Most of us agree that we are conscious, and we can be consciously aware of public things such as mountains, tables, foods, and so forth; we can also be consciously aware of our own psychological states and episodes such as emotions, thoughts, perceptions, and so forth. Each of us can be aware of our body via vision, sound, smell, and so on. We also can be aware of our own body “from the inside,” via proprioception, kinaesthesis, the sense of balance, and interoception. When you are reading this article, in addition to your visual experiences of many words, you might feel that your legs are crossed, that one of your hands is moving toward a coffee mug, and that you are a bit hungry, without ever seeing or hearing your limbs and your stomach. We all have these experiences. The situation can get peculiar, intriguing, and surprising if we reflect upon it a bit more: the body and its parts are objective, public things, and that is why in principle everyone else can perceive our bodies. But the body and its parts also have a subjective dimension. This is why many believe that in principle only one’s own self can be aware of one’s own body “from the inside.” Consciousness of, or awareness of, one’s own body, then, can generate many interesting and substantive philosophical and empirical questions due to the objective-subjective dual aspects, as is seen below. The beginning of section 1 introduces the structure of this article and presents some caveats. Having these early on can be daunting, but they occur there because this is a complicated area of study.
Table of Contents
- Varieties of Bodily Awareness
- Contemporary Issues
- Phenomenological Insights: The Body as a Subjective Object and an Objective Subject
- References and Further Reading
1. Varieties of Bodily Awareness
Bodily awareness, or bodily consciousness, covers a wide range of experiences. It is closely related to, though crucially different from, bodily representation (1.e) and bodily self-awareness (2.d). Another related notion is bodily self-knowledge, which includes immunity to error through misidentification (2.b). What follows is some broad territory, and it is unrealistic to claim comprehensiveness. It is divided in the following way: section 1 discusses varieties of bodily awareness, without committing the view that this represents the classification of bodily awareness (Armstrong, 1962): different researchers would carve things up in slightly different ways, but the most important elements are covered here. Section 2 surveys several contemporary issues in Anglo-Saxon philosophy and cognitive sciences. Note that the divide between sections 1 and 2 is somewhat artificial: in introducing varieties of bodily awareness, we will of course discuss theoretical issues and questions in those areas, otherwise, it would become a pure reportage. However, this divide between sections 1 and 2 is not entirely arbitrary, since while section 1 will be primarily on different varieties of bodily awareness, section 2 will be explicitly question-oriented. They will be mutually complementary and not repetitive. Section 3 discusses some insights from the phenomenological tradition with a specific focus on the lived body as a subjective object and an objective subject. The divide between sections 2 and 3 can also be seen as somewhat artificial: it is perfectly sensible to spread those or even more phenomenological insights along the way in sections 1 and 2. This will not be the strategy because in practice, these traditions work in parallel most of the time, and seek to communicate when there are opportunities. It will be conceptually cleaner if we proceed in a way that separates them first. Also, the phenomenological insights covered below seem especially suitable for the larger issues in section 3, so we will save them mostly for that section, with the proviso that many ideas in section 3 will rely on various elements in the previous sections, and that considerations from the analytic tradition will creep back toward the end. Note that the discussions of section 3 are highly selective; after all, this article is mostly written from the analytical point of view. Many phenomenologists have studied the body and bodily awareness intensively, but for the flow of the narrative and the scope of the article, they are not included below. Notable names that we will not discuss include Aron Gurwitsch (1964), Michel Henry (1965), Dorothée Legrand (2007a, 2007b), and Dan Zahavi (2021). Section 4 concludes and summarises.
What is touch? This question is surprisingly difficult to answer if what we are looking for is a precise definition. Examples are easy to give: we (and other animals) touch things with our hands, feet, and/or other parts of the body when we make contact with those things with body parts. Things quickly become murkier when we consider specific conditions; for example, is skin necessary for touch? Many animals do not have skin, at least under common understandings of what skins are, but they can touch things and have tactile experiences, at least according to most. Even humans seem to be able to touch things with lips, tongues, and eyes, thereby having tactile experiences, but they are not covered by skin. Some would even claim that when one’s stomach is in contact with foods, one can sometimes feel tactile sensations, though see discussions of interoception below (1.c). So even if we only focus on examples, it is difficult to differentiate touch from non-touch. Moreover, many touches or tactile experiences seem to involve indirect contacts: for example, your hands can touch your shoulders even when wearing clothes or gloves; one’s hands can have tactile feedbacks by using crutches to walk. Exactly how to conceive the relation between touch and contact can seem controversial.
What about definitions then? This often appears under the heading of “individuating the senses” (for example, Macpherson, 2011): what are the individuation conditions of, say, vision, audition, olfaction, gustation, touch, and perhaps other senses? Aristotle in De Anima proposed the “proper object account”: colours are only for vision, sounds are only for audition, smells are only for olfaction, tastes are only for gustation, and so on. But what about touch? There does not seem to be any proper object for it. With touch we can take in information about objects’ sizes and shapes, but they can also be taken in by sight, or perhaps even by audition: we seem to be able to hear (to some extent) whether the rolling rocks are huge or small, or what the shape of a room roughly is, for example (for example, Plumbley, 2013). Some have argued that pressure is the proper objects of touch (Vignemont and Massin, 2015), though controversies have not been settled. Researchers have proposed many other candidate criteria, including the representational criterion, the phenomenal character criterion, the proximal stimulus criterion, the sense-organ criterion, and so on. Each has its strengths and weaknesses. Still, there are difficult questions to answer such as: are ventral and dorsal visions separate senses? How about orthonasal and retronasal olfaction (Wilson, 2021)? Does neutral touch, thermoception, and nociception form a unitary sense (Fulkerson, 2013)? To acknowledge touch as one element of bodily awareness, though, one does not need to resolve these difficult questions first.
Setting aside the above controversies, a basic distinction within touch is between haptic/active and passive touch. While in daily life, creatures often actively explore objects in the environment, they also experience passive touch all the time; consider the contacts between your body and the chair you sit on, or the clothing that covers different parts of your body. This distinction is closely related to, though not perfectly mapped onto, the distinction between kinaesthesis and proprioception (see the next subsection). In experimental works, laboratories tend to specialise on either haptic or passive touch, focusing on their temporal or/and spatial profiles. For example, in the famous cutaneous rabbit illusion (a.k.a. cutaneous saltation), where participants feel a tactile illusion induced by tapping multiple separate regions of the skin (often on a forearm) in rapid succession (Geldard and Sherrick, 1972), participants are asked not to move their body; same is true of the perhaps even more famous rubber hand illusion, in which the feeling that a rubber hand belongs to one’s body is generated by stroking a visible rubber hand synchronously to the participant’s own hidden hand (Ehrsson, Spence, and Passingham, 2004; also see a related four-hand illusion in Chen, Huang, Lee, and Liang, 2018, where each participant has the illusory experience of owning four hands). Varieties of tactile and body illusions are important entry points for researchers to probe the distinctive properties of touch. Vignemont (2018) offers an excellent list of bodily illusions with informative descriptions (p. 207-211).
An important approach to studying touch is to look into cases in which the subjects have no sight, both congenitally and otherwise (Morash, Pensky, Alfaro, and McKerracher, 2012). This also includes experimental conditions where participants are blindfolded or situated in a dark room. This is a useful method because crossmodal or multisensory interactions can greatly influence tactile experiences; therefore, blocking the influence from vision (and other senses) can make sure what is being studied is touch itself. This is one reason why Molyneux’s question is so theoretically relevant and intriguing (Locke 1693/1979; Cheng, 2020; Ferretti and Glenney, 2020). Molyneux’s question hypothesizes that it is possible to restore the vision of those who are born completely blind. It then asks whether the subjects who obtain this new visual capability can immediately tell which shapes are which, solely by vision. The question depends on how we think of the structural similarities between sight and touch, how amodal spatial representation works in transforming spatial representations in different modalities, and so on. The same consideration about blocking crossmodal effects applies to audition: in experiments on touch, participants are often asked to put on earplugs or headphones with white noises. The relations between sight, touch, and multimodality have been important in the literature, but this goes beyond the scope of this article.
Touch is a form of perception, and in many philosophical and empirical studies of touch, researchers focus primarily on the “cold” aspect of it; that is, sometimes people talk as if touch is primarily about gathering information about the immediate environment and one’s own body. But touch also has the “hot” aspect, which is often called “affective touch.” This cold/hot distinction is also applicable to other sense modalities, and even to cognition. While “cold” perceptions or cognitions are often said to be receptive and descriptive, “hot” perceptions and cognitions are by contrast evaluative and motivational. Affective perceptions involve conscious experiences, emotions, and evaluative judgments. Another way to pick out this “hot” aspect is to label these perceptions as “valenced.” Focusing on touch, it is notable that tactile experiences often if not always have felt pleasant or unpleasant phenomenal characters. Phenomenologically speaking, these valences might feel as if they are integral to tactile experiences themselves, though physiologically, specialised afferent nerve channels “CT-Afferents” might be distinctively responsible for pleasantness (McGlone, Wessberg, and Olausson, 2014). Affective perceptions, touch included, seem to be essential to varieties of social relations and aesthetic experiences, and this makes them a much wider topic of study in philosophy, psychology, and beyond (Nanay, 2016; Korsmeyer, 2020).
Touch carries information both about the external world and about the body itself (Katz, 1925/1989). It is related to other forms of bodily awareness, such as proprioception and kinaesthesis, thermal sensation and pain, interoception, and so on. These will be discussed in some detail in the following subsections. For other philosophical discussions concerning touch, for example, varieties of tangible qualities, the nature of pleasant touch, and the relation between touch and action, see for example Fulkerson (2015/2020).
b. Proprioception, Kinaesthesis, and the Vestibular Sense
The term “proprioception” can be at least traced back to Sherrington (1906): “In muscular receptivity, we see the body itself acting as a stimulus to its own receptors – the proprioceptors.” This definition has been refined many times in the past century, and the term has at least a broad and a narrow meaning. Broadly construed, this term is interchangeable with “kinaesthesis,” and they jointly refer to the sense through which the subjects can perceive or sense the position and movement of our body (Tuthill and Azim, 2018). Narrowly construed, although “proprioception” refers to the perception or at least sensing of the positions of our body parts, “kinaesthesis” refers to the perception or at least sensing of the movement of our body parts. The reservation here concerning perception is that some would think perception is necessarily exteroceptive and can be about multiple objects, while some might regard proprioception and kinaesthesis as interoceptive and can only be about one specific object (note that Sherrington himself clearly distinguishes proprioception from interoception; for more on interoception and related issues, see also 1.c and 3.b). With this narrower usage, one can see that proprioception and kinaesthesis can sometimes be dissociated, but they often occur together: when we sit or stand without any obvious movement, we still feel where our limbs are and how they stretch, and so forth, so this can be a case of having proprioception without kinaesthesis. In other cases, where someone moves around or uses their hands to grab things, they at the same time feel the positions and movements of our body parts.
Proprioception and kinaesthesis raise some distinctive philosophical issues (for example, Fridland, 2011); specifically, some have argued that surprisingly, one can proprioceive someone else’s movements in some sense (Montero, 2006); it is also explored as an aesthetic sense (Schrenk, 2014) and an affective sense (Cole and Montero, 2007). In considering deafferented subjects, who lack proprioceptive awareness of much of their bodies (or “body blind”; see 2.e), some have considered the role of proprioceptive awareness in our self-conscious unity as practical subjects (Howe, 2018). Relatedly, it has been argued that the possibility of bodily action is provided by multimodal body representations for action (Wong, 2017a). Also based on deafferented patients, some have argued that proprioception is necessary for body schema plasticity (Cardinali, Brozzoli, Luauté, Roy, and Farnè, 2016). Moreover, some have argued that proprioception is our direct, immediate knowledge of the body (Hamilton, 2005). It has also been identified as a crucial element in many other senses (O’Dea, 2011). And there is much more. To put it bluntly, proprioception is almost everywhere in our conscious life, though this might not be obvious before being pointed out. It is worth noting that the above contributions are from both philosophers and empirical researchers, and sometimes it is hard to figure out whether a specific work is by philosophers or scientists.
The vestibular sense or system in the inner ear is often introduced with proprioception and kinaesthesis as bodily senses; it is our sense of balance, including sensations of body rotation, gravitation, acceleration, and movement. The system includes two structures of the bony labyrinth of the inner ear – the vestibule and the semicircular canals. When it goes wrong, we feel dizziness or vertigo. The basic functions of the vestibular system include stabilising postures and gazes and providing the gravitational or geocentric frame of reference (Berthoz, 1991). It is multisensory in the sense that it is often or even always implicated in other sense perceptions. Whether it has “proprietary phenomenology,” that is, phenomenology specific to it, is a matter of dispute (Wong, 2017b). It is less seen in philosophical contexts, but in recent years it also figures in the purview of philosophy. What are the distinctive features of the vestibular sense or system? Here are some potential candidates: vestibular afferents are constantly active even when we are motionless; it has “no overt, readily recognizable, localizable, conscious sensation from [the vestibular] organs” (Day and Fitzpatrick, 2005, p.R583); it enables an absolute frame of reference for self-motion, particularly absolute head motion in a head-centered frame of reference; and vestibular information and processing in the central nervous system is highly multisensory (Wong, 2017b). It can be argued that, however, some of these characteristics are shared with other senses. For example, the first point might be applicable to proprioception, and the fourth point might be applicable to some cases of touch. Still, even if these four points are not exclusive for the vestibular sense, they are at least important characteristics of it. One major philosophical import of the vestibular sense is the ways in which it relates self, body, and world. More specifically, the vestibular system plays crucial roles “in agentive self-location…, in anchoring the self to its body…, and in orienting the subject to the world… balance is being-in-my-body-in-the-world” (ibid., p. 319-320; 328). Note that self-location is often but not always bounded with body-location: in the case of out-of-body experience (Lenggenhager, Tadi, Metzinger, and Blanke, 2007), for example, the two are dissociated. It has also been proposed that there should be a three-way distinction here: in addition to self-location and body-location, there is also “1PP-location”: “the sense of where my first-person perspective is located in space” (Huang, Lee, Chen, and Liang, 2017).
c. Thermal Sensation, Pain, and Interoception
Another crucial factor in bodily awareness is thermal sensation or thermoception, which is necessarily implicated in every tactile experience: people often do not notice the thermal aspect of touch, but they can become salient when, for example, the coffee is too hot, or the bathing water is too cold. They also exist in cases without touch: People feel environmental temperatures without touch (exteroceptive), and they feel body temperature in body parts that have no contact with things (interoceptive; for more on the exteroceptive and the interoceptive characters of thermal perception, see Cheng, 2020). Thermal illusions are also ways of probing the nature of bodily awareness (for example, thermal referral, Cataldo, Ferrè, di Pellegrino, and Haggard, 2016; thermal grill, Fardo, Finnerup, and Haggard, 2018). Connecting back to the individuation of the senses discussion, there is a question concerning how many senses there are within the somatosensory system. More specifically, are touch, thermal sensation, and nociception (see below) different senses? Or should they be grouped as one sense modality? Or perhaps this question has no proper theoretical answer (Ratcliffe, 2012)? Besides, there are questions specific to thermal perception. For example, what do experiences of heat and cold represent, if they represent anything at all? Do they represent states or processes of things? Gray (2013) argues that experiences of heat and cold do not represent states of things; they represent processes instead. More specifically, he develops the “heat exchange model of heat perception,” according to which “the opposite processes of thermal energy being transmitted to and from the body, respectively” (p. 131). Relating this back to general considerations in philosophy of mind and metaphysics should help us understand what is at stake: some have argued that the senses do not have intentional content, that is, they do not represent (Travis, 2014). Many philosophers demur and hold the “content view” of experience instead (Siegel, 2010), but within the content view the major variant is that sensory experiences represent objects such as tables, chairs, mountains, and rivers; they also represent states of things, such as how crowded the room is, or the temperatures of things people are in contact. Gray’s view is that experiences of heat and cold do represent, but what they represent are not states but a certain kind of processes (for more on the ontological differences between events, processes, and states, see Steward, 1997). This view is controversial, to be sure, but it opens up a new theoretical possibility that should be considered seriously. Philosophical discussions of thermal perception or the thermal sense have been quite limited so far, and there might be some more potential in this area.
Pain is often regarded as having similar status as thermal perception, that is, subjective and (at least often) interoceptive, though pain seems to have drawn more attention at least in philosophy (for example, the toy example with pain and C-fibre firing). In the empirical literature, “pain” tends to occur with another term “nociception,” but they are strictly speaking different: “Pain is a product of higher brain center processing, whereas nociception can occur in the absence of pain” (National Research Council, 2009). This is not to deny they have large physiological overlaps, but since we do not aim to cover physiology, readers are encouraged to look for relevant resources elsewhere. Pain sometimes appears in the context of touch, for example, under specific circumstances where touch is multisensory (Fulkerson, 2015/2020); it also occurs in the context of thermal pain. But pain also has its own distinctive philosophical issues: do pains represent at all? Are painful qualities exhausted by representational properties (for example, Lycan, 1987)? Do pains have physical locations (for example, Bain, 2007)? How should we explain clinical cases such as pain asymbolia, that is, the syndrome with which subjects can feel pain but do not care to remove them (Berthier, Starkstein, and Leiguarda, 1988)? Is pain a natural kind (Corns, 2020)? Amongst these significant questions, arguably the most central question concerning the nature of pain is epitomised by the so-called “paradox of pain,” that is, according to the folk conception of pain, it is both mental and bodily (Hill, 2005, 2017; Aydede, 2013; Reuter, Phillips, and Sytsma, 2014; Reuter, 2017; Borg, Harrison, Stazicker, & Salomons, 2020). On the one hand, pains seem to allow privileged access for the subject in question and admits no appearance/reality distinction (Kripke, 1980; Searle, 1992), while on the other hand, pains seem to be bodily states, processes, or activities, just like bodily damages are. In addition to these two opposing views, there is also the “polyeidic view,” according to which our concept of pain is polyeidic or multi-dimensional, “containing a number of different strands or elements (with the bodily/mental dimension being just one strand among others” (Borg, Harrison, Stazicker, & Salomons, 2020, p. 30-31). Moreover, there is also the “polysemy view,” according to which pain terms are polysemous, referring to both mental and bodily states (Liu, 2021). Without going into the details, three observations are on offer: firstly, some have argued that the above discussions tend to be conducted in English, but other languages might reflect different conceptions of pain (Liu and Klein, 2020). Secondly, sometimes we can easily run two debates together, one about the nature or metaphysics of pain, and the other about folk notions or concepts of pain. And thirdly, sometimes it can seem that the above debate is at least partially about consciousness in general, not about pain. For example, when disagreeing about whether one can draw the distinction between appearance and reality for pain, it seems that the disagreement is actually about consciousness, whether it is painful experience or otherwise.
Apart from the above controversies, there is a relatively new category that has not been recognised widely by the literature as an independent sense, but the experience itself is familiar enough: as Lin, Hung, Han, Chen, Lee, Sun, and Chen (2018) point out, “acid or soreness sensation is a characteristic sensory phenotype of various acute and chronic pain syndromes” (p. 1). The question is whether they should be classified under nociception, or they should be singled out as a distinct sense. What is sngception exactly? In a certain variant of Chinese, acid pain is called “sng” (「痠」), “meaning a combination of soreness and pain, and is much more commonly reported than ‘pain’ among patients with chronic pain, especially for those with musculoskeletal pain” (ibid., 2018, p. 5). The authors introduced this term “specifically to describe the response of the somatosensory nervous system to sense tissue acidosis or the activation of acid-sensitive afferent neurons” (ibid., p. 6). The authors’ reason for distinguishing it from other elements of bodily awareness is primarily physiological, and as indicated above we will not go into those biological details. As far as individuating the senses is concerned, physiology is an important consideration, but it is far from decisive (Macpherson, 2011). Whether sng-ception should really be distinguished from pain and nociception is an open empirical question.
Interoception is to be contrasted with exteroception: whether the senses in question are directed toward the outside or inside, to put it crudely. One major difficulty is how to draw the inner/outer boundary, since not every part of our body is covered by skin, but there seems to be an intuitive sense in which we want to classify specific senses as exteroceptive or interoceptive. For example, the classical five senses – vision, audition, olfaction, gustation, and touch – are exteroceptive, while proprioception, kinaesthesis, feelings of heart beats and gut, and so forth, are interoceptive. A more technical definition is this: “Interoception is the body-to-brain axis of signals originating from the internal body and visceral organs (such as gastrointestinal, respiratory, hormonal, and circulatory systems)” (Tsakiris, and de Preester, 2019, p. v; some use “visceroception” to refer to the sensings of visceral organs). But in the very same piece, actually the next two sentences, the authors say that it “refers to the sensing of the state of the inner body and its homeostatic needs, to the ever-fluctuating state of the body beneath its sensory (exteroceptive) and musculoskeletal sheath” (ibid., p. v). These two definitions or characterisations are already not identical, and this shows that interoception is a rich territory that covers lots of grounds. More classically, and also from Sherrington (1906), interoception “is based on cardiovascular, respiratory, gastrointestinal, and urogenital systems, [which] provides information about the physiological condition of the body in order to maintain optimal homeostasis” (Vignemont, 2020, p. 83). Defining interoception has proven to be extremely difficult: in the literature, there have been the sole-object definition (“interoception consists of information that is exclusively about one’s body”), the insider definition (“interoception consists of information about what is internal to the body and not about what is at its surface”), and the regulator definition (“interoception consists of information that plays a role in internal regulation and monitoring”). Each of them exists due to certain initial plausibility, but they all face some difficult challenges and potential counterexamples (Vignemont, 2018a).
Interoception provides many good samples of philosophical relevance of bodily awareness: can interoception provide priors for the Bayesian predictive model? How does interoception shape the perception of time? In what way and to what extent is the brain-gut axis mental? What is the relation between interoception and emotion? And there are many more, especially if we consider how interoception interacts with other elements of bodily awareness, and with exteroceptions such as vision, audition, and olfaction (Tsakiris, and de Preester, 2019). In the past two decades, interoception has been thought to be connected with (bodily or otherwise) self-awareness, as in the proto-self (Damasio, 1999), the sentient self (Craig, 2003), the embodied self (Seth, 2013), and the material me (Tsakiris, 2017). However, Vignemont (2018a) argues that interoceptive feelings by itself cannot distinguish self and non-self, but it provides an affective background for bodily sensations (more on “feelings” in the next subsection).
d. Bodily Feelings
It is quite important to note that there is a group of bodily experiences that is recognisably different from all of the above. According to Vignemont (2020), they are different specifically in that these feelings are relatively permanent features of bodily awareness. In the literature, the following three are the most prominent:
The feeling of bodily presence: The body in the world.
The feeling of bodily capacities: The body in action.
The feeling of bodily ownership: The body and the self.
The notion of “presence” here is derived from the sensorimotor approach, and primarily in the case of vision (for example, Noë, 2004): when one sees a tree in front of her, for example, her sensorimotor skills or knowledge enable her to have a sense of the visual presence of the sides and the back of the tree. Quite independent of the plausibility of the sensorimotor approach itself, that understanding of presence can be appropriated to characterise bodily experiences. For example, when one feels a tickle in her left wrist, she feels not only that specific spot, but also the nearby areas of skin, muscles, and joints. There is a sense in which the body is there (presence, rather than absence), though not all parts of them are in the foreground of our awareness. This feeling of presence can sometimes be replaced by the feeling of absence, for example, in the case of depersonalisation (more on this in 3.d) and is sometimes classified as a sensory problem.
Bodily capacities include feelings of being able and unable to do with one’s own body. In the literature sometimes it is called the “sense of agency,” but that normally refers to “the awareness of oneself as the cause of a particular action” (Vignemont, 2020, p. 85; emphasis added). By “bodily capacities,” here we mean something more permanent, that is, long-term capacities to do various things with one’s body. Where do these capacities come from? They might be from monitoring our past capacities of doing stuff, and hence involve certain metacognitive abilities, which need to be studied themselves. This sense of bodily capacities can sometimes be replaced by the feeling of bodily incapacities, for example, in the case of hysterical conversion (roughly: wrongly assume that parts of one’s body is paralysed).
Bodily or body ownership is probably the most discussed phenomenon in this area, so will be also covered in 2.b and 2.c below. In most cases, “one does not normally experience a body that immediately responds to one’s intentions; one normally experiences one’s own body” (Vignemont, 2020, p. 86). Bermúdez (2011/2018) argues that this kind of body ownership involves only judgments, not feelings, but this remains to be controversial. This sense of ownership can sometimes be replaced by the feeling of bodily disownership, for example, in the case of somatoparaphrenia (more on this in 3.b). It has been argued that bodily ownership crucially involves affective consciousness (Vignemont, 2018b).
In a slightly different context, Matthew Ratcliffe (2005, 2008, 2016) has developed a sophisticated theory of existential feelings, which is both bodily and affective. This kind of feelings shapes human’s space of possible actions. They are pre-structuring backgrounds of all human experiences, and they are themselves parts of experiences as well. Ratcliffe argues that these kinds of bodily existential feelings are different from emotions and moods; they are sui generis. How this kind of feeling relates to other mental phenomena, such as thoughts and self-consciousness, remains to be seen (Kreuch, 2019). For our purposes, the most relevant question might be: in what way and to what extent do these existential feelings overlap with the three kinds of bodily feelings Vignemont identifies?
e. Bodily Representations: Body Image, Body Schema, and Peripersonal Space
Bodily awareness is closely related to bodily representations, just as in general awareness or consciousness is closely related to representations. The three notions introduced in this subsection are often understood in terms of mental representations, though they do not have to be (for anti-representational alternatives specific to some of these notions, see for example Gallagher, 2008). No matter how they are understood, it is a consensus that they play some significant roles in understanding bodily awareness. Let’s begin with body image, which refers to the subject’s mental representation of one’s own body configurations, very generally speaking. In philosophy, Brian O’Shaughnessy’s works (1980, 1995) have brought it into focus. He posits a long-term body image that sustains the spatial structure of our bodily awareness. This is a rather static notion, as the spatial structure can be quite relevant to possible actions, but it does not mention actions explicitly. Body schema, by contrast, is defined as consisting in sensory-motor capacities and actions. It is worth noting that the discussions we are familiar with today are already quite different from the original discussions in the early 20th century, notably from Head and Holmes (1911). For example, they did not mention action at all, and they distinguished two types of body schema, one that keeps track of postural changes and the other that represents the surface of the body. Also note that in other disciplines sometimes a broader notion of body image is invoked to refer to one’s thoughts and feelings about the attractiveness of one’s own body, but in philosophy we tend to stick to its narrower meanings. Note also that there is a group of questions concerning whether bodily awareness requires action (Briscoe, 2014; see also 3.b) and whether action requires bodily awareness (O’Shaughnessy, 2000; Wong, 2015), which we do not review here.
This pair of notions can seem to be intuitively clear, but when researchers make claims about them, things can get complicated and controversial. For example, O’Shaughnessy (1989) holds that our body image consists in a collection of information from our bodily senses, such as proprioception, but this seems to miss the important fact that blind subjects tend to have less accurate representations of the sizes of their own bodies (Kinsbourne and Lempert, 1980), which shows that sight also plays a crucial role in our body image. Gallagher (1986) once states that “[t]he body image is a conscious image or representation, owned, but abstract and disintegrated, and appears to be something in-itself, differentiated from its environment” (p. 541). This obviously goes beyond what many would want to mean by “body image.” The same goes for body schema. For example, Gallagher (2008) holds that body schema is in effect a sensorimotor function, which is not itself a mental representation. Moreover, both Head and Holmes (1911) and Gallagher (1986) regard body schema as unconscious, but it can be argued that under certain circumstances it can be brought into consciousness, at least in principle. To trace the history of how these terms have been used in the past century is itself an interesting and useful project (Ataria, Tanaka, and Gallagher, 2021), but since this article is not primarily a historical one, we will stick to the key idea that while body image is one’s own mental representation about the spatial structure of one’s own body, body schema is a corresponding representation that explicitly incorporate elements in relations to the possibility of actions. For potential double dissociations, see Paillard (1999). There is a long history of using the two terms interchangeably, but nowadays it is advised not to do so. Vignemont (2011/2020) offers a very useful list of potential differences that researchers have invoked to distinguish between body schema and body image, and she also points out that different taxonomies even “sometimes lead to opposite interpretations of the very same bodily disorders” (section 3.2). The situation is thorny and disappointing, and there seems to be no easy way out. To give one example, Bermúdez (1995) critically evaluates O’Shaughnessy’s views and arguments (1980, 1989, 1995) for the view that “it is a necessary condition of being capable of intentional action that one should have an immediate sensation-based awareness of one’s body” (Bermúdez, 1995, p. 382). Here he follows O’Shaughnessy’s conception of body image, but since it is about intentional action, considerations about (some notions of) body schema might be relevant; exactly how the discussion would go remains unclear. A related distinction between A-location and B-location is proposed by Bermúdez (2011/2018): while “[t]he A-location of a bodily event is fixed relative to an abstract map of the body,” “the B-location of a bodily event does take into account how the body is disposed” (p. 177-178). In introducing this pair of distinctions, the author does not mention body image or body schema.
What about peripersonal space (PPS)? This notion was invented only in the early 1980s (Rizzolatti, Scandolara, Matelli, and Gentilucci, 1981). It has also gone through many conceptual refinements and empirical investigations. A recent definition goes like this: it is “the space surrounding the body where we can reach or be reached by external entities, including objects or other individuals” (Rabellino, Frewen, McKinnon, and Lanius, 2020). Note that this kind of definition would not be accepted by those who clearly differentiate peripersonal space from reaching space; for example, “Human-environment interactions normally occur in the physical milieu and thus by medium of the body and within the space immediately adjacent to and surrounding the body, the peripersonal space (PPS)” (Serino, et al., 2018). Peripersonal space has been regarded as an index of multisensory body-environment interactions in real, virtual, and mixed realities. Some recent studies have supported the idea that PPS should be understood as a set of different graded fields that are affected by many factors other than stimulus proximity (Bufacchi and Iannetti, 2018). A basic distinction between appetitive and defensive PPS has been made (Vignemont and Iannetti, 2015), but further experimental and conceptual works are called for to substantiate this and other potential distinctions. A further question is in what ways body image, body schema, and peripersonal space relate to one another (for example, Merleau-Ponty on projection and intentional arc, 1945/2013).
It has been argued that awareness of peripersonal space facilitates a sense of being here (Vignemont, 2021). This is different from bodily presence discussed in 2.d, as the presence in question now is hereness, that is, self-location, which is different from bodily location (1.b). One implication of this view is that “depersonalized patients fail to process their environment as being peripersonal” (ibid., p. 192). Peripersonal awareness gives a specific sense of presence, which is not given by other awareness such as interoception and proprioception. This also relates bodily awareness to traditional philosophical discussions of indexicals (Perry, 1990, 2001).
Similar complications concerning representation can be found in this area too. For example, in their introductory piece, Vignemont, Serino, Wong, and Farnè have “a special way of representing space” as their subtitle, but in what sense and whether PPS is indeed representational can be debatable. Another critical point concerns in what way and to what extent issues surrounding PPS are philosophically significant, given that so many works in this area are empirical or experimental. This is indeed a difficult question, and similar worries can be raised for other interdisciplinary discussions in philosophy and cognitive sciences. Without going into the theoretical disagreements concerning a priori/armchair/a posteriori, here is a selective list of the relevant issues: What are the relations between egocentric space, allocentric space, and peripersonal space? How does it help us understand self-location, body ownership, and bodily self-awareness? How does attention affect our experiences of peripersonal space? Is peripersonal space a set of contact-related action fields? How does peripersonal space contribute to our sense of bodily presence (see various chapters in Vignemont, Serino, Wong, and Farnè, 2021)? No matter what the verdict is, it is hard to deny the relevance of peripersonal space for philosophical issues concerning bodily awareness in general, which will hopefully be clearer in the following sections.
Now, is bodily awareness a unified sense modality? Given how diverse its elements are, the answer is probably going to be negative; though as Vignemont (2018) points out, what these diverse elements “have in common is that they seem to all guarantee that bodily judgments are immune to error through misidentification relative to the first-person” (see 2.b). She then goes on to elaborate on several puzzles about body ownership, exploring varieties of bodily experiences and body representations and proposing a positive solution to those puzzles: the “bodyguard hypothesis,” which has it that “only the protective body map can ground the sense of bodily ownership” (Vignemont, 2018b, p. 167). However, “bodily awareness” can also be construed narrowly: for example, when Martin (1992) and others argue that spatial touch depends on bodily awareness (see 2.a below), they intend a narrower meaning of the term, including proprioception and kinaesthesis only. So, one can still sensibly ask: is proprioception a sense modality on its own? Is the vestibular sense a sense modality on its own? These are all open questions for future research. The next section is about some contemporary issues concerning aspects of bodily awareness. Some might hold that before asking whether bodily awareness is a unified sense modality, we should decide first whether these various experiences described above are perceptual or not. Others might hold that this is not the case, as the senses do not have to be exteroceptive, and therefore perceptual. More positively, one can ask whether proprioception itself is a natural kind, without committing that it is perceptual.
2. Contemporary Issues
In section 1, it was shown that bodily awareness has many varieties. In considering them, one has also seen that many questions arise along the way, for example, how to individuate the senses within bodily awareness, how to draw the distinction between interoception and exteroception, and so forth. However, many philosophical questions deserve further consideration given the complexities involved; in this section is a discussion of some of these questions.
a. Is There a Tactile Field?
This question would not make sense unless it is situated within a wider context. Consider visual field: in daily life, we know that when we close one eye, our visual fields are roughly cut half. In clinical contexts, we are sometimes told that due to strokes or other conditions, our visual fields shrink and as a result we bump into things more often and will need to readjust. When we say blindsight patients have a “blind field,” we are already presupposing the existence of visual fields. In psychology, we can measure the boundaries of our visual fields, and there are of course individual differences. Different philosophical theories of perception might attach different metaphysical natures of visual fields. For example, an often-quoted passage states that a visual field is the “spatial array of visual sensations available to observation in introspectionist psychological experiments” (Smythies, 1996, p. 369). This obviously commits to something – visual sensations – that are not acknowledged by many researchers in this area, though it can be regarded as the standard understanding of the sensationalist tradition (for example, Peacocke, 1983). A naïve realist might prefer characterising visual fields as constituted by external objects and phenomena themselves (Martin, 1992). A representationalist would presumably invoke mental representations to characterise visual fields. On this occasion we do not need to deal with the metaphysics of visual fields; suffice to say that visual fields seem to be indispensable, or at least quite important, for spatial vision. So, our question is: what about other spatial senses? Do they also rely on the relevant sensory fields? Specifically, for spatial touch, do they rely on a tactile field or tactile fields?
Questions concerning tactile fields arise explicitly in the context of P. F. Strawson’s essay on descriptive metaphysics:
Evidently the visual field is necessarily extended at any moment… The case of touch is less obvious: it is not, for example, clear what one would mean by a “tactual field” (Strawson, 1959, p. 65, emphasis added)
Strawson’s challenge here is moderate in the sense that he only invites those who believe in tactile fields to say more about what they mean by it. More challenging moves can be found in Brian O’Shaughnessy, M. G. F. Martin, and Matthew Soteriou. O’Shaughnessy writes, “There is in touch no analogue of the visual field of visual sensations” (1989 p. 38, emphasis added). This is more challenging because, unlike Strawson, O’Shaughnessy here asserts that there is no analogue. Notice that when he writes this, he has a rather specific view on vision, which involves visual sensations or visual sense-data. Soteriou makes a more specific claim that “The structural feature of normal visual experience that accounts for the existence of its spatial sensory field is lacking in the form of bodily awareness involved when one feels a located bodily sensation” (2013, p. 120, emphasis added).
Countering the above line of thought, Patrick Haggard and colleagues (2008, 2011) have attempted to empirically test the hypothesis that tactile fields exist, and they sustain tactile pattern perceptions. Following earlier works, Fardo, Beck, Cheng, and Haggard (2018) argue that “integration of continuous sensory inputs across several tactile RFs [receptive fields] provides an intrinsic mechanism for spatial perception” (p. 236). For a more detailed summary of this series of works, see Cheng (2019), where it is also noted that in the case of thermal perception and nociception, there seems to be no such field (Mancini, Stainitz, Steckelmacher, Iannetti, and Haggard, 2015). Further characteristics of tactile fields include, for example, we can perceive space between multiple stimuli (Mac Cumhaill 2017; also compare Evans 1980 on the simultaneous spatial concept). For touch, the sensory array has a distinctive spatial organisation due to the arrangement of receptive fields on the receptor surface on the skin.
Recently, discussions on tactile fields have gone beyond the above contexts. For example, in comparing shape representations in sight and touch, E. J. Green (2020) discusses various responses to Molyneux’s question and classifies (and argues against) the tactile field proposal into what he calls the “structural correspondence view” (also see Cheng, 2020). In investigating the spatial content of painful sensations, Błażej Skrzypulec (2021) argues that cutaneous pains “do not have field-like content, as they do not present distance relations between painful sensations” (p. 1). In what sense there are tactile fields seems to be a theoretically fruitful question, and further studies need to be done to explore ramifications in this area. Similar works have been done for other sensory modalities, such as olfaction (Aasen, 2019) and audition.
b. Does Bodily Immunity to Error Through Misidentification Hold?
“Immunity to error through misidentification relative to the first-person” (IEM) is a putative phenomenon identified by Sydney Shoemaker (1968), who also attributes it to Wittgenstein (1958) (Also see Salje, 2017). “Error through misidentification” is a specific kind of error; let’s illustrate IEM via an example. When I say “I see a canary,” if I am sincere, I can still be wrong about what I see, or even about whether I really have visual experiences at that time. But it seems that I cannot be wrong about the first-person: it is me who thinks and judges I see a canary, and there is no doubt about it (beyond reasonable doubt). Shoemaker regards this as a logical truth, though a further complication here is that Shoemaker himself draws a distinction between de facto IEM and logical IEM, which is about the scope of the IEM claim. If we regard IEM as a logical thesis, then we are after the broader, logical thesis.
Now, setting aside whether in general IEM is true, it is about self-ascription of mental states. Independently, one might reasonably wonder whether IEM is applicable to the self-ascription of bodily states (that is, physical bodily properties, including body size, weight, and posture, and so forth). Again, let’s illustrate this with an example. Suppose I come up with the judgement that I am doing a power pose. If I formed this judgement via my vision, it is possible (though unlikely) for me to get it wrong who is doing this pose, as I might confuse someone else’s arms with my own. By contrast, if I form this judgement by proprioception, I might be wrong about the pose itself, but I cannot be wrong about who is doing the power pose, or so it is sometimes argued (Evans, 1982). But things are not so simple; Vignemont (2018) usefully distinguishes between bodily immunity from the inside and from the outside. In what follows we briefly discuss their contents and potential problems respectively.
Bodily immunity from the inside is in a way more standard: bodily senses seem to guarantee IEM in this sense because they provide privileged informational access to one’s own body. This is not to say that bodily senses do not provide information about other things – touch of course brings in information about other objects – but in retrieving information about those other things, the privileged bodily information is always implicated. As Vignemont states, “Proprioceptive experiences suffice to justify bodily self-ascriptions such that no intermediary process of self-identification is required” (2018, p. 51). Details aside, this thesis faces at least two kinds of putative counterexamples: in false negative errors, “one does not self-ascribe properties that are instantiated by one’s own body” (ibid., p. 51, emphasis added), while in false positive errors, “one self-ascribes properties that are instantiated by another’s body” (ibid., p. 51, emphasis added).
For false negative errors, the clinical case somatoparaphrenia is a salient example (Bottini, Bisiach, Sterzi, and Vallar, 2002). A famous case patient FB can feel tactile experiences when her hand is touched, but she would judge that it is her niece’s hand that is touched. That is to say, she has troubles with body ownership with respect to her left hand. She does not self-ascribe properties, in this case being touched, that are instantiated by her own left hand. Whether this kind of case really constitutes counterexamples of bodily IEM is a matter of dispute. For example, Vignemont (2018) has argued that somatoparaphrenia is actually irrelevant to bodily IEM, because “The bodily IEM thesis claims that if the judgement derives from the right ground, then it is immune to error” (p. 52-3, emphasis added). However, one might worry that this move makes bodily IEM too weak. After all, philosophical theses like this tend to lose their significance when they are not universal claims. To this Vignemont might reply that “immunity to error” is a quite strong claim, so even if it needs to be qualified like above, it is still a significant thesis. For comparison, consider this parallel claim that if the perception derives from the right ground, then it is immune to error. This seems to be false because even when perceptions have right or good grounds, they can still be subject to errors.
For false positive errors, an obvious candidate is rubber hand illusion. In such a case, participants (to some extent) identify rubber hands as their hands. That is to say, they self-ascribe properties, in this case being their hands, that are not instantiated by their bodies. There are, to be sure, lots of controversies concerning the interpretation of this illusion, and whether it really constitutes a counterexample here. As Vignemont points out, “it is questionable whether participants actually self-attribute the rubber hand… they feel as if the rubber hand were part of their own body, but they do not believe it” (2018, p. 53, emphasis added). Arguably, those subjects do not make mistakes here; they rightly believe that those rubber hands are not their own hands. Another potential false positive case is embodied hand illusion, which is sometimes also derived from somatoparaphrenia. Some though not all somatoparaphrenia patients would also self-attribute another person’s hand, either spontaneously or induced via the RHI paradigm (Bolognini, Ronchi, Casati, Fortis, and Vallar, 2014; note that a similar condition can be found in those who do not have somatoparaphrenia). Basically, when the embodied hand moves, if the subjects see it, they might report feeling their hands moving. These are all tricky examples, and many individual differences are involved. What is crucial, methodologically, is to recognise that these are actual world clinical or experimental examples, rather than thought experiments. With these actual examples, we need to look into details in different cases, and be really careful in making sweeping claims about them.
What about bodily immunity from the outside? This putative phenomenon is less well known, but the cases for them might be familiar. It is less well known because we tend to think that information from outside (of the body) is fallible so cannot be immune to error. But consider this passage from J. J. Gibson:
[A]ll the perceptual systems are propriosensitive as well as exterosensitive, for they all provide information in their various ways about the observer’s activities… Information that is specific to the self is picked up as such, no matter what sensory nerve is delivering impulses to the brain. (1979, p. 115, emphasis added)
By “propriosensitive” Gibson means “information about one’s body.” This part of Gibson’s idea – self-specifying information – is less known than affordance, but is actually integral to his view, under the label of “visual kinesthesis”: due “to self-specific invariants in the optic flow of visual information (for example, rapid expansion of the entire optic array), we can see whether we are moving, even though we do not directly see our body moving” (Vignemont, 2018, p. 58). Relatedly, Evans (1982) and Cassam (1995) have argued that self-locating judgements enjoy the same status if they represent the immediate environment within an egocentric frame of reference, because this frame carries self-specifying information concerning the location of the perceiver. As Evans puts it, when I am standing in front of a tree, I cannot sincerely entertain this doubt: “someone is standing in front of a tree, but is it I?” (1982, p. 222). Again, these ideas have clear route from Wittgenstein. What is introduced above is visual experiences of the environment grounding bodily IEM; Vignemont (2018) also discusses the possibility that visual experiences of the body grounding bodily IEM (p. 58-61). Note that self-specificity is weaker than self-reference, as the former does not imply that awareness of one’s body as one’s own (Vignemont, 2018a).
Relatively independent of IEM, philosophers also disagree about how to model body ownership. The questions include: it seems to make an experiential difference whether one is aware of one’s body as one’s own or not, but how to account for this difference in consciousness or phenomenology? What are the grounds of the sense of body ownership? Is there a distinct feeling of myness (Bermúdez, 2011/2018; Alsmith, 2015; Guillot, 2017; Chadha, 2018)? Different answers have been proposed, including the deflationary account, the cognitive account, the agentive account, and the affective account. The deflationary account has it that the sense of body ownership can be reduced to the spatiality of bodily sensations and judgements of ownership about one’s own body (Martin, 1992, 1995; Bermúdez, 2011). One potential problem is that one seems to be able to become aware of the boundaries of own’s own body without being aware of the boundaries of one’s own body qua one’s own (Dokic, 2003; Serrahima, forthcoming). Another potential problem is that bodily sensations might be able to be dissociated from the sense of body ownership: patients with disownership syndromes remain to be able to experience at least some bodily experiences; whether this decisively refutes the deflationary account remains to be determined (Moro, Massimiliano, and Salvatore, 2004; Bradley, 2021). The cognitive account has it that “one experiences something as one’s own only if one thinks of something as one’s own” (Alsmith, 2015, p. 881). Whether this account is successful depends on how we account for the apparent cognitive impenetrability of the sense of body ownership: if there are cases of body ownership or disownership that cannot be altered by thinking or other propositional attitudes, it will be difficult for this account to explain what is really going on. The agentive account has it that body ownership has certain constitutive connection between body schema (Vignemont, 2007), agentive feelings (Baier and Karnath, 2008), or agentive abilities (Peacocke, 2017). One major potential problem with this is that, for example, participants with the rubber hand illusion might feel that the rubber hand is her or his own, without feeling that they can act with that very rubber hand. Finally, the affective account has it that there is a specific affective phenomenological quality that is over and above sensory phenomenological qualities of bodily awareness (Vignemont, 2018b). As we mentioned in discussing affective touch, this kind of quality is valenced or valued, and in this specific case the quality signifies the unique value of the body for the self. This kind of affective quality is key to survival. One concern is that it might be unclear whether it is affective phenomenology that explains body ownership, or the other way around. Another concern is that evolutionary explanations always risk being just-so stories. These are all very substantive issues that we do not go into, but the general shape of this rich terrain should be clear enough.
c. How Do Body Ownership and Mental Ownership Relate?
Above we have seen that somatoparaphrenia and other conditions have been regarded as test cases for body ownership. Relatedly, they might cause a parallel problem for mental or experiential ownership (Lane, 2012). Let’s recall the patient FB case: when she judges that her left hand belongs to her niece, she was confused about body ownership, as left hand is a body part. By contrast, when she judges that the relevant tactile sensations belong to her niece as well, she was confused about mental ownership, as tactile sensation is a mental state or episode. This corresponds to Evans’ distinction between mental self-ascription and bodily self-ascription (1982, p. 220-235), which also brings us back to the original formulation of IEM in Shoemaker.
How does somatoparaphrenia, cases like patient FB, threaten IEM with regard to mental ownership? Since FB gets the who wrong in mental self-ascription, it does look like a counterexample of IEM. Consider some original formulations:
(1) To ask “are you sure it’s you who have pains?” would be nonsensical. (Wittgenstein, 1958, p. 67)
(2) [T]here is no room for the thought “Someone is hungry all right, but is it me?” (Shoemaker, 1996, p. 211)
“Nonsensical” in (1) and “no room” in (2) both refer to the “immunity” part of IEM. “Are you sure it’s you who have pains?” in (1) and “Someone is hungry all right, but is it me?” in (2) refer to the “error through misidentification” part. For Wittgenstein, the question in (1) looks like a query in response to the subject’s spontaneous report of his sensational state, saying, “it is me who is in pain.” Here Wittgenstein argues that when a subject sincerely reports that she is in pain, it is nonsensical to question whether the subject is wrong about who is the subject. In the case of FB, she did not spontaneously report that she was experiencing a certain sensation; moreover, she reported that the sensation belongs to someone else. This makes no contact with what Wittgenstein has in mind. However, this is not true in Shoemaker’s case. The question “Someone is hungry all right, but is it me?” allows two kinds of cases. First, the subject is not hungry, but she suspects she is the subject of that experience. Second, the subject is truly hungry, but she suspects she is not the subject of that experience. FB fits the second case, so proponents of IEM will have a hard time reconciling this second case with the case of FB. How about the first case? Since by hypothesis the subject is not hungry in the first place, FB’s case would be irrelevant. So, if we read Shoemaker’s question in the first sense, it would be easier for proponents of IEM to face empirical cases like FB.
How, then, do body ownership and mental ownership relate? There seems to be no straightforward answer. Consider bodily IEM and the original IEM: as discussed above, Vignemont argues that the bodily IEM thesis claims that if the judgement derives from the right ground, then it is immune to error; presumably this strategy, if acceptable, can apply in the original IEM. Indeed, Shoemaker once states that “if I have my usual access to my hunger, there is no room for the thought ‘Someone is hungry alright, but is it me?’” (Shoemaker, 1996, p. 210, emphasis added). So, in this sense, Bodily IEM and the original IEM can be coped with in the same way. This does not show, to be sure, there are no crucial differences between them. What about mental ownership and body ownership in general, independent of IEM, bodily or not? They seem to go together very often: on the one hand, in normal cases one would correctly recognise one’s own limbs as one’s own, and would correctly recognise one’s own sensations as one’s own; on the other hand, in the case of FB and some other somatoparaphrenia patients, they wrongly recognise one’s own limbs as others’, and would also wrongly recognise one’s own sensations as others’ (this is debatable, to be sure). Is it possible to double dissociate them? For correct body ownership and wrong mental ownership, the claim “I feel your pain” might be a possible case, since in this case one gets the body right but the sensation wrong when it comes to the who question: when you sympathise with someone’s else’s pain so that you feel pain too, it is your pain then. What about wrong body ownership and correct mental ownership? These are all open empirical questions that need to be further explored.
d. Must Bodily Awareness Be Bodily Self-Awareness?
On the face of it, this question might make no good sense: “of course it must; bodily awareness is through proprioception, kinaesthesis, and pain and so forth, to become aware of one’s own body; one is aware of one’s own body from the inside, as it were” (see O’Shaughnessy, 1980; “highly unusual relation”). How can it fail to be bodily self-awareness?” Indeed, in the empirical literature, researchers do not normally distinguish between them (for example, Blanke, 2012). In philosophy, sometimes “bodily self-awareness” refers to something more specific, for example, aware of this body as mine, aware of this bodily self qua subject (Cassam, 1997; also see Salje, 2019; Longuenesse, 2006, 2021), or perhaps aware of oneself as a bodily presence in the world (McDowell, 1996; or “existential feelings,” various writings by Ratcliffe, and Vignemont, 2020, p. 83, as discussed in 1.d). This is not to accuse scientists of committing a conceptual confusion; it is just that philosophers are sometimes concerned with questions that have no clear empirical bearing, at least for the time being. Below we briefly review this stricter usage of “bodily self-awareness,” and philosophical implications around this corner.
In Self and World (1997), Cassam seeks to identify necessary conditions for self-consciousness. One line he takes is called the “objectivity argument,” which has it that objective experience requires “awareness of oneself, qua subject of experience, as a physical object” (p. 28; “the materialist conception”; also see his 2019). For our current purpose, that is, distinguishing bodily awareness and bodily self-awareness, we only need to get clear about what “qua subject” means. One can be aware of oneself, or one’s own body, not qua subject, but just qua (say) an animal, or even a thing. To illustrate this, consider the case in which you see yourself in a mirror from a rather strange angle (“from the outside”), and without realising that it is you. In that case, there is no self-awareness under this stricter meaning. To apply this to the body case, proprioception might automatically tell the subject the locations of the limbs, but without a proper sense of mineness, to put it vaguely, it does not automatically follow that those bodily awarenesses are also cases of bodily self-awareness. Note that Cassam sometimes defends different though related theses on different occasions; for example, he also defends the “bodily awareness thesis” that “awareness of one’s own body is a necessary condition for the acquisition and possession of concepts of primary qualities such as force and shape” (2002, p. 315).
This point can be further illustrated by the “Missing Self” problem, explained below. Here is how Joel Smith formulates the target:
[I]n bodily awareness, one is not simply aware of one’s body as one’s body, but one is aware of one’s body as oneself. That is, when I attend to the object of bodily awareness I am presented not just with my body, but with my “bodily self.” [the bodily-self thesis] (2006, p. 49)
Smith’s argument against this view is based on two claims about imagination, which he defends in turn. To retain our focus, here we will assume that those two claims are cogent. They are as follows:
(1) “[T]o imagine sensorily a ψ is to imagine experiencing a ψ” (Martin, 2002, p. 404; the “dependency thesis”).
(2) “When we engage in imagining being someone else, we do not imagine anything about ourselves” (Smith, 2006, p. 56).
With these two claims about imagination, Smith launches his argument as follows:
The argument…begins with the observation that I can imagine being Napoleon feeling a bodily sensation such as a pain in the left foot. According to , when I imagine a pain I imagine experiencing a pain. It follows from this that the content of perceptual awareness will be “mirrored” by the content of sensory imagination…Now, [given 2], then imagining being Napoleon having a pain in the left foot will not contain me as an object. The only person in the content of this imagining is Napoleon…Thus, when I simply imagine a pain, but without specifying whose pain, the imagined experience is not first personal. (2006, p. 57, emphasis added)
What should we say about this argument? For Smith, the bodily-self thesis requires getting the who right. Therefore, imagining being other people is relevant. But it is unclear whether getting the who right is crucial for Cassam (1997), for example. Suppose that I am engaging the kind of imagination Smith has in mind. In that scenario, according to his view, I am not part of the imagination. Napoleon is. Smith believes that this is sufficient for rejecting the bodily-self thesis, but this hardly places any pressure on Cassam’s view. All we need here is that in having a certain kind of bodily awareness, this awareness is not only about the body, but also about the mind that is associated with that body. Whether the mind is Tony or Napoleon is out of the question here. Perhaps I get the subject wrong. Perhaps, as Smith has it, in the imagination the subject is Napoleon, not Tony. Still, all we need is that bodily awareness is not only about the body, but the minded body. If so, even if Smith’s argument is sound, the Cassam picture is not one of his targets, since for him it is not needed to get it right about who the subject is.
Another way to see the current point is to consider an analogous point concerning the first-person pronoun: the reference of “I” is token reflexive in Reichenbach’s sense (1947): any token of “I” refers to whoever produces that expression. When I produce a sentence containing “I”, it refers to me. Whether I correctly identify myself as Tony Cheng or misidentify myself as Napoleon is irrelevant. Likewise, in the case of bodily awareness, the subject is aware of him- or herself as the person who is experiencing the bodily experience in question. Whether the subject can correctly identify who he or she is – Napoleon or not – is irrelevant. The reason might be that what is unique about the first person is the token reflexivity. The identity of the subject, though important, is always an additional question. It is interesting to compare Bernard Williams’ thought experiments concerning torturing and personal identity (1970; see also Williams 2006): when I am tortured and want to escape from the situation, what is crucial is that I am being tortured and I want to escape. Whether I am Tony Cheng or Napoleon is a further, and less important, question. One outcome of this view is that one then has no absolute authority about what one’s is imagining. This might not be a theoretical cost, as the general trend in contemporary epistemology has it that all sorts of first-person authority are less robust than philosophers have thought in the past.
The moral is that no matter who I am, who I will be, what I will remember, or what I can imagine, as long as what is going to be tortured is me, then I have every reason to fear. In his later writings, Smith is more sympathetic to the bodily-self thesis. For example, he writes: “if bodily sensations are given as located properties of one’s lived body and, further, bodily sensations are presented as properties of oneself, then bodily awareness is an awareness of one’s body as oneself” (Smith 2016, p. 157). So, must bodily awareness be bodily self-awareness? Philosophers seem to still disagree, and it is to date unclear how this can be resolved with the helps with empirical works directly.
e. What Does Body Blindness, Actual or Imagined, Show?
Partial body/proprio- blind cases have been found in the actual world, whereby the subject has no touch or proprioception below the neck but is still able to see the world roughly in the way we do, and can experience temperatures, pain, and muscle fatigue (Cole, 1991). For this kind of rare subjects, they need to make use of information from other modalities, mostly vision, to coordinate actions. What this shows is that proprioception and touch play extremely important roles in our daily lives. Although it is still possible to maintain minimal functions, it is extremely laborious to conduct bodily actions without appropriate bodily awareness.
What about the imagined case? Consider this thought experiment: “[E]ven someone who lacks the form of bodily awareness required for tactile perception can still see the surrounding world as a world of physical objects (Aquila 1979, p. 277). This is a suggestion of disembodiment: most people agree that having bodily awareness is very important for navigating the world, but in this imagined case, call it “total body blindness,” the subject seems to be able to have basic cognition without any bodily awareness. This seems to contradict Cassam’s claim that objective experiences require bodily self-awareness (1997). More specifically, Aquila argues that given that if I am body blind, “I experience no bodily sensations, or at least none which I am able to identify in connection with some particular body I perceive, and I perceive no body at all which I would identify as my own” (Aquila, 1979, p. 277). If this thought experiment is coherent, it suggests a limitation of the importance of bodily awareness: true, bodily awareness is so crucial for cognition and action, but it is not a necessary condition.
It is worth considering a real-life example that might pose a similar threat. Depersonalisation Disorder, or DPD, denotes a specific feeling of being unreal. In the newest edition of the DSM (Diagnostic and Statistical Manual of Mental Disorders, fifth edition), it has been renamed as Depersonalisation/Derealisation Disorder, or DDD. In what follows we use “depersonalisation” for this syndrome not only because it is handier, but also because depersonalisation and derealisation are closely connected but different phenomena: while depersonalisation is directed toward oneself or at least one’s own body, derealisation is directed toward the outside world. Here we will only discuss depersonalisation.
The first reported case of depersonalisation was presented by an otolaryngologist M. Krishaber under the label “cerebro-cardial neuropathy” in 1873. The term “depersonalisation” was coined later in 1880 by the Swiss researcher Henri Amiel in response to his own experiences. Like all the other mental disorders or illnesses, the evaluation and diagnosis of depersonalisation have a long and convoluted history, and the exact causes have not been entirely disentangled. What is crucial for our current purposes is the feeling involved in the phenomenon: patients with this disorder might feel themselves to be “a floating mind in space with blunted, blurry thoughts” (Bradshaw 2016). To be sure, there are individual differences amongst patients, just as there are individual differences amongst so-called “healthy subjects.” Still, this description seems to fit many such patients, and more importantly, even if it does not fit many, the very fact that some patients feel like this is sufficient to generate worries here. Here is why: presumably most, if not all, of these patients retain the capacity for object cognition and perception. They still (perceptually) understand that objects are solid, shaped, and sized, and that things can persist even when occluded, for example. But they seem to lack the kind of bodily awareness in question: the very description of a “floating mind in space” signifies this feeling of disembodiment. If this is right, these patients are real-life counterexamples to the Cassamian thesis: they have the capacity for basic perception/cognition, while lacking awareness of oneself as a physical object.
So, what does body blindness, actual or imagined, show? In the actual case, one sees in detail how a lack of robust bodily awareness can put daily life into troubles; in the imagined case, where the subject in question does not even have bodily awareness above the neck, the subject seems to be still able to have basic awareness of the world. There can be worries here, to be sure. For example, if someone has zero bodily awareness, she or he would have no muscle feedback around the eyes, which will impair the visual capacities to a substantive extent. Still, it would presumably not render the subject blind, so again, bodily awareness is so very important, but perhaps not strictly speaking necessary for basic cognition or objective experience. For more on embodiment, the self, and self-awareness, see Cassam (2011).
3. Phenomenological Insights: The Body as a Subjective Object and an Objective Subject
From the above discussions, we have seen that that the body seems to be both subjective and objective, in some sense. What should we make of this? Or more fundamentally, how is that even possible? Let’s consider the possibility that with bodily awareness one can be aware of one’s body as a subjective object and an objective subject: the bodily self can be aware of itself as an object, but it is not just another object in the world. It is a subjective object (Husserl, 1989), that is, the object that sustains one’s subjective states and episodes. It is also an objective subject, that is, the subject that is situated in an objective world. There seems to be no inherent incompatibility within this distinction between object and subject; they are not mutually exclusive. To channel Joel Smith, “in bodily awareness my body is given as lived – as embodied subjectivity – but it is also co-presented as a thing – as the one thing I constantly see” (2016, p. 159). By contrast, this line is at odds with Sartre’s idea that one’s body is either “a thing among other things, or it is that by which things are revealed to me. But it cannot be both at the same time” (1943/2003, p. 304).
a. Two Notions of the Body
If bodily self-awareness can be about subjective object and objective subject, this comes close to Merleau-Ponty’s notion of subject-object (Merleau-Ponty, 1945/2013). However, in both his and Husserl’s works, and in the phenomenological tradition more broadly, the general consensus is that we are never aware of ourselves as physical objects. In order to incorporate their insights without committing to this latter point, we need to look into some of the details of their views. For Husserl, the Body (Leib) is the “animated flesh of an animal or human being,” that is, a bodily self, while a mere body (Körper) is simply “inanimate physical matter” (1913/1998, p. xiv). The Body presents itself as “a bearer of sensations” (ibid., p. 168). A similar distinction emerges in Merleau-Ponty’s work between the phenomenal/lived body and the objective body that is made of muscles, bones, and nerves (1945/2013). There is a debate over whether the distinction should be interpreted as between different entities or different perspectives of the same entity (Baldwin, 1988). As in the case of Kant’s transcendental idealism, the two-world/entity view is in general more difficult to defend, so for our purposes we will assume the less contentious two-perspective view. The idea, then, is that the human body can be viewed in at least two ways: as phenomenal, and as objective. From the first-person point of view, the body presents to us only as phenomenal, not objective. For a detailed comparison of Husserl and Merleau-Ponty in this regard, see Carman (1999).
For Merleau-Ponty, “[t]he body is not one more among external objects” (1945/2013, p. 92). One can only be aware of oneself as the phenomenal self in one’s pre-reflective awareness. As Vignemont explains,
[T]he lived body is not an object that can be perceived from various perspectives, left aside or localized in objective space. More fundamentally, the lived body cannot be an object at all because it is what makes our awareness of objects possible…The objectified body could then no longer anchor the way we perceive the world…The lived body is understood in terms of its practical engagement with the world…[Merleau-Ponty] illustrates his view with a series of dissociations between the lived body and the objective body. For instance, the patient Schneider was unable to scratch his leg where he was stung. (2011/2020, pp. 17-18, emphasis added)
Another gloss is that the lived body is “the location of bodily sensation” (Smith 2016, p. 148, original emphasis; Merleau-Ponty, “sensible sentient,” 1968, p. 137). Compare Cassam’s characterisation of the physical or material body as the “bearer of primary qualities” (2002, p. 331). Now, for pathological cases like that of Schneider, who exemplified a “dissociation of the act of pointing from reactions of taking or grasping” (Merleau-Ponty, 1945/2013, p. 103-4), it shows only that the phenomenal/lived body is not the same as the objective body. It does not show that one cannot be aware of oneself as an objective body. For Merleau-Ponty, one’s body is “a being of two leaves, from one side a thing among things and otherwise what sees and touches them” (Merleau-Ponty, 1968, p. 137). The human body has a “double belongingness to the order of the ‘object’ and to the order of the ‘subject’” (ibid., p. 137). Our notion of the subjective object and objective subject, then, is intended to capture, or at least echo, Merleau-Ponty’s “Subject-Object,” and Husserl’s intriguing idea that the human body is “simultaneously a spatial externality and a subjective internality” (1913/1998).
This phenomenological approach has an analytic ally called “sensorimotor approach” (for example, see Noë, 2004; for details, see Vignemont, 2011/2020). Its major rival is the “representational approach,” which has it that “in order to account for bodily awareness one needs to appeal to mental representations of the body” (ibid., p. 12). To rehearse, reasons for postulating these representations include: 1) explaining the disturbances of bodily awareness such as phantom limbs; 2) accounting for the spatial organisation of bodily awareness (O’Shaughnessy 1980, 1995); and 3) understanding the ability to move one’s own body. Even if one agrees with the representational approach, it has proven to be extremely difficult to decide how many and what kinds of body representations we should postulate since the classic work by Head and Holmes (1911) (1.e). The reason for discussing the representational approach here is that while crucially different from the sensorimotor approach, the representational approach can raise a similar objection with its own terms: what one is aware of is one’s body schema or body image, but not one’s objective body. Under the phenomenological tradition, there is a branch called “neurophenomenology,” which “aimed at bridging the explanatory gap between first-person subjective experience and neurophysiological third-person data, through an embodied and enactive approach to the biology of consciousness” (Khachouf, Poletti, and Pagnoni, 2013). What these neurophenomenologists would say about the current case is not immediately clear.
This formulation of the problem might have some initial plausibility. Consider the case of phantom limb, in which the patient feels pain in a limb that has been amputated. The representational explanation says that the patient represents the pain in his body schema/image, which still retains the amputated limb. This shows, so the thought goes, that one is aware of only one’s own body schema/image. A similar line of thought can be found in Thomas Reid’s work, for instance when he argues that bodily awareness, such as sensations, is the result of purely subjective states or episodes (1863/1983, Ch. 5; see Martin, 1993 for discussion). If this is correct, then that kind of awareness can only be about something subjective, for example, the represented body, as opposed to the objective or physical body.
This inference might be too hasty. Assuming representationalism in this domain, it is sensible to hold the kind of explanation of phantom limb described above. However, the right thing to say might be that one is aware of one’s objective body through one’s body schema/image. They function as modes of presentation of the body. Why is this the right thing to say? One reason is that one can be aware of one’s own body objectively. If the representational approach needs to fit in, the only sensible place is in the modes of presentation.
In sum, the force behind the phenomenological or representational considerations should be fully acknowledged, but the right thing to say seems to be this: what one is aware of is the physical body, but one is not aware of it simply as a mere body or just yet another physical object. Rather, as explained above, one’s own body is aware of it as a subjective object, for example, the object that sustains one’s subjective states and episodes. The bodily self is aware of itself as a subjective object, and as an object in the weighty sense, that is, something can persist without being perceived (Strawson, 1959). Here we can echo Martin’s view of sensation: “Sensations are not… purely subjective events internal to the mind; they are experiences of one’s body, itself a part of the objective world” (1993, p. 209).
b. Non-Perceptual Bodily Awareness
These discussions from the phenomenological perspective also interact with the analytic tradition concerning the topic whether awareness of one’s own body is perceptual (Mandrigin and Thompson, 2015). According to Vignemont (2018b), “bodily presence” refers to the idea that “one’s body is perceived as being one object among others” (Vignemont, 2018b, p. 44). There is, to be sure, a matter of controversy given different criteria or conceptions of perception. McGinn (1996) holds that “bodily sensations do not have an intentional object in the way perceptual experiences do” (p. 8), and one potential reason can be found in the above Merleau-Ponty view, namely that “the body is not one more among external objects” (1945/2013, p. 92), and being an external object seems to be a necessary condition for perception. This seems also to echo Wittgenstein’s distinction between self as a subject and as an object, and the former cannot be an object of perception by oneself. However, this might not preclude the latter use of the self as an object, which can be an object of perception by oneself (Dokic, 2003). Another potential reason comes from the analytic tradition; Shoemaker (1996) has argued that one necessary condition of perception is that its way of gaining information needs to make room for identification and reidentification of the perceived objects, but bodily awareness seems to gain information from only one object, for example that is, one’s own body. Martin (1995) has argued that this sole-object view does not preclude bodily awareness being perceptual; Schwenkler (2013) instead argues that bodily awareness conveys information about multiple objects, since those pieces of information are about different parts of one’s own body.
This is a huge topic that deserve further investigations; as Vignemont (2011/2020) points out, the perceptual model of bodily awareness has faced challenges from many directions. In addition to the above considerations, some have argued that the distinctive spatiality of bodily awareness precludes it from being perceptual: its spatiality violates basic spatial rules in the so-called “external world” (for example, O’Shaughnessy, 1980); some go further to argue that bodily awareness itself is not intrinsically spatial (Noordhof, 2002). As the once famous local sign theory has it (Lotze, 1888), “each sensible nerve gives rise to its own characteristic sensation that is specific to the body part that is stimulated but spatial ascription does not derive from the spatial content of bodily sensations themselves” (Vignemont, 2011/2020). This goes against the tactile field view introduced in 2.a, as it argues that some intrinsic spatiality of touch is held by tactile fields as sustained by skin-space, that is, a flattened receptor surface or sheet (derma-topic, Cheng, 2019). Skin-space is to be contrasted with body-space, understood as torsos, limbs, joints, and their connections (somato-topic), and external-space, including peripersonal space, understood as coordinates in an egocentric representation that will update when the body parts move (spatio-topic). Relatedly, A. D. Smith (2002) has argued that bodily sensations are mere sensations and therefore non-perceptual, on the ground they do not meet his criteria of being objective. Other challenges toward the perceptual model of bodily awareness include the so-called “knowledge without observation” (Anscombe, 1962), the enactivists perspectives (Noë, 2004), and other action-based theories of perception (for example, Evans, 1982; Briscoe, 2014).
Now we are in a much better position to see why bodily awareness is philosophically important and intriguing: there can be many answers to this as we have seen throughout, but one major reason is that philosophy seeks to understand the convoluted relations between the subjective and the objective, and the body is one’s medium through which the objective can be reached by the subjective; this can be said to be a bodily quest for objectivity: the body as the seat of the subjective is also objective itself, and is one’s way towards the rest of the objective world; it is worth emphasising that the body is itself also part of the so-called “external world”; it is itself a denizen of the objective, that is, mind-independent. One might think that the body is external to the mind, though this spatial metaphor is not uncontroversial: others might think that the body is internal to the mind in the sense that the body is represented by the mind. Above we have touched on many aspects of the body and bodily awareness, and thereby seen how we can make progress in thinking about difficult philosophical issues in this area.
Bodily awareness is an extremely rich area of research that defies comprehensive introductions. Even if we double the word count here, there will still be territories that are not covered. Above we have surveyed varieties of bodily awareness, including touch, proprioception, kinaesthesis, the vestibular sense, thermal sensation, pain, interoception, a relatively new category called “sngception,” and bodily feelings. We have also discussed some contemporary issues that involve tactile fields, bodily IEM and IEM in general, mental ownership, bodily self-awareness, and body blindness. Finally, going beyond the Anglo-Saxon tradition, we have also selectively discussed insights from the phenomenological tradition, notably on the possibility of being aware of one’s bodily self as a subjective object and an objective subject, and whether bodily awareness is perceptual. Together they cover a huge ground under the general heading of “bodily awareness.” It would be an exaggeration to say that bodily awareness has become a heated area in the early twenty-first century, but it should be safe and accurate to state that it has been undergoing a resurgence or revival in the first quarter of the twenty-first century, as this article shows. This impressive lineup should guarantee the continuing importance of topics in this area, and there is much to follow up on in this rich area of research.
5. References and Further Reading
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