Aristippus (c. 435—356 B.C.E.)
Aristippus was a follower of Socrates, and the founder of the Cyrenaic school of philosophy. Like other Greek ethical thinkers, Aristippus’ ethics are centered around the question of what the ‘end’ is; that is, what goal our actions aim at and what is valuable for its own sake. Aristippus identified the end as pleasure. This identification of pleasure as the end makes Aristippus a hedonist. Most of the pleasures that Aristippus is depicted as pursuing have to do with sensual gratification, such as sleeping with courtesans and enjoying fine food and old wines. He taught that we should not defer pleasures that are ready at hand for the sake of future pleasures. He was willing to break the social conventions of his day and engage in behavior that was considered undignified or shocking for the sake of obtaining pleasurable experiences. His ideal life would be branded by most Greeks as being enslaved to pleasure.The Cyrenaic school developed these ideas further and influenced Epicurus and the later Greek skeptics.
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Aristippus was born in Cyrene, a Greek colony in Northern Africa. He moved to Athens and became one of the young men who followed Socrates about as Socrates questioned the citizens of Athens and exposed their ignorance. He was probably the most scandalous of Socrates’ followers because of his advocacy of a life of sensual pleasure and his willingness to accept money for his instruction, as the sophists did. He gathered a number of disciples, including his daughter Arete, to whom he taught philosophy, and these students formed the basis for the Cyrenaic school.
Beyond these spare facts, it is difficult to ascertain much with great confidence about Aristippus. This is because our main source for information on Aristippus is the Lives of the Philosophers by Diogenes Laertius, who wrote over 500 years after Aristippus died. Diogenes Laertius simply collated what others had said about various philosophers, without any regard for the sources’ reliability. Because of the contempt that the hedonism of Aristippus and the Cyrenaics inspired, Aristippus became a natural focal point for many scandalous stories that were supposed to provide fitting illustrations of his thought. Most of these stories are probably false. However, they still can be used as sources for popular attitudes toward Aristippus and to reconstruct what features of his thought and life inspired these stories.
Although Aristippus founded the Cyrenaic school, it is not clear how much of the developed Cyrenaic position was actually promulgated by him. This is because Aristippus’ grandson, also named Aristippus, is reported to have systematized much of the Cyrenaic philosophy, and thus it is difficult to disentangle which parts of the Cyrenaic philosophy were Aristippus the Elder’s, and which parts his grandson’s. For the purposes of this article, therefore, only those positions that can be confidently ascribed to Aristippus the Elder himself will be discussed, and the more developed epistemology and ethics of the school he founded are discussed in the article on the Cyrenaics.
Like other Greek ethical thinkers, Aristippus’ ethics are centered around the question of what the ‘end’ is; that is, what goal our actions aim at and what is valuable for its own sake. Aristippus identified the end as pleasure. This identification of pleasure as the end makes Aristippus a hedonist. Most of the pleasures that Aristippus is depicted as pursuing have to do with sensual gratification, such as sleeping with courtesans and enjoying fine food and old wines.
Xenophon, a hostile contemporary of Aristippus’, reports that Aristippus rejected delaying any gratification. Aristippus advocated simply deriving pleasure from whatever is present, and not producing trouble for oneself by toiling to obtain things which may bring one pleasure in the future.
Both of these features of Aristippus’ thought were developed further by the Cyrenaics.
In his pursuit of sensual gratification, Aristippus showed little regard for the standards of propriety reigning in Greece at the time. Although many of the sensationalistic stories about Aristippus are probably false, they depict a man who is willing to engage in activity that is shocking, undignified, and callous for the sake of his own pleasure, and who displays disdain for conventional standards as being mere societal prejudices.
For instance, when Aristippus was upbraided for sleeping with a courtesan, he asked whether there was any difference between taking a house in which many people have lived in before or none, or between sailing on a ship in which many people have sailed and none. When it was answered that there is no important difference, he replied that it likewise makes no difference whether the woman you sleep with has been with many people or none. Aristippus was also notorious for currying favor with King Dionysius of Syracuse, and he was called the “king’s poodle” for his willingness to do things like putting on a woman’s robes and dancing when the king demanded it, or falling at the feet of the king in order to have a request of his fulfilled. And when he was reproached for exposing his infant son to die as if it were not his own, he replied that “phlegm and vermin are also of our own begetting, but we still cast them as far away from us as possible because they are useless.”
Such a life would be branded by most Greeks as being enslaved to pleasure. Aristippus, however, thought that his willingness to do anything whatsoever for the sake of pleasure, his total flexibility, brought him a kind of freedom. Aristippus was able to do whatever the circumstances demanded of him, and his single-mindedness and disregard of social conventions made him master of himself. Aristippus said that he possessed the courtesan Laïs, but was not possessed by her, and that “what is best is not abstaining from pleasures, but instead controlling them without being controlled.” That is, as long as you are clear-headed and single-minded in your pursuit of pleasure, it is not as though pursuing pleasure in this way is making you do anything unwillingly, or making you lose your self-control.
There is no recent book-length treatment of Aristippus available in English. However, recent books that deal with the Cyrenaics in general also have valuable summaries of information on Aristippus in particular, as well as extensive bibliographies that include articles on Aristippus. For those looking for more ancient gossip and witty banter than included here, Diogenes Laertius’ account of Aristippus is in book two of his Lives of the Philosophers. The Loeb Classical Library, published by Harvard University Press, has a good translation by R.D. Hicks, revised by Herbert S. Long (1972). This edition includes a valuable introduction to Diogenes Laertius, written by Long, which discusses Diogenes’ sources, his methods of composition, and his limitations.
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