the natural state, which they propagated, can be seen as a state of innocence, but also as one of barbarism.

As a solution to this problem Lotze accepted that there is a constant human way of life which repeats itself practically unchanged: its purposes, motives and habits have the same form. This is the course of the world (der Weltlauf), an ever-green stalk from which the colorful blossoms of history cyclically emerge. In fact, the true goods of our inner life increase either only slowly, or perhaps they do not increase at all (1858, p. 345).

Perhaps the most interesting development of our modern time is the introduction of division of work and the new (Protestant) phenomenon of “profession.” (This idea was further developed by Max Weber.) An important effect of this process is that life is now divided into work and leisure (1864, p. 281; pp. 245–7).

Every profession stimulates the heart to embody a specific direction of imagination, a perspective on the world, and a way of judging. This state of affairs produced different forms of existence (Existenzarten) which makes modernity one of the most interesting epochs of human history. The main disadvantage of the professional life, Lotze says, is its monotony (1858, pp. 437–8).

c. Philosophy of History

The history of human society is a central subject of Lotze’s Microcosm.  Lotze’s views on this topic are best presented in contrast with what was then the standard or “mainstream” approach to history, which he faulted for lacking realism, and therefore for failing to generate genuine historical knowledge.

Mainstream history was inspired by two chief sources: Hegelianism, and what may loosely be described as positivism.  Although radically different in their guiding assumptions, these two movements overlapped in their consequences for history.

Hegel believed that history is produced by the movements of an arcane entity called “the world-spirit” (Weltgeist) and of its interaction with humanity.  Specifically, Hegel believed that the Weltgeist’s goal was to bring the human race into the full realization of the idea of humanity, i.e., into an ideal state of being.  To this end, it leads certain humans—by means of which they are unaware—to advance the race in various ways.  These humans (heroes) turn out to be the great figures in history, and their movements and achievements, as Hegel saw it, constitute history.  That is, history consists not of everything that happens, but above all of great movements that advance humanity significantly toward its ideal, of those events that constitute a substantial realization of the ideal.

In short, the Hegelian approach requires commitment to an inevitably contentious idealization of humanity, an assumption about what counts as the highest realization of human nature.  Lotze claimed that such theories have their place in Philosophy, but they can only skew our perceptions when allowed to control our search for fundamental data in History.  In Hegel’s case, for instance, his ideal of humanity led him to neglect both the contributions of women to history (1864, pp. 47 ff.; in this regard Lotze appears as a precursor of the modern feminism), and the role played by the mundane aspects of individuals’ lives—which of course constitutes the lager part of human history.  (This claim of Lotze shows him as a predecessor of the nouvelle histoire school of Marc Bloch which accentuated discussions in history of past facts of la vie quotidienne.)

The positivist approach to history, exemplified by Leopold von Ranke and Johann Gustav Droysen, had similar consequences.  Focusing too much on “objective” facts and formal considerations, and too little on the concrete, embodied, and emotional aspects of human life, historically significant but “ordinary” elements of human life were eliminated from consideration.

Lotze rejected both the idealism of Hegel and the demand for “objective faciticity” that came from the positivists.  Against Hegel, Lotze argued that human progress does not proceed  linearly nor ladder-wise:  many achievements of human society disappear without a trace, while others disappear for a time, only to be reintroduced by new generations. Rather, Lotze saw humanity developing in a spiral pattern, in which moments of progress are offset by moments of regress.  To be sure, this perspective appears rather gloomy alongside the mainstream approach, but it is clearly more realistic, and better suited to teaching humanity about itself.

Lotze agreed with Lessing’s thesis that the purpose of history is the education of humanity. (This point coheres with Lotze’s claim, discussed in section 2.b–c above, that we can understand philosophy and science starting from the history of human education and schooling.) That assumption helps to draw a more realistic picture of human progress than what Hegelian and positivist history provided.  Seeing history as a didactic tool, Lotze’s desiderata for good historical work were shaped by his ideals for education.  In particular, they were modeled by his conviction that the purpose of human spiritual life consists in the richness of an education capable of harmonizing all the aspects of a concrete, embodied person’s life.  This is what drove Lotze to reject the positivists’ “objective facticity” as inadequate for history.

Lotze’s alternative was an aesthetic, or poetic, approach to history. (1864, p. 46)   As he saw it, poetry and history are both creative, setting up new life-worlds.   The task of the historian was to present concepts as they were understood in their original contexts, exactly as they were embraced, felt, and consumed in the past—not anachronistically, as they might be understood in the present, through the “lens” of a different form of life.  This task required both the focus on empirical fact characteristic of positivist history, but also an element of poetic imagination—for only the latter could add flesh to the dry bones of empirical fact.  By combining both modes of cognition, the historian was to determine how the concept fitted into the total form of life characteristic of the period in which it originated, as well as those that inherited the concept—in effect, to re-create the life-world of the people whose concept it was. This line of thought was later developed by R. G. Collingwood.

d. Political Philosophy

Lotze’s political philosophy discussed such themes as social rationalization, power, bureaucracy, national values, sovereignty, and international relations. Above all, he defended the enlightened, hereditary monarchy. He saw it as offering “the greatest security for steady development”—and, as he saw it, this is of greatest value in political life. (p. 444) Further, being a philosopher of the concrete, full-blooded man, with his feelings and imagination, Lotze defended paternal patriotism; he preferred the love for the concrete fatherland over the love for the state with its institutions. In particular, Lotze criticized the view (defended by his contemporary Jacob Burckhardt) that the State should exist for its own sake. He also distrusted parliamentary representation and party politics.

Lotze repudiated Plato’s model of the state as an analog of the human person, and accepted instead a model of political equilibrium construed as “the result of the reciprocal action of unequal forces” (p. 423).  In matters of international law, he was an advocate of a balance of power of sovereign states. He believed that “the increasing relations between the different divisions of humankind changed in great measure the significance of the political boundaries and gave new stimulus to the idea of cosmopolitanism” (p. 436).

Lotze disparaged those critics of modernity who claimed that its proponents only defend their desire for material well-being. Moreover, although he did not use the term “liberalism,” Lotze adhered to the principles of what we would now call “classical bourgeois liberalism;” but he criticized “Manchester liberalism” (cf. the “turbo-capitalism” of the “roaring 1990s”) that followed ideas of such philosophers as Thomas Malthus, referring, among other things, to what today is called “the paradox of liberalism:” liberalism fails to show how an isolated human being can be a subject of rights. Indeed, right is a reciprocal, and so collective, concept: “one’s right is what the others feel for us as a duty” (p. 427).

Lotze criticized the concept of natural law employed by the mainstream Western philosophers like Aristotle and Hobbes who claim that law is set by nature. Instead, Lotze had sympathies with the historicist conception of law developed by Leopold von Ranke and Friedrich von Savigny who defended the thesis that the notions of law are coined in human practice. Lotze used to say that “the beginning of all legitimacy is illegitimate, although it need not be at the same time illegal” (p. 417).

e. Philosophy of Religion

The religion of the modern man was for Lotze a feeling of life (Lebensgefühl) in which the awareness of the fragility of the human race is connected with a sense of conscience about a lay profession. (The latter point was extensively discussed by Max Weber.) Men know how modest their life-tasks are and nevertheless are happy to pursue them. This is a belief which follows the consciousness and the inner voice, and which, nevertheless, is exactly as certain as the knowledge we receive through the senses (1858, pp. 447 f.).

Lotze criticizes the Enlightenment claim that religion is only a product of human reason. If that was true, then it would be possible to replace religion with philosophy. However, for Lotze, reason alone is not enough to grasp religious truth: we learn it through revelation which can be thought of as the historical action of God (1864, p. 546). Lotze also criticizes Fries who compared religion, which starts from unproven truths, to science which is also ultimately based on unproved axioms we believe. Rather, whereas the axioms of science are general and hypothetical judgments, the propositions of religion are apodictic.

A leading idea of Lotze’s philosophy of religion was that “all the processes in nature are understandable only through the continuing involvement of God; only this involvement arranges the passing of the interaction [Übergang des Wechselwirkungs] between different parts of the world” (p. 364). This claim can be best interpreted with reference to Lotze’s concept of idealities(discussed in section 2b–c, above) Idealities are magnitudes, identifiable in experience, and are constitutive for all academic fields: science, mathematics, metaphysics. More especially, they help to orient our concepts and studies.

In more concrete terms, Lotze hung the intelligibility of natural processes on the concept of God because of his anthropological stance—of the role the concept of humanity played in his philosophy. Important point, however, is that, to him, that concept does not have a generic character; we can grasp it only in terms of particular individuals, or persons (p. 52). This explains why Lotze claimed that the kind of purposive, creative power seen in natural processes is unthinkable except in relation to a living personality with its will; and, since the process of nature emanate from no human will, we are left with the person of God (pp. 587 ff.).

Lotze’s use of God as a necessary explanatory category is reminiscent of Kant, and has a somewhat “methodological” quality about it—we cannot prove the existence of God, Lotze thought, but we must nonetheless believe in Him; for only thus is our world ultimately intelligible. This point of Lotze was interpreted by the religious liberals of the fin de siècle (by the Congregationalists, in particular) as supporting the claim that religion is a matter of judgment of value in the Kingdom of God—a thesis made popular by Lotze’s contemporary Albrecht Ritschl (1822–1889) who fought against the conservative-Lutheran and confessional theology of the time.

f. Religious Practice

Lotze understood world-religions to have started in the Orient, with the picture, familiar from the Old Testament, of the world as a system developing according to general laws. Later, the West accepted this belief in the form of Christianity. In the Age of Enlightenment, however, it started to consider the universe as something unfinished, giving opportunities to the individuals to form it according to the specific purposes of everyone. (This stance was theoretically grounded by Kant.) The future was seen as formless in principle, so that human action can change reality in an absolutely new way (Lotze 1864, p. 331). Embracing this view, the believers abandoned quietism and embraced vita activa. Reducing the horizons of human imagination to the practical tasks of the earthy world, the need to connect it with the transcendental waned. The result was the belief in progress and a turn away from God. From now on Godhood was considered mainly in moral terms.

Pagans, in their most developed form of antiquity, believed in reason, in self-respect, and in the sublime. (Lotze called this stance “heroism of the pure reason”.) Unfortunately, pagans failed to foster humaneness. This was the historical achievement of Christianity which developed a totally new understanding of the moral duties. Of course, pagans recognized moral duties too. However, they understood them as having the same necessity as natural laws have. To be more specific, Christianity—especially Protestantism—taught its believers to carry out duties following their personal conscience. In consequence, Christianity: (i) established an immediate connection to God; (ii) it made it possible for individual Christians to pursue their own values of preference which are independent from the social background of the individual and from her actual place in the society. In this way, the respect for human dignity was secured.

Historically, Christianity placed importance on the activity of teaching and learning through the establishment of schools.  . Christianity, however, is not simply a teaching. It requires faithfulness to the historical God, realized through revelation. That is why Christian dogmatics must be preserved and cultivated.

Lotze’s conclusion was that we must look upon Christian dogmatics as posing questions about the purpose of human life, not as giving answers. Lotze was confident that every new generation would return to these questions. Of course, dogmatics can be criticized: indeed, the critical Protestant theology was, historically, the best example of such criticism. But, according to Lotze, we must not cast Christian dogmatics away as obsolete.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Lotze, Rudolph Hermann. (1840) Gedichte, Leipzig: Weidmann.
  • Lotze, Rudolph Hermann.  (1841a). Metaphysik, Leipzig: Weidmann.
  • Lotze, Rudolph Hermann. (1841b). “Bemerkungen über den Begriff des Raumes. Sendeschreiben an C. H. Weiße,” Zeitschrift für Philosophie und Spekulative Theologie 8: 1–24; in Lotze 1885/91, i, pp. 86–108.
  • Lotze, Rudolph Hermann. (1843). Logik, Lepzig: Weidmann.
  • Lotze, Rudolph Hermann. (1845). Über den Begriff der Schönheit, Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Ruprecht.
  • Lotze, Rudolph Hermann.  (1852). Medicinische Psychologie, oder Physiologie der Seele, Leipzig: Weidmann.
  • Lotze, Rudolph Hermann.  (1856a). Mikrokosmus: Ideen zur Naturgeschichte und Geschichte der Menschheit, Versuch einer Anthropologie, 1st vol., Leipzig: Hirzel.
  • Lotze, Rudolph Hermann.  (1856b). “Selbstanzeige des ersten Bandes des Mikrokosmus,” Göttinger gelehrte Anzeigen 199: 1977–92; in Lotze 1885/91, iii, pp. 303–14.
  • Lotze, Rudolph Hermann. (1857). Streitschriften, Part One, Leipzig: Hirzel.
  • Lotze, Rudolph Hermann. (1858). Mikrokosmus, 2nd vol., Leipzig: Hirzel.
  • Lotze, Rudolph Hermann.  (1864). Mikrokosmus, 3rd vol., Leipzig: Hirzel.
  • Lotze, Rudolph Hermann. (1868). Geschichte der Aesthetik in Deutschland, München: Cotta.
  • Lotze, Rudolph Hermann.  (1874). Logik, Leipzig: Hirzel.
  • Lotze, Rudolph Hermann.  (1879). Metaphysik, Leipzig: Hirzel.
  • Lotze, Rudolph Hermann. (1884). Outlines of Metaphysic, trans. and ed. by G. T. Ladd, Boston: Ginn.
  • Lotze, Rudolph Hermann. (1885). Microcosmus: An Essay Concerning Man and his Relation to the World, 2 vols., E. Hamilton and E. E. Constance Jones, Trans., Edinburgh: T. & T. Clark.
  • Lotze, Rudolph Hermann. (1885a). Outlines of Aesthetics, trans. and ed. by G. T. Ladd, Boston: Ginn.
  • Lotze, Rudolph Hermann. (1885b). Outlines of Practical Philosophy, trans. and ed. by G. T. Ladd, Boston: Ginn.
  • Lotze, Rudolph Hermann. (1885c). Outlines of Philosophy of Religion, trans. and ed. by G. T. Ladd, Boston: Ginn.
  • Lotze, Rudolph Hermann.  (1885/91). Kleine Schriften, ed. by David Peipers, 4 vols., Leipzig: Hirzel.
  • Lotze, Rudolph Hermann. (1886). Outlines of Psychology, trans. and ed. by G. T. Ladd, Boston: Ginn.
  • Lotze, Rudolph Hermann. (1887). Outlines of Logic, trans. and ed. by G. T. Ladd, Boston: Ginn.
  • Lotze, Rudolph Hermann.  (1887). Logic (B. Bosanquet et al., trans.), 2nd ed., Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Lotze, Rudolph Hermann.  (1888). Metaphysic (B. Bosanquet et al., trans.) 2nd ed., Oxford: Clarendon Press. Lotze, Rudolh Hermann.  (2003). Briefe und Dokumente, Zusammengestellt, eingeleitet und kommentiert von Reinhardt Pester, Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Cuming, Agnes. (1917). “Lotze, Bradley, and Bosanquet”, Mind 26: 162–70.
  • Hartmann, Eduard von. (1888). Lotze’s Philosophie, Leipzig: Friedrich.
  • Kronenberg, Moritz. (1899). Moderne Philosophen, München: Beck.
  • Kuntz, P. G. (1971). “Rudolph Hermann Lotze, Philosopher and Critic”, Introduction to: Santayana 1889, pp. 3–94.
  • Milkov, Nikolay. (2001). “The History of Russell’s Concepts ‘Sense-data’ and ‘Knowledge by Acquaintan­ce’,” Archiv für Begriffsgeschichte 43: 221–31.
  • Milkov, Nikolay.  (2002). “Lotze’s Concept of ‘States of Affairs’ and its Critics,” Prima Philosophia 15: 437–50.
  • Milkov, Nikolay.  (2008). “Russell’s Debt to Lotze,” Studies in History and Philosophy of Science, Part A, 39: 186–93.
  • Misch, Georg. (1912). “Einleitung”, in: Hermann Rudolph Lotze, Logik, hg. von G. Misch, Leipzig: Felix Meiner, pp. ix–cxxii.
  • Natorp, Paul. (1902). Platos Ideenlehre, Leipzig: Dürr.
  • Orth, E. W. (1986). “R. H. Lotze: Das Ganze unseres Welt- und Selbstverständnisses,” in: Josef Speck (ed.), Grundprobleme der großen Philosophen. Philosophie der Neuzeit IV, Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Ruprecht, pp. 9–51.
  • Passmore, John. (1966). A Hundred Years of Philosophy; 2nd ed., Harmondsword: Penguin.
  • Perry, Ralf Barton. (1935). The Thought and Character of William James, 2 vols., Boston: Little, Brown, and Co.
  • Pester, Reinhardt. (1997). Hermann Lotze. Wege seines Denkens und Forschens, Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann.
  • Pester, Reinhardt. (2003). “Unterwegs von Göttingen nach Berlin: Hermann Lotzes Psychologie im Spannungsfeld von Psychologie und Philosophie,” in L. Sprung and W. Schönpflug (eds.), Zur Geschichte der Psychologie in Berlin, 2nd ed., Frankfurt: Peter Lang, pp. 125–51.
  • Russell, Bertrand. (1918). Mysticism and Logic, 3rd ed., London: Allen & Unwin, 1963.
  • Santayana, George. (1889). Lotze’s System of Philosophy, ed. by P. G. Kuntz, Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1971.
  • Weiße, C. H. (1865). “Rezension von Mikrokosmus by H. Lotze,” Zeitschrift für Philosophie und philosophische Kritik 47: 272–315.

c. Bibliographies

  • Kuntz, P. G. (1971). “Lotze Bibliography”, in: Santayana 1889, pp. 233–69.
  • Pester, Reinhardt. (1997). “Bibliographie”, in: Pester, pp. 344–94.

d. Biographies

  • Falckenberg, Richard. (1901). Hermann Lotze, Stuttgart: Frommann.
  • Wentscher, Max. (1913). Hermann Lotze, Heidelberg: Winter.

e. Further Reading

  • Bauch, Bruno. (1918). “Lotzes Logik und ihre Bedeutung im deutschen Idealismus”, in: Beiträge zur Philosophie des deutschen Idealismus 1: 45–58.
  • Devaux, Philippe. (1932). Lotze et Son Influence sur la Philosophie Anglo-Saxonne, Bruxelles: Lamartin.
  • Frege, Gottlob. (1883). “17 Key Sentences on Logic”, in: idem, Posthumous Writings, ed. by Brian McGuinness, Oxford: Blackwell, 1979, pp. 174–175.
  • Gabriel, Gottfried. (1989a). “Einleitung des Herausgebers. Lotze und die Entstehung der modernen Logik bei Frege”, in H. R. Lotze, Logik, Erstes Buch. Vom Denken, Hamburg: Meiner, xi–xliii.
  • Gabriel, Gottfried.  (1989b). “Einleitung des Herausgebers: Objektivität, Logik und Erkenntnistheorie bei Lotze und Frege”, in H. R. Lotze, Logik, Drittes Buch. Vom Erkennen (Methodologie), Hamburg: Meiner, xi–xxxiv.
  • Harte, Frederick E. (1913). The Philosophical Treatment of Divine Personality: from Spinoza to Hermann Lotze, London: C. H. Kelly.
  • Hauser, Kai. (2003). “Lotze and Husserl,” Archiv für die Geschichte der Philosophie 85: 152–78.
  • Heidegger, Martin. (1978). Frühe Schriften, Frankfurt: Klostermann.
  • Henry, Jones. (1895). A Critical Account of the Philosophy of Lotze: The Doctrine of Thought, Glasgow: MacLehose.
  • Kraushaar, Otto. (1938 / 1939). “Lotze as a Factor in the Development of James’s Radical Empiricism and Pluralism,” The Philosophical Review, 47: 517–26 / 49: 455–71.
  • Moore, Vida F. (1901). The Ethical Aspect of Lotze’s Metaphysics, New York: Macmillan.
  • Orth, E. W. (1984). “Dilthey und Lotze. Zur Wandlung des Philosophiebegriffs in 19 Jahrhundret,” Dilthey-Jahrbuch, 2: 140–58.
  • Robins, Edwin Proctor. (1900). Some Problems of Lotze’s Theory of Knowledge, New York: Macmillan.
  • Schoen, Henri. (1901). La Métaphysique de Hermann Lotze: La philosophie des Actions et des Réactions Réciproques, Paris: Fischbacher.
  • Stumpf, Carl. (1917). “Zum Gedächtnis Lotzes,” in: Kantstudien 22: 1–26.
  • Thomas, E. E. (1921). Lotze’s Theory of Reality, London: Longmans Green.
  • Valentine, C. W. (1911). The Philosophy of Lotze in its Theological Aspects, Glasgow: Robert Maclehose.
  • Wentscher, Max. (1924). Fechner und Lotze, München: Reinhardt.

Author Information

Nikolay Milkov
Email: nikolay.milkov@upb.de
Universität Paderborn

Mathematical Platonism

Mathematical platonism is any metaphysical account of mathematics that implies mathematical entities exist, that they are abstract, and that they are independent of all our rational activities. For example, a platonist might assert that the number pi exists outside of space and time and has the characteristics it does regardless of any mental or physical activities of human beings. Mathematical platonists are often called “realists,” although, strictly speaking, there can be realists who are not platonists because they do not accept the platonist requirement that mathematical entities be abstract.

Mathematical platonism enjoys widespread support and is frequently considered the default metaphysical position with respect to mathematics. This is unsurprising given its extremely natural interpretation of mathematical practice. In particular, mathematical platonism takes at face-value such well known truths as that “there exist” an infinite number of prime numbers, and it provides straightforward explanations of mathematical objectivity and of the differences between mathematical and spatio-temporal entities. Thus arguments for mathematical platonism typically assert that in order for mathematical theories to be true their logical structure must refer to some mathematical entities, that many mathematical theories are indeed objectively true, and that mathematical entities are not constituents of the spatio-temporal realm.

The most common challenge to mathematical platonism argues that mathematical platonism requires an impenetrable metaphysical gap between mathematical entities and human beings. Yet an impenetrable metaphysical gap would make our ability to refer to, have knowledge of, or have justified beliefs concerning mathematical entities completely mysterious. Frege, Quine, and “full-blooded platonism” offer the three most promising responses to this challenge.

Nominalism, logicism, formalism and intuitionism are traditional opponents of mathematical platonism, but these metaphysical theories won’t be discussed in detail in the present article.

Table of Contents

  1. What Is Mathematical Platonism?
    1. What Types of Items Count as Mathematical Ontology?
    2. What Is It to Be an Abstract Object or Structure?
    3. What Is It to Be Independent of All Rational Activities?
  2. Arguments for Platonism
    1. The Fregean Argument for Object Platonism
      1. Frege’s Philosophical Project
      2. Frege’s Argument
    2. The Quine-Putnam Indispensability Argument
  3. Challenges to Platonism
    1. Non-Platonistic Mathematical Existence
    2. The Epistemological and Referential Challenges to Platonism
  4. Full-Blooded Platonism
  5. Supplement: Frege’s Argument for Arithmetic-Object Platonism
  6. Supplement: Realism, Anti-Nominalism, and Metaphysical Constructivism
    1. Realism
    2. Anti-Nominalism
    3. Metaphysical Constructivism
  7. Supplement: The Epistemological Challenge to Platonism
    1. The Motivating Picture Underwriting the Epistemological Challenge
    2. The Fundamental Question: The Core of the Epistemological Challenge
    3. The fundamental Question: Some Further Details
  8. Supplement: The Referential Challenge to Platonism
    1. Introducing the Referential Challenge
    2. Reference and Permutations
    3. Reference and the Löwenheim-Skolem Theorem
  9. References and Further Reading
    1. Suggestions for Further Reading
    2. Other References

1. What Is Mathematical Platonism?

Traditionally, mathematical platonism has referred to a collection of metaphysical accounts of mathematics, where a metaphysical account of mathematics is one that entails theses concerning the existence and fundamental nature of mathematical ontology. In particular, such an account of mathematics is a variety of (mathematical) platonism if and only if it entails some version of the following three Theses:

  1. Existence: Some mathematical ontology exists.
  2. Abstractness: Mathematical ontology is abstract.
  3. Independence: Mathematical ontology is independent of all rational activities, that is, the activities of all rational beings.

In order to understand platonism so conceived, it will be useful to investigate what types of items count as mathematical ontology, what it is to be abstract, and what it is to be independent of all rational activities. Let us address these topics.

a. What Types of Items Count as Mathematical Ontology?

Traditionally, platonists have maintained that the items that are fundamental to mathematical ontology are objects, where an object is, roughly, any item that may fall within the range of the first-order bound variables of an appropriately formalized theory and for which identity conditions can be provided. Section 2 provides an outline of the evolution of this conception of an object. Those readers who are unfamiliar with the terminology “first-order bound variable” can consult Model-Theoretic Conceptions of Logical Consequence. Let us call platonisms that take objects to be the fundamental items of mathematical ontology object platonisms. So, object platonism is the conjunction of three theses: some mathematical objects exist, those mathematical objects are abstract, and those mathematical objects are independent of all rational activities. In the last hundred years or so, object platonisms have been defended by Gottlob Frege [1884, 1893, 1903], Crispin Wright and Bob Hale [Wright 1983], [Hale and Wright 2001], and Neil Tennant [1987, 1997].

Nearly all object platonists recognize that most mathematical objects naturally belong to collections (for example, the real numbers, the sets, the cyclical group of order 20). To borrow terminology from model theory, most mathematical objects are elements of mathematical domains. Consult Model-Theoretic Conceptions of Logical Consequence for details. It is well recognized that the objects in mathematical domains have certain properties and stand in certain relations to one another. These distinctively mathematical properties and relations are also acknowledged by object platonists to be items of mathematical ontology.

More recently, it has become popular to maintain that the items that are fundamental to mathematical ontology are structures rather than objects. Stewart Shapiro [1997, pp. 73-4], a prominent defender of this thesis, offers the following definition of a structure:

I define a system to be a collection of objects with certain relations. … A structure is the abstract form of a system, highlighting the interrelationships among the objects, and ignoring any features of them that do not affect how they relate to other objects in the system.

According to structuralists, mathematics’ subject matter is mathematical structures. Individual mathematical entities (for example, the complex number 1 + 2i) are positions or places in such structures. Controversy exists over precisely what this amounts to. Minimally, there is agreement that the places of structures exhibit a greater dependence on one another than object platonists claim exists between the objects of the mathematical domains to which they are committed. Some structuralists add that the places of structures have only structural properties—properties shared by all systems that exemplify the structure in question—and that the identity of such places is determined by their structural properties. Michael Resnik [1981, p. 530], for example, writes:

In mathematics, I claim, we do not have objects with an “internal” composition arranged in structures, we only have structures. The objects of mathematics, that is, the entities which our mathematical constants and quantifiers denote, are structureless points or positions in structures. As positions in structures, they have no identity or features outside a structure.

An excellent everyday example of a structure is a baseball defense (abstractly construed); such positions as pitcher and shortstop are the places of this structure. Although the pitcher and shortstop of any specific baseball defense (for example, of the Cleveland Indians’ baseball defense during a particular pitch of a particular game) have a complete collection of properties, if one considers these positions as places in the structure “baseball defense,” the same is not true. For example, these places do not have a particular height, weight, or shoe size. Indeed, their only properties would seem to be those that reflect their relations to other places in the structure “baseball defense.”

Although we might label platonisms of the structural variety structure platonisms, they are more commonly labeled ante rem (or sui generis) structuralisms. This label is borrowed from ante rem universals—universals that exist independently of their instances. Consult Universals for a discussion of ante rem universals. Ante rem structures are typically characterized as ante rem universals that, consequently, exist independently of their instances. As such, ante rem structures are abstract, and are typically taken to exist independently of all rational activities.

b. What Is It to Be an Abstract Object or Structure?

There is no straightforward way of addressing what it is to be an abstract object or structure, because “abstract” is a philosophical term of art. Although its primary uses share something in common—they all contrast abstract items (for example, mathematical entities, propositions, type-individuated linguistic characters, pieces of music, novels, etc.) with concrete, most importantly spatio-temporal, items (for example, electrons, planets, particular copies of novels and performances of pieces of music, etc.)—its precise use varies from philosopher to philosopher. Illuminating discussions of these different uses, the nature of the distinction between abstract and concrete, and the difficulties involved in drawing this distinction—for example, whether my center of gravity/mass is abstract or concrete—can be found in [Burgess and Rosen 1997, §I.A.i.a], [Dummett 1981, Chapter 14], [Hale 1987, Chapter 3] and [Lewis 1986, §1.7].

For our purposes, the best account takes abstract to be a cluster concept, that is, a concept whose application is marked by a collection of other concepts, some of which are more important to its application than others. The most important or central member of the cluster associated with abstract is:

1. non-spatio-temporality: the item does not stand to other items in a collection of relations that would make it a constituent of the spatio-temporal realm.

Non-spatio-temporality does not require an item to stand completely outside of the network of spatio-temporal relations. It is possible, for example, for a non-spatio-temporal entity to stand in spatio-temporal relations that are, non-formally, solely temporal relations—consider, for example, type-individuated games of chess, which came into existence at approximately the time at which people started to play chess. Some philosophers maintain that it is possible for non-spatio-temporal objects to stand in some spatio-temporal relations that are, non-formally, solely spatial relations. Centers of gravity/mass are a possible candidate. Yet, the dominant practice in the philosophy of mathematics literature is to take non-spatio-temporal to have an extension that only includes items that fail to stand in all spatio-temporal relations that are, non-formally, solely spatial relations.

Also fairly central to the cluster associated with abstract are, in order of centrality:

2.  acausality: the item neither exerts a strict causal influence over other items nor does any other item causally influence it in the strict sense, where strict causal relations are those that obtain between, and only between, constituents of the spatio-temporal realm—for example, you can kick a football and cause it (in a strict sense) to move, but you can’t kick a number.

3.  eternality: where this could be interpreted as either

3a. omnitemporality: the item exists at all times, or

3b. atemporality: the item exists outside of the network of temporal relations,

4.  changelessness: none of the item’s intrinsic properties change—roughly, an item’s intrinsic properties are those that it has independently of its relationships to other items, and

5. necessary existence: the item could not have failed to exist.

An item is abstract if and only if it has enough of the features in this cluster, where the features had by the item in question must include those that are most central to the cluster.

Differences in the use of “abstract” are best accounted for by observing that different philosophers seek to communicate different constellations of features from this cluster when they apply this term. All philosophers insist that an item have Feature 1 before it may be appropriately labeled “abstract.” Philosophers of mathematics invariably mean to convey that mathematical entities have Feature 2 when they claim that mathematical objects or structures are abstract. Indeed, they typically mean to convey that such objects or structures have either Feature 3a or 3b, and Feature 4. Some philosophers of mathematics also mean to convey that mathematical objects or structures have Feature 5.

For cluster concepts, it is common to call those items that have all, or most, of the features in the cluster paradigm cases of the concept in question. With this terminology in place, the content of the Abstractness Thesis, as intended and interpreted by most philosophers of mathematics, is more precisely conveyed by the Abstractness+ Thesis: the mathematical objects or structures that exist are paradigm cases of abstract entities.

c. What Is It to Be Independent of All Rational Activities?

The most common account of the content of “X is independent of Y” is X would exist even if Y did not. Accordingly, when platonists affirm the Independence Thesis, they affirm that their favored mathematical ontology would exist even if there were no rational activities, where the rational activities in question might be mental or physical.

Typically, the Independence Thesis is meant to convey more than indicated above. The Independence Thesis is typically meant to convey, in addition, that mathematical objects or structures would have the features that they in fact have even if there were no rational activities or if there were quite different rational activities to the ones that there in fact are. We exclude these stronger conditions from the formal characterization of “X is independent of Y,” because there is an interpretation of the neo-Fregean platonists Bob Hale and Crispin Wright that takes them to maintain that mathematical activities determine the ontological structure of a mathematical realm satisfying the Existence, Abstractness, and Independence Theses, that is, mathematical activities determine how such a mathematical realm is structured into objects, properties, and relations. See, for example, [MacBride 2003]. Athough this interpretation of Hale and Wright is controversial, were someone to advocate such a view, he or she would be advocating a variety of platonism.

2. Arguments for Platonism

Without doubt, it is everyday mathematical activities that motivate people to endorse platonism. Those activities are littered with assertions that, when interpreted in a straightforward way, support the Existence Thesis. For example, we are familiar with saying that there exist an infinite number of prime numbers and that there exist exactly two solutions to the equation x2 ­– 5x + 6 = 0. Moreover, it is an axiom of standard set theories that the empty set exists.

It takes only a little consideration to realize that, if mathematical objects or structures do exist, they are unlikely to be constituents of the spatio-temporal realm. For example, where in the spatio-temporal realm might one locate the empty set, or even the number four—as opposed to collections with four elements? How much does the empty set or the real number p weigh? There appear to be no good answers to these questions. Indeed, to even ask them appears to be to engage in a category mistake. This suggests that the core content of the Abstractness Thesis–that mathematical objects or structures are not constituents of the spatio-temporal realm–is correct.

The standard route to the acceptance of the Independence Thesis utilizes the objectivity of mathematics. It is difficult to deny that “there exist infinitely many prime numbers” and “2 + 2 = 4” are objective truths. Platonists argue—or, more frequently, simply assume—that the best explanation of this objectivity is that mathematical theories have a subject matter that is quite independent of rational beings and their activities. The Independence Thesis is a standard way of articulating the relevant type of independence.

So, it is easy to establish the prima facie plausibility of platonism. Yet it took the genius of Gottlob Frege [1884] to transparently and systematically bring together considerations of this type in favor of platonism’s plausibility. In the very same manuscript, Frege also articulated the most influential argument for platonism. Let us examine this argument.

a. The Fregean Argument for Object Platonism

i. Frege’s Philosophical Project

Frege’s argument for platonism [1884, 1893, 1903] was offered in conjunction with his defense of arithmetic logicism—roughly, the thesis that all arithmetic truths are derivable from general logical laws and definitions. In order to carry out a defense of arithmetic logicism, Frege developed his Begriffsschift [1879]—a formal language designed to be an ideal tool for representing the logical structure of what Frege called thoughts. Contemporary philosophers would call them “propositions,” and they are what Frege took to be the primary bearers of truth. The technical details of Frege’s begriffsschift need not concern us; the interested reader can consult the articles on Gottlob Frege and Frege and Language. We need only note that Frege took the logical structure of thoughts to be modeled on the mathematical distinction between a function and an argument.

On the basis of this function-argument understanding of logical structure, Frege incorporated two categories of linguistic expression into his begriffsschift: those that are saturated and those that are not. In contemporary parlance, we call the former singular terms (or proper names in a broad sense) and the latter predicates or quantifier expressions, depending on the types of linguistic expressions that may saturate them. For Frege, the distinction between these two categories of linguistic expression directly reflected a metaphysical distinction within thoughts, which he took to have saturated and unsaturated components. He labeled the saturated components of thoughts “objects” and the unsaturated components “concepts.” In so doing, Frege took himself to be making precise the notions of object and concept already embedded in the inferential structure of natural languages.

ii. Frege’s Argument

Formulated succinctly, Frege’s argument for arithmetic-object platonism proceeds as follows:

i. Singular terms referring to natural numbers appear in true simple statements.

ii. It is possible for simple statements with singular terms as components to be true only if the objects to which those singular terms refer exist.


iii. the natural numbers exist.

iv. If the natural numbers exist, they are abstract objects that are independent of all rational activities.


v. the natural numbers are existent abstract objects that are independent of all rational activities, that is, arithmetic-object platonism is true.

In order to more fully understand Frege’s argument, let us make four observations: (a) Frege took natural numbers to be objects, because natural number terms are singular terms, (b) Frege took natural numbers to exist because singular terms referring to them appear in true simple statements—in particular, true identity statements, (c) Frege took natural numbers to be independent of all rational activities, because some thoughts containing them are objective, and (d) Frege took natural numbers to be abstract because they are neither mental nor physical. Observations (a) and (b) are important because they are the heart of Frege’s argument for the Existence Thesis, which, at least if one judges by the proportion of his Grundlagen [1884] that was devoted to establishing it, was of central concern to Frege. Observations (c) and (d) are important because they identify the mechanisms that Frege used to defend the Abstractness and Independence Theses. For further details, consult [Frege 1884, §26 and §61].

Frege’s argument for the thesis that some simple numerical identities are objectively true relies heavily on the fact that such identities allow for the application of natural numbers in representing and reasoning about reality, especially the non-mathematical parts of reality. It is applicability in this sense that Frege took to be the primary reason for judging arithmetic to be a body of objective truths rather than a mere game involving the manipulation of symbols. The interested reader should consult [Frege 1903, §91]. A more detailed formulation of Frege’s argument for arithmetic-object platonism, which incorporates the above observations, can be found below in section 5.

The central core of Frege’s argument for arithmetic-object platonism continues to be taken to be plausible, if not correct, by most contemporary philosophers. Yet its reliance on the category “singular term” presents a problem for extending it to a general argument for object platonism. The difficulty with relying on this category can be recognized once one considers extending Frege’s argument to cover mathematical domains that have more members than do the natural numbers (for example, the real numbers, complex numbers, or sets). Although there is a sense in which many natural languages do contain singular terms that refer to all natural numbers—such natural languages embed a procedure for generating a singular term to refer to any given natural number—the same cannot be said for real numbers, complex numbers, and sets. The sheer size of these domains excludes the possibility that there could be a natural language that includes a singular term for each of their members. There are an uncountable number of members in each such domain. Yet no language with an uncountable number of singular terms could plausibly be taken to be a natural language, at least not if what one means by a natural language is a language that could be spoken by rational beings with the same kinds of cognitive capacities that human beings have.

So, if Frege’s argument, or something like it, is to be used to establish a more wide ranging object platonism, then that argument is either going to have to exploit some category other than singular term or it is going to have to invoke this category differently than how Frege did. Some neo-Fregean platonists such as [Hale and Wright 2001] adopt the second strategy. Central to their approach is the category of possible singular term. [MacBride 2003] contains an excellent summary of their strategy. Yet the more widely adopted strategy has been to give up on singular terms all together and instead take objects to be those items that may fall within the range of first-order bound variables and for which identity conditions can be provided. Much of the impetus for this more popular strategy came from Willard Van Orman Quine. See [1948] for a discussion of the primary clause and [1981, p. 102] for a discussion of the secondary clause. It is worth noting, however, that a similar constraint to the secondary clause can be found in Frege’s writings. See discussions of the so-called Caesar problem in, for example, [Hale and Wright 2001, Chapter 14] and [MacBride 2005, 2006].

b. The Quine-Putnam Indispensability Argument

Consideration of the Quinean strategy of taking objects to be those items that may fall within the range of first-order bound variables naturally leads us to a contemporary version of Frege’s argument for the Existence Thesis. This Quine-Putnam indispensability argument (QPIA) can be found scattered throughout Quine’s corpus. See, for example, [1951, 1963, 1981]. Yet nowhere is it developed in systematic detail. Indeed, the argument is given its first methodical treatment in Hilary Putnam’s Philosophy of Logic [1971]. To date, the most extensive sympathetic development of the QPIA is provided by Mark Colyvan [2001]. Those interested in a shorter sympathetic development of this argument should read [Resnik 2005].

The core of the QPIA is the following:

i. We should acknowledge the existence of—or, as Quine and Putnam would prefer to put it, be ontologically committed to—all those entities that are indispensable to our best scientific theories.

ii. Mathematical objects or structures are indispensable to our best scientific theories.


iii. We should acknowledge the existence of—be ontologically committed to—mathematical objects or structures.

Note that this argument’s conclusion is akin to the Existence Thesis. Thus, to use it as an argument for platonism, one needs to combine it with considerations that establish the Abstractness and Independence Theses.

So, what is it for a particular, perhaps single-membered, collection of entities to be indispensable to a given scientific theory? Roughly, it is for those entities to be ineliminable from the theory in question without significantly detracting from the scientific attractiveness of that theory. This characterization of indispensability suffices for noting that, prima facie, mathematical theories are indispensable to many scientific theories, for, prima facie, it is impossible to formulate many such theories—never mind formulate those theories in a scientifically attractive way—without using mathematics.

However, indispensability thesis has been challenged. The most influential challenge was made by Hartry Field [1980]. Informative discussions of the literature relating to this challenge can be found in [Colyvan 2001, Chapter 4] and [Balaguer 1998, Chapter 6].

In order to provide a more precise characterization of indispensability, we will need to investigate the doctrines that Quine and Putnam use to motivate and justify the first premise of the QPIA: naturalism and confirmational holism. Naturalism is the abandonment of the goal of developing a first philosophy. According to naturalism, science is an inquiry into reality that, while fallible and corrigible, is not answerable to any supra-scientific tribunal. Thus, naturalism is the recognition that it is within science itself, and not in some prior philosophy, that reality is to be identified and described. Confirmational holism is the doctrine that theories are confirmed or infirmed as wholes, for, as Quine observes, it is not the case that “each statement, taken in isolation from its fellows, can admit of confirmation or infirmation …, statements … face the tribunal of sense experience not individually but only as a corporate body” [1951, p. 38].

It is easy to see the relationship between naturalism, confirmation holism, and the first premise of the QPIA. Suppose a collection of entities is indispensable to one of our best scientific theories. Then, by confirmational holism, whatever support we have for the truth of that scientific theory is support for the truth of the part of that theory to which the collection of entities in question is indispensable. Further, by naturalism, that part of the theory serves as a guide to reality. Consequently, should the truth of that part of the theory commit us to the existence of the collection of entities in question, we should indeed be committed to the existence of those entities, that is, we should be ontologically committed to those entities.

In light of this, what is needed is a mechanism for assessing whether the truth of some theory or part of some theory commits us to the existence of a particular collection of entities. In response to this need, Quine offers his criterion of ontological commitment: theories, as collections of sentences, are committed to those entities over which the first-order bound variables of the sentences contained within them must range in order for those sentences to be true.

Although Quine’s criterion is relatively simple, it is important that one appropriately grasp its application. One cannot simply read ontological commitments from the surface grammar of ordinary language. For, as Quine [1981, p. 9] explains,

[T]he common man’s ontology is vague and untidy … a fenced ontology is just not implicit in ordinary language. The idea of a boundary between being and nonbeing is a philosophical idea, an idea of technical science in the broad sense.

Rather, what is required is that one first regiment the language in question, that is, cast that language in what Quine calls “canonical notation.” Thus,

[W]e can draw explicit ontological lines when desired. We can regiment our notation. … Then it is that we can say the objects assumed are the values of the variables. … Various turns of phrase in ordinary language that seem to invoke novel sorts of objects may disappear under such regimentation. At other points new ontic commitments may emerge. There is room for choice, and one chooses with a view to simplicity in one’s overall system of the world. [Quine 1981, pp. 9-10]

To illustrate, the everyday sentence “I saw a possible job for you” would appear to be ontologically committed to possible jobs. Yet this commitment is seen to be spurious once one appropriately regiments this sentence as “I saw a job advertised that might be suitable for you.”

We now have all of the components needed to understand what it is for a particular collection of entities to be indispensable to a scientific theory. A collection of entities is indispensable to a scientific theory if and only if, when that theory is optimally formulated in canonical notation, the entities in question fall within the range of the first-order bound variables of that theory. Here, optimality of formulation should be assessed by the standards that govern the formulation of scientific theories in general (for example, simplicity, fruitfulness, conservativeness, and so forth).

Now that we understand indispensability, it is worth noting the similarity between the QPIA and Frege’s argument for the Existence Thesis. We observed above that Frege’s argument has two key components: recognition of the applicability of numbers in representing and reasoning about the world as support for the contention that arithmetic statements are true, and a logico-inferential analysis of arithmetic statements that identified natural number terms as singular terms. The QPIA encapsulates directly parallel features: ineliminable applicability to our best scientific theories (that is, indispensability) and Quine’s criterion of ontological commitment. While the language and framework of the QPIA are different from those of Frege’s argument, these arguments are, at their core, identical.

One important difference between these arguments is worth noting, however. Frege’s argument is for the existence of objects; his analysis of natural languages only allows for the categories “object” and “concept.” Quine’s criterion of ontological commitment recommends commitment to any entity that falls within the range of the first-order bound variables of any theory that one endorses. While all such entities might be objects, some might be positions or places in structures. As such, the QPIA can be used to defend ante rem structuralism.

3. Challenges to Platonism

a. Non-Platonistic Mathematical Existence

Since the late twentieth century, an increasing number of philosophers of mathematics in the platonic tradition have followed the practice of labeling their accounts of mathematics as “realist” or “realism” rather than “platonist” or “platonism.” Roughly, these philosophers take an account of mathematics to be a variety of (mathematical) realism if and only if it entails three theses: some mathematical ontology exists, that mathematical ontology has objective features, and that mathematical ontology is, contains, or provides the semantic values of the components of mathematical theories. Typically, contemporary platonists endorse all three theses, yet there are realists who are not platonists. Normally, this is because these individuals do not endorse the Abstractness Thesis. In addition to non-platonist realists, there are also philosophers of mathematics who accept the Existence Thesis but reject the Independence Thesis. Section 6 below discusses accounts of mathematics that endorse the Existence Thesis, or something very similar, yet reject either the Abstractness Thesis or the Independence Thesis.

b. The Epistemological and Referential Challenges to Platonism

Let us consider the two most common challenges to platonism: the epistemological challenge and the referential challenge. Sections 7 and 8 below contain more detailed, systematic discussions of these challenges.

Proponents of these challenges take endorsement of the Existence, Abstractness and Independence Theses to amount to endorsement of a particular metaphysical account of the relationship between the spatio-temporal and mathematical realms. Specifically, according to this account, there is an impenetrable metaphysical gap between these realms. This gap is constituted by a lack of causal interaction between these realms, which, in turn, is a consequence of mathematical entities being abstract (see [Burgess and Rosen 1997, §I.A.2.a]). Proponents of the epistemological challenge observe that, prima facie, such an impenetrable metaphysical gap would make human beings’ ability to form justified mathematical beliefs and obtain mathematical knowledge completely mysterious. Proponents of the referential challenge, on the other hand, observe that, prima facie, such an impenetrable metaphysical gap would make human beings’ ability to refer to mathematical entities completely mysterious. It is natural to suppose that human beings do have justified mathematical beliefs and mathematical knowledge, for example, that 2 + 2 = 4, and do refer to mathematical entities, for example, when we assert “2 is a prime number.” Moreover, it is natural to suppose that the obtaining of these facts is not completely mysterious. The epistemological and referential challenges are challenges to show that the truth of platonism is compatible with the unmysterious obtaining of these facts.

This raises two questions. Why do proponents of the epistemological challenge maintain that an impenetrable metaphysical gap between the mathematical and spatio-temporal realms would make human beings’ ability to form justified mathematical beliefs and obtain mathematical knowledge completely mysterious? (For readability, we shall drop the qualifier “prima facie” in the remainder of this discussion.) And, why do proponents of the referential challenge insist that such an impenetrable metaphysical gap would make human beings’ ability to refer to mathematical entities completely mysterious?

To answer the first question, consider an imaginary scenario. You are in London, England while the State of the Union address is being given. You are particularly interested in what the U.S. President has to say in this address. So, you look for a place where you can watch the address on television. Unfortunately, the State of the Union address is only being televised on a specialized channel that nobody seems to be watching. You ask a Londoner where you might go to watch the address. She responds, “I’m not sure, but if you stay here with me, I’ll let you know word for word what the President says as he says it.”  You look at her confused. You can find no evidence of devices in the vicinity (for example, television sets, mobile phones, or computers) that could explain her ability to do what she claims she will be able to. You respond, “I don’t see any TVs, radios, computers, or the like. How are you going to know what the President is saying?”

That such a response to this Londoner’s claim would be appropriate is obvious. Further, its aptness supports the contention that you can only legitimately claim knowledge of, or justified beliefs concerning, a complex state of affairs if there is some explanation available for the existence of the type of relationship that would need to exist between you and the complex state of affairs in question in order for you to have the said knowledge or justified beliefs. Indeed, it suggests something further: the only kind of acceptable explanation available for knowledge of, or justified beliefs concerning, a complex state of affairs is one that appeals directly or indirectly to a causal connection between the knower or justified believer and the complex state of affairs in question. You questioned the Londoner precisely because you could see no devices that could put her in causal contact with the President, and the only kind of explanation that you could imagine for her having the knowledge (or justified beliefs) that she was claiming she would have would involve her being in this type of contact with the President.

An impenetrable metaphysical gap between the mathematical and spatio-temporal realms of the type that proponents of the epistemological challenge insist exists if platonism is true would exclude the possibility of causal interaction between human beings, who are inhabitants of the spatio-temporal realm, and mathematical entities, which are inhabitants of the mathematical realm. Consequently, such a gap would exclude the possibility of there being an appropriate explanation of human beings having justified mathematical beliefs and mathematical knowledge. So, the truth of platonism, as conceived by proponents of the epistemological challenge, would make all instances of human beings having justified mathematical beliefs or mathematical knowledge completely mysterious.

Next, consider why proponents of the referential challenge maintain that an impenetrable metaphysical gap between the spatio-temporal and mathematical realms would make human beings’ ability to refer to mathematical entities completely mysterious. Once again, this can be seen by considering an imaginary scenario. Imagine that you meet someone for the first time and realize that you went to the same university at around the same time years ago. You begin to reminisce about your university experiences, and she tells you a story about John Smith, an old friend of hers who was a philosophy major, but who now teaches at a small liberal arts college in Ohio, was married about 6 years ago to a woman named Mary, and has three children. You, too, were friends with a John Smith when you were at the University. You recall that he was a philosophy major, intended to go to graduate school, and that a year or so ago a mutual friend told you that he is now married to a woman named Mary and has three children. You incorrectly draw the conclusion that you shared a friend with this woman while at the University. As a matter of fact, there were two John Smiths who were philosophy majors at the appropriate time, and these individuals’ lives have shared similar paths. You were friends with one of these individuals, John Smith1, while she was friends with the other, John Smith2.

Your new acquaintance proceeds to inform you that John and Mary Smith got divorced recently. You form a false belief about your old friend and his wife. What makes her statement and corresponding belief true is that, in it, “John Smith” refers to John Smith2, “Mary Smith” refers to Mary Smith2, John Smith2’s former wife, and John Smith2 and Mary Smith2 stand to a recent time in the triadic relation “x got divorced from y at time t.” Your belief is false, however, because, in it, “John Smith” refers to John Smith1, “Mary Smith” refers to Mary Smith1, John Smith1’s wife, and John Smith1 and Mary Smith1 fail to stand to a recent time in the triadic relation “x got divorced from y at time t.”

Now, consider why John Smith1 and Mary Smith1 are the referents of your use of “John and Mary Smith” while John Smith2 and Mary Smith2 are the referents of your new acquaintance’s use of this phrase. It is because she causally interacted with John Smith2 while at the University, while you causally interacted with John Smith1. In other words, your respective causal interactions are responsible for your respective uses of the phrase “John and Mary Smith” having different referents.

Reflecting on this case, you might conclude that there must be a specific type of causal relationship between a person and an item if that person is to determinately refer to that item. For example, this case might convince you that, in order for you to use the singular term “two” to refer to the number two, there would need to be a causal relationship between you and the number two. Of course, an impenetrable metaphysical gap between the spatio-temporal realm and the mathematical realm would make such a causal relationship impossible. Consequently, such an impenetrable metaphysical gap would make human beings’ ability to refer to mathematical entities completely mysterious.

4. Full-Blooded Platonism

Of the many responses to the epistemological and referential challenges, the three most promising are (i) Frege’s, as developed in the contemporary neo-Fregean literature, (ii) Quine’s, as developed by defenders of the QPIA, and (iii) a response that is commonly referred to as full-blooded or plenitudinous platonism (FBP). This third response has been most fully articulated by Mark Balaguer [1998] and Stewart Shapiro [1997].

The fundamental idea behind FBP is that it is possible for human beings to have systematically and non-accidentally true beliefs about a platonic mathematical realm—a mathematical realm satisfying the Existence, Abstractness, and Independence Theses—without that realm in any way influencing us or us influencing it. This, in turn, is supposed to be made possible by FBP combining two theses: (a) Schematic Reference: the reference relation between mathematical theories and the mathematical realm is purely schematic, or at least close to purely schematic and (b) Plenitude: the mathematical realm is VERY large. It contains entities that are related to one another in all of the possible ways that entities can be related to one another.

What it is for a reference relation to be purely schematic will be explored later. For now, these theses are best understood in light of FBP’s account of mathematical truth, which, intuitively, relies on two further Theses: (1) Mathematical theories embed collections of constraints on what the ontological structure of a given “part” of the mathematical realm must be in order for the said part to be an appropriate truth-maker for the theory in question. (2) The existence of any such appropriate part of the mathematical realm is sufficient to make the said theory true of that part of that realm. For example, it is well-known that arithmetic characterizes an ω-sequence, a countable-infinite collection of objects that has a distinguished initial object and a successor relation that satisfies the induction principle. Thus, illustrating Thesis 1, any part of the mathematical realm that serves as an appropriate truth-maker for arithmetic must be an ω-sequence. Intuitively, one might think that not just any ω-sequence will do, rather one needs a very specific ω-sequence, that is, the natural numbers. Yet, proponents of FBP deny this intuition. According to them, illustrating Thesis 2, any ω-sequence is an appropriate truth-maker for arithmetic; arithmetic is a body of truths that concerns any ω-sequence in the mathematical realm.

Those familiar with the model theoretic notion of “truth in a model” will recognize the similarities between it and FBP’s conception of truth. (Those who are not can consult Model-Theoretic Conceptions Logical Consequence, where “truth in a model” is called “truth in a structure.”) These similarities are not accidental; FBP’s conception of truth is intentionally modeled on this model-theoretic notion. The outstanding feature of model-theoretic consequence is that, in constructing a model for evaluating a semantic sequent (a formal argument), one doesn’t care which specific objects one takes as the domain of discourse of that model, which specific objects or collections of objects one takes as the extension of any predicates that appear in the sequent, or which specific objects one takes as the referents of any singular terms that appear in the sequent. All that matters is that those choices meet the constraints placed on them by the sequent in question. So, for example, if you want to construct a model to show that ‘Fa & Ga’ does not follow from ‘Fa’ and ‘Gb’, you could take the domain of your model to be the set of natural numbers, assign extensions to the two predicates by requiring Ext(F) = {x: x is even} and Ext(G) = {x: x is odd}, and assign denotations Ref(a) = 2, and Ref(b) = 3. Alternatively, you could take the domain of your model to be {Hillary Clinton, Bill Clinton}, Ext(F) = {Hillary Clinton}, Ext(G) = {Bill Clinton}, Ref(a) = Hillary Clinton, and Ref(b) = Bill Clinton. A reference relation is schematic if and only if, when employing it, there is the same type of freedom concerning which items are the referents of quantifiers, predicates, and singular terms as there is when constructing a model. In model theory, the reference relation is purely schematic. This reference relation is employed largely as-is in Shapiro’s structuralist version of FBP, whereas Balaguer’s version of FBP places a few more constraints on this reference relation. Yet neither Shapiro’s nor Balaguer’s constraints undermine the schematic nature of the reference relation they employ in characterizing their respective FBPs.

By endorsing Thesis 2, proponents of FBP endorse the Schematic Reference Thesis. Moreover, Thesis 2 and the Schematic Reference Thesis distinguish the requirements on mathematical reference (and, consequently, truth) from the requirements on reference to (and, consequently, truth concerning) spatio-temporal entities. As illustrated in section 3 above, the logico-inferential components of beliefs and statements about spatio-temporal entities have specific, unique spatio-temporal entities or collections of spatio-temporal entities as their referents. Thus, the reference relationship between spatio-temporal entities and spatio-temporal beliefs and statements is non-schematic.

FBP’s conception of reference appears to provide it with the resources to undermine the legitimacy of the referential challenge. According to proponents of FBP, in offering their challenge, proponents of the referential challenge illegitimately generalized a feature of the reference relationship between spatio-temporal beliefs and statements, and spatio-temporal entities, that is, its non-schematic character.

So, the Schematic Reference Thesis is at the heart of FBP’s response to the referential challenge. By contrast, the Plenitude Thesis is at the heart of FBP’s response to the epistemological challenge. To see this, consider an arbitrary mathematical theory that places an obtainable collection of constraints on any truth-maker for that theory. If the Plenitude Thesis is true, we can be assured that there is a part of the mathematical realm that will serve as an appropriate truth-maker for this theory because the truth of the Plenitude Thesis amounts to the mathematical realm containing some part that is ontologically structured in precisely the way required by the constraints embedded in the particular mathematical theory in question. So, the Plenitude Thesis ensures that there will be some part of the mathematical realm that will serve as an appropriate truth-maker for any mathematical theory that places an obtainable collection of constraints on its truth-maker(s). Balaguer uses the term “consistent” to pick out those mathematical theories that place obtainable constraints on their truth-maker(s). However, what Balaguer means by this is not, or at least should not be, deductively consistent. The appropriate notion is closer to Shapiro’s [1997] notion of coherent, which is a primitive modeled on set-theoretic satisfiability. Yet, however one states the above truth, it has direct consequences for the epistemological challenge. As Balaguer [1998, pp. 48–9] explains:

If FBP is correct, then all consistent purely mathematical theories truly describe some collection of abstract mathematical objects. Thus, to acquire knowledge of mathematical objects, all we need to do is acquire knowledge that some purely mathematical theory is consistent [.…] But knowledge of the consistency of a mathematical theory … does not require any sort of contact with, or access to, the objects that the theory is about. Thus, the [epistemological challenge has] been answered: We can acquire knowledge of abstract mathematical objects without the aid of any sort of contact with such objects.

5. Supplement: Frege’s Argument for Arithmetic-Object Platonism

Frege’s argument for arithmetic-object platonism proceeds in the following way:

i. The primary logico-inferential role of natural number terms (for example, “one” and “seven”) is reflected in numerical identity statements such as “The number of states in the United States of America is fifty.”

ii. The linguistic expressions on each side of identity statements are singular terms.

Therefore, from (i) and (ii),

iii. In their primary logico-inferential role, natural number terms are singular terms.

Therefore, from (iii) and from Frege’s logico-inferential analysis of the category “object,”

iv. the items referred to by natural number terms (that is, the natural numbers) are members of the logico-inferential category object.

v. Many numerical identity statements (for example, the one mentioned in (i) are true.

vi. An identity statement can be true only if the object referred to by the singular terms on either side of that identity statement exists.

Therefore, from (v) and (vi),

vii. the objects to which natural number terms refer (that is, the natural numbers) exist.

viii. Many arithmetic identities are objective.

ix. The existent components of objective thoughts are independent of all rational activities.

Therefore, from (viii) and (ix),

x. the natural numbers are independent of all rational activities.

xi. Thoughts with mental objects as components are not objective.

Therefore, from (viii) and (xi),

xii. the natural numbers are not mental objects.

xiii. The left hand sides of numerical identity statements of the form given in (i) show that natural numbers are associated with concepts in a specific way.

xiv. No physical objects are associated with concepts in the way that natural numbers are.

Therefore, from (xiii) and (xiv),

xv. The natural numbers are not physical objects.

xvi. Objects that are neither mental nor physical are abstract.

Therefore, from (xi), (xv), and (xvi),

xvii. the natural numbers are abstract objects.

Therefore, from (vii), (x), and (xvii),

xviii. arithmetic object platonism is true.

Return to section 2 where this section is references.

6. Supplement: Realism, Anti-Nominalism, and Metaphysical Constructivism

a. Realism

Since the late twentieth century, an increasing number of philosophers of mathematics who endorse the Existence Thesis, or something very similar, have followed the practice of labeling their accounts of mathematics “realist” or “realism” rather than “platonist” or “platonism,” where, roughly, an account of mathematics is a variety of (mathematical) realism if and only if it entails three theses: some mathematical ontology exists, that mathematical ontology has objective features, and that mathematical ontology is, contains, or provides the semantic values of the logico-inferential components of mathematical theories. The influences that motivated individual philosophers to adopt this practice are diverse. In the broadest of terms, however, this practice is the result of the dominance of certain strands of analytic philosophy in the philosophy of mathematics.

In order to see how one important strand contributed to the practice of labeling accounts of mathematics “realist” rather than “platonist,” let us explore Quinean frameworks. These are frameworks that embed the doctrines of naturalism and confirmational holism in a little more detail. Two features of such frameworks warrant particular mention.

First, within Quinean frameworks, mathematical knowledge is on a par with empirical knowledge; both mathematical statements and statements about the spatio-temporal realm are confirmed and infirmed by empirical investigation. As such, within Quinean frameworks, neither type of statement is knowable a priori, at least in the traditional sense. Yet nearly all prominent Western thinkers have considered mathematical truths to be knowable a priori. Indeed, according to standard histories of Western thought, this way of thinking about mathematical knowledge dates back at least as far as Plato. So, to reject it is to reject something fundamental to Plato’s thoughts about mathematics. Consequently, accounts of mathematics offered within Quinean frameworks almost invariably reject something fundamental to Plato’s thoughts about mathematics. In light of this, and the historical connotations of the label “platonism,” it is not difficult to see why one might want to use an alternate label for such accounts that accept the Existence Thesis (or something very similar).

The second feature of Quinean frameworks that warrants particular mention in regard to the practice of using “realism” rather than “platonism” to label accounts of mathematics is that, within such frameworks, mathematical entities are typically treated and thought about in the same way as the theoretical entities of non-mathematical natural science. In some Quinean frameworks, mathematical entities are simply taken to be theoretical entities. This has led some to worry about other traditional theses concerning mathematics. For example, mathematical entities have traditionally been considered necessary existents, and mathematical truths have been considered to be necessary, while the constituents of the spatio-temporal realm—among them, theoretical entities such as electrons—have been considered to be contingent existents, and truths concerning them have been considered to be contingent. Mark Colyvan [2001] uses his discussion of the QPIA—in particular, the abovementioned similarities between mathematical and theoretical entities—to motivate skepticism about the necessity of mathematical truths and the necessary existence of mathematical entities. Michael Resnik [1997] goes one step further and argues that, within his Quinean framework, the distinction between the abstract and the concrete cannot be drawn in a meaningful way. Of course, if this distinction cannot be drawn in a meaningful way, one cannot legitimately espouse the Abstractness Thesis. Once again, it looks as though we have good reasons for not using the label “platonism” for the kinds of accounts of mathematics offered within Quinean frameworks that accept the Existence Thesis (or something very similar).

b. Anti-Nominalism

Most of the Quinean considerations relevant to the practice of labeling metaphysical accounts of mathematics “realist” rather than “platonist” center on problems with the Abstractness Thesis. In particular, those who purposefully characterize themselves as realists rather than platonists frequently want to deny some important feature or features in the cluster associated with abstract. Frequently, such individuals do not question the Independence Thesis. John Burgess’ qualms about metaphysical accounts of mathematics are broader than this. He takes the primary lesson of Quine’s naturalism to be that investigations into “the ultimate nature of reality” are misguided, for we cannot reach the “God’s eye perspective” that they assume. The only perspective that we (as finite beings situated in the spatio-temporal world, using the best methods available to us, that is, the methods of common sense supplemented by scientific investigation) can obtain is a fallible, limited one that has little to offer concerning the ultimate nature of reality.

Burgess takes it to be clear that both pre-theoretic common sense and science are ontologically committed to mathematical entities. He argues that those who deny this, that is, nominalists, do so because they misguidedly believe that we can obtain a God’s eye perspective and have knowledge concerning the ultimate nature of reality. In a series of manuscripts responding to nominalists—see, for example, [Burgess 1983, 2004] and [Burgess and Rosen 1997, 2005]—Burgess has defended anti-nominalism. Anti-nominalism is, simply, the rejection of nominalism. As such, anti-nominalists endorse ontological commitment to mathematical entities, but refuse to engage in speculation about the metaphysical nature of mathematical entities that goes beyond what can be supported by common sense and science. Burgess is explicit that neither common sense nor science provide support for endorsing the Abstractness Thesis when understood as a thesis about the ultimate nature of reality. Further, given that, at least on one construal, the Independence Thesis is just as much a thesis about the ultimate nature of reality as is the Abstractness Thesis, we may assume that Burgess and his fellow anti-nominalists will be unhappy about endorsing it. Anti-nominalism, then, is another account of mathematics that accepts the Existence Thesis (or something very similar), but which cannot be appropriately labeled “platonism.”

c. Metaphysical Constructivism

The final collection of metaphysical accounts of mathematics worth mentioning because of their relationship to, but distinctness from, platonism are those that accept the Existence Thesis—and, in some cases, the Abstractness Thesis—but reject the Independence Thesis. At least three classes of accounts fall into this category. The first accounts are those that take mathematical entities to be constructed mental entities. At some points in his corpus, Alfred Heyting suggests that he takes mathematical entities to have this nature—see, for example, [Heyting 1931]. The second accounts are those that take mathematical entities to be the products of mental or linguistic human activities. Some passages in Paul Ernest’s Social Constructivism ss a Philosophy of Mathematics [1998] suggest that he holds this view of mathematical entities. The third accounts are those that take mathematical entities to be social-institutional entities like the United States Supreme Court or Greenpeace. Rueben Hersh [1997] and Julian Cole [2008, 2009] endorse this type of social-institutional account of mathematics. Although all of these accounts are related to platonism in that they take mathematical entities to exist or they endorse ontological commitment to mathematical entities, none can be appropriately labeled “platonism.”

Return to section 3 where this section is referenced.

7. Supplement: The Epistemological Challenge to Platonism

Contemporary versions of the epistemological challenge ,sometimes under the label “the epistemological argument against platonism,” can typically be traced back to Paul Benacerraf’s paper “Mathematical Truth” [1973]. In fairness to Frege, however, it should be noted that human beings’ epistemic access to the kind of mathematical realm that platonists take to exist was a central concern in his work. Benacerraf’s paper has inspired much discussion. An overview of which appears in [Balaguer 1998, Chapter 2]. Interestingly, very little of this extensive literature has served to develop the challenge itself in any great detail. Probably the most detailed articulation of some version of the challenge itself can be found in two papers collected in [Field 1989]. The presentation of the challenge provided here is inspired by Hartry Field’s formulation, yet is a little more detailed than his formulation.

The epistemological challenge begins with the observation that an important motivation for platonism is the widely held belief that human beings have mathematical knowledge. One might maintain that it is precisely because we take human beings to have mathematical knowledge that we take mathematical theories to be true. In turn, their truth motivates platonists to take their apparent ontological commitments seriously. Consequently, while all metaphysical accounts of mathematics need to address the prima facie phenomenon of human mathematical knowledge, this task is particularly pressing for platonist accounts, for a failure to account for human beings’ ability to have mathematical knowledge would significantly diminish the attractiveness of any such account. Yet it is precisely this that (typical) proponents of the epistemological challenge doubt the platonists’ ability to account for human beings having mathematical knowledge.

a. The Motivating Picture Underwriting the Epistemological Challenge

In order to understand the doubts of proponents of the epistemological challenge, one must first understand the conception or picture of platonism that motivates them. Note that, in virtue of their endorsement of the Existence, Abstractness, and Independence Theses, platonists take the mathematical realm to be quite distinct from the spatio-temporal realm. The doubts underwriting the epistemological challenge derive their impetus from a particular picture of the metaphysical relationship between these distinct realms.  According to this picture, there is an impenetrable metaphysical gap between the mathematical and spatio-temporal realms. This gap is constituted by the lack of causal interaction between these two realms, which, in turn, is a consequence of mathematical entities being abstract—see [Burgess and Rosen 1997, §I.A.2.a] for further details. Moreover, according to this picture, the metaphysical gap between the mathematical and spatio-temporal realms ensures that features of the mathematical realm are independent of features of the spatio-temporal realm. That is, features of the spatio-temporal realm do not in any way influence or determine features of the mathematical realm and vice versa. At the same time, the gap between the mathematical and spatio-temporal realms is more than merely an interactive gap; it is also a gap relating to the types of properties characteristic of the constituents of these two realms. Platonists take mathematical entities to be not only acausal but also non-spatio-temporal, eternal, changeless, and (frequently) necessary existents. Typically, constituents of the spatio-temporal world lack all of these properties.

It is far from clear that the understanding of the metaphysical relationship between the mathematical and spatio-temporal realms outlined in the previous paragraph is shared by self-proclaimed platonists. Yet this conception of that relationship is the one that proponents of the epistemological challenge ascribe to platonists. For the purposes of our discussion of this challenge, let us put to one side all concerns about the legitimacy of this conception of platonism, which, from now on, we shall simply call the motivating picture. The remainder of this section assumes that the motivating picture provides an appropriate conception of platonism and it labels as “platonic” the constituents of realms that are metaphysically isolated from and wholly different from the spatio-temporal realm in the way that the mathematical realm is depicted to be by the motivating picture.

b. The Fundamental Question: The Core of the Epistemological Challenge

Let us make some observations relevant to the doubts that underwrite the epistemological challenge. First, according to the motivating picture, the mathematical realm is that to which pure mathematical beliefs and statements are responsible for their truth or falsity. Such beliefs are about this realm and so are true when, and only when, they are appropriately related to this realm. Second, according to all plausible contemporary accounts of human beings, human beliefs in general, and, hence, human mathematical beliefs in particular, are instantiated in human brains, which are constituents of the spatio-temporal realm. Third, it has been widely acknowledged since ancient times that beliefs or statements that are true purely by accident do not constitute knowledge. Thus, in order for a mathematical belief or statement to be an instance of mathematical knowledge, it must be more than simply true; it must be non-accidentally true.

Let us take a mathematical theory to be a non-trivial, systematic collection of mathematical beliefs. Informally, it is the collection of mathematical beliefs endorsed by that theory. In light of the above observations, in order for a mathematical theory to embed mathematical knowledge, there must be something systematic about the way in which the beliefs in that theory are non-accidentally true.

Thus, according to the motivating picture, in order for a mathematical theory to embed mathematical knowledge, a distinctive, non-accidental and systematic relationship must obtain between two distinct and metaphysically isolated realms. That relationship is that the mathematical realm must make true, in a non-accidental and systematic way, the mathematical beliefs endorsed by the theory in question, which are instantiated in the spatio-temporal realm.

In response to this observation, it is reasonable to ask platonists, “What explanation can be provided of this distinctive, non-accidental and systematic relationship obtaining between the mathematical realm and the spatio-temporal realm?” As Field explains, “there is nothing wrong with supposing that some facts about mathematical entities are just brute facts, but to accept that facts about the relationship between mathematical entities and human beings are brute and inexplicable is another matter entirely” [1989, p. 232]. The above question—which this section will call the fundamental question—is the heart of the epistemological challenge to platonism.

c. The fundamental Question: Some Further Details

Let us make some observations that motivate the fundamental question. First, all human theoretical knowledge requires a distinctive type of non-accidental, systematic relationship to obtain. Second, for at least the vast majority of spatio-temporal theories, the obtaining of this non-accidental, systematic relationship is underwritten by causal interaction between the subject matter of the theory in question and human brains. Third, there is no causal interaction between the constituents of platonic realms and human brains. Fourth, the lack of causal interaction between platonic realms and human brains makes it apparently mysterious that the constituents of such realms could be among the relata of a non-accidental, systematic relationship of the type required for human, theoretical knowledge.

So, the epistemological challenge is motivated by the acausality of mathematical entities. Yet Field’s formulation of the challenge includes considerations that go beyond the acausality of mathematical entities. Our discussion of the motivating picture made it clear that, in virtue of its abstract nature, a platonic mathematical realm is wholly different from the spatio-temporal realm. These differences ensure that not only causal explanations, but also other explanations grounded in features of the spatio-temporal realm, are unavailable to platonists in answering the fundamental question. This fact is non-trivial, for explanations grounded in features of the spatio-temporal realm other than causation do appear in natural science. For examples, see [Batterman 2001]. So, a platonist wanting to answer the fundamental question must highlight a mechanism that is not underwritten by any of the typical features of the spatio-temporal realm.

Now, precisely what type of explanation is being sought by those asking the fundamental question? Proponents of the epistemological challenge insist that the motivating picture makes it mysterious that a certain type of relationship could obtain. Those asking the fundamental question are simply looking for an answer that would dispel their strong sense of mystery with respect to the obtaining of this relationship. A plausible discussion of a mechanism that, like causation, is open to investigation, and thus has the potential for making the obtaining of this relationship less than mysterious, should satisfy them. Further, the discussion in question need not provide all of the details of the said explanation. Indeed, if one considers an analogous question with regard to spatio-temporal knowledge, one sees that the simple recognition of some type of causal interaction between the entities in question and human brains is sufficient to dispel the (hypothetical) sense of mystery in question in this case.

Next ask, “Is the fundamental question legitimate?” That is, should platonists feel the need to answer it? It is reasonable to maintain that they should. Explanations should be available for many types of relationships, including the distinctive, non-accidental and systematic relationship required in order for someone to have knowledge of a complex state of affairs. It is this justified belief that legitimizes the fundamental question. One instance of it is the belief that some type of explanation should be, in principle, available for the obtaining of the specific, non-accidental and systematic relationship required for human mathematical knowledge if this is knowledge of an existent mathematical realm. It is illegitimate to provide a metaphysical account of mathematics that rules out the possibility of such an explanation being available, because it would be contrary to this justified belief. The fundamental question is a challenge to platonists to show that they have not made this illegitimate move.

Return to section 3 where this section is referenced.

8. Supplement: The Referential Challenge to Platonism

In the last century or so, the philosophy of mathematics has been dominated by analytic philosophy. One of the primary insights guiding analytic philosophy is that language serves as a guide to the ontological structure of reality. One consequence of this insight is that analytic philosophers have a tendency to assimilate ontology to those items that are the semantic values of true beliefs or statements, that is, the items in virtue of which true beliefs or statements are true. This assimilation played an important role in both of the arguments for platonism developed in section 2. The relevant language-world relations are embedded in Frege’s logico-inferential analysis of the categories of object and concept and in Quine’s criterion of ontological commitment. This assimilation is at the heart of the referential challenge (to platonism).

a. Introducing the Referential Challenge

Before developing the referential challenge, let us think carefully about the following claim: “Pure mathematical beliefs and statements are about the mathematical realm, and so are true when, and only when, they are appropriately related to this realm.” What precisely is it for a belief or statement to be about something? And, what is the appropriate relationship that must obtain in order for whatever a belief or statement is about to make that belief or statement true? It is natural to suppose that the logico-inferential components of beliefs and statements have semantic values. Beliefs and statements are “about” these semantic values. Beliefs and statements are true when, and only when, these semantic values are related in the way that those beliefs and statements maintain that they are. The formal mathematical theory that theorizes about this appropriate relation is model theory. Moreover, on the basis of the above, it is reasonable to suppose that the semantic values of the logico-inferential components of beliefs and statements are, roughly, set or determined by means of causal interaction between human beings and those semantic values.

Applying these observations to the claim “pure mathematical beliefs and statements are about the mathematical realm, and so are true when, and only when, they are appropriately related to this realm,” we find that it maintains that constituents of a mathematical realm are the semantic values of the logico-inferential components of pure mathematical beliefs and statements. Further, such beliefs and statements are true when, and only when, the appropriate semantic values are related to one another in the way that the said beliefs and statements maintain that they are related—more formally, the way demanded by the model-theoretic notion of truth in a model.

So far, our observations have been easily applicable to the mathematical case. Yet they highlight a problem. How are the appropriate semantic values of the logico-inferential components of pure mathematical beliefs and statements set or determined? If platonists are correct about the metaphysics of the mathematical realm, then no constituent of that realm causally interacts with any human being. Yet it is precisely causal interaction between human beings and the semantic values of beliefs and statements about the spatio-temporal world that is responsible for setting or determining the semantic values of such beliefs and statements. The referential challenge is a challenge to platonists to explain how constituents of a platonic mathematical realm could be set or fixed as the semantic values of human beliefs and statements.

b. Reference and Permutations

Two specific types of observations have been particularly important in conveying the force of the referential challenge. The first is the recognition that a variety of mathematical domains contain non-trivial automorphisms, which means that there is a non-trivial, structure-preserving, one-to-one and onto mapping from the domain to itself. A consequence of such automorphisms is that it is possible to systematically reassign the semantic values of the logico-inferential components of a theory that has such a domain as its subject matter in a way that preserves the truth values of the beliefs or statements of that theory. For example, consider the theory of the group {Z,+}, that is, the group whose elements are the integers  …, -2, -1, 0, 1, 2, … and whose operation is addition. If one takes an integer n to have –n as its semantic value rather than n (that is, ‘2’ refers to -2, ‘-3’ refers to 3, and so forth), then the truth values of the statements or beliefs that constitute this theory would be unaltered.  For example, “2 + 3 = 5” would be true in virtue of -2 + -3 being equal to -5. A similar situation arises for complex analysis if one takes each term of the form ‘a+bi’ to have the complex number a-bi as its semantic value rather than the complex number a+bi.

To see how this sharpens the referential challenge, suppose, perhaps per impossible, that you and your acquaintance each know a person named “John Smith.” John Smith1 and John Smith2 are actually indistinguishable on the basis of the properties and relations that you discuss with your new acquaintance. That is, all of the consequences of all of the true statements that your new acquaintance makes about John Smith2 are also true of John Smith1, and all of the consequences of all of the true statements that you make about John Smith1 are also true of John Smith2. Under this supposition, her statements are still true in virtue of her using “John Smith” to refer to John Smith2, and your statements are still true in virtue of you using “John Smith” to refer to John Smith1. Using this as a guide, you might claim that ‘2 + 3 = 5’ should be true in virtue of ‘2’ referring to 2, ‘3’ referring to 3, and ‘5’ referring to 5 rather than in virtue of ‘2’ referring to the number -2, ‘3’ referring to the number -3, and ‘5’ referring to the number -5 as would be allowed by the automorphism mentioned above. One way to put this intuition is that 2, 3, and 5, are the intended semantic values of ‘2’, ‘3’, and ‘5’ and, intuitively, beliefs and statements should be true in virtue of the intended semantic values of their components being appropriately related to one another, not in virtue of other items (for example, -2, -3, and, -5) being so related. Yet, in the absence of any causal interaction between the integers and human beings, what explanation can be provided of ‘2’, ‘3’, and ‘5’ having their intended semantic values rather than some other collection of semantic values that preserves the truth values of arithmetic statements?

c. Reference and the Löwenheim-Skolem Theorem

The sharpening of the referential challenge discussed in the previous section is an informal, mathematical version of Hilary Putnam’s permutation argument. See, for example, [Putnam 1981]. A related model-theoretic sharpening of the referential challenge, also due to Putnam [1983], exploits an important result from mathematical logic: the Löwenheim-Skolem theorem. According to the Löwenheim-Skolem theorem, any first-order theory that has a model has a model whose domain is countable, where a model can be understood, roughly, as a specification of semantic values for the components of the theory. To understand the importance of this result, consider first-order complex analysis and its prima facie intended subject matter, that is, the domain of complex numbers. Prima facie, the intended semantic value of a complex number term of the form ‘a+bi’ is the complex number a+bi. Now, the domain of complex numbers is uncountable. So, according to the Löwenheim-Skolem theorem, it is possible to assign semantic values to terms of the form ‘a+bi’ in a way that preserves the truth values of the beliefs or statements of complex analysis, and which is such that the assigned semantic values are drawn from a countable domain whose ontological structure is quite unlike that of the domain of complex numbers. Indeed, not only the truth of first-order complex analysis, but the truth of all first-order mathematics can be sustained by assigning semantic values drawn from a countable domain to the logico-inferential components of first-order mathematical theories. Since most of mathematics is formulated (or formulable) in a first-order way, we are left with the question, “How, in the absence of causal interaction between human beings and the mathematical realm, can a platonist explain a mathematical term having its intended semantic value rather than an alternate value afforded by the Löwenheim-Skolem theorem?”

Strictly speaking, a platonist could bite a bullet here and simply maintain that there is only one platonic mathematical domain, a countable one, and that this domain is the actual, if not intended, subject matter of most mathematics. Yet this is not a bullet that most platonists want to bite, for they typically want the Existence Thesis to cover not only a countable mathematical domain, but all of the mathematical domains typically theorized about by mathematicians and, frequently, numerous other domains about which human mathematicians have not, as yet, developed theories. As soon as the scope of the Existence Thesis is so extended, the sharpening of the referential challenge underwritten by the Löwenheim-Skolem theorem has force.

Return to section 3 where this section is referenced.

9. References and Further Reading

a. Suggestions for Further Reading

  • Balaguer, Mark 1998. Platonism and Anti-Platonism in Mathematics, New York, NY: Oxford University Press.
    • The first part of this book provides a relatively gentle introduction to full-blooded platonism. It also includes a nice discussion of the literature surrounding the epistemological challenge.
  • Balaguer, Mark 2008. Mathematical Platonism, in Proof and Other Dilemmas: Mathematics and Philosophy, ed. Bonnie Gold and Roger Simons, Washington, DC: Mathematics Association of America: 179–204.
    • This article provides a non-technical introduction to mathematical platonism. It is an excellent source of references relating to the topics addressed in this article.
  • Benacerraf, Paul 1973. Mathematical Truth, Journal of Philosophy 70: 661–79.
    • This paper contains a discussion of the dilemma that motivated contemporary interest in the epistemological challenge to platonism. It is relatively easy to read.
  • Burgess, John and Gideon Rosen 1997. A Subject With No Object: Strategies for Nominalistic Interpretation of Mathematics, New York, NY: Oxford University Press.
    • The majority of this book is devoted to a technical discussion of a variety of strategies for nominalizing mathematics. Yet §1A and §3C contain valuable insights relating to platonism. These sections also provide an interesting discussion of anti-nominalism.
  • Colyvan, Mark 2001. The Indispensability of Mathematics, New York, NY: Oxford University Press.
    • This book offers an excellent, systematic exploration of the Quine-Putnam Indispensability Argument and some of the most important challenges that have been leveled against it. It also discusses a variety of motivations for being a non-platonist realist rather than a platonist.
  • Field, Hartry 1980. Science Without Numbers, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
    • This book contains Field’s classic challenge to the Quine-Putnam Indispensability Argument. Much of it is rather technical.
  • Frege, Gottlob 1884. Die Grundlagen der Arithmetik: eine logisch-mathematische Untersuchung über den Begriff der Zahl, translated by John Langshaw Austin as The Foundations of Mathematics: A logico-mathematical enquiry into the concept of number, revised 2nd edition 1974, New York, NY: Basil Blackwell.
    • This manuscript is Frege’s original, non-technical, development of his platonist logicism.
  • Hale, Bob and Crispin Wright 2001. The Reason’s Proper Study: Essays towards a Neo-Fregean Philosophy of Mathematics, New York, NY: Oxford University Press.
    • This book collects together many of the most important articles from Hale’s and Wright’s defense of neo-Fregean platonism. Its articles vary in difficulty.
  • MacBride, Fraser 2003. Speaking with Shadows: A Study of Neo-Logicism, British Journal for the Philosophy of Science 54: 103–163.
    • This article provides an excellent summary of Hale’s and Wright’s neo-Fregean logicism. It is relatively easy to read.
  • Putnam, Hilary 1971. Philosophy of Logic, New York, NY: Harper Torch Books.
    • This manuscript contains Putnam’s systematic development of the Quine-Putnam Indispensability Argument.
  • Resnik, Michael 1997. Mathematics as a Science of Patterns, New York, NY: Oxford University Press.
    • This book contains Resnik’s development and defense of a non-platonist, realist structuralism. It contains an interesting discussion of some of the problems with drawing the abstract/concrete distinction.
  • Shapiro, Stewart 1997. Philosophy of Mathematics: Structure and Ontology, New York, NY: Oxford University Press.
    • This book contains Shapiro’s development and defense of a platonist structuralism. It also offers answers to the epistemological and referential challenges.
  • Shapiro, Stewart 2005. The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy of Mathematics and Logic, New York, NY: Oxford University Press.
    • This handbook contains excellent articles addressing a variety of topics in the philosophy of mathematics. Many of these articles touch on themes relevant to platonism.

b. Other References

  • Batterman, Robert 2001. The Devil in the Details: Asymptotic Reasoning in Explanation, Reduction, and Emergence, New York, NY: Oxford University Press.
  • Burgess, John 1983. Why I Am Not a Nominalist, Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic 24: 41–53
  • Burgess, John 2004. Mathematics and Bleak House, Philosophia Mathematica 12: 18–36.
  • Burgess, John and Gideon Rosen 2005. Nominalism Reconsidered, in The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy of Mathematics and Logic, ed. Stewart Shapiro, New York, NY: Oxford University Press: 515–35.
  • Cole, Julian 2008. Mathematical Domains: Social Constructs? in Proof and Other Dilemmas: Mathematics and Philosophy, ed. Bonnie Gold and Roger Simons, Washington, DC: Mathematics Association of America: 109–28.
  • Cole, Julian 2009. Creativity, Freedom, and Authority: A New Perspective on the Metaphysics of Mathematics, Australasian Journal of Philosophy 87: 589–608.
  • Dummett, Michael 1981. Frege: Philosophy of Language, 2nd edition, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Ernest, Paul 1998. Social Constructivism as a Philosophy of Mathematics, Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
  • Field, Hartry 1989. Realism, Mathematics, and Modality, New York, NY: Basil Blackwell.
  • Frege, Gottlob 1879. Begriffsschift, eine der arithmetschen nachgebildete Formelsprache des reinen Denkens, Halle a. Saale: Verlag von Louis Nebert.
  • Frege, Gottlob 1893. Grundgesetze der Arithmetik, Band 1, Jena, Germany: Verlag von Hermann Pohle.
  • Frege, Gottlob 1903. Grundgesetze der Arithmetik, Band 2, Jena, Germany: Verlag von Hermann Pohle.
  • Hale, Bob 1987. Abstract Objects, New York, NY: Basil Blackwell.
  • Hersh, Rueben 1997. What Is Mathematics, Really? New York, NY: Oxford University Press.
  • Heyting, Alfred 1931. Die intuitionistische Grundlegung der Mathematik, Erkenntnis 2: 106–115, translated in Paul Benacerraf and Hilary Putnam, Philosophy of Mathematics: Selected Readings, 2nd edition, 1983: 52–61.
  • Lewis, David 1986. On the Plurality of Worlds, New York, NY: Oxford University Press.
  • MacBride, Fraser 2005. The Julio Czsar Problem, Dialectica 59: 223–36.
  • MacBride, Fraser 2006. More problematic than ever: The Julius Caesar objection, in Identity and Modality: New Essays in Metaphysics, ed. Fraser MacBride, New York, NY: Oxford University Press: 174–203.
  • Putnam, Hilary 1981. Reason, Truth, and History, New York, NY: Cambridge University Press.
  • Putnam, Hilary 1983. Realism and Reason, New York, NY: Cambridge University Press.
  • Quine, Willard Van Orman 1948. On what there is, Review of Metaphysics 2: 21–38.
  • Quine, Willard Van Orman 1951. Two dogmas of empiricism, Philosophical Review 60: 20–43, reprinted in From a Logical Point of View, 2nd edition 1980, New York, NY: Cambridge University Press: 20–46.
  • Quine, Willard Van Orman 1963. Set Theory and Its Logic, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Quine, Willard Van Orman 1981. Theories and Things, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Resnik, Michael 1981. Mathematics as a science of patterns: Ontology and reference, Noûs 15: 529–50.
  • Resnik, Michael 2005. Quine and the Web of Belief, in The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy of Mathematics and Logic, ed. Stewart Shapiro, New York, NY: Oxford University Press: 412–36.
  • Shapiro, Stewart 1991. Foundations Without Foundationalism: A Case for Second Order Logic, New York, NY: Oxford University Press.
  • Shapiro, Stewart 1993. Modality and ontology, Mind 102: 455–481.
  • Tennant, Neil 1987. Anti-Realism and Logic, New York, NY: Oxford University Press.
  • Tennant, Neil 1997. On the Necessary Existence of Numbers, Noûs 31: 307–36.
  • Wright, Crispin 1983. Frege’s Conception of Numbers as Objects, volume 2 of Scots Philosophical Monograph, Aberdeen, Scotland: Aberdeen University Press.

Author Information

Julian C. Cole
Email: colejc@buffalostate.edu
Buffalo State College
U. S. A.