All posts by Shyam Ranganathan

Veṅkaṭanātha (Vedānta Deśika) (c. 1269—c. 1370)

Veṅkaṭanātha (also known as Vedānta Deśika “teacher of Vedānta”) was an Indian polymath who wrote philosophical as well as religious and poetical works in several languages, including Sanskrit, Maṇipravāḷa—a Sanskritised form of literary Tamil—and Tamil. He is traditionally dated to 1269-1370, but as explained by Neevel “the lifespans of the earliest teachers of Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta have been prolonged in order to connect them with each other” (1977, p. 14-16). He constitutes a turning point in the history of Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta philosophy, and his intellectual work shaped this current, as well as the tradition, of Śrī Vaiṣṇavism (the religious counterpart of Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta ) in general. The number of works he produced (more than 100 are attributed to him) and their depth make each assessment of his contribution preliminary, and the present one is no exception. He is a major figure in the history of Indian philosophy who wrote on a variety of philosophical topics and in a variety of genres. Unlike other authors, it appears that Veṅkaṭanātha was able to convey his theological ideas in different genres and different styles, so that his poems express in a mystical and condensed way what his essays explain in a systematic language. Veṅkaṭanātha’s philosophical works are composed mostly in Sanskrit but in some cases also in Maṇipravāḷa. Veṅkaṭanātha wrote both independent treatises and commentaries on other works.

Table of Contents

  1. Background
  2. Veṅkaṭanātha’s Life, Works, and Formation
  3. Veṅkaṭanātha’s Role within the History of Indian Philosophy
  4. Veṅkaṭanātha’s Epistemology, Ontology, and Theology
    1. Epistemological Issues
    2. Cosmology and Metaphysics
  5. State of the Art of Research on Veṅkaṭanātha
  6. Abbreviations
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Background

The Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta is a philosophical and theological school, chiefly active in South India from the last centuries of the first millennium until today, that holds that the Ultimate is a personal God who is the only existing entity and of whom everything else (from matter to human and other living beings) is a characteristic. This God is usually called Viṣṇu, hence the adjective Vaiṣṇava for His believers. As its name declares, Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta sees itself as a Vedānta school. The designation “Vedānta” (or “Uttara Mīmāṃsā”) is the name adopted by various concurring philosophical schools recognizing the Vedāntasūtras “Aphorisms on Vedānta” (also called Brahmasūtras “aphorisms on the brahman”) as one of their foundational texts focusing on the exegesis of the Upaniṣads. The latter are a collection of texts recognized by Vedāntins as the culmination of the Vedas, the Indian sacred texts, that elaborate on the brahman, the absolute, with theistic or a more or less monistic approach. By contrast, the philosophical school of Mīmāṃsā (or Pūrva Mīmāṃsā) is based on the Mīmāṃsāsūtra (or Pūrva Mīmāṃsā Sūtra) and focuses on the exegesis of the prescriptive portion of the Veda, namely the Brāhmaṇas. Further three schools will be mentioned in the next pages, namely the Advaita Vedānta, or monistic Vedānta, the Sāṅkhya, and the Nyāya one. The first one offers a monistic interpretation of the Upaniṣads, against which the Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta reacts vehemently. The Sāṅkhya school is a dualist school focusing on the opposition between a dynamic natura naturans, from which everything in the world originates, and an inert Spirit (see Sāṅkhya). The Nyāya school is the school of Indian philosophy focusing on logic, dialectics and epistemology, and it recognizes the Nyāyasūtra as its foundational text (see Nyāya).

The beginnings of Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta as an independent school are usually connected to Rāmānuja (traditional dates 1017-1137, see Rāmānuja ), both in India and in Western scholarship. Rāmānuja was indeed the first one to write a new commentary on the Vedāntasūtras, and thus robustly collocating his school within Vedānta. Ex post and principally due to the work of Veṅkaṭanātha, further predecessors of Rāmānuja have been linked to the prehistory of Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta, especially Nāthamuni, of whom no work is extant, and Yāmuna, of whom a complete work and various fragmentary ones are preserved.

The religious counterpart of Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta is usually called Śrī Vaiṣṇavism (on the introduction of this term, see Colas 2003, p. 247) since it focuses on the devotion to Viṣṇu and His wife Śrī. Other Vaiṣṇava texts worth mentioning are the constellation of texts called Pāñcarātras, a heterogenous group of texts prescribing tantric rituals, and the devotional poetry in Tamil of the Āḻvārs. The heterogeneity of the extant Pāñcarātra texts make it difficult to reconstruct a Pāñcarātra theology, but all Pāñcarātrins agree on the doctrine of God’s manifestations (called vyūhas), a belief which appear to clash with the absolute monism of Advaita Vedānta.

2. Veṅkaṭanātha’s Life, Works, and Formation

On Veṅkaṭanātha, we have an unusual wealth of biographical material although much of it is based on later hagiographies and is, therefore, not necessarily reliable in terms of yielding sheer historical data. Nonetheless, it appears to be clear that Veṅkaṭanātha was born in a family closely linked to Śrī Vaiṣṇavism and that he was born and raised in the current state of Tamil Nadu. It seems that Veṅkaṭanātha was born in Tūppul, close to Kañcipūram, and was active in various key locations of Śrī Vaiṣṇavism and eventually settled in Śrīraṅgam, the temple town that is the chief centre of Śrī Vaiṣṇavism even in the 21st century. More than one hundred works (some of which are very short religious hymns) attributed to Veṅkaṭanātha have been preserved, and for most of them the attribution seems to be genuine. As noted earlier, Veṅkaṭanātha was able to convey his theological ideas in different genres and styles. One example is Veṅkaṭanātha’s hymn to Hayagrīva (Viṣṇu’s form as a horse and as God of knowledge), which glorifies the figure of the god Hayagrīva as the only God thus unifying, in a single symbol, Veṅkaṭanātha’s emphasis on a personal relation to God, his stress on Vedic learning, and his conception of a God who is not (only) transcendent.

This ability of mastering different approaches earned Veṅkaṭanātha the epithet of “lion [that is, foremost] among the poets and the philosophers,” which is widely found in most maṅgalas “auspicious verses” (found at the beginning of a work) dedicated to him. Through a comparison of his devotional, theological, and philosophical works, one can get an elaborate idea of his intellectual profile and contribution.

Veṅkaṭanātha’s philosophical works are composed mostly in Sanskrit but in some cases also in a highly Sanskritised form of Tamil called “Maṇipravāḷa.” For reasons that will be discussed below, Veṅkaṭanātha wrote both independent treatises and commentaries on other works. The former category includes such works as the Tattvamuktākalāpa, with its auto-commentary called Sarvārthasiddhi; the Nyāyasiddhāñjana and the Śatadūṣaṇī, all dealing with various philosophical topics in a relatively short number of pages for each topic; and works dealing with a single topic such as the Pāñcarātrarakṣā (Defense of Pāñcarātra) dedicated to the epistemic justification of the validity of the Pāñcarātra sacred texts. To the category of commentaries and the subcategory of the closer commentaries one can count Veṅkaṭanātha’s subcommentary (called Tātparyacandrikā) on Rāmānuja’s commentary on the Bhagavadgītā, and his subcommentary (called Tattvaṭīkā) on Rāmānuja’s Śrībhāṣya (henceforth ŚrīBh) on the Brahmasūtra. Less close are his Adhikaraṇasārāvalī, which comments on the topics of the Brahmasūtra according to their own sequence, and the Seśvaramīmāṃsā (“Theistic Mīmāṃsā” a new and independent commentary on the Mīmāṃsāsūtra). Akin to the latter work are works dealing with a specific tradition of thoughts, for example the Mīmāṃsāpādukā on Mīmāṃsā or the Nyāyapariśuddhi “Purification of Nyāya” on Nyāya and, more in general, the doxographic Paramatabhaṅga “Refutation of the other systems of thought,” written in Maṇipravāḷa. The Nyāyapariśuddhi and the Nyāsiddhāñjana are further linked insofar as the former deals with epistemology and the latter with ontology, thus mirroring the fundamental opposition of pramāṇa (“instrument of knowledge”) and prameya (“object of knowledge”) found in the Nyāya school since the Nyāyasūtra and paradigmatically in Jayanta’s masterwork, the Nyāyamañjarī, also divided in two major sections of six books each.

Veṅkaṭanātha’s maternal uncle and preceptor, Ātreya Rāmānuja, had a profound impact on his intellectual formation. Ātreya Rāmānuja is traditionally believed to have been born in Kañcipūram in the year 1220, the fourth in a lineage of disciples started by Rāmānuja himself (Ramanujachari and Srinivasacharya 1938, p. v). Several elements of Veṅkaṭanātha’s systematisation of Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta can indeed be found in Ātreya Rāmānuja’s Nyāyakuliśa (henceforth NK). Like other texts by Veṅkaṭanātha, the NK focuses on various philosophical topics rather than commenting on a root text (like Rāmānuja’s ŚrīBh) or on a single topic (like Yāmuna’s ĀP or, for instance, Maṇḍana Miśra’s treatises). Further, the NK is in a constant dialogue with the other schools of Vedānta, primarily with Advaita Vedānta, but like in the case of Veṅkaṭanātha other schools of Indian philosophy play a major role in it, namely Nyāya and Mīmāṃsā.

3. Veṅkaṭanātha’s Role within the History of Indian Philosophy

Veṅkaṭanātha is an important figure in the history of Indian philosophy. Since he is a historical figure, the explication of his thought is facilitated by the contextual knowledge available about the times, the cultural and geographical milieu, and the religious tradition related to him. Conversely, the study of Veṅkaṭanātha and of his sources allows one to undertake a study of Indian philosophy as known to him and of the changes he implemented in its interpretation.

Veṅkaṭanātha’s works are also an invaluable mine of information concerning his predecessors within what was later labelled Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta since Veṅkaṭanātha’s intellectual openness led him to frequent confrontations with previous authors and, thus, to quotes from them. In this way, thanks to Veṅkaṭanātha numerous quotes (otherwise lost works) have come to us from Nāthamuni’s Nyāyatattva (quoted largely in the Nyāyasiddhāñjana, for example, Vīrarāghavācārya 1976, p. 519) to Nārāyaṇārya (quoted, for example, in the Nyāyasiddhāñjana ad 8, Vīrarāghavācārya 1976, p. 39, about whom see Trikha 1999); from Parāśara Bhaṭṭa’s Tattvaratnākara (quoted in the Nyāyasiddhāñjana, for example, Vīrarāghavācārya 1976, p. 111, 408) to the Vṛttikāra (quoted, for example, in the introduction of the SM); from Rāmamiśra’s Ṣaḍarthasaṅkṣepa (quoted in the Nyāyasiddhāñjana) to Dramiḍācārya (quoted in the Nyāyasiddhāñjana, Vīrarāghavācārya 1976, p. 437) and to Yādavaprakāśa (about whom see Oberhammer 1997 and about whose presence in Veṅkaṭanātha’s works see Freschi 2016 b).

The Vedāntic school of Indian philosophy we refer to as Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta has been largely influenced by the shape Veṅkaṭanātha gave to it. For instance, the traditional lineage of teachers of Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta includes the Āḻvārs (an elusive Vṛttikāra), Nāthamuni, Yāmunācārya, Rāmānuja, and Parāśara Bhaṭṭa. All bear just some vague family resemblance with each other but all are directly linkable to Veṅkaṭanātha’s view of Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta, which includes the Āḷvārs devotionalism, the Pāñcarātra’s ritualism together with a robust commitment to the scholarly tradition of Indian philosophy in general (as already found in Nāthamuni and, from a different point of view, Yāmuna), and Vedānta in particular (as explicit in Rāmānuja).

Veṅkaṭanātha’s contributions reconfigured his predecessor’s contributions by giving them a new meaning. This is true for Veṅkaṭanātha’s closer engagement with the philosophical debate (even with the opponents of Vedānta) for Veṅkaṭanātha’s reformulation of what is included in “Vedānta,” for Veṅkaṭanātha’s reexamination of some key issues in Rāmānuja’s thought, for the fixation of Rāmānuja as the key reference point for Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta, and for Veṅkaṭanātha’s redefinition of the supreme Deity (see Freschi 2015a, 2015c and 2016a and b).

The main philosophical outlines of Veṅkaṭanātha’s Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta are:

  1. the Vedāntic viewpoint
  2. the emphasis on Pūrva Mīmāṃsā and Uttara Mīmāṃsā (or Vedānta) as a single system
  3. the incorporation of Pāñcarātra
  4. the incorporation of the Āḻvārs’ theology

All these points are shared with one or the other among the predecessors of Veṅkaṭanātha: 1 and—to a much lesser extent—2 with Rāmānuja (see Freschi 2016a), 3 with Yāmuna, and 4 with the Āḻvārs, and perhaps also with some other predecessors. What remains distinctively unique of Veṅkaṭanātha is the smooth synthesis of these various elements and the usage of Mīmāṃsā as a synthesizing key. For instance, the aikaśāstrya “unity of the teaching” which Veṅkaṭanātha shows to hold between Pūrva and Uttara Mīmāṃsā offers the model for further extensions of the Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta system. Similarly, Veṅkaṭanātha uses the model of the Mīmāṃsā’s approach to the various Vedic śākhās “recensions” in order to deal with the different views highlighted in the various Pāñcarātra Saṃhitās.

The development of Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta as a Vedāntic school becomes clear as one looks back at Veṅkaṭanātha’s predecessors, but it is important to note that what seems a posteriori to be a Vedāntic school would probably not have appeared such to the school’s contemporaries. In fact, Yāmuna’s relation to Vedānta is complex. He quoted from the Upaniṣads in his Ātmasiddhi “Establishment of the Self” (henceforth ĀtS), where he started by listing the Vedānta teachers he wanted to refute (including Bhartṛhari and Śaṅkara), so that one might think that he is keener to “purify” Vedānta than he is to “purify” Nyāya. At the same time, at least in the ĀtS (see Mesquita 1971, p. 4–13), Yāmuna accepted an anti-Vedāntic proof for the existence of God, namely the inference, whereas Pūrva and Uttara Mīmāṃsā would rather agree that God can only be known through the Sacred Texts. Moreover, Yāmuna’s Āgamaprāmāṇya “On the Validity of the [Vaiṣṇava] Sacred Texts” (henceforth ĀP) seems to have a completely different focus as it stresses the epistemic validity of the Pāñcarātra texts as works of a reliable author, namely God Himself. Rāmānuja is more straightforwardly part of a Vedāntic approach and this is probably also the reason why he has often been considered the “founder” of Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta—a term which he and Yāmuna still ignore. The term seems to have indeed been used first by Rāmānuja’s commentator Sudarśanasūri, and it did not become established as the name of a school until much later, namely in “the latter half of the 16th century” (Varadachari 1962). As for Nāthamuni, his relation to Vedānta can only be presupposed from what we know of him through his successors, given that his works have been lost. Their titles focus, however, on Nyāya and Yoga (and not on Vedānta).

We know nothing about Nāthamuni’s relation to Pūrva Mīmāṃsā (Mīmāṃsā for short), but we do know that at least one trend within Vedānta (as testified by Śaṅkara’s commentary on the Brahmasūtra, see Freschi 2016a) claimed that the study of Pūrva Mīmāṃsā was not necessary and this trend possibly remained influential for a long time, given the energy Veṅkaṭanātha still needed to dedicate to the issue well after Rāmānuja’s nominal acceptance of Mīmāṃsā. In fact, as will be shown immediately below, Rāmānuja accepted Mīmāṃsā as a preliminary discipline of Vedānta, possibly in order to situate Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta well within the Vedic orthodoxy (readers will remember that the Mīmāṃsā focuses on the exegesis of a portion of the Veda) and as part of his polemics against Śaṅkara’s Advaita Vedānta. Nonetheless, it is only with Veṅkaṭanātha that this acceptance becomes an inclusion of Mīmāṃsā on the same level as Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta.

Before Rāmānuja, Yāmuna’s relation to Pūrva Mīmāṃsā is two-faced, insofar as Pūrva Mīmāṃsā authors seem to be his targeted objectors whom he wanted to convince of the legitimacy of the Pāñcarātra transmission but often by recurring to their arguments; additionally, he by and large adopted Nyāya strategies, such as the reference to God as the authoritative source of the epistemological validity of the Pāñcarātra or the use of inference to establish God’s existence (a procedure which is criticized by Veṅkaṭanātha in the chapter on God of the Nyāyasiddhāñjana, see Clooney 2000, p. 108-109). The situation changes perhaps during Yāmuna’s own life, certainly with Rāmānuja, who steered in the direction of Vedānta and, thus, came closer to the Pūrva Mīmāṃsā. He came so close that he programmatically stated at the beginning of his commentary on the Brahmasūtra that not only the Brāhmaṇa part of the Veda (the one Mīmāṃsā authors focus on) needs to be studied, but that its study is part of the same teaching as the Vedānta. Veṅkaṭanātha took advantage of this remark and spelt out its deep implications: he could thus state that the whole of Pūrva Mīmāṃsā and the whole of Uttara Mīmāṃsā constitute a single teaching (ekaśāstra). To that he added a distinctive role to the Saṅkarṣakāṇḍa, a less well-known Mīmāṃsā text which had little fortune within Pūrva Mīmāṃsā but which rose with Veṅkaṭanātha (or perhaps already in the lost predecessors who inspired him) to the role of a bridge between the Pūrva and Uttara Mīmāṃsā since it is interpreted as focusing on veneration and on God.

As for the incorporation of Pāñcarātra and of the Āḻvārs (see Nos. 3 and 4 above), Veṅkaṭanātha used the same model he elaborated to establish 2 in order to incorporate these further elements into the system. He reached back to the Pāñcarātra, which had been defended by Yāmuna but rather neglected by Rāmānuja, and, more strikingly, to the hymns of the Āḻvārs. It is in this sense more than telling that Veṅkaṭanātha (as the first among the early teachers of Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta) decided to write in Tamil and to write theology in poetical form, as the Āḻvārs had done.

As is evident from the previous sections, Veṅkaṭanātha attempted to bring different voices together in a synthesis without excluding any of them. He examined and selected texts and ideas coming from different backgrounds and reshaped Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta in a distinctive way, one which the 21st reader recognizes at first sight but only because he or she is following Veṅkaṭanātha’s interpretation of the school.

One of the guiding elements of Veṅkaṭanātha’s synthesis was his pro-Vedic attitude, which translated into a pro-Pūrva Mīmāṃsā bias and the attempt to moderate the anti-Vedic tendencies within Śrī Vaiṣṇavism. For instance, Veṅkaṭanātha (at least in his Sanskrit works) did not espouse the Ekāntin current within Śrīvaiṣṇavism (which contended that a Pāñcarātra text, the Ekāyanaveda, was the Ur-Veda, from which all Vedas originated), and his defense of the Pāñcarātra was based predominantly on the fact that they are rather based on the Vedas, like any other smṛti (a group of texts deriving their validity from the fact that they—allegedly—merely re-elaborate Vedic contents) (see Seśvaramīmāṃsā ad PMS 1.1.2), apart from their independent value as autonomous revelation of God.

This pro-Vedic attitude is probably the reason for Veṅkaṭanātha’s personal devotion to Hayagrīva. Before Veṅkaṭanātha, Hayagrīva was considered only a minor avatāra of Viṣṇu, and Veṅkaṭanātha was the first to dedicate to him a stotra “eulogy.” The reason for his choice of Hayagrīva as his favourite form of God is probably Hayagrīva’s link with intellectuality and with the Vedas, as well as being a form of Viṣṇu. In this sense, Hayagrīva was a perfect symbol of the union of Pūrva Mīmāṃsā Vedism and devotionalism.

Veṅkaṭanātha’s figure played a major role also in the so-called split between the so-called Vaṭakalai and Teṅkalai currents within Śrī Vaiṣṇavism even though these two currents became known by these names only much later than Veṅkaṭanātha. In the 21st century, the two currents are distinguished by sociological as well as doctrinal elements, for example, the doctrine of an Ekāyanaveda and the emphasis on God’s Grace vs. free will in the Teṅkalai and vice versa in the Vaṭakalai. Although, as will be shown below, Veṅkaṭanātha tried to find a synthesis within the latter tension, the Vaṭakalai current retrospectively identified Veṅkaṭanātha as its founder and adopted en bloc his theology and philosophy. This also means that the Vaṭakalai identified itself through elements that were typical of Veṅkaṭanātha’s philosophical and religious attitude, even those that had not been necessarily prosecuted after him. The desire to follow Veṅkaṭanātha in each possible aspect is probably the key reason for why Vaṭakalai authors added a short praise to Hayagrīva at the beginning of their works instead of the customary praise to Gaṇeśa (the elephant-God of learning praised at the beginning of each work). Out of the same set of reasons, in 1676 a temple was dedicated to Hayagrīva and is currently run by Vaṭakalais.

4. Veṅkaṭanātha’s Epistemology, Ontology, and Theology

a. Epistemological Issues

Veṅkaṭanātha more or less adopted the Pūrva Mīmāṃsā epistemology but with some differences which will be highlighted below. By contrast, his attitude towards the antagonist of Mīmāṃsā (including also the Uttara Mīmāṃsā, that is, Vedānta), namely Nyāya, is much more critical:

Therefore, according to the rule of the lion hidden in the forest, we will follow the Veda supported by the logical rules (nyāya) according to reality, and the Nyāya when it agrees with the Veda. By contrast, we will not follow the pure Nyāya.

ataḥ siṃhavanaguptinyāyena yathāvasthitanyāyānugṛhītaṃ vedaṃ vedānumataṃ ca nyāyam anusarāmaḥ, na punar nyāyamātram (Nyāyapariśuddhi 1.1.2)

Concerning sense perception, one sensitive topic is that of yogipratyakṣa ‘intellectual intuition,’ a specific kind of direct perception in which the intellect acts as direct access to knowledge, as if it were a sense faculty. Philosophers of the Nyāya and of the Buddhist Pramāṇavāda schools uphold this kind of direct perception as belonging to exceptional individuals. Through intellectual intuition, exceptional individuals (like the Buddha, a ṛṣi “mythical seer,” or God) could have direct access to dharma, thus relativizing the uniqueness of the Vedic Sacred Texts. To support the possibility of yogipratyakṣa is, thus, consistent with the Nyāya’s discussion of the validity of the Veda as dependent on its author and on the Pramāṇavāda view that the Buddha could access dharma. Veṅkaṭanātha, conversely, is in a difficult situation, insofar as he wants to defend both the uniqueness of the Vedas (see above, section 3, for his Vedism) and the authority of God. In order to reconcile these two positions, Veṅkaṭanātha in his SM ad 1.1.4 (the PMS aphorism on direct perception) rigidly negates the possibility for human beings to attain intellectual intuition, so that no single human being could ever question the validity of the Vedas. Nonetheless, consistently with his theism, Veṅkaṭanātha does not negate the possibility for God alone to see the dharma. This entails that it would be theoretically possible for God to reveal a new Sacred Text. He will, nonetheless, not do it because the Veda is already His will made into words, and God does not change whimsically what He wants.

As for the Pāñcarātras, they enjoy the same validity of smṛti texts insofar as they derive their validity from the fact of stating what is already present in the Veda, either in a branch of it that is available, or in a currently lost one.

b. Cosmology and Metaphysics

What, then, is God’s relationship to the Veda and to the world? The Veda is said to be the direct manifestation of His will but not His revelation. The latter option is refused because it would make the Veda subordinate to God’s will and liable to be overcome by a later and possibly more complete revelation. Thus, the Veda is a crystallization of God’s permanent free will. Similarly, the world—including all human beings inhabiting it—is described as God’s body in the sense that God can experience through it, insofar as each body pertains to something conscious (cetana) (Nyāyasiddhāñjana, Vīrarāghavācārya 1976, pp. 162–163).

The claim that the world is the body of God also puts Veṅkaṭanātha’s interest in ontology in the right perspective, which is always subordinate to his interest in theology. Ontology is not conceived as the study of what exists independently from God nor as the study of inert matter—since such inert matter is inconceivable in the Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta worldview.

A further topic that is closely linked to this one regards the definition of body in general in the work of Veṅkaṭanātha. Classical Indian philosophers tend to define śarīra “body” as a tool for experience (bhogasādhana). Thus, most philosophers state that plants only seem to have bodies because of our anthropomorphic tendencies, which make us believe that they function like us, whereas in fact plants cannot experience (Freschi 2015b). By contrast, Veṅkaṭanātha in the Nyāyasiddhāñjana defines śarīra in the following way:

Therefore, this śarīra is of two types: permanent and impermanent. Among them, permanent are God’s body—consisting of auspicious substrates, namely substances with the three qualities, time and [individual] souls—and the intrinsic form of Garuḍa, the snake (Ananta), etc. belonging to permanent [deities]. The impermanent [body] is of two types: not made of karman ‘past actions’ and made of karman. The first one has the form of the primordial natura naturans, etc. of God. In the same way, [an impermanent body not made of karman] assumes this or that form according to the wish of the liberated souls, such as Ananta and Garuḍa. Also the [body] made of karman is of two types: made out of one’s decision and karman and made out of karman alone. The first type belongs to great [souls] like the Muni Saubhari. The other one belongs to the other low [souls] (i.e., all normal human beings and the other conscious living beings). Moreover, the body in general is of two types, movable and unmovable. Wood (i.e., trees) and other [plants] and rocks and other [minerals] are unmovable. […] That there are souls also in rock-bodies is established through stories such as that of Ahalyā. (Nyāyasiddhāñjana, Vīrarāghavācārya 1976, p. 174–176, my translation)

Note that the inclusion of plants and rocks within what is a body could have to do with the fact that the whole world is the body of God and that consequently everything is a śarīra. The first commentary explains the “etc.” after natura naturans as referring to God’s manifestations, called vyūhas, which are a typical mark of Pāñcarātra theology throughout its history (see Schmücker 2007 for their relevance in Veṅkaṭanātha). The various forms assumed by God(s) are the impermanent ones He can assume on top of His permanent one at wish, not depending on karman. Last, the hint at Ahalyā refers to a story told: for example, in the Sanskrit epic Rāmāyaṇa, Ahalyā was transformed into a stone and then back into a woman, a fact which proves that a soul was present also while she was a stone.

The definition of God’s body entails that God is conscious and has as His body, apart from other substances and time, also the conscious souls of living beings. How can free will be possible under these circumstances? According to Veṅkaṭanātha’s Sanskrit works, human free will is granted only insofar as God Himself actively wants humans to be free (see Freschi 2015c). The possibility of human free will is ontologically plausible insofar as Veṅkaṭanātha does not consider karman an all-encompassing causal force, so that its suspension would transgress the normal causation. Rather, karman only bounds low-level souls whereas God and liberated souls do not undergo the karman’s laws and their free will is unrestrained.

In the Nyāyapariśuddhi, Veṅkaṭanātha discussed some fundamental ontological topics in order to distinguish his positions from the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika position. The Nyāyasūtra proposes a fundamental division of realities into dravya “substances,” guṇa “qualities,” and karman “actions” (for a full list, including further categories included later, see Franco and Preisendanz 1998), with the former as the substrate of the latter two. This leads to two difficulties for Veṅkaṭanātha’s agenda. On the one hand, the radical distinction between substance and attribute means that Nyāya authors imagine liberation to be the end of the connection of the ātman “self” (of each individual being) to all attributes, from sufferance to consciousness. By contrast, Veṅkaṭanātha would never accept consciousness to be separated from the individual soul and even less from God, who, being a substance, would also (from the point of view of Nyāya) be at least in principle separable from His attributes, including from consciousness. The other difficulty regards the theology of Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta. Since the beginnings of Pāñcarātra, one of its chief doctrines has been that of the manifestations (vibhūti) of Viṣṇu, which are dependent on Him but co-eternal with Him, and, in this sense, are unexplainable according to the division of substances into eternal and transient.

To that, Veṅkaṭanātha opposed more than one classification, so that it is clear that Veṅkaṭanātha’s main point is addressing the above-mentioned problems with the Nyāya ontology rather than establishing in full detail a distinct ontology.

The first proposal found in the Nyāyapariśuddhi (1.1.2) is based on the idea of a two-fold division into dravya “substance” and adravya “non-substance” where it defines substance as the “substrate of possible accidental characteristics” (āgantukadharmāśraya). The attribute “accidental” hints at the fact that characteristics are ephemeral, whereas substances are permanent (nitya). The sub-classifications go further as depicted in Figure 1, with substance being divided into inert and alive. The former category includes the prakṛtinatura naturans” of Sāṅkhya and time, which is thus no longer a quality (guṇa) as in Nyāya. The latter category (alive substance) includes separate and heteronomous substances. Within the former are individual souls and God, distinguished insofar as individual souls are conscious but dependent on someone else (namely God), whereas God is autonomous (paratantracetano jīvaḥ, svatantra iśvaraḥ). The heteronomous category includes cognition as essential to God (see the paragraph immediately above) and the permanent manifestations of God, which are logically dependent on Him but have not been created by Him. Thus, there are ultimately six types of substances: the prakṛti, time, God, individual souls, God’s knowledge, and God’s manifestations.

Figure 1

Figure 1


The final result is an ontology that shares several elements with the other Vedāntic schools, such as the embedment of the Sāṅkhya structure whereas the genealogy of the ajaḍa part of the classification appears to be distinctive. It is opposed to the Vedāntic pariṇāmavāda “theory of the evolution [of the Absolute (brahman) into the world],”—according to which the brahman is the material cause of the world—and also to the māyāvāda “theory of the illusory [evolution of the brahman in the world]”—according to which only the brahman exists and everything else is just an illusion. Veṅkaṭanātha’s ontology, in this sense, is not monistic insofar as it has God as its pivotal point but not as its only component:

For, the other things rely only on the brahman, which is self-established (itareṣāṃ svaniṣṭhabrahmaikaniṣṭhatvāt, Nyāyapariśuddhi 1.1.2).

The ajaḍa part of the classification is, instead, directly connected to Yāmuna’s stress on dharmabhūtajñāna “knowledge as an inseparable characteristic [of God]” (see Mesquita 1971 and Neevel 1977) and to Veṅkaṭanātha’s dissociation of the personal aspect of God from any material ontology. Noteworthy in this connection is the fact that God’s vibhūtis “manifestations” are substances but devoid of any materiality. It is in this light that the concept of God’s body (see above) assumes its significance.

Furthermore it is noteworthy that God’s essential relation to the world should not be understood as that of a substance and its qualities, since if it were so the souls and so forth as a quality of the Lord, could not be bearers of further qualities (since Veṅkaṭanātha shares the notion common to all classical Indian philosophers that there are no qualities of qualities). Instead, God is linked to the material world through the prakṛti and to the individual souls insofar as He is their inner ruler.

Qualities are of two kinds. Ordinary qualities (avasthā) are defined by Veṅkaṭanātha as āgantuko ’pṛthaksiddho dharmo ’vasthā “A quality is an accidental characteristic which cannot be established separately [of the substance in which it inheres]” (NSi 3 ad v. 77, Vīrarāghavācārya 1976, p. 357). In the same text he lists the ordinary qualities, starting with the three guṇas of the prakṛti (sattva, rajas, tamas) [see Prakṛti and the three guṇa-s], then the five sensibilia (rūpa, rasa, gandha, sparśa, śabda), saṃyoga “contact,” śakti “power,” and then gurutva “heaviness,”, dravatva “fluidity,” snehatva “viscidity,” saṃskāra “(mnestic) trace,” saṅkhyā “number,” pariṇāma “measure,” pṛthaktva “distinction,” vibhāga “separation,” aparatva “distance,” paratva “proximity,” karman “action,” sāmānya “universal,” sādṛśya “similarity,” viśeṣa “individuality,” samavāya “inherence,” abhāva “absence,” and vaiśiṣṭya “qualified-ness” (NSi, beginning of 3, Vīrarāghavācārya 1976, p. 443). Noteworthy here is that out of these twenty-seven qualities, sixteen are shared with the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika school (the five sensibilia, saṅkhyā, parimāṇa, pṛthaktva, paratva, aparatva, saṃyoga, vibhāga, gurutva, snehatva, dravatva, saṃskāra), and the three guṇas derive from the Sāṅkhya school. Further, four qualities offer a new way to systematize distinct categories of the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika (karman, sāmānya, viśeṣa, samavāya). Two are of Mīmāṃsā origin (śakti and abhāva). Last, sādṛśya and, even more clearly, vaiśiṣṭya are most probably connected with specific theologemes of Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta, which indeed presents itself as upholding a qualified monism, that is, the possibility that a single God really exists exactly insofar as He is ultimately qualified by all His qualifications.

Apart from the accidental qualities, there are the svarūpanirūpakadharmas “qualities which define the own nature [of a given substance].” These allow Veṅkaṭanātha to explain that the six substances mentioned above (prakṛti, time, God, individual souls, God’s knowledge, and God’s manifestations) are nitya “permanent” although they can only be grasped through a quality (which would amount to a paradox if the qualities were only accidental and ephemeral).

Further discussions about ontologically relevant topics are not altogether absent in Veṅkaṭanātha’s texts. On the contrary, they are largely dealt with whenever the topic has some impact on his theology.

Veṅkaṭanātha was fiercely adverse to the Buddhist theory of momentariness (“Whatever exists is momentary,” compare Ratnakīrti, Kṣaṇabhaṅgasiddhi, third sentence), opposing it through the Mīmāṃsā-developed argument of recognition (pratyabhijñā), that is we do recognize things, which means that they did not pass away (Nyāyasiddhāñjana ad 6, Vīrarāghavācārya 1976, p. 16–37). The topic is of central theological significance because if everything were momentary, then there would be neither a lasting self nor a lasting God.

A topic at the centre of centuries of Nyāya-Mīmāṃsā controversies is the status of śabda “word.” Nyāya authors understand it as synonymous with the audible sounds composing the phones and thus declare it impermanent. Mīmāṃsā authors, by contrast, understand śabda as the linguistic unit capable of communicating a meaning and only manifested by phones but existing independently of them. In this sense, śabda is nitya “permanent.” Veṅkaṭanātha dealt with the issue in slightly modified terms according to whether he is speaking from a Nyāya or a Mīmāṃsā perspective. Still, even in the former case (Nyāyapariśuddhi, 1.1.3) he looked for a solution to the controversy by saying that the phones composing the Veda recur (āvṛt-) at each new creation of the world and that in this sense they are permanent. In the background is the Mīmāṃsā definition of permanence as two types, kūṭastha– and pravāhanityatva. The first is the unchanging permanence of (for example ether) whereas the second is the permanence-in-flux of (for example, a stream water—if this can be assumed to be permanent), the single elements of which are always renewed.

This same doctrine of recurrence is present also in Veṅkaṭanātha’s account of cosmology. According to him, God has not created the world e nihilo. By contrast, since the world is God’s body, it is necessarily co-eternal with Him. The idea of recurrent destructions (vilaya) and recreations is dealt with by saying that even at the state of destruction everything is present in subtle (sūkṣma) form and neither the karman of the individuals nor the Veda nor any other aspect of the world is lost. Given the fact that the creation e nihilo appears to be chiefly a Judaeo-Christian concept, Veṅkaṭanātha did not need to address the possible objection that a body coeternal with God might be a limitation to His omnipotence (on Time and God see also Schmücker’s work).

5. State of the Art of Research on Veṅkaṭanātha

Among the volumes dedicated to Śrī Vaiṣṇavism, Raman (2007) focuses on the Vaṭakalai-Teṅkalai debate (see above, section 3) and dedicates several pages to Veṅkaṭanātha. Mumme (1988) focuses on the same debate from the point of view of its two champions, that is,, Maṇavāḷamāmuni and Veṅkaṭanātha.

Among the works focusing on Veṅkaṭanātha, after the pioneer study Tātāchārya (1911), Satyavrata Singh’s 1958 study is noteworthy. Notwithstanding its faults (for example, partisanship), this study is of particular significance since it discusses the syncretism of Nyāya and Vedānta by Veṅkaṭanātha and, perhaps even more importantly, it analyzes in depth (p. 106‒136) the sources of Veṅkaṭanātha, especially within Vaiṣṇavism.

As part of the same generation of scholars, K.C. Varadachari (respectfully mentioned in Singh 1958, p. xvii) has been of fundamental importance to the studies on Śrīvaiṣṇavism. He edited, translated and studied several works by Veṅkaṭanātha (among other studies, one might mention Varadachari 1943 and Varadachari 1969). His Varadachari (1940) focuses on Veṅkaṭanātha’s only commentary on an Upaniṣad, the Īśāvāsyopaniṣad. His work tries to join respect towards Veṅkaṭanātha’s thought with a philosophical insight that makes the arguments clear also for a contemporary reader. V. Varadachari further worked on the relationship between Pāñcarātras and Vaiṣṇavism and on Veṅkaṭanātha (see Varadachari 1982 and Varadachari 1983). A “friend” of K.C. Varadachari (as he calls himself in his preface to Varadachari 1943), P.N. Srinivasachari is the author of Srinivasachari (1946), which has set some of the fundamental parameters of interpretation for Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta (defined as “a philosophy of religion”). The text very often refers to Veṅkaṭanātha.

Born in 1918, S.M. Srinivasa Chari has written (apart from several volumes on South Indian Vaiṣṇavism) several insightful volumes, each on a distinct work of Veṅkaṭanātha, examined from a philosophical and theological perspective (Srinivasa Chari 1961; Srinivasa Chari 1988; Srinivasa Chari 2007; and Srinivasa Chari 2011). Unlike Carman, Hardy, and Hopkins (about whom see a few lines below), Srinivasa Chari programmatically focuses on philosophical topics (see Srinivasa Chari 1988, pp. ix-x):

The emphasis placed by Rāmānuja on the acceptance of saviśeṣa Brahman or the personal Supreme Being endowed with attributes […] has led some scholars to feel that Rāmānuja’s system is essentially theological. […] But the Viśiṣṭādvaita system has both a philosophical as well as theological aspect, and the former is of greater importance for the reason that it gives meaning and value to the latter. […] The main objective of this task [i.e., Srinivasa Chari 1988, E.F.] is to remove a prevalent impression that Viśiṣṭādvaita is primarily theology and establish that it is essentially a system of philosophy. It is a system which has been developed, apart from an appeal to scriptural authority, on the basis of well-formulated epistemological, ontological, cosmological and religious doctrines. (Srinivasa Chari 1988, pp. ix-x)

Srinivasa Chari also explains why key works of Viśiṣṭādvaita have hardly been studied nor have been translated yet despite the system being of major significance in India, well-known and studied:

The metaphysical doctrines, developed by the Viśiṣṭādvaitin on the basis of which the system is founded, cannot be understood easily unless one has made a deep study of ancient treatises in the original. Next to the Śrī-bhāṣya of Rāmānuja, there are two outstanding philosophical classics, Tattva-muktā-kalāpa and Śatadūṣaṇī, written by Veṅkaṭanātha. A study of these texts is an essential prerequisite for getting a deeper insight into Viśiṣṭādvaita tenets. But […] these are highly technical works written in terse Sanskrit and presented in the classical style replete with subtleties of dialectical arguments. The […] texts have therefore remained beyond the approach of ordinary scholars and modern students of philosophy. […] Even among the existing scholars, brought up strictly in the traditional disciplines of scholarship, there are very few who can claim to have studied them fully. (Srinivasa Chari 1988, pp. ix-x)

The same argument could be repeated in regard to the epistemology of Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta and the SM would play a major role in this case, possibly highlighting the fact that (against the first quote above) also the appeal to the authority of Sacred Texts can become part of one’s philosophical enterprise and be epistemologically well-grounded.

Three scholars working in close connection or linked as teacher and student, John Carman, Friedhelm Hardy and Steven Paul Hopkins have dedicated insightful and thought-provoking essays to Veṅkaṭanātha and to Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta. Most of these studies are characterized by an unusual attention to the contemporary Śrīvaiṣṇava tradition and try to be sensitive to an insider view of their subject (this attitude is particularly evident in Hardy 1977). Hardy and Hopkins focus on the artistic production of Veṅkaṭanātha and show how it is of intrinsic aesthetic value and of deep philosophical significance. They also show how the two aspects are deeply connected in Veṅkaṭanātha’s theology. Selected examples of the production of these scholars are Carman (1981), on Rāmānuja but explicitly relying on Veṅkaṭanātha’s commentaries; Hardy (1979), on Veṅkaṭanātha’s Dehalīśastuti; and Hopkins (2007) on Veṅkaṭanātha’s devotional songs.

Also dedicated to the philosophical works of Veṅkaṭanātha is Narayanan (2008), which focuses on the Nyāyapariśuddhi, one of Veṅkaṭanātha’s most important works dedicated to epistemology and with Nyāya and Mīmāṃsā authors as chief discussants. Narayanan (2008) closely follows the order of Veṅkaṭanātha’s work and is in this sense precious for closer studies of this text.

Toshihiro Mikami (Mikami n.y.) translated Nyāyasiddhāñjana, but unfortunately this scholar died before being able to write a complete study on it. Clooney (2000) analyzes a chapter of the same text, the one on rational theology (Īśvarapariccheda).

Furthermore, several studies have been dedicated to Veṅkaṭanātha in particular, such as the short and hagiographical Narasimhachary (2004) and Clooney (2008) on his theology of devotion attitude. Other studies focus on Veṅkaṭanātha’s Tamil works and will not be analysed here (apart from Hopkins’ studies mentioned above, Colas 2002 is also noteworthy).

Last, the IKGA in Vienna has hosted and still hosts a group of scholars who started working intensively on Veṅkaṭanātha after having focused on Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta and on the Pāñcarātra tradition: Gerhard Oberhammer, Sylvia Stark, Marion Rastelli, and Marcus Schmücker. Particularly noteworthy in this connection is the series dedicated to the “Rāmānuja school” and edited by Oberhammer together with Rastelli and Schmücker, which constitutes a regular platform for scholars working on this topic. Gerhard Oberhammer’s list of works on this topic is impressive (1971, 1998, 2000, 2002, 2004, 2006, 2007, 2008) as is the zeal with which he created an international network of scholars working on Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta and enabled them to discuss with scholars researching on similar topics within parallel religious traditions (Oberhammer and Rastelli 2002; Oberhammer and Schmücker 2003; Oberhammer and Rastelli 2007; Oberhammer and Schmücker 2008). Schmücker (2009), dedicated to the epistemology of sense and super-sensuous perception (yogipratyakṣa), discusses Veṅkaṭanātha’s views on epistemology. Schmücker (2011) focuses on subjectivity in Veṅkaṭanātha and shows how Veṅkaṭanātha equates the ātman with the aham “I,” most probably (and this is not Schmücker’s conclusion) following Kumārila’s idea that one might prove the existence of an ātman through one’s cognition of an “I” (ahampratyaya) (on ahampratyaya in Kumārila, see Watson 2006, chapter 3 and more briefly Freschi 2014).

6. Abbreviations

ĀtS Ātmasiddhi by Yāmuna

ĀP Āgamaprāmāṇya by Yāmuna

BṬ Bṛhaṭṭīkā by Kumārila Bhaṭṭa

NK Nyāyakuliśa by Veṅkaṭanātha

NP Nyāyapariśuddhi by Veṅkaṭanātha

NSi Nyāyasiddhāñjana by Veṅkaṭanātha

PMS Pūrva Mīmāṃsā Sūtra

ŚrīBh Śrībhāṣya by Rāmānuja

ŚV Ślokavārttika by Kumārila Bhaṭṭa

SM Seśvaramīmāṃsā by Veṅkaṭanātha

7. References and Further Reading

  • Ayyaṅgār, Tirunārāyaṇapuram Kṛṣna (2008). Swamy Śrī Vedānta Deśikan (life span 1268 AD to 1369 AD, 101 years), as seen through his own writings, Stothrangal and Paduka Sahasram. Bangalore: D.K. Agencies.
  • Carman, John Braisted (1981). The theology of Ramanuja: an essay in interreligious understanding. 2nd (1st New Haven 1974). Ananthacharya Indological Research Institute series 9. Bombay: Ananthacharya Indological Research Institute.
  • Clooney, Francis Xavier (2000). “Vedānta Deśika’s “Definition of the Lord” (Īśvarapariccheda) and the Hindū Argument about Ultimate Reality”. In: Ultimate Realities. Ed. by Robert Neville, New York: SUNY, pp. 95-123.
  • Clooney, Francis Xavier (2008). Beyond Compare. St. Francis de Sales and Śrī Vedānta Deśika on Loving Surrender to God. Washington D.C.: Georgetown University Press.
  • Colas, Gérard (2002). “Variations sur la pâmoison dévote. A propos d’un poème de Vedāntadeśika et du théâtre des araiyar ”. In: Images du corps dans le monde hindou. Ed. by Véronique Bouillier and Gilles Tarabout. Paris: CNRS Editions, pp. 275–314.
  • Colas, Gérard (2003). “History of Vaiṣṇava Traditions: An Esquisse”. In: The Blackwell Companion to Hinduism. Ed. by Gavin Flood. Oxford: Blackwell. Chap. 11, pp. 229–270.
  • Franco, Eli and Karin Preisendanz (1998). “Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika”. In: Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy. Ed. by Edward Craig. London: Routledge, pp. 57–67.
  • Freschi, Elisa (2014). “Does the subject have desires? The Ātman in Prābhākara Mīmāṃsā”. In: Puṣpikā: Tracing Ancient India Through Texts and Traditions. Contributions to Current Research in Indology. Number 2. Ed. by Giovanni Ciotti, Paolo Visigalli, and Alastair Gornall. Oxford: Oxbow Books Press, pp. 55–86.
  • Freschi, Elisa (2015a). “Between Theism and Atheism: a journey through Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta and Mīmāṃsā”. In: Puṣpikā: Tracing Ancient India Through Texts and Traditions. Contribu-tions to Current Research in Indology. Number 3. Ed. By Robert Leach and Jessie Pons. Oxford: Oxbow Books Press, pp. 24–47.
  • Freschi, Elisa (2015b). “Systematizing an absent category: discourses on “nature” in Prābhākara Mīmāṃsā”. In: The Human Person and Nature in Classical and Modern India. Ed. by Raffaele Torella and Giorgio Milanetti. Supplemento della Rivista di Studi Orientali LXXXVIII, pp. 45—54.
  • Freschi, Elisa (2015c). “Free will in Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta: Rāmānuja, Sudarśana Sūri and Veṅkaṭanātha”. In: Religion Compass 9.9, pp. 287–296.
  • Freschi, Elisa (2016[a]). “Reusing, Adapting, Distorting. Veṅkaṭanātha’s reuse of Rāmānuja, Yāmuna and the Vṛttikāra in his commentary ad PMS 1.1.1”. In: Adaptive Reuse of Texts, Ideas and Images in Classical India. Ed. by Elisa Freschi and Philipp A. Maas. Abhandlungen für die Kunde des Morgenlandes. Wiesbaden: Harrassowitz. (a pre-print version is available on
  • Freschi, Elisa (2016[b]). “Veṅkaṭanātha’s engagement with Buddhist opponents in the Buddhist texts he reused”. In: The reuse of texts in Buddhist literature. Ed. by Catherine Cantwell, Elisa Freschi, and Jowita Kramer. Buddhist Studies Review 33, 1—2. (a pre-print version is available on
  • Hardy, Friedhelm (1977). “Ideology and Cultural Contexts of the Śrīvaiṣṇava Temple”. In: The Indian Economic and Social History Review XIV.1, pp. 119–151.
  • Hardy, Friedhelm (1979). “The Philosopher as Poet — A Study of Vedāntadeśika’s Dehalīśastuti”. In: Journal of Indian Philosophy 7.3, pp. 277–325.
  • Hopkins, Steven Paul, ed. (2007). An Ornament for Jewels. Love Poems for the Lord of Gods by Vedāntadeśika. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • McCann, Erin (forthcoming). Maṇipravāḷa in Śrīvaiṣṇavism. PhD thesis. Montreal, Québec: McGill University, Faculty of Religious Studies.
  • Mesquita, Roque (1971). “Das Problem der Gotteserkenntnis bei Yāmunamuṇi”. PhD thesis. Wien: Universität Wien.
  • Mikami, Toshihiro (n.y.). “Nyāyasiddhāñjana of Vedānta Deśika. An annotated Translation”. PhD thesis. Tokyo: University of Tokyo. Available through the website of the University of Tokyo as pdf.
  • Mumme, Patricia Y. (1988). The Śrī Vaiṣṇava Theological Dispute: Maṇavāḷamāmuni and Vedānta Deśika. Madras: New Era Publications.
  • Narasimhachary, Mudumby (2004). Sri Vedanta Desika. New Delhi: Sahitya Academi.
  • Narayanan, Vedavalli (2008). The Epistemology of Viśiṣṭādvaita. A Study Based on the Nyāyapariśuddhi of Vedānta Deśika. New Delhi: Munshiram Manoharlal.
  • Neevel, Walter G. Jr. (1977). Yāmuna’s Vedānta and Pāñcarātra: Integrating the Classical and the Popular. Harvard Dissertations in Religion. Missoula, Montana: Scholars Press, Harvard Theological Review.
  • Oberhammer, Gerhard (1997). Materialien zur Geschichte der Rāmānuja-Schule III. Yādavaprakāśa, der vergessene Lehrer Rāmānujas. Wien: Verlag der Österreichischen Akademie der Wissenschaften.
  • Oberhammer, Gerhard (1998). Materialien zur Geschichte der Rāmānuja-Schule IV. Der “Innere Lenker” (Antaryāmī), Geschichte eines Theologems. Wien: Verlag der Österreichischen Akade-mie der Wissenschaften.
  • Oberhammer, Gerhard (2000). Materialien zur Geschichte der Rāmānuja-Schule V. Zur Lehre von der ewigen vibhūti Gottes. Wien: Verlag der Österreichischen Akademie der Wissenschaften.
  • Oberhammer, Gerhard (2002). Materialien zur Geschichte der Rāmānuja-Schule VI. Die Lehre von der Göttin vor Veṅkaṭanātha. Wien: Verlag der Österreichischen Akademie der Wissen-schaften.
  • Oberhammer, Gerhard (2004). Materialien zur Geschichte der Rāmānuja-Schule VII. Zur spirituellen Praxis des Zufluchtnehmens bei Gott (śaraṇāgatiḥ) vor Veṅkaṭanātha. Wien: Verlag der Öster-reichischen Akademie der Wissenschaften.
  • Oberhammer, Gerhard (2006). Materialien zur Geschichte der Rāmānuja-Schule VIII. Zur Eschatologie der Rāmānuja-Schule vor Veṅkaṭanātha. Wien: Verlag der Österreichischen Akademie der Wissenschaften.
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Author Information

Elisa Freschi
Austrian Academy of Sciences

The Upaniṣads

The Upaniṣads are ancient texts from India that were composed orally in Sanskrit between about 700 B.C.E. and 300 B.C.E. There are thirteen major Upaniṣads, many of which were likely composed by multiple authors and are comprised of a variety of styles. As part of a larger group of texts, known as the Vedas, the Upaniṣads were composed in a ritual context, yet they mark the beginning of a reasoned enquiry into a number of perennial philosophical questions concerning the nature of being, the nature of the self, the foundation of life, what happens to the self at the time of death, the good life, and ways of interacting with others. As such, the Upaniṣads are often considered to be the fountainhead of the subsequent rich and varied philosophical tradition in India. The Upaniṣads contain some of the oldest discussions about key philosophical terms such as ātman (the self), brahman (ultimate reality), karma, and yoga, as well as saṃsāra (worldly existence), mokṣa (enlightenment), puruṣa (person), and prakṛti (nature)—all of which would continue to be central to the philosophical vocabulary of later traditions. In addition to contributing to the development of a discursive language, the Upaniṣads further frame later philosophical debates by their exploration of a number of means of attaining knowledge, including deduction, comparison, introspection, and debate.

Table of Contents

  1. The Upaniṣads and the Vedas
    1. Main Upaniṣads
    2. Minor Upaniṣads
  2. From Ritual to Philosophy
  3. The Self
  4. Ātman and Brahman
  5. Karma, Saṃsāra, and Mokṣa
  6. Ethics and the Upaniṣads
  7. The Upaniṣads and Hindu Darśanas before Vedānta
  8. The Upaniṣads and Vedānta
  9. The Upaniṣads as Philosophy
  10. The Upaniṣads in the Modern Period
  11. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. The Upaniṣads and the Vedas

a. Main Upaniṣads

The Upaniṣads are the fourth and final section of a larger group of texts called the Vedas. There are four different collections of Vedic texts, the Ṛgveda, Yajurveda, Sāmaveda, and Atharvaveda, with each of these collections containing four different layers of textual material: the Saṃhitās, Brāhmaṇas, Āraṇyakas, and Upaniṣads. Although each of these textual layers has a variety of orientations, the Saṃhitās are known to be largely comprised of  hymns praising gods and the Brāhmaṇas are mostly concerned with describing and explaining Vedic rituals. The Āraṇyakas and Upaniṣads are also firmly rooted in ritual, but with both groups of texts there is an increasing emphasis on understanding the meaning of ritual, while some sections of the Upaniṣads seem to move completely away from the ritual setting into naturalistic and philosophical inquiry about the processes of life and death, the workings of the body, and the nature of reality.

The Vedic Upaniṣads are widely recognized as being composed during two chronological stages. The texts of the first period, which would include the Bṛhadāraṇyaka (BU), Chāndogya (CU), Taittirīya (TU), Aitareya (AU) and Kauṣītakī (KsU), are generally dated between 700 and 500 B.C.E., and are considered to predate the emergence of the so-called heterodox traditions, such as the Buddhists, Jains, and Ājīvikas. Scholarly consensus dates the second stage of Vedic Upaniṣads, which includes the Kena (KeU), Kaṭha (KaU), Īśā (IU), Śvetāśvatara (SU), Praśna (PU), Muṇḍaka (MuU), Māṇḍūkya (MaU), and Maitrī (MtU), between 300-100 B.C.E. (Olivelle 1998: 12-13). The older Upaniṣads are primarily composed in prose, while the later ones tend to be in metrical form, but any individual text may contain a diversity of compositional styles. Additionally, many individual Upaniṣads consist of various types of material, including creation myths, interpretations of ritual actions, lineages of teachers and students, magical formulae, procreation rites, and narratives and dialogues about famous teachers, students, and kings.

The so-called Hindu darśanas—Nyāya, Vaiśeṣika, Mīmāṃsā, and Vedānta—do not adhere to the chronology above, as they regard all the Vedic Upaniṣads as śruti, meaning a timeless revealed knowledge. The remaining two Hindu darśanas—Sāṃkhya and Yoga—are usually read as supporting the Vedas.  However, when tracing the historical development of philosophical ideas, it is helpful to note some differences in orientation between the two stages of Upanishadic material. While all the Upaniṣads devote considerable attention to topics such as the self (ātman) and ultimate reality (brahman), as well as assume some version of the karma doctrine, the earlier texts tend to characterize ultimate reality in abstract and impersonal ways, while the later Upaniṣads, particularly the Īśā and Śvetāśvatara, are more theistic in orientation. Meanwhile, the later Upaniṣads explicitly address a number of key topics such as yoga, mokṣa, and saṃsāra, all of which would continue to be central aspects of subsequent Indian philosophy.

b. Minor Upaniṣads

In addition to those affiliated with the Vedas, there are literally hundreds of other texts bearing the name “Upaniṣad.” These texts have been grouped together by scholars according to common themes, such as the Yoga Upaniṣads (Upaniṣads on Yoga), the Saṃnyāsa Upaniṣads (Upaniṣads on Renunciation), the Śaiva Upaniṣads (Upaniṣads on the Hindu God Śiva), and the Vaiṣṇava Upaniṣads (Upaniṣads on the Hindu God Viṣṇu) (see Deussen 1980 and Olivelle 1992). The majority of these texts were composed between the 2nd and 15th centuries CE, although texts referred to as  “upaniṣad” have continued to be composed up to the present day. Many of the post-Vedic Upaniṣads further develop core concepts from the Vedic Upaniṣads, such as ātman, brahman, karma, and mokṣa. In addition to a shared conceptual world, the post-Vedic Upaniṣads often quote extensively from the earlier texts and feature many of the same teachers and students, such as Yājñavalkya, Janaka, and Śaunaka.

2. From Ritual to Philosophy

Despite their significant contribution to subsequent Indian philosophical traditions, there has been disagreement about whether or not the Upaniṣads themselves constitute philosophy. Much of this debate depends, of course, on how one defines philosophy. A recurring argument as to why the Upaniṣads might not be considered philosophy is because they do not contain a unified or a systematic position. This, however, largely reflects the composite and fragmented nature of the texts. Rather than being characterized as unsystematic, the diversity of teachings can be better understood when considering the fact that different texts were composed within the context of separate and often competing scholarly traditions or schools (śākhas). Accordingly, the Upaniṣads do not have a unified philosophical system, but rather contain a number of overlapping themes and mutual interests. Nonetheless, there can be considerable uniformity within a particular text or within a group of texts ascribed to the same school, and even more so according to the lessons ascribed to any particular teacher. In addition to the distinct philosophical agendas of different texts, we see different teachers articulate their teachings within the context of competition over recruiting students, securing patronage, and debating with rivals in public contests. With this context in mind, it is not surprising to find various, sometimes conflicting, teachings throughout the texts.

Due to their connection with previous Vedic material, the Upaniṣads generally assume a ritual context, containing many passages that explain the significance of ritual actions or interpret mantras (sacred verses) uttered during the ritual. One of the most prevalent tendencies to continue from the ritual texts is an attempt to identify the underlying connections (bandhus) that exist among different orders of reality. Often these connections were made among three spheres: the cosmos, the body of the sponsor of the ritual (yajamāna), and the ritual grounds—in other words, between the macrocosm, the microcosm, and the ritual. An illustrative example appears at the beginning of the Bṛhadāraṇyaka Upaniṣad, where the different body parts of the horse in the sacrifice (aśvamedha) are compared to the different elements, regions, and intervals of time in the cosmos (BU 1.1). The implication is that by reflecting on the relational composition of the horse, one can understand the structure of the universe.

There have been some debates regarding the meaning of the word “upaniṣad,” with the components of the word (upa + ni + sad) suggesting texts that were to be learned ‘sitting down near’ one’s teacher. However, the word is not employed in this way in the texts, nor in existing commentaries. Rather, in its earliest textual contexts, the word “upaniṣad” takes on a meaning similar to bandhu, describing a connection between things, often presented in a hierarchical relationship. In these contexts, upaniṣad is often interpreted as the most essential or most fundamental connection. Moreover, “upaniṣad” designates equivalences between components of different realms of reality that were not considered to be observable by the senses, but remained concealed and obscured, and required special knowledge or understanding. On several occasions, “upaniṣad” means ‘secret teaching’ (that is, CU 1.1.10; 1.13.4; 8.8.4; 4.2.1; 5.5.3-4), a notion that is reinforced by the use of other formulations such as guhyā ādeśā (‘hidden instruction’; BU 3.5.2) and para guhya (‘supreme secret’; KaU 3.17; SU 6.22). In the Bṛhadāraṇyaka Upaniṣad, the word “upaniṣad” is equated with the formulation satyasya satyam (BU 2.2.20)—‘the truth behind the truth’— an expression suggesting that an upaniṣad is a truth or reality beyond that which appears to be true.

Whether discussing the essence of life or the source of a king’s power, the Upaniṣads show an interest in establishing a firm foundation or an ontological grounding for different aspects of reality, and ultimately, for reality as a whole. One of the terms most associated with these discussions is brahman. The oldest usages of the word are closely connected with the power of speech, with brahman meaning a truthful utterance or powerful statement. In the Upaniṣads, brahman retains this connection with speech, but also comes to refer to the underlying reality or the ontological foundation. In some passages brahman is associated with truth (TU 1.1), while on other occasions its is linked with immortality (CU 2.23.1) or characterized as a heavenly abode (BU 4.4.7-8).

3. The Self

One of the most widely discussed topics throughout both the early and late Upaniṣads is the self (ātman). The word “ātman” is a reflexive pronoun, likely derived from √an (to breathe). Even in the Ṛgveda (c.1200 B.C.E.), the earliest textual source from ancient India, ātman had already a wide range of lexical meanings, including ‘breath’, ‘spirit’, and ‘body’. By the time of the Upaniṣads, the word was used in a variety of ways, sometimes referring to the material body, but often designating something like an essence, a life-force, consciousness, or ultimate reality.

One of the most well known teachings of ātman appears in the Chāndogya Upaniṣad (6.1-16), as the instruction of the brahmin Uddālaka Āruṇi to his son Śvetaketu. Uddālaka begins by explaining that one can know the universal of a material substance from a particular object made of that substance: by means of something made of clay, one can know clay; by means of an ornament made of copper, one can know copper; by means of a nail cutter made of iron, one can know iron. Uddālaka uses these examples to explain that objects are not created from nothing, but rather that creation is a process of transformation from an original being (sat) which emerges into the multiplicity of forms that characterizes our everyday experiences. Uddālaka’s explanation of creation is often assumed to have influenced the satkāryavāda theory—the theory that the effect exists within the cause—which was accepted by the Sāṃkhya, Yoga, and Vedānta darśanas.

Later in his instruction to Śvetaketu, Uddālaka makes a series of inferences from comparisons with empirically observable natural phenomena to explain that the self is a non-material essence present in all living beings. He first uses the example of nectar, collected by bees from different sources, but when gathered together becomes an undifferentiated whole. Similarly, water flowing from different rivers merges together without distinction when reaching the ocean. Uddālaka then asks Śvetaketu to conduct two simple experiments. In the first he instructs his son to cut a banyan fruit, and then the seed within the fruit, only for his son to find that he cannot observe anything inside the seed. Uddālaka compares the fine essence of the seed, which cannot even be seen, to the self. Uddālaka then tells Śvetaketu to place some salt in water. When returning the next day, Śvetaketu cannot see the salt anywhere in the water, but by tasting the water he perceives that it is equally distributed throughout. Uddālaka concludes that, like salt in water, the self is not immediately discernible, but yet permeates the entire body. After each of these comparisons with natural phenomena Uddālaka brings attention back to Śvetaketu, emphasizing that the self operates the same way in him as it does in all living beings. Repeating the phrase ‘you are that’ (tat tvam asi) throughout his discourse, the thrust of Uddālaka’s teaching is that the self is both the essence that connects parts with the whole and the constant that remains the same even while taking on different forms. Thus, he offers an organic understanding of ātman, characterizing the self in terms of the life force that animates all living beings.

Yājñavalkya, the most prominent teacher in the Bṛhadāraṇyaka Upaniṣad, characterizes ātman more in terms of consciousness than as a life-giving essence. In a debate that pits him against Uddālaka—his senior colleague and, by some accounts, his former teacher (BU 6.3.7; 6.5.3)—Yājñavalkya explains that the self is the inner controller (antaryāmin), present within all sensing and cognizing, yet at the same time distinct (BU 3.7.23). Here, Yājñavalkya characterizes the self as that which has mastery over the otherwise distinct psycho-physical capacities. He goes on to explain that we know the existence of the self through actions of the self, through what the self does, not through our senses—that the self, as consciousness, cannot be an object of consciousness.

Another recurring theme in Yājñavalkya’s discussion with Janaka is that the self is described as consisting of various parts, but not reducible to any (e.g BU 4.4.5; see also TU 2.2.1). Similarly, in a creation myth at the beginning of the Āitareya Upaniṣad, ātman is cast as a creator god, who creates the various elements and bodily functions from himself (ĀU 1.3.11). As with Yājñavalkya’s teaching, in this passage the functions of the body and cognitive capacities are seen to be components of the self and even evidence of the self, but the self cannot be reduced to any particular part. Such examples emphasize that an understanding of the self cannot be attained through observing how the self operates in just one faculty, but by means of observing the self in relation to a number of psycho-physical faculties, and their relationship with each other. In addition to being portrayed as the agent or inner controller (antaryāmin) of sensing and cognizing, the self is characterized as an underlying base or foundation (pratiṣṭha) of all the sense and cognitive faculties. Throughout his teachings Yājñavalkya describes the self as being hidden or behind that which is immediately perceptible, suggesting that the self cannot be known by rational thought or described in conventional language because it can never be the object of thought or knowledge. Here, Yājñavalkya draws attention to the limitations of language, suggesting that because the self cannot be an object of knowledge it cannot have attributes, and therefore can only be described by using negative propositions.

Another prominent teacher of the self is Prajāpati, the creator god of Vedic ritual texts, who is recast in the Chāndogya Upaniṣad as a typically aloof guru, who is reluctant to disseminate his teachings (CU 8.7-12). Similar to Yājñavalkya, Prajāpati conceptualizes the self in terms of consciousness, describing ātman as the agent responsible for sensing and cognizing: ātman is ‘the one who is aware’ (CU 8.12.4-5). However, despite some similarities with Yājñavalkya’s teaching of ātman, Prajāpati seems to reject some of his positions. Prajāpati’s teaching is presented in the context of his instruction to the god Indra, taking place during several episodes over a period of more than one hundred years. In his first teaching Prajāpati defines the self as the material body, and sends Indra away thinking he has learned the true teaching. Before going back to the other gods, however, Indra realizes that this teaching cannot be true, and returns to Prajāpati to learn more. This pattern continues several times, before Prajāpati finally presents ātman as the ‘one who is aware’ of his final and true teaching. One of the teachings that Prajāpati presents as false, or at least as incomplete, is a description of ātman in terms of dreamless sleep, a teaching of the self that Yājñavalkya describes as the ‘highest goal’ and ‘the highest bliss’ in his instruction to King Janaka in the Bṛhadāraṇyaka Upaniṣad (4.3.32).

Despite the diversity among these teachings, most of the discussions represent a different set of concerns than those found in earlier Vedic texts, with many teachings focusing on the human body and individual person as opposed to the primordial or ideal body, as often discussed in Vedic rituals. Rather than assuming a correspondence between the human body and the universe, some of the teachings about the self in the Upaniṣads begin to show an interest in the fundamental essence of life.

4. Ātman and Brahman

Perhaps the most famous teaching of the self, the identification of ātman and brahman, is delivered by Śāṇḍilya in the Chāndogya Upaniṣad. After describing ātman in various ways, Śāṇḍilya equates ātman with brahman (CU 3.14.4), implying that if one understands brahman as the entire world, and one understands that the self is brahman, then one becomes the entire world at the time of death.

Although Śāṇḍilya’s teaching of ātman and brahman is often considered the central doctrine of the Upaniṣads, it is important to remember that this is not the only characterization either of the self or of ultimate reality. While some teachers, such as Yājñavalkya, also equate ātman with brahman (BU 4.4.5), others, such as Uddālaka Āruṇi, do not make this identification. Indeed, Uddālaka, whose famous phrase tat tvam asi is later taken by Śaṅkara to be a statement of the identity of ātman and brahman, never uses the term “brahman”—neither in his instruction to his son Śvetaketu, nor on any other of his many appearances in the Upaniṣads. Moreover, it is often unclear, even in Śāṇḍilya’s teaching, whether linking ātman with brahman refers to the complete identity of the self and ultimate reality, or if ātman is considered an aspect or quality of brahman. Such debates about how to interpret the teachings of the Upaniṣads have continued throughout the Indian philosophical tradition, and are particularly characteristic of the Vedānta darśana.

Furthermore, while most teachings about brahman assume that the world emerged from one undifferentiated abstract cosmic principle, there are a number of passages explaining creation in terms of a more materialist point of view, describing the world as coming forth from an initial natural element, such as water or air. The Bṛhadāraṇyaka Upaniṣad (5.1), for example, contains a teaching attributed to the son of Kauravyāyanī, depicting brahman as space. This same section of the Bṛhadāraṇyaka Upaniṣad (5.5.1) includes a passage describing the world as beginning from water. Similarly, in the Chāndogya Upaniṣad (4.3.1-2), Raikva traces the beginning of the world to wind in the cosmic sphere, and breath in the microcosm.

Returning to the self, and keeping in mind later philosophical developments, it is also worth noting that the Upaniṣads often present ātman in ways that contrast with the changeless and inactive descriptions of the self as articulated by traditions such as Sāṃkhya, Yoga, and Advaita Vedānta. As we have seen, the self can be characterized as both active and dynamic: as the inner controller (antaryāmin), the self is depicted as the agent or actor behind all sensing and cognizing faculties (for example, BU 3.7.23); while as a creator god, ātman is cast as a personal deity—closely resembling Prajāpati—from whom all creation emanates (BU 1.4.1; 1.4.17; TU 2.1; AU 1.1).

One feature of the self that is quite consistent throughout the Upaniṣads and continues to be shared by a number of subsequent schools of Hindu philosophy is that knowledge of ātman can lead to some sort of liberation or ultimate freedom. While the Sāṃkhya and Yoga school would conceptualize such emancipation as kaivalya—abstraction, autonomy from nature—and Advaita Vedāntins as freedom from ignorance (avidya),  in the Upaniṣads the ultimate goal achieved through knowledge of the self is primarily freedom from death. Nonetheless, a prominent philosophical strand in the Upaniṣads, particularly in the teachings of Yājñavalkya, is that ātman dwells within the body when it is alive, that ātman, in one way or another, is responsible for the body being alive, and that ātman does not die when the body dies, but rather finds a dwelling place in another body. Such depictions seem to have been a catalyst for or been developed alongside early Buddhist conceptions of selfhood. The Buddhists explicitly rejected any notion of an indivisible and unchanging self, not only introducing the term “not-self” (anātman in Sanskrit; anattā in Pāli) to describe the lack of any fixed essence, but also explaining karmic continuity from one lifetime to the next in terms of the five skandhas—a theory maintaining that what Upanishadic thinkers take to be a unified self is really made of five components, all of which are subject to change.

5. Karma, Saṃsāra, and Mokṣa

Karma (“karman”) is another central concept in the Indian philosophical tradition that finds some of its first philosophical articulations in the Upaniṣads. Literally meaning ‘action’, karma emerges out of a ritual context where it refers to any ritual action, which, if performed correctly, yields beneficial results, but if performed incorrectly, brings about negative consequences. The Upaniṣads do not offer any explicit theory of karma, but do contain a number of teachings that seem to extend the notion of karma beyond the ritual context to more general understandings of moral retribution and of causality. Yājñavalkya, for example, when asked by Ārtabhāga about what happens to a person after death, responds that a person becomes good by good action and bad by bad action (BU 3.2.13). Here and elsewhere, one of Yājñavalkya’s fundamental assumptions is that present actions have consequences in the future and that our present circumstances have been shaped by our past actions. While this law-like character of karma suggests that the consequences of one’s actions shape one’s future, Yājñavalkya does not give any indication that the future is completely determined. Rather, he seems to suggest that one can create good consequences in the future by performing good actions in the present. In other words, Yājñavalkya presents karma more as a theory to promote good actions, than as a fatalistic doctrine in which the future is fixed.

While Yājñavalkya assumes that karma takes place across lifetimes, he does not attempt to explain the mechanisms of rebirth. In the Chāndogya Upaniṣad, however, King Pravāhaṇa Jaivali is more specific about how karma and rebirth operate, describing the link between them in terms of a naturalistic philosophy (CU 5.4-10). In a dialogue that also appears in the Bṛhadāraṇyaka Upaniṣad (BU 6.2.9-16), but without the explicit connection to karma, Pravāhaṇa discloses the teaching of the five fires (pañcāgnividyā) to Uddālaka Āruṇi. Pravāhaṇa’s instruction describes human life as part of a cycle of regeneration, whereby the essence of life takes on different forms as it passes through different levels of existence: when humans die, they are cremated and travel in the form of smoke to the other world (the first fire), where they become soma; as soma they enter a rain cloud (the second fire) and become rain; as rain they return to earth (the third fire), where they become food; as food they enter man (the fourth fire), where they become semen; as semen they enter a woman (the fifth fire) and become an embryo. According to Pravāhaṇa, those who know the teaching of the five fires follow the path of the gods and enter the world of brahman, but those who do not know this teaching, will follow the path of the ancestors and continue to be reborn.

Pravāhaṇa states that knowledge of the teaching of the five fires will affect the conditions of one’s future births. He explains that people who are pleasant will enter a ‘pleasant womb’ such as the womb of a brahmin, a kṣatriya, or a vaiśya. But that people of foul behavior can expect to enter the womb of a dog, a pig, or an outcaste (CU 5.10.7). In this teaching, Pravāhaṇa demonstrates the link between karma and rebirth by specifying different types of animals (dogs, pigs) and different types of matter (smoke, rain, food, semen) through which karma operates. By implication, karma not only applies to the causes and effects of human actions, but also includes non-human animals and other forms of organic and inorganic matter. Moreover, karma is not directed by a divine being, but rather is described as an independent, natural process. As such, karma is presented as an impersonal moral force that operates throughout the totality of existence, balancing out the consequences of good and bad action. Here, we see that Uddālaka Āruṇi’s teaching implies that everyone’s actions have moral consequences and that all the actions of humans and non-humans are interconnected.

Such discussions linking actions in one lifetime to consequences in a future one would become widely accepted in subsequent philosophical discourse—not only among Hindus, but also by Buddhists and Jains, and, to a certain extent, by the Ājīvikas. In subsequent developments across these traditions, karma would often be conceptualized in terms of intention and much of what we might describe as ethics was to be focused on ways to cultivate a state of mind that would generate positive rather than negative intentions.

Despite the development of ideas about karma, the earliest Upaniṣads generally do not contain the assumption that life is suffering (duḥkha), or illusion (māyā), or ignorance (avidyā)—views that would later dominate discussions of karma and rebirth. Nonetheless, we do see the introduction of the term “saṃsāra” in the comparatively late Kaṭha (3.7) and Śvetāśvatara (6.16) Upaniṣads. Literally meaning, ‘that which turns around forever’, saṃsāra refers to the cycle of birth, life, death, and rebirth. All living creatures, including the gods, are considered to be a part of saṃsāra. Accordingly, death is not considered to be final, and rebirth is an essential aspect of existence.

Closely related to saṃsāra is mokṣa, the concept that one can escape or be released from the endless cycle of repeated births. Similar to saṃsāra, the Upaniṣads do not contain an explicit theory about mokṣa, with the term “mokṣa” only assuming its connotations of liberation in the later texts (that is, SU 6.16). The Hindu darśanas would subsequently consider mokṣa to be a fundamental teaching of all the Upaniṣads, but the texts themselves, particularly the early ones, focus much more attention on securing wealth, status, and power in this lifetime than on describing existence as an endless cycle. They also tend to present life as desirable, and not as a condition from which people need release or escape. One of the most common soteriological goals is immortality, amṛta, which literally means ‘not dying’. The Upaniṣads describe immortality in different ways, including having a long life span, surviving death in the heavenly world, becoming one with the essential being of the universe, and being preserved in the social memory.

6. Ethics and the Upaniṣads

Philosophy in the Upaniṣads does not merely consist of abstract claims about the nature of reality, but is also presented as a way of living one’s life. In Yājñavalkya’s teaching to Janaka, for example, knowledge of ātman is associated with a change in one’s disposition and behavior. As we have seen, karma is characterized as a natural moral process, with knowledge of the self as a way out of that process. In this respect, a fundamental assumption throughout many teachings of the self is that it is untouched by karma. Yājñavalkya teaches Janaka that knowledge of the self is beyond virtuous (kalyāṇa) and evil (pāpa)—that, through knowledge of the self one reaches the world of brahman, where the good or bad actions of one’s life do not follow (BU 4.4.22).

Yājñavalkya explains that in the world of brahman a thief is not a thief, a murderer is not a murderer, an outcaste not an outcaste, a mixed-caste person (paulkasa) is not a mixed-caste person, a renunciate (śramaṇa) is not a renunciate, and an ascetic not an ascetic, that neither the good (puṇya) nor the evil (pāpa) follow him (BU 4.3.22; see also TU 2.9.1). In using these examples Yājñavalkya illustrates the degree to which knowledge of the self is beyond everyday notions of moral behavior. In other words, he seems to be saying that even if one has committed evil deeds, one can still be liberated from karma by means of knowing the self. Yet Yājñavalkya is not suggesting that one can continue to perform ‘evil’ deeds without suffering karmic retribution. Rather, as he asserts later in his discussion with Janaka: when one is knowledgeable, one necessarily acts morally. Yājñavalkya explains that a man who has proper knowledge becomes calm (śānta), restrained (dānta), withdrawn (uparata), patient (titikṣu), and composed (samāhita) (BU 4.4.23). Here Yājñavalkya characterizes knowledge of the self as a change in one’s disposition. In other words, one who is a knower of the self becomes a person of good character and—by definition—would not perform an evil action.

While Yājñavalkya talks about becoming calm, restrained, withdrawn, patient, and composed, these dispositions are not presented as virtues to cultivate for the sake of knowledge, but rather as consequences of knowing ātman. Subsequent texts would devote considerable attention to how one should cultivate oneself in order to achieve the highest knowledge. For example, both the eight-fold path of the Buddhist Nikāyas and the eight limbs in the Yoga Sūtra suggest that one needs to live a moral life in order to achieve true knowledge. In Yājñavalkya’s teaching about ātman, however, there is more attention paid to the objective of knowing the self than the ethical means of controlling the self.

Despite the lack of details about the path to knowledge, Yājñavalkya nevertheless connects  knowledge of ātman with particular practices, explaining to Janaka that brahmins seek to know ātman by means of vedic recitation (vedānuvacana), sacrifice (yajña), gift-giving (dāna), austerity (tapas), and fasting (BU 4.4.22). Yājñavalkya elaborates, claiming that by knowing the self, one becomes a sage (muni), undertaking an ascetic and peripatetic lifestyle (BU 4.4.22). Here, Yājñavalkya implies that those who come to know ātman will become renunciates—that knowledge of the self not only brings about certain dispositions or a certain character, but also provokes a particular lifestyle. Similarly, in the Muṇḍaka Upaniṣad, Aṅgiras teaches Śaunaka that the self can be mastered by means of asceticism and celibacy, among other practices (MU 3.1.5).

With the connection between knowledge and lifestyle, there are notable gender implications of Upanishadic teachings. Yājñavalkya, for example, assumes that the main knowers of the self will be brahmin men, even claiming that through knowledge of the self one can become a brahmin (BU 4.4.23). The word “ātman” is grammatically masculine and teachings of the self are directed specifically towards a male audience and articulated in overtly androcentric metaphors (Black 2007: 135-41). Nonetheless, a number of teachings of the self suggest that true knowledge goes beyond gender distinctions. As we have seen, Uddālaka Āruṇi describes the self as an organic, universal life-force, while Yājñavalkya teaches that one who knows the self will see the self in all living beings (BU 4.4.23). It is also noteworthy that the Upaniṣads depict several women—such as Gārgī and Maitreyī—as participating in philosophical discussions and debates (Black 2007: 48-67; Lindquist 2008).

7. The Upaniṣads and Hindu Darśanas before Vedānta

The influence of the Upaniṣads on the so-called ‘Hindu’ darśanas is more oblique than explicit, with few direct references, yet with many of the dominant terms and concepts seemingly inherited from them. Many of the six main Hindu schools officially recognize the Upaniṣads as a source of philosophy in so far as they recognize śabda as a valid means for attaining knowledge. Śabda literally means ‘word’, but in philosophical discourse it refers to verbal testimony or reliable authority, and is sometimes taken to refer specifically to śruti. Despite the nominal acceptance of śabda as a pramāṇa, however, the Upaniṣads are only cited occasionally in the surviving texts, and rarely as a source to validate fundamental arguments, before the emergence of the Vedānta school in the 7th century.

Notably, the Upanishadic notion of self—as a spiritual essence separate from the physical body—is generally accepted by the classical Hindu philosophical schools. The Nyāya and Mīmāṃsā darśanas, for example, which do not cite the Upaniṣads to prove its existence, nevertheless describe the self as an immaterial substance that resides in and acts through the body. In addition to conceptual similarities with certain passages from the Upaniṣads, both schools seem to consider the Upaniṣads as texts that specialize in the self. The Nyāya philosopher Vātsyāyana (c. 350-450 C.E.), for instance, characterizes the Upaniṣads as dealing with the self.

Similarly, the early texts of the Sāṃkhya and Yoga darśanas do not refer to the Upaniṣads when making their fundamental arguments, but do seem to inherit much of their terminology, as well as some of their views, from them. At the beginning of Uddālaka Āruṇi’s instruction to Śvetaketu in the Chāndogya Upaniṣad (6.2-5), for instance, he describes existence (sat) as consisting of three forms (rūpas): fire (red), water (white), and food (black)—a scheme that closely resembles the later Sāṃkhya doctrine of prakṛti and the three guṇas. The Śvetāśvatara Upaniṣad (4.5), the oldest extant text to use the word “sāṃkhya” (5.2), seems to build on Uddālaka’s three-fold scheme when describing the unborn as red, white, and black. Also, a number of core terms in Sāṃkhya philosophy first appear in the Upaniṣads, such as ahaṃkāra (CU 7.25.1) and the tattvas (BU 4.5.12), while some passages contain groups of terms appearing together in ways that are similar to how they appear in later Sāṃkhya texts: the Kaṭha Upaniṣad (3.10-11), for example, lists a hierarchy of principles including person (puruṣa), discernment (buddhi), mind (manas), and the sense capacities (indriyas).

A number of details about the practice of yoga, which would become more systematized by the Yoga darśana, are also first found in the Upaniṣads. The Kaṭha (3.3-13; 6.7-11) and Śvetāśvatara (2.8-11) Upaniṣads both contain some of the earliest descriptions of exercises for controlling the senses, breathing techniques, and bodily postures, with the Śvetāśvatara Upaniṣad (for example, 2.15-17) making explicit connections between yogic practice and union with a personal god—a connection that would be of central importance in the Yoga darśana. The Maitrī Upaniṣad (6-7) has the most extensive and systematic discussion of yoga in the Upaniṣads, containing a number of parallels with the Yoga Sūtra.

In addition to employing terms and concepts from the Upaniṣads, there are occasions when classical Indian philosophers refer to the Upaniṣads directly. Vātsyāyana, of the Nyāya school, quotes passages from the Bṛhadāraṇyaka and Chāndogya Upaniṣads when discussing mokṣa, the means of attaining it, and the stages of life. Additionally, the grammarian Patañjali (c.150 B.C.E.) argues that the study of grammar is useful for a correct understanding of passages from the Upaniṣads, and thus for attaining mokṣa.

Such examples indicate that the philosophers of classical Hindu philosophy knew the Upaniṣads quite well and would dip into the texts from time to time to provide an analogy or, occasionally, to support one of their arguments. However, the early surviving texts of the Nyāya, Vaiśeṣika, Mīmāṃsā, Sāṃkhya, and Yoga schools do not tend to use the Upaniṣads to validate their core positions. The Vaiśeṣika Sūtra (3.2.8), for example, agrees that the self is discussed in the Upaniṣads, but then argues that the proof of the existence of the self should not be established exclusively by means of śruti, but also can be determined through inference. Additionally, none of the early schools produced a commentary on the Upaniṣads, nor did any of them aim to offer an interpretation on the Upaniṣads as a whole. As such, the Upaniṣads provided a general philosophical framework, as well as serving as a repository for terms and analogies, but none of the early schools claimed the texts for themselves.

An interesting illustration of this point is that competing schools would sometimes recognize that their rival’s positions were also to be found in the Upaniṣads. The Nyāya philosopher Jayanta Bhaṭṭa even finds the positions of the heterodox Lokāyata darśana, or Materialist school, in the Upaniṣads. In the context of criticizing the validity of śabda as a pramāṇa, Bhaṭṭa argues that if śabda were a valid means for establishing knowledge, then even the doctrines of the Lokāyatas must be true, because their doctrines can be found in the Upaniṣads. Due to a lack of sources from the Lokāyata school, we do not know if they ever referred to the Upaniṣads in their own texts, but Bhaṭṭa’s argument is illustrative of a general reluctance of most of the early schools to put too much stake in śruti as a means of knowledge. His comments are also an acknowledgement that the Upaniṣads contain a variety of viewpoints.

8. The Upaniṣads and Vedānta

The oldest surviving systematic interpretation of the Upaniṣads is the Brahma Sūtra (200 B.C.E.—200 C.E.), attributed to Bādarāyaṇa. Although technically not a commentary (that is, it is a sūtra rather than a bhāṣya), the Brahma Sūtra is an explanation of the philosophy of the Upaniṣads, treating the texts as the source for knowledge about brahman. Despite being considered a Vedānta text, the Brahma Sūtra (a.k.a. Vedānta Sūtra) was composed centuries before the establishment of Vedānta as a philosophical school. The Brahma Sūtra uses the Upaniṣads to refute the position of dualism, as put forth by the Sāṃkhya school. Like Śaṅkara does later, the Brahma Sūtra (1.1.3-4) states that śruti is the source of all knowledge about brahman. Additionally, the Brahma Sūtra maintains that mokṣa is the ultimate goal as opposed to action or sacrifice.

Centuries later, the Vedānta darśana was the first philosophical school to attempt to present the Upaniṣads as holding a unified philosophical position. Vedānta means ‘end of the Vedas’ and is often used to refer specifically to the Upaniṣads. The school divides the Vedas into two sections: karmakānda, the section of spiritual exegesis (consisting of the Saṃhitās and the Brāhmaṇas), and jñānakānda, the section of knowledge (consisting of the Upaniṣads, and to a certain extent, the Āraṇyakas). According to the Vedānta school, the ritual section contains detailed instructions of how to perform the rituals, whereas the Upaniṣads contain transcendent knowledge for the sake of achieving mokṣa. There are three main branches of the Vedānta school: Advaita Vedānta, Viśiṣtādvaita Vedānta, and Dvaita Vedānta. Although these branches would put forth distinct philosophical positions, they all took śabda as the exclusive means to knowledge about its central doctrines and considered the Upaniṣads, the Brahma Sūtra, and Bhagavad Gītā as its core texts (prasthānatraya). Despite disagreeing with each other, all three of the most well known philosophers of the Vedānta school—Śaṅkara, Rāmānuja, and Madhva—wrote commentaries on the Upaniṣads, presenting them as having a single, and consistent philosophical position.

The most well-known philosopher of the Vedānta school was Śaṅkara (c. 700 C.E.), whose interpretations of the Upaniṣads made a major impact on the Indian philosophical tradition in the centuries after his lifetime and continued to dominate readings of the texts throughout the 19th and early 20th centuries. Śaṅkara was the main proponent of Advaita Vedānta, which put forth a position of non-dualism. According to Śaṅkara the fundamental teaching of the Upaniṣads is that ātman and brahman are one and the same.

For Śaṅkara, the Upaniṣads are not merely sources to back up his claims, but they also provide him with techniques for making his arguments. Śaṅkara takes the Upaniṣads as outlining methods for their own interpretation, following a number of literary criteria as clues for how to read the texts (Hirst 2005: 59-64). Consequently, even when he uses examples not found in the Upaniṣads, Śaṅkara can maintain that his arguments are based on scripture, for as long as he argues in the same way that the Upaniṣads do,  he can claim that his arguments are based on his sources.

Despite the significance of Śaṅkara’s philosophy, it is important to note that his interpretation of the Upaniṣads was not the only one accepted by philosophers of the Vedānta school. Rāmānuja (c. 1000 C.E.), the main proponent of a form of Vedānta known as Viśiṣtādvaita, or qualified non-dualism, used the Upaniṣads to argue that ātman is not identical with brahman, but an aspect of brahman. Rāmānuja also found in the Upaniṣads a source for bhakti, as he identified the Upanishadic brahman with God. Two centuries later, Madhva (c. 1200 C.E.) used the Upaniṣads as a source for a dualist branch of the school, known as Dvaita Vedānta. Madhva interpreted brahman as an infinite and independent God, with the self as finite and dependent. As such, ātman is dependent upon brahman, but they are not exactly the same.

It is well known that the Vedānta school became extremely influential in shaping subsequent philosophical debates, and we may conjecture that the tendency for various Vedānta philosophers to use the Upaniṣads in support of their own positions, as well as in their criticisms of rival schools, prompted other schools to engage with the Upaniṣads more closely. This is illustrated by the fact that schools such as Nyāya and Sāṃkhya, which previously seem to have relied very little on the Upaniṣads, began invoking them to counter the claims of Advaita Vedānta.

The Nyāya philosopher Bhāsarvajña (c. 850-950 CE), for example, quotes some verses from the Upaniṣads to support his position of a distinction between the ordinary and supreme sense of self when arguing with the Advaita position of non-dualism. Another Nyāya philosopher, Gaṅgeśa (c. 1300 C.E.), seems to be quoting from the Upaniṣads to back up the claim that karmic retribution is not binding for those who know the self—a position stated by Yājñavalkya (BU 4.4.23). Moreover, a number of Sāṃkhya and Yoga philosophers use the Upaniṣads in an attempt to make their schools more compatible with Vedānta. The Sāṃkhya philosopher Nāgeśa (c. 1700-1750), for example, draws from the Upaniṣads—as well as the other two source texts of the Vedānta school, the Bhagavad Gītā and Brahma Sūtra—to argue that the Vedānta and Sāṃkhya schools do not contradict each other. This trend can also be found in the Sāṃkhyasūtra (c. 1400-1500 C.E.), which argues that the identification of brahman and ātman was a qualitative identity, but not a numerical one—seemingly defending Sāṃkhya against Śaṅkara’s criticism that the Sāṃkhya doctrine of multiple selves contradicts the Upaniṣads. Interestingly, this argument suggests that Sāṃkhya philosophers not only felt the need to show that their positions did not contradict the Upaniṣads, but also that they basically accepted the Advaita Vedānta reading of the Upaniṣads.

9. The Upaniṣads as Philosophy

As noted above, many of the Upaniṣads are composite and fragmented, and therefore lacking a coherent philosophical position. Moreover, the teachers portrayed in the Upaniṣads do not seem to make linear arguments that start with premises and build to larger conclusions, but rather tend to make points through analogies and metaphors, with many core ideas presented as truths or insights known to particular teachers, not as logical propositions that can be independently verified. Nonetheless, in a number of sections of the texts, there appear to be implicit philosophical methods in place.. We have already noted that Yājñavalkya’s discussion of the self is based on a reflective introspection (see also MuU 3.1.8-9). The early Upaniṣads do not contain passages explicitly articulating method, but with the development of yoga and meditation in the later texts, introspection begins to be formalized as a philosophical mode of enquiry.  Also, many of Uddālaka Āruṇi’s descriptions of ātman are derived from his observations of the natural world.

In addition to providing a repository of terms, concepts, and, to a certain degree, philosophical methods, from which subsequent philosophical schools would draw, the Upaniṣads were also influential in the development of the practice of debates, which would become the defining social practice of Indian philosophy. Although the texts do not discuss debate reflectively, a number of the most important teachings are articulated within the context of discussions between teachers and students, and verbal disputes among rival brahmins. In some dialogues, there is a dialectical relationship between the arguments of competing interlocutors, indicating that the dialogical presentation of teachings was a way of formulating philosophical rhetoric (Black 2015). In this way, debate is another way by which the Upaniṣads extend ideas first articulated in the context of the Vedic ritual into a more philosophical discourse.

10. The Upaniṣads in the Modern Period

The Upaniṣads are some of the most well-known Indian sources outside of India. Their first known translation into a non-Indian language was initiated by the Mughal prince Dārā Shūkōh, son of the emperor Shah Jahan. This Persian translation, known as the Sirr-i Akbar (the Great Secret), consisted of fifty texts, including the Vedic upaniṣads, many of the yoga, renunciate, and devotional upaniṣads, as well as other texts, such as the Puruṣa Sūkta hymn of the Ṛgveda and some material from unidentified sources. Dārā Shūkōh considered the Upaniṣads to be the sources of Indian monotheism and he was convinced that the Koran itself referred to the Upaniṣads.

Henry Thomas Colebrooke’s translation of the Aitareya Upaniṣads in 1805 was the first rendering of an upaniṣad into English. Rammohan Roy subsequently translated the Kena, Īśā, Kāṭha, and Muṇḍaka Upaniṣads into English, while his Bengali translation of the Kena Upaniṣad in 1816 was the first rendering of an upaniṣad into a modern Indian language.

Roy used the introductions of his translations into both Bengali and English to promote the reformation of Hinduism, endorsing the values of reason and religious tolerance, while criticizing practices such as idolatry and caste hierarchy. Roy felt that contemporary religion in India was in decline and hoped that his translations could provide Hindus with direct access to what he considered to be the true doctrines of Hinduism. The Upaniṣads first reached Europe in the modern period through the French philologist Abraham Hyacinthe Anquetil-Dupperon’s translation of the Sirr-i Akbar into Latin, which was published in 1804. It was Anquetil-Dupperon’s text, known as the Oupnek’hat. which was read by the German philosopher Arthur Schopenhauer, the first major European thinker to engage explicitly with Indian sources. Schopenhauer considered the Upaniṣads, Plato, and Kant to be the three major influences on his work and is known to have kept a copy of Anquetil-Dupperon’s translation by his bedside table, reflecting that the Upaniṣads were his consolation in life and would equally be his consolation in death.

11. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Buitenen, J. A. B. van, tr. 1962. The Maitrāyaṇīya Upaniṣad: A Critical Essay with Text. Translation & Commentary. The Hague: Mouton & Co.
  • Deussen, Paul, tr. 1980 (originally published in 1897). Sixty Upaniṣads of the Veda, translated by V. M. Bedekar and G. B. Palsule. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
  • Eggeling, Julius, tr. 1994 (originally published in 1882-97). Śatapatha Brāhmaṇa, Vols. 12, 26, 41, 43 and 44 (5 parts of the Sacred Books of the East; Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass).
  • Hume, Robert, tr. 1975 (originally published in 1921). The Thirteen Principal Upanishads. London: Oxford University Press.
  • Keith, A. B., tr. 1995 (originally published in 1909). Aitareya Āraṇyaka. London: Oxford University Press.
  • Müller, F. Max, tr. 2000 (originally published in 1897). The Upanishads Parts 1-2. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
  • Olivelle, Patrick, tr. 1992. Saṃnyāsa Upaniṣads. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Olivelle, Patrick, tr. 1996. The Upaniṣads. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Olivelle, Patrick, tr. 1998. The Early Upaniṣads: Annotated Text and Translation. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Oertel, H., tr. 1897. ‘The Jaiminīya or Talavakāra Upaniṣad Brāhmaṇa’. Journal of the American Oriental Society 16: 79-260.
  • Radhakrishnan, Sarvepalli, tr. 1992 (originally published in 1953). The Principal Upaniṣads. New Jersey: Humanities Press.
  • Roebuck, Valerie, tr. 2004. Upaniṣads. Harmondsworth: Penguin.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Black, Brian. 2007. The Character of the Self in Ancient India: Priests, Kings, and Women in the early Upaniṣads. Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Black, Brian. 2011. “Ambaṭṭha and Śvetaketu: Literary Connections between the Upaniṣads and Early Buddhist Narratives.” Journal of the American Academy of Religion, Vol. 79, No. 1: 136–161
  • Black, Brian. 2011. “The Rhetoric of Secrecy in the Upaniṣads.” Essays in Honor of Patrick Olivelle, edited by Steven Lindquist. Florence: Florence University Press: 101-125.
  • Black, Brian 2015. “Dialogue and Difference: Encountering the Other in Indian Religious and Philosophical Sources.” Dialogue in Early South Asian Religions: Hindu, Buddhist, and Jain Traditions, edited by Brian Black and Laurie Patton Farnham, UK: Ashgate: pp. 243-257.
  • Brereton, Joel. 1990. “The Upanishads.” Approaches to the Asian Classics, edited by Wm. T. de Bary and I. Bloom. New York: Columbia University: 115-135.
  • Cohen, Signe. 2008. Text and Authority in the Older Upaniṣads. Leiden: Brill.
  • Deussen, Paul. 2000 (originally published 1919). The Philosophy of the Upanishads. Delhi: Oriental Publishers.
  • Ganeri, Jonardon. 2007. The Concealed Art of the Soul: Theories of Self and Practices of Truth in Indian Ethics and Epistemology. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Hirst, J. G. Suthren. 2005. Śaṃkara’s Advaita Vedānta: A Way of Teaching, London: RoutledgeCurzon.
  • Killingley, Dermot. 1997. “The Paths of the Dead and the Five Fires.” Indian Insights: Buddhism, Brahmanism and Bhakti: Papers from the Annual Spalding Symposium on Indian Religions, edited by Peter Connolly and Sue Hamilton. London: Luzac Oriental.
  • Lindquist, Steven. 2008. “Gender at Janaka’s  Court: Women in the Bṛhadāraṇyaka Upaniṣad Reconsidered.” Journal of Indian Philosophy. Vol. 36, No. 3: 405-426.
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Author Information

Brian Black
Lancaster University
United Kingdom


Nyāya (literally “rule or method of reasoning”) is a leading school of philosophy within the “Hindu umbrella”—those communities which saw themselves as the inheritors of the ancient Vedic civilization and allied cultural traditions. Epistemologically, Nyāya develops of a sophisticated precursor to contemporary reliabilism (particularly process reliabilism), centered on the notion of “knowledge-sources” (pramāṇa), and a conception of epistemic responsibility which allows for default, unreflective justification accorded to putatively veridical cognition. It also extensively studies the nature of reasoning in the attempt to map pathways which lead to veridical inferential cognition. Nyāya’s methods of analysis and argument resolution influenced much of classical Indian literary criticism, philosophical debate, and jurisprudence. Metaphysically, Nyāya defends a robust realism, including universals, selves, and substances, largely in debate with Buddhist anti-realists and flux-theorists. Nyāya thinkers were also India’s most sophisticated natural theologians. For at least a millennium, Nyāya honed a variety of arguments in support of a baseline theism in constant engagement with sophisticated philosophical atheists, most notably Buddhists and Mīmāṁsakas (Hindu Ritualists).

Nyāya’s prehistory is tied to ancient traditions of debate and rules of reasoning (vādaśāstra). The oldest extant Nyāya text is the Nyāya-sūtra attributed to Gautama (c. 200 C.E.). Throughout much of Nyāya’s formative period the philosophical development of the school took place through commentaries on the sūtras (with important exceptions including works of Jayanta, c. 875, Udayana, c. 975, and the somewhat heterodox Bhāsarvajña, c. 875). Leading commentators include Vātsyāyana (c. 450), Uddyotakara (c. 600) Vācaspati Miśra (c. 900) and Udayana. The school would enter its “new” phase (navya-nyāya) in the work of the eminent epistemologist Gaṅgeśa Upādhyāya (c. 1325). This article focuses on the older tradition of Nyāya, beginning with the sūtras, with occasional gestures toward developments within the new school.  Given the breadth of Nyāya thought, this discussion has to exclude some important topics for the sake of economy, such as aesthetics, philosophy of language, and theory of value. The article’s primary focus is on epistemology and metaphysics. There is a brief consideration of Nyāya’s philosophy of religion.

Table of Contents

  1. Epistemology
    1. Perception
      1. The Characteristics of Perception
      2. Extraordinary Perceptual States
      3. Introspection
    2. Inference
      1. The Characteristics of Inference
      2. The Structure of Inference
      3. Inferential Defeaters or Fallacies
      4. Suppositional Reasoning
    3. Analogical Reasoning
    4. Testimony
    5. Non-pramāṇa Epistemic Capacities
    6. General Theory of Knowledge
      1. A Causal Theory of Knowledge
      2. Internalist Constraints
      3. A Relational Theory of Cognition
      4. Response to Skepticism
  2. Metaphysics
    1. Substance
    2. Quality
    3. Action
    4. Universal
    5. Inherence
    6. Individuator
    7. Absence
    8. Causation
  3. Philosophy of Religion
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Sanskrit Source Materials
    2. Primary Texts in English Translation
    3. Studies of Nyāya Epistemology, Metaphysics, and Philosophy of Religion in English
    4. General Studies

1. Epistemology

The Nyāya-sūtra opens with a list of its primary topics, sixteen items which may be grouped into the following four categories: epistemology, metaphysics, procedures and elements of inquiry, and debate theory. That Nyāya’s initial topic is epistemology (pramāṇas, “knowledge-sources”) is noteworthy. Both the sūtras and the commentarial tradition argue that epistemic success is central in the search for happiness, since we must understand the world properly should we desire to achieve the goods it offers.Vātsyāyana claims that while Nyāya’s metaphysical concerns overlap with other, more scripturally-based Hindu schools, what distinguishes Nyāya is a reflective concern with evidence, doubt and the objects of knowledge. He further defines Nyāya’s philosophical method as the “investigation of a subject by means of knowledge-sources” (NB 1.1.1). Importantly, the pramāṇas are not simply the means by which individuals attain veridical cognition. They are also the final court of appeals in philosophical dispute. Uddyotakara thus claims the best kind of demonstrative reasoning occurs when the pramāṇas are deployed in concert in order to establish a fact.

The four pramāṇas are perception, inference, analogical reasoning, and testimony. We will discuss them in order. Then, we will consider Nyāya’s theory of knowledge in general.

a. Perception (pratyakṣa)

i. The Characteristics of Perception

Nyāya-sūtra 1.1.4 defines perceptual cognition as follows.

A perceptual cognition arises by means of the connection between sense faculty and object, is not dependent on words, is non-deviating, and is determinate.

This sūtra provides four conditions which must be met for cognition to be perceptual. The first, that cognition arises from the connection between sense faculty and object, evinces Nyāya’s direct realism. It is such connection, the central feature of the causal chain which terminates in perceptual cognition, which fixes the intentionality of a token percept. Uddyotakara enumerates six kinds of connection (sannikarṣa) to account for the fact that that we perceive not only substances, but properties, absences, and so on: (i) conjunction (samyoga), the connection between a sense faculty and an object; (ii) inherence in what is conjoined (saṁyukta-samavāya), the connection between a sense faculty and a property-trope which inheres in an object; (iii) inherence in what inheres in what is conjoined (saṁyukta-samaveta-samavāya), the connection between a sense faculty and the universal which is instantiated in a property-trope; (iv) inherence (samavāya), the kind of connection which makes auditory perception possible; (v) inherence in what inheres (samaveta-samavāya), the connection between the auditory faculty and universals which inhere within sounds; (vi) qualifier-qualified relation (viśeṣya-viśeṣaṇa-bhāva), the connection which allows for the perception of inherence and absence in objects. In all cases, the perceptual cognition is born of connection between a sense faculty and an occurrent fact or object.

The second condition, that the cognition produced is not dependent on words, has a somewhat complicated interpretive history. Generally, Nyāya holds that ordinary perception involves concept deployment. Therefore, this restriction does not endorse a view held by the Buddhist Dignāga and his followers, that genuine perception is non-conceptual (kalpanā-apodha). Still, the meaning of avyapadeśya is disputed amongst Naiyāyikas. On one reading, this qualification serves the purpose of distinguishing between perceptually and testimonially generated cognitions. The latter also require information provided by the senses but further require the deployment of semantic and syntactic knowledge. An allied reading suggests that while involving the application of concepts, perception of an object is often causally prior to speech acts involving it.

The third, “non-deviating” condition blocks false cognitions, like the misperception that an oyster shell is a piece of silver, from the ranks of pramāṇa-born. This is tied to the Nyāya notion that pramāṇas are by definition inerrant, and that false cognitive presentations are not truly pramāṇas but pseudo-pramāṇas (pramāṇa-ābhāsa). Though we may mistakenly take a pseudo-pramāṇa, like the illusion of a person in the distance, to be the real thing, it is not. “Perception” and similar pramāṇa-terms have success grammar for Nyāya.

The fourth, “determinate” condition blocks cognitions which are merely doubtful from the ranks of the pramāṇa-born. Dubious cognitions, like that of a distant person at dusk, do not convey misleadingly false information, but being unclear, they do not properly apprehend the object in question. It could be a person or a post. As such, one neither correctly grasps its character nor falsely takes it to represent accurately a certain object. Later Naiyāyikas, most notably Vācaspati Miśra, read the qualifiers “notdependent on words” and “determinate” disjunctively, in order to say that perception may be non-propositional or propositional. However anachronistic this may be as an interpretation of the Nyāya-sūtra, this division is accepted by later Nyāya.

ii. Extraordinary Perceptual States

Nyāya admits of certain kinds of extraordinary perception in order to account for cognitive states that are perceptual in character, but distinct from those commonly experienced. They involve modes of sense-object connection other than the six kinds noted above. Later Nyāya (beginning at least with Jayanta) recognizes three kinds of extraordinary perception: (i) yogic perception, (ii) perception of a universal through an individual which instantiates it, and (iii) perception of an object’s properties as mediated by memory.

Yogic perception includes experiential states reported by contemplatives in deep mediation. Their cognitive objects (usually the deep self or God) are taken to be experienced in a direct and unmediated way, but generally without the operation of the external senses. Given their experiential character and their putative agreement with other sources of knowledge like scripture and inference, yogic experiences are prima facie taken to be veridical, produced by non-normal perception.

Perception of a universal through an individual which instantiates it is Nyāya’s response to the problem of induction. Nyāya holds that universals are perceptually experienced as instantiated in individuals (see the third of Uddyotakara’s six kinds of connection above). But the notion that we may have apprehension of all of the individuals which instantiate a universal, qua their being instantiations of the universal, is further accepted by Nyāya in order to explain how we attain to knowledge of vyāpti, or invariable relation between universals, which undergirds causal regularities of various sorts. Unless one’s experience of some particular smoke instance as conjoined with a fire instance allows him to experience all instances of smoke qua smoke as being conjoined with all instances of fire qua fire, through the natural tie between the universals smokiness and fieriness, inductive extrapolation would be impossible. Nyāya thus solves the problem of induction by appeal to extraordinary perception. This does not imply that we are always able to recognize such relations. It may take repeated experience for us to notice the ever-present connection. But when such recognition arises, it is due to perceptual experience, not an extrapolative projection of past experience.

Perception of the properties of an object mediated by memory involves the visual experience of unpresented properties of an object which is currently seen. Standard examples include seeing a piece of sandalwood as fragrant or seeing a piece of ice as cold. Here, there is a standard kind of sense object connection, but some of the phenomenal features of the experience, while veridical, are not generated by the ordinary connection. They are rather mediated by a special connection grounded in memory. What distinguishes this kind of perception from straightforward inference is that the property in question is experienced with a phenomenal character lacking in inference. This suggests that what may be considered inference for some may take the form of perception for others, depending on their familiarity with the conceptual connection between the properties in question.

iii. Introspection

Nyāya holds that while cognitions reveal or present their intentional objects, they rarely present themselves directly. When they are directly cognized, cognitions are grasped by other, apperceptive cognitions. As apperceptive awareness reveals a cognition along with its predication content or “objecthood” (that is, my cognition of a red truck is apperceptively cognized as having the predication content “red” and “truck-hood”), it is practically indefeasible. But, as Gaṅgeśa notes, this indefeasibility does transfer to the content of the original cognition (which is itself object of the apperceptive awareness). I may have mistaken a purple truck for a red truck, forgetting that my eyewear distorts certain colors. Apperception is subsumed by Nyāya into the category of perception. In this case, the operative sense faculty is the “inner organ” (manas) and the object is a cognition conceived of as a property of a self. Gaṅgeśa argues at length with a Prābhākara Mīmāṁsaka (a representative of another leading Hindu school), defending Nyāya’s version of apperception against the Mīmāṁsā view that each cognition itself has a component of reflectively self-awareness.

A few words on manas (the inner organ): NS 1.1.16 argues that the absence of simultaneous cognition from all of the senses indicates the presence of a faculty which governs selective attention. The manas is identified as this faculty, an insentient psychological apparatus which processes the information of the senses. A formulation of perception by the Vaiśeṣika school (Vaiśeṣika-sūtra 3.1.18), accepted by Nyāya, is that it normally consists in a chain of connection between four things: a self and its manas, the manas and a sense organ, and the sense organ and an object. Manas also is the faculty which governs mnemonic retrieval and, as noted above, apperceptive awareness of mental states. Selves, in the Nyāya view, are fundamentally loci of awareness, cognition, and mnemonic dispositions (saṁskāra). But just as they rely on the five senses to experience the world, they rely on manas for the functioning of memory and apperception.

To conclude, we may note that perception is commonly called the jyeṣṭapramāṇa (the “eldest” knowledge source) by Nyāya, since other pramāṇas depend on perceptual input, while perception operates directly on the objects of knowledge. Indeed, Gaṅgeśa suggests the following definition of a perceptual cognition: “a cognition that does not have another cognition as its proximate instrumental cause.” Inference, analogy, and testimony, on the other hand, depend on immediately prior cognitions to trigger their functioning. The normative status accorded to veridical perceptual cognition is primarily a matter of causation and intentionality (viṣayatā). If a cognition is caused by the appropriate causal chain, starting with the contact of a sense faculty and an external object (or, in the case of apperception, the internal organ and an immediately prior cognition), and the cognition produced has an “objecthood” or intentionality which accurately targets the object in question, the cognition is veridical and has the status prāmāṇya (pramāṇā-derived).

b. Inference (anumāna)

i. The Characteristics of Inference

Nyāya-sūtra 1.1.5 defines inference as follows.

[An inferential cognition] is preceded by that [perception], and is threefold: from cause to effect, from effect to cause or from that which is commonly seen.

This definition is somewhat elliptical. But it focuses on the fundamental character of inference: it is a cognition which follows from another cognition owing to their being conceptually connected in some way. Etymologically, anumāna means “after-cognizing”. Inference follows from an earlier cognition, “that” in the sūtra above. Vātsyāyana interprets “that” (tat) to refer to a perceptual cognition, and suggests that perceptual cognition precedes inference in two ways: (i) to engage in inference requires having perceptually established a fixed relationship between an inferential sign and the property to be inferred, and (ii) perceptual input triggers inference in that one must cognize the inferential sign as qualifying the locus of an inference. He provides a more explicit definition of inference as “a ‘later cognition’ of an object by means of cognition of its inferential sign” (NB 1.1.3).

Uddyotakara reasonably broadens the scope of “that” in NS 1.1.5 to refer to pramāṇa-produced cognitions of any kind which may trigger inference (NV 1.1.5). The meaning of reasoning from cause to effect and from effect to cause should be clear. Uddyotakara interprets reasoning from what is “commonly seen” as that which is grounded in non-causal correlations that have proven invariable. Vātsyāyana offers another reading: when the relationship between an inferential sign and the inferential target is not perceptible, the target may be inferred owing to the similarity of the unseen prover with something known. The classic example of this kind of inference is as follows: Desire, aversion, and knowledge are properties. Properties require substances which instantiate them. Therefore there is anunseen substance which instantiates desire, aversion, and knowledge: the inner self (NB 1.1.5). Though the connection between mental states like desire and the self which supports them is unseen, the similarity between mental states and other, commonly seen properties (like the color green) is enough to allow for the inference to a property-bearer.

The history of Nyāya’s logical theory is extensive. Here, we will note a few salient points and focus on inference as understood in the period most important to this study (the final great creative period of what is normally known as “Old Nyāya”). First, in Nyāya, logic is subsumed within epistemology, and therefore tends to have a strong informal and cognitive flavor, mapping paths of reasoning that generate veridical cognitions and noting the common ways that reasoning goes wrong. Fundamentally, one makes inferences for oneself. Formal proofs are meant to mirror the kind of reasoning that takes place internally, for didactic or polemical purposes. The first explicit recognition of this dual nature of inference is commonly attributed to the Buddhist Dignāga, who coined the terms svārthānumāna (inference for oneself) and parārthānumāna (inference for another). Such a division is implicit, however, in the Nyāya-sūtra’s distinction between inference as an individual’s source of knowledge (NS 1.1.5) and as a systematic method of proof meant to convince another (NS 1.1.32-39).

Second, inference is triggered by the recognition of a sign or mark, whose relationship with some other object (property or fact) has been firmly established. The primary cause of an inferential cognition is an immediately prior “subsumptive judgment” (parāmarśa) which grasps an inferential sign as qualifying an inferential subject (the locus of the inference), while recollecting the sign’s invariable concomitance with some other fact or object. The two fundamental requirements for inference are, therefore, awareness of pakṣadharmatā, the inferential mark’s qualifying the locus of the inference, and vyāpti, the sign’s invariable concomitance with the target property or probandum. A paradigmatic act of inference to oneself is: “There is fire on that mountain, since there is smoke on it,” which is supported by the awareness that fire is invariably concomitant with smoke. Naiyāyikas examine and standardize the conditions under which invariable concomitance (vyāpti) between a probans and a target fact is established.

Third, as logic’s function is to generate veridical cognition, Nyāya does not stress the distinction between soundness and validity in respect to the quality of an argument. Both formal fallacies and the inclusion of false premises lead to hetv-ābhāsa (“pseudo provers” or logical defeaters), since they engender false cognition.

ii. The Structure of Inference

Concerning inference for polemical or didactic purposes, Nyāya employs a formal five-step argument illustrated by the following stock example.

  1. There is fire on the hill (the pratijñā, thesis).
  2. Because there is smoke on the hill (the hetu, reason or probans).
  3. Wherever there is smoke, there is fire; like a kitchen hearth and unlike a lake (the udāharaṇa, illustration of concomitance).
  4. This hill is likewise smoky (the upanaya, application of the rule).
  5. Thus, there is fire on the hill (the nigamana, conclusion).

In practice, the five-membered “syllogism” is often truncated into three steps as follows.

A is qualified by S,
because it is qualified by T
(whatever is qualified by T is qualified by S) like (Tb&Sb).

Again, the stock example:

The hill is qualified by fieriness
because it is qualified by smokiness
(whatever is qualified by smokiness is qualified by fieriness) like a kitchen hearth and unlike a lake.

The basic components of the argument are:

  • the inferential subject (pakṣa), the locus of the inferential sign; the hill in our example. The general conditions for something to be taken up as a subject for inference, are that it be under dispute or currently unknown, with no reports from other knowledge sources available to definitively settle the issue.
  • the “prover” or inferential sign (hetu); smoke (more precisely, smokiness)
  • the probandum (sādhya), the property to be proved by the inference; fire (more precisely, fieriness)
  • the “pervasion” or concomitance (vyāpti) that grounds the inference, which is implicit in the step: “wherever there is smoke, there is fire
  • a corroborative instance (sapakṣa); a locus known to be qualified by both the prover (hetu) and the probandum (sādhya); this is a token of inductive support for the vyāpti; a kitchen hearth. There are also known negative examples, (vipakṣa) of something that lacks both the prover property and the probandum; where there is no fire, there is no smoke, like a lake. Obviously, an instantiation of the prover property in the vipakṣa class vitiates the argument.

This stock inference asserts that there is fire on the mountain (the mountain is qualified by the property of fieriness, Fm). Why?  Because the mountain is qualified by the property of smokiness, Sm. There is an implied concomitance which grounds the inference: “Whatever is qualified by smokiness is qualified by fieriness,” ∀x(Sx–>Fx). In the language of Nyāya, fire “pervades” smoke. This is an epistemic pervasion: we never find smoke instances without fire instances. As such, smoke is a prover property that allows us to infer the presence of fire. Finally, an example must be included in the syllogism to illustrate the inductive grounding which undergirds the invariable concomitance. In kitchen hearth k, fire is known to be concomitant with smoke, (Sk&Fk). In some instances, negative examples are used to indicate the vyāpti through contraposition. Wherever there is no fire there is no smoke, as illustrated in a lake, (~Fl& ~Sl).

Nyāya-sūtra 1.1.25 defines an example (dṛṣṭānta) as “something about which experts and laypersons have the same opinion (buddhi-sāmyam).” Vātsyāyana (NB Intro.; translation in Gangopadhyaya 1982: 5) elaborates:

Corroborative instance is an object of perception—an object about which the notions (buddhi) of the layman as well as the expert are not in conflict. . . It is also the basis of the application of nyāya (reasoning). By (showing) the contradiction of the dṛṣṭānta the position of the opponent can be declared as refuted. By the substantiation of the dṛṣṭānta, one’s own position is well-established. If the skeptic (nāstika) admits a corroborative instance, he has to surrender his skepticism. If he does not admit any, how can he silence his opponent?

Regarding agreement between laypersons and experts, the basic idea, of course, is that supporting examples should be non-controversial. A good illustration of this is found in Uddyotakara’s Nyāya-vārttika (2.1.16). Debating with a Buddhist interlocutor over the existence of property-bearing substances, he claims “there is no example whatever (na hi kaściddṛṣṭāntaḥ) . . . about which both parties agree (ubhaya-pakṣa-sampratipannaḥ).”

In another interpretation of the three kinds of inference in the sūtra, Uddyotakara introduces three kinds of argument: wholly-positive, wholly-negative, and positive-negative. Wholly-positive inference occurs when there are attested cases of sapakṣa but no vipakṣaknown. From a Buddhist perspective, the inference “whatever exists is momentary, like a cloud” would require this kind of inference, since there would be no available vipakṣato illustrate the non-presence of the prover. In cases where the property to be proven is entirely subsumed within the pakṣa, a wholly-negative form is employed. The vyāpti is contraposed, as in the following inference: “A living body has a self because it breathes. Whatever does not have a self does not breathe, like a pot.” Most inferences are in principle amenable to the positive-negative form, like “There is fire on that hill, since there is billowing smoke over it. Wherever there is smoke, there is fire, like a kitchen hearth, and unlike a lake.”

iii. Inferential Defeaters or Fallacies

Naiyāyikas provide various typologies of inferential fallacies and defeaters (hetv-ābāsa, “pseudo provers”). We may note five common kinds: (i) fallacies of deviation occur when the prover or inferential sign is not reliably correlated with the inferential target. To argue that “my mother must be visiting, since there is a Mazda parked outside” would involve the fallacy of deviation, since “Owning a Mazda” is a property that tracks not only my mother but many other drivers. It cannot, therefore, reliably indicate her presence. (ii) fallacies of contradiction occur when the prover in fact establishes a conclusion opposed to the thesis that someone defends. This would occur should someone argue that “Jones was not a kind man, since he gave his life for others,” as giving one’s life for others is an indicator of kindness or compassion. (iii) fallacies of unestablishment occur when a supposed prover is not actually the property of the inferential subject. Should someone argue “I know that your mother is in town, since I saw a Prius parked outside your home,” the prover is unestablished, since my mother does not in fact own a Prius. (iv) argumentsare rebutted, when their conclusions are undermined by information gleaned by more secure knowledge sources. Someone may argue that my friend must be out of town, since he hasn’t answered his phone all week. But if I just saw the friend in question at the local coffee shop, my perceptual knowledge rebuts his prover, invalidating it. Similarly, (v) arguments are counterbalanced when counterarguments of equal or greater force are put forth in support of an opposing conclusion. Disputant a argues that the inherent teleology of biological processes proves the existence of God. Disputant b argues that the existence of gratuitous evil proves that there is no God. Pending further philosophical work, argument b neutralizes the conclusion of argument a.

iv. Suppositional Reasoning

Tarka, suppositional or dialectical reasoning, is crucial to Nyāya’s philosophical program. Still, according to Vātsyāyana, it is not a full-fledged independent pramāṇa. Rather it is an “assistant to the pramāṇas” (pramāṇa-anugrahaka) (NB Introduction). Tarka is commonly employed as a form of reductio argument for the sake of judging competing claims or arguments, a reductio which depends not only on logical inconsistency, but on incoherence with deeply-held beliefs or norms. In the face of competing claims x and y about subject s, tarkais employed to show that x violates such norms, thereby shifting the presumptive weight to alternative y. Vātsyāyana (NB1.1.40) offers the example of competing claims about the nature of the self. Some say that the self is a product which comes to exist within time while others claim that it is unproduced and eternal. The Naiyāyika deploys tarkaby arguing that a consequence of the former view is that one’s initial life circumstances would not be determined by his karmic inheritance from previous lives, a severe violation of fundamental metaphysical positions held by almost every Indian school. As such, strong presumptive weight should be given to the latter view. This example illustrates the way in which considerations of negative coherence govern tarka’s deployment.

Vātsyāyana notes that the reason tarkais not an independent pramāṇa is that it does not independently establish the nature of the thing in question (anavadhāranāt). It provides consent (anujānāti) for one of two alternatives independently supported by apparent pramāṇas, by illustrating problems with the competing view. Uddyotakara (NV 1.1.1) adds that it is excluded from the ranks of pramāṇa because it does not provide definitive cognition (pramāṇamparicchedakaṁnatarkaḥ).

Later Naiyāyikas extol tarka as a means to test dubious inferential concomitances (vyāpti) by testing them against more fundamental holdings of various sorts. Tarka also has a crucial role in the management of philosophical doubt. Against the skeptic, Nyāya argues that doubt is not always reasonable. Tarka helps to distinguish legitimate doubt from mere contentiousness by illustrating which claims are better motivated and hence deserving of presumptive weight.

c. Analogical Reasoning (upamāna)

Nyāya-sūtra1.1.6 defines analogyas follows.

Analogy makes an object known by similarity with something already known.

Naiyāyikas commonly frame analogy as a means of vocabulary acquisition, and it has a severely restricted scope compared with the other pramāṇas. The standard example involves a person who is told that a water buffalo looks something like a cow and that such buffalo are present in a certain place in the countryside. Later, when out in the countryside, he recognizes that the thing he is seeing is similar to a cow, and therefore is a water buffalo. The cognition “That thing is a water buffalo,” born of the recollection of testimony regarding its similarity with a cow and the perception of such common features, is paradigmatically analogical. Though most of the other schools either reduce analogy to a more fundamental pramāṇaor conceive of it in very different terms (Mīmāṁsā conceives of it as the capacity by which we apprehend similarity itself), Nyāya contends that the cognition in question is sui generis analogical, though it incorporates information from other pramāṇas.

d. Testimony (śabda)

NS1.1.5 defines testimony as follows.

Testimony is the assertion of a qualified speaker.

The semantic range of āpta (“authority,” “credible person”) includes expertise, trustworthiness, and reliability. Vātsyāyana claims that an āpta possesses direct knowledge of something, and a willingness to convey such knowledge without distortion (NB 1.1.7). It is clear, though, that Nyāya does not require any kind of special expertise from such a speaker in normal situations. Nor does a hearer need positive evidence of trustworthiness. Mere absence of doubt in the asserter’s ability to speak authoritatively about the issue at hand is enough. Testimony is thus thought of as a transmission of information or content. A person attains an accurate cognition through some pramāṇatoken. In a properly functioning testimonial exchange, she bestows the information apprehended by the initial cognition to an epistemically responsible hearer. On such grounds, Uddyotakara notes that testimonial utterances may be divided into those whose contents are originally generated by perception or by inference. Jayanta likewise claims that the veridicality or non-veridicality of a testimonial cognition is dependent on the speaker’s knowledge of the content of her statement and her honesty in relating it.Vātsyāyana (NB 2.1.69) illustrates a levelheaded frankness about testimony’s importance, noting that “in accord with knowledge gained by testimony, people undertake their common affairs.” Uddyotakarasimilarlyrecognizes that testimony has the widest range of any source of knowledge, far outstripping what one may know from personal perception, inference or analogy.

e. Non-pramāṇa Epistemic Capacities

From the sūtra period, Nyāya recognizes a number of epistemic capacities which are nevertheless considered non-pramāṇa (NS 2.2.1-12). They are not considered independent pramāṇas for one of two reasons: (i) they are reducible to subspecies of other pramāṇas, or (ii) they do not produce the specific kind of cognitions which a pramāṇa must deliver. A core locus of debate amongst classical Indian thinkers is the nature and number of pramāṇas. Nyāya contends that the above four are the only irreducible sources of knowledge, which subsume all other kinds.

f. General Theory of Knowledge

i. A Causal Theory of Knowledge

Naiyāyikas speak of cognitive success in causal terms. “Pramāṇa” normally refers to a means or process by which veridical awareness-episodes (pramā) are generated, as seen above. Vātsyāyana glosses the meaning of pramāṇaas “that by which something is properly cognized (pramītyateanena)” (NB1.1.3).  Uddyotakara concurs: “what is spoken of as a pramāṇa? A pramāṇais the cause of a [veridical] cognition” (upalabdhi-hetupramāṇam) (NV1.1.1). Moreover, despite its focus on reflective consideration of belief and valid cognition, Nyāya argues that the simple,unreflective functioning of a pramāṇa like perception or testimony is enough to generate knowledge in the absence of countervailing evidence.

ii. Internalist Constraints

Nyāya does maintain an internalist constraint: Once doubt arises—by adversarial challenge, peer disagreement, inconsistency between differentcognitions, and so forth —a cognition must be validated in order to maintain the status of being “pramāṇa-produced.” Doubt triggers a second-order concern with reflective inquiry and certification. The sūtras state that “Where there is doubt, there must be ongoing examination” (NS 2.1.7). Uddyotakara therefore claims that doubt is an essential component of investigation (vicāraaṅga) (NV 1.1.23). Validation involves consciously reflecting on the etiology of a cognition to ensure that it is the product of a properly-functioning pramāṇa. It may also involve the deployment of other pramāṇasin the hopes for a convergence of knowledge-sources (pramāṇa-saṁplava) in support of the doubted cognition. In his opening comments on the Nyāya-sūtra, Vātsyāyana famously provides a pragmatic test (but not definition) of truth: cognitions which guide us to successful action are likely veridical.

iii. A Relational Theory of Cognition

Nyāya epistemologists speak of cognition (jñāna, buddhi, upalabdhi, pratyaya): generally immediate awareness states of what Nyāya understands to be a mind-independent external reality. In the case of apperception, one cognizesher own mental states. Ontologically, cognitions are considered properties (guṇas) of individual selves (ātmans). Memory dispositions, when triggered, generate cognition about the past. With a few exceptions, cognitions target things other than themselves.

For Nyāya, cognitions target their objects by means of a relation called “objecthood” (viṣayatā). Nyāya’s theory is thus not exactly representational, but relational. “Objecthood” minimally has a threefold structure (with the possibility of iteration) corresponding to three features of the external object in question: a portion of the cognition targets an object itself, a portion of the cognition targets a property of the object, and finally, a portion of the cognition targets the relationship between the object and its property. In cases of veridical cognition (pramā), the portion of cognition which targets a substantive and the portion which targets its property match up. Gaṅgeśa famously defines veridical cognition as “a cognitive state with predication content x about something in fact qualified by x” (Tattvacintāmaṇi, pramā-lakṣaṇa-vāda). Seeing a male human being as qualified by “man” would be a paradigm case of veridical cognition. Error is generally classified as a misfire of the property-scoping portion of cognition. In error, a substantive is indeed cognized, but the property which is targeted does not actually qualify the substantive in question. The cognition’s intentionality is bifurcated, so to speak, simultaneously scoping a substantive and a property which is in fact alien to it.

iv. Response to Skepticism

Nyāya is a staunchly anti-skeptical tradition of epistemology. While it does give an important role to doubt, which, as seen above, triggers reflection and philosophical review, it rejects the notion that doubt should be the starting place in philosophical reflection. Doubt itself should be motivated, as trust is a better default starting place in both ordinary life and philosophy. Pragmatically, Nyāya argues that the role of epistemology is to better hone our cognitive abilities in order to succeed in our life aims. But unrestricted doubt would undermine our ability to function on a basic level, and it therefore militates against the very point of epistemological inquiry. Theoretically, Nyāya argues that error and indeed doubt itself are conceptually parasitical on true cognition. Error and doubt only make sense against a background of true belief, and therefore reflection must start by taking putatively veridical cognition at face value. Allied to this is a strain of criticism that even the simple act of giving voice to skeptical arguments belays a philosopher’s dependence on knowledge sources, including the inductively-supported tie between words and their meanings, which a skeptic relies on to speak his case. Given that everyone, the skeptic included, relies on pramāṇas, they are to be given the lion’s share of default entitlement.

2. Metaphysics

Nyāya defends a realist and pluralist metaphysics of categories (padārthas, lit. “things denoted by words”), largely adapted, with some modifications, from its sister school Vaiśeṣika. The categories are substance, quality, action, universal, individuator, inherence and absence. They will be discussed individually below.

a. Substance (dravya), Including Self (ātman)

Substances are the bedrock of Nyāya/Vaiśeṣika metaphysics (hereafter, simply “Nyāya Metaphysics”), as other categories generally inhere within substances or are nested within properties that inhere within substances. Paradigmatic substances include the indestructible atoms of earth, water, air and fire; composite substances like pots and trees; inner “selves” (ātman) which are the eternal, reincarnating souls; and God, a unique ātman.

Naiyāyikas provide a number of arguments in support of a non-material self. A standard argument runs as follows: Things like desire, cognition, experiences of pleasure and pain and volition are qualities. All qualities inhere in substances. Therefore, there is a substance to which desire and the rest belong. This conclusion is then followed by an argument from elimination. None of the material elements like earth or water are the bearers of desire and the rest. Therefore, there must be a special, non-material substance, namely a self (see various commentaries on NS 1.1.10). This argument is bolstered by others meant to illustrate that the physical body, as a product of material elements cannot be the fundamental locus of conscious states.

Some of the richest debates in classical India take place between Nyāya and Buddhists over the reality of substances. The central concern of such debates is often the statusof individual selves—an important substance, to say the least. Famously, the Buddha declared that reality is “lacking a self” (anātman), and his followers develop a number of arguments which purport to illustrate this in two ways. (i) Diachronically: moment by moment, things are destroyed and new things arise, such that no substance (including selves) endures for longer than a moment. (ii) Synchronically: in a single moment, what we take to be wholes (including selves) are nothing more than heaps of micro-properties (illustrated by the famous chariot metaphor in The Questions of King Milinda.) The Buddhist position is that although there is no such thing as an enduring self, the need for moral continuity and other desiderata may be satisfied merely by the causal connections between events in a single causal stream which we refer to as a “person.”

Nyāya’s response is to defend the existence of substances generally and selves in particular. In defense of substances, it argues that composite substances have capacities beyond the mere collection of their parts (NS 2.1.35). Moreover, Nyāya argues that the Buddhist reduction, if carried out consistently, would lead to an absurdity. We can see composite substances, but we cannot seeentities like atoms, which exist below our perceptual threshold. But if substances are nothing but heaps of micro objects/properties, which themselves can be reduced, and so on, then we should not be able to perceive substances at all. Thus, there must be a unified identity for individual substances which undergirds their availability for perceptual experience (NS 2.1.36).

In defense of the diachronic existence of individual selves, Nyāya argues that our experience of recollection (“that is the very man I saw a week ago”) requires a locus of memory which spans the time between the initial experience and the re-experience of an object (NS 1.1.10 and allied commentaries). In this spirit, Uddyotakara, following Vātsyāyana, argues that if I am now a different self than the “me” of yesterday, I should not be able to recollect things which that “me” experienced, since one self is unable to recollect the content of another’s experience. In defense of the synchronic identity of selves, Nyāya argues that cross-modal recognition (“that thing I see is the same thing I am touching”) requires a single experiencer with the ability to synthesize data from various senses (NS 3.1.1-3). Early Nyāya’s arguments for the self find their apex in Udayana’s monograph Determining the Truth of the Self.

b. Quality

Qualities (guṇa), are property tropes which qualify substances. Unlike universals they are not repeatable. The red color of some particular fire hydrant is a quality. Like other instances of the color red it is inhered by the universal redness, but it is as particular as the hydrant which it qualifies. Qualities include color, number (which is thought to inhere in objects), spatial location, contact, disjunction, and so forth, along with qualities which are unique to selves, like desire, cognition, and karmic merit.

c. Action

Like qualities, actions (karma) inhere in substances and are non-repeatable tropes. But they have causal capacities which qualities lack, particularly the ability to engender conjunction and disjunction between substances.

d. Universal

Universals (sāmānya or jāti) inhere in substances (for examplepot-hood), qualities (redness) or motions (contractionhood). Naiyāyikas argue that universals are required to account for common experiences of a recurring character, for the functioning of language, andto undergird causal regularities in nature (which are held to be relations between universals). As its theory of universals is developed, Nyāya recognizes entities which are like universals, but which are, for theoretical reasons, excluded from their ranks (upādhi). Udayana would famously chart the reasons for such exclusion. These are: (i) A true universal must be capable of more than one instance. Spacehood would not be a true universal, as it can only have one instance. (ii) Two universals which have the same exact instances are in fact the same universal, simply under two designations. (iii) Should two apparent universals share an instance, while one is not entirely subsumed within the other, both are mere upādhis. This criterion, which is the most controversial of the “universal-blockers,” suggests that the operative notion of universal here is something akin to natural kinds. (iv) Any supposed universal that would, if accepted, lead to an infinite regress (for example universal-hood), is not accepted. (v) There is no universal for individuators (see below), as their ontic function is to introduce primitive differentiation. (vi) There is no universal for inherence (see below), as this would engender a vicious infinite regress: inherence would require further inherence between it and its universal “inherencehood”, and so on.

e. Inherence

Inherence is a relation which is central to Nyāya’s ontology, by which qualities, actions, universals, and individuators relate to substances, by which universals relate to qualities and actions, and by which wholes relate to their parts. In the first instance, the brown color of a cow inheres in the cow. In the second, the universal brownness inheres in the quality trope brown. In the third, my car, a substance, is a single entity, which inheres in its various parts. Thus, your touching just one part of my car is enough to justify the claim “you touched my car” simpliciter. Nyāya contends that inherence is a self-linking property. It does not rely on other instances of inherence in order to “glue” it to the two elements which it relates. Thus it seeks to rebut regress arguments of the type advanced by recently by F. H. Bradley and by the classical Vedāntin Śaṅkarācārya (c. 9th century C.E.) in classical India.

f. Individuator

Individuators are the finest-grained causes of ontological distinction. They are the means by which individual atoms within the basic kinds “earth”, “water”, and so forth, and by which individual selves are ultimately particularized. Individuators for Nyāya’s ontology may be conceived as roughly analogous to haecceities within Western philosophical discourse.

g. Absence

The ontological reality of absence, however attenuated, isaccepted by Nyāya in order to account for both linguistic practice involving negation and cognitive states which correctly ascertain non-existence of some kind.Vātsyāyana argues that the positive knowledge produced by a knowledge sourcegives immediate rise to knowledge of an absence insofar as one can reflect that if something was not made manifest at the time of the initial cognition (and provided that the thing in question is ordinarily cognizable), it was absent. Uddyotakara famously argues that negation is often perceptible: looking at my desk, I see the absence of a coffee mug, and such absence is “located” on the surface my desk. In this spirit, absence is generally thought of as a qualifier (viśeṣana) of some object or property, which is the qualificand (viśeṣya). The four basic kinds of absences accepted by Nyāya in its mature period are prior absence (of something before it is created), absence-by-destruction (of an object after it is destroyed), absolute absence (of something for some locus where it could never exist), and mutual absence (between two separately existing objects).

h. Causation

Naiyāyikas speak of a cause or causal condition as something which is necessarily antecedent to aspecific kind of effect without being “causally irrelevant”. Such causes are threefold. The (i) inherence cause, akin to a material cause, is the substratum out of which (or within which) an effect is made (the threads which together make up a cloth). The (ii) non-inherence cause includes properties of the inherence cause which influence the properties of the effect (the property of contact which inheres within the threads which make up a cloth). Finally, (iii), the instrumental/agential cause(s). This third category is a kind of catch-all which includes everything aside from the substratum and its properties. Central in this category are agents, their activities, and instruments used by then to produce effects. Out of the nexus of causal conditions which come together in the production of an effect, Naiyāyikas tend to speak of a most important factor as the trigger cause (for example the striking of a match against a rough surface which produces a lit match).

In order to weed out unnecessary or unimportant factors from the causal nexus which produces an effect, Nyāya includes the caveat that a proper cause must not be “causally irrelevant”. Causal irrelevance occurs in various ways. For example, something x which universally precedes a certain effect y, but whose relationship with the effect is mediated by some other factor z upon which it subsists is causally irrelevant. For example, a certain artist may create a unique kind of sculpture, and she is thus identified as a causal factor in its production. She may have certain properties (hair color, eye color, height) which also, by means of their subsisting in her, invariably precede the production of her sculptures. But since their participation in the causal event is derivative, they are deemed causally irrelevant and unworthy of being specified as causes.

3. Philosophy of Religion

Nyāya expressly conceives of itself as a rational defender of classical Hindu religious and theistic culture. Nyāya-sūtra begins by claiming that ascertainment of the ultimate good (niḥśreya) requires correct apprehension of reality, which gives rise to a sustained epistemological/metaphysical investigation of the kind the sūtras provide.Vātsyāyanaargues that as a discipline of inquiry, Nyāya is the support of all practices of legitimate dharma. Jayanta claims that amongst the various research programs in the umbrella of classical Vedic culture, Nyāya is of chief importance, since it aims to defend Vedic tradition and its manifold subdivisions of study from the attacks of rival, anti-Vedic philosophers. Though the Nyāya-sūtra overwhelmingly focuses on theoretical issues and not praxis, it nonetheless recommends that students of Nyāya engage in yogic practice (4.2.42) and defends the possibility of enlightenment (4.2.44-5).

From fairly early in its history, Nyāya specifically takes it upon itself to defend the existence of God (Īśvara). Nyāya primarily employs versions of the design inference. Paradigmatic arguments include:

Primordial matter, atoms and karma function when guided by a conscious agent because they are insentient (acetaṇatvāt) like an axe. As axes, due to insentience, operate only when directed by a sentient agent, so too do things like primordial nature, atoms and karma. Therefore, they too are directed by a cause possessed of intelligence. (Uddyotakara, NV 4.1.21)

Things like the earth have a maker as their cause, because they are products (kāryatvāt). (Udayana Nyāyakusumāñjali, Fifth Chapter)

With various formulations like the above, and extensive supporting arguments, Nyāya defends a version of the argument from design. Buddhist, Mīmāṁsā (and later, Jain) philosophers respond by charging Nyāya with violations of inferential boundaries: only by extrapolating far beyond the correlation between ordinary products and makers is Nyāya able to argue for a unique God-like maker of the world. A standard response, as seen in Vācaspati (NVT 4.1.21) is that even in straightforward general-to-particular inductive reasoning, we employ some degree of inference to the best explanation. This allows enough flexibility to infer new kinds of entities while appealing to correlations generated from ordinary experience.

4. References and Further Reading

a. Sanskrit Source Materials

  • JayantaBhaṭṭa. Nyāya-mañjarī. Critically Edited by Vidvan, K. S. Varadacarya.Vol 1. Mysore: Oriental Research Institute 1969.
  • JayantaBhaṭṭa. Nyāya-mañjarī. Critically Edited by Vidvan, K. S. Varadacarya.Vol 2. Mysore: Oriental Research Institute 1983.
  • Nyāya-Tarkatirtha, Taranatha and Amarendramohan Tarkatirtha, eds. Nyāyadarśanamwith Vātsyāyana’sBhāṣya [cited as NB above], Uddyotakara’s Vārttika[cited as NV], Vācaspati Miśra’s Tātparyaṭīkā [cited as NVT] & Viśvanātha’s Vṛtti. Calcutta: Munshiram Manoharlal 2003.
  • Udayana. Nyāyavārttikatātpāryaśuddhi of Udayanācārya. Edited by Anantalal Thakur. New Delhi: Indian Council of Philosophical Research.

b. Primary Texts in English Translation

  • Gangopadhyaya, Mrinalkanti, trans. Nyāya: Gautama’s Nyāya-sūtra with Vātsyāyana’s Commentary. Calcutta: Indian Studies 1982.
  • Iyer, S. R., Editor and Translator, Tarkabhāṣā of Keśava Miśra. Varanasi: Chaukhambha Orientalia, 1979.
  • JayantaBhaṭṭa. Nyāya-mañjarī. Translated by JanakiVallabhaBhattacaryya.Vol. 1. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass 1978.
  • Jha, Sir Ganganatha, trans. The Nyāya-sūtras of Gautama.Vols 1-4. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass 1999.
  • Phillips, Stephen and N. S. Ramanuja Tatacharya. Epistemology of Perception: Gaṅgeśa’s Tattvacintāmaṇi Jewel of Reflection on the Truth (About Epistemology), The Perception Chapter (pratyakṣa-khaṇḍa). New York: American Institute of Buddhist Studies 2004. [This also contains the Sanskrit text.]
  • Potter, Karl H., ed. Encyclopedia of Indian Philosophies.Vol. 2. Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass 1977. [This volume contains summary translations and helpful historical and conceptual introductions to early Nyāya and its individual philosophers.]
  • Udayana. Ātmatattvaviveka. Translation and commentary by N. S. Dravid.  Shimla: Indian Institute of Advanced Study 1995. [This also contains the Sanskrit text.]
  • Udayana. Nyāyakusumāñjali. Translation and commentary by N. S. Dravid. New Delhi: Indian Council of Philosophical Research 1996. [This also contains the Sanskrit text.]

c. Studies of Nyāya Epistemology, Metaphysics, and Philosophy of Religion in English

  • Bhattacaryya, Gopikamohan. Studies in Nyāya-vaiśeṣika Theism. Calcutta: Sanskrit College 1961.
  • Chakrabarti, Kisor Kumar. Classical Indian Philosophy of Mind: The Nyāya Dualist Tradition. Albany: State University of New York Press 1999.
  • Chemparathy, George. An Indian Rational Theology: Introduction to Udayana’s Nyāyakusumāñjali. Publications of the De Nobili Research Library, Vol. 1. Vienna: Gerold& Co.; Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass 1972.
  • Ghokale, Pradeep P. Inference and Fallacies Discussed in Ancient Indian Logic (with special reference to Nyāya and Buddhism). Bibliotheca Indo-Buddhica Series, Sunil Gupta, ed.Delhi: Sri Satguru Publications 1992.
  • Halbfass, Wilhelm. On Being and What There Is: Classical Vaiśeṣika and the History of Indian Ontology. Albany: State University of New York Press 1992. [Though this text focuses on Vaiśeṣika, it is relevant given the great overlap between Nyāya and Vaiśeṣika in metaphysical theory.]
  • Matilal, B. K. Perception. Oxford: Clarendon Press: Oxford 1986.
  • Matilal, B. K. The Character of Logic in India. Albany: SUNY Press 1998.

d. General Studies

  • Ganeri, Jonardon. Philosophy in Classical India: The Proper Work of Reason. London and New York: Routledge 2001.
  • Matilal, B. K. Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika. A History of Indian Literature, Vol. 6, Fasc. 2. Edited by Jan Gonda. Weisbaden: Otto Harrassowitz 1977.
  • Mohanty, J.N. Classical Indian Philosophy. Lanham: Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, Inc., 2000.
  • Phillips, Stephen. Classical Indian Metaphysics: Refutations of Realism and the Emergence of “New Logic.” Chicago: Open Court 1995.

Author Information

Matthew R. Dasti
Bridgewater State University
U. S. A.

Lokayata/Carvaka—Indian Materialism

In its most generic sense, “Indian Materialism” refers to the school of thought within Indian philosophy that rejects supernaturalism.  It is regarded as the most radical of the Indian philosophical systems.  It rejects the existence of other worldly entities such an immaterial soul or god and the after-life.  Its primary philosophical import comes by way of a scientific and naturalistic approach to metaphysics.  Thus, it rejects ethical systems that are grounded in supernaturalistic cosmologies.  The good, for the Indian materialist, is strictly associated with pleasure and the only ethical obligation forwarded by the system is the maximization of one’s own pleasure.

The terms Lokāyata and Cārvāka have historically been used to denote the philosophical school of Indian Materialism.  Literally, “Lokāyata” means philosophy of the people.  The term was first used by the ancient Buddhists until around 500 B.C.E. to refer to both a common tribal philosophical view and a sort of this-worldly philosophy or nature lore.  The term has evolved to signify a school of thought that has been scorned by religious leaders in India and remains on the periphery of Indian philosophical thought.  After 500 B.C.E., the term acquired a more derogatory connotation and became synonymous with sophistry.  It was not until between the 6th and 8th century C.E. that the term “Lokāyata” began to signify Materialist thought.  Indian Materialism has also been named Cārvāka after one of the two founders of the school.  Cārvāka and Ajita Kesakambalin are said to have established Indian Materialism as a formal philosophical system, but some still hold that Bṛhaspati was its original founder.  Bṛhaspati allegedly authored the classic work on Indian Materialism, the Bṛhaspati Sῡtra.  There are some conflicting accounts of Bṛhaspati’s life, but, at the least, he is regarded as the mythical authority on Indian Materialism and at most the actual author of the since-perished Bṛhaspati Sῡtra.  Indian Materialism has for this reason also been named “Bṛhaspatya.”

Table of Contents

  1. History
    1. Vedic Period
    2. Epic Period and Brāhmaṇical Systems
  2. Status in Indian Thought
    1. Contributions to Science
    2. Materialism as Heresy
  3. Doctrine
    1. Epistemology
    2. Ontology
    3. Cosmology
  4. Ethics
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1.  History

Traces of materialism appear in the earliest recordings of Indian thought.  Initially, Indian Materialism or Lokāyata functioned as a sort of negative reaction to spiritualism and supernaturalism.  During the 6th and 7th centuries C.E. it evolved into a formal school of thought and remains intact, though consistently marginalized.

a. Vedic Period

Vedic thought, in the most comprehensive sense, refers to the ideas contained within the Samhitas and the Brāhamaṇas, including the Upaniṣads.  Historians have estimated that the Vedas were written and compiled between the years 1500 B.C.E. and 300 B.C.E. It is difficult to point to one philosophical view in the Upaniṣads, at least by Western standards; however they are considered by scholars to comprise all of the philosophical writing of the Vedas.  The Vedas exemplify the speculative attitude of the ancient Indians, who had the extreme luxury of reflecting on the whence and whither of their existence.  The ancient Indians, also called Aryans, flourished due to the bounty of food and resources provided by the land.  Free from the burdens of political conflict and social upheaval, they were able to ponder the origin of the universe and the purpose of life.  Their meditations on such subjects have been recorded in the literature of the Vedas.

The Vedic period marked the weakest stage of the development of Indian Materialism.  In its most latent form, Materialism is evident in early Vedic references to a man who was known as Bṛhaspati and his followers.  The literature suggests that Bṛhaspati did not attempt to forward a constructive system of philosophy but rather characteristically refuted the claims of others schools of thought.  In this sense, followers of Bṛhaspati were not only skeptical but intentionally destructive of the orthodoxies of the time.  It is thought that any mention of “unbelievers” or “scoffers” in the Vedas refers to those who identified with Bṛhaspati and his materialist views.  Thus, Materialism in its original form was essentially anti-Vedic.  One of Bṛhaspati’s principal objections to orthodoxy was the practice of repeating verses of sacred texts without understanding their meaning.  However, Bṛhaspati’s ideas (“Bṛhaspatya”) would not become a coherent philosophical view without any positive import.  His followers eventually adopted the doctrine of “Svabhava,” which at this point in history signified the rejection of 1) the theory of causation and 2) the notion that there are good and evil consequences of moral actions.  “Svabhava” enhanced Bṛhaspatya by providing it with the beginnings of a metaphysical framework.  In the concluding portions of the Vedas there are violent tales of the opposition of the Bṛhaspatya people to the spiritualism of the time.  Interestingly, the following anecdote from the Taittiriya Brāhmaṇa implies that the gods were impervious to the destructive efforts of Bṛhaspati:

Once upon a time Bṛhaspati struck the goddess Gāyatrī on the head.  The head   smashed into pieces and the brain split.  But Gāyatrī is immortal.  She did not die.  Every bit of her brain was alive. (Dakshinaranjan, 12)

The term “Svabhava” in Sanskrit can be translated to “essence” or “nature.”  Bṛhaspati used the term to indicate a school of thought that rejected supernaturalism and the ethical teachings that followed from supernaturalist ideologies.  Bṛhaspati and his followers were scorned and ridiculed for not believing in the eternal nature of reality and for not revering the gods and the truths they were supposed to have espoused.  It is interesting to note that while other schools have incorporated the “Svabhava” as a doctrine of essences or continuity of the soul, the use of the term by Bṛhaspati was specifically meant to represent his association with the philosophical naturalism.  Naturalism, in this sense, rejects a Platonic notion of essences and the dualism that is exemplified in Platonic philosophy as well as some of the Indian spiritualistic schools.  This brand of dualism is that which asserts that there are two categorically different realms of reality: the material and the immaterial.  Supernaturalism in general embraces this doctrine and holds that the latter realm is not encompassed by “nature.”  In contrast to this, Naturalism rejects the existence of the immaterial realm and suggests that all of reality is encompassed by nature.  Widely varying schools of Naturalism exist today and do not necessarily embrace the mechanistic materialism that was originally embraced by the Cārvāka.

b. Epic Period and Brāhmaṇical Systems

The major work of the Epic Period of Indian history (circa 200 B.C.E. to 200 C.E.) is the Mahābhārata.  The Great War between the Kurus and the Pandavas inspired a many-sided conversation about morality.  Conversation developed into intellectual inquiry and religion began to be replaced by philosophy.  It was around the beginning of this period that the Bṛhaspati school began to merge with the philosophical naturalism of the time.  Naturalism rejected the existence of a spiritual realm and also rejected the notion that the morality of an action can cause either morally good or evil consequences.  Naturalist underpinnings helped to further shape Indian Materialism into a free-standing philosophical system.   The term Lokāyata replaced Bṛhaspatya and scholars have speculated that this was due to the desire for a distinction between the more evolved philosophical system and its weaker anti-Vedic beginnings.   The Lokāyata remained oppositional to the religious thought of the time, namely, Jainism and Buddhism, but it was also positive in that it claimed the epistemological authority of perception.  Furthermore, it attempted to explain existence in terms of the four elements (earth, air, fire, water).  While there is little certainty about the formal development of the Lokāyata school during the Epic Period, it is suspected that its adoption of naturalistic metaphysics led to its eventual association with scientific inquiry and rationalistic philosophy.  Materialism stood out as a doctrine because it rejected the theism of the Upaniṣadic teachings as well as the ethical teachings of Buddhism and Jainism.  It stood for individuality and rejected the authority of scripture and testimony.

The Lokāyata adopted its hedonistic values during the development of the Brāhmaṇical systems of philosophy (circa 1000 C.E.).  As a reaction against the ascetic and meditative practices of the religious devout, Indian Materialism celebrated the pleasures of the body.  People began gratifying their senses with no restraint.  Pleasure was asserted as the highest good and, according to the Lokāyata, was the only reasonable way to enjoy one’s life.  Some scholarship suggests that during this stage of its development Indian Materialism began to be referred to as “Cārvāka” in addition to the “Lokāyata.”  This is contrary to the more popular view that the school was named Cārvāka after its historical founder helped to establish the Lokāyata as a legitimate philosophy.  The term Cārvāka literally means “entertaining speech” and is derived from the term charva, which means to chew or grind with one’s teeth.  It is possible that Cārvāka himself acquired the name due to his association with Indian Materialism, which then led to the school acquiring the name as well.  This is one of many areas of the history of Indian Materialism that remains open to debate.

2.  Status is Indian Thought

The perceived value of Lokāyata from within the Indian Philosophical community is as relevant a topic as its philosophical import.  If nothing else, the etymology of the term Lokāyata is evidence of the consistent marginalization of Indian Materialism.  Because of its association with hedonistic behavior and heretical religious views, followers of the spiritualistic schools of Indian philosophy (Jainism, Buddhism, Hinduism) are reticent on the subject of the materialistic tendencies present in their own systems; however, some scholars, such as Daya Krishna, have suggested that materialism is, in varying degrees, present in all Indian philosophical schools.  This is not to say that materialism replaces other ideologies—it is to say rather that notions about the priority of this-worldliness appear even in some spiritualistic schools.  While matter does not take priority over the spiritual realm in every sense, its significance is elevated more so than in other major world religions.  This observation, for some, carries little weight when examining the philosophical import of the various Indian schools of thought; however, it seems relevant when considering the evolution of Indian thought.  The original meaning of Lokāyata as prevalent among the people has become true in the sense that it is pervasive in Indian philosophical thought at large.  This is not to say that materialism is widely accepted or even that its presence is overtly acknowledged, but it is difficult to deny its far-reaching influence on Indian Philosophy as a whole.

a. Contributions to Science

The most significant influence that Materialism has had on Indian thought is in the field of science.  The spread of Indian Materialism led to the mindset that matter can be of value in itself.  Rather than a burden to our minds or souls, the Materialist view promoted the notion that the body itself can be regarded as wondrous and full of potential.  Evidence in this shift in perspective can be seen by the progress of science over the course of India’s history.  Materialist thought dignified the physical world and elevated the sciences to a respectable level.  Moreover, the Materialist emphasis on empirical validation of truth became the golden rule of the Scientific Method.  Indian Materialism pre-dated the British Empiricist movement by over a millennium.  Whereas the authority of empirical evidence carried little weight in Ancient India, modern thought began to value the systematic and cautious epistemology that first appeared in the thought of the Lokāyata.

b. Materialism as Heresy

Regardless of its positive influence on Indian thought, the fact remains that Indian Materialism is often regarded as blatant heresy against the Spiritualistic schools.  It rejects the theism of Hinduism as well as the moralism of Buddhist and Jain thought.  The anti-orthodox claims of the Materialists are seen as heretical by the religious masses and fly in the face of the piety promoted by most religious sects.  However, it is questionable whether the formal ethics of Materialism are truly practiced to their logical extent by those who claim to belong to the school.  It is suspected by many scholars that Indian Materialism today stands for an atheistic view that values science in place of supernaturalism.  More than anything, Materialists have historically expressed a view that has not found favor among the established religious and social authorities.

3.  Doctrine

There are no existing works that serve as the doctrinal texts for the Lokāyata.  The available materials on the school of thought are incomplete and have suffered through centuries of deterioration.  Mere fragments of the Bṛhaspati Sῡtra remain in existence and because of their obscure nature provide little insight into the doctrine and practices of ancient Indian Materialists.  Clues about the history of Indian Materialism have been pieced together to formulate at best a sketchy portrayal of how the “philosophy of the people” originated and evolved over thousands of years.

a. Epistemology

Epistemological thought varies in Indian philosophy according to how each system addresses the question of “Pramānas” or the “sources and proofs of knowledge.”  (Mittal 41)  The Lokāyata (Cārvāka) school recognized perception (pratkaysa) alone as a reliable source of knowledge.  They therefore rejected two commonly held pramānas: 1) inference (anumana) and 2) testimony (sabda).  Because of its outright rejection of such commonly held sources of knowledge, the Lokāyata was not taken seriously as a school of philosophy.  The common view was that Cārvākas merely rejected truth claims and forwarded none of their own.  To be a mere skeptic during the time amounted to very low philosophical stature.

However, there are additional accounts of the Lokāyata that suggest that the epistemology was more advanced and positivistic than that of mere skepticism.  In fact, it has been compared to the empiricism of John Locke and David Hume.  The Cārvākas denied philosophical claims that could not be verified through direct experience.  Thus, the Lokāyata denied the validity of inferences that were made based upon truth claims that were not empirically verifiable.  However, logical inferences that were made based on premises that were derived from direct experience were held as valid.  It is believed that this characterization of the epistemology of the Lokāyata most accurately describes the epistemological position of contemporary Indian Materialism.

Cārvākas were, in a sense, the first philosophical pragmatists.  They realized that not all sorts of inference were problematic; in order to proceed through daily life inference is a necessary step.  For practical purposes, the Lokāyata made a distinction between inferences made based on probability as opposed to certainty.  The common example used to demonstrate the difference is the inference that if smoke is rising from a building it is probably an indication that there is a fire within the building.  However, Cārvākas were unwilling to accept anything beyond this sort of mundane use of inference, such as the mechanical inference forwarded by the Buddhists.  The Lokāyata refused to accept inferences about what has never been perceived, namely god or the after-life.

b. Ontology

The ontology of the Lokāyata rests on the denial of the existence of non-perceivable entities such as God or spiritual realm.  Critics of this school of thought point to the fallacy of moving from the premise “the soul cannot be known” to the conclusion “the soul does not exist.”  Again, there is a pragmatic tendency in this sort of thinking.  It seems that followers of the Lokāyata were not concerned with truths that could not be verified; however they were not entirely skeptical.  The Lokāyata posited that the world itself and all material objects of the world are real.  They held that all of existence can be reduced to the four elements of air, water, fire and earth.  All things come into existence through a mixture of these elements and will perish with their separation.  Perhaps the most philosophically sophisticated position of Indian Materialism is the assertion that even human consciousness is a material construct.  According to K. K. Mittal, the ontology of the Lokāyata is strictly set forth as follows:

  1. Our observation does not bring forth any instance of a disincarnate consciousness. For the manifestation of life and consciousness, body is an inalienable factor.
  2. That body is the substratum of consciousness can be seen in the undoubted fact of the arising of sensation and perception only in so far as they are conditioned by the bodily mechanism.
  3. The medicinal science by prescribing that certain foods and drinks (such as Brāhmighrta) have the properties conducive to the intellectual powers affords another proof and evidence of the relation of consciousness with body and the material ingredients (of food).  (Mittal 47)

Mittal reports (ibid.), apparently two schools of thought within the Lokāyata arose out of these tenets.  One forwarded the position that there can be no self or soul apart from the body; another posited that a soul can exist alongside a body as long as the body lives, but that the soul perishes with the body.  The latter view adopted the position that the soul is pure air or breath, which is a form of matter.  Therefore, the Lokāyata collectively rejects the existence of an other-worldly soul, while sometimes accepts the notion of a material soul.

c. Cosmology

To speculate as to why the universe exists would be an exercise in futility for an Indian Materialist.  The purpose and origin of existence is not discoverable through scientific means.  Furthermore, the speculation about such matters leads to anxiety and frustration, which reduce pleasure and overall contentment.  There is no teleology implicit in Indian Materalism, which is evidenced in the school’s position that the universe itself probably came into existence by chance.  Although there can be no certainty about the origin of the universe, the most probable explanation is that it evolved as a result of a series of random events.

There is also no doctrine of Creation in the Lokāyata.  The principles of karma (action) and niyati (fate) are rejected because they are derived from the notion that existence in itself is purposeful.  The fundamental principle of Indian Materialism was and remains “Svabhava” or nature.  This is not to suggest that nature itself has no internal laws or continuity.  It would be a misinterpretation of Indian Materialism to suppose that it forwards a cosmology of chaos.  Rather, it resembles most closely the naturalism forwarded by the American philosopher John Dewey.  While it posits no “creator” or teleology, Indian Materialism regards nature itself as a force that thrives according to its own law.

4. Ethics

The most common view among scholars regarding the ethic of Indian Materialism is that it generally forwards Egoism.  In other words, it adopts the perspective that an individual’s ends take priority over the ends of others.  Materialists are critical of other ethical systems for being tied to notions of duty or virtue that are derived from false, supernaturalist cosmologies.  Indian Materialism regards pleasure in itself and for itself as the only good and thus promotes hedonistic practices.  Furthermore, it rejects a utilitarian approach to pleasure.  Utilitarianism regards pleasure (both higher and lower) as the ultimate good and therefore promotes the maximization of the good (pleasure) on a collective level.  Indian Materialism rejects this move away from pure egoism.  The doctrine suggests that individuals have no obligation to promote the welfare of society and would only tend to do so if it were to ultimately benefit them as well.

It is interesting to note that the Cārvāka school has been maligned by virtually all schools of Indian philosophy not merely for its rejection of the supernatural but probably more so for its insistent rejection of anything beyond Egoistic ethics.  In fact, some scholars hold that Indian Materialism is purely nihilistic.  That is to say that an Egoistic or Hedonistic ethic are not even essential elements of the system, but certainly serve as accurate descriptions for the held values and practices of the Cārvāka people.  This view holds that the axiology of the Cārvāka was purely negative.  It claims nothing more than the rejection of both what we think of now as a Platonic notion of “The Good” along with any notion of “god” or “gods.”

The term “nāstika” is used by almost all schools of Indian Philosophy as a critical term to refer to another school of thought that has severely breached what is thought to be acceptable in terms of both religious beliefs and ethical values.  The greatest recipient of this term is the Cārvāka school.  Commonly degraded to the same degree, the term “Cārvāka” and the more general term “nāstika” are sometimes used interchangeably simply to denote a brand of thinking that does not fall in line with the classical schools of Indian thought.  The chief insult that is imported by the term “nāstika” is that the recipient of the title has strayed dangerously away from a path toward enlightenment.  Ethical practices and one’s spiritual education in Indian culture are inextricably tied to one another.  Those who identify with the Indian Materialist school are criticized by the prominent Indian philosophical schools of thought because they are viewed as largely ignorant of both metaphysical and moral truths.  This sort of ignorance is not perceived as a grave threat to the greater good of society, but rather to the individual who is bereft of spiritual and moral knowledge.  That Indian Philosophy as a whole shows concern for the individual beliefs and practices of its members is in stark contrast to the cultural and individual relativism that is largely embraced by the West.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Gunaratna. Tarkarahasyadīpika. Cārvāka/Lokāyata: an Anthology of Source Materials and Some Recent Studies. Ed. Debiprasad Chattopadhyaya. New Delhi: Indian Council of Philosophical Research in association with Rddhi-India Calcutta, 1990.
  • The Mahābhārata. Trans. and Ed. James L. Fitzgerald.  Chicago: Chicago  University Press, 2004.
  • The Rāmāyaṇa of Vālmīki : an Epic of Ancient India.  Ed. Robert Goldman and Sally J. Sutherland.  Trans. Robert Goldman.  Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1984.
  • The Hymns of the Rgveda. Ed. Jagdish L. Shastri.  Trans. Ralph T. H. Griffith.  New Revised Edition.  Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1973.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Chattopadhyaya, Debiprasad.  Lokāyata; a Study in Ancient Materialism. Bombay: People’s Publishing House, 1959.
  • Daksinaranjan, Sastri.  A Short History of Indian Materialism.  Calcutta: The Book Company, Ltd., 1957.
  • Dasgupta, Surendranath.  A History of Indian Philosophy.  Vol. V.  Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1955.
  • Flint, Robert.  Anti-theistic theories: being the Baird lecture for 1877. Edinburgh and London: W. Blackwood and Sons, 1879.
  • Garbe, Richard.  The Philosophy of Ancient India.  Chicago: Open Court Publishing Company, 1899.
  • Grimes, John A.  A Concise Dictionary of Indian Philosophy: Sanskrit Terms Defined in English. New and Revised Edition.  Albany: State University of New York Press, 1996.
  • Halbfass, Wilhelm. Tradition and Reflection: Explorations in Indian Thought. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 1991.
  • Hopkins, Edward Washburn.  Ethics of India.  New Haven: Yale University Press, 1924.
  • Mittal, Kewal Krishan.  Materialism in Indian Thought.  New Delhi: Munihiram Manoharlal Publishers Pvt. Ltd., 1974.
  • Radhakrishnan, Sri.  Indian Philosophy. Vols. I & II.  New York: Macmillan, 1927-1929.
  • Raju, P. T. The Philosophical Traditions of India.  Pittsburgh: University of Pittsburgh Press, 1972.
  • Raju, P. T.  Structural Depths of Indian Thought. Albany, NY: State University of New York  Press, 1985.
  • Ranganathan, Shyam.  Ethics and The History of Indian Philosophy. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass Publishers Pvt. Ltd., 2007.
  • Sharma, Ishwar Chandra.  Ethical philosophies of India. Lincol, NE: Johnsen Publishing Company, 1965.
  • Smart, Ninian.  Doctrine and Argument in Indian Philosophy.  London: Allen and Unwin, 1964.
  • Vanamamalai, N.  “Materialist Thought in Early Tamil Literature.” Social Scientist, 2.4 (1973): 25-41.

Author Information

Abigail Turner-Lauck Wernicki
Holy Family University
U. S. A.


Tibetan Philosophy

The term “Tibet” refers to a geographic area around the Himalayan mountains and the culture which originated there.  Tibetan thought is a living tradition of rigorous argumentation, psychological insights, and philosophically relevant ideas concerning metaphysics, epistemology, ethics, and moral psychology.  It has a rigorous and formal system of philosophical debate and a wealth of meditative traditions, both of which provide insights for the nature of reality, the self, and truth.

Though it is strongly influenced by earlier Indian Buddhist philosophy, it offers a range of perspectives on these issues and presents many insights and practices of its own.  This article will provide an overview of topics that have been influential in Tibetan thought and attempt to emphasize topics that are indigenously Tibetan or have been significantly developed by Tibetan thinkers.  It is important to keep in mind that Tibetan intellectual culture often treats innovation differently than that of the West.  When a thinker comes up with a new distinction, argument, or practice it is likely to be attributed to an older, often Indian, source for various reasons including (but by no means limited to) modesty, authority, loyalty, or admiration.

Though this article avoids assuming a background knowledge of Buddhism, an understanding of the basic ideas and worldview of Buddhism, in particular Mahāyāna Buddhism, is essential for understanding Tibetan philosophy.

The italicized parenthetical terms are Tibetan unless otherwise noted and they are transliterated using the Wylie system.  They are not meant to be essential for understanding the ideas of the article and are provided to avoid the confusion caused by different writers using different English glosses.


Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
    1. The Tibetan cultural sphere
      1. Language and Geography
      2. Religions
    2. Philosophy
      1. Religion and Philosophy
      2. Tibetan Debate
  2. Metaphysics and Epistemology
    1. Mādhyamaka and Yogācāra
    2. The Doctrine of the Two Truths
    3. Contemplative Practices
  3. Ethics and Moral Psychology
    1. Mahāyāna Buddhist Ethics
      1. The Bodhisattva Ideal
      2. Mismatched Categories
    2. Tibetan Emphases and Innovations
      1. Elegant Sayings
      2. The Stages of the Path
      3. Mind Training
  4. References and Further Reading


1. Introduction

a. The Tibetan Cultural Sphere

i. Language and Geography

The term “Tibetan” refers to a cultural sphere that includes not only the present day Tibetan Autonomous Region, but also parts of Sichuan, Yunnan, Gansu, and Qinghai provinces of the People’s Republic of China as well as areas of Nepal, Bhutan, and northern India.  Though the spoken language of Tibetan in these areas is quite diverse (and often mutually unintelligible), they share a common written heritage of literature, poetry, song, and philosophical texts.  However, Tibetan philosophy is very much a living tradition with a variety of philosophical views and topical emphases.

ii. Religions

Buddhism has had a profound influence on Tibetan thought and culture.  Buddhism began to gain influence in Tibet after it became favored by king Songtsän Gampo around 641 CE.  However, there is also an indigenous Tibetan religion known as Bön (bon). Despite a somewhat competitive history, Bön and Buddhism have influenced each other greatly, making it difficult to draw a clear distinction between the two.

Today there are four main sects of Tibetan Buddhism.  The difference between sects is not always purely philosophical but often involves which practices, lineage masters, and texts they emphasize and also which translations they use.  The four major sects are:

  1. Nyingma (rnying ma) “Ancient”
  2. Sakya (sa skya) “White Earth”
  3. Kagyu (bka’ brgyud) “Oral Transmission”
  4. Gelug (dge lugs) “Way of Virtue”

The Gelug, the sect of the Dalai Lamas, came to hold the majority of the political power from the seventeenth century onward.  Since the late nineteenth century a non-sectarian movement (ris med) encouraged by the current Dalai Lama has become popular and fostered a more open approach between sects and a mixing of practices.

The texts of Tibetan Buddhist Canon are divided into two sections.  The “Translated Words” or the Kangyur (bka’ ‘gyur), which are texts that are said to be the teaching of the Buddha and the “Translated Teachings” or the Tengyur (bstan ‘gyur), which are treatises and commentaries written by Indian and Tibetan authors.

b. Philosophy

i. Religion and Philosophy

Unlike Western Philosophy since the Enlightenment, there is no rigid separation between religion and philosophy in Tibetan thought.  This does not mean that Tibetan philosophy is essentially non-rational or superstitious in nature and should not preclude philosophical interest; not anymore than references to Apollo in Plato or God in Descartes prevents philosophers from finding interesting philosophical theses in their works.  However, this lack of separation between the religious and philosophical does mean that a modern reader must keep in mind that Tibetan thinkers are likely to have aims and motives outside those usually found in Western philosophy.

Being overwhelmingly Buddhist in nature, Tibetan philosophy has a soteriological aim; one engages in philosophical investigation not only to gain an understanding of the world, but so that such an understanding can aid in eliminating suffering. For Buddhists, all human suffering arises from misunderstanding the nature of the world; through study and philosophical reflection one can come to have a better grasp of the nature of reality —particularly of suffering and its causes.  When one understands this, one can avoid much suffering by beginning to act and cultivate dispositions that are in accord with reality.  Modern philosophical theorizing in the West is commonly thought to aim at discovering the nature of reality or of the best way to live.  However, such theorizing does not often include the aim of integrating such a view of reality into everyday actions or cultivating one’s own dispositions so as to actually live in the best way possible.  For Tibetans and the Buddhist tradition more generally, since the goal of philosophical investigation is to produce a practical result, one deals not only with questions like “What is the best way to act?” but also “How can I come to act that way?”

ii. Tibetan Debate

The distinctive form of Tibetan debate (rtsod pa) plays an important part of philosophical investigations in Tibetan intellectual communities.  It is central in the Gelug sect, in particular those earning their kenpo (mkhan po) degrees, though it is also practiced in other sects to varying degrees.  The practice involves a seated defender (dam bca’ ba) and a standing challenger (rigs lam pa).  The roles are quite different; the defender must assert a thesis and attempts to defend its truth.  The challenger, however, asks questions in an attempt to get the defender to accept statements that are contradictory (for example, both “all colors are white” and “there is a color that is red”) or absurd (for example, “the color of a white religious conch shell is red”).  The challenger is not held responsible for the truth content of the questions; like someone raising an objection at a lecture, the challenger does not have to assert any thesis, but only aims to show that the defender is mistaken.

The debate begins with the challenger invoking Mañjuśrī, the bodhisattva of wisdom.  This invocation is variously interpreted, but can be seen most generally as a reminder to the debaters that they are aiming at wisdom, at finding out the truth about the subject.  The challenger then sets the topic of debate by asking a question to which the defender replies and reveals his thesis. The challenger may ask questions to clarify the defender’s thesis or establish common assumptions or simply begin the debate.  During the debate, the challenger raises questions of a particular form; a complete question is one that contains a subject, predicate, and a reason.  For example, the question “(Do you agree that) the subject, Socrates, is mortal because of being a man (?)” ascribes a predicate (being mortal) to the subject (Socrates) in virtue of a reason (being a man).  When an element is omitted or ambiguous, the defender is allowed to clarify, but upon receiving a complete question, the defender has three possible replies:

  1. “I accept” (’dod)
  2. “The reason is not established” (rtags ma grub)
  3. “It does not pervade” (ma khyab)

If the defender thinks that the proposed relationship between the subject, predicate, and reason holds, then she responds with “I accept.”  When the subject does not correspond to the reason, the defender asserts that the reason is not established. For example, “Socrates is mortal because of being an elephant” would warrant this reply because the reason, being an elephant, does not apply to the subject, Socrates.  The denial of pervasion, a Tibetan innovation that is not found in earlier Indian Buddhist debate system of Dharmakīrti, claims that the reason does not entail the predicate.  There are two kinds of failures of pervasion — one of uncertainty (ma nges pa) and one of contradiction or exclusion (’gal pa).  “Socrates is a philosopher because of being a man” is uncertain because some but not all men are philosophers; the reason, being a man, does not entail the predicate, being a philosopher. “Socrates is a reptile because of being a man” is contradictory because the terms “men” and “reptile” are exclusive; there are no men that are reptiles.

2. Metaphysics and Epistemology

a. Mādhyamaka and Yogācāra

Metaphysics and epistemology in Tibet are deeply rooted in Indian Mahāyāna Buddhist philosophy.  A focal question concerns what, if anything, has an intrinsic, unchanging essence or nature (Sanskrit: svabhāva)?  One may ask about a chair or one’s self if there is some intrinsic chair-ness or self-ness to be found. The two major schools that came to Tibet from Indian Mahāyāna Buddhism, Yogācāra (the “Mind Only” school) and Mādhyamaka (the “Middle Way” school) provide somewhat different answers to this.

The Yogācāra school, associated with Vasubandhu and his half-brother Asaṅga, replies that awareness or consciousness is the only thing with an intrinsic essence.  The general idea is that while what we perceive as reality might not have an intrinsic nature, the awareness that we have of the flow of such perceptions does have such a nature.  This school is sometimes compared with German Idealism in the West.

The Mādhyamaka school, founded by Nāgārjuna, denies that anything has an unchanging essence; this is known as the Doctrine of Emptiness (Sanskrit: śūnyatā).  To say that all phenomena are empty is to say that they are empty of a stable and unconditioned essence — tables have no intrinsic table-ness and selves have no intrinsic self-ness. This may sound extreme, but Mādhyamaka sees itself as being a middle way between the extremes of positing an entity with an eternal essence and the nihilistic denial of any existence at all (to say a chair lacks an unchanging essence is not to say that it does not exist at all).  Though the Mādhyamaka view, championed by the Gelug sect, is often seen in Tibet as the higher teaching, both Yogācāra and Mādhyamaka ideas are present.

Within the Mādhyamaka school there is a distinction over the proper method of discourse with non-Mādhyamaka philosophers, specifically whether or not it is appropriate to make positive assertions in debate. The Svātantrika view, associated with Bhāvaviveka, permits the use of assertions and independent syllogisms in debate. However, the Prāsaṅgika view, attributed to Chandrakīrti and Buddhapālita, permits only the use of logical consequences, a kind of negative method of reductio ad absurdum to establish the Mādhyamaka view in debate.  Anything else, they contend, would give the impression that they accept the unconditioned essence of any of the topics under debate.  This method has been compared with that of Wittgenstein (at least the Wittgenstein of the Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus) and the Skeptics of ancient Greece.

It is important to note that this distinction is an indigenous Tibetan one; there is no evidence of either of the terms being used by Indian Mādhyamaka philosophers. The Sanskrit terms Prāsaṅgika and Svātantrika are inventions of Western scholars to translate the Tibetan terms rang rgyud pa (the Autonomists or Svātantrika) and thal ’gyur pa (the Consequentialists or Prāsaṅgika).  Through the influence of the immensely important Gelug thinker Tsongkhapa, the Prāsaṅgika became the more influential view in Tibet. A clear and accessible entry point to these issues can be found in Jamgön Mipham’s Introduction to the Middle Way.

b. The Doctrine of the Two Truths

A seminal concept in Mādhyamaka thought, and in Mahāyāna Buddhism generally, is the idea that there are two truths: a conventional or nominal truth (Sanskrit: saṃvṛti-satya) and an ultimate truth (Sanskrit: paramārtha-satya).  The idea is similar to Berkeley’s dictum that we think with the learned, but speak with the vulgar; we can accept certain conventions without thinking them to be ultimately real.  The notion can be understood epistemically or metaphysically; the term rendered here as “truth” (Sanskrit: satya, Tibetan: bden pa) can mean “true” in the sense of a true proposition but also “real” in the sense of something actually existing in the way that it appears. Suppose one were to stumble upon a friend watching a Felix the Cat cartoon ask him what is happening. The friend is likely to reply with something like, “Felix just got hit on the head with a hammer and he’s mad.” The reply is conventionally true; the question was asked from within a system of conventions — one that assumes there are entities called characters that can perform actions and feel emotions — and the reply is true within those conventions. When pressed, both may well admit that the ultimate truth is quite different; in fact there is no Felix, simply a series of lines organized in a certain way so as to create drawings that bear a resemblance to a cat, which, when shown in rapid succession create the visual illusion of actions, events, and emotions. This is the ultimate truth about what is really happening, but to reply in this way would be both impolite and pragmatically unhelpful. The view has some affinities with fictionalism in Western philosophy in that both acknowledge some value in claims that are metaphysically ungrounded.

For the Mādhyamaka philosopher, talk of physical objects, persons, causes, and all other phenomena is true only in the conventional sense. One issue of debate in Tibet has been the relationship between the Two Truths. A radical view advocated in the fourteenth century by Dolpopa claims that the Two Truths are completely separate, advocating a doctrine called Emptiness of Other (gzhan stong) — the ideal that emptiness itself has a stable and unchanging nature.  The prevailing view, advocated by Tsongkhapa and the Gelug tradition, proposes a deep unity between the two truths. This view holds the distinction between the conventional and ultimate reality to be itself merely conventional, a doctrine called Emptiness of Self (rang stong). On this view, the property of lacking an essential nature is nothing more than a conventional designation (for more on this see Kapstein 2001 pp.221ff). The idea that emptiness itself is not an ultimately real property — the emptiness of emptiness — is taken to be paradoxical to varying degrees (see Garfield 1995 pp. 319-321 and Hayes 1994) and it is said to be one of the most difficult and subtle points in Mādhyamaka philosophy.

The Two Truths are especially important when one keeps in mind the soteriological aim of Buddhist philosophy; it allows a place for teachings that are not strictly speaking true, but benefit the student. The language used in Tibetan to translate “conventional truth” reflects this; the most common terms, both translated into English as “conventional” are tanyé (tha snyad) and kundzob (kun rdzob). The former means simply a mental label for something, a conventional sign for communications, while the latter, kundzob, means something that obscures, hides, or fakes. The distinction suggests two sorts of conventional truth; those that obscure the ultimate truth and those that do not. This finds support in common sense as some false speech is used to obscure reality, as in that of political spinsters, while other false speech is used to illuminate a truth about reality, such as telling a fictional story to teach a truth about human psychology. This distinction is explained in greater detail at Garfield (2002) pp.60ff, where he notes that emptiness itself is conventional in the illuminating tanyé sense, but not in the concealing kundzob sense.

c. Contemplative Practices

There are also more meditative practices that allow the meditator to experience the emptiness of phenomena in a more direct way. One tradition, associated with the Kagyu sect and known in Sanskrit as Mahāmudrā (Tibetan: phyag rgya chen po) meaning “The Great Seal”). Another tradition known as Dzogchen (rdzogs chen) or “The Great Perfection” has its roots in the Bön and Nyingma traditions.  These practices tend to emphasize first-hand experience and the relationship with a qualified teacher.

The core of these practices involves close observation of the mind at rest and during the arising and passing of thoughts and emotions. Through this kind of meditation one comes to see one’s own true nature (ngo rang) and directly experience emptiness. These mediations are often described with language suggesting spontaneity, immediacy, and ineffability — a non-conceptual and non-dualistic awareness of reality, which is taken to be in some sense perfect as it is. To many, these features evoke affinities with mysticism that put it outside the purview of modern Analytic philosophy, though epistemological issues like introspection, phenomenology, and the limits of language are relevant.

3. Ethics and Moral Psychology

The ethics of Tibetan philosophy is inextricably linked to Buddhist ethics, in particular the ideas of Mahāyāna Buddhism.  The Mahāyāna Buddhist tradition is far too varied and vast to be adequately covered here, so what follows is a small sampling of some of the issues that have received a good deal of attention in Tibetan thought and some of the indigenous Tibetan innovations.

a. Mahāyāna Buddhist Ethics

i. The Bodhisattva Ideal

A concept central to the distinction between Mahāyāna (“The Greater Vehicle”) and the earlier Therevāda (“The School of the Elders”) Buddhism is that of the Bodhisattva. The term “bodhisattva” (literally “enlightenment-being”) in the older Pāli literature is used to describe the Buddha before he became enlightened. There is a collection of stories of the Buddha’s previous lives, known as the Jātaka Tales, which describe how the Buddha of our time behaved in his previous lives as an animal, human, or other creature. The tales teach a moral by describing the selfless and virtuous actions of the Buddha-to-be and in these tales he is called a bodhisattva. The ideal, however, in Therevāda Buddhism is one who is awakened and escaped suffering — a Buddha.

In Mahāyāna Buddhism the Bodhisattva began to take on a more central role as a spiritual and ethical ideal. Bodhisattvas, rather than becoming enlightened and escaping the sufferings of this world, choose to forgo their own enlightenment and remain in this world in order to relieve the suffering of others. The idea is rooted in earlier Indian thought, such as the classic, Way of the Bodhisattva (Sanskrit: Bodhicaryāvatāra) by Śāntideva, the emphasis on the Bodhisattva figure and the ideal of selfless compassion are central to ethics in Tibet as well. Scores of texts composed in Tibetan praise the Bodhisattva and their motives (Sanskrit: bodhicitta) from Thogmé Zangpo’s Thirty-Seven Practices of Bodhisattvas (Tibetan: rgyal sras lag len so bdun ma) to the more recent Vast as the Heavens, Deep as the Sky (Tibetan: byang chub sems kyi bstod pa rin chen sgron ma) by Khunu Rinpoche.

ii. Mismatched Categories

Modern scholars disagree about the most accurate way to view Buddhist ethics in terms of the standard Western ethical categories. Buddhist ethics seems to have affinities with all of the major ethical theories in the West. Its emphasis on the elimination of suffering is similar to Utilitarian theories like that of Jeremy Bentham, its emphasis on a universal outlook is similar to the Kantian claims about the categorical imperative, and its Bodhisattva seems similar to the sort of ideal agents imagined in Virtue Ethics.

Naturally, there are problems with each interpretation.  It is not clear that the Utilitarian framework can account for the intrinsic value given to certain motivations and the intrinsic value given to skillful actions; for example, one might think that skillful actions (Sanskrit: kuśala) lead to the elimination of suffering because they are right, not vice versa. It is also not clear that a Kantian framework can accommodate the central role of compassion and sympathy and given the importance of the consequences of actions given in Buddhist ethics, the Kantian framework seems ill-fitting.

The view championed by Damien Keown is a characterization of Buddhist ethics in terms of Aristotelian virtue ethics. For Aristotle, one develops certain character traits so that one may achieve flourishing (Greek: eudaimonia).  Similarly, argues Keown, the bodhisattva develops certain traits with the goal of achieving freedom from suffering (Sanskrit: nirvana). The argument claims that flourishing and freedom both function as a goal for which the development of good traits is cultivated. But many scholars, famously Peter Harvey, claim that Buddhist ethics cannot be placed entirely in any single Western category.  Instead, they see Buddhist ethics as being best understood as having similarities with each, though not exclusively falling into any particular one.

b. Tibetan Emphases and Innovations

i. Elegant Sayings

A popular genre of ethical advice in Tibet is that of Legshé (legs bshad) or “Elegant Sayings.” These are related to the Indian subhāṣita format and are unusually secular in content for Tibetan literature. They are in verse form, usually with four line stanzas with seven syllables per line. Commonly studied in schools and memorized, these are very popular among Tibetans and often familiar to non-scholars.

The most popular of these texts, The Elegant Sayings of Sakya Paṇḍita (sa skya legs bshad) was composed by Sakya Paṇḍita, an important figure in the Sakya sect around the Thirteenth century. The content often concerns the traits and conduct of wise (mkhas pa), noble (ya rabs) and foolish (blun po) people along with other advice regarding common human problems and tendencies. The advice is often juxtaposed with a metaphor or similar case from everyday life.  For example, regarding determining who is wise, Sakya Paṇḍita writes:

Without questioning a wise person,

One cannot measure their depth.

Without striking a drum with a stick,

One cannot distinguish it from other drums.

Important topics include the best attitude towards achievement and failure, praise and blame, wealth, anger, and work (among others). Sakya Paṇḍita’s text inspired many similar texts, popularly Virtuous Good Advice (dge ldan legs bshad) by Panchan Sonam Drakpa, which is quite similar to Sakya Paṇḍita’s text and A Treatise on Water and Wood (chu shing bstan bcos) by Gung Thang Tenpé Dronmé, which uses only forest and water imagery. A more detailed introduction to Legshé literature and a translation of Sakya Paṇḍita’s text can be found in John Davenport’s Ordinary Wisdom.

ii. The Stages of the Path

A conceptual frame that became important in Tibet is the idea of stages on the path to enlightenment (lam rim). Its roots are in the Indian Buddhist idea of Bodhisattva Stages (Sanskrit: bodhisattva-bhumi) though the notion took hold through the Bengali monk Atiśa, who was invited to Tibet to clarify the teachings early in the eleventh century. In his Lamp for the Path to Enlightenment (byang chub lam gyi sgron ma), Atiśa distinguishes three kinds of persons/abilities (skyes bu gsum):

  1. Person of Small Ability (skyes bu chung ba)
  2. Person of Intermediate Ability (skyes bu ’bring ba)
  3. Person of Great Ability (skyes bu chen po)

Those of Small Ability can seek only worldly pleasures and are concerned with their own happiness and their future well-being. Those of Intermediate Ability are able to reject worldly pleasures, but seek to end only their own suffering.  Those of Great Ability take on suffering in order to end the suffering of others.  This division can be understood as applying to the particular situation in Tibet in which mass monasticism and more esoteric forms of Buddhism could both be found. The teaching of the three kinds of abilities can be understood as a schema for determining whether or not a monk is ready for certain higher teachings and practices. The threefold division can also be understood in a wider sense, applying to people in general and how to gauge their abilities.

Aside from the obvious emphasis on altruism, the doctrine exemplifies what Harvey (2000 p.51) terms gradualism. For many ethical systems in the West, normative prescriptions apply to everyone (or perhaps everyone who can grasp them regardless of ethical development). In many forms of Buddhist ethics, though some prescriptions like refraining from taking life apply to everyone, others only apply to those with a certain depth of moral or spiritual understanding. Harvey notes that while lay practitioners usually follow five precepts, an ordained monk is subject to two hundred or more. Similarly, different teachings, practices, and requirements are suitable for the three kinds of abilities. Those of Small Ability might benefit most from reflecting on the impermanence of worldly pleasures and the inevitability of death, while the kind of altruism and patience that those of higher stages develop is out of their reach and could prove detrimental to demand of them. Atiśa notes that just as birds with undeveloped wings cannot fly, people with undeveloped understanding cannot help others in certain ways. The implication seems to be that just as we cannot demand of baby birds that they fly, we can encourage them to act in ways that nurtures the development of their wings.

iii. Mind Training

An area developed extensively in Tibet is that of Lojong (blo sbyong) or Mind Training. Recall that because of the soteriological aspect of Tibetan ethics, the aim is not solely to give an account for what the right actions and attitudes are, but to come to manifest those attitudes and actually act in that way. Lojong is a type of meditative practice that aims at helping the practitioner to generate compassion and lessen attachment to external factors like praise and popular opinion.

One kind of Lojong, often associated with Śāntideva, is the practice of Exchanging Self and Other (bdag gzhan mnyam brje). In this practice the meditator imagines himself to be another person; often a sequence of people who are beneath, equal to, and then superior to the practitioner in some respect.  By doing this, the practitioner can come to realize that the other person is the same as them in that they wish to be happy and avoid suffering. After some practice, it becomes easier to overcome obstacles (both petty and serious) to treating others in a compassionate way.

Another kind of Lojong practice, often attributed to Atiśa but popularized by Chekawa Yeshe Dorje, is that of Giving and Taking (gtong len). In this practice one imagines oneself taking in the suffering of others, and gives to them happiness in return. This often takes the form of visualizing that with each breath, one inhales the suffering of others as thick black smoke and exhales happiness to them in the form of white light.

A general feature of Lojong is the development of an ability to take negative circumstances, like being surrounded by suffering or anger, and transform it into positive attitudes and actions. Two foundational texts in this regard are Eight Verses for Training the Mind (blo sbyong tshig brgyad ma) by Geshé Langri Tangpa and The Seven-Point Mind Training (blo sbyong don bdun ma) by Chekawa Yeshé Dorjé.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Clayton, Barbra. 2006. Moral Theory in Śāntideva’s Śikṣāsamuccaya. New York: Routledge.
    • Though primarily a discussion of Śāntideva’s lesser-known work, it has a good overview of his life and works as an informed discussion of how to consider Buddhist ethics in Western categories.
  • Dreyfus, Georges J. B. 2003. The Sound of Two Hands Clapping: The Education of a Tibetan Buddhist Monk. Berkeley: University of California Press.
    • This first-hand account of Tibetan monastic life offers a realistic picture of the actual practices as well as excellent information on Tibetan debate.
  • Garfield, Jay. 2002. Empty Words. New York: Oxford University Press.
    • An insightful collection of essays on a variety of topics in Buddhist Philosophy which focuses on Tibetan Buddhism and Analytic Philosophy.
  • Garfield, Jay. trans. 1995. The Fundamental Wisdom of the Middle Way: Nāgārjuna’s Mūlamadhyamakakārikā. New York: Oxford University Press.
    • A translation from the Tibetan text of Nāgārjuna’s most famous philosophical work.  Garfield also provides very clear and philosophically informed commentary.
  • Harvey, Peter. 2000. An Introduction to Buddhist Ethics. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • A very clear introduction to Buddhist ethics with an emphasis on normative questions.
  • Hayes, Richard. 1994. “Nāgārjuna’s Appeal” in The Journal of Indian Philosophy Vol. 22, pp.299-378.
    • A classic paper that argues that Nāgārjuna’s arguments essentially rely on the fallacy of equivocation over the term Svabhāva.
  • Kapstein, Matthew. 2001. Reasons Traces. Boston: Wisdom Publications.
    • A philosophically informed discussion of personal identity, metaphysics, and epistemology in Indian and Tibetan Buddhism.
  • Keown, Damien. 1992. The Nature of Buddhist Ethics. New York: St. Martin’s Press.
    • A very interesting philosophical discussion of Buddhist ethics, offering an interpretation of Buddhist ethics that emphasizes the similarity to Aristotelian virtue ethics.
  • Khunu Rinpoche. Gareth Sparham, trans. 1999. Vast as the Heavens Deep as the Sea. Boston: Wisdom Publications.
    • A recent text in verse form praising bodhicitta, the aspiration for enlightenment.
  • Mipham, Jamgön and Chandrakirti. Padmakara Translation Group trans. 2002. Introduction to the Middle Way. Boston: Shambhala Press.
    • As a translation of Chandrakīrti’s Madhyamakāvatāra with commentary by Mipham Jamgön, it is an important primary text.  Its introduction provides a very clear and understandable way into Mādhyamaka philosophy.
  • Patrul Rinpoche. 1998. Words of My Perfect Teacher. Boston: Shambhala Press.
    • A very popular practical guide and explanation of the Tibetan Buddhist spiritual path.
  • Perdue, Daniel. 1992. Debate in Tibetan Buddhism. Ithaca: Snow Lion Press.
    • An extensive translation and explanation of an introductory Tibetan debate manual.
  • Rossi, Donatella. 1999. The Philosophical View of the Great Perfection in the Tibetan Bon Religion. Ithaca: Snow Lion Press.
    • An overview of Dzog Chen in the Bön and Nyingma traditions; includes translations along with the original Tibetan.
  • Sakya Pandita. John Davenport trans. 2000. Ordinary Wisdom. Boston: Wisdom Publications.
    • A translation and explanation of the most famous of the Legs Bshad texts.
  • Sonam Rinchen and Ruth Sonam. 1997. The Thirty-Seven Practices of Bodhisattvas. Ithaca: Snow Lion Press.
  • Sonam Rinchen and Ruth Sonam. 1997. Atisha’s Lamp for the Path to Enlightenment. Ithaca: Snow Lion Press.
  • Sonam Rinchen and Ruth Sonam. 2001. Eight Verses for Training the Mind. Ithaca: Snow Lion Press.
    • These editions are translations by Ruth Sonam and explanations by Geche Sonam Rinchen.  They all include the original Tibetan and offer clear background for understanding the root texts.
  • Sparham, Gareth. 1993. Ocean of Eloquence. New York: SUNY Press.
    • A translation of Tsong Kha Pa’s commentary on the Yogācāra Doctrine of Mind.  An example of Yogācāra study and practice in Tibet.
  • Thupten Jinpa, ed. 2006. Mind Training: The Great Collection. Boston: Wisdom Publications.
    • An excellent collection of the Lojong or “Mind Training” literature with commentaries.
  • Thurman, Robert. 1991. The Central Philosophy of Tibet: A Study and Translation of Jey Tsong Khapa’s Essence of True Eloquence. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
    • A long introduction gives a detailed overview of Tibetan philosophy followed by a translation of an important text on Mādhyamaka by Tsong Kha Pa.
  • Wayman, Alex. 1991. Ethics of Tibet. New York: SUNY Press.
    • A translation and explanation of the Bodhisattva section of Tsong Kha Pa’s Lamrim Chenmo.  Offers an overview of the stages of the bodhisattva path.



Author Information


Nicolas Bommarito
University at Buffalo
U. S. A.


Śāntideva (fl. 8th c.)

Śāntideva (literally “god of peace”) was the name given to an Indian Mahāyāna Buddhist philosopher-monk, known as the author of two texts, the Bodhicaryāvatāra and the Śikṣāsamuccaya. These works both express the ideal of the bodhisattva — the ideal person of Mahāyāna Buddhism. The term Mahāyāna, literally “Great Vehicle,” came into use to mean the idea of attempting to become a bodhisattva (and eventually a buddha) oneself, rather than merely following the teachings set out by Siddhārtha Gautama (considered the original Buddha). This was the earliest usage of the term mahāyāna in Sanskrit, although even by Śāntideva’s time, understandings of what becoming a bodhisattva involved had undergone many changes; the Mahāyāna had come to be understood as a separate school rather than as a vocation (see Nattier 2003; Harrison 1987).

Both of Śāntideva’s texts explore the bodhisattva ideal as an ethical one, in that they prescribe how a person should properly live, and provide reasons for living in that way. Śāntideva’s close attention to ethics makes him relatively unusual among Indian philosophers, for whom metaphysics (or theoretical philosophy more generally) was more typically the primary concern. Śāntideva’s ethical thought is widely known, cited  and loved among Tibetan Buddhists, and is increasingly coming to the attention of Western thinkers. Śāntideva’s metaphysics is of interest primarily because of its close connection to his ethics.

Table of Contents

  1. History and Works
    1. Writings
    2. Life
    3. Reception and Influence
  2. The Progress of the Bodhisattva
  3. Excellence in Means
  4. Good and Bad Karma
  5. The Perfections
    1. Giving
      1. Giving as Giving Up
      2. Upward Gifts: Expressing Esteem
      3. Downward Gifts: Attracting Others
    2. Good Conduct
    3. Patient Endurance
      1. Happiness from Enduring Suffering
      2. The Case Against Anger
    4. Heroic Strength
    5. Meditation
      1. Equalization of Self and Other
      2. Exchange of Self and Other
      3. Meditations Against the Three Poisons
    6. Metaphysical Insight
      1. Content
      2. Practical Implications
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Works
    2. Translations Cited
    3. General Studies of Śāntideva
    4. Specialized Studies
    5. Related Interest

1. History and Works

a. Writings

The name “Śāntideva” is associated above all with two extant texts: the Bodhicaryāvatāra (hereafter BCA) and the Śikṣāsamuccaya (hereafter ŚS). The Bodhicaryāvatāra (often rendered “Guide to the Bodhisattva’s Way of Life”), in its most widely known form, is a work of just over 900 verses. Tibetan legends suggest that the text was originally recited orally (see de Jong 1975), as do the text’s own literary features. Although it has been translated into Tibetan multiple times and is revered throughout Tibetan Buddhist tradition, it was originally composed and redacted in Sanskrit. Its Sanskrit is relatively close to Pānini’s official standards of grammar, with a Buddhist vocabulary.  Its ten chapters lead their reader through the path to becoming a bodhisattva — which is to say a future Buddha, and therefore a being on the way to perfection, according to Mahāyāna tradition.

The Śikṣāsamuccaya (“Training Anthology”) is a longer prose work in nineteen chapters. The ŚS is organized as a commentary on twenty-seven short mnemonic verses known as the Śikṣāsamuccaya Kārikā (hereafter ŚSK). It consists primarily of quotations (of varying length) from sūtras, authoritative texts considered to be the word of the Buddha — generally those sūtras associated with Mahāyāna tradition. Most scholars have taken the ŚS to be composed almost entirely of such quotations. However, Paul Harrison (2007) has recently claimed that a substantial portion of it is original to the redactor.

Like the BCA, the ŚS was originally composed in Sanskrit, as were the sūtras it quotes. However, while Śāntideva’s own portions are in relatively standard Sanskrit, the quotations are mostly in the heavily vernacularized language usually known as Buddhist Hybrid Sanskrit. It is considerably less accessible to a novice reader than the BCA, and its organization can be bewildering. Richard Mahoney (2002) has recently provided a clear account of the text’s structure, which will be discussed later in this article.

Who were these texts written for? One can infer from the texts that they are intended for an audience of men whose sexual desires are directed toward women, as the auditor’s sexual cravings are always discussed in those terms. Therefore, the use of masculine forms to refer to the implied audience is unproblematic. This auditor also understands Sanskrit, and lives in or after the seventh century CE. His knowledge of Sanskrit implies, at the least, that he is well educated, and therefore well versed in the ideas of classical Sanskritic culture. And he is not necessarily on the bodhisattva path when he begins reading or hearing the texts, but is motivated to enter that path by studying them.

The texts’ implied audience includes monks, and may also include householders (nonmonks). While monks are a significant component of the text’s implied audience (Onishi 2003), and are in some respects the ideal audience, they are not necessarily the only such audience. The principles of conduct put forth in the BCA’s fifth chapter resemble those of vinaya monastic codes, and indeed some of them have been taken directly from the prātimokṣa monastic rule books (Crosby and Skilton 1995, 32), but few of them would be impossible or absurd for a householder to follow. In the ŚS, too, Śāntideva certainly considers monasticism better and more praiseworthy than the householder life, but part of his task is to convince householding readers to pursue the monastic life. He claims that “in every birth the great bodhisattva goes forth [as a monk] . . . from the household life” (ŚS 14). But this is a process renewed in every lifetime, beginning with the household life; and Śāntideva does refer on multiple occasions to householding bodhisattvas (for example at ŚS 120 and 267). This text, then, is addressed in part to householders.

b. Life

Tibetan hagiographic histories (Bu ston, Tāranātha, Ye shes dPal ‘byor and Sum pa mKhan po) provide the most detailed accounts of Śāntideva’s life, although most contemporary historians doubt their veracity. In brief, they tell of a prince from Saurāstra (in contemporary Gujarat) who joined the great monastic university of Nālandā. His fellow monks, unaware of his wisdom, saw only a lazy man unworthy of their company. To prove his presumed lack of knowledge, they asked him to recite a Buddhist sūtra text. Śāntideva, undaunted, asked whether they would like to hear something old or something new. Asked for something new, he proceeded to recite the BCA. When he reached verse IX.34 — “When neither an entity nor a nonentity remain before thought, then thought, with no object, is pacified because it has no other destination” — he rose into the air and his body disappeared. The remainder of the text was recited by a disembodied voice. The written text of the ŚS, the voice told the audience, could be found in Śāntideva’s room, along with a text called the Sūtrasamuccaya (Pezzali 1968, 4-20). There is some debate among scholars as to the nature of the latter work, but all agree that the title does not refer to any additional surviving work of Śāntideva’s, and that the BCA and ŚS constitute his extant corpus (see Lele 2007, 17n8).

Beyond the hagiographies, most of what we know of Śāntideva comes from the ideas found in extant recensions of his texts. This article treats Śāntideva’s works together, as the works of a single author, as Indian and Tibetan Buddhist tradition has always done; similarly, it refers to the ideas found in the canonical Sanskrit recensions of the texts, not to the Tibetan or to the BCA recension found at Dunhuang. Since the article’s approach is to examine the ideas of this author, Śāntideva, it spends relatively little time on the structure of each of his two texts as separate units. For an overview of the relevant textual issues and a defense of this article’s approach to the texts, see Lele 2007, 9-31. More specifically, for a discussion of the Dunhuang recension, see Saito 1993. For discussions of the structure of the BCA, see Crosby and Skilton 1995; Saito 1993. For discussions of the structure of the ŚS, see Clayton 2006; Griffiths 1999, 133-43; Hedinger 1984; Mahoney 2002; Mrozik 2007. On both, see Pezzali 1968.

It is difficult to learn much about the texts’ historical composer, or their redactor, beyond what is found in the texts themselves. As noted, Tibetan historians recount the life story of a Śāntideva identified as the texts’ author, but it is difficult to sort fact from legend with so little corroborating evidence. There seems little reason to doubt that someone by the name of Śāntideva wrote some portion of the two texts, or that he was a monk at Nālandā. (The Tibetan historians agree on this last point, and based on what we know of Indian Buddhist history it seems a likely place for historically significant Buddhist works to have been composed.) Paul Griffiths (1999, 114-24) uses the accounts of Chinese and Tibetan visitors to reconstruct a detailed account of what life and literary culture at Nālandā might have looked like.

Beyond these points, we can say relatively little beyond the approximate date of the texts’ composition. The Tibetan translator Ye shes sde, who rendered the BCA into Tibetan, worked under the king Khri lde srong brtsan (816-838 CE), so it must have been composed before that time (Bendall 1970, v). Since the Chinese pilgrim Yijing (or I-tsing) mentions all the major Indian Mahāyāna thinkers known in India but does not mention Śāntideva, it is likely that these texts were composed, or at least became famous, after Yijing left India in 685 CE (Pezzali 1968, 38). We may therefore assign Śāntideva an approximate date of  sometime in the eighth century.

c. Reception and Influence

As historical evidence on India is difficult to come by, it is relatively difficult to ascertain Śāntideva’s influence in the later Indian Buddhist philosophical tradition. Nevertheless, a significant number of later Indian texts do refer to the BCA and ŚS (Bendall 1970, viii-x), so Śāntideva’s work must have been relatively important there.

It is far easier to speak of Śāntideva’s influence in Tibet. Tibetan Buddhists revere Śāntideva and his work, especially the BCA. All the major Tibetan texts on the stages of the bodhisattva path, such as those of Tsong kha pa and sGam po pa, quote it at length (Sweet 1977, 4-5); it is a key  source for the entire Tibetan literary genre of blo sbyong or lojong (“mental purification”) (Sweet 1996, 245). The present Dalai Lama cites it as the highest inspiration for his ideals and practices (Williams 1995, ix). Tibetan commentators have written many commentaries on the text over the years, several of which are now available in English translation (e.g. Gyatso 1986; Rinpoche 2002; Tobden 2005). While the ŚS was less influential overall, the tradition has not ignored it. In 1998 the present Dalai Lama gave public teachings on the ŚS, referring to it as a “key which can unlock all the teachings of the Buddha” (quoted in Clayton 2006, 2). Śāntideva’s work has played a significant role in other cultures influenced by Tibetan Buddhism, such as Mongolia (see, for example, de Rachewiltz 1996; Kanaoka 1963). A less influential translation of the BCA was also made into Chinese (Bendall 1970, xxix-xxx).

The BCA has also been widely translated, studied, and admired in the West. (See Onishi 2003 for a thesis-length discussion of the text’s Western reception.) Luís Gómez (1999, 262-3) even suggests that it is now the third most frequently translated text in all of Indian Buddhism, after the Dhammapāda and the Heart Sūtra. A recent introductory text (Cooper 1998) also treats the BCA as one of “the classic readings” in ethics, alongside such works as Plato’s Gorgias and Mill’s Utilitarianism.  The BCA is an appropriate choice for a reading in Buddhist ethics, for relatively few Buddhist texts make explicit ethical arguments. This situation even leads one scholar (Keown 2005, 50) to proclaim that Buddhism “does not have normative ethics,” though he does not appear to have taken Śāntideva’s work into account in making this claim (see Lele 2007, 48-52).

2. The Progress of the Bodhisattva

The central concern of both of Śāntideva’s texts is the bodhisattva, literally “awakening-being.” A bodhisattva is a being aiming to become a buddha (literally “awakened one”); the process of the final transformation into a buddha is called bodhi, “awakening,” sometimes referred to as “enlightenment.” The title Bodhicaryâvatāra, “introduction to conduct for awakening,” is usually taken to be short for Bodhisattvacaryâvatāra — “introduction to the conduct of a bodhisattva,” or “A Guide to the Bodhisattva Way of Life,” as one major translation (Wallace and Wallace 1997) has it. “Introduction to the conduct of a bodhisattva” is an appropriate description of the contents of the text, although “introduction to conduct for awakening” would be equally appropriate. Śāntideva also introduces the Śikṣāsamuccaya by claiming he will explain the sugatâtmajasamvārâvatāra, a similar phrase meaning “introduction to the requirements for the sons of the Sugatas” (ŚS 1). (Throughout Buddhist literature sugata, literally “gone well,” is a common term for buddhas, and Mahāyāna literature regularly refers to bodhisattvas as the buddhas’ sons.) The term “bodhisattva” occurs at least seven times in the nineteen chapters of the ŚS. This section examines the bodhisattva’s progress from being an ordinary person through to being a buddha, as this progress is discussed in Śāntideva’s texts.

To describe those who are neither bodhisattvas nor buddhas, Śāntideva most frequently uses the term “ordinary person,” prithagjana. He refers at one point to “all buddhas, bodhisattvas, solitary buddhas, noble searchers and ordinary people” (ŚS 9) — suggesting that ordinary people are the residual category of all those who do not fall into the previous categories. It is standard in Mahāyāna texts to refer to three “vehicles” (yāna) or paths, with the vehicles of the searcher (śrāvaka) and solitary buddha (pratyekabuddha) being distinguished from the Great Vehicle (mahāyāna) of the bodhisattva. It is quite rare, however, for Śāntideva to refer to searchers and solitary buddhas, and even buddhas appear relatively infrequently, so in practice the most important distinction in his texts is between bodhisattvas and ordinary people.

Śāntideva’s view of ordinary people is not flattering. The term “ordinary person” frequently occurs in his work alongside the term “fool” (bāla) — sometimes with the latter as a modifier (“foolish ordinary person,” bālaprithagjana, as at ŚS 61) and sometimes with the two terms used synonymously and interchangeably, as at ŚS 194. Ordinary people’s foolishness traps them in suffering; the way for them to escape from suffering is to enter the bodhisattva path and become a bodhisattva.

To become a bodhisattva, one must possess the awakening mind (bodhicitta). This mental transformation brings one out of the status of ordinary person and points one toward awakening. Śāntideva makes an important distinction between two kinds of the awakening mind: the mind resolved on awakening (bodhipraṇidhicitta) and the mind proceeding to awakening (bodhiprasthānacitta). The first, he tells us, can be reached quickly; it exists when the thought “I must become a buddha” arises as a vow (ŚS 8). He is not as explicit about the nature of the second, but in describing the first he notes that “the awakening mind is productive even without conduct” (ŚS 9), suggesting that conduct (caryā, bodhicaryā) may be what makes the difference between the mind resolved on awakening and the mind proceeding to awakening. (Brassard 2000 is a book-length study of the awakening mind and the BCA.)

It would appear, however, that possession of the mind resolved on awakening     is sufficient to make its possessor into a bodhisattva. The BCA, recall, suggests that it is intended to be ritually recited. Its reader develops the awakening mind while reciting the third chapter sincerely — saying “Therefore I will produce the awakening mind for the welfare of the world” (BCA III.23). Two verses later, the reciter, apparently not having done anything else in the intervening time, declares: “Today I have been born into the family of the buddhas; now I am a child of the buddhas,” which is to say a bodhisattva(BCA III.25).

This is not, of course, the end of the story. Such a beginning bodhisattva has just started on the path; he has a long task ahead of him. Śāntideva does not spell out the different levels of attainment that a bodhisattva may reach, but he suggests that he agrees with the account of ten stages (bhūmi) of a bodhisattva’s achievement, as set out in the Daśabhūmika Sūtra and followed in Candrakīrti’s Madhyamakâvatāra (see Sprung 1979 for a partial translation of, and commentary on, this latter text). The ŚS quotes the Daśabhūmika six times. In this context, Śāntideva distinguishes between “one who has entered a stage” (bhūmipraviṣṭa) and a beginning (ādikarmika) bodhisattva (ŚS 11), suggesting that beginning bodhisattvas have not even entered the first of the ten stages.

Notice, however, that the BCA’s reciter does not become a bodhisattva, even a beginning one, until taking the vow in the third chapter. So Śāntideva’s audience, it would seem, is not limited to bodhisattvas — a point strengthened by the profuse praises of the awakening mind in the opening chapters of both texts. The reader who starts the text might not have generated the awakening mind, hence not have started trying to become a bodhisattva, and needs to be convinced of the importance of doing so.

The eighteenth chapter of the ŚS gives some account of the end of the path. It gives a fantastical description of the buddhas — their great beauty, virtue and power (ŚS 318-22). Shortly afterwards, it also describes the qualities of bodhisattvas in similar terms  and at greater length. It is difficult to imagine how a reader who had just become a bodhisattva, taking the vow, could see himself as described by these qualities — spontaneously emitting perfumes and garlands and pearls from his body, for example (ŚS 327) — so this is likely the culmination of a long period of effort, in the last stages of which one becomes a fully realized bodhisattva. The distinctions between buddhas and fully realized bodhisattvas are not clearly spelled out; one suspects that being one of these advanced bodhisattvas is almost as good as being an actual buddha.

3. Excellence in Means

To interpret Śāntideva’s ethics in the BCA and ŚS, it is important to turn to the concept of excellence in means (upāyakauśalya). This common Mahāyāna concept is best known as a way of explaining the existence of other Buddhist traditions, as in texts like the Lotus Sūtra: the Buddha preached mainstream Buddhism as a clever way to reach people who were not ready to receive the superior teaching of the Mahāyāna. (See Pye 1978 for a book-length discussion.)

The term has a number of different senses in Buddhist tradition (see Harvey 2000, 134-40). Some Mahāyāna texts treat excellence in means as the seventh of ten perfections or virtues (pāramitā); Śāntideva does not do this, as he adheres to the conception that there are only six perfections (on which see below). For him, there are two senses in which the idea is important. The first is hermeneutical: different teachings are intended for people at different levels of ability, with the idea of ultimate truth at the very highest level (see BCA IX.2-8). For this reason the BCA is usually understood as a progressive text, leading its audience through progressively deeper levels of practice and understanding (e.g. see Crosby and Skilton 1995, 83-6). Śāntideva does not specifically use the term “excellence in means” to refer to this idea, although it is a common name for the idea in other Mahāyāna texts (Harvey 2000, 134). The second sense of the term is ethical; the idea most frequently comes up when he quotes the Upāyakauśalya Sūtra, a text which claims that bodhisattvas may break standard precepts or rules out of compassion. (The sūtra exists in Chinese and has been translated into English twice: Chang 1991, 427-68, and Tatz 1994.)

This second sense of excellence in means takes on considerable importance in contemporary discussions of Śāntideva’s ethics (e.g. Clayton 2006, 102-9) because it is under this rubric that Śāntideva comes closest to addressing the “hard cases” so beloved of contemporary moral philosophy, such as situations when one seems called on to kill in order to prevent a greater evil. While discussing excellence in means, he explains that behaviors normally forbidden, including sexual activity, can be permitted out of compassion. So too, it is to explain the importance of excellence in means that Śāntideva notes that one is permitted to kill someone about to commit a grave wrong. The idea is important to this article for similar reasons, in that it seems to be a key principle involved in what we might call Śāntideva’s casuistry — his examination of particular cases where different pieces of advice seem to collide.

For Śāntideva, a key component of excellence in means is that it is an excellence — a skill and a virtue which allows one to respond appropriately to difficult situations, if not a virtue on the official list of six perfections. There is no one formula or principle for action that Śāntideva sets out in advance (along the lines of “act to bring about the greatest happiness for the greatest number” or “act only according to that maxim you can also will to be a universal law”). As we will shortly see, there are definite elements of consequentialist reasoning in Śāntideva, but more often the bodhisattva is called on to exercise judgment, once his character is already well developed: When Śāntideva says that “even the forbidden is permitted,” it is specifically “for a compassionate one who has sight of the purpose” (BCA V.84); that is, it depends on the agent’s ability to exercise discretion in the name of compassion.

This level of discretion is evinced in the numerous places in Śāntideva’s work where difficult cases are considered. When he approves of the killing of someone about to commit a grave wrong, he says only that there is “permission” (anujñāna), not that it must be done. Similarly, in the case of alcoholics, alcohol may be given; Śāntideva uses the gerundive form deya (ŚS 271), and the gerundive in -ya does not have the imperative force of the gerundive in -tavya.

Śāntideva explicitly refers to consequences in the case of giving a weapon: one may do so after the “consideration of good or bad consequences” (ŚS 271). This is still a consideration or reflection rather than a maximizing or weighing; “consideration,” vicāra, is literally “moving around (in the mind).” A weighing of some sort comes across in introducing the possibility that one might have sex out of compassion: “even then, if one should see a greater benefit (artha) to beings, one may discard the training” (ŚS 167). Some sort of consequentialist maximizing appears to be at work here. Clayton (2006, 107) suggests that such concern for consequences means that these “examples of upāya become problematic from the perspective of a virtue ethic.” However, for Śāntideva, any true “benefit” to other beings will ultimately be an increase in their virtue. Goodman (2008) argues strongly for a consequentialist interpretation of Śāntideva’s ethics, but on the understanding that it is a “perfectionist consequentialism,” in which the consequences to be maximized consist of virtue in oneself and others.

4. Good and Bad Karma

The terms “good karma” and “bad karma,” respectively, translate the Sanskrit terms puṇya and pāpa. These terms appear very frequently in Śāntideva’s work — often as justifications for acting and feeling in a certain way. They refer to a kind of ethical causality: the process by which ethically good and bad actions (respectively) have positive and negative results. These results most characteristically, but not exclusively, include better and worse rebirths. The Sanskrit terms parallel the English usage of “good and bad karma,” thought of as the way in which one’s good or bad actions come back to affect one positively or negatively in the future. This usage corresponds exactly to the meaning of the Buddhist terms puṇya and pāpa, even though those terms do not themselves involve the Sanskrit word karma or karman (which simply means “action”). There is, at any rate, no disputing the close connection between Sanskrit karma, on the one hand, and puṇya and pāpa on the other; the latter are typically referred to in Sanskrit as karmaphala, the fruits of action.

The concepts of good and bad karma are central to Śāntideva’s thought. The ŚS is typically thought to be structured around the idea, presented inŚSK 4, that one should “protect, purify and enhance” one’s person, one’s possessions and one’s good karma, though one should also be prepared to give all of these things away (Bendall 1970, xi). ŚS 356 connects each of these verbs to good and bad karma: to “protect” something is to prevent new karmically bad mental states (dharmas) related to it; to “purify” it is to reduce the existing karmically bad states related to it; and to “enhance” it is to increase the karmically good states related to it. (Mahoney 2002, 32-9 identifies the significance of these verbs with respect to the traditional Buddhist samyakprahānas or “right strivings”.) In a certain sense, one might see the ŚS as being all about good and bad karma — a sense strengthened by the long discussions of bad karma in ŚS III, IV and VIII, and of the good karma deriving from worship in ŚS XVII. In the BCA, too, the final chapter — the highest and most important, if one adheres strictly to a progressive understanding of the text — deals with the redirection (pariṇāmanā) of good karma. Dayal (1970, 189-90) goes so far as to say that Śāntideva substituted karmic redirection for metaphysical insight as the ultimate goal of the bodhisattva path. Clayton (2006, 83) and Lele (2007, 96-7) argue that Dayal’s claim is overstated, but neither dispute that good and bad karma are vitally important to Śāntideva’s work. Clayton (2006, 67) identifies three terms closely related to good karma (kuśala, śīla and puṇya) as the most central ethical concepts in the ŚS, and even as “probably the most important ethical concepts in Indian Buddhism” more generally.

The redirection of good karma (often called “transference of merit”) is a central part of Śāntideva’s understanding of karma’s workings. He urges his readers to redirect any good karma that they acquire, so that it does not merely result in a worldly form of well-being, such as a more prosperous rebirth for oneself. This redirection can sometimes be to ensure that the good karma brings one closer to awakening instead of worldly rebirths (bodhipariṇāmanā, ŚS 158); see Kajiyama 1989 for a discussion of this first form, which is often neglected in studies of karmic redirection. More frequently, though, it means the giving up of one’s good karma to others (puṇyotsarga). This is a common idea in Buddhist texts. Buddhist stories often emphasize the supernatural nature of karmic redirection. Especially, they commonly claim or imply that ghosts (pretas or petas) are incapable of receiving physical gifts. If one wishes to give them something, it must be one’s good karma(Kajiyama 1989, 7-8).

In contemporary philosophical terms, Śāntideva’s idea of karma suggests, though not conclusively, an internal connection between virtue or ethical excellence and well-being. That is, he often uses these terms in a way that suggests that virtue is well-being in many significant senses. He does this by using puṇya in ways that make it equivalent both to virtue or excellence and to well-being or flourishing. Śāntideva uses the term for good karma (puṇya) interchangeably with the terms for good conduct (śīla) and excellence (kuśala) (see Lele 2007, 79-82)(Clayton 2006, 73). Even more frequently, however, he equates it with well-being or welfare, śubha, as Clayton (2006, 48-51) notes. This equivalence suggests a sense in which, on Śāntideva’s understanding, good karma not only produces well-being, but is well-being — constitutive of a good life, at least at the level of conventional truth. There does remain some ambiguity, however, in the sense that Śāntideva’s work also suggests that well-being is the product of the result or “ripening” (vipāka) of good karma.

This ambiguity may be compared to that in Greek conceptions of eudaimonia, which also means human welfare or flourishing, but includes a strong element of excellence (aretē) as well. To the extent that good karma is equated with excellence, Śāntideva’s thought resembles that of the Stoics, who thought that excellence alone constituted well-being. To the extent that good karma is equated with the results of excellent action, however, it looks more like Aristotle’s view, where “external goods,” outside the control of the agent’s excellence or lack thereof, are intrinsic components of well-being. (See Greek Philosophy and Stoicism.) However, Śāntideva does not ever suggest, as Aristotle does, that everyone aims at well-being but not everyone knows what it is (NE 1095a).

However we interpret the relation between action and result, it would seem that for Śāntideva good karma, as a complex of virtue and well-being, effectively constitutes its own intrinsic reason for action, as eudaimonia does. That a given action or mental state is karmically good, and that it is good per se, seem to be one and the same; Śāntideva does not make claims of the form “one should refrain from an action or mental state in spite of the good karma it generates,” or “one should have an action or mental state even though it is karmically bad.” Amod Lele argues that “there are a number of cases where it would seem like Śāntideva is saying it is not good to have more good karma, but in nearly all such cases, he actually ends up saying that the apparent loss of good karma turns out to bring more good karma” (Lele 2007, 85-7, emphasis in original).

5. The Perfections

Śāntideva typically describes the bodhisattva in terms of his six “perfections” (pāramitās); e.g., ŚS 97, 187. The perfections are beneficial and valuable traits of character, similar to Aristotelian virtues or excellences. This article renders Śāntideva’s term pāramitā as the literal “perfection” rather than as “virtue” because Śāntideva does discuss other virtues — beneficial traits of character — which are not themselves considered pāramitās, such as nonattachment and esteem.

The six perfections are nearly always arranged in ascending order: giving or generosity (dāna), good conduct (śīla), patient endurance (kṣānti), heroic strength (vīrya), meditation (dhyāna) and metaphysical insight (prajñā). An observer might be tempted to apply Aristotle’s classification  of the virtues  here and identify the first four as “moral” virtues, the sixth (and possibly the fifth) as “intellectual.” However, one should bear in mind the significance of Aristotle’s distinction: intellectual virtues are primarily attained through teaching, moral virtues through habituation (NE 1103a). Śāntideva does not distinguish the perfections in this regard; as we will see in the section on metaphysical insight below, in many ways it too is acquired through habituation.

The perfections are sufficiently important to Śāntideva’s ethical thought that  both of his texts are to some extent structured around them. The final four perfections are explicitly identified, in turn, as the topics of the BCA’s chapters VI through IX. Patient endurance and heroic strength are also identified as the topics of ŚS chapters IX and X. While the first two perfections — giving or generosity (dāna) and good conduct (śīla) — do not receive their own chapter headings, they do have an important place in Śāntideva’s ethical worldview, as we will see.

a. Giving

Śāntideva uses the term dāna to refer both to the act of giving, and to the perfection which might more idiomatically be rendered into English as generosity (dānapāramitā). He does not usually distinguish between the two. This article follows his usage and uses “giving” and “generosity” as synonyms.

Giving has relatively little role in the BCA except for its role in the redirection of good karma, mentioned above. In the ŚS, however, it takes pride of place. The first chapter of the ŚS closes by claiming that “giving alone is the bodhisattva’s awakening” (ŚS 34).  Richard Mahoney (2002), undertaking a detailed study of the ŚS’s structure, has demonstrated that the entire text is effectively organized around the idea of protecting, purifying and enhancing one’s person, possessions and good karma — culminating in giving each of these three things away.

Why is giving so important to Śāntideva? For him, giving serves at least three important and distinct purposes: first, the development of nonattachment; second, the “upward” expression of esteem (śraddhā); and third, “downward” compassionate benefit to others. Each of these three, for him, is an essential component of the bodhisattva path, and giving allows one to realize each component, though in different ways.

i. Giving as Giving Up

The first reason Śāntideva offers for giving is that one should not be attached to things in the first place; one should be ready to give them away. Śāntideva sometimes uses terms, utsarga and tyāga, which have both the sense of “giving” and of “renunciation.” By giving something to another person, one both demonstrates one’s own lack of attachment to it and minimizes the risk that it will cause future attachment. As a result, one generates a great deal of good karma. Here giving is primarily “giving up”; “giving to” is a secondary function. Śāntideva expresses this rationale for giving most forcefully in a long passage excerpted here:

What is given must no longer be guarded; what is at home must be guarded. What is given is [the cause] for the reduction of craving (triṣṇā); what is at home is the increase of craving. What is given is nonattachment (aparigraha); what is at home is with attachment (saparigraha). What is given is safe; what is at home is dangerous. What is given is [the cause] for supporting the path of awakening; what is at home is [the cause] for supporting Māra [the demonic tempter]. What is given is imperishable; what is at home is perishable. From what is given [comes] happiness; having obtained what is at home, [there is] suffering. (ŚS 19)

This passage indicates a common theme in Śāntideva’s work, one more radical than some other Buddhist takes on attachment and possession. It is not merely that a bodhisattva should avoid attachment to possessions, but that the possessions are themselves potentially harmful, because having them creates a danger of increasing one’s attachment to them. Thus Śāntideva claims elsewhere that a bodhisattva “should have fear of material gain (lābha) and of honour,” (ŚSK 16) and that “great gain is among the obstacles to the Mahāyāna” (ŚS 145).

ii. Upward Gifts: Expressing Esteem

The second reason for giving is to express one’s esteem or trust (śraddhā) in beings who have achieved a higher level on the bodhisattva path. The term śraddhā has a number of different and related senses, usually blending together: esteem, trust, confidence, devotion, faith. Maria Hibbets’s (2000) rendering “esteem” may come closest overall to the sense in which Śāntideva uses the term, though it loses the important connotation of trust. Śraddhā, Śāntideva says, is the prasāda (peaceful pleasure) of an unsoiled mind, rooted in respect (gaurava, literally “weightiness,” like the Latin gravitas), without arrogance (ŚS 5). Those without esteem oppose or ridicule buddhas (ŚS 174). One with esteem will listen whenever the Buddha’s word is spoken (ŚS 15); esteem is that by which one approaches the noble ones (Buddhas) and does not do what should not be done (ŚS 316).

When a householder makes a gift to a monk, especially a gift of food, it is called a śraddhādeya, a gift by esteem (ŚS 137-8). Similarly, when the aspiring bodhisattva makes offerings to advanced bodhisattvas and buddhas as part of the seven-part Anuttarapūjā ritual worship in BCA II.10-19, the act expresses esteem. Śāntideva does not use the word śraddhā in this passage, but the feelings it evokes match his descriptions of esteem elsewhere: a pleasurable trust in more advanced beings, recognizing their status as more advanced, that leads to better actions. Just before describing the fabulous offerings he gives, Śāntideva’s narrator describes the esteem he places in the buddhas and bodhisattvas and the good action that will result from doing so:

by becoming your possession, I am in a state of fearlessness; I make the well-being of all beings. I overcome previous bad karma and will make no further bad karma. (BCA II.9)

This esteem has deeply important benefits. It is a pleasure taken in good actions; it is “a maker of gladness about renunciation, a maker of excitement about the Jinas’ (Buddhas’) dharma” (ŚS 3). This combination of trust and pleasure leads one on to good action; as Śāntideva says, those who always have esteem toward a respectable Buddha will abandon neither good conduct nor training (ŚS 3). So the practice of esteem helps increase one’s good karma (ŚS 317).  Moreover, to encourage the growth of esteem in a giver, when an aspiring bodhisattva receives a gift, he encourages the giver and makes him feel excited about giving it (ŚS 150).

iii. Downward Gifts: Attracting Others

When one gives for either of the above reasons (expressing nonattachment or expressing esteem), one effectively does so for one’s own spiritual benefit. But Śāntideva also says that one gives to all beings (sarvasatvebhyas, ŚSK 4), for their enjoyment (ŚSK 5), adding that one also preserves the gift for the sake of their enjoyment (satvôpabhogārtham, ŚSK 6). Here he is advocating a different kind of giving, motivated by compassion and aimed at benefitting the recipient. The distinction between the second two types of giving corresponds to Maria Heim’s (Heim 2004, 74-5) distinction between “upward” and “downward” giving, out of esteem and out of compassion.

The reasons Śāntideva offers for downward giving are not as straightforward as they may first appear. For Śāntideva, the recipient of a gift benefits less from possessing the gift object, and more from receiving it in a gift encounter. When a bodhisattva gives a gift, he attracts the recipient to the bodhisattva path, so that the recipient is more likely to become a virtuous bodhisattva. The gift object itself provides little benefit, and could even be harmful (2007, 136-75).

As well as giving possessions and more conventional goods, one also gives good karma to others through its redirection (parināmanā), as noted above. Since Śāntideva tends to see good karma as intrinsically good, in this case the recipient is more likely to benefit from the gift itself. Even so, good karma involves a potential danger, since if it is not redirected it can lead merely to dangerous wealth rather than to awakening.

b. Good Conduct

Of all the perfections, Śāntideva tells us the least about the second one, śīla. This Sanskrit and Pali term has a general sense of “good conduct” or “good habits,” but its particular meaning is less clear. Unlike the final four perfections, it is not identified specifically as the single topic of a chapter in the BCA, and the chapters identified with it in the ŚS (II and V) make little reference to it. Unlike giving, it is not discussed at systematic length in either text. Śāntideva sometimes uses the term in a broad sense that would seem to encompass all of the perfections, to the point of using it interchangeably with puṇya, good karma, or śubha, well-being (Clayton 2006, 73). ŚS chapter V, entitled Śīlapāramitāyām Anarthavarjanam — abandoning of the worthless with respect to the perfection of good conduct — seems like a miscellany of topics, describing a wide variety of actions that Śāntideva endorses. A reader may then be tempted to take up the common usage in which this good conduct refers to “morality,” “virtue” or “ethics” in a general sense (see Clayton 2006, 72-3) — perhaps even a sense that includes the other perfections.

Yet Śāntideva does give some further specification of a way in which he understands “good conduct,” conceptually distinct from the other perfections, even though he does not stick consistently to this usage. His one reference to the perfection of good conduct in the BCA proclaims: “when the mind of cessation (viraticitta) is obtained, the perfection of good conduct is understood [to exist]” (BCAP 53). The ŚS specifies the goal of good conduct in a similar vein, but is more specific about what constitutes good conduct: “whichever practices are causes of meditative concentration (samādhi), those are included in good conduct” (ŚS 121). It seems that good conduct, when understood as a single perfection, consists primarily of practices that aid one to concentrate one’s mind and still its uncontrolled activity.

This suggestion is borne out by the content of the fifth BCA chapter, which, following up the claim about the mind of cessation, details exactly these sorts of practices. (Since this chapter comes immediately before the chapter on patient endurance — the third perfection — it would be a logical place for Śāntideva to discuss good conduct, the second perfection.) The chapter begins by warning the reader of the dangers of an unrestrained mind, comparing it to a mad, rutting elephant, and then specifies a number of practices that Śāntideva claims will help the mind remain under control.  We may imagine, then, that this chapter gives us some idea of what Śāntideva means by the perfection of good conduct.

The practices bear some resemblance to Buddhist monastic rules (vinaya), although they could all be followed by lay householders and the text does not restrict them to monks. Śāntideva urges his readers to walk with a downcast gaze, as if continually meditating, but notes that they may look outward to rest their eyes or to greet someone. One should look ahead (or behind) before moving there, he says, and think about one’s actions before undertaking them; one should continually observe the positioning of one’s body. Each of these actions, Śāntideva specifies, allows one to restrain the mind (BCA V.35-40). Similarly, one should avoid idle chatter, or purposeless nervous tics (BCA V.45-6). In general, as Susanne Mrozik notes, “Close careful attention to one’s bodily movements and gestures generates mindfulness and awareness. Disciplining the body is thus a means of disciplining one’s thoughts and feelings” (Mrozik 1998, 63).

Śāntideva notes that the relationship between good conduct and meditative concentration is two-way: “One aiming at meditative concentration should have good conduct, for mindfulness and introspection; so too, one aiming at good conduct should make effort at meditative concentration.” He claims that the “complete perfection of mental action” will comes from the two “mutually enhancing causes” that are good conduct and meditative concentration (ŚS 121).

The second half of the fifth BCA chapter involves details about bodily comportment which aim at pleasing others, rather than at focusing the mind; similar instructions are found in the sixth chapter of the ŚS. It is possible, though not clear, that Śāntideva also intends these to be included under good conduct. Śāntideva here enjoins etiquette of various kinds (do not spit in public, do not make noises while eating) and a pleasant tone of speaking (BCA V.71-96, ŚS 124-7). Mrozik (2007, 75-6) notes that such actions are intended to generate prasāda, a kind of peaceful pleasure, in those who observe the bodhisattva. Lele (2007, 151-9) suggests further that the goal of generating this prasāda is to attract them to the bodhisattva path, making them more likely to enter that path and increase their well-being.

c. Patient Endurance

Śāntideva divides patient endurance (kṣānti) into three major varieties: first, enduring suffering (duṣkhâdhivāsanakṣānti); second, dharmic patience, the patient endurance that comes from reflecting on the Buddha’s teaching, the dharma (dharmanidhyānakṣānti); and third, patience toward others’ wrongdoing (parâpakāramarṣanakṣānti, ŚS 179). The first, which Śāntideva opposes to frustration (daurmanasya), is closer to the English word “endurance”; the third, which Śāntideva opposes to anger (dveṣa), is closer to the English word “patience.” For this reason it is helpful to use a two-word term like “patient endurance” to encapsulate the idea of kṣānti as a whole. Śāntideva does not link these phenomena under the rubric of patient endurance merely for the sake of convenience or etymology; rather, patient endurance has common elements that pervade them all. In all three cases, one remains calm and even happy in the face of various undesired events — pains, frustrations, wrongs — that one might face.

Dharmic patience, the second variety — as Śāntideva describes it in BCA VI.22-32 — is juxtaposed against anger, and involves being patient with others’ bad actions. For this reason, it seems largely like a subtype of the third type, patience toward wrongdoing, which involves reflecting on the fact that their actions all have causes. Śāntideva likely treats the two as distinct in order to emphasize the particular importance of metaphysical reasons for patient endurance. In terms of the actions and mental dispositions that they entail, they do not appear to be different from each other. So we may here subsume this second variety under the third, except as otherwise specified.

There are at least two ways in which enduring suffering and patience toward wrongdoing are closely related in Śāntideva’s work. First, there is a logical or analytical relationship. When one is wronged by others, it is likely to be an undesired event, and therefore experienced as suffering. So, effectively, the events that evoke patience toward wrongdoing are a subset of those that evoke the endurance of  suffering. The appropriate reactions are intertwined as well. We see this when Śāntideva discusses being the victim of theft. While he addresses theft in the context of anger, and more generally of patience toward wrongdoing, the reason he gives to remain patient is that possessions are dangerous to have anyway (BCA VI.100) — a central part of Śāntideva’s justifications for nonattachment, which itself is very closely tied to enduring suffering.

Second, there is a causal relationship. Enduring suffering, as Śāntideva discusses it, requires that one fight frustration; patience toward wrongdoing requires that one fight anger. And both of Śāntideva’s texts (ŚS 179 and BCA VI.7-8) note that anger feeds on frustration; so enduring suffering makes it easier to have patience toward wrongdoing.

i. Happiness from Enduring Suffering

Śāntideva’s case for enduring suffering is relatively straightforward: one will feel less suffering and be happier. Early in his discussion of frustration (daurmanasya), Śāntideva makes the pragmatic point that it accomplishes little. So it is not only an unpleasant mental state, but an unnecessary one: “If indeed there is a remedy, then what’s the point of frustration? And if there is no remedy, then what’s the point of frustration?” (BCA VI.10).

Enduring suffering can lead to happiness, for Śāntideva, in a particularly extreme meditative state (samādhi). He refers to this state as the sarvadharmasukhakrānta, “making happiness toward all phenomena.” The passage describing this meditative state is one of the most provocative in the entire ŚS. Śāntideva says that “for a bodhisattva who has obtained this meditative state, with respect to all sense objects, pain is felt as happiness indeed, not as suffering or as indifference” (ŚS 181). He proceeds to describe a panoply of graphic tortures in a startlingly upbeat manner. For example:

[The bodhisattva who has attained this meditative state], while being fried in oil, or while pounded like pounded sugarcane, or while crushed like a reed, or while being burned in the way that oil or ghee or yogurt are burned — has a happy thought arisen. (ŚS 181)

While a reader might cringe at the literal masochism in this passage, it is also not hard to see the power of its appeal: It strongly suggests that a bodhisattva can be happy anywhere, any time, in any condition. And there is a particular practice that the bodhisattva pursues to reach this state. Whenever he is subjected to such an unpleasant fate, he makes a mental determination or vow (pranidhāna) that everyone, from those who honor him to those who torture him, should reach the great awakening (ŚS 182). In the BCA he suggests starting with small pains to learn to endure bigger ones: “because of the practice of mild distress, even great distress is tolerable” (BCA VI.14). Prajñākaramati draws a direct connection between the two, quoting the ŚS passage in his commentary on the BCA verse.

ii. The Case Against Anger

Śāntideva’s arguments for patience toward wrongdoing consist of arguments against anger, against which this patience is juxtaposed. He lays out these arguments primarily in the sixth chapter of the BCA; for a detailed commentary on this chapter, see Thurman 2004. His arguments here derive from premises both naturalistic and supernaturalistic: “One who destroys anger is happy in this world and the next” (BCA VI.6).

Śāntideva’s naturalistic arguments against anger rest first on psychological grounds: “The mind does not get peace, nor enjoy pleasure and happiness, nor find sleep or satisfaction, when the dart of anger rests in the heart” (BCA VI.3). This set of psychological claims has a strong intuitive plausibility, in our context as well as his; it is probably not difficult for anyone to remember times that anger has negatively affected her peace of mind or pleasure or sleep.

Beyond this, Śāntideva seeks to minimize the significance of others’ wrongdoing (apakāra). He is especially concerned to neutralize insults and the destruction of praise. He asks: “The gang of contempt, harsh speech and infamy does not bind my body. Why, O mind, do you get enraged by it?” (BCA VI.53)

Śāntideva also offers severe warnings concerning the karmic consequences of anger. There is no bad karma equal to anger, he says, so patient endurance is the most effective means to reduce bad karma (BCA VI.2). He warns that anger leads to suffering in the hell realms far greater than the suffering that originally provoked the anger:

If suffering merely here and now cannot be endured, why is anger, the cause of distress in hell, not restrained? In the same way, for the sake of anger I have been placed in hells thousands of times; I have done this neither for my own sake nor for anyone else’s. (BCA VI.73-4)

There is only one kind of anger that Śāntideva seems to approve of, effectively an exception that proves the rule. He approves of anger when it is directed at anger itself: “Let anger toward anger be my choice” (BCA VI.41). More generally, he suggests elsewhere that anger at “my enemies, craving, anger and so on” (BCA IV.28) might be valuable: “Lodged in my own mind, these well-stood ones still harm me. In this very case I do not get angry. Damn, what unsuitable patience (sahiṣṇutā)!” (BCA IV.29).

Śāntideva also makes the case for dharmic patience (dharmanidhyānakṣānti) in BCA VI.22-32; this, as mentioned earlier, is patience toward wrongdoing which is informed by metaphysical insight. Śāntideva’s point here is that the emotion of anger comes out of an incorrect belief about the world — namely that other agents can appropriately be blamed for their actions. “I have no anger at my bile and so on, though they make great suffering. Why is there anger at sentient beings? They too are angry due to a cause” (BCA VI.22). Anger, whether my own or another’s, has its causes. It is not chosen; it is merely another product of the universe’s dependent arising (BCA VI.23-26). Moreover, there is no self which is capable of being an agent of anger (BCA VI.27-30). And “therefore, whether one has seen an enemy or a friend doing something wrong, having considered that the act has causes, one should become happy” (BCA VI.33). Mark Siderits (2005) refers to this argument for dharmic patience as “paleo-compatibilist,” and suggests that it can help resolve contemporary debates on free will and determinism.

These arguments against anger are phrased in terms that could convince someone not already on the path. Other arguments are directed specifically at bodhisattvas. As has been mentioned before, it is crucial for the bodhisattva to win beings over; and anger interferes with this activity, where desire (rāga) might be able on some occasions to help with it. This is why anger, in Śāntideva’s eyes, is far worse than desire, though desire and anger are both afflictions (kleṣas) that cloud the mind and lead one on to suffering (ŚS 164).

He claims further that “bodhisattvas who are not excellent in means (upāyakuśala) fear downfalls connected with desire (rāga); bodhisattvas who are excellent in means fear downfalls connected with anger, not downfalls connected with desire” (ŚS 164-5). Excellence in means (upāyakauśalya), the ability to teach others in the appropriate way to bring them onto the path, is deeply hindered by anger. Unlike desire, anger has no saving graces. Anger both creates suffering for oneself and interferes with one’s ability to benefit others; this is why nothing is as karmically bad as anger, or as karmically good as patient endurance.

d. Heroic Strength

Śāntideva devotes relatively little attention to the fourth perfection, heroic strength (vīrya). Each of his texts has a short chapter (BCA VII and ŚS X) devoted to it; parallel discussions occur in the fourth chapter of the BCA. He defines heroic strength as “excellent effort” (kuśalotsaha, BCA VII.2), effort that is both skillful and virtuous — a tireless striving on the bodhisattva path. In BCA VII, he contrasts heroic strength with laziness (ālasya, BCA VII.3). The primary point of BCA VII is to insist on the urgency of the bodhisattva’s task. It is rare to be born as a human, and a short human life leaves one with little time for adequate spiritual development, so it is crucial to devote oneself wholeheartedly to the task.

ŚS X, the shortest chapter in the text — a mere four pages — explains the importance of listening to sacred texts (śruta). The topic is surprising, since it seems tangentially related, at best, to the more straightforward heroic strength addressed in BCA VII. The connection seems to be that, to listen to sacred texts properly, one must do so tirelessly. If one does not do so, Śāntideva claims, even a sacred text can lead to  “destruction” (vināśa), probably because one reads and applies the text too selectively (ŚS 189).

e. Meditation

The fifth perfection, discussed in BCA VIII and ŚS XI-XIII, is meditation (dhyāna). Meditation for Śāntideva is very much an intellectual and even philosophical exercise, not merely a stilling of the mind; some of Śāntideva’s most famous arguments appear in a context of discussions of meditation. Śāntideva emphasizes that a calming and stilling of the mind is essential to meditation, and enjoins his reader to flee society and find a solitary spot in the wilderness in order to achieve the proper degree of undistracted calm (BCA VIII.1-40, ŚS 193-201). But becoming calm and solitary, in both texts, is only the first step to grasping arguments and transformative techniques with an explicit cognitive content.

In the BCA, the first meditation that Śāntideva describes sharpens his emphasis on solitude: one considers the foulness of the human body. Specifically, his male audience is urged to reflect on the foulness of a potential female lover. He notes that the beloved will invariably become a corpse, highlights the repulsiveness of corpses, and asks the reader rhetorically why the living beloved seems any less repulsive (VIII.41-7). He then calls attention to the repulsiveness of the body’s waste products, natural smells, and fluids (VIII.48-71). Next he notes the great effort one must take in finding and keeping a lover, and the ultimate vanity of such efforts (VIII.72-83).

This meditation takes on a strongly misogynist tone, describing as it does the repulsiveness of female bodies. A contemporary reader should keep in mind its intent as a critique of lust, the passion which so easily distracts the mind from the bodhisattva’s path. While the argument is phrased in terms of the foulness of a woman’s body, its logic would apply equally well to the foulness of a man’s body, if imagined by a heterosexual female or homosexual male meditator. (Śāntideva never inverts the argument this way himself. As Wilson 1996 notes, historically Buddhists have never turned the arguments about female foulness around to have it apply to men, even when speaking to a female audience. The point is noted here to stress the relevance of these meditations for a contemporary philosophical audience, rightly skeptical of misogynistic claims.) The ideal to achieve in this lifetime, for Śāntideva, is that of a male or female monk who forswears lust and sexuality, and he calls attention to the body’s repulsive aspects in order to convince his readers of this ideal’s value.

i. Equalization of Self and Other

The two meditations which follow in BCA VIII, on the relationship between oneself and another, are Śāntideva’s most famous. The first of these is known as the equalization of self and other (parātmasamatā). In this meditation Śāntideva argues for an ethical conclusion from a metaphysical premise: because the self is empty and unreal, it makes little sense to protect only oneself from suffering and not others.

The arguments are framed against a hypothetical objector (pūrvapakṣin) who wishes to prevent only his own suffering, but not that of others. Suffering here has a strong normative force; that suffering is bad and worthy of prevention is taken as self-evident, and Śāntideva assumes that his readers will share that assumption. When an imagined objector asks why suffering should be prevented at all, he responds, “No one disputes that!” (BCA VIII.103) If we substitute “the absence of suffering” for “pleasure,” Śāntideva’s claim here seems to work like Alasdair MacIntyre’s interpretation of Mill’s claim that we know pleasure is desirable because men desire it:

He treats the thesis that all men desire pleasure as a factual assertion which guarantees the success of an ad hominem apeal to anyone who denies his conclusion. If anyone denies that pleasure is desirable, then we can ask him, But don’t you desire it? and we know in advance that he must answer yes, and consequently must admit that pleasure is desirable. (MacIntyre 1966, 239)

To deny that suffering should be prevented at all, in other words, is to argue in bad faith: anyone who makes such a claim does not really believe it. It is not hard to see the intuitive force of Śāntideva’s claim about suffering; while one might come up with exceptions, in general most human beings in most contexts have viewed suffering as something bad and undesirable.

The selfish objector is right, then, to believe that suffering should be prevented. Where he goes awry is in focusing only on his own suffering; this focus turns out to be absurd. There is no self that endures from moment to moment, so one’s own future self is as different from one’s present self as other beings are: “If [someone else] is not protected because his suffering cannot hurt me — the sufferings of a future body are not mine. Why is that hurt protected against?” (BCA VIII.97) Śāntideva’s arguments here have been compared to those of Derek Parfit (1984), who also attacks the metaphysical premise of selfhood as a premise for an altruistic ethics.

Paul Williams (1998a, 30) notes that most commentators, including Prajñākaramati, have read this verse so that the “future body” (āgāmikāya) means only the bodies one will inhabit in future rebirths, not the future state of one’s body in the present life. A literal reading of this verse and the next would suggest that they are right; the next verse adds that “one is dead, a very different other one is born” (BCA VIII.98). So Williams thinks that “from a textual point of view” this verse must be correct. However, later Tibetan commentators, especially rGyal tshab rje, interpret the verse so that it could refer to any present suffering one might try to prevent (Williams 1998a, 32-6). The “death” and “birth” would likely then refer to the body’s non-enduring nature — dying as the present moment passes away and being born anew in the following moment — rather than to literal death and rebirth. Logically this seems a more satisfying reading. The argument seems entirely superfluous if it refers only to future births; based on everything else that Śāntideva says, one concerned with better future births should, above all, prevent the suffering of others.

Śāntideva makes an additional argument beyond the point about future selves. Even the present self should be broken up into its parts. When the opponent objects that one who suffers should only prevent the suffering that belongs to him, Śāntideva retorts: “The foot’s suffering is not the hand’s. Why does [the hand] protect [the foot]?” (BCA VIII.99)

Williams (1998b) has attempted to refute Śāntideva’s arguments against egoism, claiming that the concept of suffering or pain makes little sense without a subject or self to feel the suffering. Williams’s refutation has been controversial, provoking Barbra Clayton (Clayton 2001), John Pettit (1999) and Mark Siderits (Siderits 2000) all to defend Śāntideva’s claims.

Why do these arguments appear in the chapter on meditation, when the primary focus of that chapter seems to concern the kind of metaphysical insight that is the topic of the following chapter? Two reasons suggest themselves. First, the arguments prepare the audience for the more imaginatively focused practice of the exchange and self and other. Second, as Crosby and Skilton suggest(1995, 84-5), these meditations derive from Cittamātra (Yogācāra) metaphysical views on the ultimate equivalence of self and other.   Śāntideva considers these Cittamātra views to be only a step on the road to the highest Madhyamaka view (see BCA IX). These arguments, then,  are really true only at the level of conventional truth, not at the level of wordless ultimate reality, the object of real metaphysical insight.

ii. Exchange of Self and Other

The last meditation in the chapter is called the exchange of self and other (parātmaparivartana). In it, Śāntideva attempts to put the equalization of self and other into practice, even taking it a step further to dissolve all the meditator’s vestiges of egoism. Here he urges his readers to create “a sense of self in inferiors and others, and a sense of other in oneself,” (VIII.140) to literally form a concept of “I” (ahamkāra) with respect to others, just as one would do with respect to the “drops of semen and blood” (VIII.158) which created the entity that one would normally consider a self. The intervening verses manifest this idea in practice. Here Śāntideva switches pronouns and grammatical persons so that the third person refers to the meditator and the first person to “others.” The new “I” that is the others can then feel envy and contempt toward the “he” that was oneself.

One now imagines how “he” — that is, oneself — seems happy, wealthy and praised, while “I” — others — “am” miserable, poor and despised; “I” should envy “him” (BCA VIII.141-2). Having imagined oneself from the viewpoint of an envious inferior, one then imagines the inverse viewpoint of a contemptuous superior:

We joyous ones see him finally mistreated, and the mocking laughter of all the people here and there. That wretch even had a rivalry with me! . . . Even if he were to have wealth, we should take it forcibly, having given him a mere pittance, if he does any work for us. And he should be caused to fall from happiness. (BCA VIII.150-4)

This sadomasochistic advice and the play of pronouns work together to end  feelings of egoism or attachment to self. Meditating in this way, one comes to live entirely for others.

iii. Meditations Against the Three Poisons

The above meditations from the BCA, while Śāntideva’s most famous, are not the only meditations that he prescribes. In the ŚS, after briefly advising solitude and the control of thoughts, Śāntideva presents in turn three meditations intended to counter the three mental “poisons” which, in Buddhist thought, are responsible for suffering: desire (rāga), anger (dveṣa) and delusion (moha).

Against desire, Śāntideva describes a meditation on the foulness of the body, as in the BCA (ŚS 209-12).  To counteract anger, Śāntideva prescribes the practice of friendliness or love (maitrī, ŚS 212-19). This practice takes a number of forms, but the most notable is the redirection (parināmanā) of good karma toward others’ benefit. (This will be discussed below under “good and bad karma.”) Such acts are discussed at a number of places in Śāntideva’s texts; at ŚS 213-16 he specifically refers to the practice of friendliness, which is intended to counteract anger. The way that one redirects good karma, in practice, is through an expressly stated wish: for example, “Whoever is suffering distress of body or mind in any of the ten directions — may they obtain oceans of happiness and joy through my good karma” (BCA X.2). This rationale for karmic redirection could apply even to those skeptical whether a supernatural process of karmic causality will actually work: by regularly wishing that one’s own good deeds will benefit others’ well-being, one can at least diminish the anger that one feels toward them.

Finally, to counteract delusion, one meditates on dependent origination (pratītyasamutpāda), the Buddhist theory that all things come to exist in dependence upon other causes (ŚS 219-28). This meditation leads into Śāntideva’s discussion of the final perfection, metaphysical insight.

f. Metaphysical Insight

The sixth and final perfection in Śāntideva’s thought is prajñā, a complex term which this article renders as “metaphysical insight.” The term “insight” emphasizes the depth and transformative nature of this knowledge — as we will see, Śāntideva makes strong claims about the effects that prajñā has on its possessor, so that it is classified as a perfection alongside patient endurance and restrained good conduct. The term “metaphysical” emphasizes the specific content of this knowledge: claims about the nature of reality. This is a relatively loose and nontechnical sense of the term “metaphysics” that one may find in introductory textbooks on philosophy — for example, “Metaphysics is the attempt to say what reality is” (Solomon 2006, 113). This section begins with a discussion of the ideas and arguments that Śāntideva includes as the content of metaphysical insight, and then proceeds to discuss their significance for ethics and the conduct of life.

i. Content

Śāntideva’s views on metaphysics follow those of the Madhyamaka school of thought, associated with Nāgārjuna. (See Nagarjuna and Madhyamaka Buddhism for more detail.) For Madhyamaka, all things, especially the self, are empty (śūnya) and dependently originated (pratītyasamutpanna) — they have no essential or abiding existence. Tibetan tradition has typically associated Śāntideva with the more radical Prāsangika Mādhyamika school, as his metaphysical arguments follow their approach of reductio ad absurdum (prasanga) argument rather than the independent syllogisms (svatantra) of the Svātantrika school. On the other hand, Akira Saito (1996, 261) has argued that “we cannot be too careful” in using the term Prāsangika with reference to Śāntideva.  (See McClintock and Dreyfus 2002 for a discussion of the distinction between the Prāsangika and Svātantrika schools.)

Śāntideva’s metaphysics is widely studied and commented on, both in Tibetan tradition and in the West. (For Tibetan commentaries see Dalai Lama XIV 1988; Palden and Seunam 1993. For Western commentaries see Oldmeadow 1994; Sweet 1977.) Nevertheless, the content of Śāntideva’s metaphysics does not seem particularly original; as Michael Sweet’s book-length study of Śāntideva’s metaphysics notes,

we do not find that his philosophical concerns or patterns of argumentation differ in any significant manner from those of Nāgārjuna, and especially from those of Candrakīrti, the great systematizer of the Prāsangika-Mādhyamika who preceded Śāntideva by at least a century. (Sweet 1977, 14)

Where Śāntideva’s approach innovates is in the way that he draws ethical conclusions directly from his metaphysical premises. Many Buddhist texts draw soteriological conclusions of some sort from metaphysical premises — the nature of the universe is such that everyday life is filled with suffering but one can be liberated from it. Moreover, texts often draw ethical conclusions from these soteriological ideas. So in earlier texts there is an indirect connection from metaphysics to ethics by way of soteriology. Śāntideva, on the other hand, argues directly from metaphysics to advice about conduct in life, in a way that is relatively unusual in South Asian Buddhist literature. One exception is Candrakīrti himself, who derives ethical conclusions from metaphysics in his Catuhṣataka commentary (see Lang 2003), though his approach to doing so is significantly different from Śāntideva’s.

Śāntideva’s prasanga arguments avoid foundational claims, in the stricter sense of attempts to definitively establish a position from which other claims can be deduced. Any such position would itself be considered empty and therefore in some sense flawed. Indeed, an earlier Madhyamaka text, the Vigrahavyāvartani of Nāgārjuna, famously refuted its opponents by proclaiming: “If I had any position, then I would have a flaw [in my argument]. But I have no position; therefore I have no flaw at all” (VV 29). Rather, the approach is intended to be purely dialectical and critical, examining alternative positions and knocking them down, as Śāntideva does in BCA IX. Because Śāntideva is deconstructing concepts and deriving ethical significance from this deconstruction, William Edelglass (2007) compares his philosophy to that of Emmanuel Lévinas.

Claims to have no position may seem absurd at first glance, especially when associated with a thinker like Śāntideva who seems to make many positive claims about how one should live. Śāntideva’s response relies on the central Madhyamaka distinction between conventional (samvriti) and ultimate (paramārtha) truth (e.g. BCA IX.2). The ultimate truth is inexpressible (anabhilāpya), untaught (adeṣita) and unmanifest (aprakāśita, ŚS 256); it is nonconceptual, and therefore nonrational. But because we are caught up in illusion, seeing substance, we still need to make provisional statements at a conventional level to make ourselves and others aware of this illusion and free ourselves from it. Since the ultimate truth is inexpressible, all of Śāntideva’s actual claims need to be understood at the conventional level.

The above is what Śāntideva appears to say in his own words, at any rate. It is worth noting here that the Tibetan dGe lugs (Geluk) school argues that such claims cannot be taken literally and that in fact the ultimate truth is accessible to the intellect, although other commentators from the Sa skya (Sakya) and rNying ma (Nyingma) schools accept a more literal interpretation like the one I have just provided (Sweet 1977, 20).

The distinction between ultimate and conventional truth lends support to a number of Śāntideva’s practical arguments. Especially, it supports his self-interested case for altruism on the grounds of the bodhisattva’s happiness: “All who are suffering in the world [are suffering] because of desire for their own happiness. All who are happy in the world [are happy] because of desire for others’ happiness” (BCA VIII.129). Śāntideva does not explain how this psychological claim is supposed to work. Lele (2007, 65-6) ties the claim to Śāntideva’s theory of nonattachment (aparigraha); concern for oneself and one’s own particular interests leads to painful feelings of grief, loss, and fear when, as inevitably happens, those interests are harmed. But however such arguments are supposed to work, they would seem to be undercut by another claim of Śāntideva’s: namely, that bodhisattvas still suffer in a sense, because of their compassion for others. He claims: “Just as one whose body is on fire has no joy at all, even through all pleasures, exactly so there is no way to joy with respect to the distress of beings, for those made of compassion” (BCA VI.123; see also ŚS 156, 166).

The distinction between conventional and ultimate, however, helps one resolve this apparent problem — for the claim that bodhisattvas suffer is made merely at the conventional level of truth. Śāntideva argues that suffering itself is unreal (BCA IX.88-91); and only one who realizes the ultimate truth, it seems, will be able to really recognize this unreality. This recognition is the way in which it is possible for suffering to end, as the Third Noble Truth of Buddhism promises. It is also probably part of the reason that Śāntideva proclaims that happy people are happy because they desire others’ happiness — a bodhisattva, who has lost the illusion of self, can also lose the illusion of suffering and thereby escape it.

If suffering is unreal, however, one may wonder why it should be prevented. A similar worry applies to good and bad karma. Śāntideva claims, after all, that good and bad karma themselves arise out of illusion (BCA IX.11); like everything else we can speak of, they are ultimately empty. Clayton (2006, 97-8) argues that this point implies that ethical action, good karma, or eliminating suffering are unnecessary or insignificant. She quotes Richard Hayes (1994, 38) to the effect that maintaining a sense of the importance of ethics in such a philosophy is merely “philosophical rigour and integrity being compromised by the perceived need to preserve a social institution.” She finds herself “not quite cynical enough” to doubt Śāntideva’s sincerity in accordance with Hayes’s quote, but provides no alternative explanation for why Śāntideva might have still believed in ethical action. Lele (2007, 89-90) argues to the contrary that Śāntideva maintains his philosophical integrity through the conventional-ultimate distinction. Ultimately good and bad karma are unreal, but they are very real at the conventional level. Most people remain trapped in the conventional level, where suffering occurs, and so they experience the suffering as real. For them, it is this conventional level of truth that matters.

ii. Practical Implications

Metaphysical insight has three major ethical and soteriological implications for Śāntideva, some of which we have already seen. First, knowing the nonexistence of self will lead one to benefit others. Second, one who knows dependent origination can become more patient with others’ wrongdoing, because he will know to avoid blaming them. Finally, “one who knows emptiness is not emotionally attached to worldly phenomena, because he is independent [of them]” (ŚS 264); recognizing the emptiness of things allows one to attach less significance to them.

These implications, for Śāntideva, are not merely a matter of logical implication. There is also a practical, cause-and-effect relationship between one’s realization of the metaphysical claims and one’s actions and mental states. For this reason Luis Gómez (1994, 121) notes that the closing verses of BCA IX “leave no room for doubt that we are dealing with a technology of the self” which is also a philosophical discourse. The passage quoted above does not merely state that one who knows emptiness also knows that he should not be emotionally attached to worldly phenomena; it states further that he himself is not in fact so attached (na samhriyate). Elsewhere in the text Śāntideva makes other, similar, causal claims that metaphysical insight will cause one to feel and act differently. For example, after having made a series of logical arguments for the equivalence of self and other, he immediately comes to add: “Those whose mental dispositions are developed in this way (evam), for whom the suffering of others is equal to their loves, go down into the Avīci hell like geese [into] a lotus pond” (BCA VIII.107, emphasis added). The “in this way” (Sanskrit evam) indicates that the logical arguments themselves are a way to develop mental dispositions; hearing these arguments is the thing that develops one’s mind to treat others’ suffering equally to one’s own. Metaphysical insight is not merely an idea added to a stock of knowledge, with which one can do as one pleases; it has direct consequences for one’s emotional states.

Such a view seems perplexing to contemporary Western ears, including some informed by Buddhism. Understanding ideas often seems not to have this liberating effect. David Burton puts the problem well, in terms of his personal experience:

I do not seem to be ignorant about the impermanence of entities. I appear to understand that entities have no fixed essence and that they often change in disagreeable ways. I seem to understand that what I possess will fall out of my possession. I apparently accept that all entities must pass away. And I seem to acknowledge that my craving causes suffering. Yet I am certainly not free from craving and attachment. . . . How, then, might one preserve the common Buddhist claim that knowledge of the three characteristics of existence [i.e. nonself, impermanence and suffering] results in liberation in the face of this objection? (Burton 2004, 31)

Burton explores several potential hypotheses to resolve his question. He labels the hypothesis which seems to come closest to Śāntideva’s view as “insufficient attentiveness and reflection.” That is, that for those who have not experienced the beneficial ethical, emotional or soteriological consequences that are presumed to accrue from knowledge of Buddhist ideas, their belief in such ideas “is something they have thought about from time to time perhaps, but they do not bring it to mind often enough” (Burton 2004, 48-9).

Śāntideva suggests such a hypothesis in two ways. First, he frequently mentions the shifting and changing nature of the mind; for example, he notes that the mind is “like a river flow, unstable, broken up and dissolved when produced,” and “like lightning, unsteadily cut off in a moment” (ŚS 234). Second, within the chapter of the BCA on metaphysical insight, he speaks of “cultivating,” or meditating on, arguments: “this reasoning (vicāra) is meditated on as an antidote to that [fixation on imagination]” (BCA IX.92). This point is reinforced elsewhere in the text; as we have seen, his most famous metaphysical argument, on the equivalence of self and other (BCA VIII.90-119), occurs in the context of a particular meditation, within the BCA’s chapter on meditation (dhyāna). It is not enough, for Śāntideva, to find an argument persuasive and then move on to other things; it must be fixed in one’s mind.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Works

BCA — Śāntideva, Bodhicaryāvatāra. Edition: Bodhicaryāvatāra of Śāntideva with the commentary Pañjikā of Prajñākaramati; ed. P.L. Vaidya (1960), Buddhist Sanskrit Texts XII, Darbhanga, India: Mithila Institute. References given are to chapter and verse numbers.

BCAP — Prajñākaramati, Bodhicaryāvatārapañjikā. Edition: Bodhicaryāvatāra of Śāntideva with the commentary Pañjikā of Prajñākaramati; ed. P.L. Vaidya (1960), Buddhist Sanskrit Texts XII, Darbhanga, India: Mithila Institute. Page references given are to the Poussin edition (listed with “P” in the Vaidya edition’s margins).

NE — Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics. Edition: J. Bywater, available for download and online search at as of 14 Aug 2007.

ŚS — Śāntideva, Śikṣāsamuccaya. Edition: Çikshāsamuccaya: a compendium of Buddhistic teachings, compiled by Çāntideva chiefly from earlier Mahāyāna sūtras; ed. Cecil Bendall (1970), Bibliotheca Buddhica I, Osnabruck, Germany: Biblio Verlag.

ŚSK — Śāntideva, Śikṣāsamuccaya Kārikā, in the Bendall edition of the ŚS above.

VV — Nāgārjuna, Vigrahavyāvartani. Edition: Vigrahavyāvartani of Nāgārjuna: Sanskrit Text, eds. Christian Lindtner and Richard Mahoney (2003), available for download at as of 14 Aug 2007.

b. Translations Cited

  • Bendall, Cecil. 1970. Introduction. In Çikshāsamuccaya: A Compendium of Buddhistic Teaching Compiled By Çāntideva Chiefly From Earlier Mahāyāna-Sūtras. Osnabrück: Biblio Verlag.
  • Crosby, Kate, and Andrew Skilton. 1995. The Bodhicaryāvatāra: A New Translation. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Wallace, Vesna A., and B. Alan Wallace, eds. 1997. A Guide to the Bodhisattva Way of Life. Ithaca, NY: Snow Lion.

c. General Studies of Śāntideva

  • Brassard, Francis. 2000. The Concept of Bodhicitta in Śāntideva’s Bodhicaryāvatāra. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
  • Clayton, Barbra. 2006. Moral Theory in Śāntideva’s Śikṣāsamuccaya: Cultivating the Fruits of Virtue. London and New York: RoutledgeCurzon.
  • Cooper, David E., ed. 1998. Ethics: The Classic Readings. Oxford: Blackwell Publishers.
  • Dayal, Har. 1970. The Bodhisattva Doctrine in Buddhist Sanskrit Literature. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
  • Griffiths, Paul J. 1999. Religious Reading: The Place of Reading in the Practice of Religion. Oxford, UK: Oxford University Press.
  • Gyatso, Geshe Kelsang. 1986. Meaningful to Behold: A Commentary to Shantideva’s Guide to the Bodhisattva’s Way of Life. London: Tharpa Publications.
  • Harvey, Peter. 2000. An Introduction to Buddhist Ethics: Foundations, Values and Issues. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press.
  • Hedinger, Jürg. 1984. Aspekte der Schulung in der Laufbahn eines Bodhisattva: Dargestellt nach dem Śikṣāsamuccaya des Śāntideva. Wiesbaden: Otto Harrassowitz.
  • Lele, Amod. 2007. Ethical Revaluation in the Thought of Śāntideva. Unpublished PhD dissertation, Harvard University.
  • Mahoney, Richard. 2002. Of the Progress of the Bodhisattva: The Bodhisattvamārga in the Śikṣāsamuccaya. University of Canterbury.
  • Pezzali, Amalia. 1968. Śāntideva: Mystique Bouddhiste Des Viie Et Viiie Siècles. Florence: Vallecchi Editore.
  • Rinpoche, Thrangu. 2002. A Guide to the Bodhisattva’s Way of Life of Shantideva: A Commentary. Delhi: Sri Satguru Publications.
  • Tobden, Geshe Yeshe. 2005. The Way of Awakening: A Commentary on Shantideva’s Bodhicharyavatara. Somerville, MA: Wisdom.
  • Williams, Paul. 1995. General Introduction: Śāntideva and His World. In The Bodhicaryāvatāra. Ed. Kate Crosby, and Andrew Skilton, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

d. Specialized Studies

  • Clayton, Barbra. 2001. Compassion as a Matter of Fact: The Argument From No-Self to Selflessness in Śāntideva’s Śikṣāsamuccaya. Contemporary Buddhism 2 (1): 83-97.
  • Dalai Lama XIV. 1988. Transcendent Wisdom: A Commentary on the Ninth Chapter of Śāntideva’s Guide to the Bodhisattva Way of Life. Ithaca, NY: Snow Lion.
  • de Jong, J.W. 1975. La légende de Śāntideva. Indo-Iranian Journal 16 (3): 161-82.
  • de Rachewiltz, Igor. 1996. The Mongolian Tanjur Version of the Bodhicaryāvatāra, Edited and Transcribed, With a Word-Index and a Photo-Reproduction of the Original Text (1748). Wiesbaden, Germany: Harrassowitz.
  • Edelglass, William. 2007. Ethics and the Subversion of Conceptual Reification in Lévinas and Śāntideva. In Deconstruction and the Ethical in Asian Thought. Ed. Youru Wang, London and New York: Routledge.
  • Gómez, Luis O. 1994. Presentations of Self: Personal Dimensions of Ritualized Speech. In Other Selves: Autobiography and Biography in Cross-Cultural Perspective. Ed. Phyllis Granoff, and Koichi Shinohara, Oakville, ON and Buffalo, NY: Mosaic Press.
  • Gómez, Luis O. 1999. The Way of the Translators: Three Recent Translations of Śāntideva’s Bodhicaryāvatāra. Buddhist Literature 1 262-354.
  • Goodman, Charles. 2008. Consequentialism, Agent-Neutrality, and Mahāyāna Ethics. Philosophy East and West 58 (1): 17-35.
  • Harrison, Paul. 2007. The Case of the Vanishing Poet: New Light on Śāntideva and the Śikṣā-Samuccaya. In Festschrift für Michael Hahn, zum 65. Geburtstag von Freunden und Schülern Überreicht. Ed. Konrad Klaus, and Jens-Uwe Hartmann. Vienna: Arbeitskreis für Tibetische und Buddhistische Studien.
  • Kanaoka, S. 1963. Regional Characteristics of Mongolian Buddhism: A Study on the Basis of the “Bodhicaryāvatāra”. Bukkyo Shigaku 10 (4): 15-24.
  • Palden, Khentchen Kunzang, and Minyak Kunzang Seunam. 1993. Comprendre La Vacuité: Deux Commentaires Du Chapitre Ix De La Marche Vers L’éveil De Shāntideva. Peyzac-le-Moustier, France: Éditions Padmakara.
  • Mrozik, Susanne. 1998. The Relationship Between Morality and the Body in Monastic Training According to the Śikṣāsamuccaya. Harvard University.
  • Mrozik, Susanne. 2007. Virtuous Bodies: The Physical Dimensions of Morality in Buddhist Ethics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Oldmeadow, P.R. 1994. A Study of the Wisdom Chapter (Prajñāparamitā Pariccheda) of the Bodhicaryāvatārapañjikā of Prajñākaramati. Australian National University.
  • Onishi, Kaoru. 2003. The Bodhicaryāvatāra and Its Monastic Aspects: On the Problem of Representation. University of Michigan.
  • Pettit, John. 1999. Altruism and Reality: Studies in the Philosophy of the Bodhicharyavatara. Journal of Buddhist Ethics 6.
  • Saito, Akira. 1993. A Study of Akṣayamati (=Śāntideva)’s Bodhisattvacaryāvatāra as Found in the Tibetan Manuscripts From Tun-Huang. Faculty of Humanities, Miye University.
  • Saito, Akira. 1996. Śāntideva in the History of Mādhyamika Philosophy. In Buddhism in India and Abroad: An Integrating Influence in Vedic and Post-Vedic Perspective. Ed. Kalpakam Sankarnarayan, Motohiro Yoritomi, and Shubhada A. Joshi. Mumbai: Somaiya Publications Pvt. Ltd.
  • Siderits, Mark. 2000. The Reality of Altruism: Reconstructing Śāntideva. Philosophy East and West 50 (3): 412-24.
  • Siderits, Mark. 2005. Freedom, Caring and Buddhist Philosophy. Contemporary Buddhism 6 (2): 87-113.
  • Sweet, Michael J. 1977. Śāntideva and the Mādhyamika: The Prajñāpāramitā-Pariccheda of the Bodhicaryāvatāra. University of Wisconsin-Madison.
  • Sweet, Michael J. 1996. Mental Purification (Blo Sbyong): A Native Tibetan Genre of Religious Literature. In Tibetan Literature: Studies in Genre. Ed. José Ignacio Cabezón, and Roger R. Jackson. Ithaca, NY: Snow Lion.
  • Thurman, Robert A.F. 2004. Anger: The Seven Deadly Sins. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Williams, Paul. 1998a. Altruism and Reality: Studies in the Philosophy of the Bodhicaryāvatāra. Richmond, UK: Curzon Press.
  • Williams, Paul. 1998b. The Absence of Self and the Removal of Pain: How Śāntideva Destroyed the Bodhisattva Path. In Altruism and Reality: Studies in the Philosophy of the Bodhicaryāvatāra, Richmond, UK: Curzon Press.

e. Related Interest

  • Burton, David. 2004. Buddhism, Knowledge, and Liberation: A Philosophical Analysis of Suffering. Aldershot, England; Burlington, VT: Ashgate.
  • Chang, Garma C.C., ed. 1991. A Treasury of Mahāyāna Sūtras: Selections From the Mahāratnakūṭa Sūtra. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
  • Harrison, Paul. 1987. Who Gets to Ride in the Great Vehicle? Self-Image and Identity Among Followers of the Early Mahāyāna. Journal of the International Association of Buddhist Studies 10 (2): 67-89.
  • Hayes, Richard. 1994. The Analysis of Karma in Vasubandhu’s Abhidharmakośabhāṣya. In Hermeneutical Paths to the Sacred Worlds of India. Ed. Katherine K. Young, Atlanta: Scholars Press.
  • Heim, Maria. 2004. Theories of the Gift in South Asia: Hindu, Buddhist and Jain Reflections on Dāna. New York and Oxford: Routledge.
  • Hibbets, Maria. 2000. The Ethics of Esteem. Journal of Buddhist Ethics 7 26-42.
  • Kajiyama, Yuichi. 1989. Transfer and Transformation of Merits in Relation to Emptiness. In Studies in Buddhist Philosophy (Selected Papers). Ed. Katsumi Minaki. Kyoto: Rinsen Book Co.
  • Keown, Damien. 2005. Buddhism: Morality Without Ethics? In Buddhist Studies From India to America: Essays in Honor of Charles S. Prebish. Ed. Damien Keown. London: Routledge.
  • Lang, Karen. 2003. Four Illusions: Candrakīrti’s Advice to Travelers on the Bodhisattva Path. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair. 1966. A Short History of Ethics: A History of Moral Philosophy From the Homeric Age to the Twentieth Century. New York: Touchstone.
  • McClintock, Sara, and Georges Dreyfus, eds. 2002. The Svātantrika-Prāsaṅgika Distinction: What Difference Does a Difference Make? Somerville, MA: Wisdom Publiccations.
  • Nattier, Jan. 2003. A Few Good Men: The Bodhisattva Path According to the Inquiry of Ugra (Ugraparipṛcchā). Honolulu: University of Hawai’i Press.
  • Parfit, Derek. 1984. Reasons and Persons. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Pye, Michael. 1978. Skilful Means: A Concept in Mahayana Buddhism. London: Duckworth.
  • Solomon, Robert C. 2006. The Big Questions: A Short Introduction to Philosophy. Belmont, CA: Thomson Wadsworth.
  • Sprung, Mervyn. 1979. Lucid Exposition of the Middle Way: The Essential Chapters From the Prasannapadā of Candrakīrti. Boulder, CO: Prajñā Press.
  • Tatz, Mark. 1994. The Skill in Means (Upāyakauśalya) Sūtra. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
  • Wilson, Liz. 1996. Charming Cadavers: Horrific Figurations of the Feminine in Indian Buddhist Hagiographic Literature. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.

Author Information

Amod Lele
Boston University

Buddha (c. 500s B.C.E.)

buddhaThe historical Buddha, also known as Gotama Buddha, Siddhārtha Gautama, and Buddha Śākyamuni, was born in Lumbini, in the Nepalese region of Terai, near the Indian border. He is one of the most important Asian thinkers and spiritual masters of all time, and he contributed to many areas of philosophy, including epistemology, metaphysics and ethics. The Buddha’s teaching formed the foundation for Buddhist philosophy, initially developed in South Asia, then later in the rest of Asia. Buddhism and Buddhist philosophy now have a global following.

In epistemology, the Buddha seeks a middle way between the extremes of dogmatism and skepticism, emphasizing personal experience, a pragmatic attitude, and the use of critical thinking toward all types of knowledge. In ethics, the Buddha proposes a threefold understanding of action: mental, verbal, and bodily. In metaphysics, the Buddha argues that there are no self-caused entities, and that everything dependently arises from or upon something else. This allows the Buddha to provide a criticism of souls and personal identity; that criticism forms the foundation for his views about the reality of rebirth and an ultimate liberated state called “Nirvana.” Nirvana is not primarily an absolute reality beyond or behind the universe but rather a special state of mind in which all the causes and conditions responsible for rebirth and suffering have been eliminated. In philosophical anthropology, the Buddha explains human identity without a permanent and substantial self. The doctrine of non-self, however, does not imply the absolute inexistence of any type of self whatsoever, but is compatible with a conventional self composed of five psycho-physical aggregates, although all of them are unsubstantial and impermanent. Selves are thus conceived as evolving processes causally constrained by their past.

Table of Contents

  1. Interpreting the Historical Buddha
    1. Dates
    2. Sources
    3. Life
    4. Significance
  2. The Buddha’s Epistemology
    1. The Extremes of Dogmatism and Skepticism
    2. The Role of Personal Experience and the Buddha’s Wager
    3. Interpretations of the Buddha’s Advice to the Kālāma People
    4. Higher Knowledge and the Question of Empiricism
  3. The Buddha’s Cosmology and Metaphysics
    1. The Universe and the Role of Gods
    2. The Four Noble Truths or Realities
    3. Ontology of Suffering: the Five Aggregates
    4. Arguments for the Doctrine of Non-self
    5. Human Identity and the Meaning of Non-self
    6. Causality and the Principle of Dependent Arising
  4. Nirvana and the Silence of the Buddha
    1. Two Kinds of Nirvana and the Undetermined Questions
    2. Eternalism, Nihilism, and the Middle Way
  5. Buddhist Ethics
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Interpreting the Historical Buddha

a. Dates

There is no complete agreement among scholars and Buddhist traditions regarding the dates of the historical Buddha. The most common dates among Buddhists are those of the Theravāda school, 623-543 B.C.E. From the middle of the 19th century until the late 20th century, Western scholars had believed the dates of the Buddha to be ca. 560-480 B.C.E. However, after the publication in 1991-2 of the proceedings of the international symposium on the date of the historical Buddha held in Göttingen in 1988, the original consensus on these dates no longer exists.

Although there is no conclusive evidence for any specific date, most current scholars locate the Buddha’s life one hundred years earlier, around the fifth century B.C.E. Some of the new dates for the Buddha’s “death” or more accurately, for his parinirvāṇa are: ca. 404 B.C.E. (R. Gombrich), between 410-390 B.C.E. (K.R. Norman), ca. 400 B.C.E. (R. Hikata), ca. 397 B.C.E. (K.T.S. Sarao), between ca.400-350 B.C.E. (H. Bechert), 383 B.C.E. (H. Nakamura), 368 B.C.E. (A. Hirakawa), between 420-380 B.C.E. (A. Bareau).

b. Sources

The historical Buddha did not write down any of his teachings, they were passed down orally from generation to generation for at least three centuries. Some scholars have attempted to distinguish the Buddha’s original teachings from those developed by his early disciples. Unfortunately, the contradictory conclusions have led most scholars to be skeptical about the possibility of knowing what the Buddha really taught. This however, does not mean that all Buddhist texts that attribute teachings to the Buddha are equally valuable to reconstruct his thought. The early sūtras in Pāli and other Middle Indo-Aryan languages are historically and linguistically closer to the cultural context of the Buddha than Mahāyāna sūtras in Sanskrit, Tibetan, and Chinese. This does not imply that later translations of the early sūtras in Chinese (there are no Tibetan translations of the early sūtras) are less authentic or useless in reconstructing the philosophy of the Buddha. On the contrary, the comparative study of Pāli and Chinese versions of the early sūtras can help to infer what might have been the Buddha’s position on a number of issues.

Following what seems to be a growing scholarly tendency, I will reconstruct the philosophy of the historical Buddha by drawing on the Sutta Piṭaka of the Pāli canon. More specifically, our main sources are the first four Pāli Nikāyas (Dīgha, Majjhima, Saṃyutta, Aṅguttara) and some texts of the fifth Pāli Nikāya (Dhammapada, Udāna, Itivuttaka, and Sutta Nipāta). I do not identify these sources with the Buddha’s “ipsissima verba,” that is, with “the very words” of the Buddha, even less with his “actual” thought. Whether these sources are faithful to the actual thought and teachings of the historical Buddha is an unanswerable question; I can only say that to my knowledge there are not better sources to reconstruct the philosophy of the Buddha.

According to the traditional Buddhist account, shortly after the Buddha’s death five hundred disciples gathered to compile his teachings. The Buddha’s personal assistant, Ānanda, recited the first part of the Buddhist canon, the Sūtra Piṭaka, which contains discourses in dialogue form between the Buddha, his disciples, and his contemporaries on a variety of doctrinal and spiritual questions. Ānanda is reported to have recited the sutras just as he had heard them from the Buddha; that is why Buddhist sutras begin with the words “Thus have I heard.” Another disciple, Upāli, recited the second part of the Buddhist canon, the Vinaya Piṭaka, which also contains sutras, but primarily addresses the rules that govern a monastic community. After the recitation of Ānanda and Upāli, the other disciples approved what they had heard and communally recited the teachings as a sign of agreement. The third part of the Buddhist canon or Abhidharma Piṭaka, was not recited at that moment. The Theravāda tradition claims that the Buddha taught the Abhidharma while visiting the heaven where his mother was residing.

From a scholarly perspective, the former account is questionable. It might be the case that a large collection of Buddhist texts was written down for the first time in Sri Lanka during the first century B.C.E. However, the extant Pāli canon shows clear signs of historical development in terms of both content and language. The three parts of the Pāli canon are not as contemporary as the traditional Buddhist account seems to suggest: the Sūtra Piṭaka is older than the Vinaya Piṭaka, and the Abhidharma Piṭaka represents scholastic developments originated at least two centuries after the other two parts of the canon. The Vinaya Piṭaka appears to have grown gradually as a commentary and justification of the monastic code (Prātimokṣa), which presupposes a transition from a community of wandering mendicants (the Sūtra Piṭaka period ) to a more sedentary monastic community (the Vinaya Piṭaka period). Even within the Sūtra Piṭaka it is possible to detect older and later texts.

Neither the Sūtra Piṭaka nor the Vinaya Piṭaka of the Pāli canon could have been recited at once by one person and repeated by the entire Buddhist community. Nevertheless, the Sūtra Piṭaka of the Pāli canon is of particular importance in reconstructing the philosophy of Buddha for four main reasons. First, it contains the oldest texts of the only complete canon of early Indian Buddhism, which belong to the only surviving school of that period, namely, the Theravāda school, prevalent in Sri Lanka and Southeast Asia. Second, it has been preserved in a Middle Indo-Aryan language closely related to various Prakrit dialects spoken in North of India during the third century B.C.E., including the area where the Buddha spent most of his teaching years (Magadha). Third, it expresses a fairly consistent set of doctrines and practices. Fourth, it is strikingly similar to another version of the early Sūtra Piṭaka extant in Chinese (Āgamas). This similarity seems to indicate that a great part of the Sūtra Piṭaka in Pāli does not contain exclusively Theravāda texts, and belongs to a common textual tradition probably prior to the existence of Buddhist schools.

c. Life

Since the Pāli Nikāyas contain much more information about the teachings of the Buddha than about his life, it seems safe to postulate that the early disciples of the Buddha were more interested in preserving his teachings than in transmitting all the details of his life. The first complete biographies of the Buddha as well as the Jātaka stories about his former lives appeared centuries later, even after, and arguably as a reaction against, the dry lists and categorizations of early Abhidharma literature. The first complete biography of the Buddha in Pāli is the Nidānakathā, which serves as an introduction to the Jātaka verses found in the fifth Pāli Nikāya. In Sanskrit, the most popular biographies of the Buddha are the Buddhacarita attributed to the Indian poet Aśvaghoṣa (second century C.E), the Mahāvastu, and the Lalitavistara, both composed in the first century C.E.

The first four Pāli Nikāyas contain only fragmented information about the Buddha’s life. Especially important are the Mahāpadāna-suttanta, the Ariyapariyesanā-suttanta, the Mahāsaccaka-suttanta, and the Mahāparinibbāna-suttanta. According to the Mahāpadāna-suttanta, the lives of all Buddhas or perfectly enlightened beings follow a similar pattern. Like all Buddhas of the past, the Buddha of this cosmic era, also known as Gautama (Gotama in Pāli), was born into a noble family. The Buddha’s parents were King Śuddhodana and Queen Māyā. He was a member of the Śakya clan and his name was Siddhartha Gautama. Even though he was born in Lumbinī while his mother was traveling to her parents’ home, he spent the first twenty-nine years of his life in the royal capital, Kapilavastu, in the Nepalese region of Terai, close to the Indian border.

Like all past Buddhas, the conception and birth of Gautama Buddha are considered miraculous events. For instance, when all Buddhas descend into their mothers’ wombs from a heaven named Tuṣita, a splendid light shines forth and the entire universe quakes; their mothers are immaculate, healthy, and without pain of any sort during their ten months of pregnancy, but they die a week after giving birth. Buddha babies are born clean, though they are ritually bathed with two streams of water that fall from the sky; they all take seven steps toward the north and solemnly announce that this is their last rebirth.

Like former Buddhas, prince Siddhartha enjoyed all types of luxuries and sensual pleasures during his youth. Unsatisfied with this type of life, he had a crisis when he realized that everything was ephemeral and that his existence was subject to old age, sickness, and death. After seeing the serene joy of a monk and out of compassion for all living beings, he renounced his promising future as prince in order to start a long quest for a higher purpose, nirvāṇa (Pali nibbāna), which entails the cessation of old age, sickness and death. Later traditions speak of the Buddha as abandoning his wife Yaśodharā immediately after she gave birth to Rāhula, the Buddha’s only son. The Pāli Nikāyas, however, do not mention this story, and refer to Rāhula only as a young monk.

According to the Ariyapariyesanā-suttanta and the Mahāsaccaka-suttanta, the Buddha tried different spiritual paths for six years. First, he practiced yogic meditation under the guidance of Ālāra Kālāma and Uddaka Rāmaputta. After experiencing the states of concentration called base of nothingness and base of neither-perception-nor-non-perception, he realized that these lofty states did not lead to nirvana. Then the Buddha began to practice breathing exercises and fasting. The deterioration of his health led the Buddha to conclude that extreme asceticism was equally ineffective in attaining nirvana. He thus resumed eating solid food; after recovering his health, he began to practice a more moderate spiritual path, the middle path, which avoids the extremes of sensual self-indulgence and self-mortification. Soon after, the Buddha experienced enlightenment, or awakening, under a bodhi-tree. First he was inclined to inaction rather than to teaching what he had discovered. However, he changed his mind after the god Brahmā Sahampati asked him to teach. Out of compassion for all living beings, he decided to start a successful teaching career that lasted forty-five years.

d. Significance

It would be simplistic to dismiss all supernatural aspects of the Buddha’s life as false and consider historically true only those elements that are consistent with our contemporary scientific worldview. However, this approach towards the Buddha’s life was prevalent in the nineteenth century and a great part of the twentieth century. Today it is seen as problematic because it imposes modern western ideals of rationality onto non-western texts. Here I set aside the question of historical truth and speak exclusively of significance. The significance of all the biographies of Buddha does not lie in their historical accuracy, but rather in their effectiveness to convey basic Buddhist ideas and values throughout history. Even today, narratives about the many deeds of Buddha are successfully used to introduce Buddhists of all latitudes into the main values and teachings of Buddhism.

The supernatural elements of the Buddha’s life are as historically significant as the natural ones because they help to understand the way Buddhists conceived – and in many places continue to conceive – the Buddha. Like followers of other religious leaders, Buddhist scribes tended to glorify the sanctity of their foundational figure with extraordinary events and spectacular accomplishments. In this sense, the narratives of the Buddha are perhaps better understood as hagiographies rather than as biographies. The historical truth behind hagiographies is impossible to determine: how can we tell whether or not the Buddha was conceived without sexual intercourse; whether or not he was able to talk and walk right after his birth; whether or not he could walk over water, levitate, fly, and ascend into heaven at will? How do we know whether the Buddha was really tempted by Māra the evil one; whether there was an earthquake at the moment of his birth and death? The answers to these questions are a matter of faith. If the interpreter does not believe in the supernatural, then many narratives will be dismissed as historically false. However, for some Buddhists the supernatural events that appear in the life of Buddha did take place and are historically true.

The significance of the hagiographies of the Buddha is primarily ethical and spiritual. In fact, even if the life of Buddha did not take place as the hagiographies claim, the ethical values and the spiritual path they illustrate remain significant. Unlike other religions, the truth of Buddhism does not depend on the historicity of certain events in the life of the Buddha. Rather, the truth of Buddhism depends on the efficacy of the Buddhist path exemplified by the life of the Buddha and his disciples. In other words, if the different Buddhist paths inspired by the Buddha are useful to overcome existential dissatisfaction and suffering, then Buddhism is true regardless of the existence of the historical Buddha.

The fundamental ethical and spiritual point behind the Buddha’s life is that impermanent, conditioned, and contingent things such as wealth, social position, power, sensual pleasures, and even lofty meditative states, cannot generate a state of ultimate happiness. In order to overcome the profound existential dissatisfaction that all ephemeral and contingent things eventually generate, one needs to follow a comprehensive path of ethical and mental training conducive to the state of ultimate happiness called nirvana.

2. The Buddha’s Epistemology

a. The Extremes of Dogmatism and Skepticism

While the Buddha’s view of the spiritual path is traditionally described as a middle way between the extremes of self-indulgence and self-mortification, the Buddha’s epistemology can be interpreted as a middle way between the extremes of dogmatism and skepticism.

The extreme of dogmatism is primarily represented in the Pāli Nikāyas by Brahmanism. Brahmanism was a ritualistic religion that believed in the divine revelation of the Vedas, thought that belonging to a caste was determined by birth, and focused on the performance of sacrifice. Sacrifices involved the recitation of hymns taken from the Vedas and in many cases the ritual killing of animals.

Ritual sacrifices were offered to the Gods (gods for Buddhism) in exchange for prosperity, health, protection, sons, long life, and immortality. Only the male members of the highest caste, the priestly caste of Brahmins, could afford the professional space to seriously study the three Vedas (the Atharva Veda did not exist, or if it existed, it was not part yet of the Brahmanic tradition). Since only Brahmins knew the three Vedas, only they could recite the hymns necessary to properly perform the ritual sacrifice. Both ritual sacrifice and the social ethics of the caste system were seen as an expression of the cosmic order (Dharma) and as necessary to preserve that order.

Epistemologically speaking, Brahmanism emphasized the triple knowledge of the Vedas, and dogmatic faith in their content: “in regard to the ancient Brahmanic hymns that have come down through oral transmission and in the scriptural collections, the Brahmins come to the definite conclusion: ‘Only this is true, anything else is wrong’ ” (M.II.169).

The extreme of skepticism is represented in the Pāli Nikāyas by some members of the Śramanic movement, which consisted of numerous groups of spiritual seekers and wandering philosophers. The Sanskrit word “śramana” means “those who make an effort,” and probably refers to those who practice a spiritual discipline requiring individual effort, not just rituals performed by others. In order to become a śramana it was necessary to renounce one’s life as householder and enter into an itinerant life, which entailed the observance of celibacy and a simple life devoted to spiritual cultivation. Most śramanas lived in forests or in secluded places wandering from village to village where they preached and received alms in exchange.

The Śramanic movement was extremely diverse in terms of doctrines and practices. Most śramanas believed in free will as well as the efficacy of moral conduct and spiritual practices in order to attain liberation from the cycle of reincarnations. However, there was a minority of śramanas who denied the existence of the after life, free will, and the usefulness of ethical conduct and other spiritual practices. Probably as a reaction to these two opposite standpoints, some śramanas adopted a skeptic attitude denying the possibility of knowledge about such matters. Skeptics are described by the Buddha as replying questions by evasion (D.I.58-9), and as engaging in verbal wriggling, in eel-wriggling (amarāvikkhepa): “I don’t say it is like this. And I don’t say it is like that. And I don’t say it is otherwise. And I don’t say it is not so. And I don’t say it is not not so” (M.I. 521).

b. The Role of Personal Experience and the Buddha’s Wager

In contrast to Brahmanic dogmatism, the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas did not claim to be omniscient (M.I.482); in fact, he proposed a critical attitude toward all sources of knowledge. In the Majjhima Nikāya (II.170-1), the Buddha challenges Brahmins who accept Vedic scriptures out of faith (saddhā) and oral tradition (anussava); he compares those who blindly follow scripture and tradition without having direct knowledge of what they believe with “a file of blind men each in touch with the next: the first one does not see, the middle one does not see, and the last one does not see.” The Buddha also warns Brahmins against knowledge based on likeability or emotional inclination (ruci), reflection on reasons (ākāraparivitakka), and consideration of theories (diṭṭhinijjhānakkhanti). These five sources of knowledge may be either true or false; that is, they do not provide conclusive grounds to claim dogmatically that “only this is true, anything else is wrong.”

Dogmatic claims of truth were not the monopoly of Brahmins. In the Majjhima Nikāya (I.178), the Buddha uses the simile of the elephant footprint to question dogmatic statements about him, his teachings, and his disciples: he invites his followers to critically investigate all the available evidence (different types of elephant footprints and marks) until they know and see for themselves (direct perception of the elephant in the open). The Pāli Nikāyas also refer to many śramanas who hold dogmatic views and as a consequence are involved in heated doctrinal disputes. The conflict of dogmatic views is often described as “a thicket of views, a wilderness of views, a contortion of views, a vacillation of views, a fetter of views. It is beset by suffering, by vexation, by despair, and by fever, and it does not lead to disenchantment, to dispassion, to cessation, to peace, to higher knowledge, to enlightentment, to Nibbāna” (M.I.485).

Public debates were common and probably a good way to gain prestige and converts. Any reputed Brahmin or śramana had to have not only the ability to speak persuasively but also the capacity to argue well. Rational argument played an important role in justifying doctrines and avoiding defeat in debate, which implied conversion to the other’s teaching. At the time of the Buddha many of these debates seem to have degenerated into dialectical battles that diverted from spiritual practice and led to disorientation, anger, and frustration. Although the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas utilizes reasoning to justify his positions in debates and conversations with others, he discourages dogmatic attachment to doctrines including his own (see the simile of the raft, M.I.135), and the use of his teachings for the sake of criticizing others and for winning debates (M.I.132).

Unlike the skepticism of some śramanas, the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas takes clear stances on ethical and spiritual issues, and rejects neither the existence of right views (M.I.46-63) nor the possibility of knowing certain things as they are (yathābhūtaṃ). In order to counteract skepticism, the Buddha advises to the Kālāma people “not go by oral tradition, by succession of disciples, by hearsay, by the content of sacred scripture, by logical consistency, by inference, by reflection on reasons, by consideration of theories, by appearance, by respect to a teacher.” Instead, the Buddha recommends knowing things for oneself as the ultimate criterion to adjudicate between conflicting claims of truth (A.I.189).

When personal experience is not available to someone, the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas proposes taking into account what is praised or censored by the wise, as well as a method to calculate the benefits of following certain opinions called the incontrovertible teaching (apaṇṇakadhamma), which, in some ways, resembles Pascal’s wager. According to the incontrovertible teaching, it would be better to believe in certain doctrines because they produce more benefits than others. For instance, even if there is no life after death and if good actions do not produce good consequences, still a moral person is praised in this life by the wise, whereas the immoral person is censured by society. However, if there is life after death and good action produce happy consequences, a moral person is praised in this life, and after death he or she goes to heaven. On the contrary, the immoral person is censured in this life, and after death he or she goes to hell (M.I.403). Therefore, it is better to believe that moral actions produce good consequences even if we do not have personal experience of karma and rebirth.

c. Interpretations of the Buddha’s Advice to the Kālāma People

Some have interpreted the Buddha’s advice to the Kālāma people as an iconoclast rejection of tradition and faith. This, however, does little justice to the Pāli Nikāyas, where the Buddha is said to be part of a long and respectable tradition of past Buddhas, and where the first Brahmins are sometimes commended by their holiness. The Buddha shows respect for many traditional beliefs and practices of his time, and rejects only those that are unjustified, useless, or conducive to suffering for oneself and others.

Faith in the Buddha, his teachings, and his disciples, is highly regarded in the Pāli Nikāyas: it is the first of the five factors of striving (M.II.95-6), and a necessary condition to practice the spiritual path (M.III.33). Buddhist faith, however, is not unconditional or an end in and of itself but rather a means towards direct knowledge that must be based on critical examination, supported by reasons, and eventually verified or rooted in vision (dassanamūlikā) (M.I.320).

Another common interpretation of the advice to the Kālāmas is that for the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas only personal experience provides reliable knowledge. However, this is misleading because analogical and inferential reasoning are widely used by the Buddha and his disciples to teach others as well as in debates with non-Buddhists. Similarly, analytical or philosophical meditation is a common practice for the attainment of liberation through wisdom. Personal experience, like any other means of knowledge is to be critically examined. Except in the case of Buddhas and liberated beings, personal experience is always tainted by affective and cognitive prejudices.

The Pāli Nikāyas might give the first impression of endorsing a form of naïve or direct realism: that is, the Buddha and his disciples seem to think that the world is exactly as we perceive it to be. While it is true that the Pāli Nikāyas do not question the common sense connection between objects of knowledge and the external world, there are some texts that might support a phenomenalist reading. For instance, the Buddha defines the world as the six senses (five ordinary senses plus the mind) and their respective objects (S.IV.95), or as the six senses, the six objects, and the six types of consciousness that arise in dependence on them (S.IV.39-40).

Here, the epistemology of the Buddha is a special form of realism that allows both for the direct perception of reality and the constructions of those less realized. Only Buddhas and liberated beings perceive the world directly; that is, they see the Dharma, whose regularity and stability remains independent of the existence of Buddhas (S.II.25). Unenlightened beings, on the other hand, see the world indirectly through a veil of negative emotions and erroneous views. Some texts go so far as to suggest that the world is not simply seen indirectly, but rather that it is literally constructed by our emotional dispositions. For instance, in the Majjhima Nikāya (I.111), the Buddha explicitly states that “what one feels, one perceives” (Yaṃ vedeti, taṃ sañjānāti). That is, our knowledge is formed by our feelings. The influence of feelings in our ways of knowing can also be inferred from the twelve-link chain of dependent arising, which explains the arising and cessation of suffering. The second link, saṅkhāra, or formations, conditions the arising of the third link, consciousness. The term saṅkhāra literally means “put together,” connoting the constructive role of the mental factors that fall into this category, many of them affective in nature.

Similarly, the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas says that “with what one has mentally constructed as the root cause (Yaṃ papañceti tato nidānaṃ), perceptions, concepts, and [further] mental constructions (papañcasaññāsaṅkhā) beset a man with respect to past, future, and present forms…sounds…odours…flavors…tangibles…mind-objects cognizable by the eye…ear… nose…tongue…body…mind” (M.I.111-112). That is, the knowledge of unenlightened beings has papañca, or mental constructions, as its root cause. The word papañca is a technical term that literally means diversification or proliferation; it refers to the tendency of unenlightened minds to construct or fabricate concepts conducive to suffering, especially essentialist and ego-related concepts such as “I” and “mine,” concepts which lead to a variety of negative mental states such as craving, conceit, and dogmatic views about the self (Ñāṇananda 1971).

It is precisely because our experiences are affectively and cognitively conditioned that the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas advocates a critical approach toward all sources of knowledge, including personal experience. Even the lofty experiences derived from meditation are to be analyzed carefully because they might lead to false opinions about the nature of the self, the world, and the after life. The epistemological ideal is to know things directly beyond mental constructions (papañca), which presupposes the “tranquilization of all mental formations” (sabbasaṅkhārasamatha).

d. Higher Knowledge and the Question of Empiricism

Contemplative experiences are of two main types: meditative absorptions or abstractions (jhāna), and higher or direct knowledge (abhiññā). There are six classes of higher or direct knowledge: the first one refers to a variety of supernatural powers including levitation and walking on water; in this sense, it is better understood as a know-how type of knowledge. The second higher knowledge is literally called “divine ear element” or clairaudience. The third higher knowledge is usually translated as telepathy, though it means simply the ability to know the underlying mental state of others, not the reading of their minds and thoughts.

The next three types of higher knowledge are especially important because they were experienced by the Buddha the night of his enlightenment, and because they are the Buddhist counterparts to the triple knowledge of the Vedas. The fourth higher knowledge is retrocognition or knowledge of past lives, which entails a direct experience of the process of rebirth. The fifth is the divine eye or clairvoyance; that is, direct experience of the process of karma, or as the texts put it, the passing away and reappearing of beings in accordance with their past actions. The sixth is knowledge of the destruction of taints, which implies experiential knowledge of the four noble truths and the process of liberation.

Some scholars have interpreted the Buddha’s emphasis on direct experience and the verifiable nature of Buddhist faith as a form of radical empiricism (Kalupahana 1992), and logical empiricism (Jayatilleke 1963). According to the empiricist interpretation, Buddhist faith is always subsequent to critically verifying the available empirical evidence. All doctrines taught by the Buddha are empirically verifiable if one takes the time and effort to attain higher or direct knowledge, interpreted as extraordinary sense experience. For instance, the triple knowledge of enlightenment implies a direct experience of the processes of karma, rebirth, and the four noble truths. Critiques of the empiricist interpretation point out that, at least at the beginning of the path, Buddhist faith is not always based on empirical evidence, and that the purpose of extraordinary knowledge is not to verify the doctrines of karma, rebirth, and the four noble truths (Hoffman 1982, 1987).

Whether or not the Buddha’s epistemology can be considered empiricist depends on what we mean by empiricism and experience. The opposition between rationalism and empiricism and the sharp distinction between senses and reason is foreign to Buddhism. Nowhere in the Pāli Nikāyas does the Buddha say that all knowledge begins in or is acquired from sense experience. In this sense, the Buddha is not an empiricist.

3. The Buddha’s Cosmology and Metaphysics

a. The Universe and the Role of Gods

The Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas accepts the cosmology characteristic of his cultural context: a universe with several realms of existence, where people are reborn and die again and again (saṃsāra) depending on their past actions (karma) until they attain salvation (mokṣa). However, the Buddha substantially modifies the cosmology of his time. Against the Brahmanic tendency to understand karma as ritual action, and the Jain claim that all activities including involuntary actions constitute karma, the Buddha defines karma in terms of volition, or free will, which is expressed through thoughts, words, and behavior. That is, for the Buddha, only voluntary actions produce karma.

Another important modification is that for the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas, saṃsāra refers primarily to a psychophysical process that takes place within the physical universe. For instance, when the Buddha speaks about the end of the world, he says that it cannot be reached by traveling through the physical universe, but only by putting an end to suffering (saṃsāra), where “one is not born, does not age, does not die, does not pass away, and is not reborn” Accordingly, salvation is not understood in world-denying terms or as an escape from the physical universe, but rather as an inner transformation that takes place within one’s own psychophysical organism: “It is, friend, in just this fathom-high carcass endowed with perception and mind that I make known the world, the origin of the world, the cessation of the world, and the way leading to the cessation of the world.” (S.I.62; A.II.47-9).

There are five kinds of destinations within saṃsāra: hell, animal kingdom, realm of ghosts, humankind, and realm of devas or radiant beings, commonly translated as gods (M.I.73). There are many hells and heavens and life there is transitory, just as in other destinations. In some traditions there is another destination, the realm of asuras or demigods, who are jealous of the gods and who are always in conflict with them.

The Pāli Nikāyas further divide the universe of saṃsāra into three main planes of existence, each one subdivided into several realms. The three planes of existence are sensorial, fine-material, and immaterial (M.I.50). Most destinations belong to the sensorial realm. Only a minority of heavens belong to the fine-material and immaterial realms. Rebirth in a particular realm depends on past actions: good actions lead to good destinations and bad actions to bad rebirths. Rebirth as a human or in heaven is considered a good destination; rebirth in the realm of ghosts, hell, and the animal realm are bad. Human rebirth is extremely difficult to attain (S.V.455-6; M.III.169), and it is highly regarded because of its unique combination of pain and pleasure, as well as its unique conductivity for attaining enlightenment. In this last sense human rebirth is said to be even better than rebirth as a god.

Rebirth also depends on the prevalent mental states of a person during life, and especially at the moment of death. That is, there is a correlation between mental states and realms of rebirth, between cosmology and psychology. For instance, a mind where hatred and anger prevails is likely to be reborn in hell; deluded and uncultivated minds are headed toward the animal kingdom; someone obsessed with sex and food will probably become bound to earth as a ghost; loving and caring persons will be reborn in heaven; someone who frequently dwells in meditative absorptions will be reborn in the fine-material and immaterial realms. Human rebirth might be the consequence of any of the aforementioned mental states.

Perhaps the most important modification the Buddha introduces into the traditional cosmology of his time was a new view of Gods (gods within Buddhism). In the Pāli Nikāyas, gods do not play any significant cosmological role. For the Buddha, the universe has not been created by an all-knowing, all-powerful god that is the lord of the universe and father of all beings (M.I.326-7). Rather, the universe evolves following certain cyclic patterns of contraction and expansion (D.III.84-5).

Similarly, the cosmic order, or Dharma, does not depend on the will of gods, and there are many good deeds far more effective than ritual sacrifices offered to the gods (D.I144ff). Gods for the Buddha are unenlightened beings subject to birth and death that require further learning and spiritual practice in order to attain liberation; they are more powerful and spiritually more developed than humans and other living beings, but Buddhas excel them in all regards: spiritual development, wisdom, and power. Even the supreme type of god, Brahmā, offers his respects to the Buddha, praises him, and asks him to preach the Dharma for those with little dust in their eyes (M.I.168-9).

Since the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas does not deny the existence of gods, only their cosmological and soteriological functions, it is inaccurate to define early Buddhism as atheistic or as non-theistic. The word atheistic is usually associated with anti-religious attitudes absent in the Buddha, and the term non-theistic seems to imply that rejecting the theistic concept of God is one of the main concerns of the Buddha, when in fact it is a marginal question in the Pāli Nikāyas.

b. The Four Noble Truths or Realities

One the most common frameworks to explain the basic teachings of early Buddhism is the four noble truths (ariyasacca, Sanskrit āryasatya). The word sacca means both truth and reality. The word ariya refers primarily to the ideal type of person the Buddhist path is supposed to generate, a noble person in the ethical and spiritual sense. Translating ariyasacca by ‘noble truths’ is somehow misleading because it gives the wrong impression of being a set of beliefs, a creed that Buddhists accept as noble and true. The four noble truths are primarily four realities whose contemplation leads to sainthood or the state of the noble ones (ariya). Other possible translations of ariyasacca are “ennobling truths” or “truths of the noble ones.”

Each noble truth requires a particular practice from the disciple; in this sense the four noble truths can be understood as four types of practice. The first noble truth, or the reality of suffering, assigns to the disciple the practice of cultivating understanding. Such understanding takes place gradually through reflection, analytical meditation, and eventually direct experience. What needs to be understood is the nature of suffering, and the different types of suffering and happiness within saṃsāra.

A common misconception about the first noble truth is to think that it presupposes a pessimistic outlook on life. This interpretation would be correct only if the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas had not taught the existence of different types of happiness and the third noble truth, or cessation of suffering; that is, the good news about the reality of nirvana, defined as the highest happiness (Dhp.203; M.I.505). Since the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas teaches the reality of both suffering and the highest happiness, perhaps it is more accurate to speak of his attitude as realist: there is a problem but there is also a solution to that problem.

The second noble truth, or reality of the origin of suffering, calls for the practice of renunciation to all mental states that generate suffering for oneself and others. The mental state that appears in the second noble truth is taṇhā, literally “thirst.” It was customary in the first Western translations of Buddhist texts (Burnouf, Fausboll, Muller, Oldenberg, Warren) to translate taṇhā by desire. This translation has misled many to think that the ultimate goal of Buddhists is the cessation of all desires. However, as Damien Keown puts it, “it is an oversimplification of the Buddhist position to assume that it seeks an end to all desire.” (1992: 222).

In fact, there are many terms in the Pāli Nikāyas that can be translated as desire, not all of them related to mental states conducive to suffering. On the contrary, there are many texts in the Pāli Nikāyas that demonstrate the positive role of certain types of desire in the Buddha’s path (Webster, 2005: 90-142). Nonetheless, the term taṇhā in the Pāli Nikāyas designates always a harmful type of desire that leads to “repeated existence” (ponobhavikā), is “associated with delight and lust” (nandirāgasahagatā), and “delights here and there” (tatra tatrābhinandinī) (M.I.48; D.II.308; etc). There is only one text (Nettipakaraṇa 87) that speaks about a wholesome type of taṇhā that leads to its own relinquishment, but this text is extra-canonical except in Myanmar.

The most common translation of taṇhā nowadays is craving. Unlike the loaded, vast, and ambivalent term desire, the term craving refers more specifically to a particular type of desire, and cannot be misinterpreted as conveying any want and aspiration whatsoever. Rather, like taṇhā in the Pāli Nikāyas, craving refers to intense (rāga can be translated by both lust and passion), obsessive, and addictive desires (the idiom tatra tatra can also be interpreted as connoting the idea of repetition or tendency to repeat itself).

Since craving, or taṇhā, does not include all possible types of desires, there is no “paradox of desire” in the Pāli Nikāyas. In other words, the Buddha of the the Pāli Nikāyas does not teach that in order to attain liberation from suffering one has to paradoxically desire to stop all desires. There is no contradiction in willing the cessation of craving. That is, for the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas it is possible to want, like, or strive for something without simultaneously craving for it.

The Pāli Nikāyas distinguish between three kinds of taṇhā: craving for sensual pleasures (kāmataṇhā), craving for existence (bhavataṇhā), and craving for non-existence (vibhavataṇhā). Following Webster, I understand the last two types of craving as “predicated on two extreme (wrong) views, those of eternalism and annihilationism” (2005:130-1). In other words, craving for existence longs for continued existence of one’s self within saṃsāra, and craving for non-existence is a reversed type of desire or aversion to one’s own destruction at the moment of death.

The underlying root of all suffering, however, is not craving but spiritual ignorance (avijjā). In the Pāli Nikāyas spiritual ignorance does not connote a mere lack of information but rather a misconception, a distorted perception of things under the influence of conceptual fabrications and affective prejudices. More specifically, ignorance refers to not knowing things as they are, the Dharma, and the four noble truths. The relinquishing of spiritual ignorance, craving, and the three roots of the unwholesome (greed or lobha, aversion or dosa, delusion or moha) entails the cultivation of many positive mental states, some of the most prominent in the Pāli Nikāyas being: wisdom or understanding (paññā), letting go (anupādāna), selflessness (alobha), love (avera, adosa, avyāpāda), friendliness (mettā), compassion (karuṇā), altruistic joy (muditā), equanimity (upekkhā), calm (samatha, passaddhi), mindfulness (sati), diligence (appamāda).

The third noble truth, or reality of the cessation of suffering, asks us to directly realize the destruction of suffering, usually expressed with a variety of cognitive and affective terms: peace, higher knowledge, the tranquilization of mental formations, the abandonment of all grasping, cessation, the destruction of craving, absence of lust, nirvana (Pali nibbāna). The most popular of all the terms that express the cessation of suffering and rebirth is nirvana, which literally means blowing out or extinguishing.

Metaphorically, the extinction of nirvana designates a mental event, namely, the extinguishing of the fires of craving, aversion, and delusion (S.IV.251). That nirvana primarily denotes a mental event, a psychological process, is also confirmed by many texts that describe the person who experiences nirvana with intransitive verbs such as to nirvanize (nibbāyati) or to parinirvanize (parinibbāyati). However, there are a few texts that seem to indicate that nirvana might also be a domain of perception (āyatana), element (dhātu), or reality (dhamma) known at the moment of enlightenment, and in special meditative absorptions after enlightenment. This domain is usually defined as having the opposite qualities of saṃsāra (Ud 8.1), or with metaphoric expressions (S.IV.369ff).

What is important to point out is that the concern of the Pāli Nikāyas is not to describe nirvana, which, strictly speaking, is beyond logic and language (It 37), but rather to provide a systematic explanation of the arising and cessation of suffering. The goal of Buddhism as it appears in the Pāli Nikāyas does not consist in believing that suffering arises and ceases like the Buddha says, but in realizing that what he teaches about suffering and its cessation is the case; that is, the Buddha’s teaching, or Dharma, is intended to be experienced by the wise for themselves (M.I.265).

The fourth noble truth, or reality of the path leading to the cessation of suffering, imposes on us the practice of developing the eightfold ennobling path. This path can be understood either as eight mental factors that are cultivated by ennobled disciples at the moment of liberation, or as different parts of the entire Buddhist path whose practice ennoble the disciple gradually. The eight parts of the Buddhist path are usually divided into three kinds of training: training in wisdom (right view and right intention), ethical training (right speech, right bodily conduct, and right livelihood), and training in concentration (right effort, right mindfulness and right concentration).

c. Ontology of Suffering: the Five Aggregates

A prominent concern of the Buddha in the Pāli Nikāyas is to provide a solution to the problem of suffering. When asked about his teachings, the Buddha answers that he only teaches suffering and its cessation (M.I.140). The first noble truth describes what the Buddha means by suffering: birth, aging, illness, death, union with what is displeasing, separation from what is pleasing, not getting what one wants, the five aggregates of grasping (S.V.421).

The original Pali term for suffering is dukkha, a word that ordinarily means physical and mental pain, but that in the first noble truth designates diverse kinds of frustration, and the existential angst generated by the impermanence of life and the unavoidability of old age, disease, and death. However, when the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas mentions birth and the five aggregates of grasping, he seems to be referring to the fact that our psychophysical components are conditioned by grasping, and consequently, within saṃsāra, the cycle of births and deaths. This interpretation is consistent with later Buddhist tradition, which speaks about three types of dukkha: ordinary suffering (mental and physical pain), suffering due to change (derived from the impermanence of things), and suffering due to conditions (derived from being part of saṃsāra).

When the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas speaks about personal identity and the human predicament, he uses the technical expression “five aggregates of grasping” (pañcupādānakkhandhā). That is, the Buddha describes human existence in terms of five groups of constituents. The five aggregates are: material form (rūpa), sensations (vedanā), perceptions (saññā), mental formations (saṃkhāra), consciousness (viññāṇa). While the first aggregate refers to material components, the other four designate a variety of mental functions.

The aggregate material form is explained as the four great elements and the shape or figure of our physical body. The four great elements are earth, water, fire, and air. The earth element is further defined as whatever is solid in our body, and water as whatever is liquid. The fire element refers to “that by which one is warmed, ages, and is consumed,” and the process of digestion. The air element denotes the breathing process and movements of gas throughout the body (M.I.185ff).

The aggregate sensations denote pleasant, unpleasant and neutral feelings experienced after there is contact between the six sense organs (eye, ear, nose, tongue, body, and mind) and their six objects (forms, sounds, odors, tastes, tangible objects, and mental phenomena). The aggregate perceptions express the mental function by which someone is able to identify objects. There are six types of perceptions corresponding to the six objects of the senses. The aggregate formations express emotional and intellectual dispositions, literally volitions (sañcetanâ), towards the six objects of the senses. These dispositions are the result of past cognitive and affective conditioning, that is, past karma or past voluntary actions. The aggregate consciousness connotes the ability to know and to be aware of the six objects of the senses (S.III.59ff).

d. Arguments for the Doctrine of Non-self

The Buddha reiterates again and again throughout the Pāli Nikāyas that any of the five aggregates “whether past, future or present, internal or external, gross or subtle, inferior or superior, far or near, ought to be seen as it actually is with right wisdom thus: ‘this is not mine, this I am not, this is not my self.’ ” When the disciple contemplates the five aggregates in this way, he or she becomes disenchanted (nibbindati), lust fades away (virajjati), and he or she attains liberation due to the absence of lust (virāgā vimuccati) (M.I.138-9).

The Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas justifies this view of the five aggregates as non-self with three main arguments, which are used as a method of analytical meditation, and in polemics with members of other schools. The assumption underlying the Buddha’s arguments is that something might be considered a self only if it were permanent, not leading to suffering, not dependently arisen, and subject to one’s own will. Since none of the five aggregates fulfill any of these conditions, it is wrong to see them as belonging to us or as our self.

In the first and most common argument for non-self the Buddha asks someone the following questions: “What do you think, monks, is material form permanent or impermanent?” – “Impermanent, venerable sir.” – “Is what is impermanent suffering or happiness?” – “Suffering, venerable sir.” –Is what is impermanent, suffering, and subject to change, fit to be regarded as: “this is mine, this I am, this is my self?” – “No, venerable sir” (M.I.138, etc). The same reasoning is applied to the other aggregates.

The first argument is also applied to the six sensual organs, the six objects, the six types of consciousness, perceptions, sensations, and formations that arise dependent on the contact between the senses and their objects (M.III.278ff). Sometimes the first argument for non-self is applied to the six senses and their objects without questions and answers: “Monks, the visual organ is impermanent. What is impermanent is suffering. What is suffering is non-self. What is non-self ought to be seen as it really is with right wisdom thus: ‘this is not mine, this I am not, this is not my self’ ” (S.IV.1ff).

The second argument for non-self is much less frequent: “Monks, material form is non-self. If it were self, it would not lead to affliction. It would be possible [to say] with regard to material form: ‘Let my material form be thus. Let my material form not be thus.’ But precisely because it is non-self, it leads to affliction. And it is not possible [to say] with regard to material form: ‘Let my material form be thus. Let my material form not be thus’ ”(S.III.66-7). The same reasoning is applied to the other four aggregates.

The third argument deduces non-self from that fact that physical and mental phenomena depend on certain causes to exist. For instance, in (M.III.280ff), the Buddha first analyzes the dependent arising of physical and mental phenomena. Then he argues: “If anyone says: ‘the visual organ is self,’ that is unacceptable. The rising and falling of the visual organ are fully known (paññāyati). Since the rising and falling of the visual organ are fully known, it would follow that: ‘my self arises and falls.’ Therefore, it is unacceptable to say: ‘the visual organ is self.’ Thus the visual organ is non-self.” The same reasoning is applied to the other senses, their objects, and the six types of consciousness, contacts (meeting of sense, object and consciousness), sensations, and cravings derived from them.

The third argument also appears combined with the first one without questions and answers. For instance, in (A.V.188), it is said that “whatever becomes, that is conditioned, volitionally formed, dependently arisen, that is impermanent. What is impermanent, that is suffering. What is suffering, that is [to be regarded thus]: ‘this is not mine, this I am not, this is not my self.’ ”

If something can be inferred from these three arguments, it is that the target of the doctrine of non-self is not all concepts of self but specifically views of the self as permanent and not dependently arisen. That is, the doctrine of non-self opposes what is technically called “views of personal identity” or more commonly translated “personality views” (sakkāyadiṭṭhi). Views of personal identity relate the five aggregates to a permanent and independent self in four ways: as being identical, as being possession of the self, as being in the self, or as the self being in them (M.I.300ff). All these views of personal identity are said to be the product of spiritual ignorance, that is, of not seeing with right wisdom the true nature of the five aggregates, their origin, their cessation, and the way leading to their cessation.

e. Human Identity and the Meaning of Non-self

Since the Pāli Nikāyas accept the common sense usages of the word “self” (attan, Skt. ātman), primarily in idiomatic expressions and as a reflexive pronoun meaning “oneself,” the doctrine of non-self does not imply a literal negation of the self. Similarly, since the Buddha explicitly criticizes views that reject karma and moral responsibility (M.I.404ff), the doctrine of non-self should not be understood as the absolute rejection of moral agency and any concept of personal identity. In fact, the Buddha explicitly defines “personal identity” (sakkāya) as the five aggregates (M.I.299).

Since the sixth sense, or mind, includes the four mental aggregates, and since the ordinary five senses and their objects fall under the aggregate of material form, it can be said that for the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas personal identity is defined not only in terms of the five aggregates, but also in terms of the six senses and their six objects.

If the meaning of non-self were that there is literally no self whatsoever, no personal identity and no moral agency whatsoever, then the only logical conclusion would be to state that the Buddha taught nonsense and that the Pāli Nikāyas are contradictory, sometimes accepting the existence of a self and other times rejecting it. Even though no current scholar of Buddhism would endorse such an interpretation of non-self, it is still popular in some missionary circles and apologetic literature.

A more sympathetic interpretation of non-self distinguishes between two main levels of discourse (Collins 1982). The first level of discourse does not question the concept of self and freely uses personal terms and expressions in accordance with ordinary language and social conventions. The second level of discourse is philosophically more sophisticated and rejects views of self and personal identity as permanent and not dependently arisen. Behind the second level of discourse there is a technical understanding of the self and personal identity as the five aggregates, that is, as a combination of psychophysical processes, all of them impermanent and dependently originated.

This concept of the self as permanent and not dependently arisen is problematic because it is based on a misperception of the aggregates. This misperception of the five aggregates is associated with what is technically called “the conceit I am” (asmimāna) and “the underlying tendency to the conceits ‘I’ and ‘mine’ ” (ahaṃkāra-mamaṅkāra-mānānusaya). This combination of conceit and ignorance fosters different types of cravings, especially craving for immortal existence, and subsequently, speculations about the past, present, and future nature of the self and personal identity. For instance, in (D.I.30ff), the Buddha speaks of different ascetics and Brahmins who claim that the self after death is “material, immaterial, both material and immaterial, neither material nor immaterial, finite, infinite, both, neither, of uniform perception, of varied perception, of limited perception, of unlimited perception, wholly happy, wholly miserable, both, neither.” The doctrine of non-self is primarily intended to counteract views of the self and personal identity rooted in ignorance regarding the nature of the five aggregates, the conceit “I am,” and craving for immortal existence.

A minority of scholars reject the notion that the Buddha’s doctrine of non-self implies the negation of the true self, which for them is permanent and independent of causes and conditions. Accordingly, the purpose of the doctrine of non-self is simply to deny that the five aggregates are the true self. The main reason for this interpretation is that the Buddha does not say anywhere in the Pāli Nikāyas that the self does not exist; he only states that a self and what belongs to a self are not apprehended (M.I.138). Therefore, for these interpreters the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas only claims that impermanent and conditioned things like the five aggregates are not the true self. For these scholars, the Buddha does talk about the true self when he speaks about the consciousness of liberated beings (M.I.140), and the unconditioned, unborn and deathless nirvana (Bhattacarya 1973; Pérez Remón 1981).

However, the majority of Buddhist scholars agree with the traditional Buddhist self-understanding: they think that the doctrine of non-self is incompatible with any doctrine about a permanent and independent self, not just with views that mistakenly identify an alleged true self with the five aggregates. The main reason for this interpretation relates to the doctrine of dependent arising.

f. Causality and the Principle of Dependent Arising

The importance of dependent arising (paṭiccasamuppāda) cannot be underestimated: the Buddha realized its workings during the night of his enlightenment (M.I.167). Preaching the doctrine of dependent arising amounts to preaching the Dharma (M.II.32), and whoever sees it sees the Dharma (M.I.191). The Dharma of dependent arising remains valid whether or not there are Buddhas in the world (S.II.25), and it is through not understanding it that people are trapped into the cycle of birth and death (D.II.55).

The doctrine of dependent arising can be formulated in two ways that usually appear together: as a general principle or as a chain of causal links to explain the arising and ceasing of suffering and the process of rebirth. The general principle of dependent arising states that “when this exists, that comes to be; with the arising of this, that arises. When this does not exist, that does not come to be; with the cessation of this, that ceases” (M.II.32; S.II.28).

Unlike the logical principle of conditionality, the principle of dependent arising does not designate a connection between two ideas but rather an ontological relationship between two things or events within a particular timeframe. Dependent arising expresses not only the Buddha’s understanding of causality but also his view of things as interrelated. The point behind dependent arising is that things are dependent on specific conditions (paṭicca), and that they arise together with other things (samuppāda). In other words, the principle of dependent arising conveys both ontological conditionality and the constitutive relativity of things. This relativity, however, does not mean that for the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas everything is interdependent or that something is related to everything else. This is a later development of Buddhist thought, not a characteristic of early Indian Buddhism.

The most comprehensive chain of dependent arising contains twelve causal links: (1) ignorance, (2) formations, (3) consciousness, (4) mentality-materiality, (5) the six senses, (6) contact, (7) sensations, (8) craving (9) grasping, (10) becoming, (11) birth, (12) old age and death. The most common formulation is as follows: with 1 as a condition 2 [comes to be]; with 2 as a condition 3 [comes to be], and so forth. Conversely, with the cessation of 1 comes the cessation of 2; with the cessation of 2 comes the cessation of 3, and so forth.

It is important to keep in mind that this chain does not imply a linear understanding of causality where the antecedent link disappears once the subsequent link has come to be. Similarly, each of the causal links is not to be understood as the one and only cause that produces the next link but rather as the most necessary condition for its arising. For instance, ignorance, the first link, is not the only cause of the process of suffering but rather the cause most necessary for the continuation of such a process. For the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas, as well as for later Buddhist tradition, there is always a multiplicity of causes and conditions at play.

The traditional interpretation divides the twelve link chain of dependent arising into three lives. The first two links (ignorance and formations) belong to the past life: due to a misperception of the nature of the five aggregates, a person (the five aggregates) performs voluntary actions: mental, verbal, and bodily actions, with wholesome, unwholesome, and neutral karmic effects. The next ten factors correspond to the present life: the karmic effects of past voluntary formations are stored in consciousness and transferred to the next life. Consciousness together with the other mental aggregates combines with a new physical body to constitute a new psychophysical organism (mentality-materiality). This new stage of the five aggregates develops the six senses and the ability to establish contact with their six objects. Contacts with objects of the senses produce pleasant, unpleasant and neutral sensations. If the sensations are pleasant, the person usually responds with cravings for more pleasant experiences, and if the sensations are unpleasant, with aversion. Craving and aversion, as well as the underlying ignorance of the nature of the five aggregates are fundamental causes of suffering and rebirth: the three roots of the unwholesome according to the Pāli Nikāyas, or the three mental poisons according to later Buddhist traditions.

By repeating the affective responses of craving and aversion, the person becomes more and more dependent on whatever leads to more pleasant sensations and less unpleasant ones. This creates a variety of emotional dependencies and a tendency to grasp or hold onto what causes pleasure and avoids pain. The Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas speaks about four types of grasping: towards sensual pleasures, views, rites-and-observances, and especially towards doctrines of a [permanent and independent] self (D.II.57-8).

The original term for grasping is upādāna, which also designates the fuel or supply necessary to maintain a fire. In this sense, grasping is the psychological fuel that maintains the fires of craving, aversion, and delusion, the fires whose extinction is called nirvana. The Buddha’s ideal of letting go and detachment should not be misunderstood as the absence of any emotions whatsoever including love and compassion, but specifically as the absence of emotions associated with craving, aversion, and delusion. Motivated by grasping and the three mental fires, the five aggregates perform further voluntary actions, whose karmic effects perpetuate existence within the cycle of rebirth and subsequent suffering. The last two links (birth, aging and death) refer to the future life. At the end of this present existence, a new birth of the five aggregates will take place followed by old age, death, and other kinds of suffering.

The twelve-link chain of dependent arising explains the processes of rebirth and suffering without presupposing a permanent and independent self. The Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas makes this point explicit in his passionate rebuttal of the monk Sāti, who claimed that it is the same consciousness that wanders through the cycle of rebirth. For the Buddha, consciousness, like the other eleven causal links, is dependent on specific conditions (M.I.258ff), which entails that consciousness is impermanent, suffering, and non-self.

Instead of a permanent and independent self behind suffering and the cycle of rebirth, the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas presupposes five psychophysical sets of processes, namely, the five aggregates, which imply an impermanent and dependently-arisen concept of ‘self’ and ‘personal identity.’ In other words, the Buddha rejects substance-selves but accepts process-selves (Gowans 2003). Yet, the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas explicitly refuses to use personal terms such as ‘self’ in technical explanations of rebirth and suffering, and he prefers to speak in terms of causes and conditions that produce other causes and conditions (S.II.13-4; S.II.62; M.III.19). But what happens to consciousness and the other aggregates when grasping no longer exists and the three mental fires have been extinguished? What happens when suffering ceases and the cycle of rebirth stops?

4. Nirvana and the Silence of the Buddha

a. Two Kinds of Nirvana and the Undetermined Questions

When the fires of craving, aversion, and ignorance are extinguished at the moment of enlightenment, the aggregates are liberated due to the lack of grasping. This is technically called nirvana with remainder of grasping (saupādisesa-nibbāna), or as later tradition puts it, nirvana of mental defilements (kilesa-parinibbāna). The expression ‘remainder of grasping’ refers to the five aggregates of liberated beings, which continue to live after enlightenment but without negative mental states.

The aggregates of the liberated beings perform their respective functions and, like the aggregates of anybody else, they grow old, get sick, and are subject to pleasant and unpleasant sensations until death. The difference between unenlightened and enlightened beings is that enlightened beings respond to sensations without craving or aversion, and with higher knowledge of the true nature of the five aggregates.

The definition of nirvana without remainder (anupādisesa-nibbāna) that appears in (It 38) only says that for the liberated being “all that is experienced here and now, without enchantment [another term for grasping], will be cooled (sīta).” Since “all” is defined in the Pāli Nikāyas as the six senses and their six objects (S.IV.15), which is another way of describing the individual psychophysical experience or the five aggregates, the expression “all that is experienced” refers to what happens to the aggregates of liberated beings. Since (It 38) explicitly uses the expression “here and now” (idheva), it seems impossible to conclude that the definition of nirvana without remainder is intended to say anything about nirvana or the aggregates beyond death. Rather (It 38) describes nirvana and the aggregates at the moment of death: they will be no longer subject to rebirth and they will become cooled, tranquil, at peace. The question is: what does this peace or coolness entail? What happens after the nirvana of the aggregates? Does the mind of enlightened beings survive happily ever after? Does the liberated being exist beyond death or not?

These questions are left undetermined (avyākata) by the Buddha of the the Pāli Nikāyas. The ten questions in the the Pāli Nikāyas ask whether (1) The world is eternal; (2) The world is not eternal; (3) The world is infinite; (4) The world is finite; (5) Body and soul are one thing; (6) Body and soul are two different things; (7) A liberated being (tathāgata) exists after death; (8) A liberated being (tathāgata) does not exist after death; (9) A liberated being (tathāgata) both exists and does not exist after death; (10) A liberated being (tathāgata) neither exists nor does not exist after death. In Sanskrit Buddhist texts the ten views become fourteen by adding the last two possibilities of the tetralema (both A and B, neither A nor B) to the questions about the world.

Unfortunately for those looking for quick answers, the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas does not provide a straightforward yes or no response to any of these questions. When the Buddha is asked whether the liberated being exists, does not exist, both, or neither, he sets aside these questions by saying that (1) he does not hold such views, (2) he has left the questions undetermined, and (3) the questions do not apply (na upeti). The first two answers are also used to respond to questions about the temporal and spatial finitude or infinitude of the world, and the identity or difference between the soul and the body. Only the third type of answer is given to the questions about liberated beings after death.

Most presentations of early Buddhism interpret these three answers of the Buddha as an eloquent silence about metaphysical questions due primarily to pragmatic reasons, namely, the questions divert from spiritual practice and are not conducive to liberation from suffering. While the pragmatic reasons for the answers of the Buddha are undeniable, it is inaccurate to understand them as silence about metaphysical questions. In fact, the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas does address many metaphysical issues with his teachings of non-self and dependent arising.

The answers of the Buddha to the undetermined questions are due not only to pragmatic reasons but also to metaphysical reasons: the questions are inconsistent with the doctrines of non-self and dependent arising because they assume the existence of a permanent and independent self, a self that is either finite or infinite, identical or different from the body, existing or not existing after death. Besides pragmatic and metaphysical reasons, there are cognitive and affective reasons for the answers of the Buddha: the undetermined questions are based on ignorance about the nature of the five aggregates and craving for either immortal existence or inexistence. The questions are expressions of ‘identity views,’ that is, they are part of the problem of suffering. Answering the questions directly would have not done any good: a yes answer would have fostered more craving for immortal existence and led to eternalist views, and a no answer would have fostered further confusion and led to nihilist views (S.IV.400-1).

In the case of the undetermined questions about the liberated being, there are also apophatic reasons for answering “it does not apply.” The Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas illustrates the inapplicability of the questions with the simile of the fire extinct: just as it does not make sense to ask about the direction in which an extinct fire has gone, it is inappropriate to ask about the status of the liberated being beyond death: “The fire burned in dependence on its fuel of grass and sticks. When that is used up, if it does not get any more fuel, being without fuel, it is reckoned as extinguished. Similarly, the enlightened being has abandoned the five aggregates by which one might describe him…he is liberated from reckoning in terms of the five aggregates, he is profound, immeasurable, unfathomable like the ocean” (M.I.487-8).

b. Eternalism, Nihilism, and the Middle Way

There are three possible interpretations of the simile of the extinct fire: (1) liberated beings no longer exist beyond death (2) liberated beings exist in a mysterious unfathomable way beyond death (3) the Buddha is silent about both the liberated being and nirvana after death. The first interpretation seems the most logical conclusion given the Buddha’s ontology of suffering and the doctrine of non-self. However, the nihilist interpretation makes Buddhist practice meaningless and contradicts texts where the Buddha criticizes teachings not conducive to spiritual practice such as materialism and determinism (M.I.401ff). But more importantly, the nihilist interpretation is vehemently rejected in the Pāli Nikāyas: “As I am not, as I do not proclaim, so have I been baselessly, vainly, falsely, and wrongly misrepresented by some ascetics and brahmins thus: ‘the ascetic Gotama [Buddha] is one who leads astray; he teaches the annihilation, the destruction, the extermination of an existing being’ ”(M.I.140).

The second interpretation appears to some as following from the Buddha’s incontrovertible response to the nihilist reading of his teachings: since the Buddha rejects nihilism, he must somehow accept the eternal existence of liberated beings, or at least the eternal existence of nirvana. For eternalist interpreters, the texts in the Pāli Nikāyas that speak about the transcendence and ineffability of liberated beings and nirvana can be understood as implying their existence after or beyond death.

There are several eternalist readings of the Buddha’s thought. We have already mentioned the most common: the doctrine of non-self merely states that the five aggregates are not the true self, which is the transcendent and ineffable domain of nirvana. However, there are eternalist interpretations within Buddhism too. That is, interpretations that are nominally consistent with the doctrine of non-self but that nevertheless speak of something as eternally existing: either the mind of liberated beings or nirvana. For instance, Theravāda Buddhists usually see nirvana as non-self, but at the same time as an unconditioned (asaṃkhata) and deathless (amata) reality. The assumption, though rarely stated, is that liberated beings dwell eternally in nirvana without a sense of “I” and “mine,” which is a transcendent state beyond the comprehension of unenlightened beings. Another eternalist interpretation is that of the Dalai Lama who, following the standard interpretation of Tibetan Buddhists, claims that the Buddha did not teach the cessation of all aggregates but only of contaminated aggregates. That is, the uncontaminated aggregates of liberated beings continue to exist individually beyond death, though they are seen as impermanent, dependently arisen, non-self, and empty of inherent existence (Dalai Lama 1975:27). Similarly, Peter Harvey understands nirvana as a selfless and objectless state of consciousness different from the five aggregates that exists temporarily during life and eternally beyond death (1995: 186-7).

The problem with eternalist interpretations is that they contradict what the Pāli Nikāyas say explicitly about the way to consider liberated beings, the limits of language, the content of the Buddha’s teachings, and dependent arising as a middle way between the extremes of eternalism and annihilationism. In (S.III.110ff), Sāriputta, the Buddha’s leading disciple in doctrinal matters, explains that liberated beings should be considered neither as annihilated after death nor as existing without the five aggregates.

In (D.II.63-4) the Buddha makes clear that consciousness and mentality-materiality, that is, the five aggregates, are the limits of designation (adhivacana), language (nirutti), cognitions (viññatti), and understanding (paññā). Accordingly, in (D.II.68) the Buddha says it is inadequate to state that the liberated being exists after death, does not exist, both, or neither. This reading is confirmed by (Sn 1076): “There is not measure (pamāṇa) of one who has gone out, that by which [others] might speak (vajju) of him does not exist. When all things have been removed, then all ways of speech (vādapathā) are also removed.”

Given the Buddha’s understanding of the limits of language and understanding in the Pāli Nikāyas, it is not surprising that he responded to the accusation of teaching the annihilation of beings, by saying that “formerly and now I only teach suffering and the cessation of suffering.” Since the Buddha does not teach anything beyond the cessation of suffering at the moment of death, that is, beyond the limits of language and understanding, it is inaccurate to accuse him of teaching the annihilation of beings. Similarly, stating that liberated beings exist after death in a mysterious way beyond the four logical possibilities of existence, non-existence, both or neither, is explicitly rejected in (S.III.118-9) and (S.IV.384), where once again the Buddha concludes that he only makes known suffering and the cessation of suffering.

If the eternalist interpretation were correct, it would have been unnecessary for the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas to put so much emphasis on the teaching of dependent arising. Why would dependent arising be defined in (S.II.17) as right view and as the middle way between the extremes of eternalism and annihilationism if the truth were that the consciousness of liberated beings or the unconditioned nirvana exist eternally? If knowing and seeing dependent arising precludes someone from speculating about a permanent self in the past and the future (M.I.265), why would the Buddha teach anything about the eternal existence of liberated beings and nirvana?

In order to avoid the aforementioned contradictions entailed by eternalist readings of the Pāli Nikāyas, all texts about nirvana and the consciousness of liberated beings are to be understood as referring to this life or the moment of death, never to some mysterious consciousness or domain that exists beyond death. Since none of the texts about nirvana and liberated beings found in the Pāli Nikāyas refer unambiguously to their eternal existence beyond death, I interpret the Buddha as being absolutely silent about nirvana and liberated beings beyond death (Vélez de Cea 2004a). In other words, nothing of what the Pāli Nikāyas say goes beyond the limits of language and understanding, beyond the content of the Buddha’s teachings, and beyond dependent arising as the middle way between eternalism and annihilationism.

Instead of focusing on nirvana and liberated beings beyond death, the Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas emphasizes dependent arising and the practice of the four foundations of mindfulness. Dependent arising is intended to avoid views about a permanent and independent self in the past and the future (M.I.265; M.III.196ff), and the four foundations of mindfulness are said to be taught precisely to destroy such views (D.III.141). That is, the Buddha’s fundamental concern is to address the problem of suffering in the present without being distracted by views about the past or the future: “Let not a person revive the past, or on the future build his hopes; for the past has been left behind and the future has not been reached. Instead with insight let him see each presently arising state (paccuppannañca yo dhammaṃ tattha tattha vipassati); let him know that and be sure of it, invincibly, unshakeably. Today the effort must be made, tomorrow death may come, who knows?” (Bhikkhu Bodhi’s translation. M.III.193).

5. Buddhist Ethics

Early Buddhist ethics includes more than lists of precepts and more than the section on ethical training of the eightfold noble path; that is, Buddhist ethics cannot be reduced to right action (abstaining from killing, stealing, lying), right speech (abstaining from false, divisive, harsh, and useless speech), and right livelihood (abstaining from professions that harm living beings). Besides bodily and verbal actions, the Pāli Nikāyas discuss a variety of mental actions including thoughts, motivations, emotions, and perspectives. In fact, it is the ethics of mental actions that constitutes the main concern of the Buddha’s teaching.

Early Buddhist ethics encompasses the entire spiritual path, that is, bodily, verbal, and mental actions. The factors of the eightfold noble path dealing with wisdom and concentration (right view, right intentions, rights effort, right concentration, right mindfulness) relate to different types of mental actions. The term “right” (sammā) in this context does not mean the opposite of “wrong,” but rather “perfect” or “complete;” that is, it denotes the best or the most effective actions to attain liberation. This, however, does not imply that the Buddha advocates the most perfect form of ethical conduct for all his disciples.

Early Buddhist ethics is gradualist in the sense that there are diverse ways of practicing the path with several degrees of commitment; not all disciples are expected to practice Buddhist ethics with the same intensity. Monks and nuns take more precepts and are supposed to devote more time to spiritual practices than householders. However, a complete monastic code (prātimoka) like those found in later Vinaya literature does not appear in the Pāli Nikāyas. The most comprehensive formulation of early Buddhist ethics, probably common to monastic disciples and lay people, is the list of ten dark or unwholesome actions and their opposite, the ten bright or wholesome actions: three bodily actions (abstaining from killing, stealing, sexual misconduct), four verbal actions (abstaining from false, divisive, harsh, and useless speech), and tree mental actions (abstaining from covetousness, ill-will, and dogmatic views).

The Buddha of the Pāli Nikāyas defines action in terms of intention or choice (cetanā): “It is intention, monks, what I call action. Having intended, someone acts through body, speech, and mind” (A.III.415). The Pāli Nikāyas define the roots of unwholesome (akusala) actions as greed (lobha), aversion (dosa), and delusion (moha). Conversely, the roots of wholesome actions are defined as the opposite mental states (M.I.47). Some scholars infer from these two definitions that Buddhist ethics is an ethics of intention or an agent-based form of virtue ethics. That is, according to these scholars, for the Buddha of the the Pāli Nikāyas, only the agent’s intention or motivation determine the goodness of actions. This interpretation, however, is disproved by many texts of the Pāli Nikāyas where good and evil actions are discussed without any reference to the underlying intention or motivation of the agent. Consequently, the more comprehensive account understands intention not as the only factor that determines the goodness of actions, but rather as the condition of possibility, the necessary condition for speaking about action in the moral sense. Without intention or choice, there is no ethical action. Similarly, motivation, while a central moral factor in Buddhist ethics, is neither the only factor nor always the most important factor to determine the goodness of actions. Understanding Buddhist ethics as concerned exclusively with the three roots of the wholesome does not fully capture the breath of moral concern of the Pāli Nikāyas (Vélez de Cea 2004b).

The fundamental moral law of the universe according to early Buddhism is what is popularly called the “law of karma”: good actions produce good consequences, and bad actions lead to bad consequences. The consequences of volitional actions can be experienced in this life or in subsequent lives. Although not everything we experience is due to past actions, physical appearance, character, lifespan, prosperity, and rebirth destination are believed to be influenced by past actions. This influence however, is not to be confused with fatalism, a position rejected in the Pāli Nikāyas. There is always room for mitigating and even eradicating the negative consequences of past actions with new volitions in the present. That is, past karma does not dictate our situation: the existence of freewill and the possibility of changing our predicament is always assumed. There is conditioning of the will and other mental factors, but no hard determinism.

A common objection to early Buddhist ethics is how there can be freewill and responsibility without a permanent self that transmigrates through lives. If there is no self, who is the agent of actions? Who experiences the consequences of actions? Is the person who performs an action in this life the same person that experiences the consequences of that action in a future life? Is it a different person? The Buddha considers these questions improper of his disciples, who are trained to explain things in terms of causes and condition (S.II.61ff; S.II.13ff)). In other words, since the Buddha’s disciples explain processes with the doctrine of dependent arising, they should avoid explanations that use personal terms and presuppose the extremes of eternalism and nihilism. The moral agent is not a substance-self but rather the five aggregates, a dynamic and dependently-arisen process-self who, like a flame or the water of a river, changes all the time and yet has some degree of continuity.

The most common interpretations of early Buddhist ethics view its nature as either a form of agent-based virtue ethics or as a sophisticated kind of consequentialism. The concern for virtue cultivation is certainly prevalent in early Buddhism, and evidently the internal mental state or motivation underlying actions is extremely important to determine the overall goodness of actions, which is the most important factor for advanced practitioners. Similarly, the concern for the consequences of actions, whether or not they lead to the happiness or the suffering of oneself and others, also pervades the Pāli Nikāyas. However, the goodness of actions in the Pāli Nikāyas does not depend exclusively on either the goodness of motivations or the goodness of consequences. Respect to status and duty, observance of rules and precepts, as well as the intrinsic goodness of certain external bodily and verbal actions are equally necessary to assess the goodness of at least certain actions. Since the foundations of right action in the Pāli Nikāyas are irreducible to one overarching principle, value or criterion of goodness, early Buddhist ethics is pluralistic in a metaethical sense. Given the unique combination of deontological, consequentialist, and virtue ethical trends found in the Pāli Nikāyas, early Buddhist ethics should be understood in its own terms as a sui generis normative theory inassimilable to Western ethical traditions.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

All references to the Pāli Nikāyas are to the edition of The Pāli Text Society, Oxford. References to the Aṅguttara, Dīgha, Majjhima, and Saṃyutta Nikāyas are to the volume and page number. References to Udāna and Itivuttaka are to the page number and to Dhammapada and Sutta Nipāta to the verse number.

A. Aṅguttara Nikāya

D. Dīgha Nikāya

M. Majjhima Nikāya

S. Saṃyutta Nikāya

Ud. Udāna

It. Itivuttaka

Dhp. Dhammapada

Sn. Sutta Nipāta

b. Secondary Sources

  • Bechert, H. (Ed) 1995. When Did the Buddha Live? The Controversy on the Dating of the Historical Buddha. Selected Papers Based on a Symposium Held under the Auspices of the Academy of Sciences in Göttingen. Delhi: Sri Satguru Publications. 1995.
  • Bhattacharya, K. 1973. L´Ātman-Brahman dans le Bouddhisme Ancien. París: EFEO.
  • Bhikkhu Ñānamoli and Bhikkhu Bodhi. 1995. The Middle Length Discourses of the Buddha. A New Translation of the Majjhima Nikāya. Kandy: Buddhist Publication Society.
  • Bhikkhu Ñāṇananda. 1971. Concept and Reality in Early Buddhist Thought. Kandy: Buddhist Publication Society.
  • Cousins, L.S. 1996. “Good or Skillful? Kusala in Canon and Commentary.” Journal of Buddhist Ethics.Vol. 3: 133-164.
  • Collins, S. 1982. Selfless Persons. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Collins, S. 1994. “What are Buddhists Doing When They Deny the Self?” In Religion and Practical Reason, edited by Frank E. Reynolds and David Tracy. Albany: SUNY.
  • Collins, S. 1998. Nirvana and other Buddhist Felicities. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press
  • Dalai Lama. 1994. The Way to Freedom. San Francisco: Harper.
  • Dharmasiri, G. 1996. Fundamentals of Buddhist Ethics. Singapore: Buddhist Research Society.
  • Fuller, P. 2005. The Notion of Diṭṭhi in Theravāda Buddhism. London: RoutledgeCurzon.
  • Gombrich, R. 1988. Theravāda Buddhism: A Social History from Ancient Benares to Modern Colombo. London: Routledge.
  • Gombrich, R. 1996. How Buddhism Began. London: Athlone.
  • Gethin, R. 2001. The Buddhist Path to Awakening. Richmon Surrey: Curzon Press.
  • Gowans, C. W. 2003. Philosophy of the Buddha. London: Routledge.
  • Hallisey, C. 1996. “Ethical Particularism in Theravāda Buddhism.” Journal of Buddhist Ethics. Vol. 3: 32-34.
  • Hamilton, S. 2000. Early Buddhism: A New Approach. Richmon Surrey: Curzon Press.
  • Harvey, P. 1995. The Selfless Mind: Personality, Consciousness, and Nirvana in Early Buddhism. Richmon Surrey: Curzon Press.
  • Harvey, P. 1995. “Criteria for Judging the Unwholesomeness of Actions in the Texts of Theravāda Buddhism.” Journal of Buddhist Ethics. Vol. 2: 140-151.
  • Harvey, P. 2000. An Introduction to Buddhist Ethics. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Hoffman, F. J. 1987. Rationality and Mind in Early Buddhism. New Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
  • Hwang, S. 2006. Metaphor and Literalism in Buddhism: The Doctrinal History of Nirvana. London: RoutledgeCurzon.
  • Jayatilleke, K. N. 1963. Early Buddhist Theory of Knowledge. London: Allen & Unwin.
  • Johansson, R. 1969. The Psychology of Nirvana. London: Allen and Unwin Ltd.
  • Kalupahana, D. 1976. Buddhist Philosophy: A Historical Analysis. Honolulu: University Press of Hawai’i.
  • Kalupahana, D. 1992. A History of Buddhist Philosophy: Continuities and Discontinuities. Honolulu: University Press of Hawai’i.
  • Keown, D. 1992. The Nature of Buddhist Ethics. New York: Palgrave.
  • Norman, K. R. 1983. Pāli Literature: Including the Canonical Literature in Prakrit and Sanskrit of all the Hīnayāna schools of Buddhism. Wiesbaden: Otto Harrassowitz.
  • Norman, K. R. 1990-6. Collected Papers. Oxford: The Pāli Text Society.
  • Pande, G.C. 1995. Studies in the Origins of Buddhism. New Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
  • Pérez-Remón, J. 1980. Self and Non-Self in Early Buddhism. New York: Mouton.
  • Perret, R. 1986. “Egoism, Altruism, and Intentionalism in Buddhist Ethics.” Journal of IndianPhilosophy. Vol. 15: 71-85.
  • Premasiri, P. D. 1987. “Early Buddhist Concept of Ethical Knowledge: A Philosophical Analysis.” Kalupahana, D.J. and Weeraratne, W.G. eds. Buddhist Philosophy and Culture: Essays in Honor of N.A. Jayawickrema. Colombo: N.A. Jayawickrema Felicitation Volume Committee. Pp. 37-70.
  • Ronkin, N. 2005. Early Buddhist Metaphysics: The Making of a Philosophical Tradition. London: RoutledgeCurzon.
  • Tilakaratne, A. 1993. Nirvana and Ineffability: A Study of the Buddhist Theory of Reality and Languague. Colombo: Karunaratne and Sons.
  • Vélez de Cea , A. 2004 a. “The Silence of the Buddha and the Questions about the Tathāgata after Death.” The Indian International Journal of Buddhist Studies, no 5.
  • Vélez de Cea , A. 2004 b. “The Early Buddhist Criteria of Goodness and the Nature of Buddhist Ethics.”Journal of Buddhist Ethics 11, pp.123-142.
  • Vélez de Cea , A. 2005. “Emptiness in the Pāli Suttas and the Question of Nāgārjuna’s Orthodoxy.”Philosophy East and West. Vol. 55: 4.
  • Webster, D. 2005. The Philosophy of Desire in the Pali Canon. London: RoutledgeCurzon.

See also the Encylopedia articles on Madhyamaka Buddhism and Pudgalavada Buddhism.

Author Information

Abraham Velez
Eastern Kentucky University
U. S. A.

Advaita Vedanta

Advaita Vedānta is one version of Vedānta. Vedānta is nominally a school of Indian philosophy, although in reality it is a label for any hermeneutics that attempts to provide a consistent interpretation of the philosophy of the Upaniṣads or, more formally, the canonical summary of the Upaniṣads, Bādarāyaņa’s Brahma Sūtra. Advaita is often translated as “non-dualism” though it literally means “non-secondness.” Although Śaṅkara is regarded as the promoter of Advaita Vedānta as a distinct school of Indian philosophy, the origins of this school predate Śaṅkara. The existence of an Advaita tradition is acknowledged by Śaṅkara in his commentaries. The names of Upanṣadic teachers such as Yajñavalkya, Uddalaka, and Bādarāyaņa, the author of the Brahma Sūtra, could be considered as representing the thoughts of early Advaita. The essential philosophy of Advaita is an idealist monism, and is considered to be presented first in the Upaniṣads and consolidated in the Brahma Sūtra by this tradition. According to Advaita metaphysics, Brahman—the ultimate, transcendent and immanent God of the latter Vedas—appears as the world because of its creative energy (māyā). The world has no separate existence apart from Brahman. The experiencing self (jīva) and the transcendental self of the Universe (ātman) are in reality identical (both are Brahman), though the individual self seems different as space within a container seems different from space as such. These cardinal doctrines are represented in the anonymous verse “brahma satyam jagan mithya; jīvo brahmaiva na aparah” (Brahman is alone True, and this world of plurality is an error; the individual self is not different from Brahman). Plurality is experienced because of error in judgments (mithya) and ignorance (avidya). Knowledge of Brahman removes these errors and causes liberation from the cycle of transmigration and worldly bondage.

Table of Contents

  1. History of Advaita Vedānta
  2. Metaphysics and Philosophy
    1. Brahman, Jīva, īśvara, and Māyā
    2. Three Planes of Existence
  3. Epistemology
    1. Error, True Knowledge and Practical Teachings
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. History of Advaita Vedānta

It is possible that an Advaita tradition existed in the early part of the first millennium C.E., as indicated by Śaṅkara himself with his reference to tradition (sampradāya). But the only two names that could have some historical certainty are Gaudapāda and Govinda Bhagavadpāda, mentioned as Śaṅkara’s teacher’s teacher and the latter Śaṅkara’s teacher. The first complete Advaitic work is considered to be the Mandukya Kārikā, a commentary on the Mandukya Upanṣad, authored by Gaudapāda. Śaṅkara, as many scholars believe, lived in the eight century. His life, travel, and works, as we understand from thedigvijaya texts are almost of a superhuman quality. Though he lived only for 32 years, Śaṅkara’s accomplishments included traveling from the south to the north of India, writing commentaries for the ten Upaniṣads, the cryptic Brahma Sūtra, the Bhagavad Gītā, and authoring many other texts (though his authorship of only some is established), and founding four pītas, or centers of (Advaitic) excellence, with his pupils in charge. Śaṅkara is supposed to have had four (prominent) pupils: Padmapāda, Sureśvara, Hastamalaka and Toṭaka. Padmapāda is said to be his earliest student. Panchapadika, by Padmapāda, is a lucid commentary on Śaṅkara’s commentary on the first verses of the Brahma Sūtra. Sureśvara is supposed to have written Naiṣkarmya Siddhi, an independent treatise on Advaita. Mandana Miśra (eight century), an earlier adherent of the rival school of Bhatta Mīmāṃsa, is responsible for a version of Advaita which focuses on the doctrine of sphota, a semantic theory held by the Indian philosopher of language Bhartṛhari. He also accepts to a greater extent the joint importance of knowledge and works as a means to liberation, when for Śaṅkara knowledge is the one and only means. Mandana Miśra’s Brahmasiddhi is a significant work, which also marks a distinct form of Advaita. Two major sub-schools of Advaita Vedānta arose after Śaṅkara: Bhamati and Vivarana. The BhamatiSchool owes its name to Vacaspati Miśra’s (ninth century) commentary on Śaṅkara’s Brahma SūtraBhāṣya, while the Vivarana School is named after Prakashatman’s (tenth century) commentary on Padmapāda’s Pancapadika, which itself is a commentary on Śaṅkara’s commentary on the Brahma Sūtra. The prominent names in the later Advaita tradition are Prakāsātman (tenth century), Vimuktātman (tenth century), Sarvajñātman (tenth century), Śrī Harṣa (twelfth century), Citsukha (twelfth century), ānandagiri (thirteenth century), Amalānandā (thirteenth century), Vidyāraņya (fourteenth century), Śaṅkarānandā (fourteenth century), Sadānandā (fifteenth century), Prakāṣānanda (sixteenth century), Nṛsiṁhāśrama (sixteenth century), Madhusūdhana Sarasvati (seventeenth century), Dharmarāja Advarindra (seventeenth century), Appaya Dīkśita (seventeenth century), Sadaśiva Brahmendra (eighteenth century), Candraśekhara Bhārati (twentieth century), and Sacchidānandendra Saraswati (twentieth century).Vivarana, which is a commentary on Padmapāda’s Panchapadika, written by Vacaspati Mshra is a landmark work in the tradition. The Khandanakhandakhadya of Śrī Harṣa, Tattvapradipika of Citsukha, Pañcadasi of Vidyāraņya, Vedāntasāra of Sadānandā, Advaitasiddhi of Madhusadana Sarasvati, and Vedāntaparibhasa of Dharmarāja Advarindra are some of the landmark works representing later Advaita tradition. Throughout the eigteenth century and until the twenty-first century, there are many saints and philosophers whose tradition is rooted primarily or largely in Advaita philosophy. Prominent among the saints are Bhagavan Ramana Maharśi, Swami Vivekananda, Swami Tapovanam, Swami Chinmayānandā, and Swami Bodhānandā. Among the philosophers, KC Bhattacharya and TMP Mahadevan have contributed a great deal to the tradition.

2. Metaphysics and Philosophy

The classical Advaita philosophy of Śaṅkara recognizes a unity in multiplicity, identity between individual and pure consciousness, and the experienced world as having no existence apart from Brahman. The major metaphysical concepts in Advaita Vedānta tradition, such as māyāmithya (error in judgment),vivarta (illusion/whirlpool), have been subjected to a variety of interpretations. On some interpretations, Advaita Vedānta appears as a nihilistic philosophy that denounces the matters of the lived-world.

a. Brahman, Jīvaīśvara, and Māyā

For classical Advaita Vedānta, Brahman is the fundamental reality underlying all objects and experiences. Brahman is explained as pure existence, pure consciousness and pure bliss. All forms of existence presuppose a knowing self. Brahman or pure consciousness underlies the knowing self. Consciousness according to the Advaita School, unlike the positions held by other Vedānta schools, is not a property of Brahman but its very nature. Brahman is also one without a second, all-pervading and the immediate awareness. This absolute Brahman is known as nirguņa Brahman, or Brahman “without qualities,” but is usually simply called “Brahman.” This Brahman is ever known to Itself and constitutes the reality in all individuals selves, while the appearance of our empirical individuality is credited to avidya (ignorance) and māyā (illusion). Brahman thus cannot be known as an individual object distinct from the individual self. However, it can be experienced indirectly in the natural world of experience as a personal God, known as saguņa Brahman, or Brahman with qualities. It is usually referred to as īśvara (the Lord). The appearance of plurality arises from a natural state of confusion or ignorance (avidya), inherent in most biological entities. Given this natural state of ignorance, Advaita provisionally accepts the empirical reality of individual selves, mental ideas and physical objects as a cognitive construction of this natural state of ignorance. But from the absolute standpoint, none of these have independent existence but are founded on Brahman. From the standpoint of this fundamental reality, individual minds as well as physical objects are appearances and do not have abiding reality. Brahman appears as the manifold objects of experience because of its creative power, māyāMāyā is that which appears to be real at the time of experience but which does not have ultimate existence. It is dependent on pure consciousness. Brahman appears as the manifold world without undergoing an intrinsic change or modification. At no point of time does Brahman change into the world. The world is but avivarta, a superimposition on Brahman. The world is neither totally real nor totally unreal. It is not totally unreal since it is experienced. It is not totally real since it is sublated by knowledge of Brahman. There are many examples given to illustrate the relation between the existence of the world and Brahman. The two famous examples are that of the space in a pot versus the space in the whole cosmos (undifferentiated in reality, though arbitrarily separated by the contingencies of the pot just as the world is in relation to Brahman), and the self versus the reflection of the self (the reflection having no substantial existence apart from the self just as the objects of the world rely upon Brahman for substantiality). The existence of an individuated jīva and the world are without a beginning. We cannot say when they began, or what the first cause is. But both are with an end, which is knowledge of Brahman. According to classical Advaita Vedānta, the existence of the empirical world cannot be conceived without a creator who is all-knowing and all-powerful. The creation, sustenance, and dissolution of the world are overseen by īśvaraīśvara is the purest manifestation of Brahman. Brahman with the creative power ofmāyā is īśvaraMāyā has both individual (vyaśti) and cosmic (samaśti) aspects. The cosmic aspect belongs to one īśvara, and the individual aspect, avidya, belongs to many jīvas. But the difference is thatīśvara is not controlled by māyā, whereas the jīva is overpowered by avidyaMāyā is responsible for the creation of the world. Avidya is responsible for confounding the distinct existence between self and the not-self. With this confounding, avidya conceals Brahman and constructs the world. As a result thejīva functions as a doer (karta) and enjoyer (bhokta) of a limited world. The classical picture may be contrasted with two sub-schools of Advaita Vedānta that arose after Śaṅkara: Bhamati and Vivarana. The primary difference between these two sub-schools is based on the different interpretations for avidya and māyā. Śaṅkara described avidya as beginningless. He considered that to search the origin of avidya itself is a process founded on avidya and hence will be fruitless. But Śaṅkara’s disciples gave greater attention to this concept, and thus originated the two sub-schools. TheBhamati School owes its name to Vacaspati Miśra’s (ninth century) commentary on Śaṅkara’s Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya, while the Vivarana School is named after Prakāṣātman’s (tenth century) commentary on Padmapāda’s Pañcapadika, which itself is a commentary on Śaṅkara’s Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya. The major issue that distinguishes Bhamati and Vivarana schools is their position on the nature and locus of avidya. According to the Bhamati School, the jīva is the locus and object of avidya. According to the VivaranaSchool, Brahman is the locus of avidya. The Bhamati School holds that Brahman can never be the locus of avidya but is the controller of it as īśvara. Belonging to jīvatulaavidya, or individual ignorance performs two functions – veils Brahman, and projects (vikṣepa) a separate world. Mulaavidya (“root ignorance”) is the universal ignorance that is equivalent to Māyā, and is controlled by īśvara. The Vivarana School holds that since Brahman alone exists, Brahman is the locus and object of avidya. With the help of epistemological discussions, the non-reality of the duality between Brahman and world is established. The Vivarana School responds to the question regarding Brahman’s existence as both “pure consciousness” and “universal ignorance” by claiming that valid cognition (prama) presumes avidya, in the everyday world, whereas pure consciousness is the essential nature of Brahman.

b. Three Planes of Existence

There are three planes of existence according to classical Advaita Vedānta: the plane of absolute existence (paramarthika satta), the plane of worldly existence (vyavaharika satta) which includes this world and the heavenly world, and the plane of illusory existence (pratibhāsika existence). The two latter planes of existence are a function of māyā and are thus illusory to some extent. A pratibhāsikaexistence, such as objects presented in a mirage, is less real than a worldly existence. Its corresponding unreality is, however, different from that which characterizes the absolutely nonexistent or the impossible, such as a sky-lotus (a lotus that grows in the sky) or the son of a barren woman. The independent existence of a mirage and the world, both of which are due to a certain causal condition, ceases once the causal condition change. The causal condition is avidya, or ignorance. The independent existence and experience of the world ceases to be with the gain of knowledge of Brahman. The nature of knowledge of Brahman is that “I am pure consciousness.” The self-ignorance of the jīva (individuated self) that “I am limited” is replaced by the Brahman-knowledge that “I am everything,” accompanied by a re-identification of the self with the transcendental Brahman. The knower of Brahman sees the one non-plural reality in everything. He or she no longer gives an absolute reality to independent and limited existence of the world, but experiences the world as a creative expression of pure consciousness. The states of waking (jāgrat), dreaming (svapna) and deep sleep (susupti) all point to the fourth nameless state turiya, pure consciousness, which is to be realized as the true self. Pure consciousness is not only pure existence but also the ultimate bliss which is experienced partially during deep sleep. Hence we wake up refreshed.

3. Epistemology

The Advaita tradition puts forward three lesser tests of truth: correspondence, coherence, and practical efficacy. These are followed by a fourth test of truth: epistemic-nonsublatability (abādhyatvam orbādhaṛāhityam). According to the Vedānta Paribhāṣa (a classical text of Advaita Vedānta) “that knowledge is valid which has for its object something that is nonsublated.” Nonsublatablity is considered as the ultimate criterion for valid knowledge. The master test of epistemic-nonsublatability inspires a further constraint: foundationality (anadhigatatvam, lit. “of not known earlier”). This last criterion of truth is the highest standard that virtually all knowledge claims fail, and thus it is the standard for absolute, or unqualified, knowledge, while the former criteria are amenable to mundane, worldly knowledge claims. According to Advaita Vedānta, a judgment is true if it remains unsublated. The commonly used example that illustrates epistemic-nonsublatabilty is the rope that appears as a snake from a distance (a stock example in Indian philosophy). The belief that one sees a snake in this circumstance is erroneous according to Advaita Vedānta because the snake belief (and the visual presentation of a snake) is sublated into the judgment that what one is really seeing is a rope. Only wrong cognitions can be sublated. The condition of foundationality disqualifies memory as a means of knowledge. Memory is the recollection of something already known and is thus derivable and not foundational. Only genuine knowledge of the Self, according to Advaita Vedānta, passes the test of foundationality: it is born of immediate knowledge (aparokṣa jñāna) and not memory (smṛti). Six natural ways of knowing are accepted as valid means of knowledge (pramāṅa) by Advaita Vedānta: perception (pratyakṣa), inference (anumāna), verbal testimony (śabda), comparison (upamana), postulation (arthapatti) and non-apprehension (anupalabdhi). The pramāṅas do not contradict each other and each of them presents a distinct kind of knowledge. Nonfoundational knowledge of Brahman cannot be had by any means but through Śruti, which is the supernaturally revealed text in the form of the Vedas (of which the Upaniṣads form the most philosophical portion). Inference and the other means of knowledge cannot determinately reveal the truth of Brahman on their own. However, Advaitins recognize that in addition toŚruti, one requires yukti (reason) and anubhava (personal experience) to actualize knowledge of Brahman. Mokṣa (liberation), which consists in the cessation of the cycle of life and death, governed by the karma of the individual self, is the result of knowledge of Brahman. As Brahman is identical with the universal Self, and this Self is always self-conscious, it would seem that knowledge of Brahman is Self-knowledge, and that this Self-knowledge is ever present. If so, it seems that ignorance is impossible. Moreover, in the adhyāsa bhāṣya (his preamble to the commentary on the Brahma Sūtra) Śaṅkara says that the pure subjectivity—the Self or Brahman—can never become the object of knowledge, just as the object can never be the subject. This would suggest that Self-knowledge that one gains in order to achieve liberation is impossible. Śaṅkara’s response to this problem is to regard knowledge of Brahman that is necessary for liberation, derived from scripture, to be distinct from the Self-consciousness of Brahman, and rather a practical knowledge that removes ignorance, which is an obstacle to the luminance of the ever-present self-consciousness of Brahman that does pass the test of foundationality. Ignorance, in turn, is not a feature of the ultimate Self on his account, but a feature of the individual self that is ultimately unreal. Four factors are involved in an external perception: the physical object, the sense organ, the mind (antaḥkarana) and the cognizing self (pramata). The cognizing self alone is self-luminous and the rest of the three factors are not self-luminous being devoid of consciousness. It is the mind and the sense organ which relates the cognizing self to the object. The self alone is the knower and the rest are knowable as objects of knowledge. At the same time the existence of mind is indubitable. It is the mind that helps to distinguish between various perceptions. It is because of the self-luminous (svata-prakāṣa) nature of pure consciousness that the subject knows and the object is known. In his commentary to Taittirīya Upaniṣad, Śaṅkara says that “consciousness is the very nature of the Self and inseparable from It.” The cognizing self, the known object, the object-knowledge, and the valid means of knowledge (pramāṅa) are essentially the manifestations of one pure consciousness.

a. Error, True Knowledge and Practical Teachings

Śaṅkara uses adhyāsa to indicate illusion – illusory objects of perception as well as illusory perception. Two other words which are used to denote the same are adhyāropa (superimposition) and avabhāsa(appearance). According to Śaṅkara the case of illusion involves both superimposition and appearance.Adhyāsa, as he says in his preamble to the Brahma Sūtra, is the apprehension of something as something else with two kinds of confounding such as the object and its properties. The concept of illusion, in Advaita Vedānta, is significant because it leads to the theory of a “real substratum.” The illusory object, like the real object, has a definite locus. According to Śaṅkara, adhyāsais not possible without a substratum. Padmapāda says in Pañcapadika that adhyāsa without a substratum has never been experienced and is inconceivable. Vacaspati affirms that there cannot be a case of illusion where the substratum is fully apprehended or not apprehended at all. The Advaita theory of error (known as anirvacanīya khyāti, or the apprehension of the indefinable) holds that the perception of the illusory object is a product of the ignorance about the substratum. Śaṅkara characterizes illusion in two ways in his commentary on the Brahma Sūtra. The first is an appearance of something previously experienced—like memory—in something else (smṛtirupaḥ paratra pūrva dṛṣṭaḥ avabhāsah). The second is a minimalist characterization—the appearance of one thing with the properties of another (anyasya anyadharma avabhāsatam. Śaṅkara devotes his introduction to his commentary on the Brahma Sūtra, to the idea of adhyāsa to account for illusory perception relating to both everyday experience and also transcendent entities. This introduction, called the adhyāsa bhāṣya (commentary on illusion) presents a realistic position and a seemingly dualistic metaphysics: “Since it is an established fact that the object and subject which are presented as yusmad—‘you’ /the other, and asmad—‘me’ are by very nature contradictory, and their qualities also contradictory, as light and darkness they cannot be identical.” Plurality and illusion, on this account, are constructed out of the cognitive superimposition of the category of objects on pure subjectivity. While two conceptual categories are superimposed to create objects of illusion, the Adavita Vedānta view is that the only possible way of metaphysically describing the object of illusion is with the help of a characteristic, other than those of non-existence and existence, which is termed as the “indeterminate” (anirvacaniya) which also somehow connects the two usual possibilities of existence and non-existence. The object of illusion cannot be logically defined as real or unreal. Error is the apprehension of the indefinable. It is due to the “illegitimate transference” of the qualities of one order to another. Perceptual illusion forms the bridge between Advaita’s soteriology, on the one hand, and its theory of experience, on the other. The relationship between the experience of liberation in this life (mukti) and everyday experience is viewed as analogous to the relation between veridical and delusive sense perception. Śaṅkara formulates a theory of knowledge in accordance with his soteriological views. Śaṅkara’s interest is thus not to build a theory of error and leave it by itself but to connect it to his theory of the ultimate reality of Self-Consciousness which is the only state which can be true according to his twin criteria for truth (non-sublatability and foundationality). The characteristic of indeterminacy that qualifies objects of illusion is that which is truly neither real nor unreal but appears as a real locus. It serves as a stark contrast to the soteriological goal of the Self, which is truly real and determinate. On the basis of his theory of knowledge, Śaṅkara elucidates the fourfold (mental and physical) practices or qualifications—sādana catuṣṭaya—to aid in the achievement of liberation: (i) the discrimination (viveka) between the permanent (nitya) and the impermanent (anitya) objects of experience; (ii) dispassion towards the enjoyment of fruits of action here and in heaven; (iii) accomplishment of means of discipline such as calmness, mental control etc.; (iv) a longing for liberation. In his commentary to theBrahma Sūtra, Śaṅkara says that the inquiry into Brahman could start only after acquiring these fourfold qualifications. The concept of liberation (mokṣa) in Advaita is cashed out in terms of Brahman. The pathways to liberations are defined by the removal of self-ignorance that is brought about by the removal of mithyajñāna (erroneous knowledge claims). This is captured in the formula of one Advaitin: “[He] is never born again who knows that he is the only one in all beings like the ether and that all beings are in him” (Upadesa Sahasri XVII.69). Many thinkers in the history of Indian philosophy have held that there is an important connection between action and liberation. In contrast, Śaṅkara rejects the theory of jñāna-karma-samuccaya, the combination of karma (Vedic duties) with knowledge of Brahman leading to liberation. Knowledge of Brahman alone is the route to liberation for Śaṅkara. The role of action (karma) is to purify the mind (antaḥkaranasuddhi) and make it free from likes and dislikes (raga dveṣa vimuktaḥ). Such a mind will be instrumental to knowledge of Brahman.

4. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Alladi Mahadeva Sastri (Trans.). The Bhagavad Gita with the commentary of Śrī Śaṅkara. Madras: Samata Books, 1981.
  • Madhusudana, Saraswati. Gudartha Dipika. Trans. Sisirkumar Gupta. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass Pubs., 1977.
  • Brahma Sūtra Śaṅkara Bhāṣya: 3.3.54. Found in, V.H. Date, Vedānta Explained: Śaṅkara’s Commentary on the Brahma-Sūtra, vols. 1 and 2 (Bombay: Book Seller’s Publishing Com., 1954).
  • Date, V. H. Vedānta Explained: Śaṅkara’s commentary on the Brahma Sūtra. Vol. I. Bombay: Book Seller’s Publishing Company, 1954.
  • Taittiriya Upaniṣad Śaṅkara Bhāṣya: 2.10. Found in Karl H. Potter, Gen. Ed. Encyclopedia of Indian Philosophies, Vol. III. 1st Ind. ed. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass Publishers, 1981.
  • Upadesa Sahasri of Śaṅkaracharya, Trans. Swami Jagadananda. Mylapore: Śrī Ramkrishna Math, 1941.
  • Dṛg-dṛṣya Viveka of Śaṅkara. Trans. Swami Nikhilananda. 6th ed. Mysore: Śrī Ramakrishna Ashrama, 1976.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Potter, Karl H. Advaita Vedānta up to Śaṅkara and his Pupils. Vol. III of Encyclopedia of Indian Philosophies. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1981.
  • Mahadevan, T M P. Śaṅkara. New Delhi: National Book Trust, 1968.
  • Mahadevan, T M P. Superimposition in Advaita Vedānta. New Delhi: Sterling Publishers Pvt. Ltd., 1985.
  • Satprakashananda, Swami. Methods of Knowledge According to Advaita Vedānta. Calcutta: Advaita Ashrama, 1974.
  • Dasgupta, Surendranath. A History of Indian Philosophy. Vol. I. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1975.
  • Radhakrishnan, S. Indian Philosophy. Vol. II. Delhi: Oxford University Press, 1940.
  • Rangacarya, M. (Trans.). The Sarva Siddhānta-Saṅgraha of Śaṅkara. New Delhi: Ajay Book Service, 1983.

Author Information

Sangeetha Menon
National Institute of Advanced Studies
Indian Institute of Science Campus, Bangalore

Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan (1888—1975)

Radhakrishnan_SAs an academic, philosopher, and statesman, Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan (1888-1975) was one of the most recognized and influential Indian thinkers in academic circles in the 20th century. Throughout his life and extensive writing career, Radhakrishnan sought to define, defend, and promulgate his religion, a religion he variously identified as Hinduism, Vedanta, and the religion of the Spirit. He sought to demonstrate that his Hinduism was both philosophically coherent and ethically viable. Radhakrishnan’s concern for experience and his extensive knowledge of the Western philosophical and literary traditions has earned him the reputation of being a bridge-builder between India and the West. He often appears to feel at home in the Indian as well as the Western philosophical contexts, and draws from both Western and Indian sources throughout his writing. Because of this, Radhakrishnan has been held up in academic circles as a representative of Hinduism to the West. His lengthy writing career and his many published works have been influential in shaping the West’s understanding of Hinduism, India, and the East.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography and Context
    1. Early Years (1888-1904)
    2. Madras Christian College (1904-1908)
    3. Early Teaching and Writing (1908-1912)
    4. The War, Tagore, and Mysore (1914-1920)
    5. Calcutta and the George V Chair (1921-1931)
    6. The 1930s and 1940s
    7. Post-Independence: Vice-presidency and Presidency
  2. Philosophy of Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan
    1. Metaphysics
    2. Epistemology: Intuition and the Varieties of Experience
      1. Intuition
      2. Varieties of Experience
        1. Cognitive Experience
        2. Psychic Experience
        3. Aesthetic Experience
        4. Ethical Experience
        5. Religious Experience
    3. Religious Pluralism
    4. Authority of Scripture and the Scientific Basis of Hinduism
    5. Practical Mysticism and Applied Ethics
      1. Ethics of Caste
  3. Criticism
    1. Epistemic Authority
    2. Cultural and Religious Constructions
    3. Selectivity of Evidence
  4. List of Abbreviations
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources by Radhakrishnan
    2. Selected Secondary Sources

1. Biography and Context

a. Early Years (1888-1904)

Rather little detail is known of Radhakrishnan’s earliest childhood and education. Radhakrishnan rarely spoke about his personal life, and what he does reveal comes to us after several decades of reflection. Radhakrishnan was born in Tirutani, Andhra Pradesh into a brahmin family, likely smarta in religious orientation. Predominantly Hindu, Tirutani was a temple town and popular pilgrimage center, and Radhakrishnan’s family were active participants in the devotional activities there. The implicit acceptance of Śaṅkara’s Advaita by the smarta tradition is good evidence to suggest that an advaitic framework was an important, though latent, feature of Radhakrishnan’s early philosophical and religious sensibilities.

In 1896, Radhakrishnan was sent to school in the nearby pilgrimage center of Tirupati, a town with a distinctively cosmopolitan flavor, drawing bhaktas from all parts of India. For four years, Radhakrishnan attended the Hermannsburg Evangelical Lutheran Missionary school. It was there that the young Radhakrishnan first encountered non-Hindu missionaries and 19th century Christian theology with its impulse toward personal religious experience. The theology taught in the missionary school may have found resonance with the highly devotional activities connected with the nearby Tirumala temple, activities that Radhakrishnan undoubtedly would have witnessed taking place outside the school. The shared emphasis on personal religious experience may have suggested to Radhakrishnan a common link between the religion of the missionaries and the religion practiced at the nearby Tirumala temple.

Between 1900 and 1904, Radhakrishnan attended Elizabeth Rodman Voorhees College in Vellore, a school run by the American Arcot Mission of the Reformed Church in America. The mandate of the Mission was to preach the gospel, to publish vernacular tracts, and to educate the “heathen” masses. It was here, as Robert Minor points out, that Radhakrishnan was “introduced to the Dutch Reform Theology, which emphasized a righteous God, unconditional grace, and election, and which criticized Hinduism as intellectually incoherent and ethically unsound.” At the same time, the Mission demonstrated an active concern for education, health care, and social uplift through its participation in famine relief, the establishment of hospitals, and education for all irrespective of social status. Such activities were not inconsistent with the mandate of the Mission as they often served as incentives for conversion. In was in this atmosphere that Radhakrishnan encountered what would have appeared to him as crippling assaults on his Hindu sensibilities. He also would have witnessed the positive contributions of the social programs undertaken by the Mission in the name of propagation of the Christian gospel.

Thus, Radhakrishnan inherited from his upbringing a tacit acceptance of Śaṅkara’s Advaita Vedanta and an awareness of the centrality of devotional practices associated with the smarta tradition. His experiences at Tirupati brought him into contact with Lutheran Christian missionaries whose theological emphasis on personal religious experience may have suggested to him a common ground between Christianity and his own religious heritage. In Vellore, the presence of a systematic social gospel was intimately bound up with the religion of those who sought to censure Radhakrishnan’s cultural norms and religious worldview.

Radhakrishnan was married to his wife of over 50 years, Sivakamuamma, in 1904 while living in Vellore. The couple went on to have six children: five daughters and a son.

It is in this historical and hermeneutic contexts and with these experiences informing his worldview that Radhakrishnan encountered a resurgent Hinduism. Specifically, Radhakrishnan encountered the writings of Swami Vivekananda and V.D. Savarkar’s The First War of Indian Independence. The Theosophical Society was also active in the South Arcot area at this time. The Theosophists not only applauded the ancient wisdom they claimed to have found in India, but were persistent advocates of a philosophical, spiritual, and scientific meeting of East and West. Moreover, the Society’s role in the Indian nationalist movement is evidenced by Annie Besant’s involvement with the Indian National Congress. While Radhakrishnan does not speak of the Theosophists presence at this time, it is unlikely that he would have been unfamiliar with their views.

What Vivekananda, Savarkar, and Theosophy did bring to Radhakrishnan was a sense of cultural self-confidence and self-reliance. However, the affirmation Radhakrishnan received from this resurgence of Hinduism did not push Radhakrishnan to study philosophy nor to interpret his own religion. It was only after Radhakrishnan’s experiences at Madras Christian College that he began to put down in writing his own understanding of Hinduism.

b. Madras Christian College (1904-1908)

In 1904, Radhakrishnan entered Madras Christian College. At this time Radhakrishnan’s academic sensibilities lay with the physical sciences, and before beginning his MA degree in 1906 his interest appears to have been law.

Two key influences on Radhakrishnan at Madras Christian College left an indelible stamp on Radhakrishnan’s sensibilities. First, it was here that Radhakrishnan was trained in European philosophy. Radhakrishnan was introduced to the philosophies of Berkeley,LeibnizLockeSpinozaKantJ.S. MillHerbert SpencerFichteHegelAristotle, andPlato among others. Radhakrishnan was also introduced to the philosophical methods and theological views of his MA supervisor and most influential non-Indian mentor, Professor A.G. Hogg. Hogg was a Scottish Presbyterian missionary who was educated in the theology of Albrecht Ritschl and studied under the philosopher Andrew Seth Pringle-Pattison. As a student of Arthur Titius, himself a student of Albrecht Ritschl, Hogg adopted the Ritschlian distinction between religious value judgments, with their emphasis on subjective perception, and theoretical knowledge, which seeks to discover the nature of ultimate reality. Religious value judgments give knowledge which is different from, though not necessarily opposed to, theoretical knowledge. For Ritschl, and subsequently for Titius and Hogg, this distinction led to the conclusion that doctrines and scriptures are records of personal insights and are therefore necessary for religious, and specifically Christian, faith. This distinction left its mark on Radhakrishnan’s philosophical and religious thinking and resonates throughout his writing.

A second key factor shaping Radhakrishnan’s sensibilities during this time is that it was at Madras Christian College that Radhakrishnan encountered intense religious polemic in an academic setting. Radhakrishnan later recalled: “The challenge of Christian critics impelled me to make a study of Hinduism and find out what is living and what is dead in it… I prepared a thesis on the Ethics of the Vedanta, which was intended to be a reply to the charge that the Vedanta system had no room for ethics” (MST 19).

c. Early Teaching and Writing (1908-1912)

Upon the completion of his MA degree in 1908, Radhakrishnan found himself at both a financial and professional crossroads. His obligations to his family precluded him from applying for a scholarship to study in Britain and he struggled without success to find work in Madras. The following year, with the assistance of William Skinner at Madras Christian College, Radhakrishnan was able to secure what was intended to be a temporary teaching position at Presidency College in Madras.

At Presidency College, Radhakrishnan lectured on a variety of topics in psychology as well as in European philosophy. As a junior Assistant Professor, logic, epistemology and ethical theory were his stock areas of instruction. At the College, Radhakrishnan also learned Sanskrit.

During these years, Radhakrishnan was anxious to have his work published, not only by Indian presses but also in European journals. The Guardian Press in Madras published his MA thesis, and scarcely revised portions of this work appeared in Modern Review andThe Madras Christian College Magazine. While Radhakrishnan’s efforts met with success in other Indian journals, it was not until his article “The Ethics of the Bhagavadgita and Kant” appeared in The International Journal of Ethics in 1911 that Radhakrishnan broke through to a substantial Western audience. As well, his edited lecture notes on psychology were published under the title Essentials of Psychology.

d. The War, Tagore, and Mysore (1914-1920)

By 1914, Radhakrishnan’s reputation as a scholar was beginning to grow. However, the security of a permanent academic post in Madras eluded him. For three months in 1916 he was posted to Anantapur, Andhra Pradesh, and in 1917 he was transferred yet again, this time to Rajahmundry. Only after spending a year in Rajahmundry did Radhakrishnan find some degree of professional security upon his acceptance of a position in philosophy at Mysore University. This hiatus in his occupational angst would be short lived. His most prestigious Indian academic appointment to the George V Chair in Philosophy at Calcutta University in February of 1921 would take him out of South India for the first time only two and a half years later.

Between 1914 and 1920, Radhakrishnan continued to publish. He authored eighteen articles, ten of which were published in prominent Western journals such as The International Journal of EthicsThe Monist, and Mind. Throughout these articles, Radhakrishnan took it upon himself to refine and expand upon his interpretation of Hinduism.

There is a strong polemical tenor to many of these articles. Radhakrishnan was no longer content simply to define and defend Vedanta. Instead, he sought to confront directly not only Vedanta’s Western competitors, but what he saw as the Western philosophical enterprise and the Western ethos in general.

Radhakrishnan’s polemical sensibilities during these years were heightened in no small part by the political turmoil both on the Indian as well as on the world stage. Radhakrishnan’s articles and books during this period reflect his desire to offer a sustainable philosophical response to the unfolding discontent he encountered. World War One and its aftermath, and in particular the events in Amritsar in the spring of 1919, further exacerbated Radhakrishnan’s patience with what he saw as an irrational, dogmatic, and despotic West. Radhakrishnan’s 1920 The Reign of Religion in Contemporary Philosophy is indicative of his heightened polemical sensibilities during this period.

A more positive factor in Radhakrishnan’s life during these years was his reading of Rabindranath Tagore, the Bengali poet. Radhakrishnan joined the rest of the English-speaking world in 1912 in reading Tagore’s translated works. Though the two had never met at this time, Tagore would become perhaps Radhakrishnan’s most influential Indian mentor. Tagore’s poetry and prose resonated with Radhakrishnan. He appreciated Tagore’s emphasis on aesthetics as well as his appeal to intuition. From 1914 on, both of these notions — aesthetics and intuition — begin to find their place in Radhakrishnan’s own interpretations of experience, the epistemological category for his philosophical and religious proclivities. Over the next five decades, Radhakrishnan would repeatedly appeal to Tagore’s writing to support his own philosophical ideals.

e. Calcutta and the George V Chair (1921-1931)

In 1921, Radhakrishnan took up the prestigious George V Chair in Philosophy at Calcutta University. As an honored, though hesitant, heir to Brajendranath Seal, Radhakrishnan’s appointment to the chair was not without its dissenters who sought a fellow Bengali for the position. In Calcutta, Radhakrishnan was for the first time out of his South Indian element — geographically, culturally, and linguistically.

However, the isolation Radhakrishnan experienced during his early years in Calcutta allowed him to work on his two volume Indian Philosophy, the first of which he began while in Mysore and published in 1923 and the second followed four years later. Throughout the 1920s, Radhakrishnan’s reputation as a scholar continued to grow both in India and abroad. He was invited to Oxford to give the 1926 Upton Lectures, published in 1927 as The Hindu View of Life, and in 1929 Radhakrishnan delivered theHibbert Lectures, later published under the title An Idealist View of Life. The later of these two Views is Radhakrishnan’s most sustained, non-commentarial work. An Idealist View of Life is frequently seen as Radhakrishnan’s mature work and has undoubtedly received the bulk of scholarly attention on Radhakrishnan.

While Radhakrishnan enjoyed a growing scholarly repute, he was also confronted in Calcutta with growing conflict and confrontation. The events of Amritsar in 1919 did little to encourage positive relations between Indians and the British Raj; and Gandhi’s on again-off again Rowlatt satyagraha was proving ineffective in cultivating a united Indian voice. The ambiguity of the Montagu-Chelmsford Reforms with their olive branch for “responsible government” further fragmented an already divided Congress. The Khalifat movement splintered the Indian Muslim community, and aggravated the growing animosity between its supporters and those, Muslim or otherwise, who saw it as a side issue to swaraj (self-rule). But the racial paternalism of the 1927 Simon Commission prompted a resurgence of nationalist sentiment. While Indian solidarity and protest received international attention, due in no small part to the media coverage of Gandhi’s Salt March, such national unity was readily shaken. Indian political consensus, much less swaraj, proved elusive. Communal division and power struggles on the part of Indians and a renewed conservatism in Britain crippled the London Round Table Conferences of the early 1930s, reinforcing and perpetuating an already highly fragmented and politically volatile India.

With the publication of An Idealist View of Life, Radhakrishnan had come into his own philosophically. In his mind, he had identified the “religious” problem, reviewed the alternatives, and posited a solution. An unreflective dogmatism could not be remedied by escaping from “experiential religion” which is the true basis of all religions. Rather, a recognition of the creative potency of integral experience tempered by a critical scientific attitude was, Radhakrishnan believed, the only viable corrective to dogmatic claims of exclusivity founded on external, second-hand authority. Moreover, while Hinduism (Advaita Vedanta) as he defined it best exemplified his position, Radhakrishnan claimed that the genuine philosophical, theological, and literary traditions in India and the West supported his position.

f. The 1930s and 1940s

Radhakrishnan was knighted in 1931, the same year he took up his administrative post as Vice Chancellor at the newly founded, though scarcely constructed, Andhra University at Waltair. Sir Radhakrishnan served there for five years as Vice Chancellor, when, in 1936, not only did the university in Calcutta affirm his position in perpetuity but Oxford University appointed him to the H.N. Spalding Chair of Eastern Religions and Ethics. In late 1939, Radhakrishnan took up his second Vice Chancellorship at Benares Hindu University (BHU), and served there during the course of the second world war until mid-January 1948, two weeks before Gandhi’s assassination in New Delhi.

Shortly after his resignation from BHU, Radhakrishnan was named chairman of the University Education Commission. The Commission’s 1949 Report assessed the state of university education and made recommendations for its improvement in the newly independent India. Though co-authored by others, Radhakrishnan’s hand is felt especially in the chapters on The Aims of University Education and Religious Education.

During these years, the question of nationalism occupied Radhakrishnan’s attention. The growing communalism Radhakrishnan had witnessed in the 1920s was further intensified with the ideological flowering of the Hindu Mahasabha under the leadership of Bhai Parmanand and his heir V.D. Savarkar. Likewise, Muhammad Iqbal’s 1930 poetic vision and call for Muslim self-assertion furnished Muhammad Jinnah with an ideological template in which to lay claim to an independent Pakistan. This claim was given recognition at the Round Table Conferences in London early that decade. If the Montagu-Chelmsford Reforms had in the 1920s served to fracture already fragile political alliances, its 1935 progeny as the Government of India Act with its promise for greater self-government further crowded the political stage and divided those groups struggling for their share of power. During these years, the spectrum of nationalist vision was as broad as Indian solidarity was elusive.

The issues of education and nationalism come together for Radhakrishnan during this period. For Radhakrishnan, a university education which quickened the development of the whole individual was the only responsible and practical means to the creation of Indian solidarity and clarity of national vision. Throughout the 1930s and 1940s, Radhakrishnan expressed his vision of an autonomous India. He envisioned an India built and guided by those who were truly educated, by those who had a personal vision of and commitment to raising Indian self-consciousness.

g. Post-Independence: Vice-presidency and Presidency

The years following Indian independence mark Radhakrishnan’s increasing involvement in Indian political as well as in international affairs. The closing years of the 1940s were busy ones. Radhakrishnan had been actively involved in the newly incorporated UNESCO (United Nations Educational, Scientific, and Cultural Organization), serving on its Executive Board as well as leading the Indian delegation from 1946-1951. Radhakrishnan also served for the two years immediately following India’s independence as a member of the Indian Constituent Assembly. Radhakrishnan’s time and energy to UNESCO and the Constituent Assembly had also to be shared by the demands of the University Commission and his continuing obligations as Spalding Professor at Oxford.

With the Report of the Universities Commission complete in 1949, Radhakrishnan was appointed by then Prime Minister Jawaharlal Nehru as Indian Ambassador to Moscow, a post he held until 1952. The opportunity for Radhakrishnan to put into practice his own philosophical-political ideals came with his election to the Raja Sabha, in which he served as India’s Vice-President (1952-1962) and later as President (1962-1967).

Radhakrishnan saw during his terms in office an increasing need for world unity and universal fellowship. The urgency of this need was pressed home to Radhakrishnan by what he saw as the unfolding crises throughout the world. At the time of his taking up the office of Vice-President, the Korean war was already in full swing. Political tensions with China in the early 1960s followed by the hostilities between India and Pakistan dominated Radhakrishnan’s presidency. Moreover, the Cold War divided East and West leaving each side suspicious of the other and on the defensive.

Radhakrishnan challenged what he saw as the divisive potential and dominating character of self-professed international organizations such as the League of Nations. Instead, he called for the promotion of a creative internationalism based on the spiritual foundations of integral experience. Only then could understanding and tolerance between peoples and between nations be promoted.

Radhakrishnan retired from public life in 1967. He spent the last eight years of his life at the home he built in Mylapore, Madras. Radhakrishnan died on April 17, 1975.

2. Philosophy of Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan

a. Metaphysics

Radhakrishnan located his metaphysics within the Advaita (non-dual) Vedanta tradition (sampradaya). And like other Vedantins before him, Radhakrishnan wrote commentaries on the Prasthanatraya (that is, main primary texts of Vedanta ): the Upanisads (1953),Brahma Sutra (1959), and the Bhagavadgita (1948).

As an Advaitin, Radhakrishnan embraced a metaphysical idealism. But Radhakrishnan’s idealism was such that it recognized the reality and diversity of the world of experience (prakṛti) while at the same time preserving the notion of a wholly transcendent Absolute (Brahman), an Absolute that is identical to the self (Atman). While the world of experience and of everyday things is certainly not ultimate reality as it is subject to change and is characterized by finitude and multiplicity, it nonetheless has its origin and support in the Absolute (Brahman) which is free from all limits, diversity, and distinctions (nirguṇa). Brahman is the source of the world and its manifestations, but these modes do not affect the integrity of Brahman.

In this vein, Radhakrishnan did not merely reiterate the metaphysics of Śaṅkara (8th century C.E.), arguably Advaita Vedanta’s most prominent and enduring figure, but sought to reinterpret Advaita for present needs. In particular, Radhakrishnan reinterpreted what he saw as Śaṅkara’s understanding of maya strictly as illusion. For Radhakrishnan, maya ought not to be understood to imply a strict objective idealism, one in which the world is taken to be inherently disconnected from Brahman, but rather mayaindicates, among other things, a subjective misperception of the world as ultimately real. [See Donald Braue, Maya in Radhakrishnan’s Thought: Six Meanings Other Than Illusion(1985) for a full treatment of this issue.]

b. Epistemology: Intuition and the Varieties of Experience

This section deals with Radhakrishnan’s understanding of intuition and his interpretations of experience. It begins with a general survey of the variety of terms as well as the characteristics Radhakrishnan associates with intuition. It then details with how Radhakrishnan understands specific occurrences of intuition in relation to other forms of experience — cognitive, psychic, aesthetic, ethical, and religious.

i. Intuition

Radhakrishnan associates a vast constellation of terms with intuition. At its best, intuition is an “integral experience”. Radhakrishnan uses the term “integral” in at least three ways. First, intuition is integral in the sense that it coordinates and synthesizes all other experiences. It integrates all other experiences into a more unified whole. Second, intuition is integral as it forms the basis of all other experiences. In other words, Radhakrishnan holds that all experiences are at bottom intuitional. Third, intuition is integral in the sense that the results of the experience are integrated into the life of the individual. For Radhakrishnan, intuition finds expression in the world of action and social relations.

At times Radhakrishnan prefers to emphasize the “mystical” and “spiritual” quality of intuition as attested to by the expressions “religious experience” (IVL 91), “religious consciousness” (IVL 199), “mystical experience” (IVL 88), “spiritual idealism” (IVL 87), “self-existent spiritual experience” (IVL 99), “prophetic indications” and “the real ground in man’s deepest being” (IVL 103), “spiritual apprehension” (IVL 103), “moments of vision” (IVL 94), “revelation” (IVL 210), “supreme light” (IVL 206), and even “faith” (IVL 199). But it is the creative potency of intuition, designated by Radhakrishnan’s reference to the “creative center” of the individual (IVL 113), “creative intuition” (IVL 205), “creative spirit” (IVL 206), and “creative energy” (IVL 205), that is the lynchpin for Radhakrishnan’s understanding of intuition. As Radhakrishnan understands it, all progress is the result of the creative potency of intuition.

For Radhakrishnan, intuition is a distinct form of experience. Intuition is of a self-certifying character (svatassiddha). It is sufficient and complete. It is self-established (svatasiddha), self-evidencing (svāsaṃvedya), and self-luminous (svayam-prakāsa) (IVL 92). Intuition entails pure comprehension, entire significance, complete validity (IVL 93). It is both truth-filled and truth-bearing (IVL 93). Intuition is its own cause and its own explanation (IVL 92). It is sovereign (IVL 92). Intuition is a positive feeling of calm and confidence, joy and strength (IVL 93). Intuition is profoundly satisfying (IVL 93). It is peace, power and joy (IVL 93).

Intuition is the ultimate form of experience for Radhakrishnan. It is ultimate in the sense that intuition constitutes the fullest and therefore the most authentic realization of the Real (Brahman). The ultimacy of intuition is also accounted for by Radhakrishnan in that it is the ground of all other forms of experience.

Intuition is a self-revelation of the divine. Intuitive experience is immediate. Immediacy does not imply in Radhakrishnan’s mind an “absence of psychological mediation, but only non-mediation by conscious thought” (IVL 98). Intuition operates on a supra-conscious level, unmediated as it is by conscious thought. Even so, Radhakrishnan holds that there is “no such thing as pure experience, raw and undigested. It is always mixed up with layers of interpretation” (IVL 99). One might object here that Radhakrishnan has conflated the experience itself with its subsequent interpretation and expression. However, Radhakrishnan’s comment is an attempt to deny the Hegelian interpretation of Hinduism’s “contentless” experience, affirming instead that intuition is the plenitude of experience.

Finally, intuition, according to Radhakrishnan, is ineffable. It escapes the limits of language and logic, and there is “no conception by which we can define it” (IVL 96). In such experiences “[t]hought and reality coalesce and a creative merging of subject and object results” (IVL 92). While the experience itself transcends expression, it also provokes it (IVL 95). The provocation of expression is, for Radhakrishnan, testimony to the creative impulse of intuition. All creativity and indeed all progress in the various spheres of life is the inevitable result of intuition.

ii. Varieties of Experience

1) Cognitive Experience

Radhakrishnan recognizes three categories of cognitive experience: sense experience, discursive reasoning, and intuitive apprehension. For Radhakrishnan all of these forms of experience contribute, in varying degrees, to a knowledge of the real (Brahman), and as such have their basis in intuition.

Sense Experience

Of the cognitive forms of knowledge, Radhakrishnan suggests that sensory knowledge is in one respect closest to intuition, for it is in the act of sensing that one is in “direct contact” with the object. Sense experience “helps us to know the outer characters of the external world. By means of it we acquire an acquaintance with the sensible qualities of the objects” (IVL 134). “Intuitions,” Radhakrishnan believes, “are convictions arising out of a fullness of life in a spontaneous way, more akin to sense than to imagination or intellect and more inevitable than either” (IVL 180). In this sense, sense perception may be considered intuitive, though Radhakrishnan does not explicitly describe it as such.

Discursive Reasoning

Discursive reasoning, and the logical knowledge it produces, is subsequent to sensory experience (perception). “Logical knowledge is obtained by the processes of analysis and synthesis. Unlike sense perception which Radhakrishnan claims to be closer to direct knowledge, logical knowledge “is indirect and symbolic in its character. It helps us to handle and control the object and its workings” (IVL 134). There is a paradoxical element here. Radhakrishnan seems to be suggesting that the direct proximity to an external object one encounters in sense perception is compromised when the perception is interpreted and subsequently incorporated into a more systematic, though presumably higher, form of knowledge through discursive reasoning.

For Radhakrishnan, discursive reasoning and the logical systems they construct possess an element of intuition. The methodical, mechanical working through of logical problems and the reworking of rational systems cannot be divorced from what Radhakrishnan might call an “intuitive hunch” that such a course of action will bear positive results; “In any concrete act of thinking the mind’s active experience is both intuitive and intellectual” (IVL 181-182).

Intuitive Apprehension

Radhakrishnan argues against what he sees as the prevalent (Western) temptation to reduce the intuitive to the logical. While logic deals with facts already known, intuition goes beyond logic to reveal previously unseen connections between facts. “The art of discovery is confused with the logic of proof and an artificial simplification of the deeper movements of thought results. We forget that we invent by intuition though we prove by logic” (IVL 177). Intuition not only clarifies the relations between facts and seemingly discordant systems, but lends itself to the discovery of new knowledge which then becomes an appropriate subject of philosophical inquiry and logical analysis.

Claiming to take his cue from his former adversary Henri Bergson, Radhakrishnan offers three explanations to account for the tendency to overlook the presence of intuition in discursive reasoning. First, Radhakrishnan claims, intuition presupposes a rational knowledge of facts. “The insight does not arise if we are not familiar with the facts of the case…. The successful practice of intuition requires previous study and assimilation of a multitude of facts and laws. We may take it that great intuitions arise out of a matrix of rationality” (IVL 177). Second, the intuitive element is often obscured in discursive reasoning because facts known prior to the intuition are retained, though they are synthesized, and perhaps reinterpreted, in light of the intuitive insight. “The readjustment [of previously known facts] is so easy that when the insight is attained it escapes notice and we imagine that the process of discovery is only rational synthesis” (IVL 177). Finally, intuition in discursive reasoning is often overlooked, disguised as it is in the language of logic. In short, the intuitive is mistaken for the logical. “Knowledge when acquired must be thrown into logical form and we are obliged to adopt the language of logic since only logic has a communicable language.” This last is a perplexing claim since elsewhere Radhakrishnan clearly recognizes that meaning is conveyed in symbols, poetry, and metaphors. Perhaps what Radhakrishnan means is that logic is the only valid means by which we are able to organize and systematize empirical facts. Regardless, according to Radhakrishnan, the presentation of facts in logical form contributes to “a confusion between discovery and proof” (IVL 177).

Conversely, Radhakrishnan offers a positive argument for the place of intuition in discursive reasoning. “If the process of discovery were mere synthesis, any mechanical manipulator of prior partial concepts would have reached the insight and it would not have taken a genius to arrive at it” (IVL 178). A purely mechanical account of discursive reasoning ignores the inherently creative and dynamic dimension of intuitive insight. In Radhakrishnan’s view the mechanical application of logic alone is creatively empty (IVL 181).

However, Radhakrishnan holds that the “creative insight is not the final link in a chain of reasoning. If it were that, it would not strike us as “inspired in its origin” (IVL 178). Intuition is not the end, but part of an ever-developing and ever-dynamic process of realization. There is, for Radhakrishnan, a continual system of “checks and balances” between intuition and the logical method of discursive reasoning. Cognitive intuitions “are not substitutes for thought, they are challenges to intelligence. Mere intuitions are blind while intellectual work is empty. All processes are partly intuitive and partly intellectual. There is no gulf between the two” (IVL 181).

2) Psychic Experience

Perhaps the most understudied dimension of Radhakrishnan’s interpretations of experience is his recognition of “supernormal” experiences. As early as his first volume of Indian Philosophy (1923), Radhakrishnan affirms the validity of what he identifies as “psychic phenomena”. Radhakrishnan accounts for such experiences in terms of a highly developed sensitivity to intuition. “The mind of man,” Radhakrishnan explains, “has the three aspects of subconscious, the conscious, and the superconscious, and the ‘abnormal’ psychic phenomena, called by the different names of ecstasy, genius, inspiration, madness, are the workings of the superconscious mind” (IP1 28). Such experiences are not “abnormal” according to Radhakrishnan, nor are they unscientific. Rather, they are the products of carefully controlled mental experiments. In the Indian past, “The psychic experiences, such as telepathy and clairvoyance, were considered to be neither abnormal nor miraculous. They are not the products of diseased minds or inspiration from the gods, but powers which the human mind can exhibit under carefully ascertained conditions” (IP1 28). Psychic intuitions are not askew with Radhakrishnan’s understanding of the intellect. In fact, they are evidence of the remarkable heights to which the undeveloped, limited intellect is capable. They are, for Radhakrishnan, accomplishments rather than failures of human consciousness.

As highly developed powers of apprehension, psychic experiences are a state of consciousness “beyond the understanding of the normal, and the supernormal is traced to the supernatural” (IVL 94). Moreover, in what Radhakrishnan might recognize as an “intuitive hunch” in the articulation of a new scientific hypothesis, psychic premonitions, as partial or momentary as they may be, lend themselves to the “psychic hypothesis” that the universal spirit is inherent in the nature of all things (IVL 110). For Radhakrishnan, psychic intuitions are suprasensory: “We can see objects without the medium of the senses and discern relations spontaneously without building them up laboriously. In other words, we can discern every kind of reality directly” (IVL 143). In a bold, albeit highly problematic, declaration, Radhakrishnan believes that the “facts of telepathy prove that one mind can communicate with another directly”(IVL 143).

3) Aesthetic Experience

“All art,” Radhakrishnan declares, “is the expression of experience in some medium” (IVL 182). However, the artistic experience should not be confused with its expression. While the experience itself is ineffable, the challenge for the artist is to give the experience concrete expression. “The success of art is measured by the extent to which it is able to render experiences of one dimension into terms of another. (IVL 187) For Radhakrishnan, art born out of a “creative contemplation which is a process of travail of the spirit is an authentic “crystallization of a life process” (IVL 185). At its ultimate and in its essence, the “poetical character is derived from the creative intuition (that is, integral intuition) which holds sound, suggestion and sense in organic solution” (IVL 191).

In Radhakrishnan’s view, without the intuitive experience, art becomes mechanical and a rehearsal of old themes. Such “art” is an exercise in (re)production rather than a communication of the artist’s intuitive encounter with reality. “Technique without inspiration,” Radhakrishnan declares, “is barren. Intellectual powers, sense facts and imaginative fancies may result in clever verses, repetition of old themes, but they are only manufactured poetry” (IVL 188). It is not simply a difference of quality but a “difference of kind in the source itself” (IVL 189). For Radhakrishnan, true art is an expression of the whole personality, seized as it was with the creative impulse of the universe.

Artistic intuition mitigates and subdues rational reflection. But “[e]ven in the act of composition,” Radhakrishnan believes, “the poet is in a state in which the reflective elements are subordinated to the intuitive. The vision, however, is not operative for so long as it continues, its very stress acts as a check on expression” (IVL 187).

For Radhakrishnan, artistic expression is dynamic. Having had the experience, the artist attempts to recall it. The recollection of the intuition, Radhakrishnan believes, is not a plodding reconstruction, nor one of dispassionate analysis. Rather, there is an emotional vibrancy: “The experience is recollected not in tranquility… but in excitement” (IVL 187). To put the matter somewhat differently, the emotional vibrancy of the aesthetic experience gives one knowledge by being rather than knowledge by knowing (IVL 184).

Art and Science

There is in Radhakrishnan’s mind a “scientific” temperament to genuine artistic expression. In what might be called the science of art, Radhakrishnan believes that the “experience or the vision is the artist’s counterpart to the scientific discovery of a principle or law” (IVL 184). There is a concordance of agendas in art and science. “What the scientist does when he discovers a new law is to give a new ordering to observed facts. The artist is engaged in a similar task. He gives new meaning to our experience and organizes it in a different way due to his perception of subtler qualities in reality” (IVL 194).

Despite this synthetic impulse, Radhakrishnan is careful to explain that the two disciplines are not wholly the same. The difference turns on what he sees as the predominantly aesthetic and qualitative nature of artistic expression. “Poetic truth is different from scientific truth since it reveals the real in its qualitative uniqueness and not in its quantitative universality” (IVL 193). Presumably, Radhakrishnan means that, unlike the universal laws with which science attempts to grapple, art is much more subjective, not in its creative origin, but in its expression. A further distinction between the two may lend further insight into Radhakrishnan’s open appreciation for the poetic medium. “Poetry,” he believes, “is the language of the soul, while prose is the language of science. The former is the language of mystery, of devotion, of religion. Prose lays bare its whole meaning to the intelligence, while poetry plunges us in the mysterium tremendum of life and suggests the truths that cannot be stated” (IVL 191).

4) Ethical Experience

Not surprisingly, intuition finds a place in Radhakrishnan’s ethics. For Radhakrishnan, ethical experiences are profoundly transformative. The experience resolves dilemmas and harmonizes seemingly discordant paths of possible action. “If the new harmony glimpsed in the moments of insight is to be achieved, the old order of habits must be renounced” (IVL 114). Moral intuitions result in “a redemption of our loyalties and a remaking of our personalities” (IVL 115).

That Radhakrishnan conceives of the ethical development of the individual as a form of conversion is noteworthy as it underscores Radhakrishnan’s identification of ethics and religion. For Radhakrishnan, an ethical transformation of the kind brought about by intuition is akin to religious growth and heightened realization. The force of this view is underscored by Radhakrishnan’s willing acceptance of the interchangeability of the terms “intuition” and “religious experience”.

Of course, not all ethical decisions or actions possess the quality of being guided by an intuitive impulse. Radhakrishnan willingly concedes that the vast majority of moral decisions are the result of conformity to well-established moral codes. However, it is in times of moral crisis that the creative force of ethical intuitions come to the fore. In a less famous, though thematically reminiscent analogy, Radhakrishnan accounts for growth of moral consciousness in terms of the creative intuitive impulse: “In the chessboard of life, the different pieces have powers which vary with the context and the possibilities of their combination are numerous and unpredictable. The sound player has a sense of right and feels that, if he does not follow it, he will be false to himself. In any critical situation the forward move is a creative act” (IVL 196-197).

By definition, moral actions are socially rooted. As such the effects of ethical intuitions are played out on the social stage. While the intuition itself is an individual achievement, Radhakrishnan’s view is that the intuition must be not only translated into positive and creative action but shared with others. There is a sense of urgency, if not inevitability, about this. Radhakrishnan tells us one “cannot afford to be absolutely silent” (IVL 97) and the saints “love because they cannot help it” (IVL 116).

The impulse to share the moral insight provides an opportunity to test the validity of the intuition against reason. The moral hero, as Radhakrishnan puts it, does not live by intuition alone. The intuitive experience, while it is the creative guiding impulse behind all moral progress, must be checked and tested against reason. There is a “scientific” and “experimental” dimension to Radhakrishnan’s understanding of ethical behavior. Those whose lives are profoundly transformed and who are guided by the ethical experience are, for Radhakrishnan, moral heroes. To Radhakrishnan’s mind, the moral hero, guided as he or she is by the ethical experience, who carves out an adventurous path is akin to the discoverer who brings order into the scattered elements of a science or the artist who composes a piece of music or designs buildings” (IVL 196). In a sense, there is very much an art and science to ethical living.

Radhakrishnan’s moral heroes, having developed a “large impersonality” (IVL 116) in which the joy, freedom and bliss of a life uninhibited by the constraints of ego and individuality are realized, become “self-sacrificing” exemplars for others. “Feeling the unity of himself and the universe, the man who lives in spirit is no more a separate and self-centered individual but a vehicle of the universal spirit” (IVL 115). Like the artist, the moral hero does not turn his back on the world. Instead, “[h]e throws himself on the world and lives for its redemption, possessed as he is with an unshakable sense of optimism and an unlimited faith in the powers of the soul” (IVL 116). In short, Radhakrishnan’s moral hero is a conduit whose “world-consciousness” delights “in furthering the plan of the cosmos” (IVL 116).

Radhakrishnan believes that ethical intuitions at their deepest transcend conventional and mechanically constructed ethical systems. Moral heroes exemplify Radhakrishnan’s ethical ideal while at the same time provoking in those who accept the ethical status quo to evaluate and to reconsider less than perfect moral codes. As the moral hero is “fighting for the reshaping of his own society on sounder lines [his] behavior might offend the sense of decorum of the cautious conventionalist” (IVL 197). The contribution of ethically realized individuals is their promotion of moral progress in the world. “Though morality commands conformity, all moral progress is due to nonconformists” (IVL 197). The moral hero is no longer guided by external moral codes, but by an “inner rhythm” of harmony between self and the universe revealed to him in the intuitive experience. “By following his deeper nature, he may seem to be either unwise or unmoral to those of us who adopt conventional standards. But for him the spiritual obligation is more of a consequence than social tradition” (IVL 197).

5) Religious Experience

For the sake of clarity, we must at the outset make a tentative distinction between religious experience on the one hand and integral experience on the other. Radhakrishnan’s distinction between “religion” and “religions” will be helpful here. At its most basic, religions, for Radhakrishnan, represent the various interpretations of experience, while integral experience is the essence of all religions. “If experience is the soul of religion, expression is the body through which it fulfills its destiny. We have the spiritual facts and their interpretations by which they are communicated to others” (IVL 90). “It is the distinction between immediacy and thought. Intuitions abide, while interpretations change” (IVL 90). But the interpretations should not be confused with the experiences themselves. For Radhakrishnan, “[c]onceptual expressions are tentative and provisional… [because] the intellectual accounts… are constructed theories of experience” (IVL 119). And he cautions us to “distinguish between the immediate experience or intuition which might conceivably be infallible and the interpretation which is mixed up with it” (IVL 99).

For Radhakrishnan, the creeds and theological formulations of religion are but intellectual representations and symbols of experience. “The idea of God,” Radhakrishnan affirms, “is an interpretation of experience” (IVL 186). It follows here that religious experiences are, for Radhakrishnan, context relative and therefore imperfect. They are informed by and experienced through specific cultural, historical, linguistic and religious lenses. Because of their contextuality and subsequent intellectualization, experiences in the religious sphere are limited. It is in this sense that we may refer to experiences which occur under the auspices of one or other of the religions as “religious experiences”. Radhakrishnan spends little time dealing with “religious experiences” as they occur in specific religious traditions. And what little he does say is used to demonstrate the theological preconditioning and “religious” relativity of such experiences. However, “religious experiences” have value for Radhakrishnan insofar as they offer the possibility of heightening one’s religious consciousness and bringing one into ever closer proximity to “religious intuition”.

Much to the confusion and chagrin of readers of Radhakrishnan, Radhakrishnan uses “religious experience” to refer to such “sectarian” religious experiences (as discussed immediately above) as well as to refer to “religious intuitions” which transcend narrow sectarian and religious boundaries and are identical to intuition itself (taken up in the section on “Intuition” above (B.I.) and revisited immediately below).

Radhakrishnan is explicit and emphatic in his view that religious intuition is a unique form of experience. Religious intuition is more than simply the confluence of the cognitive, aesthetic, and ethical sides of life. However vital and significant these sides of life may be, they are but partial and fragmented constituents of a greater whole, a whole which is experienced in its fullness and immediacy in religious intuition.

To Radhakrishnan’s mind, religious intuition is not only an autonomous form of experience, but a form of experience which informs and validates all spheres of life and experience. Philosophical, artistic, and ethical values of truth, beauty, and goodness are not known through the senses or by reason. Rather, “they are apprehended by intuition or faith…” (IVL 199-200). For Radhakrishnan, religious intuition informs, conjoins, and transcends an otherwise fragmentary consciousness.

Informing Radhakrishnan’s interpretation of religious intuition is his affirmation of the identity of the self and ultimate reality. Throughout his life, Radhakrishnan interpreted the Upaniṣadic mahavakya, tat tvam asi, as a declaration of the non-duality (advaita) of Atman and Brahman. His advaitic interpretation allows him to affirm the ineffability of the truth behind the formula. Radhakrishnan readily appropriates his acceptance of the non-dual experience to his interpretation of religious intuition. Radhakrishnan not only claimed to find support for his views in the Upaniṣads, but believed that, correctly understood, the ancient sages expounded his interpretation of religious intuition. Any attempt at interpretation of the intuition could only approximate the truth of the experience itself. As the ultimate realization, religious intuition must not only account for and bring together all other forms of experience, but must overcome the distinctions between them. Radhakrishnan goes so far as to claim that intuition of this sort is the essence of religion. All religions are informed by it, though all fail to varying degrees to interpret it. “Here we find the essence of religion, which is a synthetic realization of life. The religious man has the knowledge that everything is significant, the feeling that there is harmony underneath the conflicts and the power to realize the significance and the harmony” (IVL 201).

With this, the present discussion of intuition and the varieties of experience has come full circle. Radhakrishnan identifies intuition — in all its contextual varieties — with integral experience. The two expressions are, for Radhakrishnan, synonymous. Integral experience coordinates and synthesizes the range of life’s experiences. It furnishes the individual with an ever-deepening awareness of and appreciation for the unity of Reality. As an intuition, integral experience is not only the basis of all experience but the source of all creative ingenuity, whether such innovation be philosophical, scientific, moral, artistic, or religious. Moreover, not only does integral experience find expression in these various spheres of life, but such expression, Radhakrishnan believes, quickens the intuitive and creative impulse among those it touches.

c. Religious Pluralism

Radhakrishnan’s hierarchy of religions is well-known. “Hinduism,” Radhakrishnan affirms, “accepts all religious notions as facts and arranges them in the order of their more or less intrinsic significance”: “The worshippers of the Absolute are the highest in rank; second to them are the worshippers of the personal God; then come the worshippers of the incarnations like Rama, Kṛṣṇa, Buddha; below them are those who worship ancestors, deities and sages, and the lowest of all are the worshippers of the petty forces and spirits” (HVL 32).

Radhakrishnan uses his distinctions between experience and interpretation, between religion and religions, to correlate his brand of Hinduism (that is, Advaita Vedanta ) with religion itself. “Religion,” Radhakrishnan holds, is “a kind of life or experience.” It is an insight into the nature of reality (darsana), or experience of reality (anubhava). It is “a specific attitude of the self, itself and not other” (HVL 15). In a short, but revealing passage, Radhakrishnan characterizes religion in terms of “personal experience.” It is “an independent functioning of the human mind, something unique, possessing and autonomous character. It is something inward and personal which unifies all values and organizes all experiences. It is the reaction to the whole of man to the whole of reality. [It] may be called spiritual life, as distinct from a merely intellectual or moral or aesthetic activity or a combination of them” (IVL 88-89).

For Radhakrishnan, integral intuitions are the authority for, and the soul of, religion (IVL 89-90). It is here that we find a critical coalescence of ideas in Radhakrishnan’s thinking. If, as Radhakrishnan claims, personal intuitive experience and inner realization are the defining features of Advaita Vedanta , and those same features are the “authority” and “soul” of religion as he understands it, Radhakrishnan is able to affirm with the confidence he does: “The Vedanta is not a religion, but religion itself in its most universal and deepest significance” (HVL 23).

For Radhakrishnan, Hinduism at its Vedantic best is religion. Other religions, including what Radhakrishnan understands as lower forms of Hinduism, are interpretations of Advaita Vedanta . Religion and religions are related in Radhakrishnan’s mind as are experience and interpretation. The various religions are merely interpretations of his Vedanta. In a sense, Radhakrishnan “Hinduizes” all religions. Radhakrishnan appropriates traditional exegetical categories to clarify further the relationship: “We have spiritual facts and their interpretations by which they are communicated to others, śruti or what is heard, and smṛti or what is remembered. Śaṅkara equates them with pratyakṣa or intuition and anumana or inference. It is the distinction between immediacy and thought. Intuitions abide, while interpretations change” (IVL 90).

The apologetic force of this brief statement is clear. For Radhakrishnan, the intuitive, experiential immediacy of Advaita Vedanta is the genuine authority for all religions, and all religions as intellectually mediated interpretations derive from and must ultimately defer to Advaita Vedanta . Put succinctly: “While the experiential character of religion is emphasized in the Hindu faith, every religion at its best falls back on it” (IVL 90).

For Radhakrishnan, the religions are not on an even footing in their approximations and interpretations of a common experience. To the extent that all traditions are informed by what Radhakrishnan claims to be a common ground of experience (that is, Advaita Vedanta ), each religion has value. At the same time, all religions as interpretations leave room for development and spiritual progress. “While no tradition coincides with experience, every tradition is essentially unique and valuable. While all traditions are of value, none is finally binding” (IVL 120). Moreover, according to Radhakrishnan, the value of each religion is determined by its proximity to Radhakrishnan’s understanding of Vedanta.

d. Authority of Scripture and the Scientific Basis of Hinduism

Radhakrishnan argues that Hinduism, as he understands it, is a scientific religion. According to Radhakrishnan, “[i]f philosophy of religion is to become scientific, it must become empirical and found itself on religious experience” (IVL 184). True religion, argues Radhakrishnan, remains open to experience and encourages an experimental attitude with regard to its experiential data. Hinduism more than any other religion exemplifies this scientific attitude. “The Hindu philosophy of religion starts from and returns to an experimental basis” (HVL 19). Unlike other religions, which set limits on the types of spiritual experience, the “Hindu thinker readily admits of other points of view than his own and considers them to be just as worthy of attention” (HVL 19). What sets Hinduism apart from other religions is its unlimited appeal to and appreciation for all forms of experience. Experience and experimentation are the origin and end of Hinduism, as Radhakrishnan understand it.

Radhakrishnan argues that a scientific attitude has been the hallmark of Hinduism throughout its history. In a revealing passage, Radhakrishnan explains: “The truths of the ṛṣis are not evolved as the result of logical reasoning or systematic philosophy but are the products of spiritual intuition, dṛṣti or vision. The ṛṣis are not so much the authors of the truths recorded in the Vedas as the seers who were able to discern the eternal truths by raising their life-spirit to the plane of universal spirit. They are the pioneer researchers in the realm of the spirit who saw more in the world than their followers. Their utterances are not based on transitory vision but on a continuous experience of resident life and power. When the Vedas are regarded as the highest authority, all that is meant is that the most exacting of all authorities is the authority of facts” (IVL 89-90).

If the ancient seers are, as Radhakrishnan suggests, “pioneer researchers,” the Upaniṣads are the records of their experiments. “The chief sacred scriptures of the Hindus, the Vedas register the intuitions of the perfected souls. They are not so much dogmatic dicta as transcripts from life. They record the spiritual experiences of souls strongly endowed with the sense of reality. They are held to be authoritative on the ground that they express the experiences of the experts in the field of religion” (HVL 17).

Radhakrishnan’s understanding of scripture as the scientific records of spiritual insights holds not only for Hinduism, but for all religious creeds. Correctly understood, the various scriptures found in the religions of the world are not an infallible revelation, but scientific hypotheses: “The creeds of religion correspond to theories of science” (IVL 86). Radhakrishnan thus recommends that “intuitions of the human soul… should be studied by the methods which are adopted with such great success in the region of positive science” (IVL 85). The records of religious experience, of integral intuitions, that are the world’s scriptures constitute the “facts” of the religious endeavor. So, “just as there can be no geometry without the perception of space, even so there cannot be philosophy of religion without the facts of religion” (IVL 84).

Religious claims, in Radhakrishnan’s mind, are there for the testing. They ought not be taken as authoritative in and of themselves, for only integral intuitions validated by the light of reason are the final authority on religious matters. “It is for philosophy of religion to find out whether the convictions of the religious seers fit in with the tested laws and principles of the universe” (IVL 85). “When the prophets reveal in symbols the truths they have discovered, we try to rediscover them for ourselves slowly and patiently” (IVL 202).

The scientific temperament demanded by “Hinduism” lends itself to Radhakrishnan’s affirmation of the advaitic Absolute. The plurality of religious claims ought to be taken as “tentative and provisional, not because there is no absolute, but because there is one. The intellectual accounts become barriers to further insights if they get hardened into articles of faith and forget that they are constructed theories of experience” (IVL 199).

For Radhakrishnan, the marginalization of intuition and the abandonment of the experimental attitude in matters of religion has lead Christianity to dogmatic stasis. “It is an unfortunate legacy of the course which Christian theology has followed in Europe that faith has come to connote a mechanical adherence to authority. If we take faith in the proper sense of truth or spiritual conviction, religion is faith or intuition” (HVL 16). The religious cul de sac in which Europe and Christian theology find themselves testifies to their reluctance to embrace the Hindu maxim that “theory, speculations, [and] dogma change from time to time as the facts become better understood” (IVL 90). For the value of religious “facts” can only be assessed “from their adequacy to experience” (IVL 90). Just as the intellect has dominated Western philosophy to the detriment of intuition, so too has Christianity followed suit in its search for a theological touchstone in scripture.

e. Practical Mysticism and Applied Ethics

Radhakrishnan’s appeal to intuition underlies his vision for an ethical Hinduism, a Hinduism free from ascetic excesses. The ethical potency of intuition affirms the validity of the world. “Asceticism,” Radhakrishnan emphasizes, “is an excess indulged in by those who exaggerate the transcendent aspect of reality.” Instead, the rational mystic “does not recognize any antithesis between the secular and the sacred. Nothing is to be rejected; everything is to be raised” (IVL 115).

Radhakrishnan’s ethical mystic does not simply see the inherent value of the world and engage in its affairs. Rather, the ethical individual is guided by an intuitive initiative to move the world forward creatively, challenging convention and established patterns of social interaction. For Radhakrishnan, this ethically integrated mode of being presents a positive challenge to moral dogmatism. The positive challenge to moral convention, according to Radhakrishnan, is the creative promotion of social tolerance and accommodation. Just as Radhakrishnan’s Hinduism rejects absolute claims to truth and the validity of external authority, so too has Hinduism “developed an attitude of comprehensive charity instead of a fanatic faith in an inflexible creed” (HVL 37).

i. Ethics of Caste

Radhakrishnan affirms that the caste system, correctly understood, is an exemplary case of ethical tolerance and accommodation born out of an intuitive consciousness of reality. “The institution of caste illustrates the spirit of comprehensive synthesis characteristic of the Hindu mind with its faith in the collaboration of races and the co-operation of cultures. Paradoxical as it may seem, the system of caste is the outcome of tolerance and trust” (HVL 93) Based not on the mechanical fatalism of karma, as suggested by Hinduism’s critics, but on a recognition of Hinduism’s spiritual values and ethical ideals, caste affirms the value of each individual to work out his or her own spiritual realization, a spiritual consciousness Radhakrishnan understands in terms of integral experience. Just as Radhakrishnan sees his ranking of religions as affirming the relative value of each religion in terms of its proximity to Vedanta, the institution of caste is a social recognition that each member of society has the opportunity to experiment with his or her own spiritual consciousness free from dogmatic restraints. In Radhakrishnan’s eyes, herein lies the ethical potency and creative genius of integral experience. Caste is the creative innovation of those “whose lives are characterized by an unshakable faith in the supremacy of the spirit, invincible optimism, ethical universalism, and religious toleration” (IVL 126). [For a discussion of the democratic basis of caste in Radhakrishnan’s thinking, see Robert Minor, Radhakrishnan: A Religious Biography(1989).]

3. Criticism

There are numerous criticisms that may be raised against Radhakrishnan’s philosophy. What follows is not an exhaustive list, but three of the most common criticisms which may be levied against Radhakrishnan.

a. Epistemic Authority

The first is a criticism regarding the locus of epistemic authority. One might ask the question: Does the test for knowledge lie in scripture or in experience? Radhakrishnan’s view is that knowledge comes from intuitive experience (anubhava). Radhakrishnan makes this claim on the basis of scripture, namely the Upaniṣads. The Upaniṣads, according to Radhakrishnan, support a monistic ontology. Radhakrishnan makes this claim on the basis that the Upaniṣads are the records of the personal experiences of the ancient sages. Thus, the validity of one’s experience is determined by its proximity to that which is recorded in the Upaniṣads. Conversely, the Upaniṣads are authoritative because they are the records of monistic experiences. There is a circularity here. But this circularity is one with which Radhakrishnan himself would likely not only acknowledge, but embrace. After all, Radhakrishnan might argue, intuitive knowledge is non-rational. An intuitive experience of Reality is not contrary to reason but beyond the constraints of logical analysis.

b. Cultural and Religious Constructions

A second criticism of Radhakrishnan’s views surrounds his characterizations of the “East” and the “West.” Radhakrishnan characterizes the West, as well as Christianity, as inclined to dogmatism, the scientific method whose domain is limited to exploration of the outer natural world, and a reliance upon second-hand knowledge. The East, by contrast, is dominated by an openness to inner experience and spiritual experimentation. The West is rational and logical, while the East is predominantly religious and mystical. As pointed out by numerous scholars working in the areas of post-colonial studies and orientalism, Radhakrishnan’s constructions of “West” and “East” (these categories themselves being constructions) accept and perpetuate orientalist and colonialist forms of knowledge constructed during the 18th and 19th centuries. Arguably, these characterizations are “imagined” in the sense that they reflect the philosophical and religious realities of neither “East” nor “West.”

c. Selectivity of Evidence

A separate but related criticism that might be levied against Radhakrishnan’s views has to do with his theory of religious pluralism and his treatment of the religious traditions with which he deals.

First, Radhakrishnan minimizes the contributions of the monistic philosophers and religious mystics of the West. While Radhakrishnan acknowledges the work of such thinkers as Henri Bergon, Goethe, and a variety of Christian, Jewish, and Muslim mystics, he seems to imply that such approaches to religious and philosophical life in the West are exceptions rather than the rule. In fact, Radhakrishnan goes so far as to suggest that such figures are imbued with the spirit of the East, and specifically Hinduism as he understands it.

Second, while Radhakrishnan readily acknowledges the religious diversity within “Hinduism,” his treatment of Western traditions is much less nuanced. In a sense, Radhakrishnan homogenizes and generalizes Western traditions. In his hierarchy of religions (see Section 2c above), one or another form of Hinduism may be located within each of his religious categories (monistic, theistic, incarnational, ancestoral, and natural). By contrast, Radhakrishnan seems to imply that the theistic (second) and the incarnational (third) categories are the domains of Unitarian and Trinitarian Christianity respectively.

4. List of Abbreviations

HVL – The Hindu View of Life (1927)

IP1 – Indian Philosophy: Volume 1 (1923)

IVL – An Idealist View of Life (1929)

MST – My Search for Truth (1937)

5. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources by Radhakrishnan

  • The Ethics of the Vedanta and Its Metaphysical Presuppositions. Madras: The Guardian Press, 1908.
  • “Karma and Freewill” in Modern Review. (Calcutta) Vol. III (May 1908), pp. 424-428.
  • “Indian Philosophy: The Vedas and the Six Systems” in The Madras Christian College Magazine. III (New Series), pp. 22-35.
  • “‘Nature’ and ‘Convention’ in Greek Ethics” in The Calcutta Review, CXXX (January 1910), pp. 9-23.
  • “Egoism and Altruism: The Vedanta Solution” in East and West (Bombay) IX (July 1910), pp. 626-630.
  • “The Relation of Morality to Religion” in The Hindustan Review (September 1910), pp. 292-297.
  • “Morality and Religion in Education” in The Madras Christian College Magazine. X (1910-1911), pp. 233-239.
  • “The Ethics of the Bhagavadgita and Kant” in The International Journal of Ethics. XXI, Number 4 (July 1911), pp. 465-475.
  • Essentials of Psychology. London: Oxford University Press, 1912.
  • “The Ethics of the Vedanta” in The International Journal of Ethics. XXIV, Number 2 (January 1914), pp. 168-183.
  • “The Vedanta Philosophy and the Doctrine of Maya” in The International Journal of Ethics. XXIV, Number 4 (April 1914), pp. 431-451.
  • “A View of India on the War” in Asiatic Review. (London), VI (May 1915), pp. 369-374.
  • Religion and Life, Leaflet No. 15, The Theistic Endeavor Society of Madras. November 1915.
  • “The Vedantic Approach to Reality” in The Monist. XXVI, Number 2 (April 1916), pp. 200-231.
  • “Religion and Life” in The International Journal of Ethics. XXVII, Number 1 (October 1916), pp. 91-106.
  • “Bergson’s Idea of God” in The Quest. (London), VII (October 1916), pp. 1-8.
  • “The Philosophy of Rabindranath Tagore – I” in The Quest. (London) VIII, Number 3 (April 1917), pp. 457-477.
  • “The Philosophy of Rabindranath Tagore – II” in The Quest. (London) VIII, Number 4 (July 1917), pp. 592-612.
  • “Vedantamum Mayavadamum in Cittantam” in Siddhantam: Journal of the Saiva Siddhanta Association. V, pp. 159-163.
  • The Philosophy of Rabindranath Tagore. London: Macmillan & Co., 1918.
  • “James Ward’s Pluaralistic Theism: I” in The Indian Philosophical Review. II, Number 2 (October 1918), pp. 97-118.
  • “James Ward’s Pluaralistic Theism: II” in The Indian Philosophical Review. II, Number 3 (December 1918), pp. 210-232.
  • “Bergson and Absolute Idealism – I” in Mind. (New Series) XXVII (January 1919), pp. 41-53.
  • “Bergson and Absolute Idealism – II” in Mind. (New Series) XXVII (July 1919), pp. 275-296.
  • The Reign of Religion in Contemporary Philosophy. London: Macmillan & Co., 1920.
  • “The Future of Religion” in The Mysore University Magazine. IV, (1920), pp. 148-157.
  • “Review of Bernard Bosanquet’s ‘Implication and Linear Inference'” in The Indian Philosophical Review. III, Number 3 (July 1920), p. 301.
  • “The Metaphysics of the Upanisads – I” in The Indian Philosophical Review. III, Number 3, (July 1920), pp. 213-236.
  • The Metaphysics of the Upanisads – II in The Indian Philosophical Review. III, Number 4, (October 1920), pp. 346-362.
  • “Gandhi and Tagore” in The Calcutta Review. (Third Series), I (October 1921), pp. 14-29.
  • “Religion and Philosophy” in The Hibbert Journal. XX, Number 1 (October 1921), pp. 35-45.
  • “Tilak as Scholar” in The Indian Review. XXII (December 1921), pp. 737-739.
  • “Contemporary Philosophy” in The Indian Review. XXIII (July 1922), pp. 440-443.
  • “The Heart of Hinduism” in The Hibbert Journal. XXI, Number 1 (October 1922), pp. 5-19.
  • “The Hindu Dharma” in The International Journal of Ethics. XXXIII, Number 1 (October 1922), pp. 1-22.
  • Indian Philosophy: Volume 1. London: George Allen & Unwin, Ltd., 1923.
  • “Islam and Indian Thought” in The Indian Review. XXIV (Novermber 1923), pp. 53-72.
  • “Religious Unity” in The Mysore University Magazine. VII, pp. 187-198.
  • The Philosophy of the Upanisads. London: George Allen & Unwin, Ltd., 1924.
  • “Hindu Thought and Christian Doctrine” in The Madras Christian College Magazine. (Quarterly Series) (January 1924), pp. 18-34.
  • “The Hindu Idea of God” in The Quest. (London) XV, Number 3 (April 1924), pp. 289-310.
  • “Indian Philosophy: Some Problems” in Mind. (New Series) XXV (April 1926), pp. 154-180.
  • The Hindu View of Life. London: George Allen & Unwim, Ltd., 1927.
  • “The Role of Philosophy in the History of Civilization” in Edgar Shefield Brightman (ed.)Proceedings of the Sixth International Congress of Philosophy. New York: Longmans, Green and Co., 1927. pp. 543-550.
  • “The Doctrine of Maya: Some Problems” in Edgar Shefield Brightman (ed.) Proceedings of the Sixth International Congress of Philosophy. New York: Longmans, Green and Co., 1927. pp. 683-689.
  • Indian Philosophy: Volume 2. London: George Allen & Unwin, Ltd., 1927.
  • “Presidential Address” in Proceedings of the III Indian Philosophical Congress. Calcutta: Calcutta University, 1927. pp. 19-30.
  • “Educational Reform” in The Calcutta Review. (May 1927), pp. 143-154.
  • The Religion We Need. London: Ernest Benn, Ltd., 1928.
  • The Vedanta According to Śaṅkara and Ramanuja. London: George Allen & Unwin, Ltd., 1928.
  • “Indian Philosophy (To the Editor of Mind)” in Mind. (New Series) XXXVII (January 1928), pp. 130-131.
  • Buddhism in Prabuddha Bharata. XXXIII, Number 8 (August 1928), pp. 349-354.
  • “Evolution and Its Implications” in The New Era. I (November 1928), pp. 102-111.
  • Kalki or The Future of Civilization. London: Kegan, Paul, Trench & Co. Ltd., 1929.
  • An Idealist View of Life. London: George Allen & Unwin Ltd., 1929.
  • “Indian Philosophy” in Encyclopedia Britannica. (14th edition) Volume XII, New York, pp. 242-243.
  • Prof. Radhakrishnan’s Reply in The Modern Review. XLV, Number 2 (February 1929), pp. 208-213.
  • Prof. Radhakrishnan’s Reply in The Modern Review. XLV, Number 3 (March 1929), pp. 321-322.
  • “Review of John Baillie’s ‘The Interpretation of Religion'” in The Hibbert Journal. XXVIII, Number 4 (July 1930), 740-742.
  • “”Foreword”” in Abhay Kumer Majumdar, The Sāṃkhya Conception of Personality. Calcutta: Calcutta University Press, 1930. pp. ix-xii.
  • “The Hindu Idea of God” in The Spectator. May 30, 1931 (Number 51370), pp. 851-853.
  • “Intuition and Intellect” in Ramananda Chatterjee (ed.) The Golden Book of Tagore: A Hommage to Rabindranath Tagore from India and the World in Celebration of His Seventieth Birthday. Calcutta: Golden Book Committee, pp. 310-313.
  • “”Foreword”” in Nalini Kanta Brahma, The Philosophy of Hindu Sadhana. London: Kegan, Paul, Trench & Co., pp. ix-x.
  • “Presidential Address” in H.D. Bhattacharyya (ed.) Proceedings of the Eighth Indian Philosophical Congress: The University of Mysore. Calcutta: N.C. Ghosh, pp. v-xvi.
  • “Sarvamukti (Universal Salvation) – A Symposium” in H.D. Bhattacharyya (ed.)Proceedings of the Eighth Indian Philosophical Congress: The University of Mysore. Calcutta: N.C. Ghosh, pp. 314-318.
  • East and West in Religion. London: George Allen & Unwin, Ltd., 1933.
  • “Intellect and Intuition in Sankara’s Philosophy” in Triveni. VI, Number 1 (July-August 1933), pp. 8-16.
  • The Teaching of the Buddha: Being the Inaugural Lecture under the Alphina Ratnayaka Trust Delivered by Sir Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan at Columbo, 2nd October, 1933. Columbo: The Public Trust of Ceylon, 1933.
  • “The Teaching of the Buddha by Speech and by Silence” in The Hibbert Journal. XXXII, Number 3 (April 1934), pp. 342-356.
  • “”Foreword”” in Perviz N. Peerozshaw Dubash Hindu Art in its Social Setting. Madras: National Literature Publishing Co. Ltd., 1934. pp. iv-v.
  • Freedom and Culture. Madras: G.A. Natesan & Co., 1936.
  • The Heart of Hindusthan. Madras: G.A. Natesan & Co., 1936.
  • “The Spirit in Man” in Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan and J.H. Muirhead (eds.) Contemporary Indian Philosophy. London: George Allen and Unwin, Ltd., 1936. pp. 257-289.
  • “The Supreme Spiritual Ideal” in A. Douglas Millard (ed.) Faiths and Fellowship: Being the Proceddings of the World Congress of Faiths Held in London, July 3rd-17th, 1936. London: J.M. Watkins, 1936. pp. 422-430.
  • “Spiritual Freedom and the New Education in New Era” in Home and School. XVII (September-October 1936). pp. 233-235.
  • “”Foreword”” in B.L. Atreya The Philosophy of Yoga-Vasistha. Adyar: Theosophical Publishing House, 1936. p. vii.
  • “Progress and Spiritual Values” in Philosophy: The Journal of the British Institute of Philosophy. XII, Number 47 (July 1937), pp. 259-275.
  • “Education and Spiritual Freedom” in Triveni. (New Series) X, Number 3 (September 1937), pp. 9-22.
  • “Hinduism” in G.T Garratt (ed.) The Legacy of India. London: Oxford University Press, 1937. pp. 256-286.
  • “Introduction to the First Edition” in The Cultural Heritage of India. Calcutta: The Ramakrishna Mission Institute of Culture, I, 1937. pp. xxiii-xxxvi.
  • “My Search For Truth” in Vergilius Ferm (ed.) Religion in Transition. London: George Allen & Unwin, Ltd., 1937. pp. 11-59.
  • “The Individual and the Social Order” in Hinduism in E.R. Hughes (ed.) The Individual in East and West. London: Oxford University Press, 1937. pp. 109-152.
  • “The Failure of the Intellectuals” in The Indian Review. XXXVIII (December 1937), pp. 737-739.
  • “”Foreword”” in Saroj Kumar Das A Study of the Vedanta. Calcutta: Calcutta University, 1937. pp. ix-x.
  • Gautama the Buddha. London: Oxford University Press, 1938.
  • “Religion: A Plea for Sanity” in Triveni. (New Series) XI, Number 5 (November 1938), pp. 9-14.
  • “The Renascence of Religion: A Hindu View” in The Renascence of Religion: Being the Proceedings of the Third Meetings of the World Congress of Faiths. London: Arthur Probstain, 1938. pp. 8-18.
  • “Convocation Address” (December 17, 1938) reprinted in Benaras Hindu University News Letter. (Teacher’s Day Special Number) 5th September 1993. pp. 9-19.
  • “Letter to Madan Mohan Malaviya” dated 3/12/39 reprinted in Benaras Hindu University News Letter. (Teacher’s Day Special Number) 5th September 1994. p. 5.
  • “Letter to Madan Mohan Malaviya” dated 20/8/39 reprinted in Benaras Hindu University News Letter. (Teacher’s Day Special Number) 5th September 1993. p. 8.
  • “Letter to Madan Mohan Malaviya” dated 26/11 reprinted in Benaras Hindu University News Letter. (Teacher’s Day Special Number) 5th September 1993. pp. 20-21.
  • “”Foreword”” in T.M.P. Mahadevan The Philosophy of Advaita. Madras: Ganesh and Co., 1938.
  • Eastern Religions and Western Thought. London: Oxford University Press, 1939.
  • “Introduction: Gandhi’s Religion and Politics” in Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan (ed.) Mahatma Gandhi: Essays and Reflections on His Life and Work. London: George Allen & Unwin, 1939. pp. 13-40.
  • “Foreword” in S.K. George Gandhi’s Challenge to Christianity. London: George Allen & Unwin, 1939. pp. 9-10.
  • “Presidential Address” in Proceedings of the 15th Conference, All India Federation of Educational Associations, Lucknow, December 26-31, 1939. Allahabad: Ram Narain Lal, 1939. pp. 100-105.
  • “Hinduism and the West ‘in L.S.S. O’Malley (ed.) Modern India and the West. London: Oxford University Press, 1941. pp. 338-353.
  • “Supreme Values of the Spirit” (Speech on the laying of the foundation-stone to Holdar House, Banaras Hindu University) reprinted in Benaras Hindu University News Letter. (Teacher’s Day Special Number) 5th September 1994. pp. 10-14.
  • “Coming Out of Darkness” (Speech delivered on the Silver Jubilee of Benaras Hindu University, January 21, 1942) excerpts reprinted in Benaras Hindu University News Letter. (Teacher’s Day Special Number) 5th September 1993. pp. 6-7.
  • “General Preface” in Ganganatha Jha Pūrva-Mīmāṃsā in its Sources. Benaras: Benaras Hindu University, 1942. pp. v-vi.
  • “The Cultural Problem” in A.I.J. Appasamy (ed.) The Cultural Problem (Oxford Pamphlets on Indian Affairs) Number 1. Madras: Oxford University Press, 1942. pp. 41-50.
  • “India’s Heritage” in The Proceedings and Transactions of the XII Session of the All India Oriental Conference. Benaras: Benaras University Press, 1943. pp. 1-5.
  • “Silver Jubilee Address” in Annals of the Bhandarkar Oriental Research Institute. XXIV, Parts 1-2 (Monday January 4, 1943), 1943. pp. 1-8.
  • Education, Politics and War. Poona: The International Book Service, 1944.
  • India and China: Lectures Delivered in China in May 1944. Bombay: Hind Kitabs, Ltd., 1944.
  • “Foreword” in Swami Nirvedananda Hinduism at a Glance. Calcutta: Vidyamandira, 1944.
  • “Foreword” in D.S. Sharma Studies in the Renaissance of Hinduism in the Nineteenth and Twentieth Century. Banaras: Banaras Hindu University, 1944. pp. v-vi.
  • Is this Peace? Bombay: Hind Kitabs, Ltd., 1945.
  • Moral Values in Literature in K.R. Srinivasa Iyengar (ed.) Indian Writers in Council: Proceedings of the First All-India Writers Conference (Jaipur 1945). Bombay: International Book House Ltd., 1945. pp. 86-105.
  • “Introduction” in Dilip Kumar Roy Among the Great. Bombay: Nalanda Publication, 1945. pp. 11-18.
  • “Foreword” in Swami Avinasananda Gita Letters. Bombay: Hind Kitabs Ltd., 1945.
  • “Foreword” in R.K. Prabhu and U.R. Rao (eds.) The Mind of Mahatma Gandhi. Bombay: Oxford University Press, 1945. pp. v-vi.
  • “Speech” in P.E.N. News. Number 142 (March 1946), pp. 8-10.
  • “The Voice of India in the Spiritual Crisis of Our Times” in The Hibbert Journal. XLV, Number 4 (July 1946), pp. 295-304.
  • “Bhagavan Sri Ramana: Sustainer of Spiritual Reality” in Golden Jubilee Souvenir. Tiruvannamalai: Sri Ramanasram, 1946. pp. 51-56.
  • “Speech” in General Discussion of the Work of the Prepatory Commission in UNESCO General Conference: First Session. Held at UNESCO House, Paris from 20 November to 10 December, 1946. Paris: UNESCO, 1947. pp. 27-28.
  • Religion and Society. London: George Allen & Unwin Ltd., 1947.
  • “Science and Religion” in K. Bharatha Iyer (ed.) Art and Thought: A Volume In Honour of the Late Dr. Ananda K. Coomaraswamy. London: Luzac & Co., 1947. pp. 180-185.
  • “Speech” in Discussion of the Director-General’s Report in Records of the General Conference of the UNESCO. Second Session, Mexico, 1947. Paris: UNESCO, 1948. pp. 58-61.
  • The Bhagavadgita with an Introductory Essay, Sanskrit Text, English Translation and Notes. London: George Allen & Unwin Ltd., 1948.
  • “Mahatma Gandhi” in The Hibbert Journal. XLVI, Number 3 (April 1948), pp. 193-197.
  • “General Statement” in Clara Urquhart (ed.) Last Chance: 11 Questions on Issues Determining Our Destiny Answered by 26 Leaders of Thought in 14 Nations. Boston: Beacon Press, 1948. pp. 46-54.
  • “Hinduism” in Hutchinson’s Twentieth Century Encyclopedia. London: Hutchinson, 1948. pp. 522.
  • Great Indians. Bombay: Hind Kitabs Ltd., 1949.
  • Report of the University Education Commission (December 1948-August 1949). New Delhi: Ministry of Education, 1949.
  • Indian Culture in Reflections on Our Age: Lectures Delivered at the Opening Session of UNESCO at Sorbonne University, Paris. New York: Columbia University Press, 1949. pp. 115-133.
  • “Speech” in Discussion of the Director-General’s Report in Records of the General Conference of the UNESCO. Third Session, Beruit, 1948. Paris: UNESCO, 1949. pp. 56-59.
  • “Speech” in Presentation by the Chairman of the Executive Board of the Director-General’s Report on the Activities of the Organization during 1949 in Records of the General Conference of the UNESCO. Fourth Session, Paris, 1949. Paris: UNESCO, 1949. pp. 44-45.
  • “Speech” in Discussion of the Director-General’s Report in Records of the General Conference of the UNESCO. Fourth Session, Paris, 1949. Paris: UNESCO, 1949. pp. 58-60.
  • “Speech” in Consideration of the Report of the Official and External Relations Commission on UNESCO’s Work in Germany in Records of the General Conference of the UNESCO. Fourth Session, Paris, 1949. Paris: UNESCO, 1949. pp. 194-195.
  • “Goethe” in Goethe: UNESCO’s Hommage on the Occassion of the Two Hundredth Anniversary of His Birth. Paris: UNESCO, 1949. pp. 101-108.
  • Clean Advocate of Great Ideals in Nehru Abhinandan Granth: A Birthday Book. New Delhi: Nehru Abhinandan Committee, 1949. pp. 93-96.
  • The Dhammapada. London: Oxford University Press, 1950.
  • “Speech” in Discussion of the Second Report of the Credentials Committee in Records of the General Conference of the UNESCO. Fifth Session, Florence, 1950. Paris: UNESCO, 1950. pp. 178-180.
  • UNESCO and World Revolution in New Republic. July 10, 1950. pp. 15-16.
  • “Foreword” in R.R. Diwarkar The Upaniṣads in Story and Dialogue. Bombay: Hind Kitabs Ltd., 1950. pp. v-vi.
  • “Religion and World Unity” in The Hibbert Journal. XLIX (April 1951), pp. 218-225.
  • The Nature of Man in Barbara Waylen (ed.) Creators of the Modern Spirit: Towards a Philosophy of Faith. New York: Macmillan Co., 1951. pp. 64-66.
  • “The Religion of the Spirit and the World’s Need: Fragments of a Confession” in Paul A. Schilpp (ed.) The Philosophy of Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan. New York: Tudor Publishing Co., 1952. pp. 5-82.
  • “Reply to Critics” in Paul A. Schilpp (ed.) The Philosophy of Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan. New York: Tudor Publishing Co., 1952. pp. 789-842.
  • “Vedanta – The Advaita School” in S. Radhakrishnan (ed.) History of Philosophy Eastern and Western: Volume 1. New York: Barnes and Noble, 1952. pp. 272-286.
  • “Inaugural Address in Report of the Proceedings, 1952.” International Congress on Planned Parenthood. London: Family Planning, 1952. pp. 10-13.
  • “Religion and the World Crisis” in Christopher Isherwood (ed.) Vedanta for Modern Man. London: George Allen & Unwin Ltd., 1952. pp. 338-341.
  • “Foreword” in D.F.A. Bode and P. Nanavutty Songs of Zarathustra: The Gathas. London: George Allen & Unwin Ltd., 1952. p. 9.
  • “Concluding Survey” in S. Radhakrishnan (ed.) History of Philosophy Eastern and Western: Volume 2. New York: Barnes and Noble, 1953. pp. 439-448.
  • The Principal Upaniṣads. London: George Allen & Unwin Ltd., 1953.
  • Convocation Address on the occasion on the Silver Jubilee of the Andhra University, Waltair, 1953. Copy available at Andhra University Library Special Collections Section.
  • Comment in Visitor’s Book: Voorhees College, Vellore. Dated: 17.1.53. Voohees College Archives, Vellore, Tamil Nadu.
  • “Preface” in Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan, A.C. Ewing, Paul Arthur Schilpp, et al. (eds.) A.R. Wadia: Essays in Philosophy Presented in His Honour. (nd/np), 1954.
  • Recovery of Faith. New York: Harper and Brothers, 1955.
  • Bhoodan – The Economic Agrarian Revolution (Speech delivered at the Sixth Sarvodaya Sammelan at Bodh-Gaya on 19/4/1954) reprinted in Bhoodan (nd/np), 1955. pp. 1-5. Available in the Tamil Nadu State Archives, Chennai, general reference.
  • Occasional Speeches and Writings: October 1952-January 1956. New Delhi: Ministry of Information and Broadcasting, Government of India, 1956, 1960.
  • East and West: Some Reflections. London: George Allen & Unwin Ltd., 1956.
  • Occasional Speeches and Writings (Second Series): February 1956-February 1957. New Delhi: Ministry of Information and Broadcasting, Government of India, 1957.
  • A Sourcebook in Indian Philosophy. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1957. (ed. with Charles A. Moore)
  • The Brahma Sutra: The Philosophy of Spiritual Life. London: George Allen & Unwin Ltd., 1959.
  • “Prefatory Remarks” in S. Radhakrishnan and P.T. Raju (eds.) The Concept of Man. London: George Allen & Unwin Ltd., 1960. pp. 9-13.
  • Note on Vice-Presidential Letterhead (No. 26/1303) to the Principal of Voorhees College located in Visitor’s Book: Voorhees College, Vellore. Dated: 23rd June, 1960. Voorhees College Archives, Vellore, Tamil Nadu.
  • “Foreword” in Ramakrishnan Bajaj The Young Russia. Bombay: Popular Book Depot, 1960.
  • Fellowship of the Spirit. Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1961.
  • Two Addresses Delivered in Germany: October 1961. New Delhi: Max Muller Bhavan, 1961.
  • “Most Dear to All the Muses” in A Centenary Volume: Rabindranath Tagore: 1861-1961. New Delhi: Sahitya Akademi, 1961. pp. xvii-xxv.
  • “Tagore the Philosopher” in Indo-Asian Culture. XI (January 1962), pp. 283-295.
  • “Tagore and the Realization of God” in Indo Asia. IVV (April 1962), pp. 150-157.
  • Occasional Speeches and Writings (Third Series): July 1959-May 1962. New Delhi: Ministry of Information and Broadcasting, Government of India, 1963.
  • “Swami Vivekananda – A Spokesman of the Divine Logos” in Vedanta Kesari. L, Number 4 (August 1963), pp. 158-163.
  • President Radhakrishnan’s Speeches and Writings: May 1962-May1964. New Delhi: Ministry of Information and Broadcasting, Government of India, 1965.
  • On Nehru. New Delhi: Ministry of Information and Broadcasting, Government of India, 1965.
  • President Radhakrishnan’s Speeches and Writings (Second Series): May 1964-May1967. New Delhi: Ministry of Information and Broadcasting, Government of India, 1967.
  • Religion in a Changing World. London: George Allen & Unwin Ltd., 1967.
  • “The Indian Approach to the Religious Problem” in Charles A. Moore (ed.) The Indian Mind. Honolulu: East-West Center Press, 1967. pp. 173-182.
  • Religion and Culture. Delhi: Hind Pocket Books, 1968.
  • “Introduction” in Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan (ed.) Mahatma Gandhi: 100 Years. New Delhi: Gandhi Peace Foundation, 1968. pp. 1-10.
  • Our Heritage. Delhi: Hind Pocket Books, 1973.
  • The Creative Life. New Delhi: Orient Paperbacks, 1975.
  • “Are We Planning for Life?” in Mira. XXXIII, Numbers 8-9 (July-August 1975), pp. 179-180 and 206.

b. Selected Secondary Sources

  • Arapura, J.G. Radhakrishnan and Integral Experience: The Philosophy and World Vision of Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan. Calcutta: Asia Publishing House, 1966.
  • Atreya, J.P. (ed.) Dr. S. Radhakrishnan: Sovenir Volume. Moradabad: Darshana International, 1964.
  • Baird, Robert D. (ed.) Religion in Modern India. New Delhi: Manohar, 1981.
  • Banerji, Anjan Kumar (ed.) Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan: A Centenary Tribute. Varanasi, 1991-1992.
  • Bishop, Donald H. (ed.) Thinkers of the Indian Renaissance. New Delhi: Wiley Eastern Limited, 1982.
  • Braue, Donald A. Maya in Radhakrishnan’s Thought: Six Meanings Other than Illusion. Columbia: South Asia Books, 1985.
  • Brookman, David M. Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan in the Commentarial Tradition of India. Bhubaneswara, 1990.
  • Gopal, Sarvepalli. Radhakrishnan: A Biography. Delhi: Oxford University Press, 1989.
  • Harris, Ishwar C. Radhakrishnan: The Profile of a Universalist. Columbia: South Asia Books, 1982.
  • Hawley, Michael. A Biography of Experience: Radhakrishnan, Apologetics and Orientalism. (Unpublished Ph.D. Dissertation) University of Calgary, 2002.
  • Hawley, Michael. “The Making of a Mahatma: Radhakrishnan’s Critique of Gandhi” inStudies in Religion. 32/1-2 (2003) 135-148.
  • Hawley, Michael. “Reorienting Tradition: Radhakrishnan’s Hinduism” in Steven Engler and Greg P. Grieve (eds.) Historicizing’ Tradition’ in the Study of Religion. Berlin and New York: Walter de Gruyter, 2005.
  • Kalapati, Joshua. Dr. S. Radhakrishnan and Christianity. (Unpublished Ph.D. dissertation) Madras Christian College, Tambaram, March 1994.
  • Kalidas, Vuppuluri (ed.) The Radhakrishnan Number: A Souvenir Volume of Appreciations. Madras: Vyasa Publications, 1962.
  • Kulangara, Thomas. Absolutism and Theism: A Philosophical Study of S. Radhakrishnan’s Attempt to Reconcile Sankara’s Absolutism and Ramanuja’s Theism. Trivandrum, 1989.
  • McDermott, Robert A. Radhakrishnan: Selected Writings on Philosophy, Religion and Culture. New York: E.P. Dutton & Co., 1970.
  • Minor, Robert N. Modern Indian Interpreters of the Bhagavadgita. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1986.
  • Minor, Robert N. Radhakrishnan: A Religious Biography. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1987.
  • Murthy, K. Satchidananda Radhakrishnan: His Life and Ideas. Delhi, 1989.
  • Nanadakumar, Prema S. Radhakrishnan: Makers of Indian Literature. New Delhi, 1992.
  • Naravane, V.S. Modern Indian Thought. Columbia: South Asia Books, 1978.
  • Pappu, S.S. Rama Rao (ed.) New Essays in The Philosophy of Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan. Delhi: Sri Satguru Publications, 1995.
  • Parthasarathi G. and D.P. Chattapadhyaya (eds.) Radhakrishnan: Centenary Volume. Delhi: Oxford University Press, 1989.
  • Schilpp, Paul Arthur (ed.) The Philosophy of Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan. New York: Tudor Publishing, 1952.

Author Informaiton

Michael Hawley
Mount Royal College

Bhedabheda Vedanta

Bhedābheda Vedānta is one of the several traditions of Vedānta philosophy in India. “Bhedābheda” is a Sanskrit word meaning “Difference and Non-Difference.” The characteristic position of all the different Bhedābheda Vedānta schools is that the individual self (jīvātman) is both different and not different from the ultimate reality known as Brahman. Bhedābheda reconciles the positions of two other major schools of Vedānta. The Advaita (Monist) Vedānta that claims the individual self is completely identical to Brahman, and the Dvaita (Dualist) Vedānta that teaches complete difference between the individual self and Brahman. However, each thinker within the Bhedābheda Vedānta tradition has his own particular understanding of the precise meanings of the philosophical terms “difference” and “non-difference.” Bhedābheda Vedāntic ideas can traced to some of the very oldest Vedāntic texts, including quite possibly Bādarāyaṇa’sBrahma Sūtra (app. 4th c. CE). Bhedābheda ideas also had an enormous influence on the devotional (bhakti) schools of India’s medieval period. Among medieval Bhedābheda thinkers are Vallabha (1479-1531 CE), founder of the Puṣṭimārga devotional sect now centered in Nathdwara, Rajasthan, and Caitanya (1485-1533 CE) the founder of the Gaudīya Vaiṣṇava sect based in the northeastern Indian state of West Bengal.

Table of Contents

  1. Historical Overview
    1. Bādarāyaṇa and Bhartṛprapañca
    2. Bhāskara
    3. Yādavaprakāśa and Nimbārka
    4. Vallabha
    5. Caitanya
    6. Vijñānabhikṣu
  2. Ontology
    1. Part and Whole
    2. Aupādhika and Svābhāvika Bhedābheda
  3. Causality
    1. Pariṇāmavāda (Theory of real transformation)
    2. Vivartavāda (Theory of unreal manifestation)
    3. Satkāryavāda (Theory of pre-existent effect)
  4. Theology and soteriology
    1. God in Bhedābhedavāda
    2. Knowledge combined with ritual acts leads to liberation
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Historical Overview

Bhedābheda is often presented as a school of Vedānta. Vedānta, in turn, is sometimes spoken about as a single philosophy, when in reality “Vedānta” has different uses. Its most inclusive use is as a label for a philosophy that purports to be expressed at length in the latter part of the Vedas, that is, the Upaniṣads. It is centrally concerned with the inquiry into the nature of an ultimate entity called “Brahman.” There are many different accounts of this synoptic philosophy, and the various accounts are often considered schools of philosophy themselves. Unlike the well-known schools of Advaita (Non-Dualist) Vedānta, Viśiṣṭādvaita (Non-Dualism of the Qualified) Vedānta, and Dvaita (Dualist) Vedānta, it makes more sense to refer to Bhedābheda Vedānta as a “tradition” or “family” of philosophies rather than as a single “school.” This is because, unlike the three aforementioned schools, Bhedābheda has no single founder who created an institutionalized network of monasteries dedicated to the study, development, and propagation of the founder’s teachings. The history of Bhedābheda in India stretches back at least until the 7th century CE and likely quite earlier, and continues into the present day. Although there are substantial philosophical disagreements among the many Bhedābheda thinkers, their philosophies also show certain characteristic similarities. After a short historical introduction to several major Bhedābhedavādins, I will discuss a few viewpoints that almost all Bhedābheda schools share. These include the understanding of the relation between individual self (jīvātman) and Brahman as one of part and whole; the doctrine that the phenomenal world is a real transformation of Brahman (Pariṇāmavāda); and the doctrine that liberation can only be attained by means of a combination of knowledge and ritual action (Jñānakarmasamuccayavāda), not by knowledge alone.

a. Bādarāyaṇa and Bhartṛprapañca

Numerous scholars have concluded that Bādarāyaṇa’s Brahma Sūtra (circa 4th c. CE), one of the foundational texts common to all Vedānta schools, was written from a Bhedābheda Vedāntic viewpoint (Dasgupta 1922: vol. 2, p. 42; Nakamura 1989: p. 500). While that claim is disputed by other schools, there is little doubt that Bhedābheda predates Śaṅkara’s Advaita Vedānta. In his commentary on the Bṛhadāraṇyaka Upaniṣad, Śaṅkara (8th c.) repeatedly criticizes interpretations by an earlier Vedāntin named Bhartṛprapañca, who characterized the relation between Brahman and individual souls as one of difference and non-difference. One of the central disagreements between the two is that Śaṅkara claims that Brahman’s entire creation is a mere appearance (vivarta), while Bhartṛprapañca maintains that it is real (Hiriyanna 1957: vol. 2, pp. 6-16).

b. Bhāskara

The first Bhedābhedavādin widely recognized as such by the later tradition is Bhāskara (8th-9th c.). He was either a younger contemporary of Śaṅkara or perhaps lived slightly after Śaṅkara. His only extant work is a commentary on the Brahma Sūtra. That work is expressly written in order to defend the earlier claims of Bhedābhedavādins against Śaṅkara’s interpretation of the Brahma Sūtra. Although he never mentions Śaṅkara by name, he makes it clear from the beginning that his primary intention in commenting on the Brahma Sūtra is to oppose some predecessor: “I am writing a commentary on thissūtra in order to obstruct those commentators who have concealed its ideas and replaced them with their own” (Bhāskara 1903: p. 1). Bhāskara is the earliest in a long line of Vedāntic authors concerned to refute Advaita (including Rāmānuja and Madhva, not to mention numerous Bhedābhedavādins). Many of the stock arguments used against the Advaita originated with Bhāskara, if indeed he did not borrow them from an even earlier source. He also seems to have been remembered by the collective Advaita tradition as a thorn in its side. So, for instance, in the 14th century hagiography of Śaṅkara, theŚaṅkaradigvijaya, Mādhava depicts one “Bhaṭṭa Bhāskara” as a haughty and famous Bhedābhedavādin whom Śaṅkara defeats in a lengthy debate.

c. Yādavaprakāśa and Nimbārka

While the Viśiṣṭādvaita philosopher Rāmānuja (11th-12th c.) is widely acknowledged as the most influential Vedāntin after Śaṅkara, Rāmānuja’s complicated relationship with Bhedābhedavāda is rarely discussed. Rāmānuja’s teacher Yādavaprakāśa was a Bhedābhedavādin. Yādavaprakāśa’s works have been lost, and therefore almost all of what we know of his ideas comes from Rāmānuja and one of Rāmānuja’s commentators, Sudarśanasῡri. However, it is possible from these numerous hints to draw a sketch of Yādavaprakāśa’s basic views. Rāmānuja depicts Yādavaprakāśa as an exponent of Svābhāvika Bhedābhedavāda, the view that Brahman is both different and not different than the world in its very nature, and that difference is not simply due to difference of artificial limiting conditions (see Oberhammer 1997: p. 10). Yādavaprakāśa shares this basic viewpoint with Nimbārka (13th c.?), and disagrees with the Aupādhika Bhedābhedavāda of Bhāskara, who maintains that the difference of the world and Brahman is due to limiting conditions. Another characteristic of Yādavaprakāśa’s thought is his repeated insistence that Brahman has the substance of pure existence (sanmātradravya). The relationship between Brahman and the world is not merely one of class and individual, but rather both are existent entities, standing in the relationship of cause and effect (see Oberhammer 1997: p. 14).

d. Vallabha

In the late medieval period, the doctrine of Bhedābheda became increasingly associated with devotional (bhakti) movements in North India. It is largely on the basis of their reputations as the founders of religious sects, and not as philosophers per se, that thinkers such as Vallabha (1479-1531) and Caitanya (1485-1533) became widely known. Among the former’s most influential works are a commentary on the Brahma Sūtraentitled the Anubhāṣya, and his commentary on the Bhāgavata Purāṇa, entitled theSubodhinī. Vallabha founded the Vaiṣṇava sect of the Puṣṭimārga (“path of nourishment”) now based in Nathdwara, Rajasthan. His philosophical system, called Śuddhādvaita (Pure Non-Dualism), takes its name from his view that there is no dualism whatsoever between a real Brahman and an unreal world. Since both are completely real, he denies that there can be any sort of ontological dualism of real and unreal between the two—therefore it is a “pure” non-dualism. Obviously, this refers to the Advaita school’s view that the phenomenal world is not real in an ultimate sense, and is a clever attempt to re-appropriate the valued label “Advaita” for his own school. Yet in this regard all Bhedābhedavādins might claim the name Śuddhādvaita, since they all assert the reality of the phenomenal world.

e. Caitanya

Caitanya was another medieval Vaiṣṇava philosopher/theologian, famous for a school of thought known as Acintya Bhedābhedavāda (Inconceivable Difference and Non-difference). Although Caitanya never wrote down his teachings, numerous followers authored works based on his philosophy, such as Jīva Gosvāmin, author of a well-known commentary on the Bhāgavata Purāṇa. This system’s notion of “inconceivability” (acintyatva) is a central concept used to reconcile apparently contradictory notions, such as the simultaneous oneness and multiplicity of Brahman, or the difference and non-difference of God and his powers. The tradition of Acintya-Bhedābheda, also commonly known as Gaudīya Vaiṣṇavism, thrives to this day in the Indian state of West Bengal. Perhaps the most famous offshoot of this devotional tradition is the International Society for Krishna Consciousness (ISKON), more popularly known in the West by the name the “Hari Krishnas.”

f. Vijñānabhikṣu

The last major Bhedābheda thinker in pre-modern India, Vijñānabhikṣu (16th c.), did not follow the path of bhakti. Vijñānabhikṣu sought to show the ultimate unity of the schools of Vedānta, Sāṅkhya, Yoga, and Nyāya, and is most well known today for commentaries on Sāṅkhya and Yoga texts. In his innovative sub-commentary on Patanjali’s Yoga Sūtra, Vijñānabhikṣu argues that yoga is the most effective means to liberation, although he never repudiates the Bhedābheda metaphysical framework of his earliest writings (Nicholson 2005). Vijñānabhikṣu was a theist who considered Viṣṇu the supreme God. In his commentary on the Sāṅkhya Sūtra, he argues that the Sāṅkhya school requires an omnipotent God in order to cause the union of its two fundamental principles, primordial nature (prakṛti) and pure consciousness (puruṣa). Vijñānabhikṣu grounds his reinterpretations of fundamental concepts in Sāṅkhya-Yoga in Bhedābheda metaphysics. In his earliest works, such as his Bhedābheda Vedāntic commentary on the Brahma Sūtras, he understands the concepts of difference and non-difference in terms of separation and non-separation (Ram 1995). Although for him the fundamental relation of the individual self and Brahman is one of non-separation, the Sāṅkhya-Yoga analysis of the individual selves as multiple and separate from one another is correct, as long as it is understood that this state of separation is temporary and adventitious. While Vijñānabhikṣu’s acceptance of Sāṅkhya-Yoga philosophical truths puts him at odds with some earlier Bhedābhedavādins, he continues in the tradition of Bhāskara in his trenchant criticism of the Advaita Vedāntins, whom he decries as “crypto-Buddhists” (pracchannabauddha) and “Vedāntins in name alone” (vedāntibruva).

2. Ontology

One of the most notable differences between Bhedābheda Vedānta and Advaita (Monistic) Vedānta is their views on the existence of the phenomenal world. While Advaita holds that the phenomenal world is ultimately unreal (mithyā) and that only Brahman truly exists, Bhedābheda thinkers insist that the phenomenal world is real, and not at all illusory. In this basic assertion they are in line with the majority of Indian philosophical schools, including the schools of Qualified Non-Dualist (Viśiṣṭādvaita) Vedānta, Dualist (Dvaita) Vedānta, Nyāya, Sāṅkhya, and Mīmāṃsā. Although Advaitins cite certain passages from the Upaniṣads as supporting the notion that the world is akin to a mirage or a magical trick, Bhedābhedavādins accuse Advaitins of borrowing this idea from the Mind-only (Cittamātra) school of Buddhism, and frequently employ the epithet of “crypto-Buddhist” (pracchannabauddha) to refer to Advaitins.

a. Part and Whole

Bhedābhedavādins understand the relation between Brahman and the individual souls to be a relation between a whole and its parts. They frequently employ stock examples to illustrate this relation. Some of the most common are a fire and its sparks, the sun and its rays, a father and his son, and the ocean and its waves. Each of these is an example of a part-whole relation, which is also a variety of difference and non-difference (Bhedābheda). So, to take one example, the sparks that come off of a fire are both the same as that fire and different from it. They are the same insofar as they came from the fire, and are constituted by the same substance as fire. But they are also distinguishable from the original fire, as occupying a separate point in space. Although these four examples each seem to illustrate a different relation (and it may seem to make no sense at all to understand a son as a “part” of his father), Bhedābhedavādins cite these familiar examples from the physical world in order to shed light on the true metaphysical relation between Brahman and the individual selves. While each might capture some aspect of that relation, inevitably they are mere approximations, requiring further commentary and philosophical analysis.

Advaita Vedāntins object to the characterization of the individual self as a part, and characterize Brahman as partless. All schools of Vedānta understand the Veda as the ultimate epistemic authority, and arguments from scripture play a large part in intra-Vedāntic disputes. Advaitins point out that both the Upaniṣads and the Brahma Sūtras say that Brahman is partless (niravayava, niṣkala). Furthermore, the assertion that Brahman has parts seems to defy logic. It is inconceivable that Brahman could be made up of parts, for things that are made up of parts are dependent on those parts, and impermanent. Advaitins offer their own stock examples to show that Brahman cannot be divided up, and that any such division is purely an artificial limitation on an indivisible entity. For example, Advaitins commonly liken Brahman to the element called “space” (ākāśa). According to traditional science in India, space is an element that is omnipresent in the world, just as all Vedāntins agree that Brahman is omnipresent. Although we can talk about space as being delimited (the space inside a room, the space inside a pot), such limitations of space are purely accidental, not essential to the element itself. It may appear to an observer that the space inside a pot and the space outside the pot are two different entities, but this is a misunderstanding of the fundamental nature of space.

The Bhedābhedavādins can themselves appeal to textual authority for the idea that the relation between Brahman and the individual self is a relation between a whole and its parts. In Brahma Sūtra 2.3.43, The individual self is referred to as a “part” (aṁśa), and Bhedābhedavādins cite this passage whenever they require a textual support for their views. However, Advaitins take this description of the relation as a figurative, and not literal description of the status of the individual self. Otherwise, this passage will conflict with Brahma Sūtra 2.1.26, which says that Brahman is “partless” (niravayava). For Advaita, the world appears as if to be made of parts. But when it is understood correctly, all of the many entities in the world are seen to be false, and only one entity, a single, partless Brahman remains. Bhedābhedavādins, in their assertion of the world’s phenomenal reality, insist that multiplicity is real. Brahman is simultaneously one and many, depending on the perspective from which it is viewed, just as the ocean can be described as one or many, depending on the perspective from which it is described. Bhedābhedavādins maintain that Brahman’s being made up of parts in no way diminishes the perfection of Brahman, just as the existence of waves in the ocean in no way diminishes the amount of water therein.

b. Aupādhika and Svābhāvika Bhedābheda

All Bhedābhedavādins maintain the reality of the phenomenal world and the multiplicity of individual selves. However, some Bhedābheda thinkers edge closer to the Advaita position by arguing that although multiplicity is real, it is in some way less real than the absolute unity of Brahman. The early Bhedābheda thinker Bhāskara (8th-9th c. CE) exemplifies this tendency to reduce the ontological status of the phenomenal world, while still maintaining its reality. Bhāskara’s philosophy is an example of Aupādhika Bhedābhedavāda (“Difference and Non-difference Based on Limiting Conditions”). According to Bhāskara, the one, absolute Brahman becomes finite and multiple by means of limiting conditions (upādhis). Just as a pure diamond appears to be red when it is placed next to a red flower, so too the absolute Brahman appears finite when it is transformed through limiting conditions. This transformation is a real one; the individual self really is finite, subject to ignorance, suffering, and bondage, so long as it is filtered through limiting conditions. Although the individual self is real as differentiated from Brahman, for Bhāskara difference is merely a temporary state. In its natural state, Brahman is one and not many. Although it undergoes limitations to become finite, the ultimate goal of the individual is to realize his or her absolute state. Liberation is precisely the removal of such limiting conditions.

At the other end of the spectrum from Bhāskara’s Aupadhika Bhedābhedavāda is Nimbārka’s philosophy of Svābhāvika Bhedābheda (Natural Difference and Non-Difference). For Nimbārka (13th c.), Brahman is different and non-different not because of artificial limiting conditions, but contains both non-difference and non-difference as its essential nature. Along with Yādavaprakāśa (11th c.), Nimbārka comes closest to upholding both difference and non-difference as equally real states of Brahman. The tendency among most Bhedābhedavādins, however, is to subordinate difference to non-difference. Although difference is a real state that Brahman undergoes as it transforms into multiple individual selves, Bhāskara in essence makes the state of non-difference “more real” than the state of difference. In this way, school of Bhedābheda Vedānta is often closer to the school of Advaita (Monist) Vedānta than it is to the school of Dvaita (Dualist) Vedānta.

3. Causality

a. Pariṇāmavāda (Theory of real transformation)

Closely related to Bhedābheda Vedānta’s ontology is its theory of causality. Bhedābheda Vedāntins subscribe to the theory of Pariṇāmavāda, which states that the phenomenal world is a real transformation (pariṇāma) of the material cause of the world. They share this theory with the Sāṅkhya school of philosophy, as well as with most other schools of Vedānta. The major difference between the Vedāntic theory of Pariṇāmavāda and the Sāṅkhya’s Pariṇāmavāda is the understanding of what constitutes the material cause of the world. For Sāṅkhya, primordial nature (prakṛti) transforms itself into the phenomenal world. The principle of primordial nature is completely insentient, and the process of transformation that creates the world is a blind, automatic process. For Bhedābheda Vedāntins, Brahman is both the material and efficient cause of the universe. Brahman, unlike the Sāṅkhya’s prakṛti, is sentient. Yet both the sentient (individual souls) and insentient (physical things) have their origin in Brahman, according to Bhedābhedavādins. In spite of their apparent proximity to the Sāṅkhya school on the issue of causality, early Bhedābheda thinkers such as Bhāskara took pains to critique the Sāṅkhya notion ofprakṛti, accusing it of being both contrary to scripture and contrary to logic. A few later Bhedābheda thinkers took a softer line on Sāṅkhya. The most notable of these was Vijñānabhikṣu (16th c.), who argued for the ultimate unity of Sāṅkhya and Bhedābheda Vedānta doctrines.

b. Vivartavāda (Theory of unreal manifestation)

Once again, it is useful to contrast the doctrines of the Bhedābheda school with Advaita Vedānta. Advaita Vedānta maintains the doctrine of Vivartavāda, which states that the world is an unreal manifestation (vivarta) of Brahman. Advaita, like other schools of Vedānta, identifies Brahman as both material and efficient cause. But for the Advaitins, Brahman is the cause of an unreal effect. Although the world can be described as conventionally real (vyavahārasat), the Advaitins claim that all of Brahman’s effects must ultimately be acknowledged as unreal before the individual self can be liberated. Although the theory of Vivartavāda is traditionally accepted as a theory shared by the entire Advaita school, some recent historians have questioned this, noting passages in the work of Śaṅkara, the founder of the Advaita, that appear to be closer to the theory ofpariṇāma (Hacker 1953: pp. 24ff.; Rao 1996: pp. 265ff.). It is likely that the theory ofVivartavāda is a theory that emerged gradually out of the earlier Vedāntic theory ofPariṇāmavāda, rather than one that sprang fully formed out of the head of Śaṅkara. It also bears repeating that some Bhedābheda Vedāntins come perilously close to the Advaita view of the phenomenal world as only conventionally real, as they often emphasize that multiplicity is an unnatural, temporary state.

c. Satkāryavāda (Theory of pre-existent effect)

Proponents of both Vedāntic theories of causality, Pariṇāmavāda and Vivartavāda, justify each by citing a central passage at Chāndogya Upaniṣad 6.1.4-5. There, the sage Aruni describes the nature of causality to his son, Śvetaketu, using the example of the relation of clay to a pot:

It is like this, son. By means of just one lump of clay one would perceive everything made of clay—the transformation is a verbal handle, a name—while the reality is just this: ‘It’s clay.’It is like this, son. By means of just one copper trinket one would perceive everything made of copper—the transformation is a verbal handle, a name—while the reality is just this: ‘It’s copper.’ (Olivelle 1996: 148)

This passage uses the examples of an everyday material cause, clay or copper, to shed light on the nature of cause and effect. It expresses the doctrine of Satkaryavāda, which says that the effect preexists in its cause. All Vedāntins subscribe to this theory—the doctrines of real tranformation (pariṇāma) and unreal manifestation (Vivartavāda) can be understood as two different versions of the theory of Satkāryavāda. According toSatkāryavāda, the lump of clay does not go out of existence when it is transformed into a pot, a cup, a saucer, or the like, only to be replaced by something entirely new. Although the form of the clay has changed, its essence, its clay-ness, remains. The same logic applies to everything caused by Brahman. The entire world, in all of its many forms, nonetheless shares the same essence, as being Brahman. This view, something like an early Indian theory of the conservation of matter, suggests that nothing ever arrives in the universe completely new, but only as a transformation of some earlier material cause. Nothing can be created ex nihilo. In this belief, the Vedāntins are at odds with the Buddhist and Nyāya schools, who for separate reasons argue that the effect does not preexist in the cause.

Although Bhedābheda Vedāntins and Advaita Vedāntins have the theory of Satkāryavādain common, they part ways when asked to characterize the status of the effect. Is the effect a real transformation (pariṇāma) of the cause, or merely an unreal manifestation (vivarta)? The passage at Chāndogya Upaniṣad 6.1.4-5 has been interpreted in both ways. Advaitins emphasize the apparent nominalism expressed by Aruni in this passage: “the transformation is a verbal handle, a name—while the reality is just this: ‘It’s copper.’” This might suggest that the effect is unreal, and only the cause is truly real. But Bhedābhedavādins see this passage as simply another instantiation of the principle of difference and non-difference, just as it is illustrated by the examples of a fire and its sparks or the sun and its rays. From one perspective, focusing on substance, we can say that all of the various cups, saucers, and plates are one—they are all clay. Yet at the same time, they have been transformed by the pot-maker into different forms, multiple in number, occupying different points in space. From this perspective, the effects are real. Just as the many pots, plates, and saucers are simultaneously different and non-different from the original lump of clay, so too all of the individual selves are both different and non-different from Brahman, the original material cause.

4. Theology and soteriology

a. God in Bhedābhedavāda

In the medieval period, Bhedābheda Vedānta became closely associated with theism in general, and the movement of bhakti devotionalism in particular. There is a reason thatbhaktas such as Vallabha (1479-1531 CE) and Caitanya (1485-1533) built the foundations of their theological systems on centuries-old Bhedābheda concepts. Like the schools of Rāmānuja and Madhva, Bhedābhedavāda is a realist school. Whereas in the Advaita school even God has to be understood as ultimately unreal, since He too is merely Brahman limited by the artificial condition of lordliness, certain types of Bhedābheda philosophy can accommodate a God who is real in his qualified (saguṇa) form. Although on a certain level, an Advaitin can profess a belief in God, he or she knows that ultimately God is merely a crutch, a heuristic to enable human beings to go one step closer to that ultimate Brahman devoid of qualities (nirguṇa). Such a God is ultimately unsatisfying for those whose primary interest is devotion—in any system of Advaita, devotion must occupy a lower position than pure knowledge. On the other hand, many worshippers will also be unsatisfied with the Dvaita school’s uncompromising notion that they themselves are completely separate from God, and that ultimate unification with the Godhead is impossible. Both Bhedābhedavāda and Viśiṣṭādvaita offer the possibility to bridge these two alternatives, by offering the alternative of both a real God possessing qualities and the possibility of personal participation in that Godhead.

b. Knowledge combined with ritual acts leads to liberation

Besides insistence that the phenomenal world is a real transformation (pariṇāma) of Brahman, another view shared by Bhedābhedavādins is the necessity of ritual acts in combination with knowledge (Jñānakarmasamuccayavāda) in order to obtain liberation. Bhāskara devotes much of the beginning of his commentary on the Brahma Sūtra to a critique of Śaṅkara’s radical view that knowledge alone is sufficient for the attainment of Brahman, as long as one has fulfilled one’s ritual requirements at an earlier stage. Although today polemics between Vedāntins are usually depicted in solely philosophical or theological terms, this suggests that above all, Śaṅkara’s new teachings were seen by other Vedāntins in the 8th century as a serious threat to the ritual-social order. Bhāskara’s arguments in favor of Brahmanic ritualism are an important reminder of the continuities between early Vedānta and the Pūrva Mīmāṃsā (Prior Exegesis) school of ritual hermeneutics. The two schools are so close that Sanskrit authors in pre-modern India typically refer to Vedānta by the names “Brahma Mīmāṃsā” (Exegesis of Brahman) or “Uttara Mīmāṃsā” (Later Exegesis), emphasizing the central importance of Vedic interpretation for all Vedāntic thinkers.

The notion of bhakti finds a home in Bhedābhedavāda, since Bhedābheda takes activity in the world (karman) seriously, believing that activities in the world are real, and produce real effects. But it should not be thought that all Bhedābhedavādins were proponents ofbhakti. The early Bhedābheda of Bhāskara was not concerned at all with bhakti. Instead, Bhāskara uses Bhedābheda conceptual terminology as a conservative apologist, to defend the importance of Brahmanical ritual orthodoxy from Śaṅkara, a radical who rejected the ultimate efficacy of Vedic ritual. It is only with Nimbārka, a Bhedābheda thinker heavily influenced by the bhakti system of Rāmānuja, that we first fully see the union of bhaktiworship and Bhedābhedavāda. Even in medieval northern India, where bhakti was influential and widespread, not all Bhedābhedavādins were bhaktas. Vijñānabhikṣu, for example, was more interested in espousing a modified, Bhedābheda Vedāntic form of Patañjali’s Yoga than he was to proselytize for the path of devotion. Such flexibility of the Bhedābheda philosophical apparatus has allowed it to survive as a living tradition for over 1500 years in a number of very different historical contexts. Although in the modern period Bhedābheda Vedānta has been eclipsed in popularity by neo-Vedāntic interpretations of Advaita Vedānta philosophy, its lineage continues today among traditional scholars in Puṣṭimārga and Gaudīya Vaiṣṇava religious communities. And, for the first time in its long history, in the early 21st century Bhedābheda Vedānta is beginning to receive the attention it deserves among historians, philosophers, and theologians outside of India.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Bhāskara (1903). Brahmasūtrabhāṣyam, ed. Pandit Vindhyeshvari Prasada Dvivedin. Benares: Chowkhamba Sanskrit Book Depot.
  • Dasgupta, Surendranath (1922). A History of Indian Philosophy, vol III. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
  • Hacker, Paul (1953). Vivarta: Studien zur Geschichte der illusionistischen Kosmologie und Erkenntnistheorie der Inder. Wiesbaden: Franz Steiner Verlag.
  • Kapoor, O.B.L (1976). The Philosophy and Religion of Sri Caitanya. Delhi: Munshiram Manoharlal.
  • Marfatia, Mrdula I. (1967). The Philosophy of Vallabhācarya. Delhi: Munshiram Manoharlal.
  • Nakamura, Hajime (1989). A History of Early Vedānta Philosophy, part 1. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
  • Nicholson, Andrew (2005). “Vijñānabhikṣu’s Yoga,” Journal of Vaishnava Studies vol.14, no. 1: pp. 43-53.
  • Oberhammer, Gerhard (1997). Materialien zur Geschichte der Rāmānuja-Schule III:Yādavaprakāśa, der vergessene Lehrer Rāmānujas. Wien: Verlag der Osterreichische Akademie der Wissenschaften.
  • Olivelle, Patrick, translator (1996). Upaniṣads. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Ram, Kanshi (1995). Integral Non-Dualism: A Critical Exposition of Vijñānabhikṣu’s System of Philosophy. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
  • Rao, Srinivasa (1996). “Two ‘Myths’ in Advaita,” Journal of Indian Philosophy vol. 24: pp. 265-279.
  • Smith, Frederick M. (2005). “The Hierarchy of Philosophical Systems According to Vallabhācārya,” Journal of Indian Philosophy vol. 33: pp. 421-453.
  • Srinivasachari, P.N. (1972). The Philosophy of Bhedābheda. Madras: Adyar Library.

Author Information

Andrew J. Nicholson
Stony Brook University
U. S. A.


Sāṅkhya (often spelled Sāṁkhya) is one of the major “orthodox” (or Hindu) Indian philosophies. Two millennia ago it was the representative Hindu philosophy. Its classical formulation is found in Īśvarakṛṣṇa’s Sāṅkhya-Kārikā (ca. 350 C.E.), a condensed account in seventy-two verses. It is a strong Indian example of metaphysical dualism, but unlike many Western counterparts it is atheistic. The two types of entities of Sāṅkhya are Prakṛti and puruṣa-s, namely Nature and persons. Nature is singular, and persons are numerous. Both are eternal and independent of each other. Persons (puruṣa-s) are essentially unchangeable, inactive, conscious entities, who nonetheless gain something from contact with Nature. Creation as we know it comes about by a conjunction of Nature and persons. Prakṛti, or Nature, is comprised of three guṇa-s or qualities. The highest of the three is sattva (essence), the principle of light, goodness and intelligence. Rajas (dust) is the principle of change, energy and passion, while tamas (darkness) appears as inactivity, dullness, heaviness and despair. Nature, though unconscious, is purposeful and is said to function for the purpose of the individual puruṣa-s. Aside from comprising the physical universe, it comprises the gross body and “sign-body” of a puruṣa. The latter contains among other things the epistemological apparati of embodied beings (such as the mind, intellect, and senses). The sign body of a puruṣa transmigrates: after the death of the gross body, the sign-body is reborn into another gross body according to past merit, and the puruṣa continues to be a witness through its various bodies. An escape from this endless circle is possible only through the realization of the fundamental difference between Nature and persons, whereby an individual puruṣa loses interest in Nature and is thereby liberated forever from all bodies, subtle and gross. Much of the Sāṅkhya system became widely accepted in India: especially the theory of the three guṇa-s; and it was incorporated into much latter Indian philosophy, especially Vedānta.

Table of Contents

  1. History
  2. Sāṅkhya’s Existential Quandary and Solution
  3. Epistemology
  4. Metaphysics
    1. Causality
    2. Prakṛti and the three guṇa-s
    3. Puruṣa
    4. Evolution, Humanity and the World
  5. Liberation
  6. References and Further Reading

1. History

The word “Sāṅkhya” is derived from the Sanskrit noun sankhyā (number) based on the verbal root khyā (make known, name) with the preverb sam(together). “Sāṅkhya” thus denotes the system of enumeration or taking account. The first meaning is acceptable, as Sāṅkhya is very fond of sets, often naming them as “triad,” “the group of eleven,” and so forth; but the second meaning is more fitting, as the aim of Sāṅkhya is to take into account all the important factors of the whole world, especially of the human condition.

Sāṅkhya has a very long history. Its roots go deeper than textual traditions allow us to see. The last major figure in the tradition, Vijñāna Bhikṣu, thrived as late as 1575 C.E. Despite its long history, Sāṅkhya is essentially a one-book school: the earliest extant complete text, the Sāṅkhya-Kārikā, is the unquestioned classic of the tradition. Not only are its formal statements accepted by all subsequent representatives, but also its ordering of the topics and its arguments are definitive – very little is added in the course of the centuries.

Besides its own author, Īśvarakṛṣṇa, the Sāṅkhya-Kārikā itself names several ancient adherents of the school plus a standard work, the Ṣaṣṭi-Tantra (the book of sixty [topics]). The ancient Buddhist Aśvaghoṣa (in his Buddha-Carita) describes Arāḍa Kālāma, the teacher of the young Buddha (ca. 420 B.C.E.) as following an archaic form of Sāṅkhya. The great Indian epic, the Mahābhārata, represents the Sāṅkhya system as already quite old at the time of the great war of the Bharata clan , which occurred during the first half of the first millennium BCE. Such textual evidence confirms that by the beginning of our era, Indian common opinion considered Sāṅkhya as very ancient. Moreover, Sāṅkhya concepts and terminology frequently appear in the portion of the Vedas known as the Upaniṣads, notably in the Kaṭha and the Śvetāśvatara. The older (6th cent. BCE?) Chāndogya Upaniṣad presents an important forerunner of the guṇa-theory, although the terminology is different. And before that, in the Creation-hymn of the Ṛg-Veda (X. 129) we find ideas of the evolution of a material principle and of cosmic dualism, in the company of words that later became the names of the guṇa-s.

Sāṅkhya likely grew out of speculations rooted in cosmic dualism and introspective meditational practice. The agriculturally-rooted concept of the productive union of the sky-god (or sun-god or rain-god) and the earth goddess appears in India typically as the connection of the spiritual, immaterial, lordly, immobile fertilizer (represented as the Śiva-liṅgam, or phallus) and of the active, fertile, powerful but subservient material principle (Śakti or Power, often as the horrible Dark Lady, Kālī). The ascetic and meditative yoga practice, in contrast, aimed at overcoming the limitations of the natural body and achieving perfect stillness of the mind. A combination of these views may have resulted in the concept of the puruṣa, the unchanging immaterial conscious essence, contrasted with Prakṛti, the material principle that produces not only the external world and the body but also the changing and externally determined aspects of the human mind (such as the intellect, ego, internal and external perceptual organs).

Both the agrarian theology of Śiva-Śakti/Sky-Earth and the tradition of yoga (meditation) do not appear to be rooted in the Vedas. Not surprisingly, classical Sāṅkhya is remarkably independent of orthodox Brahmanic traditions, including the Vedas. Sāṅkhya is silent about the Vedas, about their guardians (the Brahmins) and for that matter about the whole caste system, and about the Vedic gods; and it is slightly inimical towards the animal sacrifices that characterized the ancient Vedic religion. But all our early sources for the history of Sāṅkhya belong to the Vedic tradition, and it is thus reasonable to suppose that we do not see in them the full development of the Sāṅkhya system, but rather occasional glimpses of its development as it gained gradual acceptance in the Brahmanic fold.

From these and also from some quotations in later literature commenting on the tradition (first of all in the Yukti-dīpikā), a variety of minor variations and differing opinions have been collected that point to the existence of many branches of the school. The most significant divergence is perhaps the development of a theistic school of Orthodox Hindu philosophy, called Yoga, which absorbs the basic dualism of Sāṅkhya, but is theistic, and thus regards one puruṣa as a special puruṣa, called the Lord (Īśvara).

According to the Indian tradition, the first masters of Sāṅkhya are Kapila and his disciple Āsuri. They belong to antiquity (and sometimes, prehistory) and are known only through ancient legends. Another putative ancient master of Sāṅkhya, Pañcaśikha, seems to be more historical, and may have been the author of the original Ṣaṣṭi-Tantra. Other important figures in the tradition, frequently referred to and also quoted in the commentaries, include Vārṣagaṇya, and Vindhyavāsin, who may have been an older contemporary of Īśvarakṛṣṇa.

Around the beginning of our era, Sāṅkhya became the representative philosophy of Hindu thought in Hindu circles, and this probably explains why we find it everywhere – not only in the epics and the Upaniṣads but also in other important texts of the Hindu tradition, such as the dharmaśāstra-s (law-books), medical treatises (āyurveda) and the basic texts of the meditational Yoga school. And in fact much of the philosophy of Yoga (as formulated by Patañjali ca. 300 C.E.) is considered by several modern scholars as a version of Sāṅkhya.

Of Īśvarakṛṣṇa we know nothing; he may have lived around 350 C.E., in any case after the composition of the foundational text of the Nyāya school of Indian philosophy, known as the Nyāya-Sūtra, and before the famous Buddhist philosopher, Vasubandhu. Īśvarakṛṣṇa’s work, the Sāṅkhya-Kārikā consists of 72 stanzas in the āryā meter. Perhaps some of the verses were added by a student, but most of the work clearly tells of a single, philosophically and poetically ingenious hand. Unlike the (older) sūtras (aphorisms) of other systems, which are often cryptic and ambiguous, the Sāṅkhya-Kārikā is a clear composition that is well ordered and argued. It is stated in the last stanza that it is a condensation of the whole Ṣaṣṭi-Tantra, leaving out only stories and debates. And in fact Īśvarakṛṣṇa never refers to the theses of other systems, nor to differences within the school. He purposefully avoids all points of conflict: he is either silent about them or uses ambivalent expressions. It is perfectly clear that he wanted to write the common standard for the whole school, acceptable to all adherents to the philosophy; and he succeeded. The Kārikā ousted all previous Sāṅkhya writings, of which only stray quotations remain. The presentation given below will thus follow this work very closely.

Many commentaries were written on the Kārikā, mostly simple explanations of the text, and very similar to each other (the better known are Gauḍapāda’s Bhāṣya, Māṭhara’s Vṛttiand Śaṅkarācārya’s Jaya-Maṅgalā — this Gauḍapāda and Śaṅkarācārya are generally thought to be different from the famous Advaitins of the same name). By far the most important and also longest commentary is the Yukti-dīpikā, “Light on the arguments” written perhaps by Rājan or Rājāna around 700 C.E. This commentary discusses different positions within the school (and is therefore our most important historical source for old Sāṅkhya) and debates with other schools over many fundamental points of doctrine. It follows the polemical style of writing in the early classical schools, with heavy emphasis on epistemological issues. Unfortunately this text received very little response in classical times; in fact it was hardly known outside Kashmir. One of the reasons for this may be the extreme popularity of another commentary, Vācaspati Miśra’s Sāṅkhya-Tattva-Kaumudī, or “Moonlight of the Principles of Sāṅkhya,” (circa 980 C.E.). This commentary, although incomparably simpler, still follows mature classical philosophical style, and was written by a master of all philosophies, respected for his works on all major schools. It was the starting point of a tradition of sub-comments continuing to the present day.

Besides the Kārikā there are two other important foundational texts of Sāṅkhya. The cryptic, half page long Tattva-Samāsa-Sūtra (Summary of the Principles) is very old at least in some parts, but no Sāṅkhya author mentions it before the 14th century. It is only a list of topics, but a list quite different from the categories of the Kārikā; it has several commentaries, the best known is the Krama-Dīpikā, “Light on the Succession.” The other text is the well-known, longish Sāṅkhya-Sūtra, which plainly follows the Kārikā in most respects but adds many more illustrative stories and polemics with later philosophic positions. It is markedly atheistic and makes arguments against the existence of God. It appears first in the 15th century and is probably not very much older. It has attracted a commentary by Vijñāna Bhikṣu, the eminent Vedāntist of the 16th century, entitledSāṅkhya-Pravacana-Bhāṣya or “Commentary expounding Sāṅkhya.” He also authored a small systematic treatise, the Sāṅkhya-Sāra (The Essence of Sāṅkhya). He introduced several innovations into the system, notably the idea that the number of the qualities is not three but infinite and that the guṇa-s are substances, not qualities.

2. Sāṅkhya’s Existential Quandary and Solution

The first premise of Sāṅkhya is the universal fact of suffering. There are many practical ways to ward off the darker side of life: such as self-defense, pleasures, medicine, and meditation. But, according to Sāṅkhya, all of them are of limited efficacy and at best can offer only temporary relief. The refuge offered by traditional Vedic religion is similarly unsatisfactory—it does not lead to complete purification (mainly because it involves bloody animal sacrifices), and the rewards it promises are all temporary: even after a happy and prolonged stay in heaven one will be reborn on Earth for more suffering.

Therefore the solution offered by Sāṅkhya is arguably superior: it analyzes the fundamental metaphysical structure of the world and the human condition, and finds the ultimate source of suffering, thereby making it possible to fight it effectively. Cutting the root of rebirth is the only way to final emancipation from suffering, according to Sāṅkhya.

Sāṅkhya analyzes the cosmos into a dualistic, and atheistic scheme. The two types of entities that exist, on Sāṅkhya’s account, are Prakṛti or Nature and puruṣa-s or persons. Nature is singular, but persons are numerous. Both are eternal and independent of each other.

Creation as we know it comes about by a conjunction of these two categories. Nature, though unconscious, is purposeful and is said to function for the purpose of the individual puruṣa-s. Aside from comprising the physical universe, it comprises the gross body and “sign body” (or “subtle body”) of a puruṣa. The sign body of a puruṣatransmigrates: after the death of the gross body, the sign body is reborn in another gross body according to past merit. An escape from this endless circle is possible only through the realization of the fundamental difference between Nature and persons, whereby an individual puruṣa loses interest in Nature and is thereby liberated forever from all bodies, subtle and gross. Characteristic of Sāṅkhya is a metaphorical but consistent presentation of the puruṣa as a conscious, unchangeable, male principle that is inactive, while Nature is the unconscious, forever changing, female principle that is active, yet subservient to the ends of the puruṣa. This is reminiscent of the cosmic dualism in Indian religions such as Tantrism, where the spiritual supreme male God mates with his female Śakti (Power) resulting in creation.

Prakṛti, or Nature, is comprised of three guṇa-s or qualities. The highest of the three issattva (essence), the principle of light, goodness and intelligence. Rajas (dust) is the principle of change, energy and passion, while tamas (darkness) appears as inactivity, dullness, heaviness and despair. Prakṛti as unmanifest, pure potentiality is the substrate of the whole world, while in her manifest form she has twenty-three interdependent structures (tattva-s). Of the latter the highest is intellect or buddhi: it is not conscious, but through its closeness to puruṣa it appears to be so. The others are egoism, mind, senses, biological abilities, the sensibilia like color and the elements (earth etc).

3. Epistemology

Sāṅkhya recognizes only three valid sources of information: perception, inference and reliable tradition. The ordering is important: we use inference only when perception is impossible, and only if both are silent do we accept tradition. A valid source of information (pramāṇa) is veridical, yielding knowledge of its object. Perception is the direct cognition of sensible qualities (such as color and sound), which mediate cognition of the elements (such as earth and water). Perception, on the Sāṅkhya account, is a complex process: the senses (such as sight) cognize their respective objects (color and shape) through the physical organs (such as the eye). And these senses are themselves the objects of cognition of the psyche (which in turn is comprised of three faculties—the mind (manas), the intellect (buddhi), and the ego (ahaṁkāra). The mind for its part internally constructs a representation of objects of the external world with the data supplied by the senses. The ego contributes personal perspective to knowledge claims. The intellect contributes understanding to knowledge. The puruṣa adds consciousness to the result: it is the mere witness of the intellectual processes. According to a simile, thepuruṣa is the lord of the house, the tripartite psyche is the door-keeper and the senses are the doors.

For Sāṅkhya , perception is reliable and supplies most of the practical information needed in everyday life, but for this very reason it cannot supply philosophically interesting data. Things that can be seen are not objects of philosophical inquiry. There are many possible reasons why an existent material object is not (or cannot be) perceived: it may be too far (or near), or it is too minute or subtle; there may be something that obstructs perception; it may be indistinguishable from other surrounding objects or the sensation produced by another object may be so strong as to overweigh it. A fault of the sense-organs or an inattentive mind can also cause a failure of perception.

For philosophy, the central source of information is inference, and this is clearly emphasized in Sāṅkhya. Īśvarakṛṣṇa appears to recognize three kinds of inference (SK 5b) (as evidenced by his clear reference to the Nyāya-Sūtra 1.1.5): cause to effect, effect to cause and analogical reasoning. The first two types are based on the previous observation of causal connections. Therefore they cannot lead us to the sphere of the essentially imperceptible. Thus all metaphysical statements are based on analogical inference—such as: the body is a complex structure; complex structures, like a bed, serve somebody else’s purpose; so there must be somebody else (the puruṣa) that the body serves. Of course the analogies utilized are themselves analogies of the causal relation; so it would be a little more appropriate to say that they are analogical reasonings from the effect to the cause, but traditionally the three classes of inference are considered mutually exclusive.

The two members of an inference are the liṅga, ‘sign’ (the given or premise) and theliṅgin, ‘having the sign’, i.e. the thing of which the liṅga is the sign (the inferred or conclusion).

The last valid source of information, āpta-vacana, literally means reliable speech, but in the context of Sāṅkhya it is understood as referring to scriptures (the Vedas) only. While the validity of scriptural authority is affirmed, its importance is downplayed: they are never used to derive or confirm philosophical theses.

4. Metaphysics

Sāṅkhya is very fond of numbers, and in its classical form it is the system of 25 realities (tattva-s). In standard categories it is a dualism of puruṣa (person) and Prakṛti (nature); but Prakṛti has two basic forms, vyakta, “manifest,” and avyakta, “unmanifest,” so there are three basic principles. Puruṣa and the avyakta are the first two tattva-s; the remaining twenty-three from intellect to the elements belong to the manifest nature.

The relation of the unmanifest and manifest nature is somewhat vague, perhaps because there were conflicting opinions on this question. Later authors understand it as a cosmogonical relation: the unmanifest was the initial state of Prakṛti, where the guṇa-s were in equilibrium. Due to the effect of the puruṣa-s this changed and evolved the manifold universe that we see, the manifest. This view nicely conforms to the standard Hindu image of cosmic cycles of creation and destruction; but it is problematic logically (without supposing God) and Īśvarakṛṣṇa – without directly opposing it – does not seem to accept it. He says that we do not grasp the unmanifest because it is subtle, not because it does not exist; and that implies that it exists also at present, as an imperceptible homogenous substrate of the world.

It is a notable feature of Sāṅkhya that its dualism is somewhat unbalanced: if we droppedpuruṣa from the picture, we would still have a fairly complete picture of the world, asPrakṛti is not inert, mechanical matter but is a living, creative principle that has all the resources to produce from itself the human mind and intellect. Sāṅkhya thus looks like a full materialist account of the world, with the passive, unchanging principle of consciousness added almost as an afterthought.

a. Causality

According to Sāṅkhya, causality is the external, objective counterpart of the intellectual process of inference. As Sāṅkhya understands itself as the school of thought that understands reality through inference, causality plays a central role in the Sāṅkhya philosophy. According to Sāṅkhya, the world as we see it is the effect of its fundamental causes, which are only known through their effects and in conjunction with a proper understanding of causation.

The Indian tradition conceives of causality differently from the recent European tradition, where it is typically regarded as a relation between events. In the Indian tradition it rather consists in the origin of a thing. The standard example of the causal relationship is that of the potter making a pot from clay, where the cause par excellence is taken to be the clay. The Sāṅkhya analysis of causation is called sat-kārya-vāda, or literally the “existent effect theory,” which opposes the view taken by the Nyāya philosophy. Perhaps sat-kārya is better rendered as “the effect of existent [causes]”; it stands for a moderate form of determinism. In the commentaries it is normally explained as the view that the effect already exists in its cause prior to its production. Understood literally, this is not tenable—if the cause existed, why was it not perceived prior to the point called its production? Rather the theory states that there is nothing absolutely new in the product: everything in it was determined by its causes.

The following five considerations are used in an argument for the sat-kārya-vāda: (a) the nonexistent cannot produce anything (given the assumed definition of “existence” as the ability to have some effect); (b) when producing a specific thing, we always need a specific substance as material cause (such as the clay for a pot, or milk for curds); (c) otherwise everything (or at least anything) would come into being from anything; (d) the creative agent (the efficient cause) produces only what it can, not anything (a potter cannot make jewelry); (e) the effect is essentially identical with its material cause, and so it has many of its qualities (a pot is still clay, and thus consists of the primary attributes of clay). This last argument is utilized to determine the basic attributes of the imperceptible metaphysical causes of the empirical world: the substrate must have the same fundamental attributes and abilities as the manifest world.

b. Prakṛti and the three guṇa-s

The term “prakṛti” (meaning nature and productive substance) is actually used in three related but different senses. (1) Sometimes it is a synonym for the second tattva, called“mūla-prakṛti” (root-nature), “avyakta” (the unmanifest) or “pradhāna” (the principal). (2) Sometimes it is paired with “vikṛti” (modification); “prakṛti” in this sense could be rendered as “source.” Then the unmanifest is prakṛti-only; and the intellect, the ego and the five sense qualities are both prakṛti-s and vikṛti-s – thus producing the set of eight prakṛti-s. (The remaining sixteen tattva-s are vikṛtis-only, while the first tattva, the unchanging, eternal puruṣa is neither prakṛti nor vikṛti.) (3) And in most cases, “prakṛti” means both the manifest and the unmanifest nature (which consists of the twenty-fourtattva-s starting from the second).

Prakṛti” is female gendered in Sanskrit, and its anaphora in Sāṅkhya is “she,” but this usage seems to be consistently metaphorical only. Prakṛti, in its various forms, contrasts with puruṣa in being productive, unconscious, objective (knowable as an object), not irreducibly atomic, and comprised of three guṇa-s.

The unmanifest form of Prakṛti contrasts with the manifest form in being single, uncaused, eternal, all-pervasive, partless, self-sustaining, independent and inactive; it is aliṅgin (known from inference only). Ironically, all these attributes with the exception of singleness also characterize the puruṣa, thus some ancient Sāṅkhya masters did call thepuruṣa also avyakta (unmanifest).

Sāṅkhya analyzes manifest Prakṛti—the world, both physical and mental—into three omnipresent aspects, the guṇa-s. This is one of Sāṅkhya’s main contributions to Indian thought. “Guṇa” variously means ‘a thread, subordinate component, quality or virtue. Here it is not just any simple quality but rather a quite complex side or aspect of anything materially existent. (The puruṣa has no guṇa-s.) The guṇa-s cannot be understood as ordinary qualities: their names are nouns, not adjectives; they are not simple, and they don’t have degrees; they themselves have qualities and activity; they interact with each other; they do not have a substrate or a substance distinct from themselves to inhere in. But neither are they substances: they cannot exist separately (in every phenomenon all the three guṇa-s are present), they are not spatially or temporally delimited, they do not have separate individuality, and they can increase or decrease gradually in an object.

They are generally characterized as the real actors, even in mental phenomena such as cognition; they are the substrata for each other and they are interrelated in various ways. They “subdue, give birth to and copulate with” each other. In other words, they compete but also combine with each other, and they can even produce each other. They cooperate for an external purpose (the puruṣa’s aim) like the parts of a lamp – the wick, the oil and the flame.

Their names are quite obscure, perhaps intentionally: they resist any facile simplistic interpretation, forcing us to understand them from their description instead of the literal meaning. The name of the first guṇa, “sattva,” means sat-ness, where the participle “sat” means being, existent, real, proper, good. “Sattva” is additionally often used for entity, existence, essence and intelligence. Sattva is light (not heavy). Its essence is affection, its purpose and activity is illuminating. “Rajas,” the name of the second guṇa, means atmosphere, mist, and dust. Rajas is supportive like a column but also mobile like water. Its essence is aversion, its purpose is bringing into motion and its activity is seizing. The name of the third guṇa, “tamas,” means darkness. Tamas is heavy and covering. Its essence is despair, its purpose is holding back, and its activity is preservation.

In more modern terms, these three guṇa-s may be paraphrased as coherence / structure / information / intelligence (sattva); energy / movement / impulse / change (rajas); and inertia / mass / passivity / conservation (tamas). The depth of this analysis is the extent to which it grasps the structure of both the external and the internal world.

c. Puruṣa

Puruṣa,” the name of the first tattva (reality) literally means “man” in Sanskrit (though it often is used for the wider concept of person in Sanskrit and the Sāṅkhya system, as the Sāṅkhya system holds that all sentient beings are embodied puruṣa-s: not simply male humans). In the Sāṅkhya philosophy, “puruṣa” is metaphorically considered to be masculine, but unlike our concept of virility it is absolutely inactive. It is pure consciousness: it enjoys and witnesses Prakṛti’s activities, but does not cause them. It is characterized as the conscious subject: it is uncaused, eternal, all-pervasive, partless, self-sustaining, independent. It is devoid of the guṇa-s, and therefore inactive and sterile (unable to produce). It can be known from inference only. As puruṣa is essentially private for every sentient being, being their true self, there are many irreducibly distinct puruṣa-s. If Prakṛti is equated with Matter, puruṣa may be equated with the soul. If Prakṛti is equated with the World, puruṣa may be equated with the (true) self. If Prakṛti is understood as Nature, puruṣa can be understood as the person.

As the immaterial soul, puruṣa is not known through direct perception. Five arguments are given to prove its existence. (1) All complex structures serve an external purpose, for instance, a bed is for somebody to lie on; so the whole of nature, or more specifically the body – a very complex system – must also serve something different from it, which is thepuruṣa. (2) The three guṇa-s give an exhaustive explanation of material phenomena, but in sentient beings we find features that are the direct opposites of the guṇa-s (such as consciousness or being strictly private), and thus they need a non-material cause, which is the Puruṣa. (3) The coordinated activity of all the parts of a human being prove that there is something supervising it; without it, it would fall apart, as we see in a dead body, hence the puruṣa must exist. (4) Although we cannot perceive ourselves as puruṣa-s with the senses, we have immediate awareness of ourselves as conscious beings: the “enjoyer,” the experiencing self is the puruṣa. (5) Liberation, or the separation of soul and matter, would be impossible without their being separate puruṣa-s to be liberated, thus puruṣa-s must exist.

An important difference between schools of Indian philosophy that recognize mokṣa(liberation) as an end is the accepted number of souls. In Buddhism there is no separate soul to be liberated. In Advaita Vedānta, there is one common world-soul, and individuality is a function of the material world only. Sāṅkhya adduces three arguments to prove that there is a separate puruṣa for each individual: (1) Birth, death and the personal history of everybody is different (it is determined by the law of karma, according to our merits collected in previous lives). If there were one puruṣa only, all bodies should be identical or at least indistinguishable for the function of the self orpuruṣa is to be a supervisor of the body. But this is clearly not so. Hence, there must be a plurality of distinct puruṣa-s. (2) If there were only one puruṣa, everyone would act simultaneously alike, for the puruṣa is the supervisor of the body. But this is clearly not so. Hence, there must be a plurality of distinct puruṣa-s. (3) If there were only onepuruṣa, we would all experience the same things. However, it is evident that the opposite is true: our experiences are inherently diverse and private, and they cannot be directly shared. Hence, there must be a separate puruṣa for us all.

In time, it became difficult to follow most of the arguments given above: if puruṣa is really inactive, it cannot supervise anything, and cannot be the source of our individual actions. Also if puruṣa has no guṇa-s (qualities), one puruṣa cannot be specifically different from another. These problems perhaps grew under the influence of the concept of the absolutely unchanging and quality-less spiritual essence elaborated in Vedānta philosophy and were thus, arguably, not part of the original Sāṅkhya philosophy. The influence of Advaita Vedanta on Sāṅkhya seems to involve a reinterpretation of two attributes of puruṣa: inactivty came to be understood as unchangingness, while having no guṇa-s was taken to mean that it has no qualities at all.

The problem appears to have been first formulated by opponents in the Nyāya and Vedānta schools, and the author of the Yukti-dīpikā is also aware of it. The answer emerging, first in Vācaspati Miśra and then more elaborately in Vijñāna Bhikṣu, involves the innovation of the theory of “reflection”: as the image in the mirror has no effect on the object reflected and the mirror remains unchanged, but the image can be seen – so the unchanging puruṣa can reflect the external world, and the material psyche can react to this reflection. In responding to the problems brought about by the influence of Advaita Vedanta on Sāṅkhya, these authors appear to have responded by formulating a version of Sāṅkhya that comes fairly close to the superimposition theory of Advaita Vedānta, according to which an individual person is a cognitive construction that comes about by the error of mixing up the qualities of objects upon the quality of pure subjectivity. (For more on this issue, see Shiv Kumar pp. 39–43, 102–109, 250–253 and Shikan Murakami in Asiatische Studien 53, pp.645–665, who give insightful analyses of the problem in the classical schools.)

In Īśvarakṛṣṇa’s SāṅkhyaKārikā, however, the inactivity of the puruṣa does not seem to involve absolute incapability for change: the same word (a-kriya, “without activity”) is used also for the unmanifest nature, the substrate of all material manifestations. Arguably, it means only inability to move in space or to have mechanical effect. As it is clear from the above arguments, puruṣa is the determinative factor of our actions – and that presupposes that it changes in time (otherwise we would always do the same thing). So it must be the locus either of volition or of some hidden motivation underlying it. And although it is “a lonely, uninterested spectator, a witness unable to act,” it does like or dislike what it sees: it can suffer (this is, after all, the existential starting point for Sāṅkhya). It cannot be the locus of our whole emotional life (passions are explicitly said to reside in the intellect), but it must be considered the final source of our conscious feelings.

This is a controversial issue. Many modern scholars understand puruṣa as strictly unchanging; some of them (for example, A.B. Keith) are led by the inconsistencies following from this to consider Sāṅkhya as a hopeless bundle of contradictions. Larson (in Larson and Bhattacharya, pp. 79–83) translates “puruṣa” as “contentless consciousness;” it is not only unchanging but also timeless and outside the realm of causality (a somewhat Kantian concept). He tries to solve some of the difficulties by proposing that the multiplicity of puruṣa-s be understood as essentially epistemological in nature— and ontologically irrelevant.

d. Evolution, Humanity and the World

For Sāṅkhya, creation consists in the conjunction of the two categories of Prakṛti andpuruṣa(s). How this comes about is left somewhat of a mystery. As a result of this conjunction, the puruṣa is embodied in the world and appears to be the agent, and moreover Prakṛti seems to be conscious as it is animated by puruṣa-s. The relation between a puruṣa and Prakṛti, according to the Sāṅkhya-Kārika are like two men, a lame man and a blind man, lost in the wilderness; the one without the power of sight (activePrakṛti) carrying the cripple (conscious puruṣa) that can navigate the wild. Their purpose is twofold: the puruṣa desires experience—without blind nature, it would be unable to have experiences; and both Prakṛti and puruṣa desire liberation (in keeping with the simile, both nature and the person, the blind and the lame, desire to make their way home and part ways). Liberation is forestalled, on the Sāṅkhya account, because puruṣabecomes enamored with the beautiful woman, Prakṛti, and refuses to part ways with her.

The nature of the puruṣaPrakṛti connection is prima facie problematic. How can the inactive soul influence matter, and how could an unintelligent substance, nature, serve anybody’s purpose? Puruṣa is unable to move Prakṛti, but Prakṛti is able to respond topuruṣa’s presence and intentions. Prakṛti, although unconscious, possesses the capability to respond in a specific, structured way because of its sattva guṇa, the information–intelligence aspect of nature. The standard simile in the early Sāṅkhya tradition explains that as milk (an unconscious substance) starts to flow in order to nurture the calf, Prakṛtiflows to nurture puruṣa. In later texts, illumination and reflection are the standard models for this connection (puruṣa is said to illuminate Prakṛti, and Prakṛti reflects the nature of puruṣa), thus solving the problem of how Prakṛti and puruṣa can seemingly borrow eachothers properties without affecting eachothers essential state.

In consequence of Prakṛti’s connection with the soul, Prakṛti evolves many forms: the twenty-three tattva-s (realities) of manifest Prakṛti. The character of this evolution (pariṇāma) is somewhat vague. Is this an account of the origin of the cosmos, or of a single being? The cosmogenic understanding is probably older, and it seems to predominate in later accounts as well. In a pantheistic account the two accounts could be harmonized, but pantheism is alien from classical Sāṅkhya. Īśvarakṛṣṇa is again probably intentionally silent on this conflicting issue, but he seems to be inclined to the microcosmic interpretation: otherwise either a single super-puruṣa’s influence would be needed (that is, God’s influence) to account for how the universe on the whole comes about, or a coordinated effect of all the puruṣa-s together would be required—and there seems to be no foundation for either of these views Sāṅkhya.

The central mechanism of evolution is the complicated interaction of the guṇa-s, which is sensitive to the environment, the substrate or locus of the current process. Just as water in different places behaves differently (on the top of the Himalaya mountain as ice, in a hill creek, in the ocean, or as the juice of a fruit) so do the guṇa-s. In the various manifestations of nature the dominance of the guṇa-s varies—in the highest forms sattvarules, in the lowest tamas covers everything.

The actual order of evolution is as follows: from root-nature first appears intellect (buddhi); from it, ego (ahaṁkāra); from it the eleven powers (indriya) and the five sensibilia (tanmātra); and from the tanmātras the elements (bhūta).

The function of the buddhi (intellect) is specified as adhyavasāya (determination); it can be understood as definite conceptual knowledge. It has eight forms: virtue, knowledge, dispassion and command, and their opposites. So it seems that on the material plane,buddhi is the locus of cognition, emotion, moral judgment and volition. All these may be thought to belong also to consciousness, or the puruṣa. However, on the Sāṅkhya account, puruṣa is connected directly only to the intellect, and the latter does all cognitions, mediates all experiences for it. The view of Sāṅkhya appears to be that whensattva (quality of goodness, or illumination) predominates in buddhi (the intellect), it can act acceptably for puruṣa, when there is a predominance of tamas, it will be weak and insufficient.

The ego or ahaṁkāra (making the I) is explained as abhimāna—thinking of as [mine]. It delineates that part of the world that we consider to be or to belong to ourselves: mind, body, perhaps family, property, rank… It individuates and identifies parts of Prakṛti: by itself nature is one, continuous and unseparated. It communicates the individuality inherent in the puruṣa-s to the essentially common Prakṛti that comprises the psyche of the individual. So it has a purely cognitive and a material function as well—like so many principles of Sāṅkhya.

The eleven powers (indriya) are mind (manas), the senses and the “powers of action” (karmendriya), the biological faculties. The senses (powers of cognition, buddhīndriya) are sight, hearing, smelling, tasting, and touching—they are the abilities, not the physical organs themselves through which they operate. The crude names of the powers of action are speech, hand, foot, anus and lap. They symbolize the fundamental biological abilities to communicate, to take in or consume, to move, to excrete and to generate.

Manas” (often translated as “mind,” though this may be misleading), designates the lowest, almost vegetative part of the central information-processing structure. Its function is saṁkalpa—arranging (literally ‘fitting together’) or coordinating the indriya-s. It functions partly to make a unified picture from sense data, provided by the senses, and partly to translate the commands from the intellect to actual, separate actions of the organs. So, it is both a cognitive power and a power of action. (Later authors take “manas” to also designate the will, for saṁkalpa also has this meaning.)

Intellect, ego and mind together constitute the antaḥ-karaṇa (internal organ), or the material psyche, while the other indriya-s (powers) collectively are called the external organ. The internal organ as an inseparable unit is the principle of life (prāṇa). In cognition the internal organ’s activity follows upon that of the external, but they are continuously active, so their activity is also simultaneous. The external organ is strictly bound to the present tense, while the psyche is active in the past and future as well (memory, planning, and the grasping of timeless truths).

The material elements are derived from the gross, tamas-ic aspect of the ego, which yields what Sāṅkhya calls tanmātra-s (only-that, that is, unmixed). These in turn yield the elements (bhūta, mahābhūta). The elements are ether (ākāśa), air, fire, water and earth. The tanmātra-s seem to be uncompounded sensibilia; perhaps subtle elements or substances, each having only one sensible quality: sound, touch, visibility, taste and smell. The gross elements are probably fixed compounds of the tanmātra-s: ether has only sound, air also touch, fire is also visible, water has in addition taste and earth has all the five qualities.

Human beings are a compound of all these. At death we lose the body made up of the five gross elements; the rest (from intellect down to the tanmātra-s) make up the transmigrating entity, called liṅga or liṅga-śarīra (sign-body), often known in English translations as the “subtle body.” The puruṣa itself does not transmigrate; it only watches. Transmigration is compared to an actor putting on different clothes and taking up many roles; it is determined by the law of (efficient) cause and effect, known also as the law of karma (action).

The world, “from the creator god Brahmā down to a blade of glass” is just a compound of such embodied liṅga-śarīra-s. The gods are of eight kinds; animals are of five kinds – and humans, significantly, belongs to one group only (suggesting an egalitarianism with respect to humans). Of course, the gods of Sāṅkhya are not classical Judeo-Christian-Muslim God; they are just extra-long-lived, perhaps very powerful beings within the empirical world, themselves compounds of matter and soul.

5. Liberation

Because Prakṛti is essentially changing, nothing is constant in the material world: everything decays and meets its destruction in the end. Therefore as long as the transmigrating entity persists, the suffering of old age and death is unavoidable.

The only way to fight suffering is to leave the circle of transmigration (saṁsāra) for ever. This is the liberation of puruṣa, in Sāṅkhya, normally called kaivalya (isolation). It comes about through loosening the bond between puruṣa and Prakṛti. This bond was originally produced by the curiosity of the soul, and it is extremely strong because the ego identifies our selves with our empirical state: the body and the more subtle organs, including the material psyche. Although puruṣa is not actually bound by any external force, it is an enchanted observer that cannot take his eyes off from the performance.

As all cognition is performed by the intellect for the soul, it is also the intellect that can recognize the very subtle distinction between Prakṛti and puruṣa. But first the effect of the ego must be neutralized, and this is done by a special kid of meditational praxis. Step by step, starting from the lowest tattva-s, the material elements, and gradually reaching the intellect itself, the follower of Sāṅkhya must practice as follows: “this constituent is not me; it is not mine; I am not this.” When this has been fully interiorized with regard to all forms of Prakṛti, then arises the absolutely pure knowledge of the metaphysical solitude of puruṣa: it is kevala, (alone), without anything external-material belonging to it.

And as a dancer, after having performed, stops dancing, so does Prakṛti cease to perform for an individual puruṣa when its task is accomplished. She has always acted for thepuruṣa, and as he is no longer interested in her (“I have seen her”), she stops forever (“I have already been seen”)—the given subtle body gets dissolved into the root-Prakṛti. This happens only at death, for the gross body (like a potter’s wheel still turning although no longer impelled) due to causally determined karmic tendencies (saṁskāra-s) goes on to operate for a little while.

Puruṣa enters into liberation, forever. Although puruṣa and Prakṛti are physically as much in contact as before—both seem to be all-pervading in extension—there is no purpose of a new start: puruṣa has experienced all that it wanted.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Asiatische Studien / Études Asiatiques 53 (1999): 457–798.
    • Papers of an 1998 conference; allows a glimpse at the state of current researches.
  • Chakravarti, Pulinbihari: Origin and Development of the Sāmkhya System of Thought. Calcutta: Metropolitan Printing and Publishing House, 1951.
    • A detailed account giving due weight to the Yukti-dīpikā.
  • Chattopadhyaya, Debiprasad: Lokāyata. A Study in Ancient Indian Materialism. Delhi: People’s Publishing House, 1959.
    • A highly unorthodox approach utilizing anthropological and even archeological sources to understand the origins of philosophical thought.
  • Kumar, Shiv: Sāmkhya Thought in the Brahmanical Systems of Indian Philosophy. Delhi: Eastern Book Linkers, 1983.
    • Looks at Sāṅkhya tradition from the outside, especially as it appears in Nyāya and Vedānta.
  • Larson, Gerald James. Classical Sāmkhya. An Interpretation of its History and Meaning.Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1979.
    • The standard book on the Kārikā and a useful summary of its antecedents.
  • Larson, Gerald James, and Ram Shankar Bhattacharya, eds. Sāmkhya. A Dualist Tradition in Indian Philosophy. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1987. (Vol. IV. inEncyclopedia of Indian Philosophies.)
    • A good description of Sāṅkhya followed by summaries of practically all surviving works.

Author Information

Ferenc Ruzsa
Eötvös Loránd University

Madhyamaka Buddhist Philosophy

buddhaMadhyamaka and Yogācāra are the two main philosophical trajectories associated with the Mahāyāna stream of Buddhist thought. According to Tibetan doxographical literature, Madhyamaka represents the philosophically definitive expression of Buddhist doctrine. Stemming from the second-century writings of Nāgārjuna, Madhyamaka developed in the form of commentaries on his works. This style of development is characteristic of the basically scholastic character of the Indian philosophical tradition. The commentaries elaborated not only varying interpretations of Nāgārjuna’s philosophy but also different understandings of the philosophical tools that are appropriate to its advancement. Tibetan interpreters generally claim to take the seventh-century commentaries of Candrakīrti as authoritative, but Indian commentators subsequent to him were in fact more influential in the course of Indian philosophy. Madhyamaka also had considerable influence (though by way of a rather different set of texts) in East Asian Buddhism, where a characteristic interpretive concern has been to harmonize Madhyamaka and Yogācāra. Although perhaps most frequently characterized by modern interpreters as a Buddhist version of skepticism, Madhyamaka arguably develops metaphysical concerns. The logically elusive character of Madhyamaka arguments has fascinated and perplexed generations of scholars. This is surely appropriate with regard to a school whose principal term of art, “emptiness” (śūnyatā), reflects developments in Buddhist thought from the high scholasticism of Tibet to the enigmatic discourse of East Asian Zen.

Table of Contents

  1. Nāgārjuna and the Paradoxical “Perfection of Wisdom” Literature
  2. The Basic Philosophical Impulse
    1. The “Two Truths” in Buddhist Abhidharma
    2. The Interminability of Dependent Origination
    3. Ethics and the Charge of Nihilism
  3. The Question of Self-contradiction and the Possible Truth of Mādhyamika Claims
  4. Historical Development of Indian Schools of Interpretation
  5. More on the Svātantrika-Prāsaṅgika Difference: Madhyamaka and Buddhist Epistemology
  6. Madhyamaka in Tibet
  7. Madhyamaka in East Asia
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Nāgārjuna and the Paradoxical “Perfection of Wisdom” Literature

“Madhyamaka” is a Sanskrit word that simply means “middle way.” (The derivative form “Mādhyamika” literally means “of or relating to the middle,” and conventionally designates an adherent of the school, or qualifies some aspect of its thought.) Madhyamaka refers to the Indian Buddhist school of thought that develops in the form of commentaries on the works of Nāgārjuna, who flourished around 150 C.E. Nāgārjuna figures in the traditional accounts developed to authenticate the literature of the self-styled “Mahāyāna” stream of Buddhist thought. Arguing that sūtras known to have begun circulating only at the beginning of the first millennium could nevertheless represent the authentic teaching of the Buddha (buddhavacana), proponents of Mahāyāna invoked the characteristically Buddhist idea of “skill in means” (upāyakauśalya); they thus claimed that the Mahāyāna sūtras promulgate an advanced stage of the Buddha’s teaching such as would not have been appropriately taught to the earliest auditors of the Buddha, who, unprepared by the necessarily preparatory earlier teachings, might draw nihilistic conclusions from the sūtras. It is Nāgārjuna who is said first to have recovered and promulgated these sūtras, having retrieved the Prajñāpāramitā (“Perfection of Wisdom”) literature from the underwater kingdom of the “Nāgas,” or serpent kings.

Two texts generally represent the criteria for attributing authorship of a text to Nāgārjuna. So, this name conventionally refers to the person who wrote the Mūlamadhyamakakārikās (MMK, “Verses on the Firmly Fixed Middle Way”) and the Vigrahavyāvartanī (VV, “Turning Back Objections”). Both of these texts, but particularly the former, have occasioned a great deal of interest among Indologists and philosophers. This is not surprising, since the MMK is indeed a rich text. Stylistically lucid yet logically enigmatic, Nāgārjuna’s major work shares with the Prajñāpāramitā literature a characteristic air of paradox, which Madhyamaka’s critics see as evidence of nihilism if not of incoherence. We read in this text, for example, that “there is, on the part of saṃsāra, no difference at all from nirvāṇa” (MMK 25.19). The text’s first verse says “There do not exist, anywhere at all, any existents whatsoever, arisen either from themselves or from something else, either from both or altogether without cause.” (MMK 1.1)

2. The Basic Philosophical Impulse

a. The “Two Truths” in Buddhist Abhidharma

In styling the school that develops from Nāgārjuna’s works the “middle way” (an expression used by Nāgārjuna himself), proponents of Madhyamaka exploited a long-invoked Buddhist trope. Traditional accounts of the life of the Buddha typically characterize him as striking a “middle way” between the extravagance of the courtly life that had been available to him as a prince and the extreme asceticism he is said initially to have tried in his pursuit of transformative insight. Philosophically, the relevant extremes between which any Buddhist account of the person must steer are “eternalism” and “nihilism.” Eternalism (śāśvatavāda) is the view that there are enduring existents of which the self is an example. Nihilism (ucchedavāda) might be termed “eliminativism,” and denotes, for Buddhists, the view that actions (karma) have no ethical consequences, insofar as the agents of actions cannot be said to endure as the subjects who will experience their effects.

Given their characteristically Buddhist concern to refuse the existence of an ultimately existent “self,” it is the nihilism pole that Mādhyamikas must work hardest to avoid. Indeed, the concern to avoid charges of nihilism represents one of the most significant preoccupations of Mādhyamika philosophers. This concern has to be understood in terms of the traditionally Buddhist idea of “two truths,” or two levels of explanation or description: the familiar level of discourse that includes reference to the “conventionally existent” (saṃvṛtisat), and the level which makes reference only to what is “ultimately existent” (parmārthasat). Most schools of Buddhist philosophy can be understood in terms of the sense in which they deny the “ultimate” existence of the self, while affirming its “conventional” existence.

In its basically Ābhidharmika iterations (that is, in the ways elaborated in the earliest scholastic literature of Indian Buddhism, the so-called “Abhidharma”) this denial of the ultimate existence of the self is an idea that can be understood as comparable to a great deal of contemporary philosophical discussion. Philosophical projects in cognitive science can be said, for example, to turn on questions of how (or perhaps whether) to relate two levels of description: (1) the broadly intentional level of description that generally reflects the first-person, phenomenological perspective (and that is also reflected in ordinary language and interactions), and (2) the scientific level of description at which the real explanatory work is done. Similarly, the broadly Ābhidharmika trajectory of Buddhist philosophy has it that the two truths basically consist in two sets of existing things: the set of conventionally existent (saṃvṛtisat) things and the set of ultimately existent (parmārthasat) things. The “conventionally existent” comprises all reducible or supervenient phenomena (basically, all temporally enduring macro-objects); the “ultimately existent” represents the set of ontological primitives, which the Abhidharma literature calls “dharmas.” It is ultimately the case, then, that causal interactions among the dharmas exhaustively explain all conventional events.

The works of Nāgārjuna and his philosophical heirs are best understood as constitutively opposed to this understanding of the two truths. The foundational idea of Madhyamaka is that the set of ultimately existent things is an empty set – a point that Mādhyamikas characteristically promote by insisting on the emptiness (śūnyatā) not only of wholes such as persons, but also of the analytic categories (dharmas) to which these are reduced in Abhidharma literature. The works of Nāgārjuna and his commentators, then, typically comprise arguments to the effect that none of the analytic categories (dharmas) and concepts used to explain anything can be coherently formulated. More precisely, the argument is that no such categories can intrinsically provide any explanatory purchase on the phenomena they purportedly explain.

b. The Interminability of Dependent Origination

In proceeding this way, Mādhyamikas can be understood to think that the ontologizing impulse of Abhidharma compromises the most important insight of the Buddhist tradition – which is, on the Mādhyamika reading, that all existents are “dependently originated” (pratītyasamutpanna). (The cardinal doctrine of the “dependent origination” of all existents represents the flip-side of the Buddhist denial of a “self”; that is, the reason we do not have unitary and enduring selves just is that any moment of experience can be explained as having originated from innumerable causes, none of which can be specified as what we “really” are.) More precisely, Mādhyamikas can be said to have recognized that the ontological primitives posited by Abhidharma could have explanatory purchase only if they are posited as an exception to the rule that everything is dependently originated; that is, dependently originated existents could only be ultimately explained by something that does not itself require the same kind of explanation. But it is precisely the Mādhyamika point to emphasize that there is no exception to this rule; phenomena are dependently originated all the way down, and it is therefore impossible to specify precisely what it is upon which anything finally depends. Hence, there can be no set of “ultimately existent” things.

Mādhyamika arguments to this effect typically work by showing that all explanatory categories turn out to be constitutively dependent upon the phenomena they purportedly explain – as, for example, notions such as “fire” and “fuel,” “action” and “agent,” or “cause” and “effect” are intelligible only relative to one another. To show the constitutively relative (that is, dependent) character of all such explanatory categories and phenomena is effectively to make the one point that Mādhyamikas are most concerned to make: that insofar as there is nothing that is not dependently originated, there is therefore nothing that is not “empty” (śūnya). (This paraphrases MMK 24.19, which says: “Since there is no dharma whatsoever that is not dependently originated, therefore there is no dharma whatsoever that is not empty.”)

In thus characterizing all categories and all existents as finally “empty,” what Mādhyamikas mean is that they are empty of what we may translate as “essence” (svabhāva). This is true just insofar as they exist not “essentially” (svabhāvena), but only relatively – that is, only in relation to other existents and categories. In arguing thus, Mādhyamikas – typifying characteristically Sanskritic styles of argumentation, in which the terms and analyses of the Sanskrit grammarians figure prominently – exploit the etymology of the word svabhāva. Although the semantic range of this Sanskrit word typically comprises ideas like “defining characteristic” or “identity,” the word can etymologically be read as referring to something “existent” (bhāva) “by itself” (sva-). Among the recently debated exegetical questions concerning Madhyamaka has been whether important Mādhyamika arguments centrally involve an equivocation on this term, unwarrantedly equating “identity” with “causally independent existence.”

c. Ethics and the Charge of Nihilism

It is not only in their characteristically Buddhist denial of a really existent “self,” but also in their more radical (and rhetorically charged) emphasis on the universally obtaining character of emptiness that Mādhyamikas recurrently elicited charges of nihilism – a charge as often issuing from proponents of other Buddhist schools as from the various Brahmanical schools of Indian philosophy. One of the most prominently recurrent sorts of exchange in Nāgārjuna’s MMK involves an interlocutor’s presupposing that by ‘emptiness’ Mādhyamikas must mean non-existence. For example, the twenty-fourth chapter of the MMK begins with the challenge of an imagined interlocutor (this one clearly another Buddhist): “If all this is empty, then there’s neither production nor destruction; it follows, for you, that the Four Noble Truths don’t exist.” (MMK 24.1) The rejoinder (at MMK 24.20): it is in fact only because everything is empty – which just is to say, dependently originated – that the Four Noble Truths can obtain. That is, the fact that existents only come into being in mutual dependence upon one another (and are therefore “empty” of an essence) is all that makes it possible for (what is the first Noble Truth) suffering to arise – and thus having arisen as a contingent and dependent phenomenon, to be caused to cease (the third Noble Truth). If, in contrast, suffering were the “natural” or “essential” state of affairs (svabhāva), this would (as Nāgārjuna sees it) mean that it could not be interrupted, and the cultivation of the entire Buddhist path would be impossible.

It is particularly important for the proponent of Madhyamaka to foreclose the possibility of a nihilist reading of claims regarding emptiness insofar as it is finally the ethical and soteriological project of Buddhist practice that is thought to be at stake. In this regard, the characteristically Mādhyamika conviction is that it is in fact the Ābhidharmika iteration of the Buddhist project (and not Mādhyamika claims regarding emptiness) that is “nihilist.” This is because on the characteristically Ābhidharmika understanding of the “two truths,” the world as “conventionally” described – as consisting, for example, in suffering persons whose plight should elicit compassionate dedication to the Buddhist path – is finally altogether superseded by the privileged level of description constitutively developed in the Abhidharma literature. The characteristically Ābhidharmika enumeration of the dharmas that putatively constitute the set of “ultimately existent” things amounts to the specification of what “really” exists instead of the self. If, in contrast, it is recognized that no such privileged level of description can coherently be elaborated – that, in other words, there is no set of ontological primitives in terms of which the only real explanatory work can be done, and that in that sense there is nothing “more real” than the world as conventionally described – then the world is finally to be accepted as irreducibly “conventional,” and the persons therein can hence be regarded as ethical agents who are not finally eliminable in terms of the analytic categories of Abhidharma.

3. The Question of Self-contradiction and the Possible Truth of Mādhyamika Claims

But this understanding also raises what are surely the most philosophically complex and interesting problems in understanding Madhyamaka: if the constitutive claim of Madhyamaka is to be taken as one to the effect that the ultimate truth is that there is (in the sense described) no “ultimate truth,” it is easy to ask: What is the status of this claim itself? It would seem open to the Mādhyamika only to allow that it is itself conventionally true – but is that not just to say that one may as well choose not to adopt this particular “convention”? The problem, then, is whether characteristically Mādhyamika claims are, to the extent they are true, performatively self-contradictory or self-referentially incoherent. This problem was well understood (if not always clearly addressed) by proponents of Madhyamaka, and is very much in play in characteristically Mādhyamika claims to the effect that “emptiness” itself is empty – that, in other words, the Mādhyamika analysis is to be applied not only to all existents, but also to this analysis thereof.

To say as much is the only way consistently to affirm the universal scope of claims regarding emptiness; for there would clearly be a performative self-contradiction in claiming that “all existents are empty-cum-dependently-originated,” while yet allowing that claim itself to stand as an exception – as itself having, that is, the kind of “ultimately” privileged explanatory purchase that is denied with respect to all other analyses. But it is a complex matter whether the Mādhyamika can, in avoiding this route to self-contradiction, affirm the “emptiness of emptiness” without thereby depriving his own claim of any purchase. It is particularly at this point, then, that there is an air of paradox going to the heart of Mādhyamika discourse, finding expression in, for example, apparent claims to the effect that no claim is being made; hence, such quintessentially Mādhyamika tropes as the claim that Madhyamaka advances no philosophical “thesis” (pratijñā), and that “emptiness” does not reflect any specific “view” (dṛṣṭi).

Such rhetoric characteristically expresses what is surely the central interpretive and philosophical issue at stake in understanding Madhyamaka, and it is not surprising, in this regard, that Madhyamaka should often have been interpreted by modern scholars as having affinities with Hellenistic skepticism. Another line of interpretation (often inflected in recent years by appeal to Wittgenstein, or to various poststructuralist thinkers) has it that Mādhyamika claims not to be making any claim should be taken seriously as expressing a basically “therapeutic” sort of stance – one meant performatively to undermine (in something like the same way, perhaps, as in the Zen discourse of koans) soteriologically counter-productive profusions of discursive thought. This line of interpretation can be warranted by characteristically Mādhyamika talk about the elimination of prapañca (often translated as conceptual “proliferation”), and by paeans to the “ultimate truth” as something finally ineffable.

Such readings are, however, difficult to reconcile with what many Tibetan interpreters (perhaps notwithstanding such rhetoric) took to be the constitutively Mādhyamika claim: namely, that “emptiness” just means (and is the only way consistently to describe) “dependent origination.” If it is said, for example, that there is nothing “non-empty” just insofar as there is nothing that is not dependently originated (here again, paraphrasing MMK 24.19), that would seem to preclude, at least, the truth of statements (made, e.g., by certain theists) to the effect that there is something (e.g., God) that is necessarily (or otherwise not dependently) existent. If the Mādhyamika statement does not rule out the truth of such statements, then it would be difficult to understand it as meaning anything (although perhaps the radically “therapeutic” interpreter of Madhyamaka will here bite the bullet and, well, argue that it is the very idea of “meaning” anything that is to be jettisoned); but to say that the Mādhyamika claim contradicts a truth-claim proffered by some theists just is to say that the former claim, too, is proposed as true. Recognizing that, one might urge that the universal scope of the Mādhyamika claim entails that there is an important sense in which Madhyamaka is constitutively anti-skeptical – that, indeed, Mādhyamika arguments advance a finally metaphysical point. For example, one could argue that what is at stake here is the properly transcendental fact that emptiness (understood as the fact that things exist only interdependently) is a condition of the possibility of any existents and of any analysis thereof.

The question for the proponent of such a line of interpretation then becomes: If “the ultimate truth is that there is no ultimate truth,” is it possible to think of this claim as itself ultimately true? It is important to note, in this regard, that while Mādhyamikas characteristically (indeed, constitutively) eschew the Ābhidharmika idea that “ultimate truth” involves a domain of enumerable existents regarding which claims are to be judged for their adequacy, Madhyamaka nevertheless makes abundant reference to the “ultimate truth.” One way to make sense of this is to attribute to Madhyamaka a basically deflationist account of truth – that is, one according to which calling a claim “true” is to be explained not as predicating a metaphysical property (such as “correspondence” with “ultimately existent” things) of it, but simply as committing oneself to it. On such a view, to the extent that the (Ābhidharmika) idea of “ultimate truth” has been shown incoherent, all that remains is the level of “truth” that is characterized by common-sense realism.

This interpretation has the advantage of fitting quite well with the kind of traditional doxographical accounts (influentially developed, early on, by the Indian Mādhyamika Bhāvaviveka) that figure prominently in the Tibetan monastic curriculum. These represent the schools of Indian Buddhist philosophy in an ascending hierarchy of progressively more refined views, the understanding of each of which requires having rightly understood its predecessors. On such an account, Madhyamaka, though framed as an uncompromising critique of Ābhidharmika Buddhism, nevertheless depends on the latter: if the naive realism of non-Buddhas consists in thinking there is something more real (paradigmatically, selves) underlying our experience of the world, the realization of the “deflated” realism of Madhyamaka differs from that (and is therefore transformative) only insofar as one has first pursued to its limits the kind of reductionist exercise that shows how unstable is our naive self-grasping. If one has not first entertained the Ābhidharmika’s reductionist approach, then there would be no difference between the common-sense realism of the Mādhyamika, and that of ordinary ignorant persons. But if one realizes the necessary failure of the reductionist’s privileged level of description only after having entertained it, the resultant “realism” will be inflected by the transformative understanding that our selves are “real” in the only sense in which anything (even the purportedly “ultimate” existents that are dharmas) can be real – that is, relatively, dependently.

Another strategy (perhaps not mutually exclusive of the foregoing) is to emphasize that what Mādhyamikas refute, under the heading of “ultimate truth,” is simply the idea of a privileged level of description (in the form of a set of enumerable ontological primitives) – but that the abstract fact of there being no such set is itself really (indeed metaphysically) true. In that case, the salient point is just that the truth of the Mādhyamika claim does not consist in its reference to – its correspondence with – a specifiable domain of objects. This reconstruction can be coupled with an understanding of Mādhyamika arguments as basically transcendental arguments. Such an interpretation makes good sense, at least, of what is surely one of the most prominently recurrent rhetorical strategies of Nāgārjuna; so, Nāgārjuna can be understood to argue that his various interlocutors’ objections are incoherent just insofar as these very objections presuppose the truth of Nāgārjuna’s claims. Emptiness is not only not mutually exclusive of the Four Noble Truths – it is a condition of the possibility thereof. Emptiness is, moreover, a condition of the possibility even of an opponent’s denying this; for any analysis or denial at all (indeed, any cognitive act) consists, in the first instance, in some relation.

Perhaps more suggestively, such an interpretation can also help map the finally ethical concerns of Madhyamaka onto some contemporary arguments concerning reductionist accounts of the person. In this regard, it was noted that the Ābhidharmika trajectory of Buddhist philosophy can be understood as analogous to various projects in cognitive science. In the idiom of the latter, then, it could be said that the Ābhidharmika idea is that there is, “conventionally,” an intentional level of description (variously characterized as the “common-sense” view, “folk psychology,” etc.); and, “ultimately,” a scientific level of description, comprising the ontological primitives that alone are said “really” to exist, and exhaustively to explain the former level. One line of critique developed against such approaches is to argue that anyone offering an exhaustively “impersonal,” non-intentional description of (what we think of as) persons can be shown necessarily to presuppose precisely the personal, intentional level of description that is purportedly explained. Similarly, the upshot of the Mādhyamika argument that the world is (as expressed above) “irreducibly conventional” is that the level of description at which “persons” are in play cannot coherently be thought to be eliminable. Many of the commentator Candrakīrti’s arguments can be said, without too great a stretch, to make something like this point, recurrently urging against various interlocutors that any purported attempt to explain the conventional world (in terms that, if the proposed account is to have any explanatory purchase, must not themselves be conventional) inevitably founders on the unavoidability of presupposing the conventional senses of words.

Suffice it to say that the philosophical and exegetical issues in play here are highly complex, and that almost any attempt at understanding the texts of Nāgārjuna and his commentators is likely to require a considerable effort of rational reconstruction – which perhaps explains the enduring appeal of this trajectory of thought.

4. Historical Development of Indian Schools of Interpretation

The Indian Buddhist tradition attests two broad streams in the interpretation of Nāgārjuna’s thought, corresponding roughly to what later Tibetan interpreters would refer to as the “Prāsaṅgika” and “Svātantrika” accounts of Madhyamaka. Interpreters of the former sort are so-called because of their view that Madhyamaka should be advanced only by reducing an opponent’s arguments to absurdity. Nāgārjuna is, on this view, to be interpreted as showing only the unwanted consequences (“prasaṅga”) entailed by his opponents’ claims, and not as defending any philosophical “thesis” (pratijñā) of his own. Svātantrikas, in contrast, are so-called because of their characteristic view that Nāgārjuna’s verses require restatement as formally valid inferences (svatantra-anumāna) whose conclusions are to be affirmed. Much contemporary debate has concerned whether these divergent lines of interpretation reflect only differing dialectical strategies, or whether (as influential Tibetan proponents of the distinction claim) they involve significantly different ontological presuppositions. Although the characterizations of these two trajectories of interpretation are not without basis in the antecedent Indian texts, this doxographic lens is of interest partly for what it can tell us about some characteristically Tibetan preoccupations (and about the influence of certain schools of Tibetan Buddhist philosophy on the contemporary interpretation of Indian Buddhist thought).

Names traditionally associated with the “Prāsaṅgika” stream of interpretation include Āryadeva, who is traditionally regarded as Nāgārjuna’s direct disciple (making his date close to Nāgārjuna’s), and who wrote the Catuḥśataka (“400 Verses”) – a text that is particularly important insofar as the divergent interpretations of it by the commentators Dharmapāla (530-561) and Candrakīrti are sometimes taken to herald a decisive split between Madhyamaka and Yogācāra (see Tillemans 1990); Buddhapālita (fl. c. 500), the author of a complete commentary (now extant only in Tibetan translation) on the MMK; and Candrakīrti (c. 600-650), whose Prasannapadā (“Clear Words”) – the only commentary on the MMK known to be extant in Sanskrit – preserves the Sanskrit text of Nāgārjuna’s verse text.

Candrakīrti is also the author of, among other works, the Madhyamakāvatāra (“Introduction to Madhyamaka”), an independent work (with auto-commentary) that represents the principal text for the “Madhyamaka” component of many Tibetan monastic curricula. This work is structured on the model of texts like the Daśabhūmika Sūtra, with chapters corresponding to that text’s progression in a bodhisattva’s mastery of ten “perfections” (pāramitā). The sixth chapter (fittingly corresponding to prajñāpāramitā, the “perfection of wisdom”) is by far the longest and the most philosophically rich, comprising, inter alia, important Mādhyamika critiques of Yogācāra.

Significant later Prāsaṅgikas include Śāntideva (fl. early eighth century), the author of the Bodhicaryāvatāra (“Introduction to the Conduct of Awakening”), an eloquent and popular text whose difficult ninth chapter (helpfully elaborated by the commentary of Prajñākaramati, who likely flourished in the tenth century) comprises important Mādhyamika arguments; and Dīpaṃkaraśrījñāna (982-1054; more popularly known as “Atiśa”), who figured prominently in the transmission of Indian Buddhism to Tibet, where he lived when he wrote the Bodhipathapradīpa (“A Lamp for the Path to Awakening”).

The “Svātantrika” line of interpretation originates with Bhāvaviveka (c. 500-570; his name is also reported as “Bhāviveka,” and he is often referred to as “Bhavya”), the author not only of a commentary on the MMK – the Prajñāpradīpa, now extant only in Tibetan and Chinese translations – but also of an independent work, the Madhyamakahṛdayakārikās, “Verses on the Heart of Madhyamaka,” with an auto-commentary entitled Tarkajvāla (“Blaze of Logic”). Other significant exponents of this line of thought include Jñānagarbha (fl. early eighth century), who is traditionally regarded as the teacher of Śāntarakṣita (725-788). The latter is the author of the Madhyamakālaṃkāra (“Ornament of Madhyamaka”), a relatively concise text elaborating Śāntarakṣita’s characteristic synthesis of Madhyamaka and Yogācāra. Śāntarakṣita is perhaps more widely known for the Tattvasaṃgraha (“Summa of Quiddities”), a massive treatise that takes on a huge range of Indian philosophical doctrines – and that quotes extensively from Brahmanical and other Buddhist philosophers, making it an important source of fragments from Indian works that do not, like the Tattvasaṃgraha, survive in Sanskrit.

The latter text is (like the Madhyamakālaṃkāra) helpfully illuminated by a commentary (the Tattvasaṃgrahapañjikā) by Śāntarakṣita’s student and disciple Kamalaśīla (c.740-795). The latter traveled with his teacher to Tibet, where both thinkers figure prominently in the founding events of Tibetan Buddhist thought. Kamalaśīla is, for example, traditionally regarded by Tibetans as having advocated the “gradualist” position in a famous debate at the bSam-yas monastery with a Chinese exponent of the Ch’an (“Zen”) understanding of “sudden enlightenment.” It was Kamalaśīla’s victory in this debate that established the “gradualist” understanding as at least officially normative for most schools of Tibetan Buddhism; while the occurrence of the debate itself may be apocryphal, such a position is surely reflected in Kamalaśīla’s three Bhāvanākrama (“stages of cultivation”) texts, written in Tibet.

5. More on the Svātantrika-Prāsaṅgika Difference: Madhyamaka and Buddhist Epistemology

As indicated, the so-called Svātantrika trajectory of Madhyamaka constitutively involves recourse to the tools of formal logic and inference, evincing a characteristic concern to restate Nāgārjuna’s arguments as formally valid inferences. More generally, it can be said that this approach is informed by Bhāvaviveka’s use of the logic and epistemology of Dignāga (c. 480-540), who influentially appealed to the idiom of pramāṇavidyā (the “discipline of logic and epistemology”) in advancing the Buddhist position – and who was, indeed, among the most important figures in developing the broadly Sanskritic conceptual vocabulary that would predominate in the subsequent course of Indian philosophy. Similarly, such later Svātantrikas as Śāntarakṣita were informed by the project of Dignāga’s influential expositor Dharmakīrti (c. 600-660), and figures such as Dharmakīrti and Śāntarakṣita would be of decisive importance for the remaining course of the Indian Buddhist philosophical tradition’s life. (Candrakīrti, in contrast, would exercise little influence in India, though he re-emerges with the Tibetan tradition’s interest in him.)

The dispute between these lines of interpretation crystallizes around the figures of Buddhapālita, Bhāvaviveka, and Candrakīrti – and can be seen, in particular, in their respective elaborations of Nāgārjuna’s MMK 1.1 (“There do not exist, anywhere at all, any existents whatsoever, arisen either from themselves or from something else, either from both or altogether without cause”). This verse basically deploys a standard tool in the Mādhyamika arsenal: the “tetralemma” (catuṣkoṭi), a four-fold statement that is meant to identify all possible relations between any category and its putative explananda (e.g., “the same,” “different,” “both the same and different,” “neither the same nor different”) – with the standard Mādhyamika denial of all four horns of the tetralemma meant as an exhaustive refutation of the efficacy and coherence of the category in question. (One modern interpretive discussion concerns whether or not this apparent violation of bivalent logic shows Mādhyamikas to have presupposed a non-standard sort of logic.)

Buddhapālita’s “prāsaṅgika” commentary on this verse does nothing more than make clear (what he takes to be) the absurd consequences that would be entailed by affirming any one of the positions here rejected. For example, the view that existents originate intrinsically – a position traditionally understood to express the Indian Sāṃkhya school’s characteristic view that effects are always latent within their causes – is to be denied “since there would be no point in the arising of already existent things.” That is, an affirmation of the causation of something from itself entails that the thing in question already exists, in which case, its coming-into-being could not be thought to require causal explanation.

In his commentary on the MMK, Bhāvaviveka then specifically took Buddhapālita to task, urging that Buddhapālita’s elaboration of the argument was unreasonable “because no reason and no example are given and because faults stated by the opponent are not answered” – which is to say, because the recognized terms of a formally stated inference (as that had been thematized by Sanskritic philosophers such as Dignāga) were not present. In contrast, then, to Buddhapālita, Bhāvaviveka offers a formally valid statement of the reasoning behind Nāgārjuna’s denial of the first horn of the verse’s tetralemma: “[Thesis:] It is certain that the inner sense fields (āyatanas) do not ultimately originate from themselves; [Reason:] because they exist [already], [Example:] like consciousness.” Among the characteristic features of Bhāvaviveka’s restatement here is his making explicit the qualifier “ultimately” (or “essentially,” svabhāvataḥ); that is, Nāgārjuna is here said to deny only that something is the case essentially or ultimately. While the first horn of this tetralemma (“existents are arisen from themselves”) perhaps requires no such qualification in order for its denial to be intelligible, many interpreters would agree that such a qualification must be added particularly in order for the denial of the second (which concerns that origination of things from other existents) to make any sense; for it is surely counter-intuitive to think that we cannot even conventionally speak of the origination of existents from one another. A great many of Nāgārjuna’s prima facie counter-intuitive refutations can be understood to make more sense if they are qualified as concerning what is “ultimately” or “essentially” the case (and not taken simpliciter).

A considerable portion of the first chapter of Candrakīrti’s Prasannapadā is then given over to defending Buddhapālita’s as the right way to proceed, and to criticizing Bhāvaviveka’s interpretive procedure as misguided. How, then, are we to make sense, without Bhāvaviveka’s characteristic qualification, of Nāgārjuna’s denial of the second horn of the tetralemma – of his denial, that is, that things originate from other existents? On Candrakīrti’s reading (which follows Buddhapālita’s), the absurdity that would be entailed by thinking otherwise would be that a sprout could just as well be produced from the coals of a fire as from a seed; and, conversely, if a sprout cannot be produced from the coals of a fire, it cannot be said to be produced from a seed, either. Candrakīrti’s argument here is usefully understood as involving a priori (as contra a posteriori) analysis; that is, the argument short-circuits any appeal to what we experience to be the case, instead analyzing only the concepts presupposed in how we explain experience – and the point is to reduce to absurdity any argument that presupposes the independence of such concepts (that presupposes, in other words, that any such concepts might afford a privileged perspective on what there is). Read this way, the argument turns simply on the definition of “other,” and the point is that the general concept of “otherness” leaves us with no principled way to know which other things are relevantly connected to the thing whose arising we seek to explain, and we are left to suppose that anything that is “other” than the latter (even the coals of a fire) could give rise to it.

Although many Tibetan exegetes were (as noted) inclined to see the dispute here as turning on subtle ontological presuppositions, this can be hard to glean from the Indian texts upon which the dispute is based. The characteristically Svātantrika appeal to the idiom of logic and epistemology can, however, be understood as meant to address what are real philosophical problems in the Mādhyamika project as that is understood by Candrakīrti – just as Candrakīrti, for his part, can be understood as having philosophically principled reasons for refusing the epistemological tools characteristically deployed by Bhāvaviveka and his heirs. What is at issue here is, once again, the question of how we are to regard the “conventionally” described world once the idea that there can be an “ultimately” true description thereof has been jettisoned. Nāgārjuna himself had emphasized the importance of some kind of relation in this regard, saying, for example, that “without relying on convention, the ultimate is not taught; without having understood the ultimate, nirvāṇa is not apprehended” (MMK 24.10). In other words, the (relative) reality of the conventionally described world is a condition of the possibility of our coming to understand what is ultimately the case; but if what is understood thereby is in fact that there is nothing “more real” than the conventionally described world – that, e.g., there are no ontological primitives that are not themselves subject to the conditions that obtain in the world – then it might be thought that, as it were, “anything goes.”

The philosophical worry, then, is that if Mādhyamika arguments are not understood in something like the way that Svātantrikas propose, Madhyamaka could degenerate into a thoroughgoing and pernicious conventionalism. The broadly Svātantrika line of interpretation attempts to address this worry by arguing that even if all discourse (including that of the Mādhyamika) perforce takes place at the “conventional” level, it is nevertheless the case that some “conventions” are more nearly true than others – and that the epistemological tools developed by Dignāga and Dharmakīrti give us the resources to sort these out. The Svātantrika Jñānagarbha (followed, in this regard, by his student Śāntarakṣita) emphasized that we can distinguish between “true convention” (tathya-saṃvṛti) and “false convention” (mithyā-saṃvṛti).

In his refusal of the characteristically “Svātantrika” use of the conceptual tools of Buddhist epistemology, Candrakīrti need not be understood as conceding simply that anything goes. Candrakīrti’s point, rather, would seem to be to emphasize that there can be no explanatory categories that do not themselves exhibit the same characteristics (chiefly, the fact of being dependently originated) already on display in the conventionally described world; and any constitutively analytic sort of reasoning (such as that exemplified by the discourse of epistemology) just is a search for something beyond what is already given in conventional discourse. What is “conventionally” true, then, is (by definition) just our conventions – and any demand for some account or explanation of these could be thought to provide some purchase only to the extent that what is demanded is something that is not itself “conventional.” But there cannot be any such discourse, any more than there can be an existent that is not dependently originated; the two claims are related insofar as all that could count as a discursively exhaustive explanation would be one that adduces something that is not itself subject to the constraints that it explains – which is to say, something not dependently originated. Although this may represent an adequate reconstruction of his position, Candrakīrti’s emphasis on the definitively “non-analytic” character of conventional discourse can, nevertheless, reasonably be thought to leave his project vulnerable to charges of incoherence, and it can be seen that the issues in dispute between Svātantrikas and Prāsaṅgika are the same paradoxes that bedevil Madhyamaka more generally.

6. Madhyamaka in Tibet

Indian Madhyamaka figures decisively in most of the Tibetan schools of Buddhist philosophy, which tend to agree in judging Madhyamaka to represent the pinnacle of Buddhist thought. There are, however, interesting historical and philosophical developments that greatly complicate this picture. For example, while the scholastic traditions of Indian Buddhist philosophy were first introduced to Tibet by the “Svātantrika” Mādhyamikas Śāntarakṣita and Kamalaśīla, many schools of Tibetan Buddhism nevertheless claim Candrakīrti’s (“Prāsaṅgika”) interpretation as authoritative – a fact partly owing, perhaps, to the influence of Atiśa in the so-called “second dissemination” of Indian Buddhism to Tibet (that is, the period during which Indian Buddhism was decisively established in Tibet, and during which the systematic translation of Indian Buddhist texts into Tibetan was brought to fruition). However, the characteristically Tibetan emphasis on “Vajrayāna” (that is, tantric) forms of practice arguably promotes greater recourse to the idiom of Yogācāra than would be encouraged by Candrakīrti. In addition, there are, as noted, philosophical reasons for qualifying some of Candrakīrti’s positions. Hence, even those Tibetan schools (such as the dGe-lugs) that most forcefully assert the authoritative character of “Prāsaṅgika” Madhyamaka tend, for example, to support their interpretation with significant studies in the Buddhist epistemological tradition – a move, as noted, definitively characteristic of the “Svātantrika” approach.

The attempt thus to wed Madhyamaka to the philosophical project of Dignāga and Dharmakīrti is worth appreciating not only because it is intrinsically interesting, but because, particularly in the United States in the latter part of the 20th century, a great many modern interpreters of Indian Madhyamaka have been influenced by characteristically Tibetan appropriations of this tradition. While this has arguably led to some distortions in the exegesis particularly of Candrakīrti’s texts, there is much to recommend the Tibetans’ systematic (as opposed to historical) presentation of Madhyamaka in relation to the other schools of Indian Buddhist philosophy. As indicated, a distinctive feature of characteristically Tibetan presentations of Buddhist philosophy is the use of doxographical digests elaborating what are called “established conclusions” (grub mtha’; this translates the Sanskrit siddhānta).

On this model, the various schools of Indian Buddhist philosophy (principally consisting, according to such presentations, in the two “Ābhidharmika” schools of the Vaibhāṣikas and Sautrāntikas, and the two “Mahāyāna” schools of Yogācāra and Madhyamaka) are represented in an ascending hierarchy of progressively more refined positions, the proper understanding of each of which requires understanding its predecessors. Ascent through the hierarchy is characterized, most basically, by the progressive elimination of ontological commitments: the two Ābhidharmika schools divide over the question of what are to be admitted as “dharmas” qualifying for inclusion in a final ontology; Yogācāra further pares down this list to nothing but mental events; the “Svātantrika” Mādhyamikas are represented as retaining only the vestigial ontological commitments that are thought to be entailed by their characteristic deference to the dialectical tools of epistemology; until, with the “Prāsaṅgika” iteration of Madhyamaka, we arrive at the school of thought for which the set of “ultimately existent” (paramārthasat) phenomena is an empty set.

The effect of this is to throw our attention back to the only “set” of existents with any remaining content: the conventionally described world, now understood as ineliminable. Hence, on this view, there is the avoidance of (what Mādhyamikas are always trying to eschew) the extreme of nihilism or “eliminativism” (ucchedavāda); but there is also the (constitutively Buddhist) avoidance of the extreme of “eternalism,” insofar as the effect of cultivating the Mādhyamika insight only as the culminating stage in a progression is (it is claimed) to have driven home the realization that the self exists (like everything “conventional”) only relatively or dependently. Once the project of a privileged level of description has been abandoned, the “common-sense realism” that remains can be seen to differ from that of the unenlightened “by virtue of its being adopted in full cognizance of the progression through the intervening stages” (Siderits 2003, 185).

The same insight is reflected in the basic monastic curriculum of dGe-lugs-pa monasteries, which is structured around five topics defined by representative Indian texts: The Vinaya, or Buddhist monastic code, as represented by the Vinaya Sūtra of Guṇaprabha; Abhidharma, as represented by the Abhidharmakośa of Vasubandhu; logic and epistemology, as represented by the Pramāṇavārttika of Dharmakīrti; Madhyamaka, as represented by Candrakīrti’s Madhyamakāvatāra; and the stages on the path to enlightenment, as represented by the Abhisamayālaṃkāra attributed to Maitreya. In this way, the study of the Madhyamaka tradition of Buddhist philosophy comes only in the context of an overarching education in a complete Buddhist world-view, such that characteristically Mādhyamika teachings concerning “emptiness” are – like the Prajñāpāramitā Sūtras whose retrieval by Nāgārjuna was thought to introduce Mahāyāna as representing the Buddha’s definitive teaching – made intelligible by the necessarily propaedeutic earlier teachings. Above all, it is the finally ethical character of Mādhyamika thought that is encouraged by this pedagogical system; for the characteristically Mādhyamika claim that “all dharmas are empty” – that, in other words, Abhidharma’s reductionist account of the person cannot finally be made coherent – cannot be understood as nihilistic if it has been made clear that the upshot of it is to return our attention to the irreducibly conventional world in which persons live and suffer.

Tibetan tradition preserves, however, not only a model for the integration of Madhyamaka philosophy into a structured set of transformative religious practices, but also a great deal of innovative and sophisticated philosophical elaboration of Mādhyamika thought. For example, the prolific scholar Tsong-kha-pa (1357-1419) – originator of the influential reformist school that would style itself the “dGe-lugs” (“virtuous way”) – did much to integrate the Prāsaṅgika Madhyamaka of Candrakīrti with the understanding and teaching of Buddhist epistemology stemming from Dharmakīrti. Tsong-kha-pa’s works (such as the massive Lam rim chen mo, “Great [treatise on] the Stages of the Path”) also bring considerable sophistication to bear on the question of how Madhyamaka ought to be understood in relation to Yogācāra. Critics of Tsong-kha-pa – such as, notably, the Sa-skya-pa scholar Go-ram-pa bSod-nams seng-ge (1429-1489) – stridently condemned his confidence that the discourse of epistemology could bring Mādhyamika analysis into contact with ultimate reality. On Go-ram-pa’s reading, such confidence amounts to the claim that the discursive thought that understands “ultimate truth” is itself ultimately true – which is to confuse the (necessarily conventional) activity of thinking about ultimate truth with what it is that such thought is about. Go-ram-pa claims that Tsong-kha-pa’s account of Madhyamaka entails the nihilistic conclusion that what is ultimately true is simply what is conventionally true. This Tibetan debate, then, recognizably addresses the perennially vexed issues that go to the heart of Madhyamaka: those concerning how we are to understand the relation between ultimate and conventional truth, in the context of a claim to the effect that “the ultimate truth is that there is no ultimate truth.”

7. Madhyamaka in East Asia

It is frequently observed that while Indo-Tibetan schools of Buddhist philosophy characteristically developed around the systematic treatises (śāstras) of historical thinkers like Nāgārjuna and Dignāga, Chinese Buddhist philosophy instead centers on (and its schools are largely defined by) the interpretation of particular Buddhist sūtras. Whatever truth there may be in this, it is certainly the case that a great deal of systematic Indian Buddhist philosophy from the mature scholastic phase of the tradition (roughly, from the sixth century on) was never translated into Chinese. Although the texts of (say) Nāgārjuna, Vasubandhu, and Dignāga are available in Chinese translation, the Chinese canon does not include the works of such thinkers as Candrakīrti, Dharmakīrti, or Śāntarakṣita – the later Mādhyamikas and epistemologists whose works decisively shaped Indo-Tibetan traditions of interpretation. Accordingly, the development of Madhyamaka in China centers on a somewhat different group of texts – all of them translated by the great translator Kumārajīva (350-409), whose efforts figure prominently in the Chinese reception of Madhyamaka. So, the Chinese analogue of the Indian Madhyamaka school was originally styled San-lun, the “Three Śāstra” school, so called for its reliance upon three of Kumārajīva’s translations. Only one of these (the MMK, here called Chung lun, “Madhyamakaśāstra”; Taishō 1564) has an extant Sanskrit antecedent. The other two – the Dvādaśanikāyaśāstra (Shih erh men lun, Taishō 1568), attributed to Nāgārjuna, and the Śata[ka]śāstra (Pai lun, Taishō 1569), attributed to Āryadeva – are extant neither in Sanskrit nor in Tibetan translation.

It was, however, arguably another treatise attributed to Nāgārjuna (and also “translated” by Kumārajīva) that was ultimately to have greater influence on East Asian interpretations of Madhyamaka: the Ta-chih-tu lun, or *Mahāprajñāpāramitopadeśa Śāstra (“Treatise which is a Teaching on the Great Perfection of Wisdom [Sūtra]”). This text – a massive summa of Buddhist doctrine, comparable in scope to the *Vijñaptimātratāsiddhi (which is ostensibly a digest and compilation of several Indian commentaries on one of the works by Vasubandhu that is foundational for Yogācāra) – is extant in no other translation than Kumārajīva’s, and comprises a great deal of material that is not easily reconciled with what is taught in Nāgārjuna’s MMK. However, despite the scholarly consensus to the effect that this text is not authentically attributed to Nāgārjuna, East Asian authors citing Nāgārjuna tend most frequently to cite Kumārajīva’s text (and not the MMK). The reasons for this are, along with one of the salient features of characteristically East Asian interpretations of Nāgārjuna, reflected in a comment by the Japanese scholar Junjirō Takakusu, who observed that while such Mādhyamika texts as the MMK are “much inclined to be negativistic idealism,” in the Ta-chih-tu lun “we see that [Nāgārjuna] establishes his monistic view much more affirmatively than in any other text” (Takakusu 1949: 100).

Takakusu’s assessment of the MMK as “negativistic” arguably relates to the ways in which characteristically East Asian interpretations of Madhyamaka have been (not surprisingly) influenced by the vicissitudes of Chinese translations from Sanskrit. For example, it has been noted (by, e.g., Swanson 1989: 14) that Chinese terms centrally associated with the two truths – yu (“existence” or “being”) and wu (“non-existence” or non-being”), identified, respectively, with saṃvṛtisatya (conventional truth) and paramārthasatya (ultimate truth) – had strongly ontological implications that can alter the sense of characteristically Mādhyamika claims (originally stated in Sanskrit) when those were translated into Chinese. In particular, the ontologically “negative” sense of the term wu has arguably had the effect of recommending that Mādhyamika claims regarding emptiness be taken (notwithstanding Nāgārjuna’s repeated cautions in this regard) as rather more nihilistic than was intended.

We can consider, in this regard, chapter 24, verse 18 of Nāgārjuna’s MMK – a pivotal verse that may be rendered: “We call that which is dependent origination [pratītyasamutpāda] emptiness [śūnyatā]. That [emptiness,] a relative indication [upādāya prajñapti], is itself the middle path [madhyamā pratipad].” This often cited (and variously translated) verse is significant chiefly for its asserting that the authentic “middle path” – and hence (given the centrality of the middle way trope in Buddhist thought) the authentically Buddhist doctrine – lies in realizing the identity of three terms: dependent origination, emptiness, and “dependent designation” or “relative indication” (upādāya prajñapti). The semantic range of the latter term is such as to suggest that emptiness-cum-dependent origination is itself “conventional,” and one upshot of the verse is therefore to express, in effect, the idea of the “emptiness of emptiness.” More straightforwardly, though, this verse clearly represents one of the countless occasions on which Nāgārjuna is concerned to emphasize that by “emptiness” he means simply “dependent origination.”

On one characteristically East Asian interpretation of this verse (that of the modern Japanese scholar Gadjin Nagao), however, we are to understand here that the verse’s initial predication (“we call that which is dependent origination emptiness”) amounts to a negation of (the ontologically “positive” phenomenon which is) dependent origination. As Nagao states this idea, “This pratītya-samutpāda dies in the second [quarter verse].” The second predication – which characterizes this “emptiness” as a “relative indication” – then amounts to a return to the ontologically “positive.” On this reading, then, the verse “is dialectical, moving from affirmation to negation and again to affirmation.” (Nagao 1991: 193-94) This “dialectical” reading of a quintessentially Mādhyamika claim is frequently encountered in modern Japanese scholarship – a fact that arguably reflects the extent to which many Japanese scholars (even those who have developed deep acquaintance with the Sanskrit texts of Indian Buddhism) have their initial grounding in the characteristically East Asian traditions of interpretation in which the Ta-chih-tu lun of Kumārajīva is paramount.

Another characteristic preoccupation of East Asian interpreters of Madhyamaka is one also evident in some of the Indo-Tibetan traditions of interpretation: that of attempting to harmonize Madhyamaka and Yogācāra. In the East Asian case, the fact that so many Buddhist interpreters of Madhyamaka should attempt – notwithstanding the extent to which many Indian Mādhyamika and Yogācāra texts are framed as mutually polemical – to develop a synthesis of these two great schools of Mahāyāna philosophy partly reflects the predominance of Yogācāra in East Asian Buddhist thought. If, however, Madhyamaka philosophy was largely eclipsed by Yogācāra (and more importantly, by other indigenous developments) in the East Asian context, it nevertheless arguably lives on in the enigmatic discourse of Ch’an/Zen Buddhism that many take to be quintessentially East Asian. While any Mādhyamika influence on Zen is surely indirect, the latter tradition’s particular debt to the Prajñāpāramitā literature (the Vajracchedikā, or “Diamond,” Sūtra figures most importantly here) perhaps explains why many modern observers are inclined to see affinities with Madhyamaka.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Ames, William L. 1986. “Buddhapālita’s Exposition of the Madhyamaka.” Journal of Indian Philosophy 14: 313-348.
  • Ames, William L. 1993-94. “Bhāvaviveka’s Prajñāpradīpa: A Translation of Chapter One: ‘Examination of Causal Conditions’ (Pratyaya),” [in two parts], Journal of Indian Philosophy 21: 209-259; 22: 93-135.
    • These articles provide a good point of access to the interpretations of Nāgārjuna ventured by two of his earliest commentators (the two discussed at length in the commentary of Candrakīrti).
  • Arnold, Dan. 2005. Buddhists, Brahmins, and Belief: Epistemology in South Asian Philosophy of Religion. New York: Columbia University Press.
    • Part 3 of this work makes a case (based on an engagement with Candrakīrti’s critique of the Buddhist epistemologist Dignāga) for the interpretation of Madhyamaka as involving transcendental arguments.
  • Bhattacharya, Kamaleswar. 1990. The Dialectical Method of Nāgārjuna: Vigrahavyāvartanī. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
    • Contains (along with an edition of the Sanskrit text) a reliable translation of one of Nāgārjuna’s major works.
  • Blumenthal, James. 2004. The Ornament of the Middle Way: A Study of the Madhyamaka Thought of Śāntarakṣita. Ithaca, NY: Snow Lion Publications.
    • A translation and extensive study (together with a translated dGe-lugs-pa commentary) of Śāntarakṣita’s Madhyamakālaṃkāra.
  • Burton, David F. 1999. Emptiness Appraised: A Critical Study of Nāgārjuna’s Philosophy. London: Curzon.
    • Argues that despite Nāgārjuna’s expressed intentions, his arguments entail nihilistic conclusions.
  • Cabezón, José Ignacio. 1992. A Dose of Emptiness: An Annotated Translation of the sTong thun chen mo of mKhas grub dGe legs dpal bzang. Albany: SUNY Press.
    • This extensively annotated and reliable translation makes available a representative example of a Tibetan dGe-lugs-pa interpretation of Madhyamaka (this one by one of Tsong-kha-pa’s two major disciples).
  • Chimpa, Lama, and Alaka Chattopadhyaya, trans. 1970. Tāranātha’s History of Buddhism in India. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
    • A useful translation of a traditional history of the Indian Buddhist tradition, containing representative accounts of the careers and works of important Indian thinkers.
  • Conze, Edward, trans. 1975. The Large Sutra on Perfect Wisdom, with the divisions of the Abhisamayālaṅkāra. Berkeley: University of California Press.
    • A useful point of access to the paradoxical style of discourse that is characteristic of the “Prajñāpāramitā” literature that figures in Nāgārjuna’s background.
  • Crosby, Kate, and Andrew Skilton, trans. 1995. The Bodhicaryāvatāra. New York: Oxford University Press.
    • A translation of the major work of Śāntideva, with an introduction and annotations.
  • Dreyfus, Georges. 2003. The Sound of Two Hands Clapping: The Education of a Tibetan Buddhist Monk. Berkeley: University of California Press.
    • An insightful study of the pedagogical context for the Tibetan interpretation and transmission of Madhyamaka.
  • Dreyfus, Georges, and Sara McClintock, eds. 2003. The Svātantrika-Prāsaṅgika Distinction: What Difference Does a Difference Make? Boston: Wisdom Publications.
    • A collection of scholarly essays representative of the current state of debate on this division of Madhyamaka, with attention both to this as a Tibetan doxographical category, and to matters of interpretation regarding the antecedent Indian texts.
  • Garfield, Jay L., trans. 1995. The Fundamental Wisdom of the Middle Way: Nāgārjuna’s Mūlamadhyamakakārikā. New York: Oxford University Press.
    • Though translated from the Tibetan (and not from the extant Sanskrit), this is the most accessible of the available translations of Nāgārjuna’s foundational text – and far and away the most philosophically sophisticated and illuminating.
  • Hayes, Richard P. 1994. “Nāgārjuna’s Appeal.” Journal of Indian Philosophy 22: 299-378.
    • Argues that Nāgārjuna’s works centrally involve an equivocation on the word svabhāva.
  • Huntington, C. W., with Geshe Namgyal Wangchen. 1989. The Emptiness of Emptiness: An Introduction to Early Indian Mādhyamika. Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press.
    • An annotated translation of Candrakīrti’s Madhyamakāvatāra, with a lengthy introduction that makes a case for the interpretation of Madhyamaka along lines suggested by poststructuralist philosophy.
  • Iida Shotaro. 1980. Reason and Emptiness: A Study in Logic and Mysticism. Tokyo: Hokuseido.
    • A study, with texts and translations, of major works of Bhāvaviveka.
  • Jha, Ganganath, trans. 1986. The Tattvasaṁgraha of Shāntarakṣita with the Commentary of Kamalashīla. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass. (Reprint; first published in Gaekwad’s Oriental Series, 1937-1939.)
    • A relatively inaccessible (but nonetheless complete) translation of this major work by Śāntarakṣita.
  • La Vallée Poussin, Louis de, ed. 1970. Mūlamadhyamakakārikās (Mādhyamikasūtras) de Nāgārjuna, avec la Prasannapadā Commentaire de Candrakīrti. Bibliotheca Buddhica, Vol. IV. Osnabrück: Biblio Verlag. (Reprint; originally published 1903-1913.)
    • This work warrants mention as the standard edition of the foundational text of Madhyamaka.
  • Lamotte, Etienne, trans. 1944-1980. Le Traité de la Grande Vertu de Sagesse. 5 volumes. Louvain: Insitut orientaliste, Bibliothèque de l’Université de Louvain.
    • The characteristically extensive annotations alone make this monumental work a treasure trove. Despite its vastness, this represents only a partial translation of the Ta-chih-tu Lun (*Mahāprajñāpārmitāśāstra) of Nāgārjuna/Kumārajīva.
  • Lang, Karen. 1986. Āryadeva’s Catuḥśataka: On the Bodhisattva’s Cultivation of Merit and Knowledge. Copenhagen: Akademisk Forlag.
    • A reliable translation of the major work of Āryadeva.
  • Lindtner, Chr. 1987. Nagarjuniana: Studies in the Writings and Philosophy of Nāgārjuna. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1987. (Reprint; first published in Copenhagen, Institute for indisk filologi, 1982.)
    • A study of the works that are (and are not) appropriately attributed to Nāgārjuna, with editions and translations of several.
  • Murti, T. R. V. 1960. The Central Philosophy of Buddhism: A Study of the Mādhyamika System. Second edition. London: George Allen and Unwin.
    • An important early study of Madhyamaka, representing one of a few influential neo-Kantian interpretations thereof.
  • Nagao Gadjin. 1991. Mādhyamika and Yogācāra: A Study of Mahāyāna Philosophies. Trans. Leslie S. Kawamura. Albany: SUNY Press.
    • A selection of translated essays representative of the approach and legacy of this important Japanese scholar.
  • Ramanan, K. Venkata. 1975. Nāgārjuna’s Philosophy as presented in the Mahā-Prajñāpāramitā-Śāstra. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass. (Reprint; first published Charles Tuttle, 1966.)
    • This work is useful for its making accessible the contents and style of the text (extant only in Kumārajīva’s Chinese translation) that most influenced the East Asian reception of Madhyamaka. (Ramanan is in the scholarly minority in accepting the Chinese tradition’s attribution of the text to Nāgārjuna.)
  • Ruegg, David Seyfort. 1981. The Literature of the Madhyamaka School of Philosophy in India. A History of Indian Literature (ed. Jan Gonda), Vol. VII, Fasc. 1. Wiesbaden: Otto Harrassowitz.
    • This authoritative work on the history and texts of Indian Madhyamaka is the standard reference work on the subject.
  • Siderits, Mark. 2003. Personal Identity and Buddhist Philosophy: Empty Persons. Burlington, VT: Ashgate.
    • Chapters 6-9 develop a sophisticated philosophical reconstruction of Madhyamaka (here characterized as a philosophically “anti-realist” position), which is represented as constitutively related to the reductionism of Ābhidharmika Buddhism (treated in the first half of the book). A difficult work that can seem to owe more to analytic philosophy than to Indian Buddhism, but an exceptionally sensitive account of the issue of truth vis-à-vis Madhyamaka. In particular, Siderits argues for a version of Madhyamaka as involving a “deflationist” account of truth (here called “semantic non-dualism”).
  • Sopa, Geshe Lhundup, and Jeffrey Hopkins, trans., Cutting Through Appearances: The Practice and Theory of Tibetan Buddhism. 2nd ed. Ithaca, NY: Snow Lion Publications, 1989.
    • Includes a somewhat inaccessible translation of a standard Tibetan doxographical text, which is useful for a sense of how Madhyamaka is represented by Tibetans in relation to other Buddhist schools of thought.
  • Sprung, Mervyn, trans. 1979. Lucid Exposition of the Middle Way: The Essential Chapters from the Prasannapadā of Candrakīrti. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
    • Currently the closest thing to a complete Western-language translation of Candrakīrti’s text (hence, the translation also comprises most of Nāgārjuna’s MMK). While not an altogether reliable translation, this provides some access to the discourse of Candrakīrti.
  • Stcherbatsky, Th. 1927. The Conception of Buddhist Nirvāṇa. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1989. (Reprint.)
    • This early work includes a dated and eccentric (but nonetheless useful) translation of the first chapter of Candrakīrti’s Prasannapadā. Stcherbatsky influentially advanced a broadly neo-Kantian interpretation of Madhyamaka.
  • Swanson, Paul L. 1989. Foundations of T’ien-T’ai Philosophy: The Flowering of the Two Truths Theory in Chinese Buddhism. Berkeley: Asian Humanities Press.
    • An accessible study of the East Asian reception and interpretation of Madhyamaka.
  • Takakusu Junjirō. 1949. The Essentials of Buddhist Philosophy. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1975. (Reprint; first published by the University of Hawaii.)
    • A concise presentation of the various schools of Buddhist philosophy as they are reckoned in East Asian traditions. The presentation of Madhyamaka (“Sanron,” the “Three Treatise” school) is at pp.99-111.
  • Thurman, Robert. 1991. The Central Philosophy of Tibet: A Study and Translation of Jey Tsong Khapa’s Essence of True Eloquence. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
    • A translation of part of an important work by Tsong-kha-pa, representing a Tibetan Mādhyamika engagement with Yogācāra. The author’s lengthy introduction advances a broadly Wittgensteinian understanding of Madhyamaka.
  • Tillemans, Tom J. F. 1990. Materials for the Study of Āryadeva, Dharmapāla and Candrakīrti. Wiener Studien zur Tibetologie und Buddhismuskunde, Heft 24, 1-2. Wien: Arbeitskreis für tibetische und buddhistische Studien.
    • Annotated translations (with a philosophically sophisticated introduction and annotations) of parts of the divergent commentaries on Āryadeva by the Mādhyamika Candrakīrti and the Yogācārin Dharmapāla.
  • Tuck, Andrew. 1990. Comparative Philosophy and the Philosophy of Scholarship: On the Western Interpretation of Nāgārjuna. New York: Oxford University Press.
    • An illuminating study of the philosophical presuppositions informing important modern interpretations of Nāgārjuna.
  • Walser, Joseph. 2005. Nāgārjuna in Context: Mahāyāna Buddhism and Early Indian Culture. New York: Columbia University Press.
    • An attempt to locate the figure of Nāgārjuna in socio-historical context (and particularly in relation to the then nascent Mahāyāna movement).
  • Williams, Paul. 1989. Mahāyāna Buddhism: The Doctrinal Foundations. London: Routledge.
    • An accessible and lucid survey of Mahāyāna Buddhist thought. Chapter 3 treats Madhyamaka, with some attention to Tibetan and East Asian developments therein.

Author Information

Dan Arnold
University of Chicago Divinity School
U. S. A.

Kashmiri Shaiva Philosophy

What is commonly called “Kashmiri Shaivism” is actually a group of several monistic and tantric religious traditions that flourished in Kashmir from the latter centuries of the first millennium C.E. through the early centuries of the second. These traditions have survived only in an attenuated form among the Brahmans of Kashmir, but there have recently been efforts to revive them in India and globally. These traditions must be distinguished from a dualistic Shaiva Siddhānta tradition that also flourished in medieval Kashmir. The most salient philosophy of monistic Kashmiri Shaivism is the Pratyabhijnā, or “Recognition,” system propounded in the writings of Utpaladeva (c. 925-975 C.E.) and Abhinavagupta (c. 975-1025 C.E.). Abhinavagupta’s disciple Kshemarāja (c. 1000-1050) and other successors interpreted that philosophy as defining retrospectively the significance of earlier monistic Shaiva theology and philosophy. This article will focus on the historical development and basic teachings of the Pratyabhijnā philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Historical Development of Monistic Shaiva Philosophy in Kashmir
    1. Tantra and Kashmiri Shaivism
    2. Basic Ritual Pattern of Kashmiri Shaivism
    3. Domestication of Kashmiri Shaiva Thought
    4. “Trika” Sub-tradition of Shaivism
  2. Basic Themes of Somānanda’s Shivadrishti
  3. Purposes and Methods of Utpaladeva’s and Abhinavagupta’s Pratyabhijnā System
  4. The Pratyabhijnā Epistemology
  5. The Pratyabhijnā Ontology: The Syntax of Empowered Identity
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Historical Development of Monistic Shaiva Philosophy in Kashmir

The great cultural dynamism of medieval Kashmir included a number of cults that scholars now classify as “tantric,” including the interweaving Shaiva (Siva worshiping) and Shākta (Goddess worshiping) lineages the Vaishnava Pancarātra (an esoteric tradition centered around the worship of Visnu) and the Buddhist Vajrāyana tradition.

a. Tantra and Kashmiri Shaivism

While tantrism is a complex and controversial subject, one of its most definitive characteristics for contemporary classifications—if not its most definitive one—is the pursuit of power. Tantric traditions are thus those that aim at increasing the power of the practitioner. The theological designation for the essence of such power is Shakti (the female counterpart to the male divine principle, whose essence is power). The manifestations of Shakti that the practitioner of tantra aspire after vary greatly, from relatively limited magical proficiencies (siddhis or vibhūtis), through royal power, to the deindividualized and liberated saint’s omnipotence to the performance of God’s cosmic acts.

In his seminal essay, “Purity and Power among the Brahmans of Kashmir,” the Oxford historian Alexis Sanderson elucidates that the tantric pursuit of such power transgresses orthodox, mainstream Hindu norms that delimit human agency for the sake of symbolic and ritual purity (shuddhi) (Sanderson 1985). Violating prescriptions regarding caste, sexuality, diet and death, many of the tantric rites were originally performed in cremation grounds.

Whereas in Shākta tantrism, Shakti as a Goddess is herself the ultimate deity, in monistic Kashmiri Shaivism she is incorporated into the metaphysical essence of the God Shiva. Shiva is the Shaktiman (the “possessor of Shakti”) encompassing her within his androgynous nature as his integral power and consort. According to the predominant monistic Shaiva myth, Shiva out of a kind of play divides himself from Shakti and then in sexual union emanates and controls the universe through her.

b. Basic Ritual Pattern of Kashmiri Shaivism

The basic pattern of spiritual practice, which also reflects the appropriation of Goddess worship (Shaktism) by Shaivism is the approach to Shiva through Shakti. As the Shaiva scripture Vijnāna-Bhairava proclaims, Shakti is the door. The adept pursues the realization of identity with the omnipotent Shiva by assuming his mythic agency in emanating and controlling the universe through Shakti. Thus in the sexual ritual a man realizes himself as the possessor of Shakti within his partner. In more frequent internalized “theosophical” contemplations one realizes oneself as the possessor of Shakti in all her immanent modalities with the aid of circular diagrams of cosmogenesis (mandalas) and mantras.

c. Domestication of Kashmiri Shaiva Thought

Scholars identify some of the preconditions for the eventual development of monistic Shaiva philosophical discourse in the trend of medieval tantric movements to “domesticize” themselves by assimilating to upper-caste Hindu norms. Radical practices were toned down, concealed under the guise of propriety, or interpreted as metaphors of internal contemplations.

An expression of this same process was the production by monistic Shaiva Brahmans of increasingly systematic manuals of doctrines and practices on the model of Sanskrit scholastic texts (shāstras). This creation of what may be described as a religious mission to the educated elites also led to the increasing consolidation of the various streams of monistic Shaivism. This development began in the ninth century with Vasugupta’s transmission of the manual Shiva Sūtra, ostensibly revealed to him by Shiva himself; and the further systematization of its teachings by either Vasugupta or his disciple Kallata in the Spanda Kārikā. These two works and their commentaries form the core texts of the “Spanda system” of monistic Shaivism, known for its interpretation of Shakti as spanda, “cosmic pulsation.”

d. “Trika” Sub-tradition of Shaivism

The tradition of monistic Shaivism called “Trika” (referring to its emphasis on various triads of modalities of Shakti and cosmic levels) produced the first work of full-fledged scholastic philosophy. This was the Shivadrishti, “Cognition of Shiva,” by Somānanda (c. 900-950 C.E.). (See the summary of themes of the Shivadrishti below.)

Utpaladeva, a student of Somānanda, wrote a commentary on the Shivadrishti, the Shivadrishtivritti. He also wrote several other works interpreting and furthering the work of Somānanda with much greater sophistication. Those texts are the foundational works of the Pratyabhijnā philosophy of focus in this article. The most comprehensive of these texts are the Īshvarapratyabhijnākārikā, “Verses on the Recognition of the Lord,” and two commentaries on the Verses, the short Īshvarapratyabhijnākārikāvritti, and the more detailed Īshvarapratyabhijnāvivriti. (The latter text has been accessible to contemporary scholars only in fragments.) Utpaladeva also wrote a trilogy of more specialized philosophical studies, the Siddhitrayī, “Three Proofs”—Īshvarasiddhi, “Proof of the Lord;” Ajadapramātrisiddhi, “Proof of a Subject who is not Insentient;” and Sambandhasiddhi, “Proof of Relation.”

Abhinavagupta, widely recognized as one of the greatest philosophers of South Asia, was a disciple of a disciple of Utpaladeva. Abhinava profoundly elaborated and augmented Utpaladeva’s arguments in long commentaries, one directly on the Verses, the Īshvarapratyabhijnāvimarshinī; and the other on Utpaladeva’s longer autocommentary, the Īshvarapratyabhijnāvivritivimarshinī.

While Abhinavagupta’s Pratyabhijnā commentaries are of paramount philosophical importance, this thinker’s greatest significance in the history of tantrism is probably his effort, in his monumental Tantrāloka and numerous other works, to systematize and provide a critical philosophical structure to non-philosophical tantric theology. Abhinava utilized categories from the Pratyabhijnā philosophy to interpret and organize the diverse aspects of doctrine and practice and Shaiva symbolism from the “Trika” sub-tradition; and he synthesized under the rubric of this philosophically rationalized Trika Shaivism an enormous range of symbolism and practice from other Shaiva and Shākta traditions as well. Abhinavagupta is also renowned for his works on Sanskrit poetics—in which he interpreted aesthetic experience as homologous to, and practically approaching the monistic Shaiva soteriological realization.

Abhinava’s own disciple, Kshemarāja, further pursued his teacher’s agendas with a simplified manual of monistic Shaiva doctrine and practice, the Pratyabhijnāhridaya, “Heart of Recognition,” and several lengthy commentaries on tantric scriptures. As further diffused through these and subsequent works, Utpaladeva’s and Abhinavagupta’s philosophical thought came to have a large influence on tantric and devotional (bhakti) traditions throughout South Asia.

2. Basic Themes of Somānanda’s Shivadrishti

While the focus of this article is on Utpaladeva’s and Abhinavagupta’s Pratyabhijnā philosophy, mention should be made of some of the basic themes of Somānanda’s precursory Shivadrishti.

Somānanda’s broadest concern is to explain how Shiva through the various modalities of his Shakti emanates a real universe that remains identical with himself. In establishing the Shaiva doctrine he refutes a number of alternative views on ultimate reality, the self, God and the metaphysical status of the world. He devotes the greatest polemical efforts against the theories of the 4th-6th century Vaiyākarana (or “Grammarian”) philosopher Bhartrihari.

According to Bhartrihari, the ultimate reality is the Word Absolute (shabdabrahman)—a super-linguistic plenum, which fragments and emanates into the multiplicity of forms of expressive speech and referents of that speech. Somānanda repudiates the view that a linguistic entity could be the ultimate reality, while at the same time identifying the true source of language as the Sound (nāda) integral to Shiva’s creative power.

Somānanda takes a less polemical approach towards Shāktism. He argues that there is ultimately no difference between Shakti and Shiva, who is the possessor of Shakti. He supports this contention with the analogy of the inseparability of heat from fire, which is the possessor of heat. Nevertheless, he asserts that it is more proper to refer to the ultimate reality as Shiva rather than Shakti. Other Hindu schools criticized by Somānanda include the Pancarātra as well as the Vedānta, Sāmkhya and Nyāya-Vaisheshika systems.

Somānanda briefly adduces some considerations against the Buddhist theory of momentariness, which were directly picked up and elaborated by Utpaladeva and Abhinavagupta. The most important of these was his advertence to the experience of recognition (pratyabhijnā) as evidence both for the continuity of entities from the past through the present, and for the self that connects the past and present experiences of those entities. It was originally the Nyāya-Vaisheshika school that adduced such considerations against the Buddhists, and the ninth-century Shaiva Siddhānta thinker Sadyojyoti in his Nareshvaraparīkshā had also recently employed these arguments. Somānanda introduced them to monistic Shaiva philosophical reflection with great future consequences.

Somānanda’s claims that synthetic categories or universals are more primitive than particulars, and his invocation of Sanskrit syntax to explain Shiva’s agency likewise had an important impact on Utpaladeva and Abhinavagupta. (See below.) Also noteworthy is Somānanda’s advocacy of a “panpsychist” theory that all things, which emanate from the consciousness of Shiva, have their own consciousness and agency. Somānanda additionally engages in reflecting on the contemplations that lead to the realization of identity with Shiva.

3. Purposes and Methods of Utpaladeva’s and Abhinavagupta’s Pratyabhijnā System

Utpaladeva and Abhinavagupta ambitiously conceive the Pratyabhijnā system as both a philosophical apologetics (which follows Sanskritic standards of scholastic argument) and an internalized form of tantric ritual that leads students directly to identification with Shiva. They explain the basic means by which the system conveys Shiva-identity according to the same basic ritual pattern described above, as shaktyāvishkarana, “the revealing of Shakti.”

The Pratyabhijnā philosophers, however, also frame Shakti as the reason of a publicly assessable inference, or “inference for the sake of others” (parārthānumāna). According to the scholastic logic, the reason identifies a quality in the inferential subject “I” known to be invariably concomitant with the predicate, “Shiva.” Thus I am Shiva because I have his quality, that is, Shakti, the capacity of emanating and controlling the universe.

4. The Pratyabhijnā Epistemology

In order to address debates on epistemology that were then current, Utpaladeva and Abhinavagupta further explain the mythic and ritual pattern of Shiva and Shakti in terms of recognition. The specific problem the writers address had been formulated by the Buddhist logic school of Dignāga and Dharmakīrti, which flourished in medieval Kashmir. Contemporary interpreters have characterized the philosophy of Buddhist logic as a species of phenomenalism akin to that of David Hume. According to this school, the foundation of knowledge is a series of momentary and discrete perceptual data (svalakshana). There are no grounds in those data for the recognitions of any enduring entities through ostensible cognitions utilizing linguistic or conceptual interpretation (savikalpaka jnāna). In debates over several centuries, the Buddhist logicians had propounded arguments attacking many concepts that seemed commonsensical and were religiously significant to the various orthodox Hindu philosophical schools—such as ideas of external objects, ordinary and ritual action, an enduring Self, God, and revelation.

The Pratyabhijnā philosophers’ response to the problematic posed by Buddhist logic revolutionized earlier approaches of the Nyaya philosophers, the Shaiva Siddhāntin Sadyojyoti and even Utpaladeva’s teacher Somānanda, and may be characterized as a form of transcendental argumentation. Utpaladeva and Abhinavagupta interpret their central myth of Shiva’s emanation and control of the universe through Shakti as itself an act of self-recognition (ahampratyavamarsha, pratyabhijnā). Furthermore, abjuring Somānanda’s agonistic stance towards Bhartrihari, they also equate Shiva’s self-recognition (Shakti) with the principle of Supreme Speech (parāvāk), which they derive from the Grammarian. They thereby appropriate the Grammarian’s explanation of creation as linguistic in nature. Thus the Kashmiri Shaiva philosophers ascribe to Speech a primordial status, denied by the Buddhist logicians.

As ritual recapitulates myth, the Pratyabhijnā system endeavors to lead the student to participate in the recognition “I am Shiva,” by demonstrating that all experiences and contents of experience are expressions of the recognition that “I am Shiva.” The paradox of the Pratyabhijnā formulation of the inference for the sake of others is that the self-recognition “I am Shiva,” as an interpretation of Shakti, becomes in effect both the conclusion and the reason. This circularity of conclusion and reason is a consequence of the Kashmiri Shaiva monism. From the intratraditional perspective, there is no fact that can be adduced in support of another separate fact, as everything is always the same in essential nature. From the intertraditional perspective of philosophical debate, however, the circularity is not necessarily destructive. The Shaiva technical studies of various topics of epistemology and ontology in effect provide further ostensible justification for this apparent circularity.

Utpaladeva’s and Abhinavagupta’s epistemology may best be illustrated by its approach to perceptual cognition. The Pratyabhijnā arguments on this subject may be divided into those centered around two sets of terms: prakāsha; and vimarsha and cognates such as pratyavamarsha and parāmarsha.

Prakāsha is the “bare subjective awareness” that validates each cognition, so that one knows that one knows. The thrust of the arguments about prakāsha is analogous to George Berkeley’s thesis of idealism that esse est percipi. The Shaivas contend that, as no object is known without validating awareness, this awareness actually constitutes all objects. There is no ground even for a “representationalist” inference of objects external to awareness that cause its diverse contents, because causality can be posited only between phenomena of which one has been aware. Furthermore, the Kashmiri Shaivas argue that there cannot be another subject outside of one’s own awareness. They conclude, however, not with solipsism as usually understood in the West, but a conception of a universal awareness. All sentient and insentient beings are essentially one awareness.

Vimarsha and its cognates have the significance of apprehension or judgment with a recognitive structure, and may be glossed as “recognitive apprehension.” (The recognitive is the act of recognizing or an awareness that something perceived has been perceived before.) Utpaladeva’s and Abhinavagupta’s arguments centering on these terms develop earlier considerations of Bhartrihari on the linguistic nature of experience. Utpaladeva and Abhinavagupta refute the Buddhist contention that recognition is a contingent reaction to direct experience by claiming that it is integral or transcendental to all experience. Some of the considerations they adduce to support this claim are the following: that children must build upon a subtle, innate form of linguistic apprehension in their learning of conventional language; that there must be a recognitive ordering of our most basic experiences of situations and movements in order to account for our ability to perform rapid behaviors; and that some form of subtle application of language in all experiences is necessary in order to account for our ability to remember them.

The two phases of argument operate together. The idealistic prakāsha arguments make the recognition shown by the vimarsha arguments to be integral to all epistemic processes, constitutive of them and their objects. Moreover, on the radical logic of the Kashmiri Shaiva idealism, the recognition generating all things belongs to one subject. It must therefore be his self-recognition. As it is through the monistic subject’s self-recognition that all phenomena are created, the Pratyabhijnā thinkers have ostensibly demonstrated their cosmogonic myth of Shiva’s emanation through Shakti in terms of self-recognition. The student, by coming to see this self-recognition as the inner reality of all that is experienced, is led to full participation in it.

Also noteworthy is the Kashmiri Shaiva theory of what may be called “semantic exclusion” (apoha). This concept had originally been formulated by the Buddhist logicians to explain a nonepistemic “coordination” (sārūpya) between language and momentary perceptual data as the basis for successful reference in communication and behaviors. According to the Buddhists, words have no isomorphism with the sense data, but only exclude other words that would not lead to successful behavior. The only reference of the word “cow” to a perceived particular is that it excludes non-cows, for example, a horse, a car, and so on. The Buddhist theory has an interesting point of agreement with contemporary structuralist and poststructuralist conceptions of the determination of linguistic value by difference, although it is not formulated like the latter (that is, on the basis of considerations about the systematicity of entire languages).

Utpaladeva and Abhinavagupta argue that exclusion itself depends upon a comparative synthesis, or recognition, of what does and does not fit within particular categories. We recognize that the cow is not a non-cow such as a horse. The Pratyabhijnā theorists thus in effect explain difference itself as a kind of similarity. Difference is identified in various circumstances like other forms of similarity. According to the Shaivas such difference-identification is one of the principal expressions of Shiva’s emanating self-recognition.

5. The Pratyabhijnā Ontology: The Syntax of Empowered Identity

Just as Utpaladeva and Abhinavagupta appropriate Bhartrihari in equating self-recognition with Supreme Speech and thereby interpreting recognitive apprehension as linguistic in nature, they also follow the Grammarian school in interpreting being or existence (sattā) (the generic referent of language) as action (kriyā). The Grammarian view itself originated in Brahmanic interpretations of the Veda as expressing injunctions for sacrifice. The Kashmiri Shaivas further agree with much of Vedic exegetics in conceiving being as both narrative and recapitulatory ritual action. Following the account above, it is Shiva’s mythic action through Shakti as self-recognition that constitutes all experience and objects of experience, and that is reenacted by philosophical discourse.

The Pratyabhijnā thinkers propound their philosophy of Shiva’s action to explain a wide range of topics of ontology. One of their concerns is to describe how Shiva’s action generates a multiplicity of relationships (sambandha) or universals (sāmānya) as the referents of discrete instances of recognitive apprehension. With this theory they attempt to subvert the Buddhist logicians’ contention that evanescent particulars are ontologically fundamental. For the Shaivas, categories are primitive, and particulars are formed out of syntheses of those categories.

Most illustrative of the Pratyabhijnā thinkers’ “mythico-ritual approach” to ontology is their use of theories of Sanskrit syntax to explain Shiva’s action. Again reflecting the Vedic roots of South Asian philosophies, many schools of Hinduism and Buddhism—even those which do not view all existence as action—frequently advert to considerations of action syntax in treating ontological or metaphysical topics. The relevant considerations pertain to how verbs articulating action relate to declined nouns indicating the concomitants of action (kārakas)—in English, roughly, the agent, object, instrument, purpose, source and location. Now, most Sanskritic philosophies, Hindu as well as Buddhist, have tended to delimit the syntactic role of the agent (kartri kāraka)—to different degrees, but sometimes quite strongly. The explicit and implicit reasons for this tendency are complex. At one level it evidently reflects the orthodox Brahmanic norms that subordinate the individual’s agency to the order of objective ritual behavior—pertaining to sacrifice, caste, life cycle, and so on. It also seems more broadly to reflect both Hindu and Buddhist concepts of the agent’s bondage to the process of action and result (karma) extending across rebirths (see Gerow 1982). The mainstream Buddhist philosophies completely deny the existence of a self in the dependent origination (pratītyasamutpāda) of karma.

Developing suggestions of Somānanda, the Pratyabhijnā philosophers expound a distinctive theory of agency to rationalize their tantric mythic and ritual drama of omnipotence. In their theory they take up several earlier understandings of the positive albeit delimited role of the agent and radicalize them. According to the Kashmiri Shaivas, all causal processes and other relationships constituting the universe are synthesized and impelled by the mythic agency of Shiva in his act of self-recognition. Shiva’s agency encompasses the actions of sentient beings as well as the motions and transformations of insentient beings. The Kashmiri Shaivas ultimately reduce the entire action of existence to agency. As Abhinavagupta explains, “Being is the agency of the act of becoming, that is, the freedom characteristic of an agent regarding all actions (Īshvarapratyabhijnāvimarshinī, 1.5.14, 1:258-59).”

Again, this theory of omnificent syntactic agency is ritually axiomatic as well as mythical. Utpaladeva describes the method of the Pratyabhijnā philosophy, in a manner homologous to the epistemology of recognition, as leading to salvation through the contemplation of one’s status as the agent of the universe. Abhinavagupta likewise, in his explanation of the preliminary ceremonies of the tantric ritual, identifies various components of the ritual—such as the location, ritual implements and object of sacrifice, flowers, and oblations—with the Sanskrit grammatical cases. He explains that the aspirant’s goal in the ritual action is identification with Shiva as agent of all the cases.

6. References and Further Reading

(References are given only to works available in English.)

  • Dyczkowski, Mark S.G. The Doctrine of Vibration: An Analysis of the Doctrines and Practices of Kashmir Shaivism. Albany, New York: State University of New York Press, 1987.
    • An historical introduction to monistic Kashmiri Shaiva religion and philosophy, centering on the Spanda system.
  • Dyczkowski, Mark S.G, trans. The Stanzas of Vibration: The Spandakārikā with Four Commentaries. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1992.
    • Elucidates how the Spanda system was interpreted in the light of the subsequent Pratyabhijnā philosophy.
  • Lawrence, David Peter. Rediscovering God with Transcendental Argument: A Contemporary Interpretation of Monistic Kashmiri Shaiva Philosophy. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1999.
    • Analyzes the Pratyabhijnā methodology and engages its substantive theories with Western philosophy and theology.
  • Muller-Ortega, Paul Eduardo. The Triadic Heart of Shiva: Kaula Tantricism of Abhinavagupta in the Non-Dual Shaivism of Kashmir. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1989.
    • Provides insight into Abhinavagupta’s synthetic spiritual theology, focusing on symbolism of the heart.
  • Pandey, K.C., trans. Īshvarapratyabhijnāvimarshinī of Abhinavagupta, Doctrine of Divine Recognition. Vol. 3. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1986.
    • The only published translation of Abhinavagupta’s shorter Pratyabhijnā commentary; a pioneering work, though problematic and rather opaque to nonspecialists.
  • Sanderson, Alexis. “Purity and Power Among the Brahmans of Kashmir.” In The Category of the Person: Anthropology, Philosophy, History, ed. Michael Carrithers, Steven Collins and Steven Lukes, 190-216. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1985.
    • The first of a series of groundbreaking articles by this scholar on the social history of monistic Kashmiri Shaivism.
  • Singh, Jaideva, ed. and trans. Pratyabhijnāhridayam: The Secret of Self-Recognition. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1980.
    • A manual of basic principles of monistic Shaiva doctrine and practice in the light of Pratyabhijnā philosophy by Abhinavagupta’s disciple Kshemarāja.
  • Singh, Jaideva, ed. and trans. Shivasūtras: The Yoga of Supreme Identity; Text of the Sūtras and the Commentary Vimarshinī of Kshemarāja. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1979.
    • An accessible translation and introduction to one of the core texts of monistic Kashmiri Shaivism.
  • Torella, Raffaele, ed. and trans. The Īshvarapratyabhijnākārikā of Utpaladeva with the Author’s Vritti. Corrected Edition. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 2002.
    • A foundational text and commentary on Pratyabhijnā philosophy with detailed scholarly annotations.
  • White, David. Kiss of the Yoginī. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2003.
    • An important though controversial recent work that argues—against “domesticizing” interpretations—that the tantric quest for power (Shakti) originated in ancient siddha practices aimed at gaining benefits from dangerous female divinities through offerings of sexual fluids.

Author Information

David Peter Lawrence
University of Manitoba

Bhartrihari (c. 450—510 C.E.)

Bhartrihari may be considered one of the most original philosophers of language and religion in ancient India. He is known primarily as a grammarian, but his works have great philosophical significance, especially with regard to the connections they posit between grammar, logic, semantics, and ontology. His thought may be characterized as part of the shabdadvaita (word monistic) school of thought, which asserts that cognition and language at an ultimate level are ontologically identical concepts that refer to one supreme reality, Brahman. Bhartrihari interprets the notion of the originary word (shabda) as transcending the bounds of spoken and written language and meaning. Understood as shabda tattva-the “word principle,” this complex idea explains the nature of consciousness, the awareness of all forms of phenomenal appearances, and posits an identity obtains between these, which is none other than Brahman. It is thus language as a fundamentally ontological principle that accounts for how we are able to conceptualize and communicate the awareness of objects. The metaphysical notion of shabda Brahman posits the unity of all existence as the foundation for all linguistically designated individual phenomena.

Table of Contents

  1. Bhartrihari’s Life and Works
  2. Early Grammarians and Philosophical Semantics
  3. Brahman, Language, and the World
  4. Bhartrihari’s Grammar
  5. The Sphota Theory of Language
  6. Phenomenology of Language and the Concept of ShabdaBrahman
  7. Bhartrihari and Western Philosophy
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Bhartrihari’s Life and Works

Bhartrihari’s works were so widely known that even the Chinese traveler Yijing (I-Tsing) (635-713 CE) mentions the grammarian-philosopher, mistaking him for a Buddhist. Unfortunately, we do not know much about his personal history and his works do not throw much light on the matter. There are some narratives referring to his background but they are not supported by historical data. In these somewhat dubious accounts, he is said to have been existentially torn between two kinds of life: the path of pleasure and that of the monastic yogi. Although he believed that he should renounce the world of material pleasures (reflected in poetry attributed to him by scholars), it took many attempts to finally achieve the life of dispassion. His hedonism and philosophical acumen led him, according to his legend, to produce works of great breadth, depth and beauty.

Bhartrihari credits some of the theories in his work Vâkyapadîya to his teacher, who was probably one of Candrâcârya’s contemporaries, Vasurata. To be more precise, the noted scholar T.R.V. Murti proposes the following chronology: Vasurata, followed by Bhartrihari (450-510 CE) and Dinnâga (Dignâga) (480-540 CE). Among the major works attributed to Bhartrihari are his main philosophical treatise, Vâkyapadîya (On Sentences and Words) kândas I, II, and III, Mahâbhâshyatîkâ (a commentary on the Mahâbhâshya of Patanjali), Vâkyapadîyavrtti (a commentary on the Vâkyapadîya kândas I and II), and shabdadhâtusamîksha. Since 1884, the Vâkyapadîya, containing approximately 635 verses, has been edited and published several times in English translation.

The first two chapters of the Vâkyapadîya discuss the nature of creation, the relationship of Brahman, world, language, the individual soul (jîva), and the manifestation and comprehension of the meanings of words and sentences. In addition, the literary works attributed by some to Bhartrihari (not mentioned here) have made an impact on the growing popular Hindu devotional (bhakti) movements. More importantly, his philosophical work was recognized and addressed by schools of Hindu scriptural exegesis (Mîmâmsâ), Vedânta (mystical Vedism) and Buddhism.

2. Early Grammarians and Philosophical Semantics

In ancient India, grammarians saw their task as establishing the foundations of the Vedas, but their work often resulted in the development of their own philosophical systems. Patanjali, in his Mahâbhâshya, explains that the study of grammar (vyâkaranam) was meant to maintain the truth of the Vedas, to guide the use of Vedic speech in ritual contexts, and to aid in the clear interpretations of individual human speech. Both Pânini and Patanjali, two major Sanksrit grammarians, were the first to provide a systematic and formal analysis of the grammatical bases of all intended meanings. Pânini (7th century BCE) developed the Ashtâdhyâyî (Eight-Chapters) for the grammarians. This impressive work contains a thorough analysis of the rules of Sanskrit language down into its nominal and verbal components; it contains a science of language, applicable to the Vedas, also comprised of sets of operational rules and meta -rules that interpret the former. Among these “rules for interpretation” of Vedic texts, we are given a “universal grammar. Pânini’s approach is not like the Mîmâmsâ, which focuses on the study of Vedic language. Instead, Pânini deals with spoken and Vedic languages as if they are of the same genre.

Pânini’s Ashtâdhyâyî, its commentaries, and the Vâkyapadîya of Bhartrihari are said to constitute the fundamental texts for the school of Pânini’s grammar, whose object of study was ultimately Vedic. Around 150 BCE, Patanjali wrote the Mahâbhâshya, an interpretation of some of Pânini’s rules written in dialogue form, and it is this work that is the basis for later commentaries on grammar and philosophy. It is of interest to note here that the Dharmashâstras or Treatises on Law, including the well-known Laws of Manu, were composed between 322 and 183 BCE. J.N. Mohanty points out that these treatises can be seen as attempts on the part of orthodox Brahminism to preserve itself against the anti-Vedic philosophies. However, he considers Pânini’s grammar and Patanjali’s commentary to carry greater weight in the Indian philosophical tradition.

With the Vâkyapadîya, Bhartrihari moves grammatical analysis squarely into the realm of philosophy, arguing that grammar can be consider a darshana, a “view,” or an official philosophical school, providing perspective and insight into ultimate reality. The first verse articulates the fundamental view of his newly envisaged school:

The Brahman is without beginning and end, whose essence is the Word, who is the cause of the manifested phonemes, who appears as the objects, from whom the creation of the world proceeds.

It is the project of the Vâkyapadîya to explain this verse, with all of its philosophical, linguistic, and metaphysical implications. At base, we contextualize Bhartrihari’s philosophical inquiry into language as being conditioned by the Indian culture and scriptural tradition, in which this type of intellectual pursuit had a soteriological purpose -the realization of absolute knowledge and the spiritual liberation which ensues; thus, it is a distinctively ontological reflection on language which Bhartrihari added to the thought of earlier grammarians.

3. Brahman, Language, and the World

The Brahminic view of the cosmos put forth in the Vedas is one of constant and cyclical creation and dissolution. At the dissolution of each creative cycle a seed or trace (samskâra) is left behind out of which the next cycle arises. What is significant here is that the nature of the seed from which each cycle of creation bursts forth is expressed as “Divine Word” (Daivi Vâk). If language is of divine origin, it can be conceived as Being Brahman expressing and embodying itself in the plurality of phenomena that is creation.

Bhartrihari considers Brahman, the basis of reality, to be “without beginning and end” (anâdi nidhânam), as a concept that is not subject to the attributes of temporal sequences of events, either externally or in the succession of mental events that form cognitions. The word principle, shabda Brahman, is not defined in terms of the temporal nature of our cognitive states, because it functions as the inherent, primordial ground of all cognitions. Thus, against the Hindu logicians, the Nyâyas, for whom particular forms of human speech may be expressed in conventional terms for practical purposes, language itself is not something which arises or is created in time by God or humans. As B.K. Matilal states, “To talk of an absolute beginning of language is untenable. Language is continuous and co-terminus with human existence or the existence of any sentient being.”

There has been some scholarly debate regarding the meaning of the term “eternal” or “akshara” as Bhartrihari applies it to the word-principle. While some interpret this to refer to an all-pervading entity, existing in opposition to the multiplicity of objects in space and time, others see it as Bhartrihari’s specialized way of referring to phonemes, the minimal units of meaningful sound. It seems that phonemes understood in this way explain how it is the case that Word appears as objects. Eternity is “that which appears as objects, and from whom the creation of the world proceeds.” Phonemes are thus the eternally possible elements that can be combined in inexhaustible ways to manifest the plurality of nature.

This principle accounts for creation on a number of levels: it is the origin of consciousness, of cognition, sensation, language use, cognitive and experiential aspects of the world. In other words, objects of thought and the relations between them are word-determined, regardless of whether they are objects of perception, inference or any other kind of knowledge. When we perceptually apprehend external reality, we always do so in terms of names, for without names objects are neither identifiable nor knowable.

Furthermore, when we consider phenomenal concepts, we see that they do not exist or hold any meaning aside from the words through which they are expressed; we might say that our concepts are “word-loaded” and from this we can infer that the word principle causes the world. Bhartrihari’s causal claim is in keeping with the traditional philosophical discussions on the nature of causality and inference as he applies it to the word-principle:

Just as other thinkers, while explaining causality, saw that the properties of cause continue in the effects….in the same way in the scriptures also, the word in which the power of Enjoyer and Enjoyed are submerged has been declared as the cause of the world.

4. Bhartrihari’s Grammar

In the Vâkyapadîya, kânda I, Bhartrihari defines the scope of his inquiry as the subjects of grammar. Our speech takes the form of the basic structures of language, and grammar deals with this communicatively spoken language. The correct understanding of speech can take us to the limits of our conventional and spiritual capacities, and so language analysis must operate at all the following levels: 1. sentences and words, 2. meanings corresponding to sentences and words, 3. the fitness or compatibility between sound and sense, and 4. the spiritual merit obtained by using the correct language.

In the Sanskrit grammatical tradition, the “elite” are defined as those who use the correct language; we arrive at this standard language by abstracting from communicative language, or “language-in-use.” In his linguistic theory, Bhartrihari distinguishes between two forms of language, the spoken, or “language-in-use” and the analytic. The analytic or formal language emerges from a formal, abstract analysis of communicative language. If we were to gather and compare various sentences and words from different contexts of use, we would logically infer the basic segments (roots, stems, suffixes) that account for a common logical or formal basis of denotation.

This hierarchical conception of language use and language meaning can be understood in the following way, taking off from a representation of Matilal, with the term on the far right of each column understood as the originator of the term in the middle, and the term in the middle being the originator of the term on the left. In other words, Bhartrihari’s conception of utterance and understanding can be grasped with the following schema under the rubric of:

Product Producer Derivative Element
Linguistic Components Language-in-Use Analytic Language
sentences and words word stems, suffixes, etc..
sense sentence meaning and word meaning stem meaning and suffix meaning
sound and sense relations fitness compatibility causality relations
purpose spiritual merit correct knowledge

There is debate about the ontological and epistemological status of relations between these levels of language, and Bhartrihari’s commentary on grammar includes a review of several theories and ultimately he seems to favor the “naturalist view.” In the first chapter of the Vâkyapadîya, Bhartrihari explains the naturalist view. Following the pâdavâdins (those who regard the word as the primary indivisible unit) who consider word-constituents, such as roots and suffixes, to be mere fictitious abstractions from words, so also the vâkyavâdins (those who regard the sentence as the indivisible unit) consider words to be imaginary abstractions from the sentence. The naturalists, such as Pânini, believe that language has an invariant form expressed in grammar. They therefore give epistemic primacy to spoken language; formal language is only an “appearance” and secondary aid to understanding. The conventionalists, on the other hand, hold that the analytic language is primary in that it contains within it all the structural features that may be used to create meaningful speech.

5. The Sphota Theory of Language

Bhartrihari’s theory occupies an interesting place in the ongoing Hindu-Buddhist debates about meaning and reference. For the Buddhists, meaning is a function of social and linguistic convention and reference is ultimately a projection of imaginative consciousness. For the Brahminic Nyâyas or Logicians, words have meaning because they refer to external objects; words can be combined in sentences just like things exist in relation to one another in external reality. With Advaita Vedânta, words mask the meaning of the Absolute Self (Âtman) which is Brahman, so that, when a person predicates categories to their identity such as in the sentence “I am tall,” this predication masks the all-inclusive nature of the eternal Self, which is beyond categorization. Bhartrihari puts forth a theory of language which, rather than starting by taking fundamental ontological, epistemological or social sides in these well-established debates, starts from the question of how meaning happens, how it emerges from the acts of both speaker and audience, and, constructing this theory first, what he believes to be appropriate metaphysical, epistemological and soteriological implications are drawn from it.

For Bhartrihari, linguistic meaning cannot be conveyed or accounted for by the physical utterance and perception of sounds, so he puts forth the sphota theory: the theory which posits the meaning-unit, which for him is the sentence, as a single entity. The term “sphota” dates back to Pânini’s reference to “sphotâyana” in his treatise Ashtâdhyâyî, however it was Patanjali who explicitly discusses sphota in his Mahâbhâshya. According to him sphota signifies spoken language, with the audible sound (dhvani) as its special quality. In Bhartrihari’s treatment of this concept, while the audible noise may vary depending on the speaker’s mode of utterance, sphota as the meaning unit of speech is not subject to such variations. This is so because for Bhartrihari, meaning is conveyed by the sentence. To explicate this theory, Bhartrihari depends on the root of sphota, namely sphut, meaning “to burst forth…” as in the “idea that spews forth” (in an internal mental state) when a meaningful sound, the sentence as a whole, is uttered.

The meaning of the sentence, the speech-unit, is one entire cognitive content (samvit). The sentence is indivisible (akhanda) and owes its cognitive value to the meaning-whole. Thus, its meaning is not reducible to its parts, the individual words which are distinguished only for the purposes of convention or expression. The differentiated word-meanings, which are also ontological categories, are the abstracted “pieces” we produce using imaginative construction, or vikalpa. Sphota entails a kind of mental perception which is described as a moment of recognition, an instantaneous flash (pratibhâ), whereby the hearer is made conscious, through hearing sounds, of the latent meaning unit already present in his consciousness (unconscious). The sentence employs analyzable units to express its meaning, but that meaning emerges out of the particular concatenation of those units, not because those units are meaningful in themselves. We analyze language by splitting it up into words, prefixes, suffixes, etc….but this is indicative of the fact that we “misunderstand” the fundamental oneness of the speech-unit. Words are only abstracted meaning possibilities in this sense, whereas the uttered sentence is the realization of a meaning-whole irreducible to those parts in themselves. This fundamental unity seems to apply, also, to any language taken as a whole. Matilal explains: “it is only those who do not know the language thoroughly who analyze it into words, in order to get a connected meaning.” As this scholar suggests, it is rather remarkable that Bhartrihari’s recognition of the theoretical indivisibility of the sentence resonates with the contemporary linguistic view of learning sentences as wholes (at a later stage of development we build new sentences from learned first sentences through analogical reasoning).

Sphota is therefore the cause of manifested language, which is meant to convey meaning. Sphota is more specifically identified as the underlying totality of linguistic capability, or “potency” and secondarily as the cause of two differentiated aspects of manifested meaning: applied meaning expressed as dhvani, the audible sound patterns of speech and artha-language as meaning-bearing. The grammatical/syntactical parts of the underlying sphota can only be heard and understood through its phonetic elements. Bhartrihari explains that the apparent difference between sphota and dhvani arises as we utter words. Initially, the word exists in the mind of the speaker as a unity but is manifested as a sequence of different sounds-thus giving the appearance of differentiation. dhvanis may be more specifically described as merely the audible possibility of meaning, a necessary but hardly sufficient condition of meaning.

We might think of this unit of linguistic potency, the sphota, as the cognitive/propositional whole content of meaning that can be transposed into different languages, while the actual word-sounds comprise the contents of the “speech-act”. But what holds the act to its ability to convey intended meanings? The words sounded by a plurality of speakers comprise the physical manifestation of vâk or vaikharîvâk and it is upon this form of vâk that physical objects as objective forms are modeled. The unity that underlies these objective referents and meanings, however, is known as the intuited vâkpashyativâk, which makes possible the unmediated understanding of a complete linguistic expression. This intuitive level of understanding, constitutive of the sphota, is teleological in its nature and structure in that it contains all potential possibilities of meaning-bearing dhvanis and their order of manifestation.

But, what guarantees that the hearer of speech properly comprehends what is uttered? In the second book of the Vâkyapadîya, Bhartrihari states:

Sentence meaning is produced by word meanings but is not constituted by them. Its form is that Intuition, that innate “know how” awareness (pratibhâ) possessed by all beings. It is a cognitive state evident to the hearer…not describable or definable, but all practical activities depend on it directly or through recollection of it.

Pratibhâ intuition can be characterized as shabda, the very same speech principle externalized in the utterances of speakers, as it operates within the hearer, causing her to instantaneously comprehend the meaning of the utterance. However, linguistic convention, shared by speaker and hearer, cannot account for the flash of comprehension. If that were the case, we would not have instances where communication breaks down in spite of the shared language between speaker and hearer. The comprehension of meaning lies in the sphota that is already present in the hearer’s awareness. As she hears the succession of audible phonemes, the latent and undifferentiated language potency within her is brought to “fruition” in the form of grasping the speaker’s meaning. Thus, while the audible words are necessary for such verbal comprehension to occur in the hearer, they are not sufficient. It is her own ability to understand meaning referred to by these words, by virtue of sharing the same sphota with the speaker, which completes the act of cognition.

It is at this point that the philosophy of language has for Bhartrihari religious implications of both ontological and interpretive scope. Just as various sentences might sound different in the mouths of different speakers and yet convey the same meanings, various Vedas may seem different in form and style, but there is a unity carried by the underlying sphota, which ensures that it is the same truth, or dharma that is expressed throughout the texts. Bearing in mind that Brahman is the ultimate referent of all speech forms, this higher reality is manifested in the sacred texts-whose efficacy (ritual, soteriological, epistemological) depends upon our ability to correctly apprehend its meaning. The sphota concept makes such interpretation possible. Again, the sphota expresses a meaning-whole behind individual letters and words. The implication for the truth of Vedic discourse is clear, for that truth is already present in the speaker (the Veda) and is potentially present in the consciousness of the hearers (the practitioners).

According to Bhartrihari’s theory, we can justify this particular philosophical method as revelatory by using the concept of shabdapramâna. The implications of this method are explained in the following section; here, we examine the source of our cognitions. But in order for one to give their assent to a worldview that renders to language the cosmic and salvific roles Bhartrihari does, a theory that posits that language is the medium of ultimate knowledge, one must be convinced that language in general has the capacity to yield ordinary knowledge. Given the way Bhartrihari conceptualizes language, as not primarily referent directed, but instead as referent-constructing, we need to look at how the grammarian thematizes the knowledge-conferring power of language within his own peculiarly unique framework.

6. Phenomenology of Language and the Concept of Shabda-Brahman

Sphota may be characterized as the intersubjective, universal “store-house” of meaning, the ground of all linguistic activity and communication. Sphota is the unifying principle that connects the word, the grammatical form of the word, and the meaning. Furthermore, just as words and sentences represent “pieces” of the meaning extracted from the whole, the objects and states of affairs these pieces represent actually refer to a “whole of objects meant” or an entire reality.

In classical Indian thought, objects are thought to be constituted of substance (dravya), but in Bhartrihari and especially in his first major commentator Helârâja, substance can be distinguished into two kinds, the substance of all things, which is Brahman, and the other individual, empirical substances. The empirical notion of substance here may be derived from the grammatical operation of ekashesha, explained by Pânini as using individual word-tokens to refer to individual objects-substances. Thus, names or singular terms are said by the earliest grammarians to refer to one substance at a time, therefore substance is defined through the relation of reference, and the nature of each substance is so specific that we cannot posit any general properties possessed by all of them. For example, each time we say the word ‘cow’ we refer to a different cow, and each cow is actually a different wholly individual entity.

Bhartrihari defines “actual” or empirical substance as that which we refer to by using indexicals and quantifiers, which refer to anything in our ontological reality: ‘this’ ‘that’ ‘something’ or ‘anything.’ The term ‘this’ points out an existence given to perception, while ‘that’ refers to something whose existence can be validated by some other means of knowledge but which is not available to perception. Bhartrihari also acknowledges the pragmatic and common sense view of “substance” as “a relative concept being dependent on our concept of quality (guna). A substance is that which is said to be distinguished and a quality is that which distinguishes the substance.

But Bhartrihari’s contribution to this debate changes the very notion of substance into a much more inclusive and general concept, since anything we refer to using a name or substantive term, even generic properties and verbs, become substances in that they are distinguished by words, as Matilal illustrates: “Thus, cooking would refer to the fact of cooking and ‘walking’ to the fact of walking as long as the speaker intends to distinguish the act of cooking from the act of walking.” “In the third book of the Vâkyapadîya, he defines the concept of ‘quality’/guna as dependent upon, as arising from substance. He rejects the Vaisheshika view that substances and qualities belong to entirely different categories (padârtha-s), and espouses the revolutionary view that the latter arises from the former. For him, qualities, existing in relation to substances serve to further differentiate those substances by “delimiting their scope.” But how does he account for such a radical revisioning?

Bhartrihari’s contribution of his particular theory of the “imaginative construction” of perceptions and language once again emerges within the context of debates with competing theories of knowledge. The Buddhist idealistic claim also argued that the world of experience or phenomena is at base a product of the human imaginative faculty. The Buddhists claim that our cognitive experiences construct our reality; these are modes of consciousness containing cognitive contents and in the final analysis, do not yield any knowledge about reality as it may be outside of themselves. It is consciousness that posits the (apparent) externality of objects, not the “objects themselves.” This form of phenomenal-idealism is developed as a counterclaim to the Hindu realist position, which affirms the existence of external reality. For the Buddhist, objects are only the external contents of the human imagination. Interestingly enough, Bhartrihari’s sphota theory of language and cognition is sometimes understood as an extension of the Buddhist position; according to the grammarian, cognition is entirely language-dependent in that the structure of our cognitive states is determined by grammar. But Bhartrihari’s theory posits knowledge as a matter of specifically linguistic construction. The concept of vikalpa for him implies the following: the structure of language shapes how we categorize the objects of our experience and our descriptions of reality as a whole. Even at the most immediate levels of awareness), we must conceptualize and therefore interpret the contents of sense perception. Thus, at the level of pure sensation, the sensory core is already saturated, as it were, with the “deep structure” of language. In this respect, Bhartrihari’s position differs from the Buddhist position rather dramatically. The Buddhists clearly distinguish between pure perception (nirvikalpa-pratyaksha), which is pre-conceptual, unverbalizable and correspondent to reality, and constructed perception (savikalpa-pratyakasha) that is conceptual and may therefore be considered a verbalized interpretation of the real. For the Buddhist, the pure sensory core is the real locus of perception. Bhartrihari, as an ontological monist, does not distinguish between a pure perception and a constructed perception such that the former is concept-free and ineffable and the latter concept-loaded and autonomously constructed, because he thinks that perception is inherently verbal. Not only are sense data and linguistic units non-different, but they are expressive of the unitary principle of Brahman-which is differentiated into the plurality of linguistic objects that make up the world.

Bhartrihari’s notion of vikalpa is also directed against the early Nyaiyayikas, who, while agreeing on the correspondence between word and thing, uphold the distinction between language and its object-referents. These Hindu Logicians held that the perceptual apprehension of the object could be distinguished from naming the object. For the Nyâyas, who are ontological pluralists and materialists, words refer to distinct generic properties of and relations between objects. Perception is a two-step process involving the initial apprehension of the object and then the subsequent apperception/awareness that results in mental and syntactic/linguistic representations of the first moment of awareness. Here, linguistic categories originate in the different substances and attributes that exist in the world. Bhartrihari counters them by arguing that the act of perception, rather than acquiring linguistic clothing after the bare particular has already been presented to consciousness, can only be aware of the object before it as a ‘this’ or ‘that’, that is, as an awareness of something only as a particular and as such, identifiable. That is to say, significantly enough, that for Bhartrihari, the word makes the thing an individual, and as one moves further and further along the refined categories of what is conventionally known as denotation, the word makes the thing what it is. For Bhartrihari, the difference the Logicians posit between the ontological and the linguistic would make meanings of all kinds, mundane ones and religious ones, contingent on the circumstances and speaker. But if perception is innately verbal, no perilous bridge need be suspended over some supposed abyss between vision and truth, both in our mundane lives and for the rishis who pronounced the Vedas. The word then makes the thing, and Brahman makes the world, and so it is entirely proper to speak of words as the creator of all things (shabdaBrahman).

7. Bhartrihari and Western Philosophy

Although previous Bhartrihari scholarship has progressed rather slowly due to numerous difficulties, within the last decade or so his work has garnered attention from Western scholars. Bhartrihari’s explorations into the relations between language, thought and reality reflect contemporary philosophical concerns with meaning, language use, and communication, particularly in the work of Chomsky, Wittgenstein, Grice, and Austin. His theory of language recognizes that meaning is conveyed in formalist terms where meaning is organized along syntactical rules. But it makes the leap, not made by modern Western philosophers, that such a view of language does not merely serve our mundane communicative purposes and see to the achievement of practical goals, but leads to paramount metaphysical knowledge, a knowledge carrying with it a palpable salvific value.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Bhartrihari. The Vâkyapadîya, Critical texts of Cantos I and II with English Translation. Trans. K. Pillai. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1971.
  • Coward, Harold G. The Sphota Theory of Language: A Philosophical Analysis . Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1980.
  • Coward, Harold G., and K. Kunjunni Raja, eds. The Philosophy of the Grammarians (Volume V of Encyclopedia of Indian Philosophies, ed. Karl Potter). Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1990.
  • Herzberger, Radhika. Bhartrihari and the Buddhists. Dordrecht: D. Reidel/Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1986.
  • Houben, Jan E.M. The Sambanda Samuddesha and Bhartrihari’s Philosophy of Language. Groningen: Egbert Forsten, 1995.
  • Iyer, Soubramania, K.A. Bhartrihari. A Study of Vâkyapadîya in the Light of Ancient Commentaries. Poona: Deccan College Postgraduate Research Institute, 1997.
  • Matilal, B.K. Mind, Language, and World. Ed. J. Ganeri. Delhi: Oxford University Press, 2002. (See “What Bhartrihari Would Have Said About Quine.”)
  • Matilal, B.K. The Word and the World: India’s Contribution to the Study of Language. Delhi: Oxford University Press, 1992.
  • Matilal, B. K. Perception: An Essay on Classical Indian Theories of Knowledge. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1986. (See chapter 12.)
  • Matilal, B.K. Epistemology, Logic, and Grammar in Indian Philosophical Analysis. The Hague: Mouton, 1971.
  • Potter, Karl, ed. The Tradition of the Nyâya-Vaisheshika up to Gangesha (Volume II of Encyclopedia of Indian Philosophies, ed. Karl Potter). Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1977.
  • Shah, K.J. “Bhartrihari and Wittgenstein.” Perspectives on the Philosophy of Meaning 1/1 (1990): 80-95.

Author Information

Stephanie Theodorou
Immaculata University
U. S. A.

Jain Philosophy

Jain_handJainism is properly the name of one of the religious traditions that have their origin in the Indian subcontinent. According to its own traditions, the teachings of Jainism are eternal, and hence have no founder; however, the Jainism of this age can be traced back to Mahavira, a teacher of the sixth century BCE, a contemporary of the Buddha. Like those of the Buddha, Mahavira’s doctrines were formulated as a reaction to and rejection of the Brahmanism (religion based on the Hindu scriptures, the Vedas and Upanisads) then taking shape. The brahmans taught the division of society into rigidly delineated castes, and a doctrine of reincarnation guided by karma, or merit brought about by the moral qualities of actions. Their schools of thought, since they respected the authority of the Vedas and Upanisads, were known as orthodox darsanas (‘darsanas‘ means literally, ‘views’). Jainism and Buddhism, along with a school of materialists called Carvaka, were regarded as the unorthodox darsanas, because they taught that the Vedas and Upanisads, and hence the brahman caste, had no authority.

Table of Contents

  1. Metaphysics
  2. Epistemology and Logic
  3. Ethics
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Metaphysics

According to Jain thought, the basic constituents of reality are souls (jiva), matter (pudgala), motion (dharma), rest (adharma), space (akasa), and time (kala). Space is understood to be infinite in all directions, but not all of space is inhabitable. A finite region of space, usually described as taking the shape of a standing man with arms akimbo, is the only region of space that can contain anything. This is so because it is the only region of space that is pervaded with dharma, the principle of motion (adharma is not simply the absence of dharma, but rather a principle that causes objects to stop moving). The physical world resides in the narrow part of the middle of inhabitable space. The rest of the inhabitable universe may contain gods or other spirits.

While Jainism is dualistic—that is, matter and souls are thought to be entirely different types of substance—it is frequently said to be atheistic. What is denied is a creator god above all. The universe is eternal, matter and souls being equally uncreated. The universe contains gods who may be worshipped for various reasons, but there is no being outside it exercising control over it. The gods and other superhuman beings are all just as subject to karma and rebirth as human beings are. By their actions, souls accumulate karma, which is understood to be a kind of matter, and that accumulation draws them back into a body after death. Hence, all souls have undergone an infinite number of previous lives, and—with the exception of those who win release from the bondage of karma—will continue to reincarnate, each new life determined by the kind and amount of karma accumulated. Release is achieved by purging the soul of all karma, good and bad.

Every living thing has a soul, so every living thing can be harmed or helped. For purposes of assessing the worth of actions (see Ethics, below), living things are classified in a hierarchy according to the kinds of senses they have; the more senses a being has, the more ways it can be harmed or helped. Plants, various one-celled animals, and ‘elemental’ beings (beings made of one of the four elements—earth, air, fire, or water) have only one sense, the sense of touch. Worms and many insects have the senses of touch and taste. Other insects, like ants and lice, have those two senses plus the sense of smell. Flies and bees, along with other higher insects, also have sight. Human beings, along with birds, fish, and most terrestrial animals, have all five senses. This complete set of senses (plus, according to some Jain thinkers, a separate faculty of consciousness) makes all kinds of knowledge available to human beings, including knowledge of the human condition and the need for liberation from rebirth.

2. Epistemology and Logic

Underlying Jain epistemology is the idea that reality is multifaceted (anekanta, or ‘non-one-sided’), such that no one view can capture it in its entirety; that is, no single statement or set of statements captures the complete truth about the objects they describe. This insight, illustrated by the famous story of the blind men trying to describe an elephant, grounds both a kind of fallibilism in epistemology and a sevenfold classification of statements in logic.

Every school of Indian thought includes some judgment about the valid sources of knowledge (pramanas). While their lists of pramanas differ, they share a concern to capture the common-sense view; no Indian school is skeptical. The Jain list of pramanas includes sense perception, valid testimony (including scriptures), extra-sensory perception, telepathy, and kevala, the state of omniscience of a perfected soul. Notably absent from the list is inference, which most other Indian schools include, but Jain discussion of the pramanas seem to indicate that inference is included by implication in the pramana that provides the premises for inference. That is, inference from things learned by the senses is itself knowledge gained from the senses; inference from knowledge gained by testimony is itself knowledge gained by testimony, etc. Later Jain thinkers would add inference as a separate category, along with memory and tarka, the faculty by which we recognize logical relations.

Since reality is multi-faceted, none of the pramanas gives absolute or perfect knowledge (except kevala, which is enjoyed only by the perfected soul, and cannot be expressed in language). As a result, any item of knowledge gained is only tentative and provisional. This is expressed in Jain philosophy in the doctrine of naya, or partial predication (sometimes called the doctrine of perspectives or viewpoints). According to this doctrine, any judgment is true only from the viewpoint or perspective of the judge, and ought to be so expressed. Given the multifaceted nature of reality, no one should take his or her own judgments as the final truth about the matter, excluding all other judgments. This insight generates a sevenfold classification of predications. The seven categories of claim can be schematized as follows, where ‘a’ represents any arbitrarily selected object, and ‘F’ represents some predicate assertible of it:

  1. Perhaps a is F.
  2. Perhaps a is not-F.
  3. Perhaps a is both F and not-F.
  4. Perhaps a is indescribable.
  5. Perhaps a is indescribable and F.
  6. Perhaps a is indescribable and not-F.
  7. Perhaps a is indescribable, and both F and not-F.

Each predication is preceded by a marker of uncertainty (syat), which I have rendered here as ‘perhaps.’ Some render it as ‘from a perspective,’ or ‘somehow.’ However it is translated, it is intended to mark respect for the multifaceted nature of reality by showing a lack of conclusive certainty.

Early Jain philosophical works (especially the Tattvartha Sutra) indicate that for any object and any predicate, all seven of these predications are true. That is to say, for every object a and every predicate F, there is some circumstance in which, or perspective from which, it is correct to make claims of each of these forms. These seven categories of predication are not to be understood as seven truth-values, since they are all seven thought to be true. Historically, this view has been criticized (by Sankara, among others) on the obvious ground of inconsistency. While both a proposition and its negation may well be assertible, it seems that the conjunction, being a contradiction, can never be even assertible, never mind true, and so the third and seventh forms of predication are never possible. This is precisely the kind of consideration that leads some commentators to understand the ‘syat’ operator to mean ‘from a perspective.’ Since it may well be that from one perspective, a is F, and from another, a is not-F, then one and the same person can appreciate those facts and assert them both together. Given the multifaceted nature of the real, every object is in one way F, and in another way not-F. An appreciation of the complexity of the real also can lead one to see that objects are, as they are in themselves, indescribable (as no description can capture their entirety). This yields the fourth form of predication, which can then be combined with other insights to yield the last three forms.

Perhaps the deepest problem with this doctrine is one that troubles all forms of skepticism and fallibilism to one degree or another; it seems to be self-defeating. After all, if reality is multifaceted, and that keeps us from making absolute judgments (since my judgment and its negation will both be equally true), the doctrines that underlie Jain epistemology are themselves equally tentative. For example, take the doctrine of anekantevada. According to that doctrine, reality is so complex that any claim about it will necessarily fall short of complete accuracy. The doctrine itself must then fall short of complete accuracy. Therefore, we should say, “Perhaps (or “from a perspective”) reality is multifaceted.” At the same time, we have to grant the propriety, in some circumstances, of saying, “Perhaps reality is not multifaceted.” Jain epistemology gains assertibility for its own doctrine, but at the cost of being unable to deny contradictory doctrines. What begins as a laudable fallibilism ends as an untenable relativism.

3. Ethics

Given that the proper goal for a Jain is release from death and rebirth, and rebirth is caused by the accumulation of karma, all Jain ethics aims at purging karma that has been accumulated, and ceasing to accumulate new karma. Like Buddhists and Hindus, Jains believe that good karma leads to better circumstances in the next life, and bad karma to worse. However, since they conceive karma to be a material substance that draws the soul back into the body, all karma, both good and bad, leads to rebirth in the body. No karma can help a person achieve liberation from rebirth. Karma comes in different kinds, according to the kind of actions and intentions that attract it. In particular, it comes from four basic sources: (1) attachment to worldly things, (2) the passions, such as anger, greed, fear, pride, etc., (3) sensual enjoyment, and (4) ignorance, or false belief. Only the first three have a directly ethical or moral upshot, since ignorance is cured by knowledge, not by moral action.

The moral life, then, is in part the life devoted to breaking attachments to the world, including attachments to sensual enjoyment. Hence, the moral ideal in Jainism is an ascetic ideal. Monks (who, as in Buddhism, live by stricter rules than laymen) are constrained by five cardinal rules, the “five vows”: (1) ahimsa, frequently translated “non-violence,” or “non-harming,” satya, or truthfulness, asteya, not taking anything that is not given, brahmacharya, chastity, and aparigraha, detachment. This list differs from the rules binding on Buddhists only in that Buddhism requires abstention from intoxicants, and has no separate rule against attachment to the things of the world. The cardinal rule of interaction with other jivas is the rule of ahimsa. This is because harming other jivas is caused by either passions like anger, or ignorance of their nature as living beings. Consequently, Jains are required to be vegetarians. According to the earliest Jain documents, plants both are and contain living beings, although one-sensed beings, so even a vegetarian life does harm. This is why the ideal way to end one’s life, for a Jain, is to sit motionless and starve to death. Mahavira himself, and other great Jain saints, are said to have died this way. That is the only way to be sure you are doing no harm to any living being.

While it may seem that this code of behavior is not really moral, since it is aimed at a specific reward for the agent—and is therefore entirely self-interested—it should be noted that the same can be said of any religion-based moral code. Furthermore, like the Hindus and Buddhists, Jains believe that the only reason that personal advantage accrues to moral behavior is that the very structure of the universe, in the form of the law of karma, makes it so.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Battacharya, Hari Mohan. Jaina Logic and Epistemology. Calcutta: K. P. Gagchi and Company, 1994.
    • A full explanation and critical examination of Jain theory of knowledge.
  • Battacharya, Narendra Nath. Jain Philosophy: Historical Outline. Delhi: Munshiram Manoharlal Publishers, 1976.
  • Benesch, Walter. An Introduction to Comparative Philosophy. London: Macmillan Press, 1997.
    • A systematic comparison of Western philosophical systems with Asian, including Jain, systems.
  • Jacobi, Herman, trans. Jaina Sutras. Sacred Books of the East, vols 22 and 45. London: Oxford University Press, 1884.
    • The only English translation of the Jain scriptures.
  • Sharma, Arvind. A Jaina Perspective on the Philosophy of Religion. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidas, 2001.
  • Tatia, Nathmal, trans. That Which Is: Tattvartha Sutra. San Francisco: HarperCollins Publishers, 1994.
    • An early Jain handbook.

Author Information

Mark Owen Webb
Texas Tech University
U. S. A.

Pudgalavada Buddhist Philosophy

buddhaThe Pudgalavāda was a group of five of the Early Schools of Buddhism. The name arises from their adherents’ distinctive doctrine (vāda) concerning the self or person (pudgala). The doctrine holds that the person, in a certain sense, is real. To other Buddhists, their view seemed to contradict a fundamental tenet of Buddhism, the doctrine of non-self. However, the Pudgalavādins were convinced that they had had preserved the true interpretation of the Buddha’s teaching.

Although now all but forgotten, the Pudgalavāda was one of the dominant traditions of Buddhism in India during the time that Buddhism survived there. It was never strong in other parts of Asia, however, and with the eventual disappearance of Buddhism in India, almost all of the literature of the Pudgalavāda was lost. It is difficult to reconstruct their understanding of the self from the few Chinese translations that have come down to us, and from the summaries of their doctrines and the critiques of their position that have been preserved by other Buddhist schools. But there is no doubt that they affirmed the reality of the self or person, and that with scriptural authority they held that the self of an enlightened one cannot be described as non-existent after death, in “complete Nirvana” (Parinirvana), even though the five “aggregates” which are the basis of its identity have then passed away without any possibility of recurrence in a further life. These five are material form, feeling, ideation, mental forces, and consciousness.

It seems, then, that they thought of some aspect or dimension of the self as transcending the aggregates and may have identified that aspect with Nirvana, which like most early Buddhists they regarded as an eternal reality. In its involvement with the aggregates through successive lives, the self could be seen as characterized by incessant change; but in its eternal aspect, it could be seen as having an identity that remains constant through all its lives until it fulfils itself in the impersonal happiness of Parinirvana. Although their account of the self seemed unorthodox and irrational to their Buddhist opponents, the Pudgalavādins evidently believed that only such an account could do justice to the Buddha’s moral teaching, to the accepted facts of karma, rebirth and liberation, and to our actual experience of selves and persons.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. The Problem of the Self in Buddhism
  3. The Pudgalavādin Characterization of the Self
  4. Reconstruction of the Pudgalavādin Conception of the Self
  5. Pudgalavādin Arguments in Support of their Conception of the Self
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

The Pudgalavāda was a group of five of the Early Schools of Buddhism, distinguished from the other schools by their doctrine of the reality of the self. The group consists of the Vātsīputrīya, the original Pudgalavādin School, and four others that derived from it, the Dharmottarīya, the Bhadrayānīya, the Sāmmitīya and the Shannagarika. Of these, only the Vātsīputrīya and the Sāmmitīya had a large following. The Vātsīputrīya evidently arose about two centuries after the death of the Buddha (the Parinirvana). Since the date of the Buddha’s death was probably in about 486 BCE or 368 BCE (according to which sources one follows), the rise of the Vātsīputrīya school would have been in the early third century or toward the middle of the second century BCE. According to the Chinese monk Xuanzang (Hsüan-tsang), who traveled in India in the seventh century CE, the Sāmmitīya was at that time by far the largest of the Shrāvakayāna schools (or Early Schools), equal in size to all of the other schools combined; and as the monastic populations of the Shrāvakayāna and the Mahāyāna were roughly the same, the Sāmmitīya represented about a quarter of the entire Buddhist monastic population of India. The Vātsīputrīya and a branch of the Sāmmitīya survived in India at least until the tenth century, but since the Pudgalavādin schools never spread to any great extent beyond the subcontinent, when Buddhism died out in India, the tradition of the Pudgalavāda came to an end.

The name Pudgalavāda came to be applied to these schools because “pudgala” was one of the words which they used for the self whose reality they affirmed. “Pudgala” is a term that appears in the early canonical texts with the meaning of a person or individual. The Pudgalavāda is thus a Doctrine of the Person, or Personalism, and Pudgalavādins are accordingly Personalists. Their use of the term “pudgala” has sometimes given the impression that they were trying to conceal their unorthodoxy by talking about a person rather than a self. But in fact they often used other words for the self, such as “ātman” and “jīva,” and were evidently quite unabashed in declaring that the self is real.

It is hardly necessary to point out the importance, both philosophically and historically, of a form of Buddhism which differs strikingly in its interpretation of the Buddha’s teaching from what we have come to regard as orthodox, and yet was for some time, at least, the dominant form of Shrāvakayāna Buddhism in India. But the difficulties facing us in investigating the Pudgalavāda are considerable. There is no living tradition of Pudgalavāda; there are no learned monks to whom we can turn for interpretations handed down within that tradition. There are very few Pudgalavādin texts that have survived, only two of them with anything to say about the self, and those only in Chinese translations of poor quality. Apart from these, we have extensive quotations from their texts (but none, unfortunately, dealing with the self) in an Indian Buddhist work which has survived only in Tibetan, some brief summaries of their doctrines in Tibetan and Chinese translations of Indian works on the formation of the Shrāvakayāna schools, and finally criticisms of their doctrines in works from other schools, some of these fortunately available in Pali or Sanskrit. The evidence we have is thus quite limited, much of it surviving only in translation, and some of it from hostile sources. Any interpretation of the Pudgalavādin doctrine of the self will necessarily be to a considerable extent a reconstruction, and should accordingly be regarded as a more or less plausible hypothesis rather than anything like a definitive account.

2. The Problem of the Self in Buddhism

The Buddha taught that no self is to be found either in or outside of the five skandhas or in their aggregates; the five are material form, feeling, ideation, mental forces, and consciousness. He rejected the two extreme positions of a permanent, unchanging self persisting in Samsara (cycle of death and rebirth) through successive lives, and of a self which is completely destroyed at death. He taught instead a middle position of dependent origination (pratītyasamutpāda), according to which our existence in this life has arisen as a result of our ethically significant volitional acts (karma) in our last life, and such volitional acts in our present life will give rise to our existence (but will not determine our acts) in our next life. What we are now is thus not the same as what we were, since this is a new life with a different body, different feelings and so on, but neither is it entirely separate from what we were, since what we are now is the result of decisions made in our past life.

In the non-Pudgalavādin schools, which we now think of as orthodox in this regard, this teaching was interpreted (not unreasonably) as a denial that there is any substantial self together with an affirmation of the complex process of evanescent phenomena which at any particular time we identify as a person. In the opinion of these schools, the teaching understood in this way offers several advantages: first, it is true, in the sense that it can be accepted as an accurate account of what can actually be observed of a person (including the events and decisions of past lives, which were supposed to be accessible to the Buddha’s memory); secondly, it removes the basis for selfishness (the root of both wrong-doing and suffering) by exposing the ultimate unreality of the self as a substantial entity; and thirdly, it supports the view that what we do makes a real difference to what we become in both this life and future lives. It thus offers rational hope for an eventual dismantling of the otherwise self-perpetuating mechanism of misunderstanding, craving and suffering in which we are trapped.

But this interpretation of the Buddha’s teaching also involves certain difficulties. In the first place, even if we can understand the functional identity of the person as simply the continuity of a causal process in which the evanescent phenomena of the five aggregates occur and recur in a gradually changing pattern, it is hard to understand how this continuity is maintained through death to the birth of the person in a new life. If rebirth is immediate, as the Theravādins held, how can the final moments of one life bring about the beginning of a new life in a place necessarily at some distance from the place of death? But if there is an intermediate state between death and rebirth, as the Sarvāstivādins held, how can the person journey from one life to the next when the aggregates of the old life have passed away and the aggregates of the new life have not yet arisen? Or if there are aggregates in the intermediate state, why does this state not constitute a life interposed between the one that has ended and the one that is to begin?

In the second place, the denial of the ultimate reality of the self certainly seems to cut away the basis for selfishness, but it seems in the same way to cut away the basis for compassion. If the effort to gain anything for oneself is essentially deluded, how can it not be equally deluded to try to gain anything for other persons, other selves? If to be liberated is to realize that there was never anyone to be liberated, why would that liberation not include the realization that there was never anyone else to be liberated either? Yet it was out of compassion that the Buddha, freshly enlightened, undertook to teach in the first place, and without that compassion there would have been no Buddhism.

Schools that accepted this interpretation, such as the Theravāda and Sarvāstivāda, were of course aware of these difficulties and dealt with them as well as they could. But it is not surprising that the Pudgalavādin schools, sensitive to such problems, developed a fundamentally different interpretation of the Buddha’s teaching about the self.

3. The Pudgalavādin Characterization of the Self

The Pudgalavādins described the person or self as “inexpressible,” that is, as indeterminate in its relation to the five aggregates, since it cannot be identified with the aggregates and cannot be found apart from them: the self and the aggregates are neither the same nor different. But whereas other schools took this indeterminacy as evidence that the self is unreal, the Pudgalavādins understood it to characterize a real self, a self that is “true and ultimate.” It is this self, they maintained, that dies and is reborn through successive lives in Samsara, continuing to exist until enlightenment is attained. Even in Parinirvana, when the aggregates of the enlightened self have passed away in death and no new aggregates can arise in rebirth, the self, though no longer existent with the aggregates of an individual person, cannot actually be said to be non-existent.

Like most other Shrāvakayāna Buddhists, the Pudgalavādins regarded Nirvana as a real entity, differing from the realm of dependent origination (though not absolutely distinct from it) in being uncaused (asamskrita) and thus indestructible. Accordingly, Nirvana is not something brought into being at the moment of enlightenment, but is rather an eternally existing reality which at that moment is finally attained. The Pudgalavādins held that the self is indeterminate also in its relation to this eternal reality of Nirvana: the self and Nirvana are neither the same nor different.

In its indeterminate relationship with the five aggregates and Nirvana, the self is understood to constitute a fifth category of existence, the “inexpressible.” The phenomena of the five aggregates and of temporal existence in general form three categories: past phenomena, present phenomena and future phenomena. Nirvana, as an eternal, uncaused reality, is the fourth category. The self or person, not to be described either as the same as the dependent phenomena of the temporal world or as distinct from them, is the fifth.

The Pudgalavādins distinguished three ways in which the self can be designated or conceived:

  1. according to the aggregates appropriated as its basis in a particular life: In the this case, we have a conception of a particular person based on what we know of that person’s physical appearance, feelings, thoughts, inclinations and awareness.
  2. according to its acquisition of new aggregates in its transition from a past life to its present one, or from the present life to a future one: In this case, we would have a conception of a particular person as one who was such-and-such a person, with that person’s body, feelings and so on, in a previous life, or as one who will be reborn as such-and-such a person, with that person’s body, feelings and so on, in a future life.
  3. according to the final passing away of its aggregates at death after attaining enlightenment: In the this case, we have a conception of a person who has attained Parinirvana based on the body, feelings, thoughts, inclinations and awareness that have passed away at death without any possibility of recurrence.

In this way, all the statements made by the Buddha—and by others on his authority or on the strength of their own observation, concerning persons or selves and their past or future existences—can be shown to be based on the five aggregates from which those persons are inseparable.

Other schools understood the self to be a merely conceptual entity in the sense that it was simply the diverse phenomena of the five aggregates comprehended for convenience under a single term such as “self” or “person.” They supposed its existence to be thus purely nominal; there is no single, substantial entity corresponding to the term we use for it. We might expect that the Pudgalavādins, who held that the self is real, would on the contrary insist that the self is not merely conceptual or nominal, but substantial. But in fact they seem to have regarded the self, at lest initially, as conceptual, though “true and ultimate.” A later source represents them as maintaining that it is neither conceptual nor substantial, and still later sources ascribe the view to them that the self is indeed substantial. The difference in these accounts may be the result of confusion in our sources, but it is certainly possible that the Pudgalavādins gradually modified their position under the pressure of criticism from other schools.

The Theravādins and Sarvāstivādins made a clear distinction between what are traditionally called “two truths,” which in modern parlance is a distinction between two types of “truth predicates”: ultimate truth (paramārthasatya) and conventional truth (samvritisatya). Ultimate truth distinguishes accurate statements about primary phenomena (dharmas) and their relationships. Conventional truth distinguishes accurate statements about persons and other composite entities; they were thus statements expressed according to the conventions of ordinary usage, and are true only in the sense that they could in principle be translated into accurate statements about the constituent phenomena on which such conventional notions as “person” and so on were based. The two types of truth predicates (commonly called the “Two Truths”) are to be distinguished from four important principles taught by the Buddha, which are not truth predicates, but are called the “Four Noble Truths.” These “Truths” are: (1) life is suffering (the Truth of Suffering), (2) suffering arises from desire (the Truth of the Origination of Suffering), (3) suffering can be stopped (the Truth of Nirvana and the Cessation of Suffering), (4) the cessation of suffering is brought about by adherence to the Buddhist Path, which consists of prescriptions such as the Eight Fold Path (the Truth of the Path).

The Pudgalavādins also distinguished between two kinds of doctrine, concerning phenomena and concerning persons, but they did not regard these as related to higher and lower kinds of truth predicates. They actually recognized three truth predicates: “ultimate truth,, “characteristical truth,” and “practical truth.” They identified ultimate truth with the Third Noble Truth, the Truth of Nirvana, and the cessation of suffering. Characteristical truth distinguishes the First, Second and Fourth of the Noble Truths, the Truths of Suffering, its Origin, and the Path leading to its cessation. Because the characteristical truth predicate was understood as characterizing the world oriented of the Four Noble Truths, it was understood as also distinguishing accurate claims about dependent phenomena. The practical truth predicate distinguished forms of speech and behavior inherited through local or family traditions or learned through monastic training. It would seem that the self was subject to all three of these truths, as the one who eventually attains the cessation of suffering, as the one who suffers as a result of craving and follows a path leading to the end of suffering, and as the one who speaks and acts in accordance with the norms of secular or monastic life.

4. Reconstruction of the Pudgalavādin Conception of the Self

What the Pudgalavādins said (or in some cases are said to have said) about the self is sufficient to locate their conception of the self in relation to various Buddhist and non-Buddhist opinions that they rejected. But the exact nature of their conception of it remains unclear. Just what was the self supposed to be? Was it simply the five aggregates taken together as a totality but which was not reducible to its parts? Or was it a persisting entity distinct from the aggregates but bound to them so that it could be said to change as the aggregates connected with it changed? Or was it in fact something else altogether?

If the self was supposed to be conceptual, as the Pudgalavādins seem initially to have asserted, that would tend to support the view that they regarded the self as the totality of its constituent aggregates. This view differed from the Theravādins and Sarvāstivādins in not thinking that this conceptual whole was reducible to its parts. On the other hand, if it was supposed to be substantial, as the Pudgalavādins seem later to have asserted, that would tend to support the view that they regarded it as an entity in its own right, non-different from the aggregates only in the sense that it was inseparably bound to them. But there is a problem that affects both of these interpretations. The person who has completely passed away in Parinirvana is supposed to be neither existent nor non-existent. If the self were the aggregates taken as a whole, then with the final destruction of body, feeling, and so on the self would simply be non-existent. But if the self were an entity distinct from the aggregates though bound to them, then in Parinirvana the self would either come to an end together with the aggregates and thus be non-existent, or else it would continue to exist without the aggregates, in spite of allegedly being bound to them, and so would be simply existent. The former interpretation in fact comes too close to identifying the self with the aggregates, and the latter, to treating it as a separate entity.

An analogy that the Pudgalavādins frequently made use of may give some indication of what they actually had in mind. They say that the person is to the aggregates as fire is to its fuel. This analogy appears in a number of the canonical texts and so would have to be accepted by all Buddhist who accepted these texts, though their understanding of it would of course be different from the Pudgalavādins’. As the Pudgalavādins explain it, fire is described in terms of its fuel, as a wood fire or a straw fire, but the fire is not the same as the fuel, nor can it continue to burn without the fuel. Similarly, the person is described in terms of the aggregates, as having such-and-such a physical appearance and so on, but it is not the same as that particular body, those feelings and so on, and cannot exist without a body, feelings and the other aggregates. This analogy makes it clear that although the aggregates in some sense support the self, they are not actually its constituents, since a fire, though supported by its fuel, is certainly not a whole constituted by some particular arrangement of logs.

What the analogy seems not to make clear is why the person in Parinirvana, no longer supported by the aggregates, is not simply non-existent like a fire that has gone out when its fuel is exhausted. But there is reason to think that the Pudgalavādins did not understand the extinction of the fire as we would. Several of the canonical texts that use this analogy specifically compare the Buddha after death to a fire that has gone out and has not gone north, south, east or west, but is simply extinct; but instead of going on to say that the Buddha is non-existent, they say that he is “unfathomable”, that he cannot be described in terms of arising or non-arising, existence or non-existence. Another text, preserved and accepted as authoritative by the Theravādins, explains that Nirvana exists eternally and can be attained even though there is no place where it is “stored up,” just as fire exists and can be produced by rubbing two sticks together even though there is no place where it is stored up. The extinction of the fire can be understood as a transition from its local existence supported by its fuel to a non-local state which cannot be described as either existence or non-existence. The Parinirvana of the Buddha will then be his transition from a local existence supported by the aggregates to a non-local state which is unfathomable. A canonical text of the Mahāyāna explicitly describes the non-local form of the Buddha after his death as his “eternal body,” which is said to be like the fire that has not gone north, south, east or west, but is simply extinct.

There is no evidence that the Pudgalavādins anticipated this Mahāyāna doctrine of an eternal body of the Buddha. However, the analogy understood in this way certainly indicates that the person or self (in this case, the Buddha) is a local manifestation of something. Could that “something” have been a supreme self such as we find in the Upanishads and the Vedānta, and, suitably qualified, in some Mahāyāna texts? There is no evidence to suggest that it was, and in fact the Pudgalavādins may have felt that it would be inappropriate to use the term designating a local, dependent manifestation of that something to refer to the something itself, which unlike any self was eternal and independent of the aggregates.

But there is some evidence which points in another direction. One of our Pudgalavādin sources speaks of the person in Parinirvana as having attained the “unshakeable happiness”, and another source says that the Pudgalavādins held that although Nirvana has the nature of non-existence, because there is no body, faculty or thought there, it also has the nature of existence, because the supreme, ever-lasting happiness is there. So Nirvana is characterized by eternal happiness, but it is a happiness unaccompanied by any body, faculty or thought. Moreover, another source ascribes to the Pudgalavādins the view that Nirvana is the quiescence of the person’s previous “coming and going” in Samsara; it seems to say, then, that Nirvana is a state that the person achieves. This “state” cannot be something that comes into being when Nirvana is attained; otherwise Nirvana would be dependent and so in principle impermanent. And in Parinirvana there are no aggregates, and thus no person, in any normal sense, of which this quiescence could be a state. But if this quiescence is Nirvana, it cannot be simply the non-existence of the person, since we are told explicitly that the person is not nonexistent in Parinirvana (though of course not existent, either). Nirvana must be quiescence in the sense in which it is the “cessation of suffering,” not as a state that arises at the moment of enlightenment and is completed at death, but as an already existing reality whose attainment puts an end to suffering and the coming and going of Samsara.

But in what sense is this eternal happiness “attained” by the person who at death ceases to exist as a self supported by body, faculties and thought? And in what sense is a person who has attained this eternal happiness “not non-existent” after death, even though the five aggregates have passed away once and for all? If even without the aggregates the person somehow survives to enjoy the eternal happiness, why do the Pudgalavādins deny that the person is existent in Parinirvana? But if the person does not survive and there is supposed to be only eternal happiness without anyone who enjoys it, in what sense does the person attain it?

The difficulty arises from the assumption that the self or person and Nirvana are two different things, the one impermanent and the other eternal. But the Pudgalavādins say that the self and Nirvana are neither the same nor different. Even while suffering in Samsara the self is not distinct from the eternal happiness of Nirvana, and when the person’s body, feelings and so on have passed away in Parinirvana, the self is still not entirely non-existent. That is because Nirvana, which is not distinct from the self, continues to exist. The relationship between the self and Nirvana, then, seems to be similar to that between the local manifestation of fire and the fire in its non-local state. The “something” that is locally manifested as a self on the basis of the aggregates would thus be Nirvana.

5. Pudgalavādin Arguments in Support of their Conception of the Self

The Pudgalavādins, like other Buddhist philosophers, saw it as their task to present what they believed to be the best interpretation of the teaching of the Buddha and to support that interpretation through rational argument. The correctness of the Buddha’s teaching was beyond question; what could be debated was the adequacy of this or that interpretation as an explanation of his meaning. Accordingly, their arguments were broadly of two kinds: appeals to the canonical texts (sutras) in which the Buddha’s teaching had been preserved, and arguments on the basis of consistency with acknowledged fact. These were not entirely distinct, since the Buddha’s teaching was supposed to be based not on divine revelation but on the exercise of human faculties developed to an extraordinary degree, and “acknowledged fact” was understood to include generally accepted Buddhist doctrines concerning, for example, karma and rebirth.

Appeals to the canonical texts were not entirely straightforward. These texts had been transmitted orally for several centuries before being committed to writing. Each school preserved its own versions of these texts, and although the versions agreed to a considerable extent, there were also differences, in some cases involving whole sutras. It was not enough, then, for the Pudgalavādins and their opponents to quote sutras from their own versions of the canon; they had to make sure that the sutra they quoted was also included in their opponents’ version. Otherwise, their opponents would feel free to dismiss it as quite possibly a forgery.

The Pudgalavādins often quoted passages in which the Buddha spoke of persons or the self as existing. In most cases, these could be readily explained by their opponents on the basis of the two truths: the Buddha spoke conventionally of persons and the self, but elsewhere made it clear that ultimately there are only the phenomena of the five aggregates. In the view of such non-Pudgalavādin schools as the Theravādins and Sarvāstivādins, these passages merely serve to explain how the Pudgalavādins have come to misunderstand the Buddha’s teaching; they give no support at all to the misinterpretation.

But there is one case at least in which the Buddha’s way of expressing himself is more difficult to account for, and the Theravādin and Sarvastivādin explanations of it show signs of strain. Here the Buddha speaks of the five aggregates as the burden, and identifies the bearer of the burden as the person. Certainly it is possible to explain this in terms, for example, of decisions made by the aggregates of a past life whose consequences are then a burden to the aggregates of this life. But the more natural and obvious reading is to take it as distinguishing between the person who transmigrates from life to life, and the aggregates which the person takes up with each life and carries as a burden.

In another passage to which the Pudgalavādins referred, the Buddha indicates that the idea that one has no self is a mistake. Their opponents were quick to point out that in the same passage he also indicates that the idea that one has a self is a mistake; the meaning, they would suggest, is that it is a mistake to affirm the ultimate existence of the self, but a mistake also to deny its conventional existence. This is certainly not unreasonable; but neither is the Pudgalavādins’ explanation: that it is a mistake to affirm the existence of a self that is either the same as the aggregates or separate from them (these being the two ways in which the self is usually imagined). but a mistake also to deny that there is any self at all.

The fact that the Buddha seems to have been generally unwilling to say outright that the self does not exist is something of an embarrassment for the Pudgalavādins’ opponents. The Buddha characteristically said that the self is not to be found in the aggregates or apart from them. The Theravādins, Sarvāstivādins and others take this to mean that there is no self at all (except nominally or conventionally); but the Pudgalavādins take it as characterizing an existing self which is neither the aggregates themselves nor something apart from them. Whenever the Buddha says that the aggregates in particular or phenomena (dharmas) in general are non-self, the Pudgalavādins understand this only as a denial that the self can be simply identified with them. The view of the Theravādins and Sarvāstivādins, that what we call the self is simply the ever-changing aggregates spoken and thought of for convenience as a persisting entity, seems to the Pudgalavādins to be equivalent to identifying the self with its aggregates, a view which the Buddha explicitly rejected.

Apart from appeals to the canonical texts, the Pudgalavādins also offered arguments pointing out what they saw as the inadequacy of their opponents’ view to account for some of the facts of personal existence and self-cultivation which were generally accepted by Buddhists. They argued, for example, that if there were no person distinguishable from the aggregates, there would be no real basis for identifying oneself, as the Buddha did, with the person that one was in a previous life, since the aggregates in the two lives would be completely different. They evidently felt that the causal relationship that was supposed to obtain between the aggregates of a past life and those of the present life was insufficient to establish a personal identity persisting through the successive lives.

They also argued that one of the meditations recommended by the Buddha, in which the meditator cultivates the wish that all sentient beings may be happy, presupposes the existence of real sentient beings, of persons, to be the objects of the meditator’s benevolence. They rejected their opponents’ opinion that the aggregates are the real object of benevolence, and insisted that if that were the case, the Buddha’s recommendation to wish that all sentient beings may be happy would not have been “well said”. In their opponents’ view, this was simply another case in which the Pudgalavādins failed to recognize that the Buddha spoke conventionally of sentient beings and persons when it would have been inconvenient to speak in terms of the aggregates, which were all that was ultimately there. But to the Pudgalavādins it seemed clear that benevolence toward a sentient being or person is not the same thing as benevolence (if it is possible at all) toward a series of constantly changing aggregates.

They argued also that the operation of karma is incomprehensible if the person is nothing more than an assemblage of phenomena. Destroying a particular arrangement of particles of clay in the form of an ox is not killing anything and has in itself no karmic consequences; but destroying a particular arrangement of aggregates in the form of a living ox is killing something and has unfortunate consequences for the person who killed it. If the ox is really nothing but an arrangement of aggregates, destroying that arrangement, rearranging the aggregates, should have no more moral and karmic significance than smashing the clay image of an ox. Their thought seems to have been something like this: the phenomena (dharmas) which are supposed to be the ox’s constituents cannot, strictly speaking, be destroyed, since their existence is in any case momentary; all that can be destroyed is the arrangement in which these phenomena have been occurring, and that, in the view of their opponents, is nothing real. As Buddhists, their opponents agree with the Pudgalavādins in accepting the effectiveness of karma, but their denial of the reality of the self makes nonsense of what they accept.

The analogy with fire was important in explaining the indeterminacy of the self or person in relation to the aggregates, but they did not offer it as an argument in its own right for the reality of the self. Its function was rather to clarify the nature of the relationship between the self and the aggregates, and to serve as evidence that at least one instance of such a relationship could be recognized in the world around us, so that there could be no justification for rejecting their position out of hand as manifestly impossible.

6. Conclusion

The view of the Pudgalavādins, that the self is a real entity which is neither the same as the aggregates nor different from them, is certainly paradoxical and seems to have been regarded by their opponents as fundamentally irrational. But they evidently felt that only such a view did justice to our actual experience of personal existence and to what in the Buddhist tradition were the accepted facts of karma, rebirth and final liberation. To some extent they were able to explain the paradox by pointing to the ways in which the self seems limited to a particular body, particular feelings and so on and the ways in which it also seems to transcend these, but the self in their view remains something mysterious and only partially amenable to the principles of rational thought.

The Theravādins, Sarvāstivādins and others naturally saw the Pudgalavādins’ account of the self as not so much paradoxical as incoherent. They were sure that the reason that the Pudgalavādins could not really make sense of the self they affirmed was that no such self is possible. But there was after all some justification for the Pudgalavādins’ view, that their opponents, if they achieved consistency, did so to some extent at the expense of the facts. And the insistence of the Theravādins and Sarvāstivādins on the precise determinacy of anything that they were prepared to regard as real brought its own problems, as the dialectic of the Mādhyamikas would show.

The very considerable success of the Pudgalavādins in India surely indicates that there were many who regarded their doctrine as a viable interpretation of the Buddha’s teaching. At the very least, it was an interpretation which, though different from what we now regard as orthodox, had significant strengths as well as weaknesses. Perhaps belief in a real though indeterminate self would tend, as their opponents argued, to reinforce our inveterate selfishness; but the Pudgalavādins held that the self once realized to be indeterminate could not be a basis for the self-love and craving that are the source of suffering. Their conception of a persisting self, moreover, could be felt to give a stronger sense of our investment in the person that we are to become, and thus a greater appreciation of the significance of our actions in this life. Finally, belief in the reality of other selves would seem to make it more difficult to ignore the suffering of others than if all persons were thought to be essentially an illusion. That there was in fact a danger that belief in the unreality of the self might lead to an attitude of indifference to other sentient beings is evident from the endless admonishments to cultivate compassion that we find in the works of the Mahāyāna.

As a theory of the self, the Pudgalavāda was naturally shaped and so in some measure limited by the concerns of Buddhism; the Pudgalavādins were interested in the nature of selfhood only to the extent that it had a bearing on the problem of suffering. But their interpretation of the Buddha’s teaching offers a perspective which is also of more general interest. Even in the fragmentary evidence that has come down to us, we can see at least the rough outline of a view which gives full weight to the instinctive conviction that as persons we are neither reducible to our apparent constituents, whether these are conceived to be dharmas or molecules, nor separable from our particular, concrete presence in the physical world. It is a view that reminds us of the experiential immediacy of our awareness of other selves, and that confirms our natural resistance to regarding a person as nothing more than a construct of the understanding. Finally, it renews in us the sense of something mysterious and perhaps ultimately unfathomable in the mere fact of our selfhood and of our existence in the world as conscious beings.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Aung, Shwe Zan and C.A.F. Rhys Davids. Points of Controversy. (English translation of the Kathāvatthu. ) London: Pali Text Society, 1915. Reprinted 1960.
  • Bareau, André. “Trois traités sur les sectes bouddhiques attribués à Vasumitra, Bhavya et Vinītadeva.” Journal Asiatique, 242 (1954), 229–66; 244 (1956), 167–200.
  • Bareau, André. Les sectes bouddhiques du petit véhicule. Paris: École Française d’ Extrême-Orient, 1955.
  • Conze, Edward. Buddhist Thought in India. London: George Allen & Unwin, 1962. Reprinted 1967, Ann Arbor: University of Michigan Press.
  • Demiéville, Paul. “L’origine des sectes bouddhiques d’après Paramartha.” Mélanges chinois et bouddhiques, 1 (1932),15–64. Reprinted 1973 in Choix d’études bouddhiques (1928–1970), Leiden: E.J. Brill, 80–130.
  • Dube, S.N. Cross Currents in Early Buddhism. New Delhi: Manohar, 1980.
  • Duerlinger, James. Indian Buddhist Theories of Persons: Vasubandhu’s “Refutation of the Theory of a Self”. London, New York: Routledge Curzon, 2003.
  • Dutt, Nalinaksha. Buddhist Sects in India. Calcutta: K.L. Mukhopadhyay, 1970.
  • Hurvitz, Leon. “The Road to Buddhist Salvation as Described by Vasubhadra.” (Includes a translation of part of the Siehanmu chaojie, Kumarabuddhi’s Chinese translation of the Tridharmakhandaka.) Journal of the American Oriental Society, 87.4 (1967), 434–86.
  • Jha, Ganganatha. The Tattvasamgraha of Sāntaraksita with the Commentary of Kamalasīla. (English translation of Shāntarakshita’sTattvasamgraha..) Baroda: Oriental Institute, 1937.
  • La Vallée Poussin, Louis de. L’Abhidharmakosa de Vasubandhu. (French translation from Xuanzang’s Chinese version of Vasubandhu’s Abhidharmakoshabhāshya.) Mélanges chinoises et bouddhiques, 16 (1923–31). Reprinted 1971.
  • La Vallée Poussin, Louis de. “La controverse du temps et du pudgala dans le Vijnānakāya.” (French translation of the first chapter of Xuanzang’s Chinese version of Devasharman’s Vijnānakāya.) Études Asiatiques, 20 (1923), 343–76.
  • Law, B.C. The Debates Commentary. (English translation of the Kathāvatthuppakarana-atthakathā.) London: Pali Text Society, 1940. Reprinted 1969.
  • Masuda, Jiryo. “Origin and Doctrines of Early Indian Buddhist Schools: a translation of the Hsüan-chwang version of Vasumitra’s treatise.” Asia Major, 2 (1925), 1–78.
  • Priestley, Leonard C.D.C. Pudgalavāda Buddhism: The Reality of the Indeterminate Self. Toronto: Centre for South Asian Studies, University of Toronto, 1999.
  • Sastri, N. Aiyaswami. Satyasiddhi of Harivarman, Vol. II. (English translation of Kumārajīva’s Chinese version of Harivarman’s Tattvasiddhi or Satyasiddhi.) Baroda: Oriental Institute, 1978.
  • Schayer, S. “Kamalasīlas Kritik des Pudgalavāda.” Rocnik Orientalistyczny, 10 (1934), 68–93.
  • Skilling, Peter. “History and Tenets of the Sāmmatīya School.” LinhSonPublications d’études bouddhiques, 19 (1982), 38–52.
  • Skilling, Peter. “The Samskrtāsamskrta-Viniscaya of Dasabalasrīmitra.” Buddhist Studies Review, 4.1 (1987), 3–23.
  • Stcherbatsky, T. Soul Theory of the Buddhists. (Includes an English translation from the Tibetan of the ninth chapter of Vasubandhu’s Abhidharmakoshabhāshya, the “Pudgalavinishcaya”.) Bulletin de l’Academie des Sciences de Russie, 1919: 823–54, 937–58. Reprinted 1970, Varanasi: Bharatiya Vidya Prakasan.
  • Thich Thien Chau, Bhikshu. The Literature of the Personalists of Early Buddhism. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1999. English translation by Sara Boin-Webb of Les Sectes personnalistes (Pudgalavâdin) du bouddhisme ancien, Thèse pour le Doctorat d’ État ès-Lettres et Sciences humaines, Université de la Sorbonne Nouvelle (Paris III), 1977.
  • Venkataramanan, K. “Sāmmitīyanikāya Sāstra.” (English translation of the Sāmmitīyanikāyashāstra..) Visva-Bharati Annals, 5 (1953), 155–243.
  • Walleser, Max. Die Sekten des alten Buddhismus. (Die buddhistische Philosophie in ihrer geschichtlichen Entwicklung, Part 4.) Heidelberg: Carl Winter, 1927.

Author Information

Leonard Priestley
University of Toronto

Hindu Philosophy

hindu2The compound “Hindu philosophy” is ambiguous. Minimally it stands for a tradition of Indian philosophical thinking. However, it could be interpreted as designating one comprehensive philosophical doctrine, shared by all Hindu thinkers. The term “Hindu philosophy” is often used loosely in this philosophical or doctrinal sense, but this usage is misleading. There is no single, comprehensive philosophical doctrine shared by all Hindus that distinguishes their view from contrary philosophical views associated with other Indian religious movements such as Buddhism or Jainism on issues of epistemology, metaphysics, logic, ethics or cosmology. Hence, historians of Indian philosophy typically understand the term “Hindu philosophy” as standing for the collection of philosophical views that share a textual connection to certain core Hindu religious texts (the Vedas), and they do not identify “Hindu philosophy” with a particular comprehensive philosophical doctrine.

Hindu philosophy, thus understood, not only includes the philosophical doctrines present in Hindu texts of primary and secondary religious importance, but also the systematic philosophies of the Hindu schools: Nyāya, Vaiśeṣika, Sāṅkhya, Yoga, Pūrvamīmāṃsā and Vedānta. In total, Hindu philosophy has made a sizable contribution to the history of Indian philosophy and its role has been far from static: Hindu philosophy was influenced by Buddhist and Jain philosophies, and in turn Hindu philosophy influenced Buddhist philosophy in India in its later stages. In recent times, Hindu philosophy evolved into what some scholars call “Neo-Hinduism,” which can be understood as an Indian response to the perceived sectarianism and scientism of the West. Hindu philosophy thus has a long history, stretching back from the second millennia B.C.E. to the present.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
    1. Defining Hinduism: Salient Features and False Starts
      1. Karma
      2. Polytheism
      3. Purushārthas: dharma, artha, kāma and mokṣa
      4. Varna (Caste)
    2. A Textual Definition of Hinduism and Hindu Philosophy
  2. Stage One: Non-Systematic Hindu Philosophy: The Religious Texts
    1. The Four Vedas
      1. Karma Khaṇḍa or Action Section of the Vedas
      2. Jñana Khaṇḍa or Knowledge Section of the Vedas
    2. Secondary Texts: Smṛti Literature
      1. Itihāsas
      2. Bhagavad Gītā
      3. Purāṇas
      4. Dharmaśāstra
  3. Stage Two: Systematic Hindu Philosophy: the Darśanas
    1. Nyāya
    2. Vaiśeṣika
    3. Sāṅkhya
    4. Yoga
    5. Pūrvamīmāṃsā
    6. Vedānta
      1. Bhedābheda
      2. Commonalities of the Three Famous Commentaries
      3. Advaita
      4. Viśiṣṭādvaita
      5. Dvaita
    7. Classical Hindu Philosophy in the Context of Indian Philosophy
  4. Stage Three: Neo-Hinduism
  5. Conclusion: the Status of Hindu Philosophy
  6. References and Further Readings
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Introduction

“Hinduism” is a term used to designate a body of religious and philosophical beliefs indigenous to the Indian subcontinent. Hinduism is one of the world’s oldest religious traditions, and it is founded upon what is often regarded as the oldest surviving text of humanity: the Vedas. It is a religion practiced the world over. Countries with Hindu majorities include Bali, India, Mauritius and Nepal, though countries in Asia, Africa, Europe and the Americas have sizable minorities of practicing Hindus.

For historical and doctrinal reasons, some modern Indologists have adopted the convention of distinguishing between traditional Hinduism and “Neo-Hinduism” (cf. Hacker; Halbfass, India and Europe). Against this distinction, “Hinduism” is often reserved for some traditional philosophical and religious beliefs indigenous to the Indian subcontinent, and “Neo-Hinduism” is reserved for a modern set of religious and philosophical beliefs articulated by Indians who defined their religious views in contrast to a perceived Western preoccupation with scientism and sectarianism. For many Western educated individuals in the world today (particularly those who count themselves as “Hindus”), the philosophy captured under the term “Neo-Hinduism” designates their religious and philosophical belief set. While Neo-Hinduism is no doubt a part of the Hindu philosophical tradition, it constitutes a distinct development within the tradition. Here the terms “Neo-Hindu” and “Neo-Hinduism” will be used to single out this recent development of Hindu thought. “Hindu” and “Hinduism” will be used to designate any portion of the tradition. The label “Hindu philosophy” will be reserved for the philosophical elements of Hinduism.

The history of Hindu philosophy can be divided roughly into three, largely overlapping stages:

  1. Non-Systematic Hindu Philosophy, found in the Vedas and secondary religious texts (beginning in the 2nd millennia B.C.E.)
  2. Systematic Hindu Philosophy (beginning in the 1st millennia B.C.E.)
  3. Neo-Hindu Philosophy (beginning in the 19th century C.E.)

Hindu philosophy is difficult to narrow down to a definite doctrine because Hinduism itself, as a religion, resists identification with any well worked out doctrine. This may not be so surprising when we consider that the term “Hinduism” itself is not in traditional, pre-colonial Hindu literature. Prior to the modern period of history, authors that we think of as Hindus did not identify themselves by that title. The term itself is not rooted in any Indian language, but likely derives from the Persian term “sindhu,” cognate with the Latin “Indus,” used to refer to inhabitants of the Indian subcontinent (cf. Monier-Williams p.1298). Its historical usage is thus an umbrella term that identifies many related religious and philosophical traditions that are not clearly part of another Indian tradition, such as Buddhism and Jainism.

Owing to the geographical proximity of the views grouped under the term “Hinduism” we might expect that such views have some comprehensive doctrinal similarities. However, many of the ideas and practices commonly associated with Hinduism can be found in adjacent Indian religio-philosophical traditions, such as Buddhism and Jainism. Moreover, some of them are not common to all Hindu thinkers. The rich diversity of views within the Hindu tradition that overlap with non-Hindu views makes identifying “Hinduism” on the basis of a shared, comprehensive doctrine difficult if not impossible.

a. Defining Hinduism: Salient Features and False Starts

i. Karma

A common thesis associated with Hinduism is the view that events in a person’s life are determined by karma. The term literally means “action,” but in this context it denotes the moral, psychological spiritual and physical causal consequences of morally significant past choices. If it were the case that a belief in karma is common to all Hindu philosophies, and only Hindu philosophies, then we would have a clear doctrinal criterion for identifying Hinduism. This approach is unsuccessful because a belief in karma is common to many of India’s religious traditions—including Buddhism and Jainism. Moreover, it is not evident that it is embraced by all sources that we consider Hindu. For instance, the doctrine of karma seems to be absent from much of the Vedas. Karma is not a sufficient criterion of Hinduism, and it likely is not a necessary condition either.

ii. Polytheism

Polytheism, or the worship of many deities, is often identified as a distinctive feature of Hinduism. However, it is not true that all Hindus are polytheists. Indeed, many Hindus belong to sectarian traditions (such as Vaiṣṇavism, or Śaivism) that specify that only one deity (Viṣṇu, in the first case, or Śiva, in the second), or a very small set of deities, are genuine Gods, and subordinate the rest of the pantheon associated with Hinduism to the status of exalted beings. We could identify Hinduism as the set of religious views that recognize the divinity or exalted status of a core set of Indic deities, but this too would not provide a way to separate Hinduism from Buddhism and Jainism. Many “Hindu” deities, such as Brahmā (the Creator God), are recognized and treated as exalted beings and deities in the Buddhist Pāli Canon (cf. Majjhima Nikāya II.130; Saṃyutta Nikāya I.421-23). Likewise, the popular Hindu deity Kṛṣṇa is treated in the early Jain tradition as a Jain Ford Maker, and a tradition of worshiping the Goddess Lakṣmī (a goddess revered by Hindus as the consort of Viṣṇu) continues amongst Jains today (see Dundas pp. 98, 183). Belief in certain deities might constitute a necessary condition of Hinduism, but it is not a sufficient criterion.

iii. Puruṣārthas : dharma, artha, kāma and mokṣa

Hinduism might be identified with a core set of values, commonly known in Hindu literature as the puruṣārthas , or ends of persons. The puruṣārthas are a set of four values: dharma, artha, kāma and mokṣa. “Dharma” in the Puruṣārtha scheme and throughout much of Hindu literature stands for the ethical or moral (in action, or in character, hence it is often translated as “duty”), “artha” for economic wealth, “kāma” for pleasure, and “mokṣa” for soteriological liberation from rebirth and imperfection. Hinduism, one might argue, is any religious view from the Indian subcontinent that recognizes that human beings ought to maximize the puruṣārthas at the appropriate time and in the appropriate ways. This approach will not do, for not all views that we consider Hindu recognize the validity of all of these values. While many of the systematic Hindu philosophical schools seem to be critical of kāma, understood as sensual pleasure, the early stage of one Hindu philosophical school—Pūrvamīmāṃsā—does not recognize the idea that there is anything like liberation as a possible end for individuals.

The puruṣārthas are important for any study of Indian thought, however, for they constitute the value-theoretic backdrop against which Indian thinkers articulated their views: typically, most all Indian philosophers recognized the validity of all four values, though some, like the Materialists (Cārvāka) are on record as holding that kāma or sensual pleasure is the only dharma or morality (Guṇaratna p.276), and that there is no such thing as liberation. Others such as the early Pūrvamīmāṃsā ignore the idea of personal liberation but emphasizes the importance of dharma. As all Hindu philosophical schools appear to recognize something that might count as “dharma” or morality, we might attempt to understand Hinduism in terms of its allegiance to a particular moral theory. This attempt to define Hinduism in terms of a simple doctrine fails, for some of what passes for dharma (ethics, morality or duty) in the context of particular schools of Hindu philosophical thought share much with non-Hindu, but Indian schools of thought. This is particularly apparent in the case of the Hindu philosophical school of Yoga, whose moral theory shares much with Jainism, and with Buddhist Mahāyāna thought. Also, there is sufficient variation amongst the schools of Hindu philosophy on moral matters that makes defining Hindu philosophy solely on the basis of a shared moral doctrine impossible. If there is a core moral theory common to all Hindu schools, it is likely to be so thin that it will also be found as a component of other Indian religions. Thus, an ethical theory might be a necessary criterion of Hinduism, but it is insufficient.

iv. Varna (Caste)

Finally, one might attempt to identify Hinduism with the institution of a caste system that carves society into a specified set of classes whose natures dispose them and obligate them to certain occupations in life. More specifically, one might argue that Hinduism is any belief system wedded to the idea that any well ordered society is composed of four castes: Brahmins (priestly or scholarly caste), Kṣatriya (marshal or royal caste), Vaiśyas (merchant caste) and Sūdras (labor caste).
This approach to defining Hinduism is essentially a rehabilitation of the idea that some core moral doctrine cements Hinduism together. There are two problems with this approach that renders it unhelpful to identifying Hinduism. First, anyone familiar with Indian society will know that caste (“varna,” or more commonly “jāti”) is an Indian phenomenon that is not restricted to Hindu sections of society. One might argue that the approving use of the term “Brahmin” in Buddhist and Jain texts shows that even these socially critical movements were comfortable with a caste structured society provided that obligations and privileges accorded to the various castes were justly distributed (cf. Dhammapada ch. XXVI; cf. Sūtrakṛtānga I.xii.11-21). Secondly, and more importantly, it is not clear that caste is philosophically important to many schools that are conventionally understood under the heading of “Hindu philosophy.” Some schools, such as Yoga, appear to be implicitly critical of life in conventional society guided by the values of social and ecological domination, while some schools, such as Advaita Vedānta, are openly critical of the idea that caste morality has any relevance to a spiritually serious aspirant.

b. A Textual Definition of Hinduism and Hindu Philosophy

Because the term “Hinduism” has no roots in the self-conceptualization of people that we in retrospect label as “Hindus,” we are unlikely to find anything very significant in the way of philosophical doctrine that is essential to Hinduism. Yet, the term continues to be useful because it centers on a stance that separates Hindu thinkers from Buddhist, Jain, or Sikh thinkers. The stance in question is openness to the provisional validity of a core set of Hindu texts. At the center of the canon of Hindu texts is the Vedas, followed by a large body of literature of secondary religious importance, which largely derive their legitimacy from Vedic thought. Non-systematic Hindu philosophy is comprised of the philosophical elements of the primary and secondary bodies of canonical Hindu texts, while the systematic Hindu philosophies, which also adopt the congenial disposition towards the Vedas, find their definitive expressions in formal philosophical texts authored by professional philosophers. Finally, Neo-Hindu philosophy of late likewise adopts a positive disposition to the Vedas, and hence constitutes the latest offering in the history of Hindu philosophy.

2. Stage One: Non-Systematic Hindu Philosophy: The Religious Texts

a. The Four Vedas

The Vedas are a large corpus, originally committed to memory and transmitted orally from teacher to student. The term “veda” means “knowledge” or “wisdom” and embodies what was likely regarded by its original attendants as the sum-total of the knowledge of their people. On the basis of linguistic variations in the corpus, contemporary scholars are of the opinion that the Vedas were composed at various points during approximately a 900 year span that can be no later than 1500 B.C.E. to 600 B.C.E.. The Vedas are composed in an Indo-European language that is loosely referred to as Sanskrit, but much of it is in an ancient precursor to Sanskrit, more properly called Vedic.

The Vedic corpus is comprised of four works each called “Vedas.” The four Vedas are Ṛg Veda, Sāma Veda, Yajur Veda and Atharva Veda, respectively. Each of the four Vedas is edited into four distinct sections: Mantras, Brāhmanas, Āraṇyakas, and Upaniṣads.

i. Karma Khaṇḍa or Action Section of the Vedas

The main portion of the Veda (which the term “Veda” most properly refers to) consists of mantras, or sacred chants and incantations. A section called the Brāhmanas, which contains ritual instruction, and speculative discussions on the meaning of Vedic rituals, follows this. These first two portions comprise what is often called the karma khaṇḍa or “action portion” of the Vedas, or alternatively, the Pūrvamīmāṃsā (“former inquiry”). (The philosophical school of Pūrvamīmāṃsā takes its name from its focus on the early part of the Vedas.)

Many of the hymns of the karma khaṇḍa ask for special favors from deities, and emphasize the worldly rewards of artha (economic prosperity) and kāma (sensual pleasure) that come from propitiating gods through prescribed sacrifices. However, the earlier portion of the Vedas is not entirely devoid of lofty or philosophical significance. Many of the mantras resurface in the latter portion of the Vedas as dense expressions of metaphysical theses. Moreover, many portions of the karma khaṇḍa elaborate the significance of the various Vedic deities, which surpass the role that could be attributed to them in a polytheistic context. Instead, what one finds frequently is the elevation of a single deity to the level of the cosmic soul (for example, see the Śrī Rudra).

A recurrent cosmological and ethical vision appears to emerge in the karma khaṇḍa. This is the idea that the universe is a closed ethical system, supported by a system of reciprocal sacrifice and obligation. In this context, the karma khaṇḍa promotes the practice of animal sacrifices to the gods, to ensure that conditions on earth are livable and fruitful for all of its inhabitants. A related doctrine that begins to emerge in portions of the karma khaṇḍa is the four-fold caste system that sets out strict obligations for all to fulfill, along with the idea that the caste-social order is divinely ordained. This is most clearly related in the Puruṣa Sūkta, a section of mantras from the Ṛg Veda. According to the Puruṣa Sūkta, the universe, as we know it, is a result of the self-sacrifice of a Cosmic Person (an ultimate God, later identified with Viṣṇu or Śiva, depending upon sectarian contexts). Upon being bound and sacrificed by the gods, the various portions of the Cosmic Person become the various castes: the head becomes the Brahmins, the arms become the Ksatriya caste, the thighs become the Vaiśya caste, and the feet become the Sūdra caste. While the caste system may be a pervasively Indian phenomenon, the idea that the caste system is divinely ordained appears to be found in Hindu philosophies in proportion to the weight they give to the authority of the karma khaṇḍa.

ii. Jñana Khaṇḍa or Knowledge Section of the Vedas

The karma khaṇḍa is followed by the Āraṇyakas, or forest books, which for the most part eschew rituals, and are far more speculative. After the Āraṇyakas come the section of the Vedas known as the “ Upaniṣads,” which consist of a dialogue between a teacher and student on metaphysical, axiological and cosmological issues. Whereas the goal of the early portion of the Vedas is action, the goal of the latter portion of the Vedas is jñāna (knowledge) of Brahman (a neuter term for the Ultimate, depicted in the Upaniṣads as the ultimate God). Further, the Upaniṣads identify Brahman with Ātma (Self) and suggest that knowing this entity will save one from all sorrow (cf. Muṇdaka Upaniṣad 7) and result in liberation. Brahman or Ātma is additionally presented as the omniscient, omnipotent and omnipresent entity hidden from plain view, but known through philosophical speculation that is driven by dissatisfaction with earthly rewards. This latter part of the Vedas is often referred to as the uttara mīmāṃsā (“higher inquiry”), or the vedānta, which means “end of the Vedas.” Alternatively, it is known as the jñāna khaṇḍa, or “knowledge portion” of the Vedas. (The Hindu schools known as Vedānta take their name from their focus on this portion of the Vedas). The sustained theme of the uttara mīmāṃsā is that the cosmos as we know it is the result of the causal efficacy of Brahman, or Ātma, that the results of works are ephemeral, and that knowledge of reality brings everlasting reward. The uttara mīmāṃsā is characterized by a pervasive dissatisfaction with ritual (cf. Muṇdaka Upaniṣad I.ii.10).

The specific relationship between the individual and Brahman, or Ātma, is a matter of controversy amongst commentators on the latter portions of the Vedas. Four major commentarial schools evolved to interpret the import of the later portions of the Vedas. This confirms the suspicion that the actual position of the Upaniṣads is less than clear, or at least debatable. (See Vedānta.)

b. Secondary Texts: Smṛti Literature

On many traditional Hindu accounts (specifically the account found in the Pūrvamīmāṃsā and Vedānta schools), the Vedas are regarded as “śruti”, “heard” or revealed texts, and are contrasted with smṛti or remembered texts. The smṛti texts are far more numerous, but purport to be based upon the learning of the Vedas. Unlike the Vedas, the smṛtis were traditionally regarded as appropriate for general consumption, while the Vedas were regarded as the sole preserve of the high castes. The smṛti literature, as a rule, was originally authored in Sanskrit. Over time, however, translations into vernacular languages became popular, and additional texts were authored in vernaculars.

The tradition of smṛti literature stretches back to the end of the Vedic period, and in some ways is still very much alive today. The smṛti texts can all be read as attempting to unify the seemingly divergent goals of the action section of the Vedas (being morality, or dharma) and the knowledge section of the Vedas (being liberation or mokṣa). The overall strategy offered in the various smṛti texts is to affirm a moral scheme known traditionally as varna āśrama dharma, or the morality of caste (varna) and station in life (āśrama). This scheme reconciles the demands of dharma and mokṣa, as well as artha and kāma, by apportioning different stages of life to the pursuit of different ends. At the end of childhood, and before the beginning of adolescence, an individual is typically expected to be a celibate student (brahmacarya), and learn one caste’s ways. Then at an appropriate age they are to marry and become a householder (gṛhastha). During this stage an individual is permitted and expected to pursue the ends of kāma or sensual pleasure through married life and artha or economic prosperity through caste occupations. After raising a family, a couple is to retire to the forest and become forest dwellers (vānaprastha), to facilitate their transition from a life focused on kāma and artha to a life geared towards liberation. Finally, individuals give up all possessions, renounce society and become a ascetic (sannyāsa) at which point they are to focus solely on mokṣa or spiritual liberation.

There are three prominent varieties of smṛti literature that are important to the study of Hindu philosophy. Though they for the most part express and extol the doctrine of varna āśrama dharma, they are composed in different styles, and with different audiences in mind.

i. Itihāsas

The best known of the smṛti literature are the great Hindu epics, such as the Mahābhārata and Rāmāyana. The focal plot of the Mahābhārata is a fratricidal war between the children of two princes. The deity Kṛṣṇa figures prominently in this epic, as a mutual cousin of both warring factions, though he is not the protagonist. The Rāmāyana is an account of the life story of the crown prince Rāma up until he vanquishes the tyrant King Rāvana and successfully rescues his wife and the crown princess Sītā from Rāvana’s grips. Both Kṛṣṇa and Rāma are traditionally regarded as human incarnations of Viṣṇu. Both the Mahābhārata and Rāmāyana are grouped under the heading of itihāsa (‘thus spoken’) literature. The focal events of the two epics likely occurred between 1000 B.C.E. and 700 A.D. (Thapar p. 31) though the epics themselves appear to have gone through a long process of revision and evolution before their final Sanskrit versions appear on the scene in the first two centuries of the common era.

Itihāsas, though recorded in the form of a narrative, are littered with philosophical discussions on cosmology, and ethics. The most philosophically famous portion of the itihāsa literature is the Bhagavad Gītā. The Bhagavad Gītā forms a portion of the Mahābhārata, but owing to its importance in the tradition it is often regarded as a stand-alone text.

ii. Bhagavad Gītā

The Bhagavad Gītā consists of a discourse given by Kṛṣṇa on the eve of the battle of the fratricidal war of the Mahābhārata to his cousin Arjuna, who becomes despondent at the thought of engaging in a war whose main aim is resting control over the throne, at the expense of the destruction of his family. Kṛṣṇa exhorts Arjuna to do his duty as a Ksatriya and fight the war that he has been charged with (Bhagavad Gītā 2:31). For “[b]etter is one’s own duty, though ill done, than the duty of another well done….” (Bhagavad Gītā 18:47; cf. Manu X. 97). In keeping with the general theme of the smṛti literature, Kṛṣṇa focuses on reconciling the goal of mokṣa with that of dharma. Kṛṣṇa’s first solution to the problem of the conflict of dharma and mokṣa involves doing one’s duty with a strong deontological consciousness, which attends to duty for duty’s sake, and not for its rewards. This deontological attitude not only perfects moral action, on Kṛṣṇa’s account, but it also constitutes true renunciation, which is a prerequisite to mokṣa. Kṛṣṇa calls the deontological renunciation of rewards of dutiful action karma yoga, or the discipline (yoga) of action (karma) (Bhagavad Gītā ch.3). This is not the only type of yoga that Kṛṣṇa prescribes. He also propounds what he identifies as distinct yogas (Bhagavad Gītā chs. 4-11) that might be grouped under the heading of jñāna yoga, or the discipline (yoga) of knowledge (jñāna), whereby one develops a detached attitude towards the fruits of works through knowledge of the excellences and unchanging nature of the transcendent (sometimes spoken of as “Brahman” in this text), and the ephemeral and temporary nature of worldly accomplishments. To this end, Kṛṣṇa calls upon the philosophy of Sāṅkhya and Yoga, as well as the philosophical concepts of the Upaniṣads to explicate the nature of the changing and the transcendent. Finally, Kṛṣṇa also prescribes what he calls bhakti yoga or the “discipline (yoga) of devotion (bhakti)” (Bhagavad Gītā chs. 12-18). Whereas in karma yoga, one merely gives up fruits of actions, in bhakti yoga one offers the fruits of one’s actions to God. Whereas in jñāna yoga one pursues knowledge for its own sake, in bhakti yoga one pursues knowledge for the sake of a loving relationship with the Ultimate. Kṛṣṇa appears to hold that any of the ways that he prescribes will result in liberation for all three varieties of yogas will ensure that the obstacle to liberation—attachment to fruits of actions—is over come.

iii. Purāṇas

Purāna” means history and is the term applied to a group of texts that share a few features: (a) they typically provide a detailed history of the origin of the various gods and the Universe, and (b) they are written in praise of the exploits of a particular deity. Unlike the itihāsas, the Purāṇas are not restricted to incarnations of deities, but describe the activities of the deities, including their incarnations. The Purāṇa literature comes down to us from a time that post dates the composition of the Vedas, though their precise dates of composition are not known (cf. Thapar p.29). There are many Purāṇas, though the most famous is likely the Bhāgavata Purāṇa.

The Bhāgavata Purāṇa is distinguished amongst Purāṇas for being regarded by Gaudiya Vaiṣṇavism, founded by the medieval Bengali saint Caitanya, as the ultimate revelation on all doctrinal matters. This tradition has come into prominence in recent times in the form of the International Society for Kṛṣṇa Consciousness, commonly known as the Hare Kṛṣṇa movement. According to the Bhāgavata Purāṇa, the Ultimate (Brahman) is both identical with and distinct from creation: on this account, Brahman converts itself into the universe but maintains a distinct identity all the same. The Bhāgavata Purāṇa also identifies Viṣṇu with Brahman, and holds that bhakti (devotion) is the chief means of attaining liberation, which consists in the personal absorption of the individual (jīva) in Brahman. The Bhāgavata Purāṇa thus presents one of the famous and enduring theistic expressions of the Bhedābheda philosophy. In the way of ethics, the Bhāgavata Purāṇa strays little from the Varna āśrama dharma found in most smṛti literature (Bhāgavata Purāṇa I.ii.9-12), though it advocates what it calls “bhāgavata dharma” (bhāgavata ethic) which is a combination of the karma yoga and bhakti yoga of the Gītā supplemented with an emphasis on living the life characteristic of a devotee of Kṛṣṇa as described in the Bhāgavata Purāṇa (XI.iii.23-31).

iv. Dharmaśāstra

The term “dharmaśāstra” literally means treaties or science (śāstra) of dharma. The term refers to a corpus of literature clearly authored by Brahmins with the aim of reinforcing a particular conception of Varna āśrama dharma: a moral theory that critics will note ensures that Brahmins are allotted a privileged or crowning position in the caste scheme. The dharmaśāstras contain many features of other smṛti literature that make them philosophically interesting.

Like the Purāṇa literature, many of the dharmaśāstras provide accounts of the origins of the universe, and sometimes they delve into the question of the means to liberation. Their dominant concern however is to prescribe the specific duties and privileges of each caste. After attending to the political question of the proper ordering of society, the dharmaśāstras typically focus on the matter of prayaścitta, or ritual expiation (see Kane vol.4 ch.1 pp. 1-40).

The idea of ritual expiation can be understood as a procedure concerned with alleviating ritual impurity. However, it also has clear moral implications: prayaścittas are prescribed for every manner of offence, and if an agent undertakes the appropriate prayaścitta, they can atone for their moral transgressions. A prayaścitta can take the form of a ritual, an act of charity, or corporal punishment. The idea that one can ritually atone for moral transgressions is unique to the dharmaśāstras, and related texts in the history of Hindu philosophy.

3. Stage Two: Systematic Hindu Philosophy: the Darśanas

Core Hindu canonical texts—the Vedas—form the textual backdrop against which many of the systematic Hindu philosophies are articulated. However, they do not exhaust the import of Hindu philosophy for two main reasons. First, the Vedas are not composed with the intention of being systematic treaties on philosophical issues. They leave many issues of philosophy relatively untouched. Secondly, the core Hindu canonical texts are not canonical in the same way for all Hindus. By and large, those we tend to regard as Hindu accord some type of provisional authority to both the Vedas, and the secondary Vedic literature. However, the authority accorded is something that Hindu thinkers have disagreed upon. Some of the foundational works in systematic Hindu philosophy do not explicitly mention the Vedas (for example, the Sāṅkhya Kārikā), leaving the impression that these schools were tolerant of the authority of the Vedas, but not philosophically wedded to it in any deep sense.

The term “darśana” in Sanskrit translates as “vision” and is conventionally regarded as designating what we are inclined to look upon as systematic philosophical views. The history of Indian philosophy is replete with darśanas. The number of darśanas to be found in the history of Indian philosophy depends largely on the organizational question of how one is to enumerate darśanas: how much difference between expressions of philosophical views can be tolerated before we are inclined to count texts as expressing distinct darśanas? The question seems particularly pertinent in cases like Buddhist and Jain philosophy, which have all had rich philosophical histories. The issue is relatively easier to settle in the context of Hindu philosophy, for a convention has developed over the centuries to count systematic Hindu philosophy as being comprised of six (āstika, or Veda recognizing) darśanas. The six darśanas are: Nyāya, Vaiśeṣika, Sāṅkhya, Yoga, Pūrvamīmāṃsā, and Vedānta.

As a rule, systematic Indian philosophy (Hinduism, Jainism and Buddhism) was recorded in Sanskrit, the pan-Indian language of scholarship, after the end of the Vedic period. While scholars are confident about the approximate dates that the texts of systematic Indian philosophy handed down to us were written (cf. Potter, “Bibliography,” Encyclopaedia of Indian Philosophies, vol.1) scholars are not in many cases as confident about the age of the schools themselves. Moreover, most of the schools of Hindu philosophy have existed side by side. Thus, the order of explication of the systematic schools of Hindu philosophy follows the conventional order of explication and not any particular historical order.

a. Nyāya

The term “nyāya” traditionally had the meaning “formal reasoning,” though in later times it also came to be used for reasoning in general, and by extension, the legal reasoning of traditional Indian law courts. Opponents of the Nyāya school of philosophy frequently reduce it to the status of an arm of Hindu philosophy devoted to questions of logic and rhetoric. While reasoning is very important to Nyāya, this school also had important things to say on the topic of epistemology, theology and metaphysics, rendering it a comprehensive and autonomous school of Indian philosophy.

The Nyāya school of Hindu philosophy has had a long and illustrious history. The founder of this school is the sage Gautama (2nd cent. C.E.)—not to be confused with the Buddha, who on many accounts had the name “Gautama” as well. Nyāya went through at least two stages in the history of Indian philosophy. At an earlier, purer stage, proponents of Nyāya sought to elaborate a philosophy that was distinct from contrary darśanas. At a later stage, some Nyāya and Vaiśeṣika authors (such as Śaṅkara-Misra, 15th cent. C.E.) became increasingly syncretistic and viewed their two schools as sister darśanas. As well, at the latter stages of the Nyāya tradition, the philosopher Gaṅgeśa (14th cent. C.E.) narrowed the focus to the epistemological issues discussed by the earlier authors, while leaving off metaphysical matters and so initiated a new school, which came to be known as Navya Nyāya, or “New” Nyāya. Our focus will be mainly on classical, non-syncretic, Nyāya.

According to the first verse of the NyāyaSūtra, the Nyāya school is concerned with shedding light on sixteen topics: pramāna (epistemology), prameya (ontology), saṃśaya (doubt), prayojana (axiology, or “purpose”), dṛṣṭānta(paradigm cases that establish a rule), Siddhānta (established doctrine), avayava (premise of a syllogism), tarka (reductio ad absurdum), nirnaya (certain beliefs gained through epistemically respectable means), vāda (appropriately conducted discussion), jalpa (sophistic debates aimed at beating the opponent, and not at establishing the truth), vitaṇḍa(a debate characterized by one party’s disinterest in establishing a positive view, and solely with refutation of the opponent’s view), hetvābhāsa (persuasive but fallacious arguments), chala (unfair attempt to contradict a statement by equivocating its meaning), jāti (an unfair reply to an argument based on a false analogy), and nigrahasthāna (ground for defeat in a debate) (NyāyaSūtra and Vātsyāyana’s Bhāṣya I.1.1-20).

With respect to the question of epistemology, the NyāyaSūtra recognizes four avenues of knowledge: these are perception, inference, analogy, and verbal testimony of reliable persons. Perception arises when the senses make contact with the object of perception. Inference comes in three varieties: pūrvavat (a priori), śeṣavat (a posteriori) and sāmanyatodṛṣṭa (common sense) (NyāyaSūtra I.1.3–7).

The Nyāya’s acceptance of both arguments from analogy and testimony as means of knowledge, allows it to accomplish two theological goals. First, it allows Nyāya to claim that the Veda’s are valid owing to the reliability of their transmitters (NyāyaSūtra II.1.68). Secondly, the acceptance of arguments from analogy allows the Nyāya philosophers to forward a natural theology based on analogical reasoning. Specifically, the Nyāya tradition is famous for the argument that God’s existence can be known for (a) all created things resemble artifacts, and (b) just as every artifact has a creator, so too must all of creation have a creator (Udayanācārya and Haridāsa Nyāyālaṃkāra I.3-4).

The metaphysics that pervades the Nyāya texts is both realistic and pluralistic. On the Nyāya view the plurality of reasonably believed things exist and have an identity independently of their contingent relationship with other objects. This applies as much to mundane objects, as it does to the self, and God. The ontological model that appears to pervade Nyāya metaphysical thinking is that of atomism, the view that reality is composed of indecomposable simples (cf. NyāyaSūtra IV.2.4.16).

Nyāya’s treatment of logical and rhetorical issues, particularly in the Nyāya Sūtra, consists in an extended inventory acceptable and unacceptable argumentation. Nyāya is often depicted as primarily concerned with logic, but it is more accurately thought of as being concerned with argumentation.

b. Vaiśeṣika

The Vaiśeṣika system was founded by the ascetic, Kaṇāḍa (1st cent. C.E.). His name translates literally as “atom-eater.” On some accounts Kaṇāḍa gained this name because of the pronounced ontological atomism of his philosophy (Vaiśeṣika Sūtra VII.1.8), or because he restricted his diet to grains picked from the field. If the Nyāya system can be characterized as being predominantly concerned with matters of argumentation, the Vaiśeṣika system can be characterized as overwhelmingly concerned with metaphysical questions. Like Nyāya, Vaiśeṣika in its later stages turned into a syncretic movement, wedded to the Nyāya system. Here the focus will be primarily on the early Vaiśeṣika system, with the help of some latter day commentaries.

Kaṇāḍa’s Vaiśeṣika Sūtra’s opening verses are both dense and very revealing about the scope of the system. The opening verse states that the topic of the text is the elaboration of dharma (ethics or morality). According to the second verse, dharma is that which results not only in abhyudaya but also the Supreme Good (niḥreyasa), commonly known as mokṣa (liberation) in Indian philosophy (Vaiśeṣika Sūtra I.1.1-2). The term “abhyudaya” designates the values extolled in the early, action portion of the Vedas, such as artha (economic prosperity) and kāma (sensual pleasure). From the second verse it thus appears that the Vaiśeṣika system regards morality as providing the way for the remaining puruṣārthas . A reading of the obscure third verse provided by the latter day philosopher Śaṅkara-Misra (15th cent. C.E.) states that the validity of the Vedas rests on the fact that it is an explication of dharma. (Misra’s alternative explanation is that the phrase can be read as asserting that the validity of the Vedas derives from the authority of its author, God—this is a syncretistic reading of the Vaiśeṣika Sūtra, influenced by Nyāya philosophy.) (Śaṅkara-Misra’s Vaiśeṣika Sūtra Bhāṣya I.1.2, p.7).

From the densely worded fourth verse, it appears that the Vaiśeṣika system regards itself as an explication of dharma. The Vaiśeṣika system holds that the elaboration or knowledge of the particular expression of dharma (which is the Vaiśeṣika system) consists of knowledge of six categories: substance (dravya), attribute (guṇa), action (karma), genus (sāmānya), particularity (viśeṣa), and the relationship of inherence between attributes and their substances (samavāya) (Vaiśeṣika Sūtra I.1.4).

The dense fourth verse of the Vaiśeṣika Sūtra gives expression to a thorough going metaphysical realism. On the Vaiśeṣika account, universals (sāmānya) as well as particularity (viśeṣa) are realities, and these have a distinct reality from substances, attributes, actions, and the relation of inherence, which all have their own irreducible reality.

The metaphysical import of the fourth verse potentially obscures the fact that the Vaiśeṣika system sets itself the task of elaborating dharma. Given the weight that the Vaiśeṣika Sūtra gives to ontological matters, it is inviting to treat its insistence that it seeks to elaborate dharma as quite irrelevant to its overall concern. However, subsequent authors in the Vaiśeṣika tradition have drawn attention to the significance of dharma to the overall system.

Śaṅkara-Misra suggests that dharma understood in its particular presentation in the Vaiśeṣika system is a kind of sagely forbearance or withdrawal from the world (Śaṅkara-Misra’s Vaiśeṣika Sūtra Bhāṣya I.1.4. p.12). In a similar vein, another commentator, Chandrakānta (19th cent. C.E.), states:

Dharma presents two aspects, that is under the characteristic of Pravṛitti or worldly activity, and the characteristic of Nivṛitti or withdrawal from worldly activity. Of these, Dharma characterized by Nivṛitti, brings forth tattva–jñana or knowledge of truths, by means of removal of sins and other blemishes. (Chandrakānta p.15.)

Thus the view of the commentators appears to be that the Vaiśeṣika system, which yields “knowledge of truths,” “knowledge of the categories,” or “knowledge of the essences” (cf. Śaṅkara-Misra, p.5) is a moral virtue of the person who is initiated into the system—that is, a “particular dharma” of that person. Hence, in elaborating the nature of reality, the Vaiśeṣika system seeks to extinguish the ignorance that obstructs the effects of dharma, and it thus also constitutes a moral virtue of the proponent of the Vaiśeṣika system. This virtue will not only yield the fruits of works, such as kāma and artha (which the Vaiśeṣika sage will know to appreciate at a distance) but it will also yield the highest good: mokṣa.

c. Sāṅkhya

The term “Sāṅkhya” means ‘enumeration’ and it suggests a methodology of philosophical analysis. On many accounts, Sāṅkhya is the oldest of the systematic schools of Indian philosophy. It is attributed to the legendary sage Kapila of antiquity, though we have no extant work left to us by him. His views are recounted in many smṛti texts, such as the Bhāgavata Purāṇa and the Bhagavad Gītā, but the Sāṅkhya system appears to stretch back to the end of the Vedic period itself. Key concepts of the Sāṅkhya system appear in the Upaniṣads (Kaṭha Upaniṣad I.3.10–11), suggesting that it is an indigenous Indian philosophical school that developed congenially in parallel with the Vedic tradition. Its relative antiquity appears to be confirmed by the references to the school in classical Jain writings (for instance, Sūtrakṛtānga I.i.1.13), which are known for their antiquity. Unlike many of the other systematic schools of Hindu philosophy, the Sāṅkhya system does not explicitly attempt to align itself with the authority of the Vedas (cf. Sāṅkhya Kārikā 2).

The oldest systematic writing on Sāṅkhya that we have is Īśvarakṛṣna’s Sāṅkhya Kārikā (4th cent. C.E.). In it we have the classic Sāṅkhya ontology and metaphysic set out, along with its theory of agency.

According to the Sāṅkhya system, the cosmos is the result of the mutual contact of two distinct metaphysical categories: Prakṛti (Nature), and Puruṣa (person). Prakṛti, or Nature, is the material principle of the cosmos and is comprised of three guṇas, or “qualities.” These are sattva, rajas, and tamas. Sattva is illuminating, buoyant and a source of pleasure; rajas is actuating, propelling and a source of pain; tamas is still, enveloping and a source of indifference (Sāṅkhya Kārikā 12-13).

Puruṣa, in contrast, has the quality of consciousness. It is the entity that the personal pronoun “I” actually refers to. It is eternally distinct from Nature, but it enters into complex configurations of Nature (biological bodies) in order to experience and to have knowledge. According to the Sāṅkhya tradition, mind, mentality, intellect or Mahat (the Great one) is not a part of the Puruṣa, but the result of the complex organization of matter, or the guṇas. Mentality is the closest thing in Nature to Puruṣa, but it is still a natural entity, rooted in materiality. Puruṣa, in contrast, is a pure witness. It lacks the ability to be an agent. Thus, on the Sāṅkhya account, when it seems as though we as persons are making decisions, we are mistaken: it is actually our natural constitution comprised by the guṇas that make the decision. The Puruṣa does nothing but lend consciousness to the situation (Sāṅkhya Kārikā 12-13, 19, 21).

The contact of Prakṛti and Puruṣa, on the Sāṅkhya account, is not a chance occurrence. Rather, the two principles make contact so that Puruṣa can come to have knowledge of its own nature. A Puruṣa comes to have such knowledge when sattva, the illuminating guṇa, assumes a governing position in a bodily constitution. The moment that this knowledge comes about, a Puruṣa becomes liberated. The Puruṣa is no longer bound by the actions and choices of its body’s constitution. However, liberation consists in the end of karma tying the Puruṣa to Prakṛti: it does not coincide with the complete annihilation of past karma, which would consist in the disentangling of a Puruṣa from Prakṛti. Hence, the Sāṅkhya Kārikā likens the self-realization of the Puruṣa to a potter’s wheel, which continues to spin down, after the potter has ceased putting energy to keep the wheel in motion (Sāṅkhya Kārikā 67).

Students of ancient Western philosophy are apt to note that the Sāṅkhya guṇas, and the dualistic theory of personhood, appear to have echos in Plato (4th cent. B.C.E.). Plato held that the body is the casing of the soul (though Plato, at Phaedo 81 and Phaedrus 250c suggests it is a prison, which the Sāṅkhya system does not), and that the embodied soul is composed of three characteristics: an earthy quality geared toward menial tasks that is appetitive (corresponding to bronze), a high-spirited quality geared towards accomplishment and competition (silver), and a reflective or rational portion that is in a position to put in order the constitution of the soul (gold) (Republic 3.415, 4.435–42). Prima facie, the bronze quality appears to correspond to tamas, silver to rajas, and sattva to gold. Owing to the antiquity of the Sāṅkhya system, it is historically implausible that it was influenced by Platonistic thought. This of course invites the contrary proposal, that Plato was influenced by the Sāṅkhya system. While Indian philosophers had an important impact on the course of ancient Greek philosophy (through Pyrrho of Elis, who traveled to India in the 3rd cent. B.C.E. and was impressed by a type of dialectic nihilism characteristic of some Buddhist philosophies, promoted by gymnosophists—naked wise people—who resemble Jain monks) (see Flintoff), there is no historical evidence to suggest that Sāṅkhya thought made its way to ancient Greece. This suggests that both Plato (4th cent. B.C.E.), and the Sāṅkhya system (dating back to the 6th cent. B.C.E. in the Vedas) articulate an ancient Indo-European philosophical perspective that predates both Plato and the Sāṅkhya system, if the similarities between the two are not purely coincidental.

d. Yoga

The Yoga tradition shares much with the Sāṅkhya darśana. Like the Sāṅkhya philosophy, traces of the Yoga tradition can be found in the Upaniṣads. While the systematic expression of the Yoga philosophy comes to us from Patañjali’s Yoga Sūtra, it comes relatively late in the history of philosophy (at the end of the epic period, roughly 3rd century C.E.), the Yoga philosophy is also expressed in the Bhagavad Gītā. The Yoga philosophy shares with Sāṅkhya its dualistic cosmology. Like Sāṅkhya, the Yoga philosophy does not attempt to explicitly derive its authority from the Vedas. However, Yoga departs from Sāṅkhya on an important metaphysical and moral point—the nature of agency—and from Sāṅkhya in its emphasis on practical means to achieve liberation.

Like the Sāṅkhya tradition, the Yoga darśana holds that the cosmos is the result of the interaction of two categories: Prakṛti (Nature) and Puruṣa (Person). Like the Sāṅkhya tradition, the Yoga tradition is of the opinion that Prakṛti, or Nature, is comprised of three guṇas, or qualities. These are the same three qualities extolled in the Sāṅkhya system—tamas, rajas, and sattva—though the Yoga Sūtra refers to many of these by different terms (cf. Yoga Sūtra II.18). As with the Sāṅkhya system, liberation in the Yoga system is facilitated by the ascendance of sattva in a person’s mind, which permits enlightenment on the nature of the self.

A relatively important point of cosmological difference is that the Yoga system does not consider the Mind or the Intellect (Mahat) to be the greatest creation of Nature. A major difference between the two schools concerns Yoga’s picture of how liberation is achieved. On the Sāṅkhya account, liberation comes about by Nature enlightening the Puruṣa, for Puruṣas are mere spectators (cf. Sāṅkhya Kārikā 62). In the contexts of the Yoga darśana, the Puruṣa is not a mere spectator, but an agent: Puruṣa is regarded as the “lord of the mind” (Yoga Sūtra IV.18): for Yoga it is the effort of the Puruṣa that brings about liberation. The empowered account of Puruṣa in the Yoga system is supplemented by a detail account of the practical means by which Puruṣa can bring about its own liberation.

The Yoga Sūtra tells us that the point of yoga is to still perturbations of the mind—the main obstacle to liberation (Yoga Sūtra I.2). The practice of the Yoga philosophy comes to those with energy (Yoga Sūtra I.21). In order to facilitate the calming of the mind, the Yoga system prescribes several moral and practical means. The core of the practical import of the Yoga philosophy is what it calls the Astāṅga yoga (not to be confused with a tradition of physical yoga also called Astāṅga Yoga, popular in many yoga centers in recent times). The Astāṅga yoga sets out the eight (aṣṭa) limbs (anga) of the practice of yoga (Yoga Sūtra II.29). The eight limbs include:

  • yama – abstention from evil-doing, which specifically consists of abstention from harming others (Ahiṃsā), abstention from telling falsehoods (asatya), abstention from acquisitiveness (asteya), abstention from greed/envy (aparigraha); and sexual restraint (brahmacarya)
  • niyamas – various observances, which include the cultivation of purity (sauca), contentment (santos) and austerities (tapas)
  • āsana – posture
  • prāṇāyāma – control of breath
  • pratyāhāra – withdrawal of the mind from sense objects
  • dhāranā– concentration
  • dhyāna – meditation
  • samādhi – absorption [in the self] (Yoga Sūtra II.29-32)

According to the Yoga Sūtra, the yama rules “are basic rules…. They must be practiced without any reservations as to time, place, purpose, or caste rules” (Yoga Sūtra II.31). The failure to live a morally pure life constitutes a major obstacle to the practice of Yoga (Yoga Sūtra II.34). On the plus side, by living the morally pure life, all of one’s needs and desires are fulfilled:

When [one] becomes steadfast in… abstention from harming others, then all living creatures will cease to feel enmity in [one’s] presence. When [one] becomes steadfast in… abstention from falsehood, [one] gets the power of obtaining for [oneself] and others the fruits of good deeds, without [others] having to perform the deeds themselves. When [one] becomes steadfast in… abstention from theft, all wealth comes.… Moreover, one achieves purification of the heart, cheerfulness of mind, the power of concentration, control of the passions and fitness for vision of the Ātma [self, or Puruṣa]. “(Yoga Sūtra II.35–41)

The steadfast practice of the Astāṅga yoga results in counteracting past karmas. This culminates in a milestone-liberating event: dharmameghasamādhi (or the absorption in the cloud of virtue). In this penultimate state, the aspirant has all their past sins washed away by a cloud of dharma (virtue, or morality). This leads to the ultimate state of liberation for the yogi, kaivalya (Yoga Sūtra IV.33). “Kaivalya” translates as “aloneness.”

Critics of the Yoga system charge that it cannot be accepted on moral grounds for it has as its ultimate goal a state of isolation. On this view, kaivalya is understood literally as a state of social isolation (see Bharadwaja). The defender of the Yoga Sūtra can point out that this reading of “kaivalya” takes the final event of liberation in the Yoga system out of context. The penultimate event that paves way for the state of kaivalya is a wholly moral event (dharmameghasamādhi) and the path that leads to this morally perfecting event is itself an intrinsically moral endeavor (Astāṅga yoga, and particularly the yamas). If the concept of ‘kaivalya’ is to be understood in the context of the Yoga system’s preoccupation with morality, it seems that it must be understood as a function of moral perfection. Given the uncommon journey that the yogi takes, it is also natural to conclude that the state of kaivalya is the state characterized by having no peers, owing to the radical shift in perspective that the yogi attains through yoga. The yogi, at the point of kaivalya, no longer sees things from the perspective of individuals in society, but from the perspective of the Puruṣa. This arguably is the yogi’s loneliness.

e. Pūrvamīmāṃsā

The Pūrvamīmāṃsā school of Hindu philosophy gains its name from the portion of the Vedas that it is primarily concerned with: the earlier (pūrva) inquiry (Mīmāṃsā), or the karma khaṇḍa. In the context of Hinduism, the Pūrvamīmāṃsā school is one of the most orthodox of the Hindu philosophical schools because of its concern to elaborate and defend the contents of the early, ritually oriented part of the Vedas. Like many other schools of Indian philosophy, Pūrvamīmāṃsā takes dharma (“duty” or “ethics”) as its primary focus (Mīmāṃsā Sūtra I.i.1). Unlike all other schools of Hindu philosophy, Pūrvamīmāṃsā did not take mokṣa, or liberation, as something to extol or elaborate upon. The very topic of liberation is nowhere discussed in the foundational text of this tradition, and is recognized for the first time by the medieval Pūrvamīmāṃsā author Kumārila (7th cent. C.E.) as a real objective worth pursuing in conjunction with dharma (Kumārila V.xvi.108–110).

The school of philosophy known as Pūrvamīmāṃsā has its roots in the Mīmāṃsā Sūtra, written by Jaimini (1st cent. C.E.). The Mīmāṃsā Sūtra, like the Vaiśeṣika Sūtra, begins with the assertion that its main concern is the elaboration of dharma. The second verse tells us that dharma (or the ethical) is an injunction (codana) that has the distinction (lakṣaṇa) of bringing about welfare (artha) (Mīmāṃsā Sūtra I.i.1-2).

The Pūrvamīmāṃsā system is distinguished from other Hindu philosophical schools—but for the Vedānta systems—in its view that the Vedas are epistemically foundational. Foundationalism is the view that certain knowledge claims are independently valid (which means that no further justificatory reasons are either possible or necessary to justify these claims), and moreover, that these independently valid knowledge claims are able to serve as justifications for beliefs that are based upon them. Such independently valid knowledge claims are thought to be justificatory foundations of a system of beliefs. While all Hindu philosophical schools recognize the validity of the Vedas, only the Pūrvamīmāṃsā and Vedānta systems explicitly regard the Vedas as foundational, and being in no need of further justification: “… instruction [in the Vedas] is the means of knowing it (dharma)—infallible regarding all that is imperceptible; it is a valid means of knowledge, as it is independent…” (Mīmāṃsā Sūtra I.i.5). The justificatory capacity of the Vedas serves to ground the smṛti literature, for it is the sacred tradition based on the Vedas (Mīmāṃsā Sūtra I.iii.2). If a smṛti text conflicts with the Vedas, the Vedas are to be preferred. When there is no conflict, we are entitled to presume that the Vedas stand as support for the smṛti text (Mīmāṃsā Sūtra I.iii.3).

Pūrvamīmāṃsā perhaps more than any other school of Indian philosophy made a sizable contribution to Indian debates on the philosophy of language. Some of Pūrvamīmāṃsā’s distinctive linguistic theses impact on theological matters. One distinctive thesis of the Pūrvamīmāṃsā tradition is that the relationship between a word and its referent is “inborn” and not mediated by authorial intention (Mīmāṃsā Sūtra I.i.5). The second view is that words, or verbal units (śabda), are eternal existents. This view contrasts sharply with the view taken by the Nyāya philosophers, that words have a temporary existence, and are brought in and out of existence by utterance (Nyāya Sūtra II.ii.13, cf. Mīmāṃsā Sūtra I.i.6-11). The commentator Śabara (5th cent. C.E.) explains the Pūrvamīmāṃsā view thus:

…the word is manifested (not produced) by human effort; that is to say, if, before being pronounced, the word was not manifest, it becomes manifested by the effort (or pronouncing). Thus it is found that the fact of words being “seen after effort” is equally compatible with both views.… The Word must be eternal;—why?—because its utterance is for the purpose of another…. If the word ceased to exist as soon as uttered then no one could speak of any thing to others…. Whenever the word “go” (cow) is uttered, there is a notion of all cows simultaneously. From this it follows that the word denotes the Class. And it is not possible to create the relation of the Word to a Class; because in creating the relation, the creator would have to lay down the relation by pointing to the Class; and without actually using the word “go” (which he could not use before he has laid down its relation to its denotation) in what manner could he point to the distinct class denoted by the word “go”…. (Śabara Bhāṣya on Mīmāṃsā Sūtra I.i.12-19, pp. 33–38)

Hence, the only solution to the problem of how words have their meaning, on the Pūrvamīmāṃsā account, is that they have them eternally. If they do not have their meaning eternally and independent of subjective associations between referents and words, communication would be impossible. These strikingly Platonistic positions on the nature of meaning allows the Pūrvamīmāṃsā tradition to argue that the Vedas are an eternally existing, unauthored corpus, and that it’s validity is beyond reproach: “… if the Veda be eternal its denotation cannot but be eternal; and if it be non-eternal (caused), then it can have no validity…” (Kumārila XXVII–XXXII, cf. V.xi.1).

Views in the history of Hindu philosophy that contrast with the Pūrvamīmāṃsā view, on the question of the source and nature of the Vedas, is the view implicit in the Nyāya Sūtra, and stated more clearly by the later syncretic Vaiśeṣika (and Nyāya) author Śaṅkara-Misra (Vaiśeṣika Sūtra Bhāṣya, p.7): the Vedas is the testimony of a particular person (namely God). This is a view that also appears to be echoed in the theistic schools of Vedānta, such as Viśiṣṭādvaita, where God is alluded to as the author of the Vedas (cf. Rāmānuja’s Bhagavad Gītā Bhāṣya 18:58).

f. Vedānta

Like the Pūrvamīmāṃsā tradition, the Vedānta school is concerned with explicating the contents of a particular portion of the Vedas. While the Pūrvamīmāṃsā concerns itself with the former portion of the Vedas, the Vedānta school concerns the end (anta) of the Vedas. Whereas the principal concern of the earlier portion of the Vedas is action and dharma, the principal concern of the latter portion of the Vedas is knowledge and mokṣa.

Philosophies that count technically as expressions of the Vedānta philosophy find their classical expression in a commentary on a synopsis of the Upaniṣads. The synopsis of the contents of the Upaniṣads is called the Vedānta Sūtras, or the Brahma Sūtras, and its author is Bādarāyana (1st cent. C.E.). The latter portion of the Vedas is a vast corpus that does not elaborate a single doctrine in the manner of a monograph. Rather, it is a collection of speculative texts of the Vedas with overlapping themes and images. A common thread that runs through most of the Upaniṣads is a concern to elaborate the nature of the Ultimate, or Brahman, Ātma or the Self (often equated in these texts with Brahman) and what in the subsequent tradition is known as the jīva, or the individual psychological unity. The Upaniṣads are relatively clear that Brahman stands to creation as its source and support, but its unsystematic nature leaves much to be specified in the way of doctrine. While Bādarāyana’s Brahma Sūtra is the systematization of the teachings of the Upaniṣads, many of the verses of the Brahma Sūtra are obscure and unintelligible without a commentary.

Owing to the cryptic nature of the Brahma Sūtra itself, many commentarial subtraditions have evolved in Vedānta. As a result, it is possible to misleadingly use the term “Vedānta” as though it stood for one comprehensive doctrine. Rather, the term “Vedānta” is best understood as a term embracing within it divergent philosophical views that have a common textual connection: their classical expression as a commentary on Bādarāyana’s text.

There are three famous commentaries (Bhāṣyas) on the Brahma Sūtra that shine in the history of Hindu philosophy. These are the 8th century C.E. commentary of Śaṅkara (Advaita) the 12th century C.E. commentary of Rāmānuja (Viśiṣṭādvaita) and the 13th century C.E. commentary by Madhva (Dvaita). These three are not the only commentaries. There appears to have been no less than twenty-one commentators on the Brahma Sūtra prior to Madhva (Sharma, vol.1 p.15), and Madhva is by no means the last commentator on the Brahma Sūtra either. Important names in the history of Indian theology are amongst the latter day commentators: Nimbārka (13th cent. C.E.), Śrkaṇṭha(15th cent. C.E.), Vallabha (16th cent. C.E.), and Baladeva (18th cent. C.E.). However, the majority of the commentaries prior to Śaṅkara have been lost to history. The philosophical positions expressed in the various commentaries fall into four major camps of Vedānta: Bhedābheda, Advaita, Viśiṣṭādvaita and Dvaita. They principally differ on the metaphysics of individual selves and Brahman, though there are also some striking ethical differences between these schools as well.

i. Bhedābheda

According to the Bhedābheda view, Brahman converts itself into the created, but yet maintains a distinct identity. Thus, the school holds that Brahman is both different (bheda) and not different (abheda) from creation and the individual jīva.

The philosophical persuasion that has produced the most commentaries on the Brahma Sūtra is the Bhedābheda philosophy. Textual evidence suggests that all of the commentaries authored prior to Śaṅkara’s famous Advaita commentary on the Brahma Sūtra subscribed to a form of Bhedābheda, which one historian calls “Pantheistic Realism” (Sharma, pp. 15-7). And on natural readings, it appears that most of the remaining commentators (but for the three famous commentators) also promulgate an interpretation of the Brahma Sūtra that falls within the Bhedābheda camp.

ii. Commonalities of the Three Famous Commentaries

While the three major commentators on the Brahma Sūtra’s differ on important metaphysical questions like the nature and relationship of Brahman to creation and jīvas, or the important moral questions on the priority of Vedic morality, there are some common views that they all share.

All of the three major schools of Vedānta hold that the Vedas are the ultimate source of knowledge of Brahman, and that the Vedas have an independent validity, not reducible or contingent upon the validity of any other means of knowledge (Śaṅkara’s, Rāmānuja’s and Madhva’s Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣyas, I.i.1-3). This interpretation of the Brahma Sūtra pits the Vedānta tradition against the Nyāya optimism about natural theology. For the major schools of Vedānta, natural reason cannot, on its own, arrive at knowledge of the existence of God (Brahman). (For a detailed criticism of the Nyāya natural theology, see Rāmānuja’s Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya pp. 162-74.)

Rāmānuja and Śaṅkara both regard the individual jīva as being uncreated, and having no beginning (Śaṅkara’s Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya II.iii.16; Rāmānuja’s Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya II.iii.18). Madhva concurs that individual souls are eternal, but yet insists that it is correct to regard Brahman as the source of individual souls (Madhva’s Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya II.iii.19).

The three major commentators on the Brahma Sūtra see eye to eye on the nature of the individual as agent. According to Śaṅkara, Rāmānuja and Madhva, the individual, or jīva, is an agent, with desires and goals. However, in and of itself, it has no power to make its will manifest. Brahman, on all three accounts, steps in and grants the fruits of the desires of an individual. Thus while on this account individuals are agents, they are really also quite impotent. (Śaṅkara’s and Rāmānuja’s Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣyas I.iii.41; Madhva’s Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya II.iii.42). All three authors are sensitive to the fact that Brahman’s help in bringing about the fruits of desires of individuals implicates Brahman in the evils of the world, and hence opens up the problem of evil. The theodicy of all three relies upon the doctrine of the eternality of the individual jīva. Since there is always some prior choice and action on the part of the individual according to which Brahman has to dispense consequences, at no point can Brahman be accused of partiality, cruelty, or making persons choose the things that they do (Śaṅkara’s and Rāmānuja’s Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣyas II.i.34; Madhva Bhāṣya II.i.35, iii.42).

Finally, Rāmānuja and Śaṅkara both appear to take a position on the propriety of animal sacrifices as prescribed in the Vedas that is reminiscent of the Pūrvamīmāṃsā deferral to the Vedas on all matters of morality. According to both Śaṅkara and Rāmānuja, animal sacrifices cannot be regarded as evils for they are enjoined in the Vedas, and the Vedas is the ultimate authority on such matters (Śaṅkara’s and Rāmānuja’s Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya III.i.25). Madhva in contrast is reputed to have been a staunch opponent of animal sacrifices, who held that such rituals are a result of a corruption of the Vedic tradition. He interprets the Brahma Sūtra in such a way that the question of animal sacrifices does not arise.

iii. Advaita

Combining the negative particle “a” with the term “dvaita” creates the term “advaita”. The term “dvaita” is often translated as “dualism” as the term “advaita” is often translated as “non-dualism.” In the case of Dvaita Vedānta, this convention of translation is misleading, for Dvaita Vedānta does not, like the Sāṅkhya system, propound a metaphysical dualism. Indeed, Dvaita Vedānta holds an explicitly pluralistic metaphysics. Rather, “dvaita” in the context of Vedānta nomenclature is an ordinal, meaning “secondness.” Dvaita Vedānta, thus, holds that there is such a thing as secondness—something extra, that comes after the first: Brahman. Advaita Vedānta, in contrast, holds that Brahman is one without a second. “Advaita” can thus be translated as “monism,” “non-duality” or most perspicuously as “non-secondness” (Hacker p.131n21).

The principal author in the Advaita tradition is Śaṅkara. In addition to writing several philosophical works, Śaṅkara the commentator on the Brahma Sūtra, set up four monasteries in the four corners of India. Successive heads of the monasteries, according to tradition, take Śaṅkara’s name. This has contributed to great confusion about the views that Śaṅkara, the commentator on the Brahma Sūtras held, for many of his successors also authored philosophical works with the same name. On the basis of comparing writing style, vocabulary, and the colophons of the various works attributed to “Śaṅkara,” the German philologist and scholar of Indian philosophy, Paul Hacker, has concluded that only a portion of the works attributed to Śaṅkara are by the author of the commentary on the Brahma Sūtras (Hacker pp. 41-56). These genuine works include commentaries on the Upaniṣads, and a commentary on the Bhagavad Gītā. The following explication will be restricted to such works.

It is commonly held that Śaṅkara argued that the common sense, empirical world as we know it is an illusion, or māyā. The term “māyā” does not figure prominently in the genuine writings of Śaṅkara. However, it is an accurate assessment that Śaṅkara holds that the majority of our beliefs about the reality of a plurality of objects and persons are ultimately false.

Śaṅkara’s philosophy and criticism of common sense rests on an argument unique to him in the history of Indian philosophy—an argument that Śaṅkara sets at the outset of his commentary on the Brahma Sūtra. From this argument from superimposition, the ordinary human psyche (which self identifies with a body, a unique personal history, and distinguishes itself from a plurality of other persons and objects) comes about by an erroneous superimposition of the characteristics of subjectivity (consciousness, or the sense of being a witness), with the category of objects (which includes the characteristics of having a body, existing at a certain time and place and being numerically distinct from other objects). According to Śaṅkara, these categories are opposed to each other as night and day. And hence, the conflation of the two categories is fallacious. However, it is also a creative mistake. As a result of this superimposition, the jīva (individual person) is constructed complete with psychological integrity, and a natural relationship with a body (Śaṅkara Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya, Preamble to I.i.1). All of this is brought about by beginningless nescience (avidyā)—a creative factor at play in the creation of the cosmos.

In reality, all there really is on Śaṅkara’s account is Brahman: objects of its awareness, such as the entire universe, exist within the realm of its consciousness. The liberation of the individual jīva occurs when it undoes the error of superimposition, and no longer identifies itself with a body, or a particular person with a natural history, but with Brahman.

It is worth stressing that Śaṅkara’s view is not a form of subjective idealism, or solipsism in any ordinary sense. For those sympathetic to Śaṅkara’s account, superimposition is an objective occurrence that happens most anywhere there is an ordinary organism with a living body. However, Śaṅkara’s system is properly characterized as a form of Absolute Idealism, for on its account only the undifferentiated Absolute is ultimately real, while affairs of the world are its thoughts.

Śaṅkara’s Advaita tradition is known for giving a nuanced, and two-part account of the ‘self’ and ‘Brahman.’ On Śaṅkara’s account, there is a lower and higher self. The lower self is the jīva, while the higher self (the real referent of the personal pronoun “I,” used by anyone) is the one real Self: Ātma, which on Śaṅkara’ s account is Brahman. Likewise, on Śaṅkara’s account, there is a lower and a higher Brahman (Śaṅkara Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya IV.3.16. pp. 403-4). The lower Brahman is the personal God that pious devotees pray to and meditate on, while the Higher Brahman is devoid of most all such qualities, is impersonal, and is characterized as being essentially bliss (ānanda) (Śaṅkara Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya III.3.14) truth (satyam) knowledge (jñānam) and infinite (anantam) (cf. Śaṅkara, Taittitrīya Upaniṣad Bhāṣya II.i.1.). The lower Brahman, or the personal God that people pray to, can be afforded the title of “Brahman” owing to its proximity to the Highest Brahman: in the world of plurality, it is the closest thing to the Ultimate (Śaṅkara Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya IV.3.9). However, it too, like the concept of the individual person, is a result of the error of superimposing the qualities of objectivity and subjectivity on each other (Śaṅkara, Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya IV.3.10). In the Advaita tradition, the lower Brahman is known as the saguṇa Brahman (or Brahman with qualities) while the highest Brahman is known as the nirguṇa Brahman (or Brahman without qualities) (Śaṅkara Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya III.2.21).

Śaṅkara takes a skeptical attitude towards the importance of dharma, or morality. On Śaṅkara’s account, so long as one exists as a construction of necessience, operating under the erroneous assumption that one is a distinct object from Brahman and other objects, then one ought to follow the Vedas and its injunctions regarding dharma for it will help form tendencies to look within (Śaṅkara, Bhagavad Gītā Bhāṣya on 18:66). However, for the serious aspirant, Śaṅkara regards dharma as an impediment to liberation—it too must be abandoned, lest an individual reinforce their self-identification with a body in contradistinction to other bodies and persons (Śaṅkara, Bhagavad Gītā Bhāṣya on 4:21). Those sympathetic to Śaṅkara’s philosophy often regard Śaṅkara’s skepticism about dharma as a liberal and progressive aspect to his philosophy, for it devalues the importance of Vedic dharma, which contains within it caste morality. Critics of Śaṅkara are likely to regard Śaṅkara’s skepticism about the importance of dharma as troubling, not because it implies that we should forsake Vedic dharma, but because it suggests that we ought to give up moral concerns, altogether, for the sake of spiritual pursuits (lest we fall back into the fallacy of superimposition).

iv. Viśistādvaita

The term “Viśiṣṭādvaita” is often translated as “Qualified Non-Dualism.” An alternative, and more informative, translation is “Non-duality of the qualified whole,” or perhaps ‘Non-duality with qualifications.” The principal exponent of this school of Vedānta is Rāmānuja, who attempted to eschew the illusionist implications of Advaita Vedānta, and the perceived logical problems of the Bhedābheda view while attempting to reconcile the portions of the Upaniṣads that affirmed a substantial monism and those that affirmed substantial pluralism. Rāmānuja’s solution to his problematic is to argue for a theistic and organismic conception of Brahman.

The theism of Rāmānuja’s Viśiṣṭādvaita shows up in his insistence that Brahman is a specific deity (Viṣṇu, also known as “Nārāyana”) who is an abode of an infinite number of auspicious qualities. The organismic aspect of Rāmānuja’s model consists in his view that all things that we normally consider as distinct from Brahman (such as individual persons or jīvas, mundane objects, and other unexalted qualities) constitute the Body of Brahman, while the Ātman spoken of in the Upaniṣads is the non-body, or mental component of Brahman. The result is a metaphysic that regards Brahman as the only substance, but yet affirms the existence of a plurality of abstract and concrete objects as the qualities of Brahman’s Body and Soul (Vedārthasaṅgraha §2).

Rāmānuja holds that in the absence of stains of passed karma the jīva (individual person) resembles Brahman in being of the nature of consciousness and knowledge (Rāmānuja, Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya, I.i.1. “Great Siddhānta” pp. 99-102). Past actions cloud our true nature and force us to act out their consequences. On Rāmānuja’s account, the prime way of extricating ourselves from the beginningless effects of karma involves bhakti, or devotion to God. But bhakti on its own is not sufficient, or at least, bhakti if it is to bring about liberation must either be combined with the karma yoga mentioned in the Bhagavad Gītā, or it must turn into bhakti yoga. For attending to one’s dharma (duty) is the chief means by which one can propitiate God, on Rāmānuja’s account (Rāmānuja, Gītā Bhāṣya, XVIII.47 p.583). Moreover, in attending to one’s dharma in the deontological spirit characteristic of karma yoga and consonant with bhakti yoga one prevents the development of new karmic dispositions, and can allow the past stores of karma to be naturally extinguished. This will have the effect of unclouding the individual jīva’s omniscience, and bringing the jīva closer to a vision of God, which alone is an unending source of joy (Vedārthasaṅgraha §241). Unlike Śaṅkara, Rāmānuja insists that dharma is never to be abandoned (Rāmānuja, Bhagavad Gītā Bhāṣya XVIII.66, p.599).

v. Dvaita

Madhva is one of the principal theistic exponents of Vedānta. On his account, Brahman is a personal God, and specifically He is the Hindu deity Viṣṇu.

According to Madhva, reality is characterized by a five fold difference: (i) jīvas (individual persons) are different from God; (ii) jīvas are also different from each other; (iii) inanimate objects are different from God; (iv) inanimate objects are different from other inanimate objects; (v) inanimate objects are different from jīvas (Mahābhāratatātparnirnayaḥ, I. 70-71). The number of types of entities on Madhva’s account appears thus to be three: God, jīvas, and inanimate objects. However, the actual number of objects on Madhva’s account appears to be very high. This substantial pluralism sets Madhva apart from the other principle exponents of Vedānta.

A distinctive doctrine of Madhva’s Vedānta is his view that jīvas fall into a hierarchy, with the most exalted jīvas occupying a place below Viṣṇu (such as Viṣṇu’s companions in his eternal abode) to the lowest jīvas, who occupy dark hell regions. Moreover, on Madhva’s account, the ranking of jīvas is eternal, and hence those who occupy the lowest hells are eternally damned. Amongst the middle level jīvas, the Gods and the most virtuous of humans are eligible for liberation. The average amongst the middle rung jīvas transmigrate forever, while the lowest amongst the middle level jīvas find themselves in the upper hells (Mahābhāratatātparnirnayaḥ I.85-88).

Madhva holds that liberation comes to those who appreciate the five fold differences and the hierarchy of the jīvas (Mahābhāratatātparnirnayaḥ, 81-2). However, ultimately, whether one is liberated or not is completely at the discretion of Brahman, and Brahman is pleased by nothing more than bhakti, or devotion (Mahābhāratatātparnirnayaḥ I.117).

g. Classical Hindu Philosophy in the Context of Indian Philosophy

Hindu philosophy did not develop in a vacuum. Rather, it is an inextricable part of the history of Indian philosophy. Hence, other Indian philosophical movements did not only influence Hindu philosophy, but it also arguably had an influence on their development as well.

The most salient manner in which Hindu philosophy was influenced by other Indian philosophical developments is in the realm of ethics. In its infancy, Hindu philosophy as set out in the action portion of the Vedas was wedded to the practice of animal sacrifices (see Aitareya Brāhmana, book II.1-2). Buddhism and Jainism were both critical of the practice. Buddhism as a philosophy devoted to the alleviation of suffering is disposed to see animal sacrifices as involving unnecessary suffering. Jainism, in contrast, had made Ahiṃsā, or non-harmfulness, its chief moral virtue. Jainism might very well have been the first religio-philosophical movement in India staunchly wedded to vegetarianism. And while vegetarianism was alien to early Hindu practice, it has become an integral part of Hindu orthodoxy in many parts of India. Now, for many Hindus, the very idea of eating meat is the very archetype of immoral and irreligious behavior. This attitude can be found amongst the most orthodox followers of both Śaṅkara and Rāmānuja, who, as noted, defended the propriety of animal sacrifices. The shift in the general attitude of many Hindus arguably goes to the credit of Jainism, a once prevalent religion in India, which has been a source of tireless criticism of violence.

A case might also be made for the influence of Jainism on the Yoga darśana. Specifically, the yama rules found in the Yoga darśana, which include Ahiṃsā, are identical to the five Great vows of Jainism (Ācāraṅga Sūtra II.15.i.1–v.1). While it is possible that these precepts have a third common source, or that they are indigenous to the Yoga tradition, it is also highly probable that they were incorporated, early on, into the Yoga tradition by way of influence of Jain thought. The Yoga tradition also shows the mark of being influenced by Mahāyāna Buddhism in its account of “dharmameghasamādhi”—a term that shows up in many latter day Buddhist texts (see Klostermaier).

In the realm of metaphysics, a controversial argument can be made that Hindu philosophy, as found in the Upaniṣads, has exercised a profound effect on the development of latter day Indian Buddhist thought. Increasingly, in the context of latter Indian Buddhism, there is a movement away from a seeming agnosticism to an affirmation of the Ultimate in terms of a master concept, which designates both the grounding and the source of all. For Buddhist Idealism (Yogācāra, or Vijñānavāda) the master concept is that of Consciousness-Only, and in the context of Mādhyamika Buddhism of Nāgārjuna (2nd cent. C.E.) the master concept is that of Emptiness, or Śūnyatā. Such a move towards a master concept resembles the Upaniṣad’s employment of the concept “Brahman” and is arguably an adaptation of some elements of the metaphysical picture of the Upaniṣads into Buddhist philosophy.

Similarly, a case might also be made that the notion of “Two-Truths” (the doctrine that there is a distinction to be drawn between conventional truth that operates in ordinary, domestic discourse that recognizes diversity, and Truth from the perspective of the Ultimate which rejects diversity) operative in latter Buddhist thought is also a doctrine that can be found in the Upaniṣads (cf. Muṇdaka Upaniṣad, I.i. 5-6). While this doctrine gets its clearest explication in the context of latter day Buddhist thought in India, it seems that it has its precursor in Vedic speculation.

4. Stage Three: Neo-Hinduism

The term “Neo-Hinduism” refers to a conception of the Hindu religion formed by recent authors who were learned in traditional Indian philosophy, and English. Famous Neo-Hindus include Swami Vivekānanda (1863-1902) the famous disciple of the traditional Hindu saint Rāma-Kṛṣṇa, and India’s first president, Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan (1888-1975) a professional philosopher who held academic posts at various universities in India and Oxford, in the UK.

A famous formulation of the doctrine of Neo-Hinduism is the simile that likens religions to rivers, and the oceans to God: as all rivers lead to the ocean so do all religions lead to God. Similarly, Swami Nirvenananda in his book Hinduism at a Glance writes:

All true religions of the world lead us alike to the same goal, namely, to perfection if, of course, they are followed faithfully. Each of them is a correct path to Divinity. The Hindus have been taught to regard religion in this light. (Nivernananda, p.20.)

Frequently, Neo-Hindu authors identify Hinduism with Vedānta in their elaboration of Neo-Hindu doctrine, and in this formulation we find another tenet of Neo-Hinduism: Hinduism is not simply another religion, but a meta-religion, or the philosophy of religion. Hence, we find Vivekānanda writes:

Ours is the universal religion. It is inclusive enough, it is broad enough to include all the ideals. All the ideals of religion that already exist in the world can be immediately included, and we can patiently wait for all the ideals that are to come in the future to be taken in the same fashion, embraced in the infinite arms of the religion of Vedānta. (Vivekānanda, vol. III p.251-2.)

Similarly, Radhakrishnan holds “[t]he Vedānta is not a religion, but religion itself in its most universal and deepest significance” (Radhakrishnan, 35).

The view identified as Neo-Hinduism here might be understood as a form of Universalism or liberal theology that attempts to ground religion itself in Hindu philosophy. Neo-Hinduism must be distinguished from another theological view that has a long history in India, which we might call Inclusivist Theology. According to Inclusivist Theology, there are elements in any number of religious practices that are consonant with the one true religion, and if a practitioner of a contrary religion holds fast to those elements in their religion that are correct, they will eventually attain the Ultimate. Often, this view finds expression in the widespread Hindu view that all the various deities are really lower manifestations of one true deity (for example, a Vaiṣṇava who held an Inclusivist theology might interpret all deities, in so far as they are consonant with the qualities attributed to Viṣṇu, to be lower manifestations of Viṣṇu, and thus good first steps to conceptualizing the Ultimate). Neo-Hinduism, in contrast, makes no distinction between deities, religions, or elements within religions, for all religions operate at the level of the practical, while the Ultimate, ex hypothesi, is transcendent. There is no religion, or no portion of any religion, which is incorrect, on this view, for all are equally human efforts to strive for the Divine. Neo-Hindus do not typically regard themselves as forming a new philosophy or religion, though the doctrine expressed by Neo-Hinduism is characterized by theses and concerns not clearly expressed in classical Hindu philosophy. As a rule, Neo-Hinduism is a reformulation of Advaita Vedānta, which emphasizes the implicit liberal theological tendencies that follow from the two-fold account of Brahman.

Recall that on Śaṅkara’s account a distinction is to be drawn between a lower and higher Brahman. Higher Brahman (nirguṇa Brahman) is impersonal and lacks much of what is normally attributed to God. In contrast, lower Brahman (saguṇa Brahman) has personal characteristics attributed to deities. While the higher Brahman is the eternally existing reality, lower Brahman is a result of the same creative error that results in the construction of normal integrated egos in bodies: superimposition. Neo-Hinduism takes note of the fact that this account of lower Brahman’s nature implies that the deities normally worshiped in a religious context are really natural artefacts, or projections of aesthetic concerns on the Ultimate: they are images of the Ultimate formulated for the sake of religious progress. Neo-Hinduism thus reasons that no one’s personal God is any more the real God than another religion’s personal God: rather, all are equally approximations of the one real, impersonal Brahman that transcends the domestic qualities attributed to it. While personal deities are considerably devalued on this account, the result is a liberal theology that is closed to no religious tradition, in principle, for any religion that personalizes God will be approaching the highest Brahman through the lens of superimposed characteristics of object-qualities on Brahman.

Critics of Neo-Hinduism have noted that while Neo-Hinduism aspires to shun the sectarianism that characterises the history of religion in the West through a spirit of Universalism, Neo-Hinduism itself engages in a sectarianism, in so far as it identifies Hinduism with the true perspective that understands the quality-less nature of the Ultimate (cf. Halbfass, Tradition and Reflection pp. 51-86). In defense of Neo-Hinduism, it could be argued that it is a genuine, modern attempt to re-understand the philosophical implications of earlier Hindu thought, and not an attempt to reconcile the various religions of the world.

Critics might also argue that Neo-Hinduism is bad history: many philosophers that we today regard as Hindu (such as Rāmānuja or Madhva) would not accept the idea that all deities are equal, and that God is ultimately an impersonal entity. Moreover, Śaṅkara, the commentator on the Brahma Sūtras did not argue for the type of Universalism characteristic of Neo-Hinduism, which regards all religious observance as equally valid (though this arguably is an implication of his philosophy). Neo-Hinduism, the critic might argue, is historical revisionism. In response, Neo-Hinduism might defend itself by insisting that it is not in the business of providing an account of the history of all of Hindu philosophy, but only a certain strand that it regards as the most important.

5. Conclusion: the Status of Hindu Philosophy

Hindu philosophers have taken varied views on many important issues in philosophy. Hindu philosophers, for instance, are not in agreement as to whether God is a person. They have not all agreed upon the nature and scope of the epistemic validity of the Vedas, nor have they all agreed on basic questions of axiology, such as the content of morality. Some affirm the importance of Vedicly prescribed acts, such as animal sacrifices, while others, such as the Yoga philosopher Patañjali, appear to suggest that violence is always to be avoided. Likewise, some Hindu philosophers hold that the content of the Vedas as always binding, such as Rāmānuja. Others, such as Śaṅkara, regard it as constituting provisional obligations, subject to a person not being serious about liberation. All Hindu philosophers are not in agreement on whether there is anything like liberation. Most recognize the existence of liberation, while the early Pūrvamīmāṃsā does not. While all Hindu philosophers hold that there is something like an individual self, they differ radically in their account of the reality and nature of this individual. This difference in ontology reflects the rich metaphysical diversity amongst Hindu philosophers: some affirm the existence of a plurality of objects; qualities and relations (such as the Vaiśeṣika, Dvaita Vedānta) while others do not (Advaita Vedānta). Such differences have made Hindu philosophy into a sub-tradition of philosophy within Indian philosophy, and not simply one comprehensive philosophical view amongst many. Hindu philosophy is not a static doctrine, but a growing tradition rich in diverse philosophical perspectives. Contrary to some popular accounts, what is presented as Hindu philosophy in recent times is not simply an elaboration of ancient tradition, but a re-evaluation and dialectical evolution of Hindu philosophical thought. Far from detracting from the authority or authenticity of recent Hindu speculation, what this shows is that Hindu philosophy is a living and vibrant tradition that shows no sign of being fossilized into a curiosity from the past, any time soon.

6. References and Further Readings

a. Primary Sources

  • Ācāraṅga Sūtra. Trans. Harmann Georg Jacobi. Jaina Sūtras. Ed. Harmann Georg Jacobi. Vol. 1. 2 vols. Delhi: AVF Books, 1987.
  • Aiterya Brāhmana. Aiterya Brāhmana of the Ṛg Veda. Trans. Martin Haug. Sacred Books of the Hindus. Ed. B.D. Basu. Allahabad: Sudhindra Nath Vasu, 1922.
  • Bhāgavata Purāṇa. Śrīmad Bhāgavatam. Trans. Tapasyānanda. Madras: Sri Ramakrishna Math, 1981.
  • Chandrakānta. Vaiśeṣika Sūtra (Gloss). Trans. Nandal Sinha. Allahabad: Sudhindra Nath Basu, 1923.
  • Dhammapada. A Source Book in Indian Philosophy. Eds. S. Radhakrishnan and Charles Alexander Moore. Princeton, N.J.: Princeton University Press, 1967. 292-325.
  • Gautama. Nyāya Sūtra. Trans. Satisa Chandra Viyabhusana. Sacred Books of the Hindus. Ed. Nandalal Sinha. 2nd rev. and enl. ed. Vol. 8. Allahabad: Panini Office, 1930.
  • Gautama, Vātsyāyana, and Uddyotakara. The NyāyaSūtras of Gautama: with the Bhāṣya of Vātsyāyana and the Vārtika of Uddyotakara. Trans. Ganganatha Jha. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1984.
  • Gītā. Śrīmad Bhagavad Gītā; the Scripture of Mankind. Trans. and Ed. Swāmi Tapasyānanda. Madras: Śrī Ramakrishna Math, 1986.
  • Guṇaratna. Tarkarahasyadīpika. Cārvāka/Lokāyata: an Anthology of Source Materials and Some Recent Studies. Ed. Debiprasad Chattopadhyaya. New Delhi: Indian Council of Philosophical Research in association with Rddhi-India Calcutta, 1990.
  • Īśvarakrsna. Sāṅkhya Kārikā. Trans. S.S. Suryanārāyana-Sastri. Madras University Philosophical Series. no. 3. Ed. S.S. Suryanārāyana-Sastri. 2nd rev. ed. Madras: University of Madras, 1948.
  • Jaimini. Mīmāṃsā Sūtra. Trans. and Ed. Mohan Lal Sandal. Sacred Books of the Hindus. Vol. 27. Allahabad: Sudhindre Nath Basu, 1923.
  • Khaṇḍa. Vaiśeṣika Sūtra. Trans. and Ed. Nandalal Sinha. Sacred Books of the Hindus. Ed. Nandal Sinha. 2nd rev. and enl. ed. Vol. 6. Allahabad: Sudhindra Nath Basu, Panini Office, 1923.
  • Kaṭha Upaniṣad. Trans. and Ed. Swami Gambirananda. Eight Upaniṣads, With the Commentary of Śankarācārya. Ed. Swami Gambirananda. Vol. 2: Advaita Ashrama, 1977. 91-220.
  • Kumārila. Ślokavārtika. 1909 Bibliotheca Indica. Calcutta: Asiatic Society. Trans. Ganganatha Jha. Śrī Garib Das Oriental Series. Vol. 8. Delhi: Śrī Satguru, 1983.
  • Madhva. Mahābhāratātparyanirnayah. Trans. and Ed. K.T. Pandurang. Vol. 1. Chirtanur: Sriman Madhva Siddhantonnanhini Sabha, 1993. Madhva. Vedānta Sūtras with the commentary of Śrī Madhwacharya (Madva Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya). Trans. S. Subba Rau. Madras: Thompson and Co., 1904.
  • Majjhima Nikāya. The Collection of the Middle Length Sayings. Trans. I. B. Horner. Pali Text Society Translation Series. Vol. 29–31. 3 vols. London: Published for the Pali Text Society by Luzac, 1957.
  • Manu. The Laws of Manu (Manavadharmaśāstra). Trans. G.Buhler. Sacred Books of the East. Ed. Max Müller. Vol. xxv. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1886.
  • Muṇdaka Upaniṣad. Trans. and Ed. Swami Gambirananda. Eight Upaniṣads, With the Commentary of Śankarācārya. Vol. 2: Advaita Ashrama, 1977. 77-172.
  • Patañjali. Yoga Sūtra. Trans. and Ed. Swāmi Prabhavananda. Madras: Ramakrishna Math., 1953.
  • Plato. Phaedo. Trans. Hugh Tredennick. The Collected Dialogues of Plato, Including the Letters. Bollingen Series 71. Eds. Edith Hamilton and Huntington Cairns. New York: Pantheon Books, 1966. 40-99.
  • Plato. Phaedrus. Trans. R. Hackforth. The Collected Dialogues of Plato, Including the Letters. Bollingen Series 71. Eds. Edith Hamilton and Huntington Cairns. New York: Pantheon Books, 1966. 475-525.
  • Plato. Republic. Trans. Paul Shorey. The Collected Dialogues of Plato, Including the Letters. Bollingen Series 71. Eds. Edith Hamilton and Huntington Cairns. New York: Pantheon Books, 1966. 575-844.
  • Puruṣa Sūkta. Śrī Rudram and Puruṣasūktam. Trans. and Ed. Swami Amritananda. Ed. Swami Amritananda. Chennai: Sri Ramakrishna Math, 1997.
  • Radhakrishnan, S. The Hindu View of Life. Books that matter. London: G. Allen & Unwin, 1961.
  • Radhakrishnan, S., and Charles Alexander Moore, eds. A Source Book in Indian Philosophy. Princeton, N.J.: Princeton University Press, 1967.
  • Rāmānuja. Śrī Rāmānuja Gītā Bhāṣya. Trans. and Ed. Swāmi Ādidevānada. Madras: Sri Ramakrishna Math, 1991.
  • Rāmānuja. Vedānta Sūtras with the commentary of Rāmānuja (Rāmānuja Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya; Śrī Bhāṣya). Trans. George Thibaut. Sacred Books of the East. Vol. 48. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1996.
  • Rāmānuja. Vedārthasaṅgraha. Trans. and Ed. S.S. Ragavachar. Mysore: Sri Ramakrishna Ashrama, 1968.
  • Ṛg Veda. Vedic hymns. Trans. Hermann Oldenberg. Sacred books of the East. Ed. F. Max Müller. Vol. 32, 46. 2 vols. Oxford: The Clarendon Press, 1891.
  • Śabara. Śabara Bhāṣya. Trans. Ganganatha Jha. Gaekwad’s Oriental Series. Vol. 66, 70, 73. Baroda: Oriental Institute, 1933.
  • Saṃyutta Nikāya. The Connected Discourses of the Buddha : a New Translation of the Saṃyutta Nikāya; translated from the Pāli. Trans. Bhikkhu Bodhi. 2 vols. Somerville, MA: Wisdom Publications, 2000.
  • Śaṅkara (ācārya). Bhagavad Gītā with the commentary of Śankarācārya. Trans. Swāmi Gambhirānanda. Calcutta: Advaita Ashrama, 1991.
  • Śaṅkara (ācārya). “Taittitrīya Upaniṣad Bhāṣya.” Trans. Swami Gambirananda. Eight Upaniṣads, With the Commentary of Śankarācārya. Vol. 1: Advaita Ashrama, 1977. 3-29.
  • Śaṅkara (ācārya). The Vedānta Sūtras (Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya). Sacred books of the East, vol.38. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1994.
  • Śaṅkara-Misra. Vaiśeṣika Sūtra Bhāṣya. Trans. Nandalal Sinha. Sacred Books of the Hindus. Ed. Nandal Sinha. 2nd rev. and enl. ed. Vol. 6. Allahabad: Sudhindra Nath Basu, Panini Office, 1923.
  • Sūtrakṛtānga . Trans. Harmann Georg Jacobi. Jaina Sūtras. Ed. Harmann Georg Jacobi. Vol. 2. Delhi: AVF Books, 1987. 235–436.
  • Tapasyānanda, Swāmi. Bhakti Schools of Vedānta. Madras: Ramakrishna Math, 1990.
  • Udayanācārya and Haridāsa Nyāyālamkāra. The Kusumāñjali: or, Hindu Proof of the Existence of a Supreme Being (10th Century). (Udayanācārya’s Nyāyausumāñjali with Haridāsa’s Nyāyālaṃkāra’s Vyākhyā). Trans. and Ed. E.B. Cowell. Varanasi: Bharat-Bharati, 1980.
  • Vivekānanda. The Complete Works of Swami Vivekānanda. Mayavati memorial ed. Calcutta: Advaita Ashrama, 1964.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Bharadwaja, V.K. “A Non-Ethical Concept of Ahiṃsā.” Indian Philosophical Quarterly. xi.2 (1984): 171-77.
  • Chaterjee, Satischandra, and Dhirendramohan Data. An Introduction to Indian Philosophy. Calcutta: University of Calcutta, 1960.
  • Dasgupta, Surendranath. A History of Indian Philosophy. 5 vols. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidas, 1975.
  • Deutsch, Eliot. Advaita Vedānta: a Philosophical Reconstruction. 1st ed. Honolulu: East-West Center Press, 1969.
  • Dundas, Paul. The Jains. New York: Routledge, 1992.
  • Flintoff, Everard. “Pyrrho and India.” Phronesis 25 (1980): 88-106.
  • Fox, Michael W. Bringing Life to Ethics: Global Bioethics for a Humane Society. Albany: State University of New York Press, 2001.
  • Hacker, Paul. Philology and Confrontation. Ed. Wilhelm Halbfass. Albany: State Universisty of New York, 1995.
  • Halbfass, Wilhelm. India and Europe: an Essay in Understanding. Indien und Europa: Perspektiven ihrer geistigen Begegnung. Basel; Stuttgart: Schwabe, 1981. Albany, N.Y.: State University of New York Press, 1988.
  • Halbfass, Wilhelm. Tradition and Reflection: Explorations in Indian Thought. Albany, N.Y.: State University of New York Press, 1991.
  • Jha, Ganganatha. Purva Mīmāṃsā in its Sources. Trans. Jha, Ganganatha. Library of Indian Philosophy and Religion. Benares: Benares Hindu University, 1942.
  • Kane, Pandurang Vaman. History of Dharmaśāstra: Ancient and Mediæval Religious and Civil Law in India. Government Oriental Series. Class B. no. 6. 2nd rev. and enl. ed. 5 vols. Poona: Bhandarkar Oriental Research Institute, 1990.
  • Klostermaier, Klaus. “Dharmamegha samādhi: Comments on Yoga Sūtra IV.29.” Philosophy East and West 36.3 (1986:): 253-62.
  • Larson, Gerald James, and Ram Shankar Bhattacharya. Samkhya: a Dualist Tradition in Indian Philosophy. Encyclopedia of Indian Philosophies. Ed. Karl H. Potter. Vol. 4. Princeton, N.J.: Princeton University Press, 1987.
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  • Sharma, B. N. Kṛṣṇamurti. The Brahma Sūtras and their Principal Commentaries; a Critical Exposition. 2nd ed. New Delhi: Munshiram Manoharlal, 1986.
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  • Whicher, Ian. The Integrity of the Yoga Darśana. Albany: State University of New York, 1998.

Author Information

Shyam Ranganathan
York University

Madhva (1238—1317)

MadhvacharyaThe Dvaita or “dualist” school of Hindu Vedanta philosophy originated in 13th-century South India with Sri Madhvacarya (Madhva). Madhva, who considered himself an avatara of the wind-god Vayu, argued that a body of canonical texts called the “Vedanta” or “end of the Veda” taught the fundamental difference between the individual self or atman and the ultimate reality, brahman. According to Madhva there are two orders of reality: 1. svatantra, independent reality, which consists of Brahman alone and 2. paratantra, dependent reality, which consists of jivas (souls) and jada (lifeless objects). Although dependent reality would not exist apart from brahman’s will, this very dependence creates a fundamental distinction between brahman and all else, implying a dualist view. By interpreting the Vedanta materials (especially the Upanisads, the Bhagavadgita and the Brahmasutras) along these lines, Madhva deliberately challenged the non-dualist reading in which the atman was identified with brahman. Madhva argued that the scriptures could not teach the identity of all beings because this would contradict ordinary perception, which tells us that we are different both from one another and from God. Madhva and his followers call their system tattvavada, “the realist viewpoint”.

Table of Contents

  1. Madhva and Sankara
  2. Madhva and Ramanuja
  3. Dvaita Vedanta
  4. Canonical Sources
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Madhva and Sankara

The main tenet of Madhva’s Dvaita Vedanta is that the Vedic tradition teaches a fundamental difference between the human soul or atman and the ultimate reality, brahman. This is markedly different from the earlier Advaita Vedanta, which Madhva often vociferously attacked. Sankara’s A-dvaita or “non-dualist” Vedanta (9th century) argued that the atman is completely identical with brahman. According to Sankara, the atman experiences a false sense of plurality and individuality when under the influence of the delusive power of maya. While maya has the ambiguous ontological status of being neither real nor unreal, the only true reality is brahman. A soul becomes liberated from the cycle of rebirth (punar-janma) by realizing that its very experience of samsara is an illusion; its true identity is the singular objectless consciousness that constitutes pure being or brahman.

2. Madhva and Ramanuja

While Ramanuja’s system of Visistadvaita Vedanta or “qualified non-dualism” modifies Sankara’s position on the soul’s identity with brahman, Madhva also rejected it. Ramanuja assumes a plurality of individual souls whose identity remains intact even after liberation but maintains that the souls share the essential nature of brahma. The souls are eternal particles issuing from brahman, who as their source retains its transcendence. Ramanuja maintains Visnu’s distinct difference from the human soul and his supremacy as creator and redeemer. Ramanuja identifies brahman with Visnu, holding that brahman is saguna, i.e. possesses attributes, in contrast to Sankara’s attributeless or “nirguna” brahman.

3. Dvaita Vedanta

Like Ramanuja, Madhva identifies brahman with Visnu. However, he argues that any system that allows for any identification of the atman with brahman undermines Visnu’s supremacy, compromises His status, and strips devotional acts of their meaning. Madhva’s insistence on the modal distinction between the atman and brahman, wherein the former is inalterably dependent upon–and therefore, fundamentally different from–the latter, insures Visnu-as-brahman‘s complete and utter transcendence of the human soul. For Madhva, this view alone makes devotion [bhakti] an essential component of religious belief and practice. Attaining Visnu’s grace is the soul’s only hope of achieving liberation [moksa] from the cycle of rebirth (samsara).

Like Ramanuja, Madhva opposes Sankara’s conception of Brahman as nirguna or without qualities and as a pure self- consciousness. Madhva views Visnu as preeminent above all other deities on the basis of His unique characteristics. This emphasis on Visnu’s particular collocation of attributes that renders Him distinct from all other gods, human souls, and the material world reveals another critical component of Madhva’s philosophy which is his acceptance of an ontological plurality as a fundamental facet of being. Indeed, Madhva rejects the notion that brahman is the only truly existent entity (tattva) and he maintains that, even though living beings and inert matter are dependent upon Brahman, such dependence differentiates them from Him and makes them discrete entities (tattvas). Thus, reality in Madhva’s system consists of three basic elements: God, the souls (jivasi), and insentient matter (jada).

Madhva’s pluralistic ontology is founded on his realist epistemology, which in turn affects his Vedic hermeneutics. He argues that God and the human soul are separate because our daily experience of separateness from God and of plurality in general is presented to us as an undeniable fact, fundamental to our knowledge of all things. Madhva’s emphasis on the validity of experience as a means of knowledge is intended to refute the nondualist position that the differences we experience in daily life are ultimately a shared illusion with the ambiguous ontological status of being neither real nor unreal. In Madhva’s view, Advaita’s denial of the innate validity of knowledge acquired through sense perception completely undermines our ability to know anything since we must always question the content of our knowledge. This questioning would encompass our knowledge of the sacred canon, which is accessible to us only through our ability to perceive it and to draw inferences from it. Madhva argues that perception and inference must be innately valid and the reality they present us with must be actually and ultimately real since such a position is the only one that allows us to know the content of the Vedas. The Vedas alone are responsible for teaching us about the nature of the self and brahman.

This aspect of Madhva’s realist epistemology is important not only because it bolsters Madhva’s claim that the atman and brahman are permanently distinct as revealed to us by experience, but because it means that the sacred texts must be read in consonance with the data we receive from our everyday experience, even though the Vedas present us with knowledge of a supra-sensible realm. Madhva argues that the Vedas cannot teach non-difference between the atman and brahman or a lack of true plurality since this would directly contradict our experience. In Madhva’s view the sacred texts teach pancabheda, the five-fold difference between 1. Visnu and jivas 2. Visnu and jada 3. jiva and jada 4. one jiva and another and 5. one form of jada and another.

Madhva’s belief in the innate difference of one soul from another led to some interesting doctrines in his system. He believed in a hierarchy of jivas, based upon their innate configurations of virtues (gunas) and faults (dosas). For example, Visnu is supreme because He possesses all qualities in their most fulfilled and perfect form. Furthermore, because Madhva believed that souls possess innate characteristics and capacities, he also maintained that they were predestined to achieve certain ends. This perspective put Madhva at odds with traditional Hindu views of the karma theory wherein differences in social and religious status are explained via past moral or immoral acts. For Madhva, each individual being possesses an innate moral propensity and karma is merely the mechanism by which a given soul is propelled towards his or her destiny.

4. Canonical Sources

Madhva’s attempts to locate his controversial views in the canonical Vedanta texts often proved difficult. He is perhaps most famous for his idiosyncratic rendering of the Chandogya Upanisad’s statement tat tvam asi or “you (the atman) are that (brahman).” By carrying over the ‘a’ from the preceding word, Madhva rendered the phrase atat tvam asi or “you are not that.” Some scholars have speculated on “foreign,” particularly Christian, influences on Madhva’s thought but current scholarly consensus maintains that political and social changes in Madhva’s region prompted a new approach to old religious convictions.

Madhva’s Dvaita Vedanta is recognized as one of the three major schools of Vedanta (besides Sankara’s Advaita and Ramanuja’s Visistadvaita Vedanta). It has been further developed by such major figures as Jayatirtha (1356-1388) and Vyasaraya (1478-1589) and is kept alive by a still flourishing community [Madhva sampradaya] in India with its main center at Udipi (Karnataka).

5. References and Further Reading

  • Sharma, B. N. K. Philosophy of Sri Madhvacarya. Rev. ed. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1986.
  • Sharma, B. N. K. Madhva’s Teachings in His Own Words. Bombay: Bharatiya Vidya Bhavan, 1961.
  • Siauve, Suzanne. La Doctrine de Madhva. Pondicherry: Institut Francais d’Indologie, 1968.

Author Information

Valerie Stoker
Wright State University
U. S. A.

Rāmānuja (c. 1017 – c. 1137)

Rāmānuja (ācārya), the eleventh century South Indian philosopher, is the chief proponent of Viśiṣṭādvaita, which is one of the three main forms of the Orthodox Hindu philosophical school, Vedānta. As the prime philosopher of the Viśiṣṭādvaita tradition, Rāmānuja is one of the Indian philosophical tradition’s most important and influential figures. He was the first Indian philosopher to provide a systematic theistic interpretation of the philosophy of the Vedas, and is famous for arguing for the epistemic and soteriological significance of bhakti, or devotion to a personal God. Unlike many of his contemporaries, Rāmānuja defended the reality of a plurality of individual persons, qualities, values and objects while affirming the substantial unity of all. On some accounts, Rāmānuja’s influence on popular Hindu practice is so vast that his system forms the basis for popular Hindu philosophy. His two main philosophical writings (the Śrī Bhāṣya and Vedārthasaṅgraha) are amongst the best examples of rigorous and energetic argumentation in any philosophical tradition, and they are masterpieces of Indian scholastic philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Rāmānuja’s Life and Works
  2. Rāmānuja’s Cosmology and Metaphysics
    1. Background
    2. Negative Philosophical Criticisms of Bhedābheda and Advaita Vedānta
      1. Logical Criticism
      2. Argument from Epistemology
    3. Substantive Theses
      1. Intentionality of Consciousness
      2. Consciousness is a Property of Something
      3. Individuals are Real
    4. Hermeneutic Criticism
      1. Vedas as Doctrinally Unified Corpus
      2. “Tat tvam asi” and Co-ordinate Predication
      3. Brahman and Ātman
  3. Rāmānuja’s Theism
  4. Rāmānuja’s Soteriology
  5. Rāmānuja’s Epistemology
    1. Perception
    2. Scripture
    3. Bhakti
    4. Error
  6. Rāmānuja’s Ethics
    1. Substantive Ethics
    2. Foundations of Ethics
  7. Interpreting Rāmānuja: the Northern and Southern Schools and the Authenticity of the Gadyas
  8. Conclusion: Rāmānuja’s Place in the History of Indian Philosophy
  9. References and Further Readings
    1. Primary Sources
    2. b. Secondary Sources on Rāmānuja

1. Rāmānuja’s Life and Works

On traditional accounts, Rāmānuja lived the unusually long life of 120 years (twice the average lifespan at the time), from 1017 to 1137 C.E., though recent scholarship places his life between 1077 to 1157 C.E., with a life of 80 years (Carman p.27). He was born in the Southern, Tamil speaking region of India, in the small township of Śrīperumbūdur on the outskirts of modern day Chennai (Madras) into a family that hailed from a subclass of Brahmins (the Hindu priestly caste) known for their scholarship and learning in the Vedas. His family was likely bilingual, fluent in both the local vernacular (Tamil) and the language of scholarship (Sanskrit). From a young age he is reputed to have displayed a prodigious intellect and liberal attitudes towards caste. At this time he became friendly with a local, saintly Sudra (member of the servile caste) by the name of Kāñcīpurna, whose occupation it was to perform services for the local temple idol of the Hindu deity Vishnu. Rāmānuja admired Kāñcīpurna’s piety and devotion to Vishnu and sought Kāñcīpurna as his guru-much to the horror of Kāñcīpurna who regarded Rāmānuja’s humility before him as an affront to caste propriety.

Shortly after being married in his teenage years, and after his father passed away, Rāmānuja and his family moved to the neighboring city of Kāñcīpuram. There Rāmānuja found his first formal teacher, Yādavaprakāśa, who was an accomplished professor of the form of the Vedānta philosophy that was in vogue at the time-a form of Vedānta that has strong affinities to Śaṅkara’s Absolute Idealistic Monism (Advaita Vedānta) but was also close to the Difference-and-non-difference view (Bhedābheda Vedānta). (“Vedānta” means the ‘end of the Vedas’ and refers to the philosophy expressed in the end portion of the Vedas, also known as the Upaniṣads, and encoded in the cryptic summary by Bādarāyaṇa called the Vedānta Sūtra or Brahma Sūtra. The perennial questions of Vedānta are: what is the nature of Brahman, or the Ultimate, and what is the relationship between the multiplicity of individuals to this Ultimate. Vedānta comprises one of the six orthodox schools of Hindu philosophy.)

At first Yādavaprakāśa was thrilled to receive a talented and intelligent student of the likes of Rāmānuja. But disagreements between the two, on the proper interpretation of the Upaniṣads, soon broke out. Yādavaprakāśa favored an amoral, impersonal, non-theistic interpretation of the Upaniṣads. Rāmānuja, in contrast, favored a theistic interpretation of the Upaniṣads that placed a premium on the aesthetic and moral excellences of Brahman. Yādavaprakāśa found Rāmānuja’s skill at offering alternative interpretations threatening both to his authority and the popularity of his philosophy. He thus hatched a plan, with some of his other students, to murder Rāmānuja while on a pilgrimage. Rāmānuja however got word of the plan from his classmate and cousin (Govinda) and escaped from the pilgrimage with his life. Rāmānuja (surprisingly) did not make public his knowledge of the failed assassination attempt and resumed classes with Yādavaprakāśa when he returned to Kāñcīpuram. Yādavaprakāśa for his part did not reveal his complicity in the plot to take Rāmānuja’s life, and feigned happiness at continuing to be his teacher. Not too long afterwards, however, Yādavaprakāśa ordered Rāmānuja to leave his school, after a final disagreement on the interpretation of scripture occurred.

Without a teacher, Rāmānuja returned dejected to his childhood mentor, Kāñcīpurna, who assured him that a teacher would come his way. For the time being, Kāñcīpurna instructed Rāmānuja to help him in his manual service to the temple idol of Vishnu.

At the same time Yamuna, the spiritual head of the fledgling Tamil Vaiṣṇava (Vishnu worshiping) community, was near the end of his life and in search of a successor. This community, known as the Śrī Vaiṣṇava Sampradāya, was formed around the memory of the Four Thousand Tamil Verses (Nālāyira Divya Prabhandam) of twelve Tamil Vaiṣṇava saints (Āḻvārs), renowned for their devotional poetry on Vishnu. While it had a modest popular base, it lacked a formal and legitimizing articulation in the Sanskrit academic community. Though a competent and accomplished philosopher in his own right who authored the impressive Siddhi Trayam, Yamuna came into the fold too late in his life to fully articulate the philosophy of Śrī Vaiṣṇavas to the pan-Indian academic community. He thus held out the hope that Rāmānuja would, amongst other things, take up the task of articulating the philosophical ethos of the tradition that had been entrusted to him, in the form of a formal, Sanskrit commentary on the Brahma Sūtra (the cryptic summary of the philosophical purport of the Upaniṣads). Upon finding out that Rāmānuja had been freed from ties to Yādavaprakāśa, and had returned to the company of Kāñcīpurna (himself a member of Yamuna’s Śrī Vaiṣṇava community) Yamuna was overjoyed and sent word to Rāmānuja to come and take up the post as his successor. Yamuna however died just before Rāmānuja could reach him, and once again Rāmānuja found himself without the teacher he had been searching for.

After Rāmānuja had gained his composure, he made his way over to the crowd centered on Yamuna’s new corpse. He noted that three fingers of Yamuna’s were curled. Yamuna’s senior disciples explained to Rāmānuja that they likely represented three wishes of Yamuna, one of which being that a commentary on the Brahma Sūtra should be written. When Rāmānuja pledged to try to fulfill those wishes, the fingers uncurled. The crowd took this as a sign that Rāmānuja was the heir apparent of Yamuna. Rāmānuja was however vexed at the local temple idol of Vishnu for not even allowing him a brief meeting with Yamuna, and would not formally join the community for nearly a year.

When Rāmānuja did decide to formally join the Śrī Vaiṣṇava fold, Yamuna’s senior disciple, Mahāpūrṇa, supervised his initiation. For a matter of six months, Rāmānuja had found himself the teacher he was looking for in the form of Mahāpūrṇa. Under Mahāpūrṇa, Rāmānuja learned the verses of the Tamil Vaiṣṇava saints. However, his learning under Mahāpūrṇa came to an abrupt end when Rāmānuja’s wife picked a fight with Mahāpūrṇa’s wife, on the premise that the latter was a member of a lower Brahmanic subcaste. Upon hearing this, the hurt Mahāpūrṇa and his wife departed from Rāmānuja’s company without notice. Rāmānuja, once again lost his teacher. But this was not the first time that Rāmānuja’s wife had interfered with his spiritual development.

At an earlier point, Rāmānuja had invited his childhood mentor, Kāñcīpurna, for a meal. Rāmānuja had hoped to partake of Kāñcīpurna’s leavings as a sacrament. However, Kāñcīpurna arrived early in absence of Rāmānuja. Rāmānuja’s wife fed Kāñcīpurna, sent him off, and ritually purified the dining area, by, amongst other things, discarding Kāñcīpurna’s leftovers.

Having lost the benefits of a teacher twice over as a result of his wife’s caste-pretensions, Rāmānuja was incensed. He thus sent his wife back to her natal home, and promptly became a renounciate (saṃnyāsin). He earned the title “king of ascetics (yatirāja) from the temple deity of Vishnu speaking through Kāñcīpurna at this point.

Rāmānuja’s separation from his wife and his initiation into the order of ascetics marks the beginning of his career as an independent and self-assured philosopher. He traveled around India and participated in public debates with exponents of rival philosophies. Many of the philosophers that Rāmānuja defeated became prominent disciples in his fold. Rāmānuja standardized and reformed temple worship in those Vaiṣṇava temples that he gained control over (often through winning debates with the custodians of the temple). To this day his instructions are the norm of Śrī Vaiṣṇava temple and home worship in India and abroad.

The Śrī Vaiṣṇava tradition is unanimous in holding that Rāmānuja authored nine, and only nine, works: all in Sanskrit. While Rāmānuja is reported by the writings of his disciples to have lectured in Tamil on the verses of the Tamil Vaiṣṇava saints, he left no writings on their work, and no explicit mention of them in his writings. At first glance, this seems remarkable, given that the Divya Prabhandam is regarded by the Śrī Vaiṣṇava tradition, as the Tamil equivalent of the Vedas. However, Rāmānuja’s silence on the Āḻvārs in his Sanskrit writings may have been a result of his aim as philosopher to not preach to the converted, but to articulate his philosophy to the pan-Indian academic community.

Rāmānuja’s first work was likely the Vedārthasaṅgraha (‘Summary of the Meaning of the Vedas’). It sets out Rāmānuja’s philosophy, which is theistic (it affirms a morally perfect, omniscient and omnipotent God) and realistic (it affirms the existence and reality of a plurality of qualities, persons and objects). This work is referred to several times in Rāmānuja’s magnum opus, his commentary on the Brahma Sūtra, the Śrī Bhāṣya (also known as his Brahma Sūtra Bhāṣya). This is the work that Rāmānuja is best known by outside of the Śrī Vaiṣṇava tradition. In addition to this large commentary on the Brahma Sūtra, Rāmānuja apparently wrote two more shorter commentaries: Vedāntapīda, and Vedāntasāra. Aside from the Vedārthasaṅgraha and Śrī Bhāṣya, Rāmānuja’s most important philosophic work is a commentary on the Bhagavad Gītā (Bhagavad Gītā Bhāṣya). In addition to these philosophic works, Rāmānuja is held by tradition to have written three prose hymns called collectively the Gadya Traya, which include the Śaraṇāgati Gadya, Śrīraṅga Gadya and the Vaikunṭḥa Gadya). The Śaraṇāgati Gadya is a dialogue between Rāmānuja and the Hindu deities Śrī (Lakṣmī) and Nārāyaṇa (Vishnu) (which jointly comprise God, or Brahman, for Rāmānuja) in which Rāmānuja surrenders himself before God and petitions Vishnu, through Lakṣmī, for his Grace. Vishnu and Lakṣmī, for their part, respond favorably to Rāmānuja’s act of surrender. The Śrīraṅga Gadya is a prayer of surrender to the feet of Ranganatha. (This is Vishnu in his repose on the many headed serpent Ādi Śeṣa -‘ancient servant,’ ‘ancient residue,’ or ‘primeval matter’- on the milk ocean.) The Vaikunṭḥa Gadya describes in great detail the eternal realm of Vishnu, called Vaikunṭḥa, on which one should meditate in order to gain liberation. Finally Rāmānuja is held to have authored a manual of daily worship called the Nityagrantha.

The authenticity of all but the three large works attributed to Rāmānuja – Śrī Bhāṣya, Vedārthasaṅgraha and the Bhagavad Gītā Bhāṣya – have come into question in recent times. The argument against the authenticity of these texts appears to be a minority position amongst scholars. With respect to the two smaller commentaries on the Brahma Sūtra, it has been argued that they must be inauthentic, because it seems unlikely that Rāmānuja would himself have bothered to take the time to abridge his larger commentary, the Śrī Bhāṣya (cf. Buitenen p.32). With respect to the short religious works attributed to Rāmānuja, it has been argued that they present doctrines that go beyond those that are found in his major commentaries (cf. Lester p.279).

2. Rāmānuja’s Cosmology and Metaphysics

a. Background

Subsequent tradition has applied the label “Viśiṣṭādvaita” to the philosophy of Rāmānuja. It is meant to contrast his philosophy from leading competing views, such as Advaita (Non-Dualist), Bhedābheda (Difference-and-non-difference) and Dvaita (Dualist) Vedānta. The term “Viśiṣṭādvaita” is often translated as ‘Qualified Non-Dualism.’ An alternative, and more informative, translation is “Non-duality of the qualified whole,” or perhaps ‘Non-duality with qualifications.” The label attempts to mark out Rāmānuja’s effort to affirm the unity of the many, without giving up on the reality of distinct persons, qualities, universals, or aesthetic and moral values.

Where all versions of Vedānta intersect is in their effort to provide a consistent and defendable interpretation of the Brahma Sūtra, on philosophical and hermeneutic grounds. Given the common textual bases, there are certain doctrinal invariances amongst the various sub-schools of Vedānta.

In accordance with the Upaniṣads, the various schools of Vedānta hold that there is an ultimate entity, called Brahman, which also is referred to by scripture as “Ātman” (“Self”). The Vedānta schools recognize, in accordance with the Upaniṣads, that Brahman plays a key role in the organization of the universe. Attainment of Brahman by an individual constitutes its highest good: soteriological liberation or moḳsa.

The chief areas of disagreement amongst the various schools of Vedānta are on the nature and ontological status of individual selves, objects of cognition and Brahman, as well as the relevance and importance of ethics or duty (dharma) to the good life.

Rāmānuja’s foils in the articulation of his philosophy are two forms of Vedānta that were not clearly distinguished during his day: these are the Bhedābheda view, and the Advaita philosophy. Both these views take a similar stance on the relationship of an individual’s subjectivity and Brahman: on both accounts, the conscious principle of the individual is of a piece with Brahman. In the case of Advaita Vedānta, the consciousness of an individual is regarded as numerically identical with the consciousness of Brahman. On this view, the psychological ego or sense of individuality is something distinct from consciousness: it is its object. The Bhedābheda view similarly asserts the numerical identity of an individual’s consciousness and Brahman, but it emphasizes that this identity is counteracted by a separating off, or differentiating effort, on the part of Brahman to compartmentalize itself and mysteriously constitute the world of plurality and difference. On this view, the individual ego is constituted by Brahman. According to the versions of Bhedābheda and Advaita that Rāmānuja was acquainted with, mere knowledge of one’s identity with Brahman is sufficient to bring about liberation; works, such as ritual and moral obligations, can at best play a preparatory role in bringing an individual to the state of being desirous for liberation, but they have no intrinsic value. Corollaries of these views are the position that consciousness, and not plurality, is metaphysically fundamental; that consciousness does not require objects for its existence; that belief in plurality consists in the uncritical acceptance of ordinary experience; and that dialectical reasoning can yield substantive knowledge with practical import. On many fronts (on the reality of universals, particulars, and moral values) both the Bhedābheda Advaita schools are classic forms of anti-realism.

Students of Rāmānuja’s thought may wish to know whom Rāmānuja is arguing against. In all likely hood, it is his former teacher, Yādavaprakāśa. However, Rāmānuja does not attribute the Advaita or Bhedābheda views to any particular philosopher. Rather, these views are voiced by the opponent, or the ubiquitous pūrvapakṣin , everywhere in Indian philosophy, expressing the views to be criticized.

Rāmānuja’s arguments that he presents against his opponent are of roughly three varieties. Some are negative, and focus on philosophical problems of the opponent’s view. Some are positive, and concern arguing for theses that Rāmānuja wishes to defend. And some arguments are hermeneutic. This last category of arguments combines criticism and positive philosophical argument, but it centers on the proper interpretation of the Vedas.

b. Negative Philosophical Criticisms of Bhedābheda and Advaita Vedānta

i. Logical Criticism

Rāmānuja criticizes many of the arguments of the Bhedābheda and Advaita views on logical grounds. These schools employed dialectical arguments that conclude on the basis of logical puzzles that arise in accounting for distinctions and difference in perception that difference (which includes the idea of a distinct quality) is an unintelligible notion. From such considerations, these philosophers would typically conclude that only undifferentiated consciousness is the real (Brahman). Rāmānuja at many points in the Śrī Bhāṣya and the Vedārthasaṅgraha attempts to argue against such views by an argument ad absurdum. Particularly, Rāmānuja argues that the arguments presented by the Bhedābheda and Advaita Vedāntins lead to intolerable contradictions and further conclusions that go against common sense. At one point he suggests that those who would make such arguments are “no better than a man who would claim that his own mother never had any children” (Śrī Bhāṣya, I.i.1. “Great Siddhānta” p.44).

ii. Argument from Epistemology

Rāmānuja argues that the epistemic considerations that his opponents adduce for their positions undercut their own views. The philosophers that Rāmānuja takes aim at argue that all means of cognition involve error. Rāmānuja argues that if this is so, it follows that we could never know that all cognition involves error, for such putative knowledge would itself involve an erroneous cognition, and hence not qualify as genuine knowledge. If Rāmānuja’s opponents view is correct, then it follows that some cognitions are not erroneous. But this is exactly what the disputed conclusion rules out (Śrī Bhāṣya, I.i.1. “Great Siddhānta” pp.74-78).

c. Substantive Theses

i. Intentionality of Consciousness

While the previous two strategies that Rāmānuja employs in his criticism of the Bhedābheda and Advaita views are largely negative, and involve criticizing these views on formal grounds, Rāmānuja also defends philosophical theses that these two schools rule out. The most important of these theses is the view that consciousness is always consciousness of some object distinguished by a characteristic (cf. Śrī Bhāṣya, I.i.1. “Great Siddhānta” p.53 and “Great Pūrvapakṣa” p.32). This is the doctrine known as “dharmabhūtajñāna” in the Viśiṣṭādvaita tradition (Śrīnivāsadāsa VII.2). It implies the view that all epistemic states, be it consciousness or perception, are intentional or object oriented. If it is the case that even consciousness requires an object for its existence, it follows that there can be no such thing as pure consciousness apart from difference (such as qualities, properties and objects of consciousness). Thus, on this account, if consciousness exists, it follows that difference and plurality does as well. With this one thesis, and against the backdrop of Vedāntic idealism, Rāmānuja is able to generate one limb of his organismic cosmology.

ii. Consciousness is a Property of Something

Another important substantive philosophical thesis that Rāmānuja defends is that consciousness is itself a property. To modern readers, this may seem to be a trivial point. However, it is central to the project of Rāmānuja’s opponents that Brahman is the only reality, and it is a reality devoid of distinctions or qualities. Rāmānuja’s opponents are happy to affirm that certain things can be said of Brahman, for instance, that it is (as affirmed in the Taittirīya Upaniṣad II.i.1.) truth (satyam) knowledge (jñānam) and infinite (anantam). However, they take the stand that these are not properties of Brahman, but the very being of Brahman (Śrī Bhāṣya, I.i.1. “Great Pūrvapakṣa” p.29). Rāmānuja, in contrast, defends the view that such attributions bring attention to the reality of Brahman‘s qualities (cf. Śrī Bhāṣya, I.i.1. “Great Pūrvapakṣa” p.28).

iii. Individuals are Real

A third and important substantive thesis that Rāmānuja defends is the reality of the individual. According to Advaita Vedānta (and the Bhedābheda view to a lesser extent), the individual person, in contradistinction to other persons, is an illusion (māyā) that comes about by nescience (avidya). Rāmānuja argues that the very idea that something can be ignorant presumes that there is an individual capable of being ignorant. For all Vedāntins affirm that Brahman is of the nature of consciousness and knowledge. Hence, to say that Brahman is ignorant is absurd. If anything is subject to ignorance, it must be an individual other than Brahman. However, if this is so, then ignorance cannot be brought into explain the existence of individuals, for it presumes the existence of an individual capable of being ignorant. Rāmānuja’s positive view is thus that there are, indeed, distinct individuals, many who are under the spell of ignorance. However, their individuality is ontologically and logically prior to their ignorance (Śrī Bhāṣya, I.i.1. “Great Siddhānta” p.103)

d. Hermeneutic Criticism

All Vedānta philosophies must turn to the Vedas, and particularly the Upaniṣads, for scriptural grounding. Hence, in criticizing his fellow Vedāntins, Rāmānuja makes use of arguments that concern the proper interpretation of scripture.

i. Vedas as Doctrinally Unified Corpus

According to Rāmānuja, his opponents have failed to arrive at an interpretation of the Vedas based on all Vedic texts. Rather, they emphasize some passages that support a monistic interpretation, and ignore those passages that either presume or emphasize plurality. Rāmānuja notes that his opponents hold to the view that those Vedic texts that come later in the corpus are to be emphasized (the fact that they come later is presumed, on this account, to show that they contain the more advanced and esoteric teachings) (Śrī Bhāṣya, I.i.1. “Great Pūrvapakṣa” p.27). These, more than other portions of the Vedas, emphasize the oneness of reality with Brahman. Rāmānuja argues that even these portions of the Vedas presume and affirm plurality. Even if it were not the case that these portions of the Vedas mentioned plurality, we would have to take all the Vedas on par for Rāmānuja. According to Rāmānuja, one cannot attempt to give interpretations of isolated portions of the Vedas. Rather, one must take the Vedas as one unified corpus, aiming at the expression of a single doctrine (cf. Śrī Bhāṣya pp.92-3, I.i.1. “Great Siddhānta“). Hence, any tenable interpretation of the philosophy of the Vedas must not only affirm the reality of plurality, but also the importance of ritual and moral obligations (dharma), for these are spoken about at length in the earlier portions of the Vedas.

ii. “Tat tvam asi” and Co-ordinate Predication

Even if the Vedic corpus as a whole is taken to present a single doctrine, Rāmānuja is still left with the task of accounting for how the seemingly monistic portions of the Upaniṣads are consistent with the reality of a plurality of distinct individuals. To overcome this hermeneutic hurdle, Rāmānuja introduces the doctrine of sāmānādhikaraṇya , sometimes translated as “co-ordinate predication” or “the principle of grammatical coordination” but literally meaning ‘several things in a common substrate.’ The etymology of the word suggests an ontological doctrine. However, Rāmānuja means to employ it as a semantic doctrine. According to Rāmānuja, “The experts on such matters define it thus: `The signification of an identical entity by several terms [śabda] which are applied to that entity on different grounds is co-ordinate predication” (Vedārthasaṅgraha §24).

In both the Śrī Bhāṣya and the Vedārthasaṅgraha, Rāmānuja draws a distinction between the object denoted by a term, and the quality that it can be identified in connection with. The possibility of using various terms with the same denotation but with different qualitative content is what Rāmānuja calls “co-ordinate predication.”

The doctrine that Rāmānuja advances under the heading of co-ordinate predication strikingly anticipates the Fregean distinction between sense and reference. In the writings of Rāmānuja, the doctrine is used to interpret monistic passages of the Vedas in a manner that affirms both the unity of the thing designated, via the coreferentiality of the various terms, while affirming that the various terms bring to the sentence an emphasis on distinct properties of the unitary thing so identified. With respect to the famous formula “that thou art” (tat tvam asi) from the Chandyoga Upaniṣad (which Advaitins quote as support for the absolute identity of the individual’s self with Brahman), Rāmānuja understands the indexicals “that” and “thou” as signifying an underlying unity, while containing distinct qualitative content. Hence, “that” in this context, brings to fore the quality of the underlying substantial unity of all individuals in Brahman, while “thou” emphasize that we, as individuals, are qualities or distinctions in this underlying unity (Śrī Bhāṣya, I.i.1. “Great Siddhānta” pp.129-39).

iii. Brahman and Ātman

Even if the doctrine of co-ordinate predication is granted, there is yet another hermeneutic hurdle for Rāmānuja to contend with: this is the Upaniṣadic equation of Brahman (the Ultimate) with Ātman (or Self). If the Ultimate and the Self are one, then it would seem that there is no room for the existence of a plurality of individual persons. The problem might be solved by denying that “Ātman” means self, but this would be to stipulate a meaning for the word “Ātman” that it does not have in Sanskrit or Vedic. Rāmānuja’s solution to this problem is the cosmological doctrine of śarīra and śarīrī (body and soul), or śeṣa </