Albert Camus (1913—1960)
Albert Camus was a French-Algerian journalist, playwright, novelist, philosophical essayist, and Nobel laureate. Though he was neither by advanced training nor profession a philosopher, he nevertheless made important, forceful contributions to a wide range of issues in moral philosophy in his novels, reviews, articles, essays, and speeches—from terrorism and political violence to suicide and the death penalty. He is often described as an existentialist writer, though he himself disavowed the label. He began his literary career as a political journalist and as an actor, director, and playwright in his native Algeria. Later, while living in occupied France during WWII, he became active in the Resistance and from 1944-47 served as editor-in-chief of the newspaper Combat. By mid-century, based on the strength of his three novels (The Stranger, The Plague, and The Fall) and two book-length philosophical essays (The Myth of Sisyphus and The Rebel), he had achieved an international reputation and readership. It was in these works that he introduced and developed the twin philosophical ideas—the concept of the Absurd and the notion of Revolt—that made him famous. These are the ideas that people immediately think of when they hear the name Albert Camus spoken today. The Absurd can be defined as a metaphysical tension or opposition that results from the presence of human consciousness—with its ever-pressing demand for order and meaning in life—in an essentially meaningless and indifferent universe. Camus considered the Absurd to be a fundamental and even defining characteristic of the modern human condition. The notion of Revolt refers to both a path of resolved action and a state of mind. It can take extreme forms such as terrorism or a reckless and unrestrained egoism (both of which are rejected by Camus), but basically, and in simple terms, it consists of an attitude of heroic defiance or resistance to whatever oppresses human beings. In awarding Camus its prize for literature in 1957, the Nobel Prize committee cited his persistent efforts to “illuminate the problem of the human conscience in our time.” He was honored by his own generation, and is still admired today, for being a writer of conscience and a champion of imaginative literature as a vehicle of philosophical insight and moral truth. He was at the height of his career—at work on an autobiographical novel, planning new projects for theatre, film, and television, and still seeking a solution to the lacerating political turmoil in his homeland—when he died tragically in an automobile accident in January 1960.
Table of Contents
- Literary Career
- Camus, Philosophical Literature, and the Novel of Ideas
- Camus, Colonialism, and Algeria
- Significance and Legacy
- References and Further Reading
Albert Camus was born on November 7, 1913, in Mondovi, a small village near the seaport city of Bonê (present-day Annaba) in the northeast region of French Algeria. He was the second child of Lucien Auguste Camus, a military veteran and wine-shipping clerk, and of Catherine Helene (Sintes) Camus, a house-keeper and part-time factory worker. (Note: Although Camus believed that his father was Alsatian and a first-generation émigré, research by biographer Herbert Lottman indicates that the Camus family was originally from Bordeaux and that the first Camus to leave France for Algeria was actually the author’s great-grandfather, who in the early 19th century became part of the first wave of European colonial settlers in the new melting pot of North Africa.)
Shortly after the outbreak of WWI, when Camus was less than a year old, his father was recalled to military service and, on October 11, 1914, died of shrapnel wounds suffered at the first battle of the Marne. As a child, about the only thing Camus ever learned about his father was that he had once become violently ill after witnessing a public execution. This anecdote, which surfaces in fictional form in the author’s novel The Stranger and is also recounted in his philosophical essay “Reflections on the Guillotine,” strongly affected Camus and influenced his lifelong opposition to the death penalty.
After his father’s death, Camus, his mother, and his older brother moved to Algiers where they lived with his maternal uncle and grandmother in her cramped second-floor apartment in the working-class district of Belcourt. Camus’s mother Catherine, who was illiterate, partially deaf, and afflicted with a speech pathology, worked in an ammunition factory and cleaned homes to help support the family. In his posthumously published autobiographical novel The First Man, Camus recalls this period of his life with a mixture of pain and affection as he describes conditions of harsh poverty (the three-room apartment had no bathroom, no electricity, and no running water) relieved by hunting trips, family outings, childhood games, and scenic flashes of sun, seashore, mountain, and desert.
Camus attended elementary school at the local Ecole Communale, and it was there that he encountered the first in a series of teacher-mentors who recognized and nurtured the young boy’s lively intelligence. These father figures introduced him to a new world of history and imagination and to literary landscapes far beyond the dusty streets of Belcourt and working-class poverty. Though stigmatized as a pupille de la nation (that is, a war veteran’s child dependent on public welfare) and hampered by recurrent health issues, Camus distinguished himself as a student and was eventually awarded a scholarship to attend high school at the Grand Lycee. Located near the famous Kasbah district, the school brought him into close proximity with the native Muslim community and thus gave him an early recognition of the idea of the “outsider” that would dominate his later writings.
It was in secondary school that Camus became an avid reader (absorbing Gide, Proust, Verlaine, and Bergson, among others), learned Latin and English, and developed a lifelong interest in literature, art, theatre, and film. He also enjoyed sports, especially soccer, of which he once wrote (recalling his early experience as a goal-keeper): “I learned . . . that a ball never arrives from the direction you expected it. That helped me in later life, especially in mainland France, where nobody plays straight.” It was also during this period that Camus suffered his first serious attack of tuberculosis, a disease that was to afflict him, on and off, throughout his career.
By the time he finished his Baccalauréat degree in June 1932, Camus was already contributing articles to Sud, a literary monthly, and looking forward to a career in journalism, the arts, or higher education. The next four years (1933-37) were an especially busy period in his life during which he attended college, worked at odd jobs, married his first wife (Simone Hié), divorced, briefly joined the Communist party, and effectively began his professional theatrical and writing career. Among his various employments during the time were stints of routine office work where one job consisted of a Bartleby-like recording and sifting of meteorological data and another involved paper shuffling in an auto license bureau. One can well imagine that it was as a result of this experience that his famous conception of Sisyphean struggle, heroic defiance in the face of the Absurd, first began to take shape within his imagination.
In 1933, Camus enrolled at the University of Algiers to pursue his diplome d’etudes superieures, specializing in philosophy and gaining certificates in sociology and psychology along the way. In 1936, he became a co-founder, along with a group of young fellow intellectuals, of the Théâtre du Travail, a professional acting company specializing in drama with left-wing political themes. Camus served the company as both an actor and director and also contributed scripts, including his first published play Revolt in Asturia, a drama based on an ill-fated workers’ revolt during the Spanish Civil War. That same year Camus also earned his degree and completed his dissertation, a study of the influence of Plotinus and neo-Platonism on the thought and writings of St. Augustine.
Over the next three years Camus further established himself as an emerging author, journalist, and theatre professional. After his disillusionment with and eventual expulsion from the Communist Party, he reorganized his dramatic company and renamed it the Théâtre de l’Equipe (literally the Theater of the Team). The name change signaled a new emphasis on classic drama and avant-garde aesthetics and a shift away from labor politics and agitprop. In 1938 he joined the staff of a new daily newspaper, the Alger Républicain, where his assignments as a reporter and reviewer covered everything from contemporary European literature to local political trials. It was during this period that he also published his first two literary works—Betwixt and Between, a collection of five short semi-autobiographical and philosophical pieces (1937) and Nuptials, a series of lyrical celebrations interspersed with political and philosophical reflections on North Africa and the Mediterranean.
The 1940s witnessed Camus’s gradual ascendance to the rank of world-class literary intellectual. He started the decade as a locally acclaimed author and playwright, but he was a figure virtually unknown outside the city of Algiers; however, he ended the decade as an internationally recognized novelist, dramatist, journalist, philosophical essayist, and champion of freedom. This period of his life began inauspiciously—war in Europe, the occupation of France, official censorship, and a widening crackdown on left-wing journals. Camus was still without stable employment or steady income when, after marrying his second wife, Francine Faure, in December of 1940, he departed Lyons, where he had been working as a journalist, and returned to Algeria. To help make ends meet, he taught part-time (French history and geography) at a private school in Oran. All the while he was putting finishing touches to his first novel The Stranger, which was finally published in 1942 to favorable critical response, including a lengthy and penetrating review by Jean-Paul Sartre. The novel propelled him into immediate literary renown.
Camus returned to France in 1942 and a year later began working for the clandestine newspaper Combat, the journalistic arm and voice of the French Resistance movement. During this period, while contending with recurrent bouts of tuberculosis, he also published The Myth of Sisyphus, his philosophical anatomy of suicide and the absurd, and joined Gallimard Publishing as an editor, a position he held until his death.
After the Liberation, Camus continued as editor of Combat, oversaw the production and publication of two plays, The Misunderstanding and Caligula, and assumed a leading role in Parisian intellectual society in the company of Sartre and Simone de Beauvoir among others. In the late 40s his growing reputation as a writer and thinker was enlarged by the publication of The Plague, an allegorical novel and fictional parable of the Nazi Occupation and the duty of revolt, and by the lecture tours to the United States and South America. In 1951 he published The Rebel, a reflection on the nature of freedom and rebellion and a philosophical critique of revolutionary violence. This powerful and controversial work, with its explicit condemnation of Marxism-Leninism and its emphatic denunciation of unrestrained violence as a means of human liberation, led to an eventual falling out with Sartre and, along with his opposition to the Algerian National Liberation Front, to his being branded a reactionary in the view of many European Communists. Yet his position also established him as an outspoken champion of individual freedom and as an impassioned critic of tyranny and terrorism, whether practiced by the Left or by the Right.
In 1956, Camus published the short, confessional novel The Fall, which unfortunately would be the last of his completed major works and which in the opinion of some critics is the most elegant, and most under-rated of all his books. During this period he was still afflicted by tuberculosis and was perhaps even more sorely beset by the deteriorating political situation in his native Algeria—which had by now escalated from demonstrations and occasional terrorist and guerilla attacks into open violence and insurrection. Camus still hoped to champion some kind of rapprochement that would allow the native Muslim population and the French pied noir minority to live together peaceably in a new de-colonized and largely integrated, if not fully independent, nation. Alas, by this point, as he painfully realized, the odds of such an outcome were becoming increasingly unlikely.
In the fall of 1957, following publication of Exile and the Kingdom, a collection of short fiction, Camus was shocked by news that he had been awarded the Nobel Prize for literature. He absorbed the announcement with mixed feelings of gratitude, humility, and amazement. On the one hand, the award was obviously a tremendous honor. On the other, not only did he feel that his friend and esteemed fellow novelist Andre Malraux was more deserving, he was also aware that the Nobel itself was widely regarded as the kind of accolade usually given to artists at the end of a long career. Yet, as he indicated in his acceptance speech at Stockholm, he considered his own career as still in mid-flight, with much yet to accomplish and even greater writing challenges ahead:
Every person, and assuredly every artist, wants to be recognized. So do I. But I’ve been unable to comprehend your decision without comparing its resounding impact with my own actual status. A man almost young, rich only in his doubts, and with his work still in progress…how could such a man not feel a kind of panic at hearing a decree that transports him all of a sudden…to the center of a glaring spotlight? And with what feelings could he accept this honor at a time when other writers in Europe, among them the very greatest, are condemned to silence, and even at a time when the country of his birth is going through unending misery?
Of course Camus could not have known as he spoke these words that most of his writing career was in fact behind him. Over the next two years, he published articles and continued to write, produce, and direct plays, including his own adaptation of Dostoyevsky’s The Possessed. He also formulated new concepts for film and television, assumed a leadership role in a new experimental national theater, and continued to campaign for peace and a political solution in Algeria. Unfortunately, none of these latter projects would be brought to fulfillment. On January 4, 1960, Camus died tragically in a car accident while he was a passenger in a vehicle driven by his friend and publisher Michel Gallimard, who also suffered fatal injuries. The author was buried in the local cemetery at Lourmarin, a village in Provencal where he and his wife and daughters had lived for nearly a decade.
Upon hearing of Camus’s death, Sartre wrote a moving eulogy in the France-Observateur, saluting his former friend and political adversary not only for his distinguished contributions to French literature but especially for the heroic moral courage and “stubborn humanism” which he brought to bear against the “massive and deformed events of the day.”
2. Literary Career
According to Sartre’s perceptive appraisal, Camus was less a novelist and more a writer of philosophical tales and parables in the tradition of Voltaire. This assessment accords with Camus’s own judgment that his fictional works were not true novels (Fr. romans), a form he associated with the densely populated and richly detailed social panoramas of writers like Balzac, Tolstoy, and Proust, but rather contes (“tales”) and recits (“narratives”) combining philosophical and psychological insights.
In this respect, it is also worth noting that at no time in his career did Camus ever describe himself as a deep thinker or lay claim to the title of philosopher. Instead, he nearly always referred to himself simply, yet proudly, as un ecrivain—a writer. This is an important fact to keep in mind when assessing his place in intellectual history and in twentieth-century philosophy, for by no means does he qualify as a system-builder or theorist or even as a disciplined thinker. He was instead (and here again Sartre’s assessment is astute) a sort of all-purpose critic and modern-day philosophe: a debunker of mythologies, a critic of fraud and superstition, an enemy of terror, a voice of reason and compassion, and an outspoken defender of freedom—all in all a figure very much in the Enlightenment tradition of Voltaire and Diderot. For this reason, in assessing Camus’s career and work, it may be best simply to take him at his own word and characterize him first and foremost as a writer—advisedly attaching the epithet “philosophical” for sharper accuracy and definition.
3. Camus, Philosophical Literature, and the Novel of Ideas
To pin down exactly why and in what distinctive sense Camus may be termed a philosophical writer, we can begin by comparing him with other authors who have merited the designation. Right away, we can eliminate any comparison with the efforts of Lucretius and Dante, who undertook to unfold entire cosmologies and philosophical systems in epic verse. Camus obviously attempted nothing of the sort. On the other hand, we can draw at least a limited comparison between Camus and writers like Pascal, Kierkegaard, and Nietzsche—that is, with writers who were first of all philosophers or religious writers, but whose stylistic achievements and literary flair gained them a special place in the pantheon of world literature as well. Here we may note that Camus himself was very conscious of his debt to Kierkegaard and Nietzsche (especially in the style and structure of The Myth of Sisyphus and The Rebel) and that he might very well have followed in their literary-philosophical footsteps if his tuberculosis had not side-tracked him into fiction and journalism and prevented him from pursuing an academic career.
Perhaps Camus himself best defined his own particular status as a philosophical writer when he wrote (with authors like Melville, Stendhal, Dostoyevsky, and Kafka especially in mind): “The great novelists are philosophical novelists”; that is, writers who eschew systematic explanation and create their discourse using “images instead of arguments” (The Myth of Sisyphus 74).
By his own definition then Camus is a philosophical writer in the sense that he has (a) conceived his own distinctive and original world-view and (b) sought to convey that view mainly through images, fictional characters and events, and via dramatic presentation rather than through critical analysis and direct discourse. He is also both a novelist of ideas and a psychological novelist, and in this respect, he certainly compares most closely to Dostoyevsky and Sartre, two other writers who combine a unique and distinctly philosophical outlook, acute psychological insight, and a dramatic style of presentation. (Like Camus, Sartre was a productive playwright, and Dostoyevsky remains perhaps the most dramatic of all novelists, as Camus clearly understood, having adapted both The Brothers Karamazov and The Possessed for the stage.)
Camus’s reputation rests largely on the three novels published during his lifetime—The Stranger, The Plague, and The Fall—and on his two major philosophical essays—The Myth of Sisyphus and The Rebel. However, his body of work also includes a collection of short fiction, Exile and the Kingdom; an autobiographical novel, The First Man; a number of dramatic works, most notably Caligula, The Misunderstanding, The State of Siege, and The Just Assassins; several translations and adaptations, including new versions of works by Calderon, Lope de Vega, Dostoyevsky, and Faulkner; and a lengthy assortment of essays, prose pieces, critical reviews, transcribed speeches and interviews, articles, and works of journalism. A brief summary and description of the most important of Camus’s writings is presented below as preparation for a larger discussion of his philosophy and world-view, including his main ideas and recurrent philosophical themes.
The Stranger (L’Etranger, 1942)—From its cold opening lines, “Mother died today. Or maybe yesterday; I can’t be sure,” to its bleak concluding image of a public execution set to take place beneath the “benign indifference of the universe,” Camus’s first and most famous novel takes the form of a terse, flat, first-person narrative by its main character Meursault, a very ordinary young man of unremarkable habits and unemotional affect who, inexplicably and in an almost absent-minded way, kills an Arab and then is arrested, tried, convicted, and sentenced to death. The neutral style of the novel—typical of what the critic Roland Barthes called “writing degree zero”—serves as a perfect vehicle for the descriptions and commentary of its anti-hero narrator, the ultimate “outsider” and a person who seems to observe everything, including his own life, with almost pathological detachment.
The Plague (La Peste, 1947)—Set in the coastal town of Oran, Camus’s second novel is the story of an outbreak of plague, traced from its subtle, insidious, unheeded beginnings and horrible, seemingly irresistible dominion to its eventual climax and decline, all told from the viewpoint of one of the survivors. Camus made no effort to conceal the fact that his novel was partly based on and could be interpreted as an allegory or parable of the rise of Nazism and the nightmare of the Occupation. However, the plague metaphor is both more complicated and more flexible than that, extending to signify the Absurd in general as well as any calamity or disaster that tests the mettle of human beings, their endurance, their solidarity, their sense of responsibility, their compassion, and their will. At the end of the novel, the plague finally retreats, and the narrator reflects that a time of pestilence teaches “that there is more to admire in men than to despise,” but he also knows “that the plague bacillus never dies or disappears for good,” that “the day would come when, for the bane and the enlightening of men, it would rouse up its rats again” and send them forth yet once more to spread death and contagion into a happy and unsuspecting city.
The Fall (La Chute, 1956)—Camus’s third novel, and the last to be published during his lifetime, is in effect an extended dramatic monologue spoken by M. Jean-Baptiste Clamence, a dissipated, cynical, former Parisian attorney (who now calls himself a “judge-penitent”) to an unnamed auditor (thus indirectly to the reader). Set in a seedy bar in the red-light district of Amsterdam, the work is a small masterpiece of compression and style: a confessional (and semi-autobiographical) novel, an arresting character study and psychological portrait, and at the same time a wide-ranging philosophical discourse on guilt and innocence, expiation and punishment, good and evil.
Camus began his literary career as a playwright and theatre director and was planning new dramatic works for film, stage, and television at the time of his death. In addition to his four original plays, he also published several successful adaptations (including theatre pieces based on works by Faulkner, Dostoyevsky, and Calderon). He took particular pride in his work as a dramatist and man of the theatre. However, his plays never achieved the same popularity, critical success, or level of incandescence as his more famous novels and major essays.
Caligula (1938, first produced 1945)—“Men die and are not happy.” Such is the complaint against the universe pronounced by the young emperor Caligula, who in Camus’s play is less the murderous lunatic, slave to incest, narcissist, and megalomaniac of Roman history than a theatrical martyr-hero of the Absurd: a man who carries his philosophical quarrel with the meaninglessness of human existence to a kind of fanatical but logical extreme. Camus described his hero as a man “obsessed with the impossible” willing to pervert all values, and if necessary destroy himself and all those around him in the pursuit of absolute liberty. Caligula was Camus’s first attempt at portraying a figure in absolute defiance of the Absurd, and through three revisions of the play over a period of several years he eventually achieved a remarkable composite by adding to Caligula’s original portrait touches of Sade, of revolutionary nihilism, of the Nietzschean Superman, of his own version of Sisyphus, and even of Mussolini and Hitler.
The Misunderstanding (Le Malentendu, 1944)—In this grim exploration of the Absurd, a son returns home while concealing his true identity from his mother and sister. The two women operate a boarding house where, in order to make ends meet, they quietly murder and rob their patrons. Through a tangle of misunderstanding and mistaken identity they wind up murdering their unrecognized visitor. Camus has explained the drama as an attempt to capture the atmosphere of malaise, corruption, demoralization, and anonymity that he experienced while living in France during the German occupation. Despite the play’s dark themes and bleak style, he described its philosophy as ultimately optimistic: “It amounts to saying that in an unjust or indifferent world man can save himself, and save others, by practicing the most basic sincerity and pronouncing the most appropriate word.”
State of Siege (L’Etat de Siege, 1948)—This odd allegorical drama combines features of the medieval morality play with elements of Calderon and the Spanish baroque; it also has apocalyptic themes, bits of music hall comedy, and a collection of avant-garde theatrics thrown in for good measure. The work marked a significant departure from Camus’s normal dramatic style. It also resulted in virtually universal disapproval and negative reviews from Paris theatre-goers and critics, many of whom came expecting a play based on Camus’s recent novel The Plague. The play is set in the Spanish seaport city of Cadiz, famous for its beaches, carnivals, and street musicians. By the end of the first act, the normally laid-back and carefree citizens fall under the dominion of a gaudily beribboned and uniformed dictator named Plague (based on Generalissimo Franco) and his officious, clip-board wielding Secretary (who turns out to be a modern, bureaucratic incarnation of the medieval figure Death). One of the prominent concerns of the play is the Orwellian theme of the degradation of language via totalitarian politics and bureaucracy (symbolized onstage by calls for silence, scenes in pantomime, and a gagged chorus). As one character observes, “we are steadily nearing that perfect moment when nothing anybody says will rouse the least echo in another’s mind.”
The Just Assassins (Les Justes, 1950)—First performed in Paris to largely favorable reviews, this play is based on real-life characters and an actual historical event: the 1905 assassination of the Russian Grand Duke Sergei Alexandrovich by Ivan Kalyayev and fellow members of the Combat Organization of the Socialist Revolutionary Party. The play effectively dramatizes the issues that Camus would later explore in detail in The Rebel, especially the question of whether acts of terrorism and political violence can ever be morally justified (and if so, with what limitations and in what specific circumstances). The historical Kalyayev passed up his original opportunity to bomb the Grand Duke’s carriage because the Duke was accompanied by his wife and two young nephews. However, this was no act of conscience on Kalyayev’s part but a purely practical decision based on his calculation that the murder of children would prove a setback to the revolution. After the successful completion of his bombing mission and subsequent arrest, Kalyayev welcomed his execution on similarly practical and purely political grounds, believing that his death would further the cause of revolution and social justice. Camus’s Kalyayev, on the other hand, is a far more agonized and conscientious figure, neither so cold-blooded nor so calculating as his real-life counterpart. Upon seeing the two children in the carriage, he refuses to toss his bomb not because doing so would be politically inexpedient but because he is overcome emotionally, temporarily unnerved by the sad expression in their eyes. Similarly, at the end of the play he embraces his death not so much because it will aid the revolution, but almost as a form of karmic penance, as if it were indeed some kind of sacred duty or metaphysical requirement that must be performed in order for true justice to be achieved.
c. Essays, Letters, Prose Collections, Articles, and Reviews
Betwixt and Between (L’Envers et l’endroit, 1937)—This short collection of semi-autobiographical, semi-fictional, philosophical pieces might be dismissed as juvenilia and largely ignored if it were not for the fact that it represents Camus’s first attempt to formulate a coherent life-outlook and world-view. The collection, which in a way serves as a germ or starting point for the author’s later philosophy, consists of five lyrical essays. In “Irony” (“L’Ironie”), a reflection on youth and age, Camus asserts, in the manner of a young disciple of Pascal, our essential solitariness in life and death. In “Between yes and no” (“Entre Oui et Non”) he suggests that to hope is as empty and as pointless as to despair, yet he goes beyond nihilism by positing a fundamental value to existence-in-the-world. In “Death in the soul” (“La Mort dans l’ame”) he supplies a sort of existential travel review, contrasting his impressions of central and Eastern Europe (which he views as purgatorial and morgue-like) with the more spontaneous life of Italy and Mediterranean culture. The piece thus affirms the author’s lifelong preference for the color and vitality of the Mediterranean world, and especially North Africa, as opposed to what he perceives as the soulless cold-heartedness of modern Europe. In “Love of life” (“Amour de vivre”) he claims there can be no love of life without despair of life and thus largely re-asserts the essentially tragic, ancient Greek view that the very beauty of human existence is largely contingent upon its brevity and fragility. The concluding essay, “Betwixt and between” (“L’Envers et l’endroit”), summarizes and re-emphasizes the Romantic themes of the collection as a whole: our fundamental “aloneness,” the importance of imagination and openness to experience, the imperative to “live as if….”
Nuptials (Noces, 1938)—This collection of four rhapsodic narratives supplements and amplifies the youthful philosophy expressed in Betwixt and Between. That joy is necessarily intertwined with despair, that the shortness of life confers a premium on intense experience, and that the world is both beautiful and violent—these are, once again, Camus’s principal themes. “Summer in Algiers,” which is probably the best (and best-known) of the essays in the collection, is a lyrical, at times almost ecstatic, celebration of sea, sun, and the North African landscape. Affirming a defiantly atheistic creed, Camus concludes with one of the core ideas of his philosophy: “If there is a sin against life, it consists not so much in despairing as in hoping for another life and in eluding the implacable grandeur of this one.”
The Myth of Sisyphus (Le Mythe de Sisyphe, 1943)—If there is a single non-fiction work that can be considered an essential or fundamental statement of Camus’s philosophy, it is this extended essay on the ethics of suicide (eventually translated and repackaged for American publication in 1955). It is here that Camus formally introduces and fully articulates his most famous idea, the concept of the Absurd, and his equally famous image of life as a Sisyphean struggle. From its provocative opening sentence—“There is but one truly serious philosophical problem, and that is suicide”—to its stirring, paradoxical conclusion—“The struggle itself toward the heights is enough to fill a man’s heart. One must imagine Sisyphus happy”—the book has something interesting and challenging on nearly every page and is shot through with brilliant aphorisms and insights. In the end, Camus rejects suicide: the Absurd must not be evaded either by religion (“philosophical suicide”) or by annihilation (“physical suicide”); the task of living should not merely be accepted, it must be embraced.
The Rebel (L’Homme Revolte, 1951)—Camus considered this work a continuation of the critical and philosophical investigation of the Absurd that he began with The Myth of Sisyphus. Only this time his primary concern is not suicide but murder. He takes up the question of whether acts of terrorism and political violence can be morally justified, which is basically the same question he had addressed earlier in his play The Just Assassins. After arguing that an authentic life inevitably involves some form of conscientious moral revolt, Camus winds up concluding that only in rare and very narrowly defined instances is political violence justified. Camus’s critique of revolutionary violence and terror in this work, and particularly his caustic assessment of Marxism-Leninism (which he accused of sacrificing innocent lives on the altar of History), touched nerves throughout Europe and led in part to his celebrated feud with Sartre and other French leftists.
Resistance, Rebellion, and Death (1960)—This posthumous collection is of interest to students of Camus mainly because it brings together an unusual assortment of his non-fiction writings on a wide range of topics, from art and politics to the advantages of pessimism and the virtues (from a non-believer’s standpoint) of Christianity. Of special interest are two pieces that helped secure Camus’s worldwide reputation as a voice of liberty: “Letters to a German Friend,” a set of four letters originally written during the Nazi Occupation, and “Reflections on the Guillotine,” a denunciation of the death penalty cited for special mention by the Nobel committee and eventually revised and re-published as a companion essay to go with fellow death-penalty opponent Arthur Koestler’s “Reflections on Hanging.”
To re-emphasize a point made earlier, Camus considered himself first and foremost a writer (un ecrivain). Indeed, Camus’s dissertation advisor penciled onto his dissertation the assessment “More a writer than a philosopher.” And at various times in his career he also accepted the labels journalist, humanist, novelist, and even moralist. However, he apparently never felt comfortable identifying himself as a philosopher—a term he seems to have associated with rigorous academic training, systematic thinking, logical consistency, and a coherent, carefully defined doctrine or body of ideas.
This is not to suggest that Camus lacked ideas or to say that his thought cannot be considered a personal philosophy. It is simply to point out that he was not a systematic, or even a notably disciplined thinker and that, unlike Heidegger and Sartre, for example, he showed very little interest in metaphysics and ontology, which seems to be one of the reasons he consistently denied that he was an existentialist. In short, he was not much given to speculative philosophy or any kind of abstract theorizing. His thought is instead nearly always related to current events (e.g., the Spanish War, revolt in Algeria) and is consistently grounded in down-to-earth moral and political reality.
a. Background and Influences
Though he was baptized, raised, and educated as a Catholic and invariably respectful towards the Church, Camus seems to have been a natural-born pagan who showed almost no instinct whatsoever for belief in the supernatural. Even as a youth, he was more of a sun-worshipper and nature lover than a boy notable for his piety or religious faith. On the other hand, there is no denying that Christian literature and philosophy served as an important influence on his early thought and intellectual development. As a young high school student, Camus studied the Bible, read and savored the Spanish mystics St. Theresa of Avila and St. John of the Cross, and was introduced to the thought of St. Augustine St. Augustine would later serve as the subject of his baccalaureate dissertation and become—as a fellow North African writer, quasi-existentialist, and conscientious observer-critic of his own life—an important lifelong influence.
In college Camus absorbed Kierkegaard, who, after Augustine, was probably the single greatest Christian influence on his thought. He also studied Schopenhauer and Nietzsche—undoubtedly the two writers who did the most to set him on his own path of defiant pessimism and atheism. Other notable influences include not only the major modern philosophers from the academic curriculum—from Descartes and Spinoza to Bergson—but also, and just as importantly, philosophical writers like Stendhal, Melville, Dostoyevsky, and Kafka.
The two earliest expressions of Camus’s personal philosophy are his works Betwixt and Between (1937) and Nuptials (1938). Here he unfolds what is essentially a hedonistic, indeed almost primitivistic, celebration of nature and the life of the senses. In the Romantic poetic tradition of writers like Rilke and Wallace Stevens, he offers a forceful rejection of all hereafters and an emphatic embrace of the here and now. There is no salvation, he argues, no transcendence; there is only the enjoyment of consciousness and natural being. One life, this life, is enough. Sky and sea, mountain and desert, have their own beauty and magnificence and constitute a sufficient heaven.
The critic John Cruikshank termed this stage in Camus’s thinking “naïve atheism” and attributed it to his ecstatic and somewhat immature “Mediterraneanism.” Naïve seems an apt characterization for a philosophy that is romantically bold and uncomplicated yet somewhat lacking in sophistication and logical clarity. On the other hand, if we keep in mind Camus’s theatrical background and preference for dramatic presentation, there may actually be more depth and complexity to his thought here than meets the eye. That is to say, just as it would be simplistic and reductive to equate Camus’s philosophy of revolt with that of his character Caligula (who is at best a kind of extreme or mad spokesperson for the author), so in the same way it is possible that the pensées and opinions presented in Nuptials and Betwixt and Between are not so much the views of Camus as they are poetically heightened observations of an artfully crafted narrator—an exuberant alter ego who is far more spontaneous and free-spirited than his more naturally reserved and sober-minded author.
In any case, regardless of this assessment of the ideas expressed in Betwixt and Between and Nuptials, it is clear that these early writings represent an important, if comparatively raw and simple, beginning stage in Camus’s development as a thinker where his views differ markedly from his more mature philosophy in several noteworthy respects. In the first place, the Camus of Nuptials is still a young man of twenty-five, aflame with youthful joie de vivre. He favors a life of impulse and daring as it was honored and practiced in both Romantic literature and in the streets of Belcourt. Recently married and divorced, raised in poverty and in close quarters, beset with health problems, this young man develops an understandable passion for clear air, open space, colorful dreams, panoramic vistas, and the breath-taking prospects and challenges of the larger world. Consequently, the Camus of the period 1937-38 is a decidedly different writer from the Camus who will ascend the dais at Stockholm nearly twenty years later.
The young Camus is more of a sensualist and pleasure-seeker, more of a dandy and aesthete, than the more hardened and austere figure who will endure the Occupation while serving in the French underground. He is a writer passionate in his conviction that life ought to be lived vividly and intensely—indeed rebelliously (to use the term that will take on increasing importance in his thought). He is also a writer attracted to causes, though he is not yet the author who will become world-famous for his moral seriousness and passionate commitment to justice and freedom. All of which is understandable. After all, the Camus of the middle 1930s had not yet witnessed and absorbed the shattering spectacle and disillusioning effects of the Spanish Civil War, the rise of Fascism, Hitlerism, and Stalinism, the coming into being of total war and weapons of mass destruction, and the terrible reign of genocide and terror that would characterize the period 1938-1945. It was under the pressure and in direct response to the events of this period that Camus’s mature philosophy—with its core set of humanistic themes and ideas—emerged and gradually took shape. That mature philosophy is no longer a “naïve atheism” but a very reflective and critical brand of unbelief. It is proudly and inconsolably pessimistic, but not in a polemical or overbearing way. It is unbending, hardheaded, determinedly skeptical. It is tolerant and respectful of world religious creeds, but at the same time wholly unsympathetic to them. In the end it is an affirmative philosophy that accepts and approves, and in its own way blesses, our dreadful mortality and our fundamental isolation in the world.
c. Themes and Ideas
Regardless of whether he is producing drama, fiction, or non-fiction, Camus in his mature writings nearly always takes up and re-explores the same basic philosophical issues. These recurrent topoi constitute the key components of his thought. They include themes like the Absurd, alienation, suicide, and rebellion that almost automatically come to mind whenever his name is mentioned. Hence any summary of his place in modern philosophy would be incomplete without at least a brief discussion of these ideas and how they fit together to form a distinctive and original world-view.
i. The Absurd
Even readers not closely acquainted with Camus’s works are aware of his reputation as the philosophical expositor, anatomist, and poet-apostle of the Absurd. Indeed, as even sitcom writers and stand-up comics apparently understand (odd fact: the comic-bleak final episode of Seinfeld has been compared to The Stranger, and Camus’s thought has been used to explain episodes of The Simpsons), it is largely through the thought and writings of the French-Algerian author that the concept of absurdity has become a part not only of world literature and twentieth-century philosophy but also of modern popular culture.
What then is meant by the notion of the Absurd? Contrary to the view conveyed by popular culture, the Absurd, (at least in Camus’ terms) does not simply refer to some vague perception that modern life is fraught with paradoxes, incongruities, and intellectual confusion. (Although that perception is certainly consistent with his formula.) Instead, as he himself emphasizes and tries to make clear, the Absurd expresses a fundamental disharmony, a tragic incompatibility, in our existence. In effect, he argues that the Absurd is the product of a collision or confrontation between our human desire for order, meaning, and purpose in life and the blank, indifferent “silence of the universe.” (“The absurd is not in man nor in the world,” Camus explains, “but in their presence together . . . it is the only bond uniting them.”)
So here we are: poor creatures desperately seeking hope and meaning in a hopeless, meaningless world. Sartre, in his essay-review of The Stranger provides an additional gloss on the idea: “The absurd, to be sure, resides neither in man nor in the world, if you consider each separately. But since man’s dominant characteristic is ‘being in the world,’ the absurd is, in the end, an inseparable part of the human condition.” The Absurd, then, presents itself in the form of an existential opposition. It arises from the human demand for clarity and transcendence on the one hand and a cosmos that offers nothing of the kind on the other. Such is our fate: we inhabit a world that is indifferent to our sufferings and deaf to our protests.
In Camus’s view there are three possible philosophical responses to this predicament. Two of these he condemns as evasions, and the other he puts forward as a proper solution.
The first choice is blunt and simple: physical suicide. If we decide that a life without some essential purpose or meaning is not worth living, we can simply choose to kill ourselves. Camus rejects this choice as cowardly. In his terms it is a repudiation or renunciation of life, not a true revolt.
The second choice is the religious solution of positing a transcendent world of solace and meaning beyond the Absurd. Camus calls this solution “philosophical suicide” and rejects it as transparently evasive and fraudulent. To adopt a supernatural solution to the problem of the Absurd (for example, through some type of mysticism or leap of faith) is to annihilate reason, which in Camus’s view is as fatal and self-destructive as physical suicide. In effect, instead of removing himself from the absurd confrontation of self and world like the physical suicide, the religious believer simply removes the offending world and replaces it, via a kind of metaphysical abracadabra, with a more agreeable alternative.
The third choice—in Camus’s view the only authentic and valid solution—is simply to accept absurdity, or better yet to embrace it, and to continue living. Since the Absurd in his view is an unavoidable, indeed defining, characteristic of the human condition, the only proper response to it is full, unflinching, courageous acceptance. Life, he says, can “be lived all the better if it has no meaning.”
The example par excellence of this option of spiritual courage and metaphysical revolt is the mythical Sisyphus of Camus’s philosophical essay. Doomed to eternal labor at his rock, fully conscious of the essential hopelessness of his plight, Sisyphus nevertheless pushes on. In doing so he becomes for Camus a superb icon of the spirit of revolt and of the human condition. To rise each day to fight a battle you know you cannot win, and to do this with wit, grace, compassion for others, and even a sense of mission, is to face the Absurd in a spirit of true heroism.
Over the course of his career, Camus examines the Absurd from multiple perspectives and through the eyes of many different characters—from the mad Caligula, who is obsessed with the problem, to the strangely aloof and yet simultaneously self-absorbed Meursault, who seems indifferent to it even as he exemplifies and is finally victimized by it. In The Myth of Sisyphus, Camus traces it in specific characters of legend and literature (Don Juan, Ivan Karamazov) and also in certain character types (the Actor, the Conqueror), all of who may be understood as in some way a version or manifestation of Sisyphus, the archetypal absurd hero.
[Note: A rather different, yet possibly related, notion of the Absurd is proposed and analyzed in the work of Kierkegaard, especially in Fear and Trembling and Repetition. For Kierkegaard, however, the Absurd describes not an essential and universal human condition, but the special condition and nature of religious faith—a paradoxical state in which matters of will and perception that are objectively impossible can nevertheless be ultimately true. Though it is hard to say whether Camus had Kierkegaard particularly in mind when he developed his own concept of the absurd, there can be little doubt that Kierkegaard’s knight of faith is in certain ways an important predecessor of Camus’s Sisyphus: both figures are involved in impossible and endlessly agonizing tasks, which they nevertheless confidently and even cheerfully pursue. In the knight’s quixotic defiance and solipsism, Camus found a model for his own ideal of heroic affirmation and philosophical revolt.]
The companion theme to the Absurd in Camus’s oeuvre (and the only other philosophical topic to which he devoted an entire book) is the idea of Revolt. What is revolt? Simply defined, it is the Sisyphean spirit of defiance in the face of the Absurd. More technically and less metaphorically, it is a spirit of opposition against any perceived unfairness, oppression, or indignity in the human condition.
Rebellion in Camus’s sense begins with a recognition of boundaries, of limits that define one’s essential selfhood and core sense of being and thus must not be infringed—as when a slave stands up to his master and says in effect “thus far, and no further, shall I be commanded.” This defining of the self as at some point inviolable appears to be an act of pure egoism and individualism, but it is not. In fact Camus argues at considerable length to show that an act of conscientious revolt is ultimately far more than just an individual gesture or an act of solitary protest. The rebel, he writes, holds that there is a “common good more important than his own destiny” and that there are “rights more important than himself.” He acts “in the name of certain values which are still indeterminate but which he feels are common to himself and to all men” (The Rebel 15-16).
Camus then goes on to assert that an “analysis of rebellion leads at least to the suspicion that, contrary to the postulates of contemporary thought, a human nature does exist, as the Greeks believed.” After all, “Why rebel,” he asks, “if there is nothing permanent in the self worth preserving?” The slave who stands up and asserts himself actually does so for “the sake of everyone in the world.” He declares in effect that “all men—even the man who insults and oppresses him—have a natural community.” Here we may note that the idea that there may indeed be an essential human nature is actually more than a “suspicion” as far as Camus himself was concerned. Indeed for him it was more like a fundamental article of his humanist faith. In any case it represents one of the core principles of his ethics and is one of the tenets that sets his philosophy apart from existentialism.
True revolt, then, is performed not just for the self but also in solidarity with and out of compassion for others. And for this reason, Camus is led to conclude that revolt too has its limits. If it begins with and necessarily involves a recognition of human community and a common human dignity, it cannot, without betraying its own true character, treat others as if they were lacking in that dignity or not a part of that community. In the end it is remarkable, and indeed surprising, how closely Camus’s philosophy of revolt, despite the author’s fervent atheism and individualism, echoes Kantian ethics with its prohibition against treating human beings as means and its ideal of the human community as a kingdom of ends.
iii. The Outsider
A recurrent theme in Camus’s literary works, which also shows up in his moral and political writings, is the character or perspective of the “stranger” or outsider. Meursault, the laconic narrator of The Stranger, is the most obvious example. He seems to observe everything, even his own behavior, from an outside perspective. Like an anthropologist, he records his observations with clinical detachment at the same time that he is warily observed by the community around him.
Camus came by this perspective naturally. As a European in Africa, an African in Europe, an infidel among Muslims, a lapsed Catholic, a Communist Party drop-out, an underground resister (who at times had to use code names and false identities), a “child of the state” raised by a widowed mother (who was illiterate and virtually deaf and dumb), Camus lived most of his life in various groups and communities without really being integrated within them. This outside view, the perspective of the exile, became his characteristic stance as a writer. It explains both the cool, objective (“zero-degree”) precision of much of his work and also the high value he assigned to longed-for ideals of friendship, community, solidarity, and brotherhood.
iv. Guilt and Innocence
Throughout his writing career, Camus showed a deep interest in questions of guilt and innocence. Once again Meursault in The Stranger provides a striking example. Is he legally innocent of the murder he is charged with? Or is he technically guilty? On the one hand, there seems to have been no conscious intention behind his action. Indeed the killing takes place almost as if by accident, with Meursault in a kind of absent-minded daze, distracted by the sun. From this point of view, his crime seems surreal and his trial and subsequent conviction a travesty. On the other hand, it is hard for the reader not to share the view of other characters in the novel, especially Meursault’s accusers, witnesses, and jury, in whose eyes he seems to be a seriously defective human being—at best, a kind of hollow man and at worst, a monster of self-centeredness and insularity. That the character has evoked such a wide range of responses from critics and readers—from sympathy to horror—is a tribute to the psychological complexity and subtlety of Camus’s portrait.
Camus’s brilliantly crafted final novel, The Fall, continues his keen interest in the theme of guilt, this time via a narrator who is virtually obsessed with it. The significantly named Jean-Baptiste Clamence (a voice in the wilderness calling for clemency and forgiveness) is tortured by guilt in the wake of a seemingly casual incident. While strolling home one drizzly November evening, he shows little concern and almost no emotional reaction at all to the suicidal plunge of a young woman into the Seine. But afterwards the incident begins to gnaw at him, and eventually he comes to view his inaction as typical of a long pattern of personal vanity and as a colossal failure of human sympathy on his part. Wracked by remorse and self-loathing, he gradually descends into a figurative hell. Formerly an attorney, he is now a self-described “judge-penitent” (a combination sinner, tempter, prosecutor, and father-confessor) who shows up each night at his local haunt, a sailor’s bar near Amsterdam’s red light district, where, somewhat in the manner of Coleridge’s Ancient Mariner, he recounts his story to whoever will hear it. In the final sections of the novel, amid distinctly Christian imagery and symbolism, he declares his crucial insight that, despite our pretensions to righteousness, we are all guilty. Hence no human being has the right to pass final moral judgment on another.
In a final twist, Clamence asserts that his acid self-portrait is also a mirror for his contemporaries. Hence his confession is also an accusation—not only of his nameless companion (who serves as the mute auditor for his monologue) but ultimately of the hypocrite lecteur as well.
v. Christianity vs. “Paganism”
The theme of guilt and innocence in Camus’s writings relates closely to another recurrent tension in his thought: the opposition of Christian and pagan ideas and influences. At heart a nature-worshipper, and by instinct a skeptic and non-believer, Camus nevertheless retained a lifelong interest and respect for Christian philosophy and literature. In particular, he seems to have recognized St. Augustine and Kierkegaard as intellectual kinsmen and writers with whom he shared a common passion for controversy, literary flourish, self-scrutiny, and self-dramatization. Christian images, symbols, and allusions abound in all his work (probably more so than in the writing of any other avowed atheist in modern literature), and Christian themes—judgment, forgiveness, despair, sacrifice, passion, and so forth—permeate the novels. (Meursault and Clamence, it is worth noting, are presented not just as sinners, devils, and outcasts, but in several instances explicitly, and not entirely ironically, as Christ figures.)
Meanwhile alongside and against this leitmotif of Christian images and themes, Camus sets the main components of his essentially pagan worldview. Like Nietzsche, he maintains a special admiration for Greek heroic values and pessimism and for classical virtues like courage and honor. What might be termed Romantic values also merit particular esteem within his philosophy: passion, absorption in pure being, an appreciation for and indeed a willingness to revel in raw sensory experience, the glory of the moment, the beauty of the world.
As a result of this duality of influence, Camus’s basic philosophical problem becomes how to reconcile his Augustinian sense of original sin (universal guilt) and rampant moral evil with his personal ideal of pagan primitivism (universal innocence) and with his conviction that the natural world and our life in it have intrinsic beauty and value. Can an absurd world have intrinsic value? Is authentic pessimism compatible with the view that there is an essential dignity to human life? Such questions raise the possibility that there may be deep logical inconsistencies within Camus’s philosophy, and some critics (notably Sartre) have suggested that these inconsistencies cannot be surmounted except through some sort of Kierkegaardian leap of faith on Camus’s part—in this case a leap leading to a belief not in God but in man.
Such a leap is certainly implied in an oft-quoted remark from Camus’s “Letter to a German Friend,” where he wrote: “I continue to believe that this world has no supernatural meaning…But I know that something in the world has meaning—man.” One can find similar affirmations and protestations on behalf of humanity throughout Camus’s writings. They are almost a hallmark of his philosophical style. Oracular and high-flown, they clearly have more rhetorical force than logical potency. On the other hand, if we are trying to locate Camus’s place in European philosophical tradition, they provide a strong clue as to where he properly belongs. Surprisingly, the sentiment here, a commonplace of the Enlightenment and of traditional liberalism, is much closer in spirit to the exuberant secular humanism of the Italian Renaissance than to the agnostic skepticism of contemporary post-modernism.
vi. Individual vs. History and Mass Culture
A primary theme of early twentieth-century European literature and critical thought is the rise of modern mass civilization and its suffocating effects of alienation and dehumanization. This became a pervasive theme by the time Camus was establishing his literary reputation. Anxiety over the fate of Western culture, already intense, escalated to apocalyptic levels with the sudden emergence of fascism, totalitarianism, and new technologies of coercion and death. Here then was a subject ready-made for a writer of Camus’s political and humanistic views. He responded to the occasion with typical force and eloquence.
In one way or another, the themes of alienation and dehumanization as by-products of an increasingly technical and automated world enter into nearly all of Camus’s works. Even his concept of the Absurd becomes multiplied by a social and economic world in which meaningless routines and mind-numbing repetitions predominate. The drudgery of Sisyphus is mirrored and amplified in the assembly line, the business office, the government bureau, and especially in the penal colony and concentration camp.
In line with this theme, the ever-ambiguous Meursault in The Stranger can be understood as both a depressing manifestation of the newly emerging mass personality (that is, as a figure devoid of basic human feelings and passions) and, conversely, as a lone hold-out, a last remaining specimen of the old Romanticism—and hence a figure who is viewed as both dangerous and alien by the robotic majority. Similarly, The Plague can be interpreted, on at least one level, as an allegory in which humanity must be preserved from the fatal pestilence of mass culture, which converts formerly free, autonomous, independent-minded human beings into a soulless new species.
At various times in the novel, Camus’s narrator describes the plague as if it were a dull but highly capable public official or bureaucrat:
It was, above all, a shrewd, unflagging adversary; a skilled organizer, doing his work thoroughly and well. (180) “But it seemed the plague had settled in for good at its most virulent, and it took its daily toll of deaths with the punctual zeal of a good civil servant.” (235)
This identification of the plague with oppressive civil bureaucracy and the routinization of charisma looks forward to the author’s play The State of Siege, where plague is used once again as a symbol for totalitarianism—only this time it is personified in an almost cartoonish way as a kind of overbearing government functionary or office manager from hell. Clad in a gaudy military uniform bedecked with ribbons and decorations, the character Plague (a satirical portrait of Generalissimo Francisco Franco—or El Caudillo as he liked to style himself) is closely attended by his personal Secretary and loyal assistant Death, depicted as a prim, officious female bureaucrat who also favors military garb and who carries an ever-present clipboard and notebook.
So Plague is a fascist dictator, and Death a solicitous commissar. Together these figures represent a system of pervasive control and micro-management that threatens the future of mass society.
In his reflections on this theme of post-industrial dehumanization, Camus differs from most other European writers (and especially from those on the Left) in viewing mass reform and revolutionary movements, including Marxism, as representing at least as great a threat to individual freedom as late-stage capitalism. Throughout his career he continued to cherish and defend old-fashioned virtues like personal courage and honor that other Left-wing intellectuals tended to view as reactionary or bourgeois.
Suicide is the central subject of The Myth of Sisyphus and serves as a background theme in Caligula and The Fall. In Caligula the mad title character, in a fit of horror and revulsion at the meaninglessness of life, would rather die—and bring the world down with him—than accept a cosmos that is indifferent to human fate or that will not submit to his individual will. In The Fall, a stranger’s act of suicide serves as the starting point for a bitter ritual of self-scrutiny and remorse on the part of the narrator.
Like Wittgenstein (who had a family history of suicide and suffered from bouts of depression), Camus considered suicide the fundamental issue for moral philosophy. However, unlike other philosophers who have written on the subject (from Cicero and Seneca to Montaigne and Schopenhauer), Camus seems uninterested in assessing the traditional motives and justifications for suicide (for instance, to avoid a long, painful, and debilitating illness or as a response to personal tragedy or scandal). Indeed, he seems interested in the problem only to the extent that it represents one possible response to the Absurd. His verdict on the matter is unqualified and clear: The only courageous and morally valid response to the Absurd is to continue living—“Suicide is not an option.”
viii. The Death Penalty
From the time he first heard the story of his father’s literal nausea and revulsion after witnessing a public execution, Camus began a vocal and lifelong opposition to the death penalty. Executions by guillotine were a common public spectacle in Algeria during his lifetime, but he refused to attend them and recoiled bitterly at their very mention.
Condemnation of capital punishment is both explicit and implicit in his writings. For example, in The Stranger Meursault’s long confinement during his trial and his eventual execution are presented as part of an elaborate, ceremonial ritual involving both public and religious authorities. The grim rationality of this process of legalized murder contrasts markedly with the sudden, irrational, almost accidental nature of his actual crime. Similarly, in The Myth of Sisyphus, the would-be suicide is contrasted with his fatal opposite, the man condemned to death, and we are continually reminded that a sentence of death is our common fate in an absurd universe.
Camus’s opposition to the death penalty is not specifically philosophical. That is, it is not based on a particular moral theory or principle (such as Cesare Beccaria’s utilitarian objection that capital punishment is wrong because it has not been proven to have a deterrent effect greater than life imprisonment). Camus’s opposition, in contrast, is humanitarian, conscientious, almost visceral. Like Victor Hugo, his great predecessor on this issue, he views the death penalty as an egregious barbarism—an act of blood riot and vengeance covered over with a thin veneer of law and civility to make it acceptable to modern sensibilities. That it is also an act of vengeance aimed primarily at the poor and oppressed, and that it is given religious sanction, makes it even more hideous and indefensible in his view.
Camus’s essay “Reflections on the Guillotine” supplies a detailed examination of the issue. An eloquent personal statement with compelling psychological and philosophical insights, it includes the author’s direct rebuttal to traditional retributionist arguments in favor of capital punishment (such as Kant’s claim that death is the legally appropriate, indeed morally required, penalty for murder). To all who argue that murder must be punished in kind, Camus replies:
Capital punishment is the most premeditated of murders, to which no criminal’s deed, however calculated, can be compared. For there to be an equivalency, the death penalty would have to punish a criminal who had warned his victim of the date on which he would inflict a horrible death on him and who, from that moment onward, had confined him at his mercy for months. Such a monster is not to be encountered in private life.
Camus concludes his essay by arguing that, at the very least, France should abolish the savage spectacle of the guillotine and replace it with a more humane procedure (such as lethal injection). But he still retains a scant hope that capital punishment will be completely abolished at some point in the time to come: “In the unified Europe of the future the solemn abolition of the death penalty ought to be the first article of the European Code we all hope for.” Camus himself did not live to see the day, but he would no doubt be gratified to know that abolition of capital punishment is now an essential prerequisite for membership in the European Union.
Camus is often classified as an existentialist writer, and it is easy to see why. Affinities with Kierkegaard and Sartre are patent. He shares with these philosophers (and with the other major writers in the existentialist tradition, from Augustine and Pascal to Dostoyevsky and Nietzsche) an habitual and intense interest in the active human psyche, in the life of conscience or spirit as it is actually experienced and lived. Like these writers, he aims at nothing less than a thorough, candid exegesis of the human condition, and like them he exhibits not just a philosophical attraction but also a personal commitment to such values as individualism, free choice, inner strength, authenticity, personal responsibility, and self-determination.
However, one troublesome fact remains: throughout his career Camus repeatedly denied that he was an existentialist. Was this an accurate and honest self-assessment? On the one hand, some critics have questioned this “denial” (using the term almost in its modern clinical sense), attributing it to the celebrated Sartre-Camus political “feud” or to a certain stubbornness or even contrariness on Camus’s part. In their view, Camus qualifies as, at minimum, a closet existentialist, and in certain respects (e.g., in his unconditional and passionate concern for the individual) as an even truer specimen of the type than Sartre.
On the other hand, besides his personal rejection of the label, there appear to be solid reasons for challenging the claim that Camus is an existentialist. For one thing, it is noteworthy that he never showed much interest in (indeed he largely avoided) metaphysical and ontological questions (the philosophical raison d’etre of Heidegger and Sartre). Of course there is no rule that says an existentialist must be a metaphysician. However, Camus’s seeming aversion to technical philosophical discussion does suggest one way in which he distanced himself from contemporary existentialist thought.
Another point of divergence is that Camus seems to have regarded existentialism as a complete and systematic world-view, that is, a fully articulated doctrine. In his view, to be a true existentialist one had to commit to the entire doctrine (and not merely to bits and pieces of it), and this was apparently something he was unwilling to do.
A further point of separation, and possibly a decisive one, is that Camus actively challenged and set himself apart from the existentialist motto that being precedes essence. Ultimately, against Sartre in particular and existentialists in general, he clings to his instinctive belief in a common human nature. In his view human existence necessarily includes an essential core element of dignity and value, and in this respect he seems surprisingly closer to the humanist tradition from Aristotle to Kant than to the modern tradition of skepticism and relativism from Nietzsche to Derrida (the latter his fellow-countryman and, at least in his commitment to human rights and opposition to the death penalty, his spiritual successor and descendant).
7. Camus, Colonialism, and Algeria
One of the main topics and even preoccupations of recent Camus studies has been the writer’s attitude, as reflected in both his fiction and in his non-fiction, towards European colonialism in general and his response to the French-Algerian “problem” or “question” (as it was often termed) in particular. The first thing that can be noted in this respect is that, unlike Sartre and many other European intellectuals, Camus never delivered a formal critique of colonialism. Nor did he sign any of the frequent manifestos and declarations deploring the practice – a sin for which he was sharply criticized and even accused of moral cowardice. In 1958, partly to explain and vindicate himself, but mainly to illustrate and give voice to the painful complexities of colonial reform and decolonization, he published Algerian Chronicles, a collection of his writings on the vexing “problem” that he had personally agonized over for more than twenty years.
In addition to his perceived silence on the issue of colonialism (a silence, as Algerian Chronicles reveals, motivated by his fear that speaking out aggressively would be more likely to heighten tensions than secure the united and independent post-colonial Algeria he hoped for), Camus has also been criticized for the virtual erasure of Arab characters and culture from his fiction. The Irish writer and politician Conor Cruise O’Brien made a partial attempt to rescue Camus from this criticism by arguing that The Fall should be read as an autobiographical work in which Camus confesses his own personal failures, including his guilt at becoming a privileged citizen in a poor country. Several writers, and most prominently and forcefully Edward Said, have denounced the nearly total absence of Arab characters in Camus’s novels and stories. Moreover, the few Arab characters who do appear, these critics point out, are inevitably mute and anonymous. They are either shadow figures, including the nameless murder victim at the climactic center of The Stranger, or mere bodies, like the uncounted and unidentified native Algerians who presumably make up the major part of the death toll in The Plague but who otherwise have no speaking role or even visible presence in the novel. Along this same line of criticism, The Meursault Investigation is a fictional and metafictional riposte to Camus by the Algerian writer Kamel Daoud. A reimagining of the characters and events of The Stranger, told from the point of view of the brother of the murdered Arab, the novel represents both a corrective rebuke and a literary tribute to it famous original. In the introduction to her recent expanded edition of Algerian Chronicles, Alice Kaplan addresses these and related criticisms and cites relevant passages from Camus’s own writing in response to them.
8. Significance and Legacy
Obviously, Camus’s writings remain the primary reason for his continuing importance and the chief source of his cultural legacy, but his fame is also due to his exemplary life. He truly lived his philosophy; thus it is in his personal political stands and public statements as well as in his books that his views are clearly articulated. In short, he bequeathed not just his words but also his actions. Taken together, those words and actions embody a core set of liberal democratic values—including tolerance, justice, liberty, open-mindedness, respect for personhood, condemnation of violence, and resistance to tyranny—that can be fully approved and acted upon by the modern intellectual engagé.
On a purely literary level, one of Camus’s most original contributions to modern discourse is his distinctive prose style. Terse and hard-boiled, yet at the same time lyrical, and indeed capable of great, soaring flights of emotion and feeling, Camus’s style represents a deliberate attempt on his part to wed the famous clarity, elegance, and dry precision of the French philosophical tradition with the more sonorous and opulent manner of 19th century Romantic fiction. The result is something like a cross between Hemingway (a Camus favorite) and Melville (another favorite) or between Diderot and Hugo. For the most part when we read Camus we encounter the plain syntax, simple vocabulary, and biting aphorism typical of modern theatre or noir detective fiction. By the way it’s worth noting that Camus was a fan of the novels of Dashiell Hammett and James M Cain and that his own work has influenced the style and the existentialist loner heroes of a succession of later crime writers, including John D McDonald and Lee Child. This muted, laconic style frequently becomes a counterpoint or springboard for extended musings and lavish descriptions almost in the manner of Proust. Moreover, this base style frequently becomes a counterpoint or springboard for extended musings and lavish descriptions almost in the manner of Proust. Here we may note that this attempted reconciliation or union of opposing styles is not just an aesthetic gesture on the author’s part: It is also a moral and political statement. It says, in effect, that the life of reason and the life of feeling need not be opposed; that intellect and passion can, and should, operate together.
Perhaps the greatest inspiration and example that Camus provides for contemporary readers is the lesson that it is still possible for a serious thinker to face the modern world (with a full understanding of its contradictions, injustices, brutal flaws, and absurdities) with hardly a grain of hope, yet utterly without cynicism. To read Camus is to find words like justice, freedom, humanity, and dignity used plainly and openly, without apology or embarrassment, and without the pained or derisive facial expressions or invisible quotation marks that almost automatically accompany those terms in public discourse today.
At Stockholm Camus concluded his Nobel acceptance speech with a stirring reminder and challenge to modern writers: “The nobility of our craft,” he declared, “will always be rooted in two commitments, both difficult to maintain: the refusal to lie about what one knows and the resistance to oppression.” He left behind a body of work faithful to his own credo that the arts of language must always be used in the service of truth and the service of liberty.
9. References and Further Reading
a. Works by Albert Camus
- The Stranger. Trans. Stuart Gilbert. New York: Vintage-Random House, 1946.
- Camus’s first novel, a classic portrait of the “outsider” originally published in France as L’Etranger by Librairie Gallimard in 1942.
- The Plague. Trans. Stuart Gilbert. New York: Vintage-International, 1991.
- Camus’s second novel, originally published in France as La Peste by Librairie Gallimard in 1947.
- The Fall. Trans. Justin O’Brien. New York: Vintage-Random House, 1956.
- Camus’s third novel, a confessional monologue originally published in France as La Chute by Librairie Gallimard in 1956.
- The Myth of Sisyphus and other Essays. Trans. Justin O’Brien. New York: Vintage-Random House, 1955.
- A philosophical meditation on suicide originally published as Le Mythe de Sisyphe by Librairie Gallimard in 1942.
- The Rebel. Trans. Anthony Bower. New York: Vintage-Random House, 1956.
- A philosophical essay on the ethics of rebellion and political violence originally published as L’Homme Revolte by Librairie Gallimard in 1951.
- Exile and the Kingdom. Trans. Justin O’Brien. New York: Vintage-Random House, 1958.
- A collection of short fiction originally published as L’Exil et le Royaume by Librairie Gallimard in 1957.
- Lyrical and Critical Essays. Ed. Philip Thody. Trans. Ellen Conroy Kennedy. New York: Vintage-Random House, 1970.
- A selection of critical writings, including essays on Melville, Faulkner, and Sartre, plus all the early essays from Betwixt and Between and Nuptials.
- Resistance, Rebellion, and Death. Trans. Justin O’Brien. New York: Vintage International, 1995.
- A collection of essays on a wide variety of political topics ranging from the death penalty to the Cold War.
- Caligula and Three Other Plays. Trans. Stuart Gilbert. New York: Vintage-Random House, 1958.
- A collection of four of Camus’s best-known dramatic works: Caligula, The Misunderstanding, The State of Siege, and The Just Assassins, with a foreword by the author.
- The First Man. Trans. David Hapgood. New York: Alfred Knopf, 1995.
- A posthumous novel, partly autobiographical.
- Camus at Combat: Writings 1944-1947. Ed. Jaqueline Levi-Valenci. Trans. Arthur Goldhammer. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 2006.
- A collection of articles and editorials that Camus wrote during and after WW II for the French Resistance journal Combat.
- Algerian Chronicles. Ed. Alice Kaplan. Trans. Arthur Goldhammer. Cambridge, MA: Belknap Press, 2013.
- A collection of Camus’s political writings on Algeria.
b. Critical and Biographical Studies
- Barthes, Roland. Writing Degree Zero. New York: Hill and Wang, 1968.
- Bloom, Harold, ed. Albert Camus. New York: Chelsea House, 1989.
- Brée, Germaine. Camus. New Brunswick, NJ: Rutgers University Press, 1961.
- Brée, Germaine, ed. Camus: A Collection of Critical Essays. Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice-Hall, 1962.
- Cruickshank, John. Albert Camus and the Literature of Revolt. London: Oxford University Press, 1959.
- Cruickshank, John. The Novelist as Philosopher. London: Oxford University Press, 1959.
- Foley, John. Albert Camus: From the Absurd to Revolt. Montreal: McGill-Queens University Press, 2008.
- Hughes, Edward J. ed. The Cambridge Companion to Camus. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press, 2007.
- Kauffman, Walter, ed. Religion from Tolstoy to Camus. New York: Harper, 1964.
- Lottman, Herbert R. Albert Camus: A Biography. Corte Madera, CA: Gingko Press, 1997.
- Malraux, Andre. Anti-Memoirs. New York: Holt, Rinehart, and Winston, 1968.
- Margerrison, Christine. et al. Albert Camus in the 21st Century: A Reassessment of his Thinking at the Dawn of the New Millennium. Amsterdam, NL: Rodopi, 2008.
- McBride, Joseph. Albert Camus: Philosopher and Littérateur. New York: St. Martin’s Press, 1992.
- O’Brien, Conor Cruise. Camus. London: Faber and Faber, 1970.
- Said, Edward. “Camus and the French Imperial Experience.” In Culture and Imperialism. New York: Vintage Books, 1994.
- Sartre, Jean-Paul. “Camus’s The Outsider.” In Situations. New York: George Braziller, 1965.
- Ronald D Srigley. Albert Camus’ Critique of Modernity. Columbia, MO: University of Missouri Press, 2011.
- Thrody, Philip. Albert Camus, 1913-1960. London: Hamish Hamilton, 1961.
- Todd, Olivier. Albert Camus: A Life. New York: Alfred A. Knopf, 1997.
- Zaretsky, Robert. A Life Worth Living: Albert Camus and the Quest for Meaning. Cambridge, MA: Belknap Press of Harvard University Press, 2013.
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