African Sage Philosophy
The Sage Philosophy Project began in the mid-1970s at the Department of Philosophy of the University of Nairobi Kenya. At the University, Henry Odera Oruka (1944-1995) popularized the term “Sage Philosophy Project,” and closely related terms such as “philosophic sagacity,” both by initiating a project of interviewing African sages, and by naming this project in a widely read popular article as the most promising of four trends of the relatively new field of African philosophy.
This encyclopedia article focuses primarily on Oruka and his immediate sources of inspiration, and then includes others whose projects share similar methodologies and goals.
Although the definition of the key terms is not always completely uniform, at the heart of this approach to African philosophy lies the emphasis on academically-trained philosophy students and professors interviewing non-academic wise persons whom Oruka called “sages,” and then engaging philosophically with the interview material. Oruka usually (but not always) emphasized keeping the identity of the individual sage well known. He also insisted that it was the sage who knew the traditions of his or her ethnic group the best, and who would be able to have critical distance to evaluate and sometimes reject prevailing beliefs and practices. The goals of collecting the interviews and evaluating them have been articulated in Oruka’s many works. The first goal was to help construct texts of indigenous African philosophies. Before Oruka’s project there was a dearth of existing texts and a need to record indigenous ideas, both for posterity (that is, for a sense of identity and for historical reasons) and for the present and future. African wisdom that had been marginalized by academia, and by city life, could provide valuable solutions to contemporaneous problems in Africa. Such texts of interviews could also sustain intellectual curiosity and provide practical guidance (or phronesis).
Oruka searched for sages and wanted a wider public to know not only their words (written down in transcripts) but also about their lives. For him, a sage’s worth was not only in their ideas but also in the way they live: by embodying their philosophies, developing their character, and affecting their communities over the years. After all, the sages in Kenya operate in contexts of social conflict and exploitation. Sages are those from whom others seek moral and metaphysical advice and consultation on issues involving moral and psychological attitudes and judgments.Oruka looked to the term japaro in Luo, meaning “thinker,” to approximate the translation of sage. The term japaro is closely related to jang’ ad rieko which means “professional advisor.” He emphasized that people would single out sages for advice on even the most delicate matters.
Table of Contents
- Oruka Biography and Early Writings
- Sage Philosophy in Philosophical Context
- Beginning Interviews in Kenya
- Relationship to the Hallen-Sodipo Study
- Folk Sages and Philosophic Sages
- Criticisms of Sage Philosophy
- Culture Philosophy and Its Relationship to Philosophic Sages
- Oruka’s Sage Philosophy: the Last Few Years
- Sage Philosophy Research by Other Philosophers: Students
- Sage Philosophy Research by Other Philosophers: Other Scholars
- References and Further Reading
The history of the project begins in the 1970s; nevertheless, it is important to understand the project’s beginning in the context of its immediate precursors, both those that served as partial models and those that served as negative examples of what must not be done. It is also important to know something about Oruka’s academic training and background, and the skills and interests he brought to the project.
Oruka grew up surrounded by sages in his home area of Ugenya, in the Nyanza Province of Kenya, and as a youth he looked up to them and learned much wisdom from them. Graduating from St. Mary’s High School in Yala, he won a scholarship to study geography at Uppsala University in Sweden. While there, Oruka was influenced by philosophy Professor Ingemar Hedenius to follow his newly developing interests and study philosophy instead. Philosophy studies at Uppsala were divided into two tracks, Practical and Theoretical, and Oruka specialized in Practical Philosophy: Applied Ethics and Political Philosophy. The approach to philosophy Oruka learned both in Sweden and later at Wayne State University in Detroit, Michigan, was greatly influenced by the logical empiricists. Indeed, Oruka referred to himself an empiricist as well (Practical 283). He would later remark that this narrow emphasis on analytic philosophy that he received in his formal training was an initial “handicap” to his ability to enter the debates on African philosophy upon his return to Kenya (Oruka, Trends 127).
When he returned to Kenya in 1970, Oruka became one of the first two African philosophy faculty members at University of Nairobi. At that time, many departments at the University of Nairobi (UON) were questioning the Eurocentric curriculum that was their colonial heritage. Ngugi wa Thiong’o, Okot p’Bitek, and Taban Lo Liyong were some of the scholars challenging the curriculum in literature, development studies, and other areas (Ogot). The Institute for African Studies at UON was founded in 1970. Sage philosophy was an attempt to rise to the challenge of imagining an approach to philosophy that focused on African ideas and realities. The fields of literature and history had turned to oral sources; there was no reason that philosophy could not do the same.
When Oruka received his first full-time position in 1970, the field of African Philosophy was dominated by Placide Tempels, John Mbiti, and other early scholars who sometimes blurred the line between religious and philosophical thinking. Also, at that time, the Philosophy and Religious Studies departments at UON were merged. Having studied with Hedenius, famous for his arguments in favor of atheism, Oruka distinguished himself with early essays in 1972 and 1975 denouncing much of what was passing for “African philosophy” as no more than dressed-up mythical thinking. (He later judged these articles as “youthful” as well as “simplistic and unnecessarily offensive” Oruka, Trends 12, n.1; 125-29; Practical 285; Graness and Kresse 12). He championed a secular and logical approach to life’s big questions. However, also impressed by the need to appreciate an unfairly-marginalized, substantial body of thought coming from Africa, Oruka proposed his “sage philosophy” project as a way to provide missing information about African ideas and values. He was convinced that rural sages were not merely “religious figures” but thinkers who used their own rational powers to develop insights, and who could explain their reasoning to others.
In his early 1972 article “Mythologies as African Philosophy” Oruka was to insist on jettisoning traditions harmful to Africa’s present and future. He criticized both Placide Tempels’ book Bantu Philosophy and John Mbiti’s book African Religions and Philosophy as backward-looking champions of absolutely unphilosophical African traditions. He agreed with Fanon’s criticism of a certain type of misguided African intellectual who falsely builds up the greatness of African tradition in a futile attempt to convince Europeans that African culture is as good as theirs. Oruka wanted instead to write for an African audience (Oruka in Graness and Kresse Sagacious 1999 ed., 23).
In “Mythologies,” Oruka began to articulate his emphasis on the need to acknowledge individual thinkers. By anonymizing everyone and providing only group consensus, Tempels, Mbiti, and W. E. Abraham (author of The Mind of Africa) presented “philosophy without philosophers.” He suggested, “We can as well start afresh by interviewing sage Africans and eliciting philosophical expositions from them” (Oruka in Graness and Kresse Sagacious 1999 ed., 30). While individuals’ thinking is influenced by their community and material conditions, they are not determined by them, and in fact individuals can also influence groups. Oruka also pointed out that a philosopher’s role is not just to describe how people think and act, but to make suggestions as to how they ought to think and act (Oruka in Graness and Kresse Sagacious 1999 ed., 31).
Oruka conceived of the project in relation to interjections from Kwasi Wiredu and Paulin Hountondji, whom he had met and who had both been invited to University of Nairobi. He had become familiar with their written works in early philosophy journals published in Africa, such as Second Order (University of Ife Press, Nigeria), Universitas (Accra), and Cahiers philosophiques africains/African philosophical journal (Zaire) (Oruka, Trends 129-30, 132-33). Both scholars had studied philosophy in African universities and abroad, Wiredu at University College, Oxford, and Hountondji at the École Normale Supérieure, and both were critical of the ethnophilosophical approaches of Tempels and Mbiti.
Wiredu, based in Ghana, emphasized the secular and rational nature of much ethical thought among the Akan groups in Ghana. He outlined three major hindrances to African cultural regeneration: anachronism, authoritarianism, and supernaturalism. But he also insisted that Africa had very wise and philosophical persons from whom a lot could be learned, especially if one paid attention to the nuances of concepts in African languages. In a 1972 issue of Second Order, Wiredu wrote that “it is a particular (though not exclusive) responsibility of African philosophers to research into their traditional background of philosophical thought” (“On an African Orientation” 12). However, he argued, while traditional concepts and codes of conduct should be an area of study, they should not lead to anachronism—an attempt to turn back the hands of time or cling to the days of yesteryear (7).
Wiredu was the first to label “what ‘our elders’ said” as “folk philosophies.” He found exciting the prospect of constructing, from “the living wise men of the tribe,” “the elaborate and argumentative reasons” behind the belief systems and moral guidelines of “our philosophers of old.” Still, the resulting material could not, Wiredu believed, help to tackle most modern problems in Africa (“On an African Orientation” 5). Along with interest in past traditions, he maintained, scientific method and clear argumentation were necessary to guide African youths in confronting the new moral dilemmas facing contemporary African society. Barry Hallen, scrutinizing Wiredu’s article, says that Wiredu intended the phrase “folk philosophies” to refer to unreasoned beliefs whether they were African or Western (Hallen “Yoruba” 106-08). Wiredu followed up this exploration with an article that Oruka recommended to his readers, in which Wiredu compared and contrasted the meaning of “philosopher” and “wise man.” The material, first published in the article (Wiredu “What Is”), was later incorporated in Wiredu’s book (Wiredu Philosophy 139-173; see Oruka Trends 69n5).
Three years later (1975), in Second Order, Oruka explained that he and others at UON were already engaged in a project along the lines of Wiredu’s description. He said, “We are seeking to unsheathe, through constant contacts and discussions with those concerned, the elaborate philosophical views and reasons from the living traditional Kenyan thinkers and sages” (Oruka “The Fundamental” 54n6). He followed Wiredu’s words and ideas closely enough to repeat the descriptors “elaborate” and “reasons.” In his subsequent book he adopted the descriptors “folk philosophies” and “folk sage,” but clarified that, in addition to elders who are examples of folk sagacity, there were some philosophic sages able to scrutinize prevailing beliefs and give sustained arguments for their positions. The elders, he asserted, were more than just depositories of outdated folk wisdom. Philosophical sages were able both to describe the “culture philosophy” held by most members of their community and also to evaluate the content (or at least understand the genesis) of such culture philosophies. In Philosophy and an African Culture (1980) Wiredu affirmed that “The recording and critical study of the thought of individual indigenous thinkers is worthy of the most serious attention of contemporary African philosophers” (37). In Cultural Universals and Particulars (1996), Wiredu wrote that Oruka’s sage philosophy book was the first to give “substantial notice” to individual philosophical thinkers in Africa (116).
Paulin Hountondji was another key influence on the development of sage philosophy. Hountondji gave a talk, “Philosophy and Its Revolutions,” at the National University of Zaire during “Special Philosophy Days” in June 1973, and a second time at University of Nairobi in November, 1973. Invitations for these talks came from the Philosophical Association of Kenya, which Oruka had founded (African 71).A paper based on the talks was published in French in 1973 in Cahiers philosophiques africains/African Philosophical Journal and later incorporated into Hountondji’s book, African Philosophy: Myth and Reality (71-108). Hountondji’s “Revolution” article, and chapter, which Oruka and other Kenyans heard in person in 1973, criticized Tempels’ book Bantu Philosophy but appreciated the works of two European anthropologists, Paul Radin and Marcel Griaule, suggesting that their approach was much more careful than Tempels’. In fact, Hountondji said, Tempels’ study was “behind the anthropology of the time” (African 76). Twenty years earlier than Tempels, Radin wrote Primitive Man as Philosopher, a study of philosophy in Africa that focused on original thinkers who were members of an intellectual class in their communities. Hountoundji explained that Radin denounced the prejudice that African individuals are submerged in unitary group-think and took it upon himself to transcribe faithfully what members of this intellectual class told him (African 76; “La Philosophie” 30-31).
Paul Radin was an anthropologist originally from Poland who had studied with Franz Boas at Columbia University. Radin recorded interviews with members of a Native American community from Nebraska called the Winnebago. He explained in his book the necessity of researchers presenting “statements made by the Winnebago” word-for-word to the public, rather than merely recounting others’ ideas in ways that mixed the researcher’s interpretation with the words and views of those interviewed (64). Researchers who thought they did readers a service, by weaving together narratives and accounts of multiple informants in a harmonizing way, actually hid the extent of disagreement and diversity of opinion in the community (xxxviii).. Since primary sources are so valuable, Radin advocated a method of careful direct questioning, a process which under the best circumstances “can become something analogous to a true philosophical dialogue” (xxxi). Radin first published his book in 1927 but came out with a second edition in 1957 which critiqued Placide Tempels’ approach as presumptive and wrong-headed insofar as Tempels presumed to describe Bantu philosophy on behalf of Bantu speaking people, instead of letting them speak for themselves.
Hountondji stated that “Radin’s work is still, to the best of my knowledge, the most lucid ethnological critique of the theoretical assumptions of ethnophilosophy” (African 79). He praised Radin for showing the level of variations in retellings of particular myths and the ways each narrator influenced the myth in their own way, thus demonstrating the “profound individualism” among African intellectuals. Though he faulted Radin for use of the insulting word “primitive,” Hountondji was struck by how, unlike other Western anthropologists, Radin conveyed Africa as a place with views as plural as those of Western societies (African 79). While Radin’s study predated Oruka’s coining of the term “sage philosophy,” certainly Radin’s project shared much in common (both in goals and method) with Oruka’s later project. While Radin’s own first-hand research was with the Winnebago tribe (now more accurately called the Ho-Chunk people) in North America, Radin’s book drew upon primary source narratives of philosophical thought from various communities around the world, including proverbs and poems from Africa.
John Dewey, who wrote the foreword to Radin’s book, thanked Radin for challenging certain common misconceptions of Africa, which tended to present Africans as accepting “automatic moral standards” based on custom, when in fact African communities respected freedom of expression and emphasized individual moral responsibility (Radin xix). The relationship and consistency between Radin’s approach and that of Oruka’s sage philosophy project was alluded to by Kai Kresse (27-28), Lucius Outlaw (in Oruka Sage 244n27), and Godwin Azenabor (73).
While Oruka probably heard about Radin in Hountondji’s 1973 presentation in Nairobi, Oruka nowhere credited Radin as an inspiration for his own chosen methods. In fact, Oruka engaged in a lifelong castigation of anthropologists, condemning them along with missionaries like Tempels. Oruka presumed that all anthropologists anonymized and conglomerated their sources into one, and he asserted that no anthropologist had devised a method similar to his own. Another important distinction to highlight is that Radin made extensive use of proverbs, poems, and songs, which he considered primary sources even if the specific authors were unknown, and found profound philosophical thought in these sources. Many in the field of African philosophy have also argued for using these kinds of sources as philosophical sources, for example, Kwame Gyekye of Ghana (An Essay 8-19) and Claude Sumner, a Canadian who researched Ethiopian philosophy for many years, and Ethiopian philosopher Workineh Kelbessa (“Logic”; Indigenous chap. 11). Even Oruka’s philosophy colleague at UON, Gerald Wanjohi, engaged in extensive analysis of proverbs (Wanjohi Wisdom). Oruka did not consider the study of proverbs to be related to his project. He narrowly focused on interviews with living sages as his only source, despite the fact that other contemporaries of his argued that one could find clear expression of logical argument as well as insightful reflection in proverbs (Sumner 22-23, 391-403). In an article he wrote on Sumner, Oruka mentioned that Sumner spent much effort studying and publishing Oromo proverbs (Practical 156), and maintained that studying proverbs is a different method than ethnophilosophy, but he did not develop these ideas. In Sage Philosophy (1990 ed. 115-16; 1991 ed. 117), the sage Simiyu Chaungo discussed the use of proverbs, but it is the only time proverbs are mentioned in the book.
Along with Radin, Hountonji’s 1973 article also included Marcel Griaule as an example of anthropologists whose methods differed from Tempels’ (31). Griaule interviewed Ogotemmeli, a Dogon elder in Mali, at length. Hountondji was disappointed that certain political factions inside and outside of Africa preferred Tempels’ style of massive, definitive synthesis of all Bantu views to capturing the plurality and disorderliness of individual thought by direct interview. In the preface to the second edition of his book, which included “Philosophy and Its Revolutions,” Hountondji again reiterated his 1974 opinion of Griaule as an important trend-setter:
The French anthropologist had chosen to transcribe the words of one sage among many. He showed the possibility of a long term project which would consist of a systematic transcription of such speeches, at least as a starting point of a critical discussion—what my Kenyan colleague the late Odera Oruka would later call “philosophical sagacity”—rather than as reconstruction of implicit philosophy behind the habits and customs of the host society through a lot of non-verifiable hypotheses which always amount to over-interpreting the facts”(ix).
In 1996, Hountondji saw Griaule’s project as an earlier version of Oruka’s project. He reiterated his estimation of Griaule in his reflections, published in English as The Struggle for Meaning (2002). In this work he reflected on his views back in 1970, saying of Griaule’s work: “Voluntarily assigning to himself the humble task of a secretary, custodian, transcriber of the worldview of a black sage, of one spiritual master among others, the French ethnologist gave the example of scientific patience and, in my eyes, did more useful work than the ethnophilosophers proper who were in a hurry to reach definitive conclusions on African philosophy in general” (99).
Oruka himself was not that impressed with Griaule and Ogotommeli. In his 1983 article in International Philosophical Quarterly, later included in Sage Philosophy, Oruka argued that Ogotemmeli was at best a “folk sage” and not a philosophical sage, because he did not transcend his group’s views. Therefore, Griaule was not engaged in sage philosophy, but only in “culture philosophy” (Oruka Sage, 1991 ed., 34, 47, 49-50).
Hountondji and Oruka both missed research published by other anthropologists in the 1960s that cast doubt on whether Griaule really followed his professed method of interviewing one person and transcribing what that person said. D. A. Masolo made a thorough review of the anthropological literature on Griaule, most but not all of it in French, in which the authors questioned whether the conversation was recorded verbatim on the series of days that Griaule recounted. They suspected Griaule of reconstructing the conversation (Masolo African 69, 77, 260). Jack Goody’s book review discussed the painstaking detail an interview must have in order to meet standards of even a “soft” science like anthropology. The words of the person interviewed should be clearly demarcated from those that are the author’s commentary. Field notes should be identified as such and distinguished from the words of the on-site translator. Original language transcriptions should be available, and the difficulty of translating esoteric words should be discussed by the author. Griaule’s book did not meet these standards (Goody review). Kibujjo Kalumba, who considered Griaule’s book on Ogotommeli one of three possible sources of sage philosophy, complained that the book contained too much of Griaule’s re-wording of Ogotommeli’s ideas (274, 276).
While Oruka declared in 1972 his intent to interview wise elders, he had just the previous year been quite critical of another philosopher’s use of the interview method applied to the topic of Ethics. Tore Nordenstam, a Norwegian based in Khartoum, Sudan, had interviewed three of his students, and on the basis of the interviews, published a book called Sudanese Ethics. In his rather harshly critical review of the book, Oruka questioned how interviews could be helpful at all in the study of ethics.
Oruka himself changed from someone with antipathy toward Nordenstam’s project to a person who promoted a large project interviewing African sages. His own project tried to avoid all of the pitfalls he pointed out in Nordenstam’s project: he did not interview students; he tried to interview those without exposure to studies in European philosophy; he addressed gender issues in most of his interviews; and he asked his interviewees sensitive political questions, even at great risk to himself (as in his interviews with Oginga Odinga). He shared with Nordenstam the focus on ethical issues. Before leaving this section on early precursors and influences on sage philosophy, it is important to note that a Kenyan scholar wrote an article in 1959 that is considered by several African philosophy scholars to be a clear precedent to sage philosophy. Taaita Towett (d. 2007) is known these days mostly for his role in Kenyan education and politics. As Minister of Education, he was “Patron” of the Philosophical Association of Kenya (see Thought and Practice 1.2  inside back cover). Towett’s 1959 article, translated into French as “Le Role d’un philosophie Africain,” “earlier expressed an identical argument” to Oruka’s, according to Ochieng’-Odhaimbo (“The Tripartite” 30n4). In the PhD thesis he wrote under Oruka’s supervision (later excerpted in Sage Philosophy) and in a 1983 journal article, Anthony Oseghare claimed that Towett’s 1959 article provided “evidence of the existence of critical philosophical reasoning in Africa” (Oseghare “Sagacity” 95; Oruka Sage 1991 ed., 237). D. A. Masolo noted that Towett, as Oruka did later, argued that literacy was not a prerequisite for philosophizing and that Socrates was an example of an oral philosopher. Towett and Oruka both contended that “there must have been African philosophers engaged in the formulation of culture philosophy” (Masolo African Philosophy 236).
In his published works, Oruka explained that he began his sage philosophy project along with his philosophy colleague Joseph Donders, a White Father from the Netherlands (“The Fundamental” 54n6; Sage 1991 ed., 17-18). Donders explained that the funds for the study were originally received from the UON’s Dean’s Committee (“Don’t Fence” 11).
Oruka’s early publications describing his projects and his methods began in the mid-1970s. At the time, Oruka made it clear that his project was a national one, and was to include wise sages from a wide variety of ethnic groups in Kenya. At this time, there was a lot of focus on building up Kenya’s national identity, and Oruka wanted his project to be a unifier for the country, where all Kenyans could take pride in a common heritage of wise philosophers. He also wanted Kenyans to evaluate and be able to justify their cultural practices (see Oruka “Philosophy”; Ochieng’-Odhiambo Trends, 116-117; Presbey “Attempts”). At the same time, Oruka focused on sages who could articulate reasons for their philosophical and ethical positions that did not rely on mere tradition or on religious authority. He also focused on the individual identities and arguments of the sages rather than melding the ideas of individuals into the “group think” of an ethnic group; to do the latter would have been to engage in the common error in African studies in philosophy.
As F. Ochieng’-Odhiambo has noted, the exact terminology for Oruka’s project has changed over time. In 1974, when Oruka first announced his project, he called it “Thoughts on Traditional Kenyan Sages.” He first coined the term “philosophic sagacity” in 1978, referring to individual critical and reflective sages engaging in thought in such a way that even European or analytic philosophers would have to admit that philosophers were present in Africa. He created and emphasized the approach as an alternative to ethnophilosophy, which he disparaged. Ochieng’-Odhiambo noted that as early as 1983, Oruka called those engaged in philosophic sagacity “sage philosophers.” He contrasted them to ordinary sages (later called “folk sages”) who, in 1983, were not considered philosophical because they lacked critical reflection and ability to create independent positions on topics. In 1984, in “Philosophy in English Speaking Africa,” Oruka used the term “sage philosophy.” At first, the two terms “philosophic sagacity” and “sage philosophy” were used interchangeably and no distinctions were drawn. But during this third stage of Oruka’s works (1984–1995), he used the term “philosophic sagacity” increasingly less, while he used “sage philosophy” increasingly more. Oruka then used the term “sage philosophy” retrospectively to refer to his pre-1984 works (Ochieng’-Odhaimbo, “The Evolution” 19, 24).
The term “philosophic sagacity” Ochieng’-Odhiambo says, was first presented in Oruka’s “Four Trends in African Philosophy” at a conference on Dr. William Amo in Accra, Ghana, in July, 1978 (Oruka Trends 21n1; also see Ochieng’-Odhaimbo “Philosophic Sagacity: Aims”). “Four Trends” was later revised and presented at the World Congress of Philosophy conference in Dusseldorf, Germany, in August, 1978 (Ochieng’-Odhiambo “The Evolution” 22, 30n6). However a Nigerian philosopher, M. Akin Makinde, commenting on Oruka’s popularization of the term, claimed to be the originator of the term in the context of African philosophy. Makinde said he used the term “philosophic sagacity” (with a different connotation than Oruka) earlier than Oruka in a conference paper he presented in June, 1978, at University of Ife (Makinde “Robin”; “Philosophy” 107). Makinde’s 1978 paper drew upon concepts in Bombastus Paracelsus’ essay Philosophia Sagax. Collins English Dictionary explains that “philosophic” is a term created in Middle English around 1350-1400 C.E. that meant “learned, pertaining to alchemy.” Makinde claimed that Oruka used the term and concept “wrongly” but admitted that Oruka’s usage became the more widespread (African 9, 122, 137). Many scholars in African philosophy do not pay attention to the term “philosophic” and refer to Oruka’s method as “philosophical sagacity” (for example see Hallen African 68-75; Imbo 25-26).
Oruka articulated his project and his methods in the context of growing debates on the topic of African philosophy. He spearheaded the founding of the Philosophical Association of Kenya and the creation of its journal, Thought and Practice, in 1974. In his famous “Four Trends” article, he divided African Philosophy into four diverse interests/trends with differing methodologies (ethno-, nationalist-ideological, and professional philosophies including his own, philosophic sagacity). At these venues and in publications he explained how his own project was not just another example of the wrong-headed “ethnophilosophy” approach (criticized by Paulin Hountondji) but was instead an alternative to it.
In a 1988 article of Oruka’s first published in German and later included in English in Trends (50-69), Oruka described his sage philosophy project, listed eight sages (all men) who were part of his study, and gave a biography of each. Two of them, Paul Mbuya Akoko (d. 1981) and Oruka Rang’inya (d. 1979), would be included at greater length in his soon-to-be-released, book-length study of sage philosophy. The others mentioned in 1988 had only biographies and short excerpts of their interviews in the German-language article, which were repeated in two books. These latter sages were Njeru wa Kanuenje, Nyaga wa Mauch, Arap Baliach, Muganda Okwako (d. 1979), Joash Walumoli, and Kasina Wa Ndoo (Trends 57-61, 66-67; Sage 1991 ed., 37-40). Oruka explained that he and researcher Jesse N.K. Mugambi interviewed Njeru wa Kanyenje of Embu district together, in the Embu language (Trends 66, 132).
Oruka’s book Sage Philosophy was published first by Brill in 1990 and later in Nairobi in 1991. There are a few differences between the two publications, but most changes are minor editorial ones, with the major exception that chapter one of the Brill edition has an extra twelve pages telling the background of the study. The book has three parts. The first is Oruka’s introduction to his project. Here, Oruka gathered (with little revision) several of his articles on sage philosophy that had been published over the years. The second part includes interviews with sages, and the third part includes commentators and critics. Documentation of the sages as individuals, and the publication of their originally oral philosophical thoughts, are crucial to Oruka’s methodology; this stands in contrast to ethnophilosophy’s practice of summarizing what informants (often anonymous) say and searching for a common denominator. Also in the second part, a brief biographical sketch and photograph precedes each interview. Oruka insisted on identifying both folk and philosophic sages in the same manner. In this way, his project does not merely repeat the same ground covered by ethnophilosophy.
The book minimizes the editorial/interpretive role of the professional philosopher, in comparison to other anthropological approaches, by including direct excerpts from interviews of sages who were self-conscious of their role as cultural critics and were respected for the critical views they articulated. Interviews with sages covered topics related to philosophy of religion (such as the existence of God, life after death, and so forth), free will and determinism, and ethics. These topics were of central concern to Oruka, whose own academic background from Uppsala was in practical philosophy rather than theoretical philosophy. Oruka mentioned “Chaungo Barasa, Fred Ochieng’-Odhiambo, Sam Oluoch Imbo, Samuel Wanjohi Kimiti and Mwangi Samuel Chege” as his key research assistants in the project (Sage 1991 ed., xi).
Oruka closely followed this first book-length publication with a monograph focusing on the interviews of Jaramogi Oginga Odinga. He explained that for the 1982 interviews he was accompanied by E. S. Atieno-Odhiambo, a well-known Kenyan historian who focuses on oral history, and in 1992 Chaungo Barasa assisted him. Odera Oruka provided his own commentary on the interviews, which focused on Odinga’s love of truth, and how Odinga’s commitment to truth and love of the masses contrasted with Plato’s own position in the Republic regarding the myth of metals, sometimes called the “noble lie” (Oginga Odinga xi, 3-4, 12-13).
Barry Hallen and J. Olubi Sodipo engaged in a research project that involved interviewing wise men among the Yoruba in Nigeria. They began their project around the same time as Oruka, in 1973-74. As Hallen and Sodipo explain, they started in 1973 with a non-credit student study group at the University of Lagos. During university breaks they asked students to “establish face-to-face fieldwork relationships with the elders and wise men of their family compounds, villages, and towns” (Hallen and Sodipo 9). They chose the concept of the person as the theme for these first discussions. After this first study, they interviewed people in the Ekiti region from 1974-84 and moved the project to the University of Ife (now Obafemi Awolowo University) in 1975 (Hallen and Sodipo xvi, 11). Sodipo became head of the newly independent philosophy department that separated from the religious studies department in 1975.
Hallen and Sodipo chose to study herbalists and native doctors because they were more critically sophisticated than the “ordinary persons” whom they advised, and were able to offer theoretical concepts (10-11). They explained that the onisegun (Yoruba wise men) they interviewed were organized into their own professional society called an egbe, with rules, evaluations, possible reprimands, and a pledge of secrecy. The onisegun were not mere masters of medicine, but rather, they “[gave] advice and counsel about business dealings, family problems, unhappy personal situations, religious problems, and the future, as well as about physical and mental illness” (13). They did not name their individual interlocutors because, as they explained, those they interviewed requested to remain anonymous (14). They acknowledged that the practical questions regarding interviewing methods were many, and they tried to sort out the question: “is each man to be treated as an individual, potentially eccentric thinker, or are opinions to be somehow collated and presented as shared and communal?” (8). They followed the latter plan, due to the fact that they were studying language use. Their study had philosophical insights regarding how the use of words “knowledge” and “belief” were understood, and came to note that among the Yoruba, the use of the term translated as “knowledge” is much narrower than the usage in Britain or the United States, because it was reserved for first-hand knowledge alone. In Britain or the U.S., people commonly claimed to know a vast amount of information (in the form of propositions) that went beyond their first-hand knowledge (see Hallen and Sodipo; Hallen “Yoruba”).
Because it involved academic philosophers interviewing wise elders in Africa, many people associated the Hallen and Sodipo project with Oruka’s sage philosophy project. However, at least in some of his writings, Oruka clarified that he did not consider their work that of sage philosophy due to its lack of emphasis on individual sages. In fact, Oruka complained that it looked like the onisegun of the study held views “in consensus” and therefore to study their views was “anthropology, not philosophy” (Oruka Sage 1991 ed., 8-10; quote, 10), or even “culture philosophy,” “cultural prejudices” or “philosophication” (Oruka Sage 1991 ed., 50). “Philosophication” is a term that Oruka intended to have a derogatory tone. At one point he defined it as “the discovery of a philosophy out of no philosophy;” he also played with coining the word “philosofolkation” which involved loving the “folk” so much that one invented a philosophy for them and made oneself its spokesperson (1990b, 7). Oruka’s criticisms began as early as his 1975 article, when he charged J. O. Sodipo with trying to pass off African superstitions regarding the agency of the Yoruba gods as an African understanding of cause and, hence, philosophical (Oruka “The Fundamental” 48). In a more conciliatory tone, he wrote in his 1983 article that the Hallen-Sodipo project, like Griaule’s Ogotemmeli, while not “philosophic sagacity,” may be “some form of sagacity” (Oruka “Sagacity” 389; Ochieng’-Odhiambo Trends 133).
On this point, Ochieng’-Odhiambo pointed out (“The Evolution” 27) that a particular end note in an article of Oruka’s 1990 book, Trends in Contemporary African Philosophy (Oruka Trends 68), suggested that Hallen and Sodipo’s project might be part of sage philosophy, despite Oruka’s clarification in other works (Oruka Sage 1991 ed., 8-9, 50) that it was not. This endnote is a bit indirect. Oruka listed Hallen and Sodipo’s works along with several others that directly address sage philosophy, and then added the caveat, “It is not the case that every one of these writings addresses itself to the direct question of Sage philosophy. But they all make special reference to a type of thinking in Africa that can only owe its existence to the thoughts of some wise men (and women) in traditional Africa.” This statement makes it sound like Hallen and Sodipo were fellow travelers. Interestingly enough, Oruka mentioned that at a certain point in his research he interviewed some sages who wanted their names withheld (Sage 1991 ed., 65n4), and he mentioned specifically a parallel with Hallen and Sodipo’s study.
In his 2006 book, African Philosophy: The Analytic Approach, Hallen agreed that it was best to keep his own project and Oruka’s separate. As good grounds for separating them, Hallen explained that his and Sodipo’s project was always intended to be an exercise in philosophy of language, and he admitted that such was not the case with Oruka’s interviews. He also acknowledged that Oruka wanted to keep them separate (4–5). But he also explained, in Knowledge, Belief, and Witchcraft, that he thought that the kinds of description of their project that Oruka engaged in were unkind and unfair. Oruka did not take into account that when one does philosophy of language one cannot help but search for common usages of terms and concepts. Hallen recounted in an afterword to the 1997 edition of Knowledge, Belief, and Witchcraft the shock he experienced upon first reading criticisms of their work such as this. He and Sodipo had been bracing for criticisms from anthropologists; they expected to be told that they weren’t properly trained to do fieldwork. But they were surprised to find themselves criticized by philosophers for advocating a communal consensus account of African thought, basically being accused of the dreaded “ethnophilosophy” as Hountondji had described it.
Hallen asked Hountodji and Oruka to rethink their criticism, since there was no way to practice ordinary language philosophical analysis, whether in Africa, England, or elsewhere, without focusing on common meanings. Hallen thought that the fact that their study was able to debunk many prevailing myths and stereotypes about Africa, including misconceptions made popular by some anthropologists that considered African thought as pre-reflective, uncritical, traditional, emotional, and non-reasonable. This was evidence that they should be appreciated, not lumped in with anthropologists and ethnophilosophers whose projects were evaluated negatively (Hallen and Sodipo 136-37n16; 140). Indeed, one of the surprising conclusions of Hallen and Sodipo’s study was that the onisegun had such stringent criteria for counting something as knowledge (that is, restricting it to first-hand experience, and requiring careful reporting and testimony from all witnesses), that they made Euro-Americans who accept second-hand propositional knowledge as true seem “dangerously naïve or perhaps even ignorant” in comparison to the onisegun (Hallen Yoruba 299).
While discussing parallels in Nigeria, it is important to note that Campbell S. Momoh (d. 2006) engaged in interviews with elders of the Uchi community. Momoh says he responded to Hallen’s call for philosophers to go to villages to discuss philosophical topics with illiterate elders (Momoh “African” 99). He cited as his intellectual sources for the methodology of the project not Oruka but instead both Paul Radin and William Abraham. In his 1962 book, Abraham distinguished public philosophy from private philosophy, referring to Griaule’s study of Ogotommeli as an example of “of an individual African philosopher rather than a repository of the public philosophy” (104). Momoh saw a commonality between Radin’s notion of the African intellectual and what Abraham called “private philosophy” (Momoh The Substance 53, 55). Momoh insisted that interviewees should be named and credited.
Momoh was himself involved in interviewing elder sages. He did his dissertation fieldwork in 1978 and submitted his dissertation in 1979 to Indiana University. His dissertation committee included William Abraham and Ivan Karp (An African Conception). The dissertation includes lengthy sections naming elder interlocutors (such as Aliu Oshiothenaua, Saliu Ikharo and others), paraphrasing their conversation in detail as well as quoting them directly (92-120). Momoh also provides contextual background of the sages’ standing and purpose in their communities (see especially 45-48, 67-70, 85-87). He even mentions seeming interruptions in the discussion, such as the presence of a young boy or a chicken, and how the conversation is shaped by these interactions (something for the most part missing from the interviews in Oruka’s study). Topics focus on metaphysics and ethics. Along with accounts of the elders’ discussions, Momoh includes his interpretation and analysis of what the elders say. While the elders may convey their ideas in story and myths, these do not just reflect communal philosophies since some of the stories are creations of individual men (for example, Ikharo’s story of woman’s refusal to accept marrying man as her God-given duty and role, see 116-117).
In his published work, Momoh names some elders, quotes them verbatim, and gives specific examples of methodological challenges during his interview of them (“African Philosophy” 87-88). He named Aliu Oshiothenaua, Pa Egbue, Pa Abudah (Momoh’s uncle), and a hunter named A. M. J. Momoh (The Substance 66, 245, 254-55, 376-78). He found in the interview of the hunter a “doctrine of existential gratitude” (The Substance 382). Oshiothenaua asserted a theory of human dependence on nature (The Substance 376). An ethnophilosophical study that merely explored communally held beliefs in the sense of Abraham’s “public philosophy” would be incomplete, Momoh insisted, because “alongside with it” it would need to name individual intellectuals and add additional contextual information such as the time period, cultural paradigm, and branch of philosophy relevant to the discussions. He criticized Bodunrin, who wanted to make an “absolute dichotomy” between ethnophilosophy and the sagacious elders, since, according to Momoh, the latter were based on the former–that is, the “sagacious elders” philosophized in a general context provided by public philosophy (“African” 77-78, 80-81; The Substance 56, 58, 59).
Momoh also insisted that sagacious elders had a better practice than much of contemporary analytic academic philosophy, since their goal was not the narrow one of negatively appraising received ideas, but the broader project of building holistic systems and attending to important moral issues (“African Philosophy” 91; The Substance 69, 75, 78). While Oruka notes that in Momoh’s earlier 1985 article Momoh seemed unaware of Oruka’s sage philosophy project (Oruka, Sage 1990 ed., xxiv) and castigated Oruka as a member of the “African logical neo-positivists” who denigrated ancient African philosophy (Momoh based this estimate on Oruka’s 1972 article critical of myth, see The Substance 64), he later revised his estimate of Oruka and acknowledged his sage philosophy project (The Substance x). In an article originally published in 1987 (included in Sage 1990 ed.), Oruka expressed his agreement with C. S. Momoh’s position that the names of sages interviewed must be given and their views credited to them (Sage 1990 ed., 20). Fayemi Ademola Kazeem considered Momoh to be engaging in a sage philosophy project as was Oruka, noting that Momoh preferred to call it “ancient African philosophy” (Kazeem 196).
Godwin Azenabor included Hallen and Sodipo, Momoh, Oruka and others in a common category of African philosophy which he called the “Purist school” because all were committed to the assertions that Africa has a similar practice of raising philosophical questions and answering them as does the West; however they all saw the need to break free of Western paradigms, conceptual schemes, and conditioning. All in the Purist School emphasized the relevance of African culture and tradition for both philosophy as well as models for African development (Azenabor Understanding xiv). While the choice of “Purist” as a descriptor can be questioned (see Sophie Oluwole’s defense of Oruka’s project as admitting up front the multiple influences on contemporary rural sages, in Graness and Kresse Sagacious 155), Azenabor’s categorization helps us to see the common themes and approaches of authors who emphasized their distinction from and competition with each other.
In some works Oruka was at pains to distinguish “folk sages” and “folk sagacity” (wise elders who could recount community traditions and beliefs but not take a critical, evaluative stance toward them) from “philosophical sages” or “philosophic sagacity” which were the interviews and ideas of particularly reflective and evaluative sages. The distinction copied “first order” and “second order” distinctions in philosophy to a great extent. Many philosophers concluded that the only important part of the sage philosophy project was the “philosophic sagacity” part. However, such an approach left unexplained the role that folk sages played in the project. Why continue to include folk sages if they are examples of unphilosophical individuals? Several scholars addressed this thorny topic (Presbey “Sage Philosophy: Criteria”; Van Hook).
Omedi Ochieng noted the irony that while Oruka first began his project to debunk Western scoffers who thought Africans were involved in unreflective groupthink, his comments championing the philosophic sages as “geniuses” in contrast to folk sages and other Africans who were satisfied at following others and not thinking for themselves ended up reinforcing the negative stereotype of Africans (“Epistemology” 348-351). He thought that Oruka capitulated and accepted academic definitions of philosophy that belittled folk wisdom and championed abstraction in a way that silenced the important contributions of many Africans (“Ideology” 153-57). Oluwole likewise noted that in some of Oruka’s texts he seemed to define “philosophy” so narrowly that even his own sages would fail to meet such narrow criteria, which would ironically lead to the failure of his own project. She insists, however, that if the sage interviews could be approached by sensitive scholars familiar with the sages’ language and context, without the near-ubiquitous prejudice against finding philosophy in African oral practices, that the project in this sense is very promising (Oluwole in Graness and Kresse 158-61).
An additional problem is that even when Oruka sorted out his folk and philosophical sages, the folk sages still demonstrated the intellectual virtues Oruka insisted belonged only to the philosophical sages. To illustrate this point, let me highlight that each of the seven “folk sages” in Sage Philosophy (chap. 6) distinguished their views from those of their communities on at least one topic. Chege Kamau said that he didn’t believe the afterlife consists in ancestral spirits as others believe. Rather, he posited, all people rejoin one big soul, which he called God. Joseph Muthee advocated sometimes unpopular inter-tribal marriages as a means of building a national culture. Ali Mwitani Masero argued that death is the end of the human being. Zacharia Nyandere said he believed men and women were equal, despite Luo perceptions to the contrary. Abel M’Nkabui said all humans were equal, and that inequalities were historical accidents. Based on this conviction, he was critical of Meru prejudice against blacksmiths. Joseph Osuru said that the Teso think that God does not belong to other tribes or races. But he thought that God belongs to all people. He also mentioned that some Teso think that having dreams of the deceased is proof that they live in a world after death. But, he pointed out, having a dream is not proof. Peris Njuhi Muthoni said that it was good that the practice of female circumcision is dying, because it led to medical problems. She stated that it was her conviction that Luo should not remove their teeth as a rite of passage. These concrete examples show that all of the so-called “folk sages” can critique their own societies, an attribute Oruka assigned only to the “philosophic sages.”
Oruka listed “philosophic sages” in their own chapter (chap. 7). The sages included there were Okemba Simiuyu Chaungo, Oruka Rang’inya, Stephen M. Kithanje, Paul Mbuya Akoko, and Chaungo Barasa (Sage 1991 ed., 109-155). An additional aspect of the sage philosophy project was that Oruka did not want the project to stay on the descriptive level. He wanted Kenyans to read and grapple with the ideas of the sages, evaluate them, extend them, and apply them to their lives. However, his own published commentary on the interviews was brief (Trends 64-65). In Sage Philosophy, he left the job of commentary on the interviews to his student, Anthony Oseghare (Sage 1991 ed., 156-160).
D. A. Masolo made the point that it is not mere disagreement with one’s cultural group that makes one a philosophic sage, but rather that “the criterion for a moral ideal, according to the sage, is not that it match the historical belief of the community but that it satisfies an acceptable idea of right, fairness, and respectfulness toward all those who are involved or may be affected by its practical application” (Masolo “Sage”). He gave the example of a sage who would counsel against the practice of a certain ritual if it would jeopardize the health of an individual. In these circumstances, the important criteria “was not their mere variance from the communal beliefs of the sages’ own groups but also a theoretical account provided by the sage as the foundation of his or her own view. . . The sage attends to the rationality of views rather than to the judgment of the group” (Masolo “Sage”).
One of the tensions found within sage philosophy is that, while Oruka privileged sages critical of their societies’ prejudices, as in the examples above, on the other hand he championed sages who hold in high esteem traditional values forgotten or marginalized by young Kenyans. In a 1979 research proposal for sage philosophy, he explained that his project was a way of defending his nation from the “invasion by foreign ideas,” which could not be stopped by guns but instead must be combated on the level of ideas. This cultural invasion included worship of technology and an adherence to crass materialism as a measure of success. Oruka bemoaned the fact that African traditional morality was already eroded by European colonialism, and their replacements, Christianity and Islam, he argued, were incapable of standing up to the cultural erosion of values (“The Philosophical”).
Oruka often asked questions about the proper relationship between men and women during his interviews with sages. Many of the sages insisted that women were inferior to men. Oruka cautioned readers that the sages were reflecting the cultural prejudices of their times, and he reminded those familiar with Western philosophy that such assertions of women’s inferiority could be found as well throughout the Western canon of well-known and respected philosophers. Still, he was proud of the fact that some of his sages held relatively progressive views on this topic (Sage 1990 ed., xix-xx; Ochieng’-Odhiambo Trends, 136), and he even had one sage’s views on the topic published in a Nairobi newspaper (“Paul Mbuya”). The views asserting men’s superiority could be found in the sages interviewed by his student F. Ochieng’-Odhiambo and Ngungi Kathanga. In Oruka’s studies as well as his students’ studies, few women sages were interviewed. Gail Presbey has drawn attention to women sages in her works (“Who”; “Kenyan”).
From early on, critics from within the community of African philosophy scholars put forward their criticisms. Oruka included three critics (Bodunrin, Kaphagawani, and Keita) and three supporters (Outlaw, Oseghare, and Neugebauer) in Sage Philosophy. Peter Bondunrin said Oruka’s sages were not enough like the Greek philosophers, who expounded their view in a context of literacy (Oruka Sage 1991 ed., 163-179, esp. 168-69). Lansana Keita said that when Oruka relegated creative individual thinking to the critical views of “philosophic sagacity,” he failed to acknowledge that the folk or ethnophilosophy of the community could itself be a product of earlier creative individual philosophizing (Sage 1990 ed., 210). While some of these criticisms were perhaps based on a misunderstanding of Oruka’s project (see Bewaji review 109), Oruka did appreciate the debates that ensued and responded to these critics in his own articles, which were included in the first part of the book.
After the publication of the book, criticism continued. D. A. Masolo said the sages Oruka quoted often made comments that were no more than common sense, perhaps with some cleverness thrown in, rather than sustained arguments (Masolo African Philosophy 236-245). Ochieng’-Odhiambo had a clever and insightful response to this kind of criticism. “The idea that philosophy must always operate at a higher rarefied level with deep abstractions is not always true . . . Philosophy can, in many ways, be expressed very simply”; in fact, he agreed with Christopher Nwondo, who advocated that philosophers in Africa should attempt to write in clear and simple language (Trends 138). But Ochieng’-Odhiambo did clarify that Masolo was not against the sage philosophy project itself, but had just stated that he thought the interviews included were not yet strong enough to prove the point to his liking (Trends 137).
Tunde Bewaji reviewed Sage Philosophy and was impressed by Oruka’s sage interviews because they “reflect a clarity of thought which is not seen in ethnographic, anthropological or sociological studies” (106). While Simiyu Chaungo argued that God was the sun, because without the sun there could be no life, Ali Mwitani Masero, on page 96 of Sage Philosophy, argued that if God created the sun, God cannot also be the sun. Bewaji also commended Osuru’s criticism of popular practices that regarded dreams as evidence about the afterlife. Bewaji pointed out that many persons from so-called civilized societies still consider dreams evidence of another world. He also commended Kithanje for arguing that there could not be many gods, because such gods could not account for the uniformity of creation (106-07).
In chapter four of his book, Philosophy in an African Place, Bruce Janz reflected upon Oruka’s sage philosophy project. He noted that the approach seemed to solve the paradox of African philosophy by appealing to universal principles of reason and exploring the context of African lived experience. Yet, Oruka imported Western philosophical ideas to a large extent and left them mostly unacknowledged. This was problematic since his project purports to be all about African philosophizing. Additionally, Janz offered critiques of the methodology. The method at first looked promising, by focusing on conversation between sage and the interviewer (an academically trained philosopher) where the two cooperatively worked toward truth. Yet, to Janz, it often sounded nevertheless like it was the academic philosopher who focused upon and made manifest the latent reasoning in the sage’s conversation. Janz noted that past, outmoded ethnographies turned Africans into objects of others’ studies and declared that he therefore preferred open-ended conversation. But the structure of questions that most sages were asked in interviews steered them toward certain answers that fit in the context of past Western philosophical paradigms such as asking for an essence (What is wisdom? What is virtue?). Such questions presumed that increasing levels of abstraction were abilities to be praised in a sage. Interviewers guided the sages, he argued, by eliciting the sage’s opinion on topics that the interviewer thought important. Janz also took Oruka to task for promising to evaluate which of the sages were wise according to an objective criterion. Janz noted the complex and multiple aspects of being a wise person, and suggested that it would not be easy for anyone to sort out the wise from the not-wise. Further, Oruka did not address whether or not wisdom is a culture-bound concept. Janz suggested that wisdom was better recognized intersubjectively, identified in “a process of explicating shared meanings in a community, rather than identifying an essence” (107).
Omedi Ochieng likewise insisted that the sages be placed in a context where their speech could be understood contextually, and he found several places where Oruka failed to fill in important aspects of context. In fact he questioned the “interview” as Oruka’s chosen method, suggesting that sages might not understand an interview as a context in which to justify their philosophical beliefs when challenged by a provocateur. Adversarial debate is a particular form of philosophizing that may not be valued by the sage. But Ochieng did think that interviews with sages in some form should still be done in a “reconstructed” version of African sage philosophy (“Epistemology” 346-47, 359).
Janz similarly suggested that Oruka depended too much on the idea of philosophizing as critique and divergence from communally accepted beliefs. Why not look for other signs of wisdom, such as creative thinking? Janz found many examples of creative thinking among the sages, such as Stephen Kithanje’s “fecund metaphor of God being like heat and cold.” Likewise, Okemba Chaungo showed through his debate of the relative good of wisdom versus land that the seeming contradiction could be overcome by understanding different senses of “good” (109). In general, Janz was frustrated that sage philosophy was not more self-critical about its methods, did not come to terms with its positionality, and did not devote time to critiquing its own methods.
W. J. Ndaba critiqued Oruka’s work, arguing that the ideal of philosophy as “an individual, explicit, critical and self-critical ratiocinative consciousness” was a Western notion, since such emphasis was “counterproductive for the emergence of a genuinely rooted African philosophy” (17). He held that an African perspective would value the folk sage, that is, the person who consulted the wisdom of their community and did not try to do it alone. He referred to the Zulu proverb, Iso—elilodwa—kaliphumeleli (“An eye—when it is one—does not succeed”), to emphasize the importance of consulting other persons who could “note points of detail which elude him or unforeseen snags which turn up to mar his plan” (20-21). He disagreed with Oruka’s claims that the philosophic sage was more valuable than the folk sage. He did, however, appreciate Oruka’s emphasis on the philosophical sage being able to warn society against holding one-sided or close-minded, ethnocentric views.
While there have been critics of sage philosophy, there have also been many scholars who have appreciated its contribution. In addition to those already mentioned above, substantive treatments of Oruka’s project can be found in the works of Lucius Outlaw (in Oruka Sage); Sophie Oluwole, Muyiwa Falaiye and Ulrich Loelke (in Graness and Kresse), and others.
Oruka was convinced, both by his training in practical philosophy as well as his own sense of values and priorities, that philosophy in general, and the sage philosophy project in particular, had to address itself to the concrete problems facing Kenyans and Africans. It should address issues in the present and suggest a course of action to make Africa’s future better.. Thus, he wanted his project to be both practical and accessible to a general audience beyond academia. He often wrote for the newspapers, such as the Daily Nation, and other popular publications. In 1986, he participated in a study sponsored by the Institute of African Studies at the University of Nairobi called “Kenya’s Socio-Political Profiles” where he was required to contribute a broad outline of the general beliefs and practices of the Luo ethnic group (Oruka Sage 1990 ed., 53, 58-61). In 1986 he became an expert witness for a now-famous trial often referred to as the S. M. Otieno burial saga. Oruka took the witness stand, and gave an account of the philosophy and practices of burial among those from the Luo ethnic group. He argued that his expertise was due to his study of so many interviews with philosophical sages from the area. He included a transcript of his evidence in court in Sage Philosophy (1990 ed., 65-80).
Note that “culture philosophy,” that is, an account of the prevailing beliefs of an ethnic community, was an offshoot of interviews aimed at discovering philosophic sagacity. In order to see how a particular sage deviated from norms in his individual, critical thinking, the sage often began by recounting reigning shared values in his community. This “offshoot” of sorts (which Oruka had before dismissed in a disparaging way as philosophy only in a broad or even “debased” sense) now became a focus. Some experts in customary law even accused Oruka of giving the court an outdated account of practices, presented as timeless truths of the Luo ethnic group (Cotran 155). When Oruka was in the witness stand, Khaminwa, Wambui Otieno’s lawyer, asked him whether in traditional society there may be people opposed to customs who want to depart from those customs and do things their own way. Oruka explained to Khaminwa that “in a traditional communal society there were very few rebels” (Sage 1990 ed., 70). He minimized the existence and role of such dissent, even though in his academic work on sage philosophy he particularly championed such dissent.
Rather than see him as taking on the role of ethnophilosopher, Ochieng’-Odhiambo suggested that, at that point, Oruka showed that he himself was a philosophic sage able to recount the traditions of his ethnic group while also resolving any inconsistencies (Ochieng’-Odhiambo Trends 125). Masolo thought that Oruka’s popularity grew because of his role in the trial, due to his ability to unmask the faulty logic of the widow’s defense team that equated “modern” with “Western” in a stereotypical and unfair way (“Sage”). Be that as it may, the court case can also be seen as another missed opportunity for Oruka to champion the rights of women in a male-dominated context (Presbey, 2012, 2013).
The court case was the beginning of a new phase in Oruka’s sage research. As Oruka explained, due to his notoriety in the case, he was offered work sensitizing District Officers and Commissioners to Luo philosophy and customs. When he gave these talks, he reiterated common beliefs among the Luos and quoted individual philosophical sages (Sage 1990 ed., 58-64). He also put his sage sources to use when studying Kenyan beliefs and practices regarding family planning, for the Department of Populations. He had two control groups, non-sages and sages, and gave the views of both. His main point was that Kenyan traditions and values already had the resources for population control through natural family planning. Further, a sensitive study of the culture of Kenyan people could reveal attitudes and practices that worked against family planning and then point the way to solutions to the problem. Here he seemed to have crossed over quite a bit into the social sciences. Dorothy Munyakho explained that his approach was still considered experimental and controversial from the perspective of people in Population Studies who were more familiar with demographics and statistics than with qualitative analysis of interview content (21).
Critic Didier Kaphagawani, in a 1987 article reprinted in Sage Philosophy, charged sage philosophy with being parasitic on ethnophilosophy, insofar as philosophic sages practiced second-order reflection and analysis of first-order ethnophilosophy (Kaphagawani in Oruka Sage 1991 ed., 181-204). But Oruka responded and clarified. He said instead that philosophic sagacity is second order to culture philosophy. Sages reflect upon the culture, though not as it is summarized in consensus form and analyzed by professional philosophers, theologians, or missionaries (as in ethnophilosophy); rather, they do so based on their first-hand observations of the culture philosophy through their personal experiences in the community (Sage 1991 ed., xxiii). This same point could serve as a fine-tuned criticism of Momoh’s terminology mentioned above, since Momoh sometimes referred to ethnophilosophy and communal philosophy without distinction. Momoh added the helpful point that all communal philosophies, not just African communal philosophies, are non-critical, and he gave some examples from Britain (The Substance 59, 63).
In an article, “Sage Philosophy Revisited,” based on a radio interview in 1993 and published posthumously, Oruka noted that some scholars considered his project “just one of the brands of ethnophilosophy,” similar to Mbiti and others, and disagreed with those critics (Practical 183). He agreed that he studied “culture philosophy” and described it as the “beliefs, practices, myths, taboos, and general values of a people” (Sage 1991 ed., xxiii). To the end, Oruka trusted his method more than that of ethnophilosophers like Tempels because he based his accounts of culture philosophy on the testimony of trusted indigenous experts (the philosophical sages), and he considered himself to be conveying only what they had told him (Sage 1990 ed., 57; 1991 ed., 43n2). Of course, there is no escaping one’s role in shaping the data insofar as the researcher, even Oruka himself, decides which parts of which interviews to highlight when presenting them to others. This methodological point was raised by Emmanuel Eze regarding Oruka’s work (Eze and Lewis 19).
It’s important to note that as time went on, ethnophilosophy’s staunchest critic, Paulin Hountondji, modified his position. He reflected on the debate that was started by his criticism of ethnophilosophy and said in 2002 that his earlier rejection of collective thought was excessive. He explained that collective culture must be taken seriously, and that individuality is fashioned from a basic personality, which has rootedness. While he agreed that individual thought should be seen in cultural context, he noted that it should not be stuck there. Roots should not become a “prison house” (The Struggle 128, 151-52, 204-05). Also, one of Hountondji’s biggest complaints about the ethnophilosophers like Tempels was that they were foreigners, or if not foreigners, at least they were writing for a foreign audience, responding to debates and criteria created abroad. Hountondji called this “extroversion,” and wanted instead to have African philosophy being written by Africans and responding to the interests and needs of Africans (“Introduction”). Certainly, the trajectory of Oruka’s interests in the sages showed that over time, the issue of proving anything to outsiders diminished in importance, as the question of how sage wisdom and reflection could help Kenya and Africa took center stage (Ochieng’-Odhiambo “The Tripartite” 21, “The Evolution” 29, and “Philosophic” 78; Kalumba 39-40; Presbey “Sage Philosophy: Criteria”).
Oruka intended his sage philosophy project to continue to grow. He called his 1992 book, on former Vice-President of Kenya Jaramogi Oginga Odinga, a continuing study in sage philosophy (Practical 162). In many respects, Oginga Odinga was quite different than the other sages, insofar as he was literate, had formal education and extensive experience in government (being first vice president of Kenya and later a presidential candidate) and had also traveled abroad. Nevertheless, Oruka insisted that in Oginga Odinga’s role as ker, that is, spiritual and cultural leader of the Luo people, he maintained with the other sages an important commitment to the betterment of his community. Oruka also clarified that, while he had begun his sage philosophy research interviewing illiterate elder sages, because their testimony might soon be lost, he never intended his project to be limited to the illiterate, elderly or rural persons. Thus, speculations that his project would become out of date the more that literacy spread in Africa were based on a misunderstanding of his project (Sage 1990 ed., xviii). Indeed, in Sage Philosophy, he included an interview of one young, educated sage, Chaungo Barasa (a water engineer), due to his wisdom and his commitment to his community (1990 ed., 149-57).
Oruka articulated and emphasized other reasons to continue sage philosophy as a project, including the need for a generation of Kenyans who grew up in cities to remain connected to their roots. He was also concerned with the practical challenges of poverty and corruption and curtailment of liberties in Kenya. He thought that sages, from the obscure rural ones to the more famous ones like Oginga Odinga, could offer a bold moral critique of Kenyan society that could help people improve their lives both individually and as a community and nation.
Oruka’s life was cut short in a road accident in December of 1995. As a pedestrian, he was struck down by a motorist in the streets of Nairobi (Nation Reporter 40). Further studies in sage philosophy have certainly been stymied by this loss but not wholly halted. Anke Graness and Kai Kresse quickly assembled scholars to comment on sage philosophy’s legacy in a memorial book to Oruka that came out shortly after his death, Sagacious Reasoning. A book of essays that Oruka had been working on at the time of his death, Practical Philosophy, was subsequently published. This book divided Oruka’s essays into four sections, one on African philosophy and culture and the other three covering issues of truth and faith, value and ideology, and environmental ethics. Excerpts of sage interviews can be found in some collections on African philosophy (see Oruka’s interview of Paul Mbuya Akoko in Hord and Lee 32-44).
To explore the ongoing influence of sage philosophy, it’s best to cast a wide net. While “philosophic sagacity” was a specialized part of sage philosophy, the project also included folk sages and culture philosophy. It makes sense to survey those who found Oruka’s emphasis on the interview process central to their own work in African philosophy. Some of these persons did not mind drawing upon interviews as well as proverbs. Many provided extensive historical background and filled in details of the context of those they interviewed to a far greater extent than Oruka ever did in his studies, and they did so for good methodological reasons. Some refined the interview method beyond Oruka’s own practice, going more in-depth, refraining from misleading questions, and some even preferred participant observation to interview. With all of these variations, it is best to understand these works as influenced by Oruka and perhaps even as improvements on his project, rather than as strict copies.
This survey will begin with those who had been Oruka’s own graduate students. Most published work beyond their original theses and many became scholars in their own right. During Oruka’s time at University of Nairobi, MA and PhD students such as Kenyans Ngungi Kathanga, Oriare Nyarwath, Patrick Dikirr, F. Ochieng’-Odhiambo (“The Significance”), Wairimu Gichohi, and Nigerian Anthony Oseghare incorporated sage philosophy as a topic and/or interviews with sages into their studies while under Oruka’s supervision. Some of them published articles sharing their research with others. Oseghare’s thesis reiterated many points of Oruka’s own position—holding a universalist definition of philosophy, limiting investigation to texts that met the philosophical standards of being critical, rigorous and of a second-order activity—and analyzed three sages according to this criteria. Two of the sages appeared in Oruka’s book, and Oseghare’s commentary on those two sages was excerpted and included in Sage Philosophy. But the thesis included discussion of a third sage, Oigara from the Kisii community. Oseghare liked Oigara best because unlike Oruka Rang’inya (who happened to be Oruka’s father) who explained the psychology behind “explaining events through the activities of spirits as a ploy of encouraging good behavior,” Oigara instead directly appealed to individuals’ abilities to make rational judgments (Oseghare xii). Oseghare concluded that the sages met his criteria for philosophical thinking.
Gichohi analyzed the interviews of sages included in Sage Philosophy (1991), finding contradictions in the concepts and positions held by some of the sages regarding their concepts of God. For starters, she questioned why Paul Mbuya Akoko said there must be one god to account for the orderliness of the universe. According to Gichohi, Mbuya begged the question, for who is to say that many gods must take on a mischievous character? (89). She also noted that Mbuya said that no one really knows God but later affirmed that God exists and rules nature (91). She noted that Oruka Rang’inya was involved in a contradiction between God being a concept and God’s living in the wind (93). She further was concerned that M’Mukindia Kithanje’s interpretation of God as present at the biological process of procreation confused the mysterious or marvelous with God (94). When it came to their ideas for the improvement of society, Gichohi found some of the sages’ suggestions problematic. Gichohi was particularly concerned with Mbuya Akoko’s suggestion that a criminal should be administered a drug during which time he could be reformed. She expressed her skepticism that such a procedure would reform the individual. Since being subjected to such drugs involuntarily is dehumanizing, how could one be reformed while his humanity has been eroded? In addition, Mbuya did not explain what type of offender and under what circumstance the punishment should be administered. These are all very important objections to the procedure which were not even questioned during the interview (103-04). Likewise, when Simiyu said that illness is due to laziness, his view, although perhaps sometimes true, could not count for all cases, such as physical destruction and disease brought on by earthquakes and other large-scale calamities not caused by humans. (131-32).
Ochieng’-Odhiambo described in his thesis and subsequent articles that his efforts were aimed at exploring “philosophic sagacity” to prove to skeptics that Africans can philosophize. For this reason, he explained, “my efforts were channeled toward presenting the thoughts of some sages in an elaborate and rarefied manner. More specifically, I concentrated on those topics that had been the focus of most ancient Greek philosophers” (“The Tripartite” 18). By proceeding in such a way, he would not only “uncoil” the philosophical ideas and logic of the sages but also “show beyond the shadow of a doubt that philosophers existed in traditional Africa” (“The Tripartite” 19). As Ochieng’-Odhiambo explained in a 1997 article that presented some of his 1994 dissertation’s findings, “The rationale of my approach was that if the thoughts of the pre-Socratics are philosophical (and this is never doubted) and if the African (Kenyan) sages think in a similar manner, then they should also be granted the prestige of being philosophical” (“Philosophic” 174). Oruka himself made references to the sages being at least as good as the pre-Socratics (Sage 1990 ed., xv-xvi, xxv, 37), so Ochieng’-Odhiambo was clearly following Oruka’s lead. The rest of the article, based on the research he did for his dissertation, involved interviewing sages and asking them, for example, questions on change and permanence. Ochieng’-Odhiambo asked Rose Ondhewe Odhiambo whether things change or are permanent (in obvious reference to the Parmenides and Heraclitus paradox). She gave a nuanced answer: some things change more than they are permanent, and some are more permanent and change little. Certainly she used reason and put forward a rational view. Ochieng’-Odhiambo went on to interview a man, Naftali Ong’alo, who when asked what the single most important element is, argued that “water is the single most important thing in the universe” (“Philosophic” 175-77).
It’s possible to raise some methodological questions regarding the approach in Ochieng’-Odhaimbo’s early works. The problem of asking “leading questions,” whether pursued intentionally or not, is a real one for any interviewer; Ochieng’-Odhaimbo himself addressed the dangers of leading questions in another work of his (Trends 132-33). While his studies with Oruka were in the 1990s, he continued to address African Philosophy in general, and sage philosophy in particular, as a key topic in his philosophical writings. He gave a thorough account of Oruka’s sage project in his 2002 and 2006 articles, and in his 2010 book (Trends 115-150).
Patrick Maison Dikirr published some findings from his 1994 master’s thesis which he wrote under Oruka’s supervision. Dikirr interviewed Maasai sages on the topic of death. As Dikirr explained, by discussing death, certain ideas, values, or lessons were reinforced about life. There were ambiguous practices among the Maasais, some of which seemed to argue for an idea of the afterlife. For example, when a Maasai person saw a snake (black python or cobra) in a hut of someone who has recently died, they fed it milk, greeted it, and told it, “We are always together!” After all, the snake may be a deceased important person such as an oloiboni (diviner), a great chief or counselor, or a wealthy man. But Dikirr wondered further, were snakes fed just to avert their anger, so that humans could survive? Or, were there ethical lessons contained in the treatment of snakes, such as: do not despise strangers who may show up to one’s house? He preferred that these lessons be the real reason behind the stories. Likewise, Maasais thought that waking someone suddenly from deep sleep should be discouraged, because the spirit travels while sleeping. But, Dikirr preferred to understand this practice as a focus on the ethical values of politeness and humility toward others. Dikirr thought the Maasai conception of self was closer to the Aristotelean unitary self-experience. He found evidence to show that Maasais thought there was a permanent end to life. The dead are no longer around. The only thing left after death is how one’s personality affects the children. A person who has children will not easily fade from memory like the single person who dies without children. Here, immortality is understood as a name to remember.
Ngungi Kathanga wrote a master’s thesis on philosophic sagacity at UON in 1992. Seven male (and no female) sages, all Kikuyus from Kirinyaga district, were included in Kathanga’s study. He explained that he originally interviewed fifty women and men (he does not mention how many of the fifty were women), but only the seven men included were judged by him to be sages (96). He included three sages’ responses to questions of men and women’s equality. All three said men were superior to women. All pointed out her physical weakness, and some added other weaknesses. Mwangi Wangu stated that women are unable to keep secrets. But he said they are respected for their roles as child-bearers, because through the naming of children, the dead survive. Joel Rukenya said women cannot rise up to tough challenges in life, and therefore should not be put in positions of power (122-24). The sages are, however, quoted as supporting racial equality (128-131).
Regarding Oginga Odinga, Peter Ogola Onyango of Moi University claims that a philosophic sage must first become a folk sage before he or she can become a philosophic sage. He then argues that Oginga Odinga proves his ability to be a folk sage by the fact that he is chosen as Ker of the Luo. Ogola Onyango then shows that Oginga Odinga is a philosophic sage because he disagreed with popular opinion of many Luos during the S. M. Otieno burial trial, when he claimed that it is fine for Luos to be buried anywhere in Kenya (240-42).
Oriare Nyarwath analyzed several of Oruka’s sages on the topic of freedom (Nyarwath in Graness and Kresse 211-218). He went on to write a PhD thesis in 2009 on Oruka’s philosophical works which included his review of the sage philosophy project’s purpose and methodology, but he did not include interviews of sages or commentary upon Oruka’s sage interviews (139-161, 247-48). Instead, the thesis focused on the question of Oruka’s commitments and overarching themes throughout his published works.
Also, students at Tangaza College in Nairobi’s Maryknoll Institute of African Studies program were regularly offered a course in sage philosophy, earlier taught by Oruka himself, then by F. Ochieng’-Odhiambo, and later, by Oriare Nyarwath (Maryknoll “Sage Philosophy”). These students continued to interview sages; their reports can be found in the Tangaza College library. In the earlier years, that is, in the 1990s, reports were almost always accompanied by transcripts of the interviews. But after around 2000, the number of student papers containing the transcript of the interviews declined. Either students gave short quotes of the interviews, or they only referred to interviews without giving any direct quotes.
Kai Kresse’s book, Philosophising in Mombasa, got its inspiration from Oruka’s project. Kresse explained that he was seeking knowledge about knowledge in the context of the Muslim community living on Kenya’s Swahili coast. He wanted to study the self-reflexive, critical knowledge of local thinkers there. His book contained three in-depth portraits of local elder intellectuals and several briefer portraits of younger thinkers. Kresse explained how his methodology differed from Oruka’s. Unlike Oruka, Kresse did not center his study on direct questions put to each thinker interviewed, but instead observed the intellectuals during their philosophical discourses with members of their community. Kresse himself became fluent in Swahili so that he could follow such discussions directly, and read the scholars’ lectures, poetry and other writings. He lived in the Mombasa Old Town community so that he could be socially accepted and therefore placed in situations to hear and document the most interesting discussions. Kresse also helped his readers by describing the historical, religious and cultural context in which the debates occurred, as well as the personal biographies of the participants. But like Oruka and Brenner, Kresse saw a key part of his work as documenting “the utterances of the intellectuals” (31; Brenner). While Kresse added his own interpretation, he provided clear demarcation to his commentary, so that the reader could accept or reject the interpretations offered.
Kresse then followed with several chapters, each focusing on a particular thinker. Ahmed Sheikh Nabhany had as his goal the preservation of all that was good in Swahili traditions. Through poetry he was able to use his creative skills to communicate the basics of Islamic practices as well as moral guidelines and cultural practices. Nabhany was active in his proposals for preservation of a moral code that was losing ground in contemporary society. In his next chapter Kresse explored Ahmad Nassir, who in his poem “Utenzi wa Mtu ni Utu” summed up a moral code that involved respecting all human beings, that provided guidelines for distinguishing between good and bad actions, and that offered a way to measure moral status. Kresse considered Nassir to be an innovator insofar as he constructed a theory of utu (humaneness) and formulated sub-concepts that enforce utu. The next chapter focused on Sheikh Abdilahi Nassir’s Ramadan lectures. Kresse argued that Abdilahi was a sage, referring to Oruka’s use of the term in the context of his sage philosophy project. Abdulahi’s practice of rethinking his own positions on issues of dire importance to his community, and the extent of his conscious effort to clarify his ideas, made Abdulahi’s practices a clear example of philosophizing (206-07).
Kresse followed the book with an article in 2008 that engaged in a study of the concept of wisdom, based on two Swahili sages. He argued that a person is identified as wise if they are able to make others see the world in a different light or from a new perspective. He argued that wisdom required social performance and interaction (“Can,” 194, 199).
Workineh Kelbessa, a philosopher from Ethiopia who had met Oruka and was inspired by his project, used Oruka’s interview method to gain knowledge about environmental values among the Oromo of Ethiopia. He wrote a book about his findings. His work drew upon culture philosophy as well as the insights of philosophic sages. He explained, “In this work, the term ‘indigenous environmental ethics’ is used sometimes to refer to the ethical views of philosophic sages who have their own independent views, and in most cases it is used as a plural (of ‘environmental ethic’) to refer to the norms and values of various Oromo groups and of other indigenous peoples” (ch. 1). His objective was to “show how indigenous knowledge systems can serve as a critical resource base for the process of development and a healthy environment.” He cautioned that he did not intend to engage in uncritical, nostalgic acceptance of Oromo indigenous knowledge. He used various sources, but depended most upon “interviewing, focus group discussion and observation” because they “enable us to understand values and attitudes of the people towards the environment at a level inaccessible to a questionnaire.” He interviewed peasant farmers and pastoralists to learn about their concepts of time and divination, their ecotheology, and their attitudes toward wild animals, forests, and agriculture (ch. 1). His study drew upon many proverbs.
A further sage philosophy study which attempted to apply the insights gained from sage philosophy to the topic of a new national culture for Kenya was written by Chaungo Barasa, who helped Oruka conduct his sage philosophy interviews. Chaungo argued that cultural practices needed to be connected to consistent thoughts and belief systems. He suggested Kenyans re-examine their lives and cultures in five areas: the intersection/harmonization of tradition and modernity, death and burial ceremonies, marriage and inheritance, inter-family and clan relations, and leadership and role-modeling. All of this could be attained with the help of sage philosophy, which encouraged people to pursue wisdom and reflect on their beliefs. The family taught moral behavior, he noted; however, in Kenya’s modern families (making up about 35 percent of the population) there was, he argued, a lack of morality. “Modern” Kenyans, he wrote, held a flawed concept of modernity, equating it with European culture and religion, and their understanding of that culture was rudimentary and incoherent. Chaungo maintained that the modern Kenyan also had a stunted understanding of indigenous cultures and traditions; in their place were materialism, and consumerism, and status. They barely masked their distaste for rural folk and environment, Chaungo argued; yet, they engaged in gender oppression which contradicted modernity. Also, modern Kenyans were easily manipulated and bought by various politicians. Such a description showed that philosophical reflection upon tradition was mandatory in order for society to become productive and coherent.
Oral historian E. S. Atieno-Odhiambo’s article “Luo Perspectives on Knowledge and Development: Samuel G. Ayany and Paul Mbuya” (2000) analyzed and evaluated books and pamphlets written by these two sages. Paul Mbuya Akoko, interviewed by Oruka and included in Sage Philosophy, was also a writer. This article met the two criteria of quoting individual sages, and engaging in critical analysis. Since the sages addressed the topic of development, the thrust of the article also fit in with Oruka’s expressed goals for his sage philosophy project. Mbuya was not the only sage included in Oruka’s Sage Philosophy who had written down his own ideas, and yet Oruka did not analyze the written works of the sages he included in his study.
In his “Conversations with Luo Sages,” D. A. Masolo recorded a conversation of pressing issues of the day in which a sage takes center stage, and in which Masolo was a participant but did not direct the conversation. Masolo considered this an example of participant observation, which, according to some anthropologists, could be a more reliable source of texts for understanding African philosophy than interviews. Masolo included this conversation transcript in his book Self and Community (255-60) because it shed light on contemporary moral debate in Kenya. While not explicitly expressed, what “emerged” during the conversation was the question of whether the worth of abstract moral principles “ought to be judged independently of any real situation” (263). Masolo then further analyzed the issues raised, in the context of moral positions expressed by Kant, Hume, and Wiredu. In another part of the same work, Masolo drew upon the insights of a sage interviewed by Oruka, Paul Mbuya Akoko. He found these to express helpful ideas for grounding the ethics of communalism, described by the sage as, in Masolo’s words, “a norm arrived at for purposes of affecting order in the lives of people by reducing social differences and promoting peace” (50). Masolo could be seen as a contemporary advocate and practitioner of a variant of sage philosophy. His methods focused not on interviews of a sage by a researcher, but rather the analysis of discourse at various public fora in which the sages gathered, such as “palavers,” public debates and negotiations. In these contexts, sages used their mental skills and were involved in sustained critical inquiry (“Sage Philosophy”).
Richard Bell’s book, Understanding African Philosophy, devoted a section to Oruka’s sage philosophy. He wanted to take Oruka’s project further by exploring oral philosophy as an example of narrative and Socratic discourse found not only in the texts of sages but also in everyday discourse and village palavers (32-35, 111-12).). For Bell, philosophy in Africa had to be tied to the experience of the lived reality of Africa, which was made up of the pre-colonial traditions of Africa, and its colonial history, current harsh circumstances, and human struggles (35). Bell analogized to Plato’s dialogues, such as Euthyphro, where, in the context of everyday life, circumstances give rise to philosophical dilemmas. Sages similarly prompted to engage in discussion as well as deep thought, and they grappled with situations which gave rise to what Bell called the “narrative ‘stuff’ of philosophy” (112).
Bekele Gutema argued that sage philosophy’s method was particularly productive in exploring topics of conflict resolution, such as crises of democracy, problems of ruling elites and corruption, and ethnic strife. Sages emphasized solutions that addressed the needs and perspectives of all parties, having as their goals the harmony between people as well as between people and nature. He added what he knew about elders being involved in reconciliation from his own experience (208-11). Presbey interviewed sages with these themes in mind. She found sages in both Kenya and Ghana who shared their insights into conflict, whether interpersonal or ethnic, and their procedures for bringing estranged parties together. She quoted from her interviews with the sages and evaluated their insights (Presbey “Contemporary African Sages”; “Philosophic Sages”; “Sage Philosophy and Critical Thinking”).
Charles Verharen of Howard University engaged in a project which combined Oruka’s sage philosophy project with the methods of Claude Sumner, S.J., the scholar who studied Ethiopian philosophy while living there for 45 years. Verharen noted that Sumner, following the suggestion of Alain Locke, enlisted the aid of linguists and anthropologists to do his philosophical work, something that Oruka did not do, but that Verharen considered essential to his project. Verharen engaged in interviews both among the Oromo and, with the help of Rianna Oelofsen of University of Fort Hare, South Africa, among the Xhosa and San. Verharen explained that he was drawn to study sage philosophy out of concerns for cultural survival as well as philosophy’s survival, as he searched for “better stories to tell” in a world where human survival was jeopardized (83-88). He suggested interviewing both those known as sages and a broader group drawn from all parts of the society, questioning them in such a way as to reveal their level of critical rationality (75-76).
Kazeem likewise suggests that sage philosophy research should continue with slight modifications in order that philosophers can salvage “indigenous epistemologies threatened with extinction” and thereby contribute to a “polycentric global epistemology” (200). Kazeem names his approach “hermeneutico-reconstructionism” and asserts that it can be used to solve Africa’s current problems (200-01).
Oruka’s contribution to the field of African philosophy was substantial, and his influence is ongoing, as sage research continues.
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Gail M. Presbey
University of Detroit Mercy
U. S. A.