In his Nicomachean Ethics, Aristotle (384-322 B.C.E.) describes the happy life intended for man by nature as one lived in accordance with virtue, and, in his Politics, he describes the role that politics and the political community must play in bringing about the virtuous life in the citizenry.
The Politics also provides analysis of the kinds of political community that existed in his time and shows where and how these cities fall short of the ideal community of virtuous citizens.
Although in some ways we have clearly moved beyond his thought (for example, his belief in the inferiority of women and his approval of slavery in at least some circumstances), there remains much in Aristotle’s philosophy that is valuable today.
In particular, his views on the connection between the well-being of the political community and that of the citizens who make it up, his belief that citizens must actively participate in politics if they are to be happy and virtuous, and his analysis of what causes and prevents revolution within political communities have been a source of inspiration for many contemporary theorists, especially those unhappy with the liberal political philosophy promoted by thinkers such as John Locke and John Stuart Mill.
Table of Contents
- Biography and History
- The Texts
- Challenges of the Texts
- Politics and Ethics
- The Importance of Telos
- The Text of the Politics
- The Politics, Book I
- The Politics, Book II
- The Politics, Book III
- The Politics, Book IV
- The Politics, Book V
- The Politics, Book VI
- The Politics, Book VII
- The Politics, Book VIII
- References and Further Reading
Aristotle’s life was primarily that of a scholar. However, like the other ancient philosophers, it was not the stereotypical ivory tower existence. His father was court physician to Amyntas III of Macedon, so Aristotle grew up in a royal household. Aristotle also knew Philip of Macedon (son of Amyntas III) and there is a tradition that says Aristotle tutored Philip’s son Alexander, who would later be called “the Great” after expanding the Macedonian Empire all the way to what is now India. Clearly, Aristotle had significant firsthand experience with politics, though scholars disagree about how much influence, if any, this experience had on Aristotle’s thought. There is certainly no evidence that Alexander’s subsequent career was much influenced by Aristotle’s teaching, which is uniformly critical of war and conquest as goals for human beings and which praises the intellectual, contemplative lifestyle. It is noteworthy that although Aristotle praises the politically active life, he spent most of his own life in Athens, where he was not a citizen and would not have been allowed to participate directly in politics (although of course anyone who wrote as extensively and well about politics as Aristotle did was likely to be politically influential).
Aristotle studied under Plato at Plato’s Academy in Athens, and eventually opened a school of his own (the Lyceum) there. As a scholar, Aristotle had a wide range of interests. He wrote about meteorology, biology, physics, poetry, logic, rhetoric, and politics and ethics, among other subjects. His writings on many of these interests remained definitive for almost two millennia. They remained, and remain, so valuable in part because of the comprehensiveness of his efforts. For example, in order to understand political phenomena, he had his students collect information on the political organization and history of 158 different cities. The Politics makes frequent reference to political events and institutions from many of these cities, drawing on his students’ research. Aristotle’s theories about the best ethical and political life are drawn from substantial amounts of empirical research. These studies, and in particular the Constitution of Athens, will be discussed in more detail below (Who Should Rule?). The question of how these writings should be unified into a consistent whole (if that is even possible) is an open one and beyond the scope of this article. This article will not attempt to organize all of Aristotle’s work into a coherent whole, but will draw on different texts as they are necessary to complete one version of Aristotle’s view of politics.
The most important text for understanding Aristotle’s political philosophy, not surprisingly, is the Politics. However, it is also important to read Nicomachean Ethics in order to fully understand Aristotle’s political project. This is because Aristotle believed that ethics and politics were closely linked, and that in fact the ethical and virtuous life is only available to someone who participates in politics, while moral education is the main purpose of the political community. As he says in Nicomachean Ethics at 1099b30, “The end [or goal] of politics is the best of ends; and the main concern of politics is to engender a certain character in the citizens and to make them good and disposed to perform noble actions.” Most people living today in Western societies like the United States, Canada, Germany, or Australia would disagree with both parts of that statement. We are likely to regard politics (and politicians) as aiming at ignoble, selfish ends, such as wealth and power, rather than the “best end”, and many people regard the idea that politics is or should be primarily concerned with creating a particular moral character in citizens as a dangerous intrusion on individual freedom, in large part because we do not agree about what the “best end” is. In fact, what people in Western societies generally ask from politics and the government is that they keep each of us safe from other people (through the provision of police and military forces) so that each of us can choose and pursue our own ends, whatever they may be. This has been the case in Western political philosophy at least since John Locke. Development of individual character is left up to the individual, with help from family, religion, and other non-governmental institutions. More will be said about this later, but the reader should keep in mind that this is an important way in which our political and ethical beliefs are not Aristotle’s. The reader is also cautioned against immediately concluding from this that Ar istotle was wrong and we are right. This may be so, but it is important to understand why, and the contrast between Aristotle’s beliefs and ours can help to bring the strengths and weaknesses of our own beliefs into greater clarity.
The reference above to “Nicomachean Ethics at 1099b30″ makes use of what is called Bekker pagination. This refers to the location of beginning of the cited text in the edition of Aristotle’s works produced by Immanuel Bekker in Berlin in 1831 (in this case, it begins on page 1099, column b, line 30). Scholars make use of this system for all of Aristotle’s works except the Constitution of Athens (which was not rediscovered until after 1831) and fragmentary works in order to be able to refer to the same point in Aristotle’s work regardless of which edition, translation, or language they happen to be working with. This entry will make use of the Bekker pagination system, and will also follow tradition and refer to Nicomachean Ethics as simply Ethics. (There is also a Eudemian Ethics which is almost certainly by Aristotle (and which shares three of the ten books of the Nicomachean Ethics) and a work on ethics titled Magna Moralia which has been attributed to him but which most scholars now believe is not his work. Regardless, most scholars believe that the Nicomachean Ethics is Aristotle’s fullest and most mature expression of his ethical theory). The translation is that of Martin Ostwald; see the bibliography for full information. In addition to the texts listed above, the student with an interest in Aristotle’s political theory may also wish to read the Rhetoric, which includes observations on ethics and politics in the context of teaching the reader how to be a more effective speaker, and the Constitution of Athens, a work attributed to Aristotle, but which may be by one of his students, which describes the political history of the city of Athens.
Any honest attempt to summarize and describe Aristotle’s political philosophy must include an acknowledgment that there is no consensus on many of the most important aspects of that philosophy. Some of the reasons for this should be mentioned from the outset.
One set of reasons has to do with the text itself and the transmission of the text from Aristotle’s time to ours. The first thing that can lead to disagreement over Aristotle’s beliefs is the fact that the Politics andEthics are believed by many scholars to be his lecture notes, for lectures which were intended to be heard only by his own students. (Aristotle did write for general audiences on these subjects, probably in dialogue form, but only a few fragments of those writings remain). This is also one reason why many students have difficulty reading his work: no teacher’s lecture notes ever make complete sense to anyone else (their meaning can even elude their author at times). Many topics in the texts are discussed less fully than we would like, and many things are ambiguous which we wish were more straightforward. But if Aristotle was lecturing from these writings, he could have taken care of these problems on the fly as he lectured, since presumably he knew what he meant, or he could have responded to requests for clarification or elaboration from his students.
Secondly, most people who read Aristotle are not reading him in the original Attic Greek but are instead reading translations. This leads to further disagreement, because different authors translate Aristotle differently, and the way in which a particular word is translated can be very significant for the text as a whole. There is no way to definitively settle the question of what Aristotle “really meant to say” in using a particular word or phrase.
Third, the Aristotelian texts we have are not the originals, but copies, and every time a text gets copied errors creep in (words, sentences, or paragraphs can get left out, words can be changed into new words, and so forth). For example, imagine someone writing the sentence “Ronald Reagan was the lastcompetent president of the United States.” It is copied by hand, and the person making the copy accidentally writes (or assumes that the author must have written) “Ronald Reagan was the leastcompetent president of the United States.” If the original is then destroyed, so that only the copy remains, future generations will read a sentence that means almost exactly the opposite of what the author intended. It may be clear from the context that a word has been changed, but then again it may not, and there is always hesitation in changing the text as we have it. In addition, although nowadays it is unacceptable to modify someone else’s work without clearly denoting the changes, this is a relatively recent development and there are portions of Aristotle’s texts which scholars believe were added by later writers. This, too, complicates our understanding of Aristotle.
Finally, there are a number of controversies related to the text of the Politics in particular. These controversies cannot be discussed here, but should be mentioned. For more detail consult the works listed in the “Suggestions for further reading” below. First, there is disagreement about whether the books of the Politics are in the order that Aristotle intended. Carnes Lord and others have argued based on a variety of textual evidence that books 7 and 8 were intended by Aristotle to follow book 3. Rearranging the text in this way would have the effect of joining the early discussion of the origins of political life and the city, and the nature of political justice, with the discussion of the ideal city and the education appropriate for it, while leaving together books 4-6 which are primarily concerned with existing varieties of regimes and how they are preserved and destroyed and moving them to the conclusion of the book. Second, some authors, notably Werner Jaeger, have argued that the different focus and orientation of the different portions of the Politics is a result of Aristotle writing them at different times, reflecting his changing interests and orientation towards Plato‘s teachings. The argument is that at first Aristotle stuck very closely to the attitudes and ideas of his teacher Plato, and only later developed his own more empirical approach. Thus any difficulties that there may be in integrating the different parts of the Politicsarise from the fact that they were not meant to be integrated and were written at different times and with different purposes. Third, the Politics as we have it appears to be incomplete; Book 6 ends in the middle of a sentence and Book 8 in the middle of a discussion. There are also several places in the Politicswhere Aristotle promises to consider a topic further later but does not do so in the text as we have i t (for example, at the end of Book II, Chapter 8). It is possible that Aristotle never finished writing it; more likely there is material missing as a result of damage to the scrolls on which it was written. The extent and content of any missing material is a matter of scholarly debate.
Fortunately, the beginning student of Aristotle will not need to concern themselves much with these problems. It is, however, important to get a quality translation of the text, which provides an introduction, footnotes, a glossary, and a bibliography, so that the reader is aware of places where, for example, there seems to be something missing from the text, or a word can have more than one meaning, or there are other textual issues. These will not always be the cheapest or most widely available translations, but it is important to get one of them, from a library if need be. Several suggested editions are listed at the end of this article.
In Book Six of the Ethics Aristotle says that all knowledge can be classified into three categories: theoretical knowledge, practical knowledge, and productive knowledge. Put simply, these kinds of knowledge are distinguished by their aims: theoretical knowledge aims at contemplation, productive knowledge aims at creation, and practical knowledge aims at action. Theoretical knowledge involves the study of truth for its own sake; it is knowledge about things that are unchanging and eternal, and includes things like the principles of logic, physics, and mathematics (at the end of the Ethics Aristotle says that the most excellent human life is one lived in pursuit of this type of knowledge, because this knowledge brings us closest to the divine). The productive and practical sciences, in contrast, address our daily needs as human beings, and have to do with things that can and do change. Productive knowledge means, roughly, know-how; the knowledge of how to make a table or a house or a pair of shoes or how to write a tragedy would be examples of this kind of knowledge. This entry is concerned with practical knowledge, which is the knowledge of how to live and act. According to Aristotle, it is the possession and use of practical knowledge that makes it possible to live a good life. Ethics and politics, which are the practical sciences, deal with human beings as moral agents. Ethics is primarily about the actions of human beings as individuals, and politics is about the actions of human beings in communities, although it is important to remember that for Aristotle the two are closely linked and each influences the other.
The fact that ethics and politics are kinds of practical knowledge has several important consequences. First, it means that Aristotle believes that mere abstract knowledge of ethics and politics is worthless. Practical knowledge is only useful if we act on it; we must act appropriately if we are to be moral. He says at Ethics 1103b25: “The purpose of the present study [of morality] is not, as it is in other inquiries, the attainment of theoretical knowledge: we are not conducting this inquiry in order to know what virtue is, but in order to become good, else there would be no advantage in studying it.”
Second, according to Aristotle, only some people can beneficially study politics. Aristotle believes that women and slaves (or at least those who are slaves by nature) can never benefit from the study of politics, and also should not be allowed to participate in politics, about which more will be said later. But there is also a limitation on political study based on age, as a result of the connection between politics and experience: “A young man is not equipped to be a student of politics; for he has no experience in the actions which life demands of him, and these actions form the basis and subject matter of the discussion” (Ethics 1095a2). Aristotle adds that young men will usually act on the basis of their emotions, rather than according to reason, and since acting on practical knowledge requires the use of reason, young men are unequipped to study politics for this reason too. So the study of politics will only be useful to those who have the experience and the mental discipline to benefit from it, and for Aristotle this would have been a relatively small percentage of the population of a city. Even in Athens, the most democratic city in Greece, no more than 15 percent of the population was ever allowed the benefits of citizenship, including political participation. Athenian citizenship was limited to adult males who were not slaves and who had one parent who was an Athenian citizen (sometimes citizenship was further restricted to require both parents to be Athenian citizens). Aristotle does not think this percentage should be increased – if anything, it should be decreased.
Third, Aristotle distinguishes between practical and theoretical knowledge in terms of the level of precision that can be attained when studying them. Political and moral knowledge does not have the same degree of precision or certainty as mathematics. Aristotle says at Ethics 1094b14: “Problems of what is noble and just, which politics examines, present so much variety and irregularity that some people believe that they exist only by convention and not by nature….Therefore, in a discussion of such subjects, which has to start with a basis of this kind, we must be satisfied to indicate the truth with a rough and general sketch: when the subject and the basis of a discussion consist of matters that hold good only as a general rule, but not always, the conclusions reached must be of the same order.” Aristotle does not believe that the noble and the just exist only by convention, any more than, say, the principles of geometry do. However, the principles of geometry are fixed and unchanging. The definition of a point, or a line, or a plane, can be given precisely, and once this definition is known, it is fixed and unchanging for everyone. However, the definition of something like justice can only be known generally; there is no fixed and unchanging definition that will always be correct. This means that unlike philosophers such as Hobbes and Kant, Aristotle does not and in fact cannot give us a fixed set of rules to be followed when ethical and political decisions must be made. Instead he tries to make his students the kind of men who, when confronted with any particular ethical or political decision, will know the correct thing to do, will understand why it is the correct choice, and will choose to do it for that reason. Such a man will know the general rules to be followed, but will also know when and why to deviate from those rules. (I will use “man” and “men” when referring to citizens so that the reader keeps in mind that Aristotle, and the Greeks generally, excluded women from political part icipation. In fact it is not until the mid-19th century that organized attempts to gain the right to vote for women really get underway, and even today in the 21st century there are still many countries which deny women the right to vote or participate in political life).
I have already noted the connection between ethics and politics in Aristotle’s thought. The concept that most clearly links the two is that which Aristotle called telos. A discussion of this concept and its importance will help the reader make sense of what follows. Aristotle himself discusses it in Book II, Chapter 3 of the Physics and Book I, Chapter 3 of the Metaphysics.
The word telos means something like purpose, or goal, or final end. According to Aristotle, everything has a purpose or final end. If we want to understand what something is, it must be understood in terms of that end, which we can discover through careful study. It is perhaps easiest to understand what a telos is by looking first at objects created by human beings. Consider a knife. If you wanted to describe a knife, you would talk about its size, and its shape, and what it is made out of, among other things. But Aristotle believes that you would also, as part of your description, have to say that it is made to cut things. And when you did, you would be describing its telos. The knife’s purpose, or reason for existing, is to cut things. And Aristotle would say that unless you included that telos in your description, you wouldn’t really have described – or understood – the knife. This is true not only of things made by humans, but of plants and animals as well. If you were to fully describe an acorn, you would include in your description that it will become an oak tree in the natural course of things – so acorns too have a telos. Suppose you were to describe an animal, like a thoroughbred foal. You would talk about its size, say it has four legs and hair, and a tail. Eventually you would say that it is meant to run fast. This is the horse’s telos, or purpose. If nothing thwarts that purpose, the young horse will indeed become a fast runner.
Here we are not primarily concerned with the telos of a knife or an acorn or a foal. What concerns us is the telos of a human being. Just like everything else that is alive, human beings have a telos. What is it that human beings are meant by nature to become in the way that knives are meant to cut, acorns are meant to become oak trees, and thoroughbred ponies are meant to become race horses? According to Aristotle, we are meant to become happy. This is nice to hear, although it isn’t all that useful. After all, people find happiness in many different ways. However, Aristotle says that living happily requires living a life of virtue. Someone who is not living a life that is virtuous, or morally good, is also not living a happy life, no matter what they might think. They are like a knife that will not cut, an oak tree that is diseased and stunted, or a racehorse that cannot run. In fact they are worse, since they have chosen the life they lead in a way that a knife or an acorn or a horse cannot.
Someone who does live according to virtue, who chooses to do the right thing because it is the right thing to do, is living a life that flourishes; to borrow a phrase, they are being all that they can be by using all of their human capacities to their fullest. The most important of these capacities is logos – a word that means “speech” and also means “reason” (it gives us the English word “logic”). Human beings alone have the ability to speak, and Aristotle says that we have been given that ability by nature so that we can speak and reason with each other to discover what is right and wrong, what is good and bad, and what is just and unjust.
Note that human beings discover these things rather than creating them. We do not get to decide what is right and wrong, but we do get to decide whether we will do what is right or what is wrong, and this is the most important decision we make in life. So too is the happy life: we do not get to decide what really makes us happy, although we do decide whether or not to pursue the happy life. And this is an ongoing decision. It is not made once and for all, but must be made over and over again as we live our lives. Aristotle believes that it is not easy to be virtuous, and he knows that becoming virtuous can only happen under the right conditions. Just as an acorn can only fulfill its telos if there is sufficient light, the right kind of soil, and enough water (among other things), and a horse can only fulfill its telos if there is sufficient food and room to run (again, among other things), an individual can only fulfill their telos and be a moral and happy human being within a well constructed political community. The community brings about virtue through education and through laws which prescribe certain actions and prohibit others.
And here we see the link between ethics and politics in a different light: the role of politics is to provide an environment in which people can live fully human, ethical, and happy lives, and this is the kind of life which makes it possible for someone to participate in politics in the correct way. As Aristotle says at Ethics1103a30: “We become just by the practice of just actions, self-controlled by exercising self-control, and courageous by performing acts of courage….Lawgivers make the citizens good by inculcating [good] habits in them, and this is the aim of every lawgiver; if he does not succeed in doing that, his legislation is a failure. It is in this that a good constitution differs from a bad one.” This is not a view that would be found in political science textbooks today, but for Aristotle it is the central concern of the study of politics: how can we discover and put into practice the political institutions that will develop virtue in the citizens to the greatest possible extent?
Having laid out the groundwork for Aristotle’s thought, we are now in a position to look more closely at the text of the Politics. The translation we will use is that of Carnes Lord, which can be found in the list of suggested readings. This discussion is by no means complete; there is much of interest and value in Aristotle’s political writings that will not be considered here. Again, the reader is encouraged to investigate the list of suggested readings. However, the main topics and problems of Aristotle’s work will be included. The discussion will, to the extent possible, follow the organization of the Politics.
Aristotle begins the Politics by defining its subject, the city or political partnership. Doing so requires him to explain the purpose of the city. (The Greek word for city is polis, which is the word that gives us English words like “politics” and “policy”). Aristotle says that “It is clear that all partnerships aim at some good, and that the partnership that is most authoritative of all and embraces all the others does so particularly, and aims at the most authoritative good of all. This is what is called the city or the political partnership” (1252a3) (See also III.12). In Greece in Aristotle’s time the important political entities were cities, which controlled surrounding territories that were farmed. It is important to remember that the city was not subordinate to a state or nation, the way that cities are today; it was sovereign over the territory that it controlled. To convey this, some translations use the word “city-state” in place of the world “polis.” Although none of us today lives in a polis , we should not be too quick to dismiss Aristotle’s observations on the way of life of the polis as irrelevant to our own political partnerships.
Notice that Aristotle does not define the political community in the way that we generally would, by the laws that it follows or by the group that holds power or as an entity controlling a particular territory. Instead he defines it as a partnership. The citizens of a political community are partners, and as with any other partnership they pursue a common good. In the case of the city it is the most authoritative or highest good. The most authoritative and highest good of all, for Aristotle, is the virtue and happiness of the citizens, and the purpose of the city is to make it possible for the citizens to achieve this virtue and happiness. When discussing the ideal city, he says “[A] city is excellent, at any rate, by its citizens’ – those sharing in the regime – being excellent; and in our case all the citizens share in the regime” (1332a34). In achieving the virtue that is individual excellence, each of them will fulfill his telos. Indeed, it is the shared pursuit of virtue that makes a city a city.
As I have already noted at the beginning of this text, he says in the Ethics at 1099b30: “The end of politics is the best of ends; and the main concern of politics is to engender a certain character in the citizens and to make them good and disposed to perform noble actions.” As has been mentioned, most people today would not see this as the main concern of politics, or even a legitimate concern. Certainly almost everyone wants to see law-abiding citizens, but it is questionable that changing the citizens’ character or making them morally good is part of what government should do. Doing so would require far more governmental control over citizens than most people in Western societies are willing to allow.
Having seen Aristotle’s definition of the city and its purpose, we then get an example of Aristotle’s usual method of discussing political topics. He begins by examining opinions which are “generally accepted,” which means, as he says in the Topics at 100b21, “are accepted by everyone or by the majority or by the philosophers – i.e. by all, or by the majority, or by the most notable and illustrious of them” on the grounds that any such opinions are likely to have at least some truth to them. These opinions (the Greek word isendoxa), however, are not completely true. They must be systematically examined and modified by scholars of politics before the truths that are part of these opinions are revealed. Because Aristotle uses this method of examining the opinions of others to arrive at truth, the reader must be careful to pay attention to whether a particular argument or belief is Aristotle’s or not. In many cases he is setting out an argument in order to challenge it. It can be difficult to tell when Aristotle is arguing in his own voice and when he is considering the opinions of others, but the reader must carefully make this distinction if they are to understand Aristotle’s teachings. (It has also been suggested that Aristotle’s method should be seen as an example of how political discussion ought to be conducted: a variety of viewpoints and arguments are presented, and the final decision is arrived at through a consideration of the strengths and weaknesses of these viewpoints and arguments). For a further discussion of Aristotle’s methodology, see his discussion of reasoning in general and dialectical reasoning in particular in the Topics. Further examples of his approach can be found in Ethics I.4 and VII.1.
In this case, Aristotle takes up the popular opinion that political rule is really the same as other kinds of rule: that of kings over their subjects, of fathers over their wives and children, and of masters over their slaves. This opinion, he says, is mistaken. In fact, each of these kinds of rule is different. To see why, we must consider how the city comes into being, and it is to this that Aristotle next turns in Book I, Chapter 2.
Here Aristotle tells the story of how cities have historically come into being. The first partnerships among human beings would have been between “persons who cannot exist without one another” (1252a27). There are two pairs of people for whom this is the case. One pair is that of male and female, for the sake of reproduction. This seems reasonable enough to the modern reader. The other pair, however, is that of “the naturally ruling and ruled, on account of preservation” (1252a30). Here Aristotle is referring to slavery. By “preservation” he means that the naturally ruling master and naturally ruled slave need each other if they are to preserve themselves; slavery is a kind of partnership which benefits both master and slave. We will see how later. For now, he simply says that these pairs of people come together and form a household, which exists for the purpose of meeting the needs of daily life (such as food, shelter, clothing, and so forth). The family is only large enough to provide for the bare necessities of life, sustaining its members’ lives and allowing for the reproduction of the species.
Over time, the family expands, and as it does it will come into contact with other families. Eventually a number of such families combine and form a village. Villages are better than families because they are more self-sufficient. Because villages are larger than families, people can specialize in a wider array of tasks and can develop skills in things like cooking, medicine, building, soldiering, and so forth which they could not develop in a smaller group. So the residents of a village will live more comfortable lives, with access to more goods and services, than those who only live in families.
The significant change in human communities, however, comes when a number of villages combine to form a city. A city is not just a big village, but is fundamentally different: “The partnership arising from [the union of] several villages that is complete is the city. It reaches a level of full self-sufficiency, so to speak; and while coming into being for the sake of living, it exists for the sake of living well” (1252b27). Although the founders of cities create them for the sake of more comfortable lives, cities are unique in making it possible for people to live well. Today we tend to think of “living well” as living a life of comfort, family satisfaction, and professional success, surrounded by nice things. But this is not what Aristotle means by “living well”. As we have seen, for Aristotle “living well” means leading a life of happiness and virtue, and by so doing fulfilling one’s telos. Life in the city, in Aristotle’s view, is therefore necessary for anyone who wishes to be completely human. (His particular concern is with the free men who are citizens). “He who is without a city through nature rather than chance is either a mean sort or superior to man,” Aristotle says (1253a3), and adds “One who is incapable of participating or who is in need of nothing through being self-sufficient is no part of a city, and so is either a beast or a god” (1253a27). Humans are not capable of becoming gods, but they are capable of becoming beasts, and in fact the worst kind of beasts: “For just as man is the best of the animals when completed, when separated from law and adjudication he is the worst of all” (1253a30). Outside of the context of life in a properly constructed city, human happiness and well-being is impossible. Even here at the very beginning of the Politics Aristotle is showing the link between ethics and politics and the importance of a well-constructed city in making it possible for the citizens to live well.
There is therefore a sense in which the city “is prior by nature to the household and to each of us” (1253a19). He compares the individual’s relationship with the city to the relationship of a part of the body to the whole body. The destruction of the whole body would also mean the destruction of each of its parts; “if the whole [body] is destroyed there will not be a foot or a hand” (1253a20). And just as a hand is not able to survive without being attached to a functioning body, so too an individual cannot survive without being attached to a city. Presumably Aristotle also means to imply that the reverse is not true; a body can survive the loss of a foot or a hand, although not without consequence. Thus the individual needs the city more than the city needs any of its individual citizens; as Aristotle says in Book 8 before beginning his discussion of the desirable education for the city’s children, “one ought not even consider that a citizen belongs to himself, but rather that all belong to the city; for each individual is a part of the city” (1337a26).
If the history that he has described is correct, Aristotle points out, then the city is natural, and not purely an artificial human construction, since we have established that the first partnerships which make up the family are driven by natural impulses: “Every city, therefore, exists by nature, if such also are the first partnerships. For the city is their end….[T]he city belongs among the things that exist by nature, and…man is by nature a political animal” (1252b30-1253a3). From the very first partnerships of male and female and master and slave, nature has been aiming at the creation of cities, because cities are necessary for human beings to express their capacities and virtues at their best, thus fulfilling their potential and moving towards such perfection as is possible for human beings. While most people today would not agree that nature has a plan for individual human beings, a particular community, or humanity as a whole (although many people would ascribe such a plan to a god or gods), Aristotle believes that nature does indeed have such a plan, and human beings have unique attributes that when properly used make it possible for us to fulfill that plan. What are those attributes?
That man is much more a political animal than any kind of bee or any herd animal is clear. For, as we assert, nature does nothing in vain, and man alone among the animals has speech….[S]peech serves to reveal the advantageous and the harmful and hence also the just and unjust. For it is peculiar to man as compared to the other animals that he alone has a perception of good and bad and just and unjust and other things of this sort; and partnership in these things is what makes a household and a city (1253a8).
Like bees and herd animals, human beings live together in groups. Unlike bees or herd animals, humans have the capacity for speech – or, in the Greek, logos. As we have seen, logos means not only speech but also reason. Here the linkage between speech and reason is clear: the purpose of speech, a purpose assigned to men by nature, is to reveal what is advantageous and harmful, and by doing so to reveal what is good and bad, just and unjust. This knowledge makes it possible for human beings to live together, and at the same time makes it possible for us to pursue justice as part of the virtuous lives we are meant to live. Other animals living in groups, such as bees, goats, and cows, do not have the ability to speak or to reason as Aristotle uses those terms. Of course, they do not need this ability. They are able to live together without determining what is just and unjust or creating laws to enforce justice among themselves. Human beings, for better or worse, cannot do this.
Although nature brings us together – we are by nature political animals – nature alone does not give us all of what we need to live together: “[T]here is in everyone by nature an impulse toward this sort of partnership. And yet the one who first constituted [a city] is responsible for the greatest of goods” [1253a29]. We must figure out how to live together for ourselves through the use of reason and speech, discovering justice and creating laws that make it possible for human community to survive and for the individuals in it to live virtuous lives. A group of people that has done this is a city: “[The virtue of] justice is a thing belonging to the city. For adjudication is an arrangement of the political partnership, and adjudication is judgment as to what is just” (1253a38). And in discovering and living according to the right laws, acting with justice and exercising the virtues that allow human society to function, we make possible not only the success of the political community but also the flourishing of our own individual virtue and happiness. Without the city and its justice, human beings are the worst of animals, just as we are the best when we are completed by the right kind of life in the city. And it is the pursuit of virtue rather than the pursuit of wealth or security or safety or military strength that is the most important element of a city: “The political partnership must be regarded, therefore, as being for the sake of noble actions, not for the sake of living together” (1281a1).
Having described the basic parts of the city, Aristotle returns in Chapter 3 of Book I to a discussion of the household, beginning with the matter of slavery, including the question of whether slavery is just (and hence an acceptable institution) or not. This, for most contemporary readers is one of the two most offensive portions of Aristotle’s moral and political thought (the other is his treatment of women, about which more will be said below). For most people today, of course, the answer to this is obvious: slavery is not just, and in fact is one of the greatest injustices and moral crimes that it is possible to commit. (Although it is not widely known, there are still large numbers of people held in slavery throughout the world at the beginning of the 21st century. It is easy to believe that people in the “modern world” have put a great deal of moral distance between themselves and the less enlightened people in the past, but it is also easy to overestimate that distance).
In Aristotle’s time most people – at least the ones that were not themselves slaves – would also have believed that this question had an obvious answer, if they had asked the question at all: of course slavery is just. Virtually every ancient Mediterranean culture had some form of the institution of slavery. Slaves were usually of two kinds: either they had at one point been defeated in war, and the fact that they had been defeated meant that they were inferior and meant to serve, or else they were the children of slaves, in which case their inferiority was clear from their inferior parentage. Aristotle himself says that the sort of war that involves hunting “those human beings who are naturally suited to be ruled but [are] unwilling…[is] by nature just” (1256b25). What is more, the economies of the Greek city-states rested on slavery, and without slaves (and women) to do the productive labor, there could be no leisure for men to engage in more intellectual lifestyles. The greatness of Athenian plays, architecture, sculpture, and philosophy could not have been achieved without the institution of slavery. Therefore, as a practical matter, regardless of the arguments for or against it, slavery was not going to be abolished in the Greek world. Aristotle’s willingness to consider the justice of slavery, however we might see it, was in fact progressive for the time. It is perhaps also worth noting that Aristotle’s will specified that his slaves should be freed upon his death. This is not to excuse Aristotle or those of his time who supported slavery, but it should be kept in mind so as to give Aristotle a fair hearing.
Before considering Aristotle’s ultimate position on the justness of slavery – for who, and under what circumstances, slavery is appropriate – it must be pointed out that there is a great deal of disagreement about what that position is. That Aristotle believes slavery to be just and good for both master and slave in some circumstances is undeniable. That he believes that some people who are currently enslaved are not being held in slavery according to justice is also undeniable (this would apparently also mean that there are people who should be enslaved but currently are not). How we might tell which people belong in which group, and what Aristotle believes the consequences of his beliefs about slavery ought to be, are more difficult problems.
Remember that in his discussion of the household, Aristotle has said that slavery serves the interest of both the master and the slave. Now he tells us why: “those who are as different [from other men] as the soul from the body or man from beast – and they are in this state if their work is the use of the body, and if this is the best that can come from them – are slaves by nature….For he is a slave by nature who is capable of belonging to another – which is also why he belongs to another – and who participates in reason only to the extent of perceiving it, but does not have it” (1254b16-23). Notice again the importance of logos – reason and speech. Those who are slaves by nature do not have the full ability to reason. (Obviously they are not completely helpless or unable to reason; in the case of slaves captured in war, for example, the slaves were able to sustain their lives into adulthood and organize themselves into military forces. Aristotle also promises a discussion of “why it is better to hold out freedom as a reward for all slaves” (1330a30) which is not in the Politics as we have it, but if slaves were not capable of reasoning well enough to stay alive it would not be a good thing to free them). They are incapable of fully governing their own lives, and require other people to tell them what to do. Such people should be set to labor by the people who have the ability to reason fully and order their own lives. Labor is their proper use; Aristotle refers to slaves as “living tools” at I.4. Slaves get the guidance and instructions that they must have to live, and in return they provide the master with the benefits of their physical labor, not least of which is the free time that makes it possible for the master to engage in politics and philosophy.
One of the themes running through Aristotle’s thought that most people would reject today is the idea that a life of labor is demeaning and degrading, so that those who must work for a living are not able to be as virtuous as those who do not have to do such work. Indeed, Aristotle says that when the master can do so he avoids labor even to the extent of avoiding the oversight of those who must engage in it: “[F]or those to whom it is open not to be bothered with such things [i.e. managing slaves], an overseer assumes this prerogative, while they themselves engage in politics or philosophy” (1255b35).
This would seem to legitimate slavery, and yet there are two significant problems.
First, Aristotle points out that although nature would like us to be able to differentiate between who is meant to be a slave and who is meant to be a master by making the difference in reasoning capacity visible in their outward appearances, it frequently does not do so. We cannot look at people’s souls and distinguish those who are meant to rule from those who are meant to be ruled – and this will also cause problems when Aristotle turns to the question of who has a just claim to rule in the city.
Second, in Chapter Six, Aristotle points out that not everyone currently held in slavery is in fact a slave by nature. The argument that those who are captured in war are inferior in virtue cannot, as far as Aristotle is concerned, be sustained, and the idea that the children of slaves are meant to be slaves is also wrong: “[T]hey claim that from the good should come someone good, just as from a human being comes from a human being and a beast from beasts. But while nature wishes to do this, it is often unable to” (1255b3). We are left with the position that while some people are indeed slaves by nature, and that slavery is good for them, it is extremely difficult to find out who these people are, and that therefore it is not the case that slavery is automatically just either for people taken in war or for children of slaves, though sometimes it is (1256b23). In saying this, Aristotle was undermining the legitimacy of the two most significant sources of slaves. If Aristotle’s personal life is relevant, while he himself owned slaves, he was said to have freed them upon his death. Whether this makes Aristotle’s position on slavery more acceptable or less so is left to the reader to decide.
In Chapter 8 of Book I Aristotle says that since we have been talking about household possessions such as slaves we might as well continue this discussion. The discussion turns to “expertise in household management.” The Greek word for “household” is oikos, and it is the source of our word “economics.” In Aristotle’s day almost all productive labor took place within the household, unlike today, in modern capitalist societies, when it mostly takes place in factories, offices, and other places specifically developed for such activity.
Aristotle uses the discussion of household management to make a distinction between expertise in managing a household and expertise in business. The former, Aristotle says, is important both for the household and the city; we must have supplies available of the things that are necessary for life, such as food, clothing, and so forth, and because the household is natural so too is the science of household management, the job of which is to maintain the household. The latter, however, is potentially dangerous. This, obviously, is another major difference between Aristotle and contemporary Western societies, which respect and admire business expertise, and encourage many of our citizens to acquire and develop such expertise. For Aristotle, however, expertise in business is not natural, but “arises rather through a certain experience and art” (1257a5). It is on account of expertise in business that “there is held to be no limit to wealth and possessions” (1257a1). This is a problem because some people are led to pursue wealth without limit, and the choice of such a life, while superficially very attractive, does not lead to virtue and real happiness. It leads some people to “proceed on the supposition that they should either preserve or increase without limit their property in money. The cause of this state is that they are serious about living, but not about living well; and since that desire of theirs is without limit, they also desire what is productive of unlimited things” (1257b38).
Aristotle does not entirely condemn wealth – it is necessary for maintaining the household and for providing the opportunity to develop one’s virtue. For example, generosity is one of the virtues listed in the Ethics, but it is impossible to be generous unless one has possessions to give away. But Aristotle strongly believes that we must not lose sight of the fact that wealth is to be pursued for the sake of living a virtuous life, which is what it means to live well, rather than for its own sake. (So at 1258b1 he agrees with those who object to the lending of money for interest, upon which virtually the entire modern global economy is based). Someone who places primary importance on money and the bodily satisfactions that it can buy is not engaged in developing their virtue and has chosen a life which, however it may seem from the outside or to the person living it, is not a life of true happiness.
This is still another difference between Aristotle and contemporary Western societies. For many if not most people in such societies, the pursuit of wealth without limit is seen as not only acceptable but even admirable. At the same time, many people reject the emphasis Aristotle places on the importance of political participation. Many liberal democracies fail to get even half of their potential voters to cast a ballot at election time, and jury duty, especially in the United States, is often looked on as a burden and waste of time, rather than a necessary public service that citizens should willingly perform. In Chapter 11, Aristotle notes that there is a lot more to be said about enterprise in business, but “to spend much time on such things is crude” (1258b35). Aristotle believes that we ought to be more concerned with other matters; moneymaking is beneath the attention of the virtuous man. (In this Aristotle is in agreement with the common opinion of Athenian aristocrats). He concludes this discussion with a story about Thales the philosopher using his knowledge of astronomy to make a great deal of money, “thus showing how easy it is for philosophers to become wealthy if they so wish, but it is not this they are serious about” (1259a16). Their intellectual powers, which could be turned to wealth, are being used in other, better ways to develop their humanity.
In the course of discussing the various ways of life open to human beings, Aristotle notes that “If, then, nature makes nothing that is incomplete or purposeless, nature must necessarily have made all of these [i.e. all plants and animals] for the sake of human beings” (1256b21). Though not a directly political statement, it does emphasize Aristotle’s belief that there are many hierarchies in nature, as well as his belief that those who are lower in the natural hierarchy should be under the command of those who are higher.
In Chapter 12, after the discussion of business expertise has been completed, Aristotle returns to the subject of household rule, and takes up the question of the proper forms of rule over women and children. As with the master’s rule over the slave, and humanity’s rule over plants and other animals, Aristotle defines these kinds of rule in terms of natural hierarchies: “[T]he male, unless constituted in some respect contrary to nature, is by nature more expert at leading than the female, and the elder and complete than the younger and incomplete” (1259a41). This means that it is natural for the male to rule: “[T]he relation of male to female is by nature a relation of superior to inferior and ruler to ruled” (1245b12). And just as with the rule of the master over the slave, the difference here is one of reason: “The slave is wholly lacking the deliberative element; the female has it but it lacks authority; the child has it but it is incomplete” (1260a11).
There is a great deal of scholarly debate about what the phrase “lacks authority” means in this context. Aristotle does not elaborate on it. Some have suggested that it means not that women’s reason is inferior to that of men but that women lack the ability to make men do what they want, either because of some innate psychological characteristic (they are not aggressive and/or assertive enough) or because of the prevailing culture in Greece at the time. Others suggest that it means that women’s emotions are ultimately more influential in determining their behavior than reason is so that reason lacks authority over what a woman does. This question cannot be settled here. I will simply point out the vicious circle in which women were trapped in ancient Greece (and still are in many cultures). The Greeks believed that women are inferior to men (or at least those Greeks who wrote philosophy, plays, speeches, and so forth did. These people, of course, were all men. What Greek women thought of this belief is impossible to say). This belief means that women are denied access to certain areas of life (such as politics). Denying them access to these spheres means that they fail to develop the knowledge and skills to become proficient in them. This lack of knowledge and skills then becomes evidence to reinforce the original belief that they are inferior.
What else does Aristotle have to say about the rule of men over women? He says that the rule of the male over the female and that of the father over children are different in form from the rule of masters over slaves. Aristotle places the rule of male over female in the household in the context of the husband over the wife (female children who had not yet been married would have been ruled by their father. Marriage for girls in Athens typically took place at the age of thirteen or fourteen). Aristotle says at 1259a40 that the wife is to be ruled in political fashion. We have not yet seen what political rule looks like, but here Aristotle notes several of its important features, one of which is that it usually involves “alternation in ruling and being ruled” (1259b2), and another is that it involves rule among those who “tend by their nature to be on an equal footing and to differ in nothing” (1259b5). In this case, however, the husband does not alternate rule with the wife but instead always rules. Apparently the husband is to treat his wife as an equal to the degree that it is possible to do so, but must retain ultimate control over household decisions.
Women have their own role in the household, preserving what the man acquires. However, women do not participate in politics, since their reason lacks the authority that would allow them to do so, and in order to properly fulfill this role the wife must pursue her own telos. This is not the same as that of a man, but as with a man nature intends her to achieve virtues of the kind that are available to her: “It is thus evident that…the moderation of a woman and a man is not the same, nor their courage or justice…but that there is a ruling and a serving courage, and similarly with the other virtues” (1260a19). Unfortunately Aristotle has very little to say about what women’s virtues look like, how they are to be achieved, or how women should be educated. But it is clear that Aristotle believes that as with the master’s superiority to the slave, the man’s superiority to a woman is dictated by nature and cannot be overcome by human laws, customs, or beliefs.
Aristotle concludes the discussion of household rule, and the first book of the Politics, by stating that the discussion here is not complete and “must necessarily be addressed in the [discourses] connected with the regimes” (1260a11). This is the case because both women and children “must necessarily be educated looking to the regime, at least if it makes any difference with a view to the city’s being excellent that both its children and its women are excellent. But it necessarily makes a difference…” (1260a14). “Regime” is one of the ways to translate the Greek word politeia, which is also often translated as “constitution” or “political system.” Although there is some controversy about how best to translate this word, I will use the word “regime” throughout this article. The reader should keep in mind that if the word “constitution” is used this does not mean a written constitution of the sort that most contemporary nation-states employ. Instead, Aristotle uses politeia (however it is translated) to mean the way the state is organized, what offices there are, who is eligible to hold them, how they are selected, and so forth. All of these things depend on the group that holds political power in the city. For example, sometimes power is held by one man who rules in the interest of the city as a whole; this is the kind of regime called monarchy. If power is held by the wealthy who rule for their own benefit, then the regime is an oligarchy.
We will have much more to say later on the topic of regimes. Here Aristotle is introducing another important idea which he will develop later: the idea that the people living under a regime, including the women and children, must be taught to believe in the principles that underlie that regime. (In Book II, Chapter 9, Aristotle severely criticizes the Spartan regime for its failure to properly educate the Spartan women and shows the negative consequences this has had for the Spartan regime). For a monarchy to last, for example, the people must believe in the rightness of monarchical rule and the principles which justify it. Therefore it is important for the monarch to teach the people these principles and beliefs. In Books IV-VI Aristotle develops in much more detail what the principles of the different regimes are, and the Politics concludes with a discussion of the kind of education that the best regime ought to provide its citizens.
“Cities…that are held to be in a fine condition” In Book II, Aristotle changes his focus from the household to the consideration of regimes that are “in use in some of the cities that are said to be well managed and any others spoken about by certain persons that are held to be in a fine condition” (1260a30). This examination of existing cities must be done both in order to find out what those cities do properly, so that their successes can be imitated, and to find out what they do improperly so that we can learn from their mistakes. This study and the use of the knowledge it brings remains one of the important tasks of political science. Merely imitating an existing regime, no matter how excellent its reputation, is not sufficient. This is the case “because those regimes now available are in fact not in a fine condition” (1260a34). In order to create a better regime we must study the imperfect ones found in the real world. He will do this again on a more theoretical level in Books IV-VI. We should also examine the ideal regimes proposed by other thinkers. As it turns out, however fine these regimes are in theory, they cannot be put into practice, and this is obviously reason enough not to adopt them. Nevertheless, the ideas of other thinkers can assist us in our search for knowledge. Keep in mind that the practical sciences are not about knowledge for its own sake: unless we put this knowledge to use in order to improve the citizens and the city, the study engaged in by political science is pointless. We will not consider all the details of the different regimes Aristotle describes, but some of them are important enough to examine here.
Aristotle begins his exploration of these regimes with the question of the degree to which the citizens in a regime should be partners. Recall that he opened the Politics with the statement that the city is a partnership, and in fact the most authoritative partnership. The citizens of a particular city clearly share something, because it is sharing that makes a partnership. Consider some examples of partnerships: business partners share a desire for wealth; philosophers share a desire for knowledge; drinking companions share a desire for entertainment; the members of a hockey team share a desire to win their game.
So what is it that citizens share? This is an important question for Aristotle, and he chooses to answer this question in the context of Socrates’ imagined community in Plato‘s dialogue The Republic. Aristotle has already said that the regime is a partnership in adjudication and justice. But is it enough that the people of a city have a shared understanding of what justice means and what the laws require, or is the political community a partnership in more than these things? Today the answer would probably be that these things are sufficient – a group of people sharing territory and laws is not far from how most people would define the modern state. In the Republic, Socrates argues that the city should be unified to the greatest degree possible. The citizens, or at least those in the ruling class, ought to share everything, including property, women, and children. There should be no private families and no private property. But this, according to Aristotle, is too much sharing. While the city is clearly a kind of unity, it is a unity that must derive from a multitude. Human beings are unavoidably different, and this difference, as we saw earlier, is the reason cities were formed in the first place, because difference within the city allows for specialization and greater self-sufficiency. Cities are preserved not by complete unity and similarity but by “reciprocal equality,” and this principle is especially important in cities where “persons are free and equal.” In such cities “all cannot rule at the same time, but each rules for a year or according to some other arrangement or period of time. In this way, then, it results that all rule…” (1261a30). This topic, the alternation of rule in cities where the citizens are free and equal, is an important part of Aristotle’s thought, and we will return to it later.
There would be another drawback to creating a city in which everything is held in common. Aristotle notes that people value and care for what is their own: “What belongs in common to the most people is accorded the least care: they take thought for their own things above all, and less about things common, or only so much as falls to each individually” (1261b32). (Contemporary social scientists call this a problem of “collective goods”). Therefore to hold women and property in common, as Socrates proposes, would be a mistake. It would weaken attachments to other people and to the common property of the city, and this would lead to each individual assuming that someone else would care for the children and property, with the end result being that no one would. For a modern example, many people who would not throw trash on their own front yard or damage their own furniture will litter in a public park and destroy the furniture in a rented apartment or dorm room. Some in Aristotle’s time (and since) have suggested that holding property in common will lead to an end to conflict in the city. This may at first seem wise, since the unequal distribution of property in a political community is, Aristotle believes, one of the causes of injustice in the city and ultimately of civil war. But in fact it is not the lack of common property that leads to conflict; instead, Aristotle blames human depravity (1263b20). And in order to deal with human depravity, what is needed is to moderate human desires, which can be done among those “adequately educated by the laws” (1266b31). Inequality of property leads to problems because the common people desire wealth without limit (1267b3); if this desire can be moderated, so too can the problems that arise from it. Aristotle also includes here the clam that the citizens making up the elite engage in conflict because of inequality of honors (1266b38). In other words, they engage in conflict with the other citizens because of their desire for an unequal share of honor, which leads them to treat the many with condescension and arrogance. Holding property in common, Aristotle notes, will not remove the desire for honor as a source of conflict.
In Chapters 9-11 of Book II, Aristotle considers existing cities that are held to be excellent: Sparta in Chapter 9, Crete in Chapter 10, and Carthage (which, notably, was not a Greek city) in Chapter 11. It is noteworthy that when Athens is considered following this discussion (in Chapter 12), Aristotle takes a critical view and seems to suggest that the city has declined since the time of Solon. Aristotle does not anywhere in his writings suggest that Athens is the ideal city or even the best existing city. It is easy to assume the opposite, and many have done so, but there is no basis for this assumption. We will not examine the particulars of Aristotle’s view of each of these cities. However, two important points should be noted here. One general point that Aristotle makes when considering existing regimes is that when considering whether a particular piece of legislation is good or not, it must be compared not only to the best possible set of arrangements but also the set of arrangements that actually prevails in the city. If a law does not fit well with the principles of the regime, although it may be an excellent law in the abstract, the people will not believe in it or support it and as a result it will be ineffective or actually harmful (1269a31). The other is that Aristotle is critical of the Spartans because of their belief that the most important virtue to develop and the one that the city must teach its citizens is the kind of virtue that allows them to make war successfully. But war is not itself an end or a good thing; war is for the sake of peace, and the inability of the Spartans to live virtuously in times of peace has led to their downfall. (See also Book VII, Chapter 2, where Aristotle notes the hypocrisy of a city whose citizens seek justice among themselves but “care nothing about justice towards others” (1324b35) and Book VII, Chapter 15).
In Book III, Aristotle takes a different approach to understanding the city. Again he takes up the question of what the city actually is, but here his method is to understand the parts that make up the city: the citizens. “Thus who ought to be called a citizen and what the citizen is must be investigated” (1274b41). For Americans today this is a legal question: anyone born in the United States or born to American citizens abroad is automatically a citizen. Other people can become citizens by following the correct legal procedures for doing so. However, this rule is not acceptable for Aristotle, since slaves are born in the same cities as free men but that does not make them citizens. For Aristotle, there is more to citizenship than living in a particular place or sharing in economic activity or being ruled under the same laws. Instead, citizenship for Aristotle is a kind of activity: “The citizen in an unqualified sense is defined by no other thing so much as by sharing in decision and office” (1275a22). Later he says that “Whoever is entitled to participate in an office involving deliberation or decision is, we can now say, a citizen in this city; and the city is the multitude of such persons that is adequate with a view to a self-sufficient life, to speak simply” (1275b17). And this citizen is a citizen “above all in a democracy; he may, but will not necessarily, be a citizen in the others” (1275b4). We have yet to talk about what a democracy is, but when we do, this point will be important to defining it properly. When Aristotle talks about participation, he means that each citizen should participate directly in the assembly – not by voting for representatives – and should willingly serve on juries to help uphold the laws. Note again the contrast with modern Western nation-states where there are very few opportunities to participate directly in politics and most people struggle to avoid serving on juries.
Participation in deliberation and decision making means that the citizen is part of a group that discusses the advantageous and the harmful, the good and bad, and the just and unjust, and then passes laws and reaches judicial decisions based on this deliberative process. This process requires that each citizen consider the various possible courses of action on their merits and discuss these options with his fellow citizens. By doing so the citizen is engaging in reason and speech and is therefore fulfilling his telos, engaged in the process that enables him to achieve the virtuous and happy life. In regimes where the citizens are similar and equal by nature – which in practice is all of them – all citizens should be allowed to participate in politics, though not all at once. They must take turns, ruling and being ruled in turn. Note that this means that citizenship is not just a set of privileges, it is also a set of duties. The citizen has certain freedoms that non-citizens do not have, but he also has obligations (political participation and military service) that they do not have. We will see shortly why Aristotle believed that the cities existing at the time did not in fact follow this principle of ruling and being ruled in turn.
Before looking more closely at democracy and the other kinds of regimes, there are still several important questions to be discussed in Book III. One of the most important of these from Aristotle’s point of view is in Chapter 4. Here he asks the question of “whether the virtue of the good man and the excellent citizen is to be regarded as the same or as not the same” (1276b15). This is a question that seems strange, or at least irrelevant, to most people today. The good citizen today is asked to follow the laws, pay taxes, and possibly serve on juries; these are all good things the good man (or woman) would do, so that the good citizen is seen as being more or less subsumed into the category of the good person. For Aristotle, however, this is not the case. We have already seen Aristotle’s definition of the good man: the one who pursues his telos, living a life in accordance with virtue and finding happiness by doing so. What is Aristotle’s definition of the good citizen?
Aristotle has already told us that if the regime is going to endure it must educate all the citizens in such a way that they support the kind of regime that it is and the principles that legitimate it. Because there are several different types of regime (six, to be specific, which will be considered in more detail shortly), there are several different types of good citizen. Good citizens must have the type of virtue that preserves the partnership and the regime: “[A]lthough citizens are dissimilar, preservation of the partnership is their task, and the regime is [this] partnership; hence the virtue of the citizen must necessarily be with a view to the regime. If, then, there are indeed several forms of regime, it is clear that it is not possible for the virtue of the excellent citizen to be single, or complete virtue” (1276b27).
There is only one situation in which the virtue of the good citizen and excellent man are the same, and this is when the citizens are living in a city that is under the ideal regime: “In the case of the best regime, [the citizen] is one who is capable of and intentionally chooses being ruled and ruling with a view to the life in accordance with virtue” (1284a1). Aristotle does not fully describe this regime until Book VII. For those of us not living in the ideal regime, the ideal citizen is one who follows the laws and supports the principles of the regime, whatever that regime is. That this may well require us to act differently than the good man would act and to believe things that the good man knows to be false is one of the unfortunate tragedies of political life.
There is another element to determining who the good citizen is, and it is one that we today would not support. For Aristotle, remember, politics is about developing the virtue of the citizens and making it possible for them to live a life of virtue. We have already seen that women and slaves are not capable of living this kind of life, although each of these groups has its own kind of virtue to pursue. But there is another group that is incapable of citizenship leading to virtue, and Aristotle calls this group “the vulgar”. These are the people who must work for a living. Such people lack the leisure time necessary for political participation and the study of philosophy: “it is impossible to pursue the things of virtue when one lives the life of a vulgar person or a laborer” (1278a20). They are necessary for the city to exist – someone must build the houses, make the shoes, and so forth – but in the ideal city they would play no part in political life because their necessary tasks prevent them from developing their minds and taking an active part in ruling the city. Their existence, like those of the slaves and the women, is for the benefit of the free male citizens. Aristotle makes this point several times in the Politics: see, for example, VII.9 and VIII.2 for discussions of the importance of avoiding the lifestyle of the vulgar if one wants to achieve virtue, and I.13 and III.4, where those who work with their hands are labeled as kinds of slaves.
The citizens, therefore, are those men who are “similar in stock and free,” (1277b8) and rule over such men by those who are their equals is political rule, which is different from the rule of masters over slaves, men over women, and parents over children. This is one of Aristotle’s most important points: “[W]hen [the regime] is established in accordance with equality and similarity among the citizens, [the citizens] claim to merit ruling in turn” (1279a8). Throughout the remainder of the Politics he returns to this point to remind us of the distinction between a good regime and a bad regime. The correct regime of polity, highlighted in Book IV, is under political rule, while deviant regimes are those which are ruled as though a master was ruling over slaves. But this is wrong: “For in the case of persons similar by nature, justice and merit must necessarily be the same according to nature; and so if it is harmful for their bodies if unequal persons have equal sustenance and clothing, it is so also [for their souls if they are equal] in what pertains to honors, and similarly therefore if equal persons have what is unequal” (1287a12).
This brings us to perhaps the most contentious of political questions: how should the regime be organized? Another way of putting this is: who should rule? In Books IV-VI Aristotle explores this question by looking at the kinds of regimes that actually existed in the Greek world and answering the question of who actually does rule. By closely examining regimes that actually exist, we can draw conclusions about the merits and drawbacks of each. Like political scientists today, he studied the particular political phenomena of his time in order to draw larger conclusions about how regimes and political institutions work and how they should work. As has been mentioned above, in order to do this, he sent his students throughout Greece to collect information on the regimes and histories of the Greek cities, and he uses this information throughout the Politics to provide examples that support his arguments. (According to Diogenes Laertius, histories and descriptions of the regimes of 158 cities were written, but only one of these has come down to the present: the Constitution of Athens mentioned above).
Another way he used this data was to create a typology of regimes that was so successful that it ended up being used until the time of Machiavelli nearly 2000 years later. He used two criteria to sort the regimes into six categories.
The first criterion that is used to distinguish among different kinds of regimes is the number of those ruling: one man, a few men, or the many. The second is perhaps a little more unexpected: do those in power, however many they are, rule only in their own interest or do they rule in the interest of all the citizens? “[T]hose regimes which look to the common advantage are correct regimes according to what is unqualifiedly just, while those which look only to the advantage of the rulers are errant, and are all deviations from the correct regimes; for they involve mastery, but the city is a partnership of free persons” (1279a16).
Having established these as the relevant criteria, in Book III Chapter 7 Aristotle sets out the six kinds of regimes. The correct regimes are monarchy (rule by one man for the common good), aristocracy (rule by a few for the common good), and polity (rule by the many for the common good); the flawed or deviant regimes are tyranny (rule by one man in his own interest), oligarchy (rule by the few in their own interest), and democracy (rule by the many in their own interest). Aristotle later ranks them in order of goodness, with monarchy the best, aristocracy the next best, then polity, democracy, oligarchy, and tyranny (1289a38). People in Western societies are used to thinking of democracy as a good form of government – maybe the only good form of government – but Aristotle considers it one of the flawed regimes (although it is the least bad of the three) and you should keep that in mind in his discussion of it. You should also keep in mind that by the “common good” Aristotle means the common good of the citizens, and not necessarily all the residents of the city. The women, slaves, and manual laborers are in the city for the good of the citizens.
Almost immediately after this typology is created, Aristotle clarifies it: the real distinction between oligarchy and democracy is in fact the distinction between whether the wealthy or the poor rule (1279b39), not whether the many or the few rule. Since it is always the case that the poor are many while the wealthy are few, it looks like it is the number of the rulers rather than their wealth which distinguishes the two kinds of regimes (he elaborates on this in IV.4). All cities have these two groups, the many poor and the few wealthy, and Aristotle was well aware that it was the conflict between these two groups that caused political instability in the cities, even leading to civil wars (Thucydides describes this in his History of the Peloponnesian War, and the Constitution of Athens also discusses the consequences of this conflict). Aristotle therefore spends a great deal of time discussing these two regimes and the problem of political instability, and we will focus on this problem as well.
First, however, let us briefly consider with Aristotle one other valid claim to rule. Those who are most virtuous have, Aristotle says, the strongest claim of all to rule. If the city exists for the sake of developing virtue in the citizens, then those who have the most virtue are the most fit to rule; they will rule best, and on behalf of all the citizens, establishing laws that lead others to virtue. However, if one man or a few men of exceptional virtue exist in the regime, we will be outside of politics: “If there is one person so outstanding by his excess of virtue – or a number of persons, though not enough to provide a full complement for the city – that the virtue of all the others and their political capacity is not commensurable…such persons can no longer be regarded as part of the city” (1284a4). It would be wrong for the other people in the city to claim the right to rule over them or share rule with them, just as it would be wrong for people to claim the right to share power with Zeus. The proper thing would be to obey them (1284b28). But this situation is extremely unlikely (1287b40). Instead, cities will be made up of people who are similar and equal, which leads to problems of its own.
The most pervasive of these is that oligarchs and democrats each advance a claim to political power based on justice. For Aristotle, justice dictates that equal people should get equal things, and unequal people should get unequal things. If, for example, two students turn in essays of identical quality, they should each get the same grade. Their work is equal, and so the reward should be too. If they turn in essays of different quality, they should get different grades which reflect the differences in their work. But the standards used for grading papers are reasonably straightforward, and the consequences of this judgment are not that important, relatively speaking – they certainly are not worth fighting and dying for. But the stakes are raised when we ask how we should judge the question of who should rule, for the standards here are not straightforward and disagreement over the answer to this question frequently does lead men (and women) to fight and die.
What does justice require when political power is being distributed? Aristotle says that both groups – the oligarchs and democrats – offer judgments about this, but neither of them gets it right, because “the judgment concerns themselves, and most people are bad judges concerning their own things” (1280a14). (This was the political problem that was of most concern to the authors of the United States Constitution: given that people are self-interested and ambitious, who can be trusted with power? Their answer differs from Aristotle’s, but it is worth pointing out the persistence of the problem and the difficulty of solving it). The oligarchs assert that their greater wealth entitles them to greater power, which means that they alone should rule, while the democrats say that the fact that all are equally free entitles each citizen to an equal share of political power (which, because most people are poor, means that in effect the poor rule). If the oligarchs’ claim seems ridiculous, you should keep in mind that the American colonies had property qualifications for voting; those who could not prove a certain level of wealth were not allowed to vote. And poll taxes, which required people to pay a tax in order to vote and therefore kept many poor citizens (including almost all African-Americans) from voting, were not eliminated in the United States until the mid-20th century. At any rate, each of these claims to rule, Aristotle says, is partially correct but partially wrong. We will consider the nature of democracy and oligarchy shortly.
Aristotle also in Book III argues for a principle that has become one of the bedrock principles of liberal democracy: we ought, to the extent possible, allow the law to rule. “One who asks the law to rule, therefore, is held to be asking god and intellect alone to rule, while one who asks man adds the beast. Desire is a thing of this sort; and spiritedness perverts rulers and the best men. Hence law is intellect without appetite” (1287a28). This is not to say that the law is unbiased. It will reflect the bias of the regime, as it must, because the law reinforces the principles of the regime and helps educate the citizens in those principles so that they will support the regime. But in any particular case, the law, having been established in advance, is impartial, whereas a human judge will find it hard to resist judging in his own interest, according to his own desires and appetites, which can easily lead to injustice. Also, if this kind of power is left in the hands of men rather than with the laws, there will be a desperate struggle to control these offices and their benefits, and this will be another cause of civil war. So whatever regime is in power should, to the extent possible, allow the laws to rule. Ruling in accordance with one’s wishes at any particular time is one of the hallmarks of tyranny (it is the same way masters rule over slaves), and it is also, Aristotle says, typical of a certain kind of democracy, which rules by decree rather than according to settled laws. In these cases we are no longer dealing with politics at all, “For where the laws do not rule there is no regime” (1292b30). There are masters and slaves, but there are no citizens.
In Book IV Aristotle continues to think about existing regimes and their limitations, focusing on the question: what is the best possible regime? This is another aspect of political science that is still practiced today, as Aristotle combines a theory about how regimes ought to be with his analysis of how regimes really are in practice in order to prescribe changes to those regimes that will bring them more closely in line with the ideal. It is in Book VII that Aristotle describes the regime that would be absolutely the best, if we could have everything the way we wanted it; here he is considering the best regime that we can create given the kinds of human beings and circumstances that cities today find themselves forced to deal with, “For one should study not only the best regime but also the regime that is [the best] possible, and similarly also the regime that is easier and more attainable for all” (1288b37).
Aristotle also provides advice for those that want to preserve any of the existing kinds of regime, even the defective ones, showing a kind of hard-headed realism that is often overlooked in his writings. In order to do this, he provides a higher level of detail about the varieties of the different regimes than he has previously given us. There are a number of different varieties of democracy and oligarchy because cities are made up of a number of different groups of people, and the regime will be different depending on which of these groups happens to be most authoritative. For example, a democracy that is based on the farming element will be different than a democracy that is based on the element that is engaged in commerce, and similarly there are different kinds of oligarchies. We do not need to consider these in detail except to note that Aristotle holds to his position that in either a democracy or an oligarchy it is best if the law rules rather than the people possessing power. In the case of democracy it is best if the farmers rule, because farmers will not have the time to attend the assembly, so they will stay away and will let the laws rule (VI.4).
It is, however, important to consider polity in some detail, and this is the kind of regime to which Aristotle next turns his attention. “Simply speaking, polity is a mixture of oligarchy and democracy” (1293b32). Remember that polity is one of the correct regimes, and it occurs when the many rule in the interest of the political community as a whole. The problem with democracy as the rule of the many is that in a democracy the many rule in their own interest; they exploit the wealthy and deny them political power. But a democracy in which the interests of the wealthy were taken into account and protected by the laws would be ruling in the interest of the community as a whole, and it is this that Aristotle believes is the best practical regime. The ideal regime to be described in Book VII is the regime that we would pray for if the gods would grant us our wishes and we could create a city from scratch, having everything exactly the way we would want it. But when we are dealing with cities that already exist, their circumstances limit what kind of regime we can reasonably expect to create. Creating a polity is a difficult thing to do, and although he provides many examples of democracies and oligarchies Aristotle does not give any examples of existing polities or of polities that have existed in the past.
One of the important elements of creating a polity is to combine the institutions of a democracy with those of an oligarchy. For example, in a democracy, citizens are paid to serve on juries, while in an oligarchy, rich people are fined if they do not. In a polity, both of these approaches are used, with the poor being paid to serve and the rich fined for not serving. In this way, both groups will serve on juries and power will be shared. There are several ways to mix oligarchy and democracy, but “The defining principle of a good mixture of democracy and oligarchy is that it should be possible for the same polity to be spoken of as either a democracy or an oligarchy” (1294b14). The regime must be said to be both – and neither – a democracy and an oligarchy, and it will be preserved “because none of the parts of the city generally would wish to have another regime” (1294b38).
In addition to combining elements from the institutions of democracy and oligarchy, the person wishing to create a lasting polity must pay attention to the economic situation in the city. In Book II of the EthicsAristotle famously establishes the principle that virtue is a mean between two extremes. For example, a soldier who flees before a battle is guilty of the vice of cowardice, while one who charges the enemy singlehandedly, breaking ranks and getting himself killed for no reason, is guilty of the vice of foolhardiness. The soldier who practices the virtue of courage is the one who faces the enemy, moves forward with the rest of the troops in good order, and fights bravely. Courage, then, is a mean between the extremes of cowardice and foolhardiness. The person who has it neither flees from the enemy nor engages in a suicidal and pointless attack but faces the enemy bravely and attacks in the right way.
Aristotle draws a parallel between virtue in individuals and virtue in cities. The city, he says, has three parts: the rich, the poor, and the middle class. Today we would probably believe that it is the rich people who are the most fortunate of those three groups, but this is not Aristotle’s position. He says: “[I]t is evident that in the case of the goods of fortune as well a middling possession is the best of all. For [a man of moderate wealth] is readiest to obey reason, while for one who is [very wealthy or very poor] it is difficult to follow reason. The former sort tend to become arrogant and base on a grand scale, the latter malicious and base in petty ways; and acts of injustice are committed either through arrogance or through malice” (1295b4). A political community that has extremes of wealth and poverty “is a city not of free persons but of slaves and masters, the ones consumed by envy, the others by contempt. Nothing is further removed from affection and from a political partnership” (1295b22). People in the middle class are free from the arrogance that characterizes the rich and the envy that characterizes the poor. And, since members of this class are similar and equal in wealth, they are likely to regard one another as similar and equal generally, and to be willing to rule and be ruled in turn, neither demanding to rule at all times as the wealthy do or trying to avoid ruling as the poor do from their lack of resources. “Thus it is the greatest good fortune for those who are engaged in politics to have a middling and sufficient property, because where some possess very many things and others nothing, either [rule of] the people in its extreme form must come into being, or unmixed oligarchy, or – as a result of both of these excesses – tyranny. For tyranny arises from the most headstrong sort of democracy and from oligarchy, but much less often from the middling sorts [of regime] and those close to them” (1295b39).
There can be an enduring polity only when the middle class is able either to rule on its own or in conjunction with either of the other two groups, for in this way it can moderate their excesses: “Where the multitude of middling persons predominates either over both of the extremities together or over one alone, there a lasting polity is capable of existing” (1296b38). Unfortunately, Aristotle says, this state of affairs almost never exists. Instead, whichever group, rich or poor, is able to achieve power conducts affairs to suit itself rather than considering the interests of the other group: “whichever of the two succeeds in dominating its opponents does not establish a regime that is common or equal, but they grasp for preeminence in the regime as the prize of victory” (1296a29). And as a result, neither group seeks equality but instead each tries to dominate the other, believing that it is the only way to avoid being dominated in turn. This is a recipe for instability, conflict, and ultimately civil war, rather than a lasting regime. For the polity (or any other regime) to last, “the part of the city that wants the regime to continue must be superior to the part not wanting this” in quality and quantity (1296b16). He repeats this in Book V, calling it the “great principle”: “keep watch to ensure that that the multitude wanting the regime is superior to that not wanting it” (1309b16), and in Book VI he discusses how this can be arranged procedurally (VI.3).
The remainder of Book IV focuses on the kinds of authority and offices in the city and how these can be distributed in democratic or oligarchic fashion. We do not need to concern ourselves with these details, but it does show that Aristotle is concerned with particular kinds of flawed regimes and how they can best operate and function in addition to his interest in the best practical government and the best government generally.
In Book V Aristotle turns his attention to how regimes can be preserved and how they are destroyed. Since we have seen what kind of regime a polity is, and how it can be made to endure, we are already in a position to see what is wrong with regimes which do not adopt the principles of a polity. We have already seen the claims of the few rich and the many poor to rule. The former believe that because they are greater in material wealth they should also be greater in political power, while the latter claim that because all citizens are equally free political power should also be equally distributed, which allows the many poor to rule because of their superior numbers. Both groups are partially correct, but neither is entirely correct, “And it is for this reason that, when either [group] does not share in the regime on the basis of the conception it happens to have, they engage in factional conflict” which can lead to civil war (1301a37). While the virtuous also have a claim to rule, the very fact that they are virtuous leads them to avoid factional conflict. They are also too small a group to be politically consequential: “[T]hose who are outstanding in virtue do not engage in factional conflict to speak of; for they are few against many” (1304b4). Therefore, the conflict that matters is the one between the rich and poor, and as we have seen, whichever group gets the upper hand will arrange things for its own benefit and in order to harm the other group. The fact that each of these groups ignores the common good and seeks only its own interest is why both oligarchy and democracy are flawed regimes. It is also ultimately self-destructive to try to put either kind of regime into practice: “Yet to have everywhere an arrangement that is based simply on one or the other of these sorts of equality is a poor thing. This is evident from the result: none of these sorts of regimes is lasting” (1302a3). On the other hand, “[O]ne should not consider as characteristic of popular rule or of oligarchy something tha t will make the city democratically or oligarchically run to the greatest extent possible, but something that will do so for the longest period of time” (1320a1). Democracy tends to be more stable than oligarchy, because democracies only have a conflict between rich and poor, while oligarchies also have conflicts within the ruling group of oligarchs to hold power. In addition, democracy is closer to polity than oligarchy is, and this contributes to its greater stability. And this is an important goal; the more moderate a regime is, the longer it is likely to remain in place.
Why does factional conflict arise? Aristotle turns to this question in Chapter 2. He says: “The lesser engage in factional conflict in order to be equal; those who are equal, in order to be greater” (1302a29). What are the things in which the lesser seek to be equal and the equal to be greater? “As for the things over which they engage in factional conflict, these are profit and honor and their opposites….They are stirred up further by arrogance, by fear, by preeminence, by contempt, by disproportionate growth, by electioneering, by underestimation, by [neglect of] small things, and by dissimilarity” (1302a33). Aristotle describes each of these in more detail. We will not examine them closely, but it is worth observing that Aristotle regards campaigning for office as a potentially dangerous source of conflict. If the city is arranged in such a way that either of the major factions feels that it is being wronged by the other, there are many things that can trigger conflict and even civil war; the regime is inherently unstable. We see again the importance of maintaining a regime which all of the groups in the city wish to see continue.
Aristotle says of democracies that “[D]emocracies undergo revolution particularly on account of the wanton behavior of the popular leaders” (1304b20). Such leaders will harass the property owners, causing them to unify against the democracy, and they will also stir up the poor against the rich in order to maintain themselves in power. This leads to conflict between the two groups and civil war. Aristotle cites a number of historical examples of this. Oligarchies undergo revolution primarily “when they treat the multitude unjustly. Any leader is then adequate [to effect revolution]” (1305a29). Revolution in oligarchical regimes can also come about from competition within the oligarchy, when not all of the oligarchs have a share in the offices. In this case those without power will engage in revolution not to change the regime but to change those who are ruling.
However, despite all the dangers to the regimes, and the unavoidable risk that any particular regime will be overthrown, Aristotle does have advice regarding the preservation of regimes. In part, of course, we learn how to preserve the regimes by learning what causes revolutions and then avoiding those causes, so Aristotle has already given us useful advice for the preservation of regimes. But he has more advice to offer: “In well-blended regimes, then, one should watch out to ensure there are no transgressions of the laws, and above all be on guard against small ones” (1307b29). Note, again, the importance of letting the laws rule.
It is also important in every regime “to have the laws and management of the rest arranged in such a way that it is impossible to profit from the offices….The many do not chafe as much at being kept away from ruling – they are even glad if someone leaves them the leisure for their private affairs – as they do when they suppose that their rulers are stealing common [funds]; then it pains them both not to share in the prerogatives and not to share in the profits” (1308b32).
And, again, it is beneficial if the group that does not have political power is allowed to share in it to the greatest extent possible, though it should not be allowed to hold the authoritative offices (such as general, treasurer, and so forth). Such men must be chosen extremely carefully: “Those who are going to rule in the authoritative offices ought to have three things: first, affection for the established regime; next, a very great capacity for the work involved in rule; third, virtue and justice – in each regime the sort that is relative to the regime…” (1309a33). It is difficult to find all three of these in many men, but it is important for the regime to make use of the men with these qualities to the greatest degree possible, or else the regime will be harmed, either by sedition, incompetence, or corruption. Aristotle also reminds us of the importance of the middling element for maintaining the regime and making it long-lasting; instead of hostility between the oligarchs and democrats, whichever group has power should be certain always to behave benevolently and justly to the other group (1309b18).
“But the greatest of all the things that have been mentioned with a view to making regimes lasting – though it is now slighted by all – is education relative to the regimes. For there is no benefit in the most beneficial laws, even when these have been approved by all those engaging in politics, if they are not going to be habituated and educated in the regime – if the laws are popular, in a popular spirit, if oligarchic, in an oligarchic spirit” (1310a13). This does not mean that the people living in a democracy should be educated to believe that oligarchs are enemies of the regime, to be oppressed as much as possible and treated unjustly, nor does it mean that the wealthy under an oligarchy should be educated to believe that the poor are to be treated with arrogance and contempt. Instead it means being educated in the principles of moderate democracy and moderate oligarchy, so that the regime will be long-lasting and avoid revolution.
In the remainder of Book V Aristotle discusses monarchy and tyranny and what preserves and destroys these types of regimes. Here Aristotle is not discussing the kind of monarchies with which most people today are familiar, involving hereditary descent of royal power, usually from father to son. A monarch in Aristotle’s sense is one who rules because he is superior to all other citizens in virtue. Monarchy therefore involves individual rule on the basis of merit for the good of the whole city, and the monarch because of his virtue is uniquely well qualified to determine what that means. The tyrant, on the other hand, rules solely for his own benefit and pleasure. Monarchy, therefore, involving the rule of the best man over all, is the best kind of regime, while tyranny, which is essentially the rule of a master over a regime in which all are slaves, is the worst kind of regime, and in fact is really no kind of regime at all. Aristotle lists the particular ways in which both monarchy and tyranny are changed and preserved. We do not need to spend much time on these, for Aristotle says that in his time “there are many persons who are similar, with none of them so outstanding as to match the extent and the claim to merit of the office” that would be required for the rule of one man on the basis of exceptional virtue that characterizes monarchy (1313a5), and tyranny is inherently extremely short lived and clearly without value. However, those wishing to preserve either of these kinds of regimes are advised, as oligarchs and democrats have been, to pursue moderation, diminishing the degree of their power in order to extend its duration.
Most of Book VI is concerned with the varieties of democracy, although Aristotle also revisits the varieties of oligarchy. Some of this discussion has to do with the various ways in which the offices, laws, and duties can be arranged. This part of the discussion we will pass over. However, Aristotle also includes a discussion of the animating principle of democracy, which is freedom: “It is customarily said that only in this sort of regime do [men] share in freedom, for, so it is asserted, every democracy aims at this” (1317a40). In modern liberal democracies, of course, the ability of all to share in freedom and for each citizen to live as one wants is considered one of the regime’s strengths. However, keep in mind that Aristotle believes that human life has a telos and that the political community should provide education and laws that will lead to people pursuing and achieving this telos. Given that this is the case, a regime that allows people to do whatever they want is in fact flawed, for it is not guiding them in the direction of the good life.
He also explains which of the varieties of democracy is the best. In Chapter 4, we discover that the best sort of democracy is the one made up of farmers: “The best people is the farming sort, so that it is possible also to create [the best] democracy wherever the multitude lives from farming or herding. For on account of not having much property it is lacking in leisure, and so is unable to hold frequent assemblies. Because they do not have the necessary things, they spend their time at work and do not desire the things of others; indeed, working is more pleasant to them than engaging in politics and ruling, where there are not great spoils to be gotten from office” (1318b9). This is a reason why the authoritative offices can be in the hands of the wealthy, as long as the people retain control of auditing and adjudication: “Those who govern themselves in this way must necessarily be finely governed. The offices will always be in the hands of the best persons, the people being willing and not envious of the respectable, while the arrangement is satisfactory for the respectable and notable. These will not be ruled by others who are their inferiors, and they will rule justly by the fact that others have authority over the audits” (1318b33). By “adjudication” Aristotle means that the many should be certain that juries should be made up of men from their ranks, so that the laws will be enforced with a democratic spirit and the rich will not be able to use their wealth to put themselves above the law. By “authority over the audits” Aristotle refers to an institution which provided that those who held office had to provide an accounting of their activities at regular intervals: where the city’s funds came from, where they went, what actions they took, and so forth. They were liable to prosecution if they were found to have engaged in wrongdoing or mismanagement, and the fear of this prosecution, Aristotle says, will keep them honest and ensure that they act according to the wishes of the democracy.
So we see again that the institutions and laws of a city are important, but equally important is the moral character of the citizens. It is only the character of the farming population that makes the arrangements Aristotle describes possible: “The other sorts of multitude out of which the remaining sorts of democracy are constituted are almost all much meaner than these: their way of life is a mean one, with no task involving virtue among the things that occupy the multitude of human beings who are vulgar persons and merchants or the multitude of laborers” (1319a24). And while Aristotle does not say it here, of course a regime organized in this way, giving a share of power to the wealthy and to the poor, under the rule of law, in the interest of everyone, would in fact be a polity more than it would be a democracy.
In Chapter 5 of Book VI he offers further advice that would move the city in the direction of polity when he discusses how wealth should be handled in a democracy. Many democracies offer pay for serving in the assembly or on juries so that the poor will be able to attend. Aristotle advises minimizing the number of trials and length of service on juries so that the cost will not be too much of a burden on the wealthy where there are not sources of revenue from outside the city (Athens, for example, received revenue from nearby silver mines, worked by slaves). Where such revenues exist, he criticizes the existing practice of distributing surpluses to the poor in the form of cash payments, which the poor citizens will take while demanding more. However, poverty is a genuine problem in a democracy: “[O]ne who is genuinely of the popular sort (i.e. a supporter of democracy) should see to it that the multitude is not overly poor, for this is the reason for democracy being depraved” (1320a33). Instead the surplus should be allowed to accumulate until enough is available to give the poor enough money to acquire land or start a trade. And even if there is no external surplus, “[N]otables who are refined and sensible will divide the poor among themselves and provide them with a start in pursuing some work” (1320b8). It seems somewhat unusual for Aristotle to be advocating a form of welfare, but that is what he is doing, on the grounds that poverty is harmful to the character of the poor and this harms the community as a whole by undermining its stability.
It is in Book VII that Aristotle describes the regime that is best without qualification. This differs from the discussion of the best regime in Book IV because in Book IV Aristotle’s concern was the best practical regime, meaning one that it would be possible to bring about from the material provided by existing regimes. Here, however, his interest is in the best regime given the opportunity to create everything just as we would want it. It is “the city that is to be constituted on the basis of what one would pray for” (1325b35). As would be expected, he explicitly ties it to the question of the best way of life: “Concerning the best regime, one who is going to undertake the investigation appropriate to it must necessarily discuss first what the most choiceworthy way of life is. As long as this is unclear, the best regime must necessarily be unclear as well…” (1323a14). We have already discussed the best way of life, as well as the fact that most people do not pursue it: “For [men] consider any amount of virtue to be adequate, but wealth, goods, power, reputation, and all such things they seek to excess without limit” (1323a35). This is, as we have said more than once, a mistake: “Living happily…is available to those who have to excess the adornments of character and mind but behave moderately in respect to the external acquisition of good things” (1323b1). And what is true for the individual is also true for the city. Therefore “the best city is happy and acts nobly. It is impossible to act nobly without acting [to achieve] noble things; but there is no noble deed either of a man or of a city that is separate from virtue and prudence. The courage, justice, and prudence of a city have the same power and form as those human beings share in individually who are called just, prudent, and sound.” (1324b30). The best city, like any other city, must educate its citizens to support its principles. The difference between this city and other cities is that the principles that it teaches its citizens are the correct principles for living the good life. It is here, and nowhere else, that the excellent man and the good citizen are the same.
What would be the characteristics of the best city we could imagine? First of all, we want the city to be the right size. Many people, Aristotle says, are confused about what this means. They assume that the bigger the city is, the better it will be. But this is wrong. It is certainly true that the city must be large enough to defend itself and to be self-sufficient, but “This too, at any rate, is evident from the facts: that it is difficult – perhaps impossible – for a city that is too populous to be well managed” (1326a26). So the right size for the city is a moderate one; it is the one that enables it to perform its function of creating virtuous citizens properly. “[T]he [city] that is made up of too few persons is not self-sufficient, though the city is a self-sufficient thing, while the one that is made up of too many persons is with respect to the necessary things self-sufficient like a nation, but is not a city; for it is not easy for a regime to be present” (1326b3). There is an additional problem in a regime that is too large: “With a view to judgment concerning the just things and with a view to distributing offices on the basis of merit, the citizens must necessarily be familiar with one another’s qualities; where this does not happen to be the case, what is connected with the offices and with judging must necessarily be carried on poorly” (1326b13).
The size of the territory is also an important element of the ideal regime, and it too must be tailored to the purpose of the regime. Aristotle says “[the territory should be] large enough so that the inhabitants are able to live at leisure in liberal fashion and at the same time with moderation” (1326b29). Again Aristotle’s main concern is with life at peace, not life at war. On the other hand, the city and its territory should be such as to afford its inhabitants advantages in times of war; “it ought to be difficult for enemies to enter, but readily exited by [the citizens] themselves,” and not so big that it cannot be “readily surveyable” because only such a territory is “readily defended” (1326b41). It should be laid out in such a way as to be readily defensible (Book VII, Chapters 11-12). It should also be defensible by sea, since proper sea access is part of a good city. Ideally the city will (like Athens) have a port that is several miles away from the city itself, so that contact with foreigners can be regulated. It should also be in the right geographical location.
Aristotle believed that geography was an important factor in determining the characteristics of the people living in a certain area. He thought that the Greeks had the good traits of both the Europeans (spiritedness) and Asians (souls endowed with art and thought) because of the Greek climate (1327b23). While the harsh climate to the north made Europeans hardy and resilient, as well as resistant to being ruled (although Aristotle did not know about the Vikings, they are perhaps the best example of what he is talking about), and the climate of what he called Asia and we now call the Middle East produced a surplus of food that allowed the men the leisure to engage in intellectual and artistic endeavors while robbing them of spiritedness, the Greeks had the best of both worlds: “[I]t is both spirited and endowed with thought, and hence both remains free and governs itself in the best manner and at the same time is capable of ruling all…” (1327b29).
However, despite the necessary attention to military issues, when we consider the ideal city, the principles which we have already elaborated about the nature of the citizens remain central. Even in the ideal city, constructed to meet the conditions for which we would pray, the need for certain tasks, such as farming and laboring, will remain. Therefore there will also be the need for people to do these tasks. But such people should not be citizens, for (as we have discussed) they will lack the leisure and the intellect to participate in governing the city. They are not really even part of the city: “Hence while cities need possessions, possessions are no part of the city. Many animate things (i.e. slaves and laborers) are part of possessions. But the city is a partnership of similar persons, for the sake of a life that is the best possible” (1328a33). The citizens cannot be merchants, laborers, or farmers, “for there is a need for leisure both with a view to the creation of virtue and with a view to political activities” (1329a1). So all the people living in the city who are not citizens are there for the benefit of the citizens. Any goals, wishes, or desires that they might have are irrelevant; in Kant’s terms, they are treated as means rather than ends.
Those that live the lives of leisure that are open to citizens because of the labor performed by the non-citizens (again, including the women) are all similar to one another, and therefore the appropriate political arrangement for them is “in similar fashion to participate in ruling and being ruled in turn. For equality is the same thing [as justice] for persons who are similar, and it is difficult for a regime to last if its constitution is contrary to justice” (1332b25). These citizens will only be able to rule and be ruled in turn if they have had the proper upbringing, and this is the last major topic that Aristotle takes up in the Politics. Most cities make the mistake of neglecting education altogether, leaving it up to fathers to decide whether they will educate their sons at all, and if so what subject matter will be covered and how it will be taught. Some cities have in fact paid attention to the importance of the proper education of the young, training them in the virtues of the regime. Unfortunately, these regimes have taught them the wrong things. Aristotle is particularly concerned with Sparta here; the Spartans devoted great effort to bringing up their sons to believe that the virtues related to war were the only ones that mattered in life. They were successful; but because war is not the ultimate good, their education was not good. (Recall that the Spartan education was also flawed because it neglected the women entirely).
It is important for the person devising the ideal city to learn from this mistake. Such cities do not last unless they constantly remain at war (which is not an end in itself; no one pursues war for its own sake). Aristotle says “Most cities of this sort preserve themselves when at war, but once having acquired [imperial] rule they come to ruin; they lose their edge, like iron, when they remain at peace. The reason is that the legislator has not educated them to be capable of being at leisure” (1334a6). The proper education must be instilled from the earliest stages of life, and even before; Aristotle tells us the ages that are appropriate for marriage (37 for men, 18 for women) in order to bring about children of the finest quality, and insists on the importance of a healthful regimen for pregnant women, specifying that they take sufficient food and remain physically active. He also says that abortion is the appropriate solution when the population threatens to grow too large (1335b24).
Book VIII is primarily concerned with the kind of education that the children of the citizens should receive. That this is a crucial topic for Aristotle is clear from its first sentence: “That the legislator must, therefore, make the education of the young his object above all would be disputed by no one” (1337a10). It is so important that it cannot be left to individual families, as was the custom in Greece. Instead, “Since there is a single end for the city as a whole, it is evident that education must necessarily be one and the same for all, and that the superintendence of it should be common and not on a private basis….For common things the training too should be made common” (1337a21). The importance of a common education shaping each citizen so as to enable him to serve the common good of the city recalls the discussion of how the city is prior to the individual in Book I Chapter 2; as has been quoted already in the discussion above, “one ought not even consider that a citizen belongs to himself, but rather that all belong to the city; for each individual is a part of the city” (1337a26).
He elaborates on the content of this education, noting that it should involve the body as well as the mind. Aristotle includes physical education, reading and writing, drawing, and music as subjects which the young potential citizens must learn. The aim of this education is not productive or theoretical knowledge. Instead it is meant to teach the young potential citizens practical knowledge – the kind of knowledge that each of them will need to fulfill his telos and perform his duties as a citizen. Learning the subjects that fall under the heading of productive knowledge, such as how to make shoes, would be degrading to the citizen. Learning the subjects that would fall under the heading of theoretical knowledge would be beyond the ability of most of the citizens, and is not necessary to them as citizens.
The list below is not intended to be comprehensive. It is limited to works published from 1962 to 2002. Most of these have their own bibliographies and suggested reading lists, and the reader is encouraged to take advantage of these.
Translations of Aristotle
- Barnes, Jonathan, ed. The Complete Works of Aristotle: The Revised Oxford Translation. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1984. Two volumes.
- The standard edition of Aristotle’s complete works.
- Irwin, Terence, and Gail Fine, eds. Aristotle: Introductory Readings. Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing Company, Inc., 1996
- As the title suggests, this book includes excerpts from Aristotle’s writings. Understanding any of Aristotle’s texts means reading it in its entirety, but if you want a book by your side to check cross-references from whichever of his texts you are reading (for example, if the editor of the edition of the Politics you are reading refers to the Ethics), this one should do the trick.
- Aristotle. Nicomachean Ethics. Translated and edited by Roger Crisp. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000.
- This translation lacks the scholarly and critical apparatus of the Rowe translation but is still a fine choice.
- Aristotle. Nicomachean Ethics. Translated and edited by Terry Irwin. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing, 1999.
- Aristotle. Nicomachean Ethics. Translated and with an introduction by Martin Ostwald. New York: Macmillan Publishing Company, 1962.
- The translation used in preparing this entry. A good basic translation.
- Aristotle. Nicomachean Ethics. Translated and with an introduction by David Ross. Revised by J.L. Ackrill and J.O. Urmson. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1980.
- Updated and revised version of a classic translation from 1925. See also Ross’ book on Aristotle below.
- Aristotle. Nicomachean Ethics. Translation and historical introduction by Christopher Rowe; philosophical introduction and commentary by Sarah Broadie. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2002.
- A very thorough introduction and commentary are included with this translation of theEthics. A good choice for the beginning student – but remember that the introduction and commentary are not meant to substitute for actually reading the text!
- Aristotle. The Politics. Translated and with an introduction by Carnes Lord. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1984.
- The translation used in preparing this entry. A useful introduction and very thorough notes, identifying names, places, and terms with which the reader may not be familiar.
- Aristotle. The Politics. Translated by C.D.C. Reeve. Indianapolis : Hackett Publishing, 1998.
- Aristotle. The Politics of Aristotle. Translated by Peter Simpson. Chapel Hill: University of North Carolina Press, 1997.
- Aristotle. The Politics and The Constitution of Athens. Edited by Stephen Everson. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
- If you’re looking for The Constitution of Athens this is a good place to go – and with thePolitics in the same book it’s easy to compare the two books to each other. However, the texts are lacking in footnotes, which is a particular problem with the Constitution since it records Athenian history. So, for example, on page 237 we learn that during the rule of the Thirty Tyrants in Athens the rulers chose “ten colleagues to govern the Peiraeus,” without any indication that the Peiraeus was the Athenian harbor and its surrounding community, five miles from the city (it is also the setting of Plato’s Republic). It would help to have names, places, and concepts defined and explained through footnotes for the beginning student. The more advanced student may wish to consult the four volumes on the Politics in the Oxford University Press’s Clarendon Aristotle Series. Volume I, covering Books I and II of the Politics, is by Trevor Saunders; Volume II, on Books III and IV, is by Richard Robinson; Volume III, on Books V and VI, is by David Keyt, and Volume IV, on Books VII and VIII, is by Richard Kraut.
- Aristotle. The Rhetoric. In George A. Kennedy, Aristotle On Rhetoric: A Theory of Civic Discourse.Translated and with an introduction by George A. Kennedy. New York: Oxford University Press, 1991.
- The Rhetoric includes observations on politics and ethics in the context of teaching the reader how to become a rhetorician. Whether or not this requires the student to behave ethically is a matter of some debate. Speaking well in public settings was crucial to attaining political success in the Athenian democracy (and is still valuable today) and much of Aristotle’s practical advice remains useful.
Secondary literature – general works on Aristotle
- Ackrill, J. L. Aristotle the Philosopher. New York: Oxford University Press, 1981.
- Adler, Mortimer. Aristotle for Everybody: Difficult Thought Made Easy. New York: Macmillan Publishing Co., Inc., 1978.
- This is probably the easiest-to-read exposition of Aristotle available; Adler says that it is aimed at “everybody – of any age, from twelve or fourteen years upward.” Obviously the author has had to make some sacrifices in the areas of detail and complexity to accomplish this, and anyone who has spent any time at all with Aristotle will probably wish to start elsewhere. Nevertheless, the author succeeds to a very great degree in delivering on the promise of the subtitle, expressing the basics of Aristotle’s thought in simple language using common examples and straightforward descriptions.
- Barnes, Jonathan. Aristotle: A Very Short Introduction. New York: Oxford University Press, 2000.
- Barnes, Jonathan, ed. The Cambridge Companion to Aristotle. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995.
- “The Companion is intended for philosophical readers who are new to Aristotle,” Barnes writes in the Introduction, and the book delivers. Chapter Seven, by D.S. Hutchinson, covers Aristotle’s ethical theory; Chapter Eight, by C.C.W. Taylor, his political theory. Barnes himself writes the first chapter on Aristotle’s life and work, as well as an excellent introduction which includes an explanation of why no book (or, I would add, encyclopedia article) can substitute for reading the original Aristotelian texts. It also includes the following: “Plato had an influence second only to Aristotle…. But Plato’s philosophical views are mostly false, and for the most part they are evidently false; his arguments are mostly bad, and for the most part they are evidently bad.” If those remarks provoke any kind of emotional or intellectual response in you, you may as well give up: you are on the way to being a student of philosophy.
- Guthrie, W.K.C. Aristotle: An Encounter. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1981.
- Volume 6 of his six volume Cambridge History of Ancient Greek Philosophy written between 1962 and 1981.
- Robinson, Timothy A. Aristotle in Outline. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, Inc., 1995.
- Another short (125 pages) introduction to Aristotle’s thought, with three sections: Wisdom and Science, Aristotle’s Ethics, and Politics. It would be an excellent choice for the beginning student or anyone who just wants to be introduced to Aristotle’s philosophy. Robinson is sympathetic to Aristotle but also to his readers, keeping things easy to read while at the same time offering enough detail about Aristotle’s doctrines to illuminate his entire system and making the interconnections among the various elements of Aristotle’s system clear.
- Ross, Sir David. Aristotle. With an introduction by John L. Ackrill. Sixth edition. London: Routledge, 1995.
- This is a classic in the field, now in its sixth edition, having first been published in 1923. Not many books can stay useful for eighty years. “It is not an elementary introduction for the absolute beginner,” the introduction says, and that seems right to me, but neither does it require the reader to be an expert. It covers all of Aristotle’s work, with chapters on Logic, Philosophy of Nature, Biology, Psychology, Metaphysics, Ethics, Politics, and Rhetoric and Poetics.
- Thompson, Garrett and Marshall Missner. On Aristotle. Belmont, CA: Wadsworth, 2000.
- Another short (100 page) overview of Aristotle’s thought that is too short to be adequate for any one topic (Chapter Nine, Aristotle’s view of politics, is less than six pages long) but might be useful for the new student of Aristotle interested in a brief look at the breadth of Aristotle’s interests. The book by Barnes included above is to be preferred.
Secondary literature – books on Aristotle’s Politics
- Keyt, David, and Fred Miller, eds. A Companion to Aristotle’s Politics. London: Blackwell, 1991.
- Kraut, Richard. Aristotle: Political Philosophy. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2002.
- An exceptional work of scholarship. Detailed, insightful, and as close to being comprehensive as anyone is likely to get in one book. The text is clearly broken down by topic and sub-topic, and the bibliography will help steer the Aristotle student in the right direction for future research. Kraut also notes other authors who disagree with his interpretation and why he believes they are wrong; this too is helpful for further research. Highly recommended.
- Miller, Fred. Nature, Justice and Rights in Aristotle’s Politics. New York: Oxford University Press, 1995.
- Mulgan, R.G. Aristotle’s Political Theory: An Introduction for Students of Political Theory. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1977.
- Mulgan’s book “is intended for students of political theory who are meeting the Politics for the first time and in an English translation.” It is divided into subjects rather than following the topics in the order discussed in the Politics as this article has done, with footnotes to the relevant passages in Aristotle’s texts. It is nicely detailed and offers excellent discussions (and criticisms) of Aristotle’s thought.
- Simpson, Peter. A Philosophical Commentary on the Politics of Aristotle. Chapel Hill: University of North Carolina Press, 1998.
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