Bonaventure (d. 1274) was a philosopher, a theologian, a prolific author of spiritual treatises, an influential prelate of the Medieval Church, the Minister General of the Franciscan Order, and, later in his life, a Cardinal. He has often been placed in the Augustinian tradition in opposition to the work of his peer, Thomas of Aquinas, and his successors in the Franciscan Order, John Duns Scouts and William of Ockham, who relied more heavily on the recent recovery of Aristotle’s philosophical texts and those of Aristotle’s commentators, notably Ibn Rushd. However, a more accurate reading of the relevant sources places Bonaventure at one end of a spectrum of a wide range of classical traditions, Pythagorean, Platonic, Neo-Platonic, Augustinian, and Stoic, as well as that of Aristotle and the commentators, in his effort to develop a distinct philosophy, philosophical theology, and spiritual tradition that remains influential to this day. His philosophy was part and parcel of his greater effort to further the knowledge and love of God; nevertheless, he clearly distinguished his philosophy from his theology, although he did not separate them, and this distinction is the basis for his status as one of the most innovative and influential philosophers of the later Middle Ages—a list that also includes Aquinas, Scotus, Ockham, and, perhaps, Buridan.
Bonaventure derived the architectonic structure of his thought from a Neo-Platonic process that began in the logical analysis of a Divine First Principle, continued in the analysis of the First Principle’s emanation into the created order, and ended in an analysis of the consummation of that order in its reunion with the First Principle from which it came. He was a classical theist, indeed, he contributed to the formation of classical theism, and he advanced the depth of that tradition in his development of a logically rigorous series of epistemic, cosmological, and ontological arguments for the First Principle. He argued that the First Principle created the heavens and earth in time and ex nihilo, contra the dominant opinion of the philosophers of classical antiquity, and he based his argument on the classical paradoxes of infinity. He emphasized the rational soul’s apprehension of the physical realm of being—although he was no empiricist—and argued for a cooperative epistemology, in which the rational soul abstracts concepts from its apprehension of the physical realm of being, but it does so in the light, so to speak, of a divine illumination that renders its judgments of the truth of those concepts certain. He revised a classical eudaimonism, steeped in Aristotelian virtue theory, in the context of the Christian doctrines and spiritual practices of the thirteenth century. He weaved these and other elements into a memorable account of the soul’s causal reductio of the cosmos, its efficient cause, final cause, and formal cause, to its origin in the First Principle, and the soul’s moral reformation that renders it fit for ecstatic union with the First Principle.
Table of Contents
- Life, Work, and Influence
- The Light of Philosophy
- The First Principle
- The Emanation of the Created Order
- The Epistemological Process
- Moral Philosophy
- The Ascent of the Soul into Ecstasy
- References and Further Reading
1. Life, Work, and Influence
a. Life and Work
Giovanni, later Bonaventure, was born in 1217—or perhaps as late as 1221—in the old City of Bagnoregio, the Civita di Bagnoregio, on the border between Tuscany and Lazio in central Italy. The view is striking. The Civita stands atop a scarped hill of volcanic stone that overlooks a valley at the foot of the Apennines. Bonaventure’s home has since collapsed into the valley, but a plaque remains to mark its former location. His father, Giovanni di Fidanza, was reportedly a physician and his father’s status as a member of the small but relatively prosperous professional classes provided the young Giovanni opportunity to study at the local Franciscan convent. His mother, Maria di Ritello, was devoted to St. Francis of Assisi (d. 1226), and her devotion provides the context for one of Giovanni’s few autobiographical reflections. He tells us that he suffered a grave illness when he was a young boy, but his mother’s prayers to St. Francis, who had passed in 1226, saved him from an early death (Bonaventure, Legenda maior prol. 3). He thus inherited his mother’s devotion to Francis, affectionately known as the Poor One (il Poverello).
Giovanni arrived in Paris in 1234 or perhaps early in 1235 to attend the newly chartered Université de Paris. He may well have found the city overwhelming. Philip II (d. 1223) had transformed France into the most prosperous kingdom in medieval Europe and rebuilt Paris to display its prosperity. He and his descendants oversaw a renaissance in art, architecture, literature, music, and learning. The requirements for the degree in the arts at the University focused on the trivium of the classical liberal arts, grammar, rhetoric, and logic. But they also included the quadrivium, arithmetic, geometry, music, and astronomy, which emphasized the role of number and other mathematical concepts in the structure of the universe, and Aristotle’s texts on philosophy and the natural sciences—the students and masters of the university routinely ignored the prohibitions to study Aristotle and his commentators first issued in 1210. Giovanni made good use of these “arts” throughout his career. Priscian’s grammar, the cadences of Cicero and other classical authors, deductive, inductive, and rhetorical argument, the prevalence of the concept of numerical order, and a firm grasp of the then current state of the natural sciences inform the entire range of his works.
Giovanni’s encounter with Alexander of Hales (d. 1245), an innovative Master of Theology at the University, would set the course for his future. Alexander entered the Franciscan Order in 1236 and established what would soon become a vibrant Franciscan school of theology within the University. Giovanni, who regarded Alexander as both his “master” and “father”, followed him into the Order in 1238, or perhaps as late as 1243, and began to study for an advanced degree in theology. He took the name Bonaventure when he entered the Order to celebrate his “good fortune”.
Alexander set the standard for Bonaventure and a long list of other students who emphasized a philosophical approach to the study of the scriptures and theology with particular attention to Aristotle and Aristotle’s commentators, whose entire corpus, with the notable exception of the Politics, would have been available to Bonaventure as a student of the arts, as well as the Liber de Causis, an influential Neo-Platonic treatise attributed to Aristotle. Alexander was fundamentally a Christian Platonists in the tradition of Augustine, Anselm, and the School of St. Victor; nevertheless, he was one of the first to incorporate Aristotelian doctrines into the broader Platonic framework that dominated the Franciscan school of thought in the thirteenth century.
Bonaventure continued his studies under Alexander’s successors, Jean de la Rochelle, Odo Rigaud, and William of Melitona. He began his commentaries on the scriptures, Ecclesiastes, Luke, and John, in 1248, and his commentary on the Sentences of Peter Lombard, the standard text for the advanced degree in theology, in 1250. He completed his studies in 1252 and began to lecture, engage in public disputations, and preach—the critical edition of his works includes over 500 sermons preached throughout the course of his life. He received his license to teach (licentia docendi) and succeeded William as Master and Franciscan Chair of Theology in 1254. The Reduction of the Arts to Theology is probably a revision of his inaugural lecture. His works from this period also include a revised version of the Commentary on the Sentences of Peter Lombard, his most extensive treatise in philosophical theology, and a series of disputations On the Knowledge of Christ, in which he presented his first extensive defense of his doctrine of divine illumination, On the Trinity, in which he summarized his arguments for the existence of God, and On Evangelical Perfection, in which he defended the Franciscan commitment to poverty.
But the secular masters of the University—those professors who did not belong to a religious order—refused to recognize his title and position. They had long been at odds with members of the religious orders who often flaunted the rules of the University in deference to those of their own orders. When the secular masters suspended the work of the University in a dispute with the ecclesial authorities of Paris in 1253, the religious orders refused to join them. The secular masters then attempted to expel them from the University. Pope Alexander IV intervened and settled the dispute in favor of the religious orders. The secular masters formally recognized Bonaventure as Chair of Theology in August of 1257, but Bonaventure had already relinquished his title and position. The Franciscan friars had elected him Minister General of the Order in February of 1257.
His initial task as Minister General proved difficult. His predecessor, John of Parma (d. 1289), endorsed some of the heretical tendencies of Joachim of Fiore (d. 1202), who had foretold that a New Age of the Holy Spirit would descend on the faithful and transcend the prominence of Christ, the papacy, Christ’s vicar on earth, and the current ecclesial leadership who served the papacy. John and other Franciscans, notably Gerard of Borgo San Donnino, had identified Francis as the herald of that New Age and his disciples, the Franciscans, as the Order of the Spirit. The papacy and other members of the ecclesial hierarchy formally condemned some aspects of Joachim’s doctrine at the Fourth Lateran Council in 1215 and issued a more thorough condemnation, in response to Franciscan support of his doctrine, at the Council of Arles in 1260. Bonaventure would display some degree of sympathy for their claims. He, too, insisted that Francis was the Angel of the Sixth Seal who had heralded the start of the New Age of the Spirit, but he also insisted Francis’ disciples remain in full obedience to the current ecclesial hierarchy (Bonaventure, Legenda maior prol. 1).
His second challenge stemmed from a dispute that emerged within the Order during Francis’ lifetime. Francis had practiced a life of extreme poverty in obedience to Christ’s admonition to the rich young man to “sell everything you have and distribute the proceeds to the poor… and come and follow me” (Luke 18:18-30). Francis, like the rich young man, had been rather wealthy until he renounced his father’s inheritance in obedience to the admonition and spent the rest of his life as a charismatic preacher. But many of his followers argued for some degree of mitigation to their life of extreme poverty so they could better serve in other capacities, as administrators, teachers, and more learned preachers. The debate came to a head shortly after Francis’ death, since many of the friars who practiced a more rigorous commitment to poverty also supported Joachim’s apocalypticism. Bonaventure strongly supported Francis’ commitment to poverty as evidenced in his initial Encyclical Letter to the Provincial Ministers of the Order in 1257 and his codification of the Franciscan Rule in the Constitutions of Narbonne in 1260; nevertheless, he also permitted some degree of mitigation for specific purposes in specific contexts—the books, for example, students needed to complete their studies at Paris and other universities to become administrators, teachers, and preachers. Bonaventure maintained the peace in these disputes largely through his own commitment to poverty. But that peace would collapse shortly after his death when the Fraticelli, also known as the Spiritual Franciscans, who argued for a more rigorous life of poverty, and the Conventuals, who argued for a degree of mitigation, would split into factions. Many of the Fraticelli would oppose the papacy and the established hierarchy in their zeal for poverty and suffer censure, imprisonment, and, on occasion, death. Boniface VIII pronounced them heretics in 1296 and Clement V, who had also suppressed the Templars, sentenced four of the Fraticelli to burn at the stake in Marseille in 1318.
Bonaventure resided in the convent of Mantes sur Seine, to the west of Paris, throughout his term as Minister General and visited the university often—it was the center of the European intellectual world. He also travelled widely, in frequent visits to the friars throughout France, England, Italy, Germany, the Low Countries, and Spain, and he did so on foot, the standard means of transportation for those who had pledged themselves to Francis’ Lady Poverty. His works from this period reveal his careful attention to his friars’ spiritual needs. He published the Breviloquium, a short summary of his philosophical theology, at the bequest of the friars in 1257, shortly after his election, and a number of spiritual treatises in which he displays a deft ability to weave his philosophical theology in a sophisticated and often moving prose. These include the Soliloquies, a series of the soul’s dialogues with its innermost self in its effort to further its knowledge and love of God, the Threefold Way, a treatise on spiritual development, the Tree of Life, a series of meditations on Christ’s life, death, and resurrection that furthers the late medieval emphasis on the suffering of Christ, and the Longer Life of Saint Francis of Assisi, which would become the most influential biography of the saint until the nineteenth century. But the most influential of these texts is the Soul’s Journey into God (Itinerarium Mentis in Deum), a short summary of the ascent of the soul on the steps of Bonaventure’s reformulation of the Platonic Ladder of Love that ends in an ecstatic union with God. Those interested in Bonaventure’s thought should begin their reading with the Itinerarium.
His final challenge as Minister General dealt directly with the proper relationship between reason and faith. Aristotle and his commentators, the so-called radical Aristotelians, had argued for a number of doctrines that contradicted the orthodox reading of the Christian scriptures. He met this challenge in a series of Collations, academic conferences in which he singled out their errors, the Collations on the Ten Commandments, the Seven Gifts of the Holy Spirit, and the Six Days of Creation—the last of these remains unfinished. These errors included the eternity of the world, the absolute identity of the agent intellect, the denial of Platonic realism in regard to the theory of metaphysical forms, the denial of God’s direct knowledge of the world, the denial of the freedom of the will, and the denial of reward or punishment in the world to come. Bonaventure provided detailed arguments against each of these positions in his Collations and other works, but his principal argument was the concept of Christ the Center (medium) of all things, neither Aristotle, whom Bonaventure regarded as the Philosopher par excellence, nor his commentators (Bonaventure, Hexaëmeron 1:10-39). Thus, Christ’s teaching and, through extension, the entire scriptures, remained the only reliable guard against the tendency of the human intellect to error.
Pope Clement IV attempted to appoint Bonaventure Bishop of York in 1265, but Bonaventure refused the honor. Clement’s death in 1268 then precipitated a papal crisis. Louis IX of France and his younger brother, Charles of Anjou, attempted to intervene, but the Italian Cardinals and a number of other factions resisted. Bonaventure supported a compromise candidate, Teobaldi Visconti, whose election in 1271 brought the crisis to an end. Teobaldi, now Pope Gregory X, appointed Bonaventure the Cardinal Bishop of Albano in 1273, perhaps in gratitude for his support, and called on him to lead the effort to reunify the Roman Catholic Church and the Orthodox Church at the Second Council of Lyon. Once again, his efforts proved instrumental. The Council celebrated the reunion on July 6, 1274. It would not last. The representatives of the Emperor, Michael VIII Palaiologos, and the Orthodox Patriarch had agreed to the terms of union without the support of their clergy or the faithful. Bonaventure passed away unexpectedly shortly thereafter, on July 15, 1274, while the Council was in session. Gregory and the delegates of the Council celebrated his funeral mass. Pope Sixtus IV declared him a saint in 1482 and Sixtus V declared him a Doctor of the Church, the Doctor Seraphicus, in 1588.
Historically, Bonaventure remains the preeminent representative of the Christian Neo-Platonic tradition in the thirteenth century and the last influential representative of that tradition. He was also the last single individual to master the three critical components of the Christian intellectual tradition, philosophy, theology, and spirituality. His prominent disciples in the thirteenth century include Eustace of Arras, Walter of Bruges, John Peckham, William de la Mare, Matthew of Aquasparta, William of Falgar, Richard of Middleton, Roger Marsten, and Peter John Olivi.
Bonaventure fell out of favor in the fourteenth century. Scotus, Ockham, and other, less influential philosophers possessed less confidence in reason’s ability to ascend the Ladder of Love without the assistance of faith. They began to dismantle the close knit harmony between the two that Bonaventure had wrought, and set the stage for the opposition between them that emerged in the Enlightenment.
Nevertheless, the Franciscans revived interest in Bonaventure’s thought in response to his canonization in the fifteenth century and again in the sixteenth. The Conventual Franciscans, one of the three current branches of the medieval Order of Friars Minor, established the College of St. Bonaventure in Rome in 1587 to further interest in Bonaventure’s thought. They produced the first edition of his works shortly thereafter in 1588-1599, revised in 1609, 1678, 1751, and, finally, in 1860. The Conventuals and other Franciscans also supported the effort to establish medieval philosophy as a distinct field of academic inquiry in the nineteenth century, and rallied to include Bonaventure in the standard canon of medieval philosophers. The Observant branch of the Friars Minor founded the College of St. Bonaventure in Quaracchi, just outside Florence, in 1877 to prepare a new critical edition of Bonaventure’s works in support of this effort. It appeared in 1882-1902 and remains, with some relatively minor revisions, the foundation of current scholarship.
Bonaventure’s philosophy continued, and still continues, to command considerable interest, particularly among historians of medieval thought and philosophers in the Roman Catholic and other Christian traditions in their effort to distinguish philosophy from theology and develop a metaphysics, epistemology, ethics, and even aesthetics within their respective traditions. Notable examples include Malebranche, Gioberti, and other ontologists who revived a robust Platonism to argue that the human intellect possesses direct access to the divine ideas, Tillich and other Christian existentialists who developed Bonaventure’s epistemology into an existential encounter with the “truth” of the Divine Being, and, most recently, Delio, among others, who have relied on Bonaventure and the wider Franciscan intellectual tradition in their attempt to solve current problems in environmental ethics, health care, and other areas of social justice.
2. The Light of Philosophy
Bonaventure’s reputation as a philosopher had been the subject of debate throughout the nineteenth and early twentieth centuries. He never penned a philosophical treatise independent of his theological convictions, such as Aquinas’ On Being and Essence, and he imbedded his philosophy within his theological and spiritual treatises to a greater extent than Aquinas, Scotus, Ockham, and other medieval philosophers. Nevertheless, he clearly distinguished philosophy from theology and insisted on the essential role of reason in the practice of theology, the rational reflection on the data of revelation contained in the Christian scriptures. This distinction provides the basis for a successful survey of his philosophy. But its integral role in his larger enterprise, the rational reflection on the data of revelation, requires some degree of reference to fields that normally fall outside the scope of philosophy as practiced today, namely, his theology, spirituality, and, on occasion, even mysticism.
Bonaventure classified philosophy as a rational “light” (lux), a gift from God, “the Father of Lights and the Giver of every good and perfect gift” (Bonaventure, De reductione artium 1). It would prove critical in Bonaventure’s overarching goal to further his reader’s knowledge and love of God, and an indispensable “handmaiden” to theology, the greater “light” and the “queen of the sciences”. It reveals intelligible truth. It inquires into the cause of being, the principles of knowledge, and the proper order of the human person’s life. It is a critical component in a Christian system of education (paideia) with its roots in the thought of Clement of Alexandria, Augustine, Boethius, and Capella, who first delineated the classical system of the seven liberal arts. But it is also important to note that it possessed a wider range of denotation than it does today: according to Bonaventure, philosophy included grammar, rhetoric, and logic, mathematics, physics, and the natural sciences, ethics, household economics, politics, and metaphysics, in sum, rational investigation into full extent of the created order and its Creator independent of the data of revelation.
The light of reason also played a critical role in Bonaventure’s approach to theology (Bonaventure, De reductione artium 5). Alexander and his heirs in the Franciscan school at Paris had pioneered the transformation of theology into a rationally demonstrative science on the basis of Aristotle’s conception of scientia. Bonaventure brought those efforts to perfection in a rigorous causal analysis of the discipline (Bonaventure, 1 Sent. prol., q. 1-4). Its subject is the sum total of all things, God, the First Principle, the absolute first cause of all other things, and the full extent of God’s creation revealed in the scriptures and the long list of councils, creeds, and commentaries on the doctrine contained in its pages. Its method, the “sharp teeth” of rational inquiry, analysis, and argument (Aristotle, Physics 2.9). And its goal, the perfection of the knowledge and love of God that ends in an ecstatic union with God. But for what purpose? Why engage in a rational demonstration of the faith rather than a pious reading of the scriptures? Bonaventure listed three reasons: (1) the defense of the faith against those who oppose it, (2) the support of those who doubt it, and (3) the delight of the rational soul of those who believe it. “There is nothing,” Bonaventure explained, “which we understand with greater pleasure than those things which we already believe” (Bonaventure, 1 Sent. prol., q. 2, resp.). Nevertheless, reason was a handmaiden who knew her own mind. Bonaventure routinely admonished his readers against the “darkness of error” that diminished the light of intelligible truth and led them into the sin of pride: “Many philosophers,” he lamented, “have become fools. They boasted of their knowledge and have become like Lucifer” (Bonaventure, Hexaëmeron 4:1).
The evaluation of Bonaventure’s status as a philosopher had been closely bound to his attitude toward Aristotle and Aristotle’s commentators. Mandonnet had placed Bonaventure within a Neo-Platonic school of thought, largely Augustinian, that rejected Aristotle and his commentators and failed to develop a formal distinction between philosophy and theology (Quinn, Historical Constitution, 17-99). Van Steenberghen had argued that Bonaventure relied on a wide range of sources, Platonic, Neo-Platonic, and Aristotelian, for his philosophy, but it was an eclectic philosophy that served only to provide ad hoc support for his theological doctrines. Gilson had argued that Bonaventure developed a Christian Neo-Platonic philosophy, largely Augustinian, distinct from theology but in support of it, and he did so in a deliberate effort to distance himself from the radical Aristotelians who opposed the doctrinal positions of the Christian tradition. The debate on particular aspects of Bonaventure’s status as a philosopher and his debt to Aristotle and Aristotle’s commentators continues, but current consensus recognizes that Bonaventure developed a distinct and cohesive philosophy in support of his theology, and that he relied on a wide range of sources, Pythagorean, Platonic, Neo-Platonic, Stoic, Augustinian, and even Aristotelian to do so.
3. The First Principle
Bonaventure began the comprehensive presentations of his philosophy and philosophical theology in the beginning (in principio), in a statement of faith that testifies to the existence of the First Principle (Primum Principium) of Genesis, the God of Abraham, Isaac, and Jacob or, more specifically, God the Father, the first person of the Christian Trinity (Bonaventure, 1 Sent. d. 2, a. 1, q. 1; Breviloquium 1.1; and Itinerarium prol. 1). But he also insisted that this Principle is the fundamental cause of each and every other thing in heaven and earth and so, through the rational reductio of each thing to its efficient, formal, and final cause, this Principle is known to the human intellect independent of divine revelation. It is also common, in some form, to the philosophical traditions of classical antiquity, Pythagorean, Platonic, Neo-Platonic, Peripatetic, and Stoic. Indeed, Bonaventure absorbed much of that heritage in his own exposition of the existence and nature of the One God.
a. The Properties of the First Principle
He also developed a philosophical description of the fundamental properties of the First Principle on the basis of that classical heritage (Bonaventure, Itinerarium 5.5). The First Principle is being itself (ipsum esse). It comes neither from nothing nor from something else and is the absolute first cause of every other thing (Bonaventure, 1 Sent. d. 28, a. 1, q. 2 ad 4). If not, it would possess some degree of potential and not be absolute being. It is also eternal, simple, actual, perfect, and one in the sense of its numerical unity and the simplicity of its internal unification. If not, it would, again, possess some degree of potential and thus not be absolute being. Bonaventure developed slightly different lists of these divine properties throughout his works, but they all share the common root in the concept of absolute being.
b. The Theory of the Forms
Bonaventure’s arguments for the existence of the First Principle depended on his revision of the Platonic theory of the forms and an analysis of truth on the basis of those formal principles. Plato had developed his theory in response to a problem Heraclitus first proposed. All things in the physical realm of being are in a constate state of change. So much so, that when we claim to know them, we fail. The things we claim to know no longer exist. They have changed into something else. Our claim of knowledge, then, is at best a fleeting glimpse of the past and a fiction in the present. But Plato argued that we do, in fact, know things and we know some of them with certainty, such as mathematical principles and evaluative concepts like justice. If so, what accounts for them? Plato proposed his theory of forms to answer the question. The forms (eíde) are the paradigmatic exemplars of the things they inform. They exist in a permanent realm of being independent of the things they inform, and they persist in spite of the changes within those things. The mind grasps the forms through its recollection (anamnesis) of them or, in the testimony of Diotima in the Symposium, in an ecstatic vision of those forms in themselves.
But Plato and his successors, notably Aristotle, continued to debate particular aspects of the theory. Do the forms exist within a divine realm of being (ante rem) independent of the things they inform? Do they serve as exemplars so that the individual instantiations of those forms in the physical realm of being imitate them? Do they exist in the things they inform so that those things participate, in some way, in the forms (in re)? Do they exist in the mind that conceives them (post rem)? If so, how does the mind acquire those forms? Or, as later philosophers would argue, are they merely a linguistic expression (flatus vocis)? Or some combination of the above?
Bonaventure relied on Plato’s theory, transmitted through Augustine, and Aristotle’s criticisms of that theory to develop a robust “three-fold” solution that embraced the full spectrum of possibilities (Bonaventure, Itinerarium 1.3; Christus unus magister 18). The forms, he argued, exist eternally in the Eternal Art (ante rem), in the things they inform (in re), and in the mind who apprehends them (post rem), and this included their expression in the speech of the person who apprehends them (flatus vocis). They serve as exemplars so that the individual instantiations of them in the physical realm of being imitate them, and they participate in the presence of those forms in re. Finally, the mind acquires them, Bonaventure argued, through the cooperative effort of the rational soul that abstracts them from its sensory apprehension of the things they inform and the illumination of the Eternal Art that preserves the certainty of their truth (Bonaventure, Itinerarium 2.9).
Bonaventure’s commitment to a robust theory of Platonic realism in regard to the forms has earned him the title as the last of the great Platonists of the Middle Ages, but the praise is a thinly veiled criticism. It often implies his endorsement of a dead end in philosophical metaphysics in contrast to more enlightened philosophers, such as Aquinas, Scotus, and Ockham, who would reject a robust Platonism in their anticipation of a more thoroughly rational and naturalistic metaphysics. But it is important to note that Platonism endured. Renaissance Platonists, with the benefit of the full scope of the Platonic corpus, would reinvigorate a tradition that survived and often thrived in subsequent generations and continues to do so, particularly in the field of the philosophy of mathematics, to the present day.
c. Truth and the Arguments for the First Principle
Bonaventure’s arguments for the existence of the First Principle remain impressive for their depth and breadth (Houser, 9). He classified his arguments for the existence of the First Principle on the basis of the metaphysical forms, ante rem, in re, and post rem, and a type of correspondence theory of truth mapped onto the three fundamental divisions of the Neo-Platonic concept of being (esse): the cosmological truth of physical being, the epistemological truth of intelligible being, and the ontological truth of Divine Being (Bonaventure, 1 Sent. d. 8, p. 1, a. 1, q. 1). Cosmological truth depends on the correspondence between an object and its form in the divine mind (ante rem), intelligible truth on the correspondence between an object and its intelligible form in the human mind (post rem), and ontological truth on the correspondence between an object and the form within it (in re) that renders it into a particular type of thing. But the First Principle, the absolute origin of every other thing, does not possess the material principle of potential. It is the “pure” act of being—a concept Bonaventure will develop throughout his arguments. It and It alone is the perfect instantiation of its form, so to speak, and, thus, It and It alone is necessarily true in Itself.
i. The Epistemological Argument
Bonaventure began with the epistemological argument which, he claimed, is certain, but added that the arguments in the other categories are more certain. His initial formulation of the argument asserted that the rational soul, in its self-reflection, recognizes the “impression” (impressio) of the First Principle on its higher faculties, its memory, intellect, and will, and their proper end in the knowledge and love of that First Principle (Bonaventure, Mysterio Trinitatis q.1, a.1 fund. 1-10). The argument is not as viciously circular as it appears. Bonaventure contended that the soul possesses an innate desire for knowledge and love that remains unsated in the physical and intelligible realms of being. These realms, as Bonaventure will explain in more detail in his revision of the argument, possess a degree of potential that necessarily renders them less than fully satisfying. But, as Aristotle had frequently insisted, nature does nothing in vain. Thus, per the process of elimination, the soul finds satisfaction in the knowledge and love of a Divine Being.
He revised the epistemological argument in his later works into a more sophisticated, and less circular, argument from divine illumination (Bonaventure, Scientia Christi q. 4; Christus unus magister 6-10, 18; and Itinerarium 2.9).
- The rational soul (mens) possesses knowledge of certain truth.
Bonaventure presumed that the soul possesses certain truth. Paradigmatic examples include the principles of discrete quantity, the point, the instant, and the unit, and the logical axioms of the Aristotelian sciences, such as the principle of non-contradiction. He also cited Plato’s account of the young boy who possessed an innate knowledge of the principles of geometry that enabled him, without the benefit of formal education, to successfully double the area of a square.
- The rational soul is fallible and the object of its knowledge mutable and thus fails to provide the proper basis for certain truth.
Bonaventure appears to have some sympathy for Heraclitus’ argument that the world is in a constant state of change. If so, our knowledge of the world at any given time is accurate for only a fleeting passage of time. But the thrust of his argument in support of this premise stems from his conception of truth in relation to his theory of the metaphysical forms that exist in the divine realm of being (ante rem), in the intelligible (post rem), and in the physical (in re). Empirical observation reveals that the physical realm of being is always in some degree of potency in relation to its participation in the metaphysical forms in re. This potential testifies to its existence ex nihilo—it is the root cause of its possession of some degree of potency. Its truth depends on the degree to which it participates in its metaphysical form in re and the degree to which it imitates its form ante rem. Thus, its truth necessarily falls short of its ideal. The soul, also created ex nihilo, also possesses some degree of potency in relation to its ideal. Thus, its abstraction of these imperfect forms from the physical realm of being is fallible.
- Therefore, the rational soul relies on a divine “light” to render itself infallible and the object of its knowledge immutable.
Bonaventure divided the sum total of the cosmos into three realms of being without remainder: physical, intelligible, and divine. Thus, per the process of elimination, the soul relies on an “eternal reason” from the divine realm of being for its possession of certain truth.
ii. The Cosmological Argument
Bonaventure relied on Aristotle’s analysis of the concept of being (esse) into being-in-potency and being-in-act for his cosmological argument (Mysterio Trinitatis q. 1, a. 1 fund. 11-20). He began with a series of empirical observations. The physical ream of being possesses a number of conditions that reveal it is being-in-potency. It is posterior, from another, possible, and so on. Its possession of these properties indicates that it depends on something else to account for its existence, something prior, something not from another, something necessary. In fact, its being-in-potency reveals its origin ex nihilo, and it continues to possess some degree of the “nothingness” from which it came—contra Aristotle, who had argued for the eternal existence of a continuous substratum of matter on the basis of Parmenides’ axiom that nothing comes ex nihilo. Thus, it “cries out” its dependence on something prior, something not from another, something necessary. This being cannot be another instance of physical being, since each and every physical thing is posterior, from another, possible, and so on. It cannot be intelligible being which shares the same dependencies. Thus, again per the process of elimination, it is the Divine Being.
iii. The Ontological Argument
Bonaventure was the first philosopher of the thirteenth century to possess a thorough grasp of the ontological argument and advance its formulation (Seifert, Si Deus est Deus). He did so in two significant directions. First, he provided an affirmative compliment to the emphasis on the logical contradiction of the reductio ad absurdum common among traditional forms of the argument (Bonaventure, Mysterio Trinitatis q. 1, a.1 fund. 21-29 and Itinerarium mentis in Deum 5.3). He began with the first of Aristotle’s conceptual categories of being, non-being, and argued that the concept of non-being is a privation of the concept of being and thus presupposes the concept of being. The next category, being-in-potency, refers to the potential inherent in things to change. An acorn, for example, possesses the potential to become a sapling. The final category, being-in-act, refers to the degree to which something has realized its potential. The thing that had been an acorn is now a sapling. Thus, the concept of being-in-potency depends on the concept of being-in-act. But if so, then the concept of being-in-act depends on a final conceptual category, the concept of a “pure” act of being without potential and this final concept, Bonaventure argued, is being itself (ipsum esse).
Second, he reinforced the argument to include the transcendental properties of being, the one, the true, and the good. The concept of the transcendentals (transcendentia) was a distinctive innovation in the effort of medieval philosophers and theologians to reengage the sources of the syncretic philosophical systems of late antiquity, such as Porphyry’s Introduction to Aristotle’s Categories, Boethius’ On the Cycles of the Seven Days—often cited in its Latin title, De hebdomadibus—and Dionysius’ On the Divine Names, to identify the most common notions (communissima) of the concrete existence of being (ens) that “transcended” the traditional Peripatetic division of things, or perhaps the names of things, into the categories of substance and its accidents: quantity, quality, relation, and so on. Each and every particular thing that exists in the physical realm of being is one, true, and good. But it is imperfectly one, true, and good. It is one-in-potency, truth-in-potency, and good-in-potency. It depends on one-in-act, truth-in-act, and good-in-act, and thus on the “pure” act of being the one, the true, and the good.
His final step is to locate this being itself, the one, the true, and the good, within the Neo-Platonic division of being. It does not fall within the category of the physical realm of being “which is mixed with potency”. It does exist within the intelligible realm of being, but not entirely so. If it existed in the rational soul and only in the soul, it would exist only as a concept, an intelligible fictum, and thus possess “only a minimal degree of being”. And so, per the process of elimination, being itself is the Divine Being.
d. Epistemic Doubt
Bonaventure insisted that these arguments are self-evident (per se notum) and thus indubitable. But if so, what accounts for doubt or disbelief? Bonaventure located the root of doubt in a series of objective failures, a vague definition of terms, insufficient evidence in support of the truth of propositions, or a formal error in the logical process (Bonaventure, 1 Sent. d. 8, p. 1, a. 1, q. 2 resp.). None of these, he argued, applied in the case of his arguments for the existence of God. Nevertheless, he recognized the reality of those who would deny them. But if so, what accounts for their denial? Either a subjective failure to grasp the terms, the propositions, or the arguments or, perversely, a willful ignorance to do so.
4. The Emanation of the Created Order
Bonaventure’s account of creation depended on Plato’s Timaeus which he read in a careful counterpoint with Genesis as well as Aristotle’s Physics and other texts in natural philosophy. It begins with a revision of Plato’s myth of the Divine Architect (Bonaventure, De reductione artium 11-14). The First Principle, God the Father, similar to Plato’s Divine Architect, carefully studied the metaphysical forms in God the Son, the Eternal Art “in whom He has disposed all things” (Wisdom 11:21). The Father then fashioned the artifacts (artificia) of the created realm of being in imitation of those formal exemplars and declared them good in terms of their utility and their beauty. Finally, He created human beings in the image of Himself, so that they would recognize the presence of the artist in the work of His hands and praise Him, serve Him, and delight in Him.
Bonaventure’s description of the Divine Architect differs from Plato’s in one crucial respect. His fidelity to the orthodox formula of the ecumenical councils compelled him to insist that the First Principle exists in one and the same substance (ousia) with the Eternal Art (Breviloquium 1.2). The distinction between them, in the phrase of the councils, is entirely personal (hypostatic). Bonaventure argued that this distinction is the result of their respective modes of origin. God the Father, the first of the divine hypostases, is the absolute First Principle without beginning, and the Son, the second divine hypostasis, comes from the Father. Philosophically, Bonaventure’s distinction between the two on the basis of origin seems too metaphysically thin to account for a real distinction between them. Nevertheless, his commitment to orthodox monotheism precluded a substantial distinction between the two.
Bonaventure also insisted that the First principle created the world in time and out of nothing (Bonaventure, 2 Sent. d. 1, p. 1, a. 1, q. 2). Aristotle proposed the first detailed argument for the eternity of the world and most ancient philosophers, notably Proclus, endorsed it. Jewish and Christian philosophers, notably Augustine, developed the doctrine of creation in time and ex nihilo to oppose it. But the rediscovery of Aristotle’s natural philosophy in the twelfth century revived the debate. Bonaventure was the first of the philosopher-theologians of the later Middle Ages to possess a firm grasp of the classical arguments for and against the proposition, particularly Philoponus’ reflection on the paradoxes of infinity, the impossibility of the addition, order, traversal, comprehension, and simultaneous existence of an infinite number of physical entities (Dales, 86-108). He may not have thought the argument against the eternity of the world on the basis of these paradoxes was strictly demonstrative; nevertheless, he clearly thought that the eternal existence of a created world was an impossibility.
Bonaventure relied on three closely related concepts, the Aristotelian principle of matter, the Stoic concept of causal principles, and the Neo-Platonic concept of metaphysical light, to further develop his account of creation (Bonaventure, Breviloquium 2.1-12). He relied on Aristotle’s principle of matter, distinct from matter in the sense of concrete, physical things, to account for the continuity of those things through change. The metaphysical forms within them rendered them into something particular and directed the changes within them in the course of time. The principle of matter received those forms, and rendered those concrete, physical particulars into stable receptacles of change. It was the foundation (fundamentum) of the physical realm of being. But Bonaventure also argued, contra Aristotle, that the rational souls of human persons and other intelligent creatures in the intelligible realm of being, angels and even the devil and his demons, possess the potential to change and thus they possess the same principle of matter. Their metaphysical forms rendered them into something intelligible, distinct from other concrete, physical things, but those forms subsist in the same material principle. Bonaventure’s doctrine of universal hylomorphism, in which both physical and intelligible creatures possess the principles of matter and form, is an essential feature in his distinction between the First Principle, who does not change (Malachi 3:6), and Its creation.
Early Jewish and Christian philosophers developed the Stoic concept of causal principles or “seeds” (rationes seminales) to account for the potential within concrete particulars to change. The metaphysical forms that informed those changes exist in potentia within them. They exist as metaphysical seeds, so to speak, that will develop into forms in re in the fullness of time in response to a secondary agent, such as the human artist who, in imitation of the Eternal Art, creates artifacts that are useful and beautiful. Bonaventure insisted on the presence of these metaphysical seeds in his rejection of Ibn Sina’s doctrine of occasionalism, in which the First Principle, and the First Principle alone, is the efficient cause of each and every change in the created realm of being. Bonaventure argued, contra Ibn Sina, that the dignity of the human person, created in the image of God, demands that they, too, serve as efficient causes in the created order and cooperate with Him in their effort to know and love Him.
Bonaventure developed his light metaphysics in opposition to Aristotle who had argued that light was an accidental form that rendered things bright, not a substantial form (Bonaventure, 2 Sent. d. 13). Aristotle’s approach accounted for bright things, such as the sun, the moon, and the stars, but did not allow for the existence of light in itself. Bonaventure favored the less popular but more syncretic approach of Grosseteste, who argued that a metaphysical light (lux) was the substantial form of corporeity. It bestowed extension on physical things and rendered them visible—the fundamental properties of all physical things. It also prepared them for further formation. Bonaventure was a proponent of the “most famous pair” (binarium famosissimum), the logical entailment of the thesis of (near) universal hylomorphism and the plurality of metaphysical form that distinguished the Franciscan school of thought throughout the thirteenth century. He argued that all created things possess the metaphysical attributes of matter and form—his advocacy of the doctrine of divine simplicity precluded his application of the thesis to the Divinity. He also argued that a series of forms determined the precise nature of each thing. The form of light (lux) was common to all physical things, but other forms rendered them into particular types of physical things according to an Aristotelian hierarchy of the forms, the nutritive form common to all living things, the sensory form common to all animals, and the rational form, or soul, which distinguishes the human person from other terrestrial creatures.
The First Principle weaved these threads together in Its creation of the corporeal light (lumen) on the first day of creation. This light was a single, undifferentiated physical substance in itself, not an accidental property of something else, extended in space and, in potential, time. It possessed the inchoate forms that would guide its further development and stood, the principle of matter made manifest, as the corner stone of the physical cosmos.
The First Principle divided this primal light into three realms of physical being (naturae), the luminous on the first day of creation, the translucent on the second, and the opaque on the third, and then filled them with their proper inhabitants on the subsequent days of creation. The luminous realm consists of the purest form of metaphysical light (lux) and corresponds to the heavens, bright with the light of its form and a modest amount of prime matter. The translucent realm consists of air and, to a lesser extent, water, and contains a less pure degree of the primordial light in its mixture with prime matter. The opaque consists of earth and contains the least pure degree of light in its mixture. He relied on Aristotelian cosmology to further divide the cosmos into the empyrean heaven, the crystalline heaven, and the firmament; the planetary spheres, Saturn, Jupiter, Mars, the Sun, Venus, Mercury, and the Moon; the elemental natures of fire, air, water, and the earth; and, finally, the four qualities, the hot, the cold, the wet, and the dry, the most basic elements of Aristotelian physics. The heavenly spheres, he explained, correspond to the luminous realm. The elemental natures of air, water, and earth, correspond to the sublunar realms and contain the birds of the air, the fish of the sea, and each and every thing that crawls on the earth. Fire is a special case. Although elemental, it shares much in common with the luminous, and thus consumes the air around it in its effort to rise to the heavens.
The process came to its end in the formation of the human person in the image of God. Bonaventure adopted a definition of the human person common among Jewish, Christian, and Islamic philosophers and theologians throughout the Middle Ages: the human person is a composite of a soul (anima) and body, “formed from the mire (limus) of the earth” (Breviloquium 2.10). The human soul is the metaphysical forma of its body. It perfects its body in so far as its union with its body brings the act of creation to its proper end in the formation of the human person, the sum of all creation, in the image of God. It then directs its body in the completion of its principal task, to enable the human person to recognize creation’s testimony to its Creator so that it might come to its proper end in union with its Creator.
He distinguished his definition of the human composite from his peers in his juxtaposition of two convictions that initially seem to oppose one another: the ontological independence of the soul as a substantial, self-subsisting entity and the degree to which he emphasized the soul’s disposition to unite with its body. Plato and his heirs who had insisted on the soul’s substantial independence tended to denigrate its relationship with the body. Plotinus’ complaint is indicative if hyperbolic: Porphry, his biographer, told us that he “seemed ashamed of being in the body” (Porphyry, On the Life of Plotinus 1). Bonaventure rejected this tendency. He agreed that the soul is an independent substance on the basis of his conviction that it possesses its own passive potential. It is able to live, perceive, reason, and will independently of its body in this life and the next and, after its reunion with a new, “spiritual” body, in its eternal contemplation of God. The soul, Bonaventure insisted, is something in itself (Bonaventure, 2 Sent. d. 17, a. 1, q. 2). The human spirit is a fully functioning organism with or without its corporeal body.
But he also argued that the soul is the active principle that brings existence to the human composite in its union with its body and enables it to function properly in the physical realm of being (Bonaventure, 4 Sent. d. 43, a.1, q.1 fund. 5). Thus, the soul possesses an innate tendency to unite with its body (unibilitas). The soul is ordered to its body, not imprisoned within it. It realizes its perfection in union with its body, not in spite of it; and with its body, it engages in the cognitive reductio that leads to its proper end in the knowledge of God and ecstatic union with God. Its relationship with its body is so intimate that it no longer functions properly at the moment of its body’s death. It yearns for its reunion with its risen body in the world to come, a clear, impassible, subtle, and agile body that furthers its access to the beatific vision.
5. The Epistemological Process
Bonaventure began his account of the epistemological process with a classical theme common throughout the Middle Ages: the human person, body and soul, is a microcosm (minor mundus) of the wider world (Bonaventure, Itinerarium 2.2). Its body consists of the perfect proportion of the fundamental elements that comprise the physical realm of being, the primordial light (lux) of the first day of creation that regulates the composition of the other four elements: the earth that renders the body into something substantial, the air that gives it breath, the bodily fluids that regulate its health, and the fire that instills the physiological basis for its passions. Its soul (anima) renders it into the most well-developed of all creatures in its capacities for nutrition, which it shares with the plant kingdom, sensation, which it shares with the animal kingdom, and reason, which belongs to rational creatures alone. But above all, it possesses the capacity to know all things throughout the full extent of the created order, the luminous, translucent, and opaque realms of the cosmos.
Bonaventure divided the epistemological process through which the rational soul (mens), the definitive aspect of the human person, comes to know all things into three distinct stages: apprehension, delight, and rational judgment.
Bonaventure’s theory of sense apprehension (apprehensionem) depended on the current state of the physical sciences in the early thirteenth century, psychology, biology, physiology, neurology, and physics. He located the start of the process in the rational soul’s sensory apprehension of the physical realm of being. But Bonaventure was not an empiricist. He admitted the soul possesses the rational principles that enable it to reason in its estimation of the physical realm of being and the ability to know itself and other intelligible beings, namely, angels, the devil, demons, and the Divine Being. The internal sense is the first to engage the physical realm of being. It determines the degree of threat the physical realm poses and thus serves to protect the soul and its body from harm. The next series of senses includes the more familiar senses of sight, hearing, smell, taste, and touch. Each sense is a “door” (porta) that opens onto a particular element or combination of elements. Sight opens to the primordial light of the first day of creation. Hearing opens to air, smell to “vapors”, an admixture of air, water, and fire, the remnant of the elemental particle of heat, taste to water, and touch to earth. Each sense also apprehends common aspects of physical things, their number, size, physical form, rest, and motion.
Bonaventure insisted that, for most things, the human person invokes each of the senses in tandem with the others. Each sense opens onto particular properties inherent within physical things and when the rational soul applies them in conjunction with one another, they provide a comprehensive grasp of the universe in its totality. Some things, like the morning star, remain so bright, so pure, that it is accessible only to sight. But most things contain a more thorough mixture of the primordial light of creation and the more substantial elements of earth, air, fire, and water that in themselves consist of the fundamental particles of medieval physics, the hot, the cold, the wet, and the dry. The rational soul’s apprehension of the macrocosmus as a whole demands the use of all its senses.
Bonaventure’s metaphor of the door reveals his debt to an Aristotelian intromission theory of sense perception. The sense organs, the eyes, ears, nose, and so on, are passive, but the metaphysical light within the objects of the senses render them into something active. They shine, so to speak, and impress an impression (similitudo) of themselves onto the media that surround them, the light, fire, air, water, or in some cases, earth. Each impression is an exemplum of an exemplar, like the wax impression of a signet ring. These impressions in the media impress another exemplum of themselves onto the exterior sense organs, the eyes, ears, nose, and so on. These impress an image of themselves onto the inner sense organs of the nervous system and, finally, onto the apprehension, the outermost layer of the mind. The physical realm of being is filled with the “brightness” of its self-disclosure, “loud” with its cries, pungent, savory, and tangible. The soul cannot escape its self-disclosure. It remains in “tangible” contact with each and every thing it apprehends—albeit through a series of intermediary impressions.
These sensory species or similitudines within the soul’s apprehension are “intentions” in the sense of signs, rarified, information bearing objects within itself, not merely the soul’s awareness of the objects of its apprehension. They contain information about the way things look, sound, smell, taste, and feel, information about their size, shape, whether they are in rest or in motion, hic et nunc, the imprint of the concrete reality of physical being. But the soul’s apprehension of them is an apprehension of the impression of a series of impressions of the object, not the object in itself, and the subtle decline in the accuracy of each impression accounts for the errors of perception.
Bonaventure emphasized the role of delight (delectatio) in this process to a greater extent than his peers (Lang, Bonaventure’s Delight in Sensation). He identified three sources of the rational soul’s delight in its apprehension of the “abstracted” impression: the beautiful (speciositas), the agreeable (suavitas), and the good (salubritas). (It is clear from the context of the passage that the soul delights in its “abstraction” of a sensory impression at this stage of the process, not in its abstraction of a metaphysical form from those sensory impressions.) His immediate source for the innovation was the incipit of Aristotle’s Metaphysics: “All men [and women] naturally desire to know” and the further claim that the “delight” they take in their senses is evidence of that desire (Aristotle, Metaphysics 1.1). But he derived his classification of those delights from a long tradition of Pythagorean, Platonic, and Peripatetic texts on the proper objects of natural desire, distilled in Ibn Sina’s On First Philosophy.
The first of these three, the soul’s delight in its apprehension of beauty, was wholly original. It doesn’t appear in the pertinent sources. It refers to the “proportion” (proportio) between the sensory impression and its object, the sensory impression of a sunset, for example, and the sunset itself. Thus, beauty is subject to truth. The greater the degree of similarity between the sensory impression of an object and the object, the greater degree its truth and thus its beauty. The second, agreeableness, was common in the pertinent sources. It refers to the proportion between the sensory impression and the media through which it passes. A pleasant light, for example, is proportional to its media. A blinding light is disproportional. The third, goodness, was also common. It refers to the proportion between a sensory impression and the needs of the recipient, like a cool glass of water on a hot day.
Bonaventure aligned particular delights with particular senses, beauty with sight, agreeableness with hearing or smell, and goodness with taste or touch, but he does so “through appropriation in the manner of speech” (appropriate loquendo), that is, to “speak” about what is “proper” to each sense, not what is exclusive to each of them. The soul’s delight in the beauty of an object is most proper to sight, not restricted to it, and so, too, for the other forms of delight and their proper senses. The soul can also delight in the beauty of the sound of well-proportioned verse, the smell of a well-proportioned perfume, the taste of well-proportioned ingredients, or even the touch of a well-proportioned body. The soul is able to access beauty through all its senses and the loss of one or more of them does not deny it the opportunity to delight in the beauty of the world.
Finally, it is important to note that he distinguished between the beautiful, agreeable, and good properties within the soul’s apprehensions of things, not beautiful, agreeable, or good things. The same objects are, at once, beautiful, agreeable, and good.
The similarity between Bonaventure’s distinction of the soul’s delight in speciositas, suavitas, and salubritas and Kant’s seminal distinction of the beautiful (das Schöne), the agreeable (das Angenehme), and the good (das Gute) is striking (Kant, Critique of Judgment 5). But the lists are not coordinate. Bonaventure’s concept of suavitas is comparable to Kant’s concept of das Angenehme, but neither his conceptualization of speciositas to Kant’s das Schöne nor his conceptualization of salubritas to Kant’s das Gute. Bonaventure’s conceptualization of the soul’s pleasure in the apprehension of beauty, speciositas, depends on the degree of correspondence between the soul’s apprehension of the sensible species and its proper object, not on the free play of the mind’s higher cognitive faculties, the intellect and the imagination; and his conceptualization of the pleasure in salubritas depends on the wholesomeness of the object, not on the degree of esteem or approval we place upon it. Nor is there evidence for Kant’s familiarity with Bonaventure’s text. The best explanation for the similarity is that Kant relied on the common themes of antiquity, namely, the beauty of proper proportions and the pleasure in the contemplation of them, and perhaps common texts, but not Bonaventure’s direct influence on Kant.
Bonaventure brought his account of this epistemological process to completion in its third stage, rational judgment (diiudicatio). It is in this stage, and only this stage, that the soul determines the reason for its delight, and it does so in its abstraction of concepts, the metaphysical forms in re, from the sensory species in its apprehension. He developed an innovative two-part process to account for the rational soul’s abstraction of the sensible species: an Aristotelian abstraction theory of concept formation and a Platonic doctrine of divine illumination that rendered its judgments on the basis of those species certain. Most other philosophers depended on one or the other, or principally one or the other, not both.
i. The Agent Intellect
Bonaventure depended on the common distinction between two fundamental powers (potentia) of the intellect for his development of an abstraction theory of concept formation: the active power (intellectus agens) and the passive (intellectus possibilis). The active power abstracts the intelligible forms from the sensory species and impresses them in the intellect. The passive power receives the impressions of those intelligible forms. But he also insisted that the agent power subsists in one and the same substance (substantia) with the possible. He did so to distinguish his theory from those who identified the active power with a distinct substance, the Divine Being or a semi-divine intelligence. If so, this would render the human person entirely passive in its acquisition of knowledge and reduce its dignity as a rational creature in the image of God. Thus, the phrase “intellectus agens” refers to a distinction (differentia) in the action of one and the same intellectual faculty. It is a natural “light” that “shines” on the intelligible properties of the sensible species and reveals them. It makes them “known” and then “impresses” them upon the intellect. It also depends on the potential of the intellect to do so. The agent power, in itself, cannot retain the impression of the forms, and the intellect’s potential, in itself, is unable to abstract them. The intellect requires the interdependent actions of both its active and passive powers to function properly.
ii. Divine Illumination
Bonaventure insisted that the rational soul possesses the innate ability to abstract the intelligible species from the impressions of its sensory apprehension and thus come to know the created order without the assistance of the Divine Being or other, semi-divine intelligences. But he also insisted that the soul requires the assistance of the illumination of the forms in the Eternal Art (ante rem) to do so with certitude.
Bonaventure presented his doctrine of divine illumination in the context of his epistemological argument for the existence of God. The rational soul is fallible, and the object of its knowledge in the physical realm of being is mutable. Thus, it relies on a divine “light” that is infallible and immutable to render its abstraction of the metaphysical forms from its sensory apprehension infallible and the object of its knowledge immutable. But precisely how this occurs has been the subject of a wide range of debate (Cullen, Bonaventure 77-87). Gioberti had placed Bonaventure within the tradition of Malebranche and other advocates of ontologism, who had argued that the soul has direct access to the divine forms as they exist in the Eternal Art ante rem. Portalie had placed him within the tradition of Augustine who, so Portalie insisted, had argued that the Eternal Art impresses the forms directly on the rational soul. (Note, however, that Augustine’s theory of illumination is also the subject of a wide range of debate.) Gilson argued for a formalist position in which the rational soul depends on the light of the divine forms to judge the accuracy, objectivity, and certainty of its conceptual knowledge, but denied its role in the formation of concepts.
Gendreau pioneered the current consensus that endorses an interpretative synthesis between Portalie’s reading of Bonaventure’s doctrine and Gilson’s (Gendreau, The Quest for Certainty). Bonaventure explicitly affirmed that the “light” of the forms in the Eternal Art, but not the forms as they exist in the Eternal Art ante rem, “shines” on the soul to “motivate” and “regulate” its abstraction of the intelligible forms from its sensory apprehension of the physical realm of being. But he explicitly denied that it is the “sole” principle in “its full clarity”. Furthermore, if the soul possessed direct access to the divine forms in the Eternal Art (ante rem) or if that Art impressed those forms directly onto its faculties (post rem), there would be no need for the agent power of the intellect to abstract the forms from the sensory species (in re). Bonaventure would have undermined his careful effort to delineate the subtle distinctions between the agent power of the intellect and the possible in their role in concept formation.
Thus, Bonaventure developed a cooperative epistemology in which the Eternal Art projects some type of image of the divine forms ante rem onto the rational soul’s higher cognitive faculties, its memory, intellect, and will. But this projection is not the “sole” principle of cognition. The rational soul “sees” its abstraction of the intelligible forms within itself (post rem) in the “light” of the projection of the forms in the Eternal Art, and this light enables it to overcome the imperfection of its abstraction of the intelligible forms and renders its knowledge of them certain—although it does not see the forms ante rem in themselves, that is, in their full clarity. Nevertheless, Bonaventure did not think that the projection of this light of the Eternal Art was fully determinative. The soul could and would occasionally err in its judgment of the intelligible forms within itself even in light of the projection of the Eternal Art through either natural defect or willful ignorance.
6. Moral Philosophy
The goal of Bonaventure’s moral philosophy is happiness, a state of beatitude in which the soul satisfies its fundamental desire to know and love God (Bonaventure, 4 Sent. d. 49, p. 1, a. 1, q. 2). He admitted that the human person must attend to the needs of its body—at least in this lifetime. His emphasis on the virtue of charity and the care of the lepers, the poor, and others in need, in body and soul, attests to that commitment (Bonaventure, Legenda maior 1.5-6). But while necessary, the satisfaction of these physical needs remains insufficient. The rational soul is the essential core of the human person and thus the soul and its needs set the terms for its happiness in this life and the next.
The structure of the rational soul established its proper end. Its rational faculties, its memory, intellect, and will, worked in close cooperation with one another in its effort to know and love the full extent of the cosmos in the physical realm of being, the intelligible, and the divine until it comes “face to face” with the divine in an ecstatic union that defies rational analysis. Bonaventure readily admitted that the soul finds delight in its contemplation of the physical realm of being. Indeed, he encouraged the proper measure of the soul’s delight in “the origin, magnitude, multitude, plenitude, operation, order, and beauty” of the full extent of the physical realm of being (Bonaventure, Itinerarium 1:14). But, Bonaventure argued, the soul’s knowledge and love of the physical realm of being fails to provide full satisfaction. Even if the soul could plumb the full extent of its depths, it would still fail to satisfy. The physical realm of being comes from nothing (ex nihilo) and is therefore fundamentally nothing in itself. “Everything is vanity (vanitas), says the teacher” (Ecclesiastes 1:1). It is fleeting (vanum) and vain (vanitas) and, at most, provides a fleeting degree of satisfaction (Bonaventure, Ecclesiastae c. 1, p. 1, a. 1). So, too, the intelligible realm. Even if the soul could come to a full comprehension of itself, it comes from nothing. Thus, per the process of elimination, the soul finds its satisfaction only in its knowledge and love of Divine Being, Being Itself, the Pure Act of Being, first, eternal, simple, actual, perfect, and unsurpassed in its unity and splendor.
Bonaventure reinforced this argument with a careful analysis of Aristotle’s conception of happiness in the first book of the Nicomachean Ethics. He pointed out that the Philosopher had defined happiness as the soul’s practice or possession of its proper excellence (areté). Thus, the human person, precisely as a rational animal, finds happiness in its rational contemplation of truth and, in particular, the highest truth of the first, eternal, immutable cause of every other thing, the contemplation of the Thought that Thinks Itself.
Bonaventure accepted much of Aristotle’s account of happiness, but relied on Augustine’s critique of eudaimonism in the City of God to point out three critical errors: (1) it lacks the permanence of immortality, (2) the contemplation of abstract truth is insufficient, and (3) the soul cannot attain its proper end in itself (Bonaventure, Breviloquium 2.9). He argued, contra Aristotle, that the soul’s perfect happiness is found in its eternal knowledge and love of the highest truth in an ecstatic union with the concrete instantiation of that truth in the Divine Being, not merely the rational contemplation of that Divine Truth. He also argued, contra Aristotle, that the soul relied on the assistance (gratia) of the Divine Being to ensure that it comes to its proper end in union with the Divine Being.
Bonaventure proposed two means to attain this end. The first was the rational reductio of the physical realm of being and, through self-reflection, the intelligible, to its fundamental causes, efficient, formal, and final, in the First Principle. The second, the practice of the virtues, the moral counterpart to the soul’s rational ascent in its effort to know and love the First Principle and come to its proper end in union with that Principle.
Bonaventure relied primarily on Aristotle to derive his definition of virtue in its proper sense: a rationally determined voluntary disposition (habitus) that consists in a mean [between extremes] (Bonaventure 2 Sent. d. 27, dub. 3). The definition requires some explanation. First, Bonaventure insisted that the higher faculties of the rational soul, its memory, intellect, and will, worked in close cooperation with one another to exercise the free decision of its will (liberum arbitrium). The process begins in the memory, the depths of the human person, in which the First Principle infused the dispositions of the virtues. The process continues in the intellect that, with the cooperation of the light of divine illumination, recognizes those dispositions and directs its will to act on them. The process comes to its end in an act of the will that freely chooses to put them into practice.
Second, Bonaventure argued that all the virtues reside in the rational faculties of the soul, its memory, intellect, and will, and not in its sensory appetites, such as its natural desire for those things that benefit its health. He provided a number of reasons to support his claim, but two are of particular importance. First, some of the virtues may be prior to others in the sense that love, discussed below, is the form of all the other virtues, but all of them are equal in the degree to which they provide a source of merit. Bonaventure had argued that the rational soul is unable to reform itself. Thus, it relies on divine grace to help it reform itself in a process of cooperative development in which the soul’s efforts merit divine assistance. Second, the rational faculties render free decision possible, and free decision, in cooperation with divine grace, is the essential criterion for merit.
Finally, Bonaventure’s insistence on the mean between extremes in the practice of virtue corrects the tendency to read him and other medieval philosophers through the lens of a dichotomy in which the pilgrim soul must choose between heaven and earth. Bonaventure, as mentioned, encouraged the rational soul to delight in the physical realm of being in its proper measure. Nevertheless, his conception of this proper measure is often rather closer to dearth than excess. He practiced a degree of asceticism that while not as extraordinary as his spiritual father, St Francis, exceeded even the standards of his own day. His conception of a middle way consisted in the minimum necessary for sustenance and the practice of one’s vocation (Bonaventure, Hexaëmeron 5.4). He provided a memorable rebuke to illustrate this standard. In response to the criticism that a person requires a modest degree of possessions to practice the mean between the extremes of dearth and excess, Bonaventure replied that having sexual intercourse with half the potential partners in the world is hardly the proper mean between having intercourse with all of them and none. One, he argued, would suffice.
Bonaventure also argued, contra Aristotle, that virtue in its most proper sense referred to an infused disposition of the soul in fidelity to the Platonic tradition passed down through Augustine and the orthodox doctrines of the Christian theological tradition. But this posed a problem. Is Aristotle correct in his claim that virtue is an acquired disposition of the soul or is Augustine correct? Bonaventure’s solution is not entirely clear. He appeared to reject Aristotle on this point and almost every other in the critical edition of his final but unfinished treatise, the Collations on the Six Days of Creation. But DeLorme has edited another reportatio of the Collations in which Bonaventure provided a more subtle critique of Aristotle and his commentators. The weight of evidence suggests that DeLorme’s edition of the Collations is more accurate. Bonaventure appears to have argued that virtue is an infused disposition of the soul, but it does not fully determine the free decision of its will. Rather, the First Principle plants the seeds (rationes seminales) of virtue in the soul, and that soul must carefully cultivate them, with the further assistance of divine grace, to bring them to fruition.
Bonaventure presented long lists of virtues, gifts of the sprit, and beatitudes in the development of his moral philosophy (Bonaventure, 3 Sent. d. 23-36; Breviloquium 5.4; Hexaëmeron 5:2-13 and 6.6-32). These include: the theological virtues, faith, hope, and love; the cardinal virtues, justice, temperance, fortitude, and prudence; the intellectual virtues of science, art, prudence, understanding, and wisdom—some virtues, such as prudence, appear in more than one category; the gifts of the spirit, fear of the lord, piety, knowledge, fortitude, counsel, understanding, and wisdom; and the beatitudes, poverty of spirit, meekness, mourning, thirst for justice, mercy, cleanliness of heart, and peace. The authors of the secondary literature on Bonaventure’s moral philosophy tend to restrict themselves to the virtues, but the distinction between them and other dispositions of the soul is slight. Bonaventure derived the theological virtues from the scriptures and placed them in the same broad category as the cardinal and intellectual virtues. Furthermore, all three of the categories—the virtues, gifts, and beatitudes—dispose the soul to the rational consideration of the mean, and they do so to order the soul to its proper end.
Bonaventure insisted that all of the virtues and, per extension, the gifts and beatitudes, retain the same degree of value in relation to their end. Nevertheless, some of them are more fundamental than others, namely, love, justice, humility, poverty, and peace.
Love is the first and most important of the virtues (Bonaventure, Breviloquium 5.8). It is the metaphysical form of the other virtues and common to all of them. It brings them into being and renders them effective. Without love, the other virtues exist in the rational soul in potentia, and thus fail to dispose the soul’s will to its proper end. It also provides the fundamental impetus (pondus inclinationis) that inclines the affections of the will to the First Principle, itself, others, and, finally, its body and the full extent of the physical realm of being. Bonaventure’s ethics, like Francis’, includes a substantial degree of regard for the wider world in itself and as a sign (signum) that testifies to the existence of the First Principle in its causal dependence on that Principle.
Justice is the “sum” of the virtues (Bonaventure, De reductione artium 23). It inclines the will to the good. It further refines the proper order of its inclination to the First Principle, itself, others, and the physical realm of being and, finally, it establishes the proper measure of its affection to the First Principle, itself, and others.
Humility is the “foundation” of the virtues and the principal antidote to pride (Bonaventure, Hexaëmeron 6.12). It is the soul’s recognition that the First Principle brought it into being ex nihilo and of its inherent nothingness (nihilitatem). It thus enables the will to overcome its inordinate love for itself and love the First Principle, itself, and others in their proper order and measure.
Bonaventure relegated poverty, the most characteristic of Francis’ virtues, to a subordinate position relative to love and the other virtues to correct the tendency of some of his Franciscan brothers and sisters to take excessive pride in their practice of poverty (Bonaventure, Perfectione evangelica q. 2, a. 1). Bonaventure encouraged the practice of poverty, but argued that it is the necessary but insufficient instrumental cause of love, humility, and all the other virtues, not an end in itself. It corrects the tendency to cupidity, the narcissistic cycle in which the soul’s regard for itself dominates its regard for other things. Indeed, it is poverty that is the mean between extremes and not, as the opponents of the mendicant orders had argued, the violation of the mean.
Peace is the disposition of the will to its final end (Bonaventure, Triplica via 7). The disorder of the soul led to conflict between the soul and the First Principle, itself, others, and its body. The practice of love, justice, and the long list of virtues, gifts, and beatitudes restored the proper order of its will and dissolved that conflict. Peace is the result of that effort. It is the tranquility of the perfection of the rectitude of the will. It is the state of the soul’s complete satisfaction of its desires in its union with the First Principle.
Bonaventure delineated the soul’s progress in its practice of these virtues, gifts, and beatitudes in his reformulation of the Neo-Platonic process of the triple way (triplica via): the purgation, illumination, and perfection that renders the soul fit for its proper end in ecstatic union with the First Principle (Bonaventure, Triplica via 1). The first stage consists in the purgation of sin in which the practice of the virtues rids the soul of its tendencies toward vice, for example, the practice of love in opposition to greed, justice to malice, fortitude to weakness, and so on. The second stage consists in the imitation of Christ, Francis, and other moral exemplars. He authored a number of innovative spiritual treatises in which he asked his readers to contemplate the life of Christ, Francis, and others who modeled their lives on Christ, and then to imagine their participation in the life of Christ, to imagine that they, too, cared for the lepers, for example, to foster their practice of the virtues (Bonaventure, Lignum vitae, prol. 1-6; Legenda maior, prol. 1.5-6). The third and final stage consists in the perfect order of the soul in relation to the First Principle, itself, others, its body, and the full extent of the physical realm of being. It restored its status as an image of the First Principle (deiformitas) and rendered the soul fit for union with that Principle in the perfection of its well-ordered love (Bonaventure, Breviloquium 5.1.3).
Bonaventure’s reformulation of this hierarchic process differed from its original formulation in the Neo-Platonic tradition in three significant ways. First, the original process had been primarily epistemic and referred to the rational soul’s purgation of the metaphysical forms from the physical realm of being (in re), its illumination of those forms in the intelligible realm of being (post rem), and the perfection of those forms in the divine realm (ante rem). Second, he allotted a more significant role for the imitation of Christ and other moral exemplars in the process than even his predecessors in the Christian tradition. Finally, he insisted that the soul progresses along the three ways simultaneously. The soul engages in purgation, illumination, and perfection throughout its progress in its effort to reform itself into the ever more perfect image of the First Principle.
7. The Ascent of the Soul into Ecstasy
“This is the sum of my metaphysics: It consists in its entirety in emanation, exemplarity, and consummation, the spiritual radiations that enlighten [the soul], and leads it back to the highest reality” (Bonaventure, Hexaëmeron 1.17).
Bonaventure had argued that the rational soul’s proper end is union with its Creator. But he also argued that the rational soul, created ex nihilo, possesses a limit to its intellectual capacities that prevents the application of its proper function, reason, in the full attainment of its proper end in union with God. The human mind, Bonaventure argued, cannot fully comprehend its Creator.
Plotinus and his heirs in late antiquity, principally Proclus, developed an elegant three-part formula that provided Bonaventure with the raw material to resolve the dilemma: It began with (1) the existence of the First Principle, the One (to Hen), the foundation of the Neo-Platonic cosmos, continued in (2) the emanation (exitus) of all other things from the First Principle, and ended in (3) its recapitulation (reditus) into the First Principle.
Bonaventure did not possess direct access to the formula. He relied on Augustine, Dionysius, and Dionysius’s heirs in the medieval west, Hugh, Richard, and Thomas Gallus of the School of St. Victor, to access the formula, and refine it into a viable solution. He contracted the first two movements of the process into one, “emanation” (emanatio), and reformulated his contraction in two significant ways (Bonaventure, Hexaëmeron 1.17). First, Plotinus and other classical Neo-Platonists envisioned a linear exitus, the First Principle “expresses” Itself in a series of distinct hypostases, the Nous, the Psyché, and its further expression into the intelligible and physical realms of being from eternity (ab aeterno). Bonaventure divided that exitus into two distinct movements: (1) the “emanation” of the First Principle (Principium) that exists in one substance with Its Eternal Art and Spirit ab aeterno and (2) the further “emanation” of that First Principle, in its perfect perichoresis—its reciprocal coinherence—with Its Art and Spirit, in Its creation of the intelligible and physical realms of being in time and ex nihilo.
Second, he interposed a middle term, so to speak, in the process, “exemplarity” (exemplaritas). The created realm of being exemplifies its origins in the First Principle in Its perfect perichoresis with Its Art and Spirit through a carefully graded series of resemblances (Bonaventure, 1 Sent. d. 3). The first degree of its resemblance, the shadow (umbra), exemplified its indeterminate causal dependence on the First Principle. The second degree, the vestige (vestigium), exemplified its determinate causal dependence, efficient, formal, and final, on the First Principle. The third degree, the image (imago), exemplified its explicit dependence on the First Principle in Its perfect perichoresis with Its Eternal Art and Spirit. Bonaventure would abandon the first degree of resemblance, the shadow, in his latter works and introduce a fourth, the moral reformation of the soul into a more perfect image, the similitude (similitudo), fit for union with the First Principle.
Bonaventure also reimagined the final stage of the Neo-Platonic process as a “consummation” (consummatio) that consisted of two movements: (1) the soul’s recognition of the carefully graded series of resemblances, the “spiritual radiations that enlighten the soul” and testify to its causal dependence on the “highest reality” of the First Principle, in Its perfect perichoresis with Its Eternal Art and Spirit, and (2) its transformation into a more perfect image (similitudo) of the First Principle that fits it for union with that Principle, Its Art, and Spirit. Thus, he explained, the process curves into itself “in the manner of an intelligible circle” and ends in principium (Bonaventure, Mysterio Trinitatis q. 8 ad 7).
Bonaventure provided a particularly rich account of his reformulation of this Neo-Platonic process in his most celebrated text, the Itinerarium mentis in Deum. It is a difficult text to categorize. It is a philosophical text, but not exclusively. It is a philosophical text steeped in a Neo-Platonic Christian tradition that relies heavily on the data of revelation contained in the Christian scriptures and the spiritual practices of the thirteenth century to construct a Platonic Ladder of Love in the context of that syncretic tradition. Bonaventure’s distinction between philosophy and theology provides the means to distinguish the philosophical core of the text from its theological setting—with occasional reference to its theological dimensions to provide a comprehensive analysis of each rung of that ladder.
Bonaventure derived the initial division of the rungs of that ladder from the Neo-Platonic division of the cosmos that permeates so much of his thought: the rational soul’s contemplation of the vestige (vestigium) of the First Principle in the physical realm of being (esse), its contemplation of the image (imago) of the First Principle in the intelligible realm of being, and its contemplation of the First Principle in Itself in the divine realm of being that prepares it for union with that Principle. The path is a deft harmony of Dionysius’ contrast between the soul’s cataphatic contemplation of creation—in which it applies its intellect—and its apophatic contemplation of the divine—in which it suspends its intellect in mystical union (McGinn, “Ascension and Introversion”). The soul moves from its contemplation of the physical realm of being outside itself, to its contemplation of the intelligible realm of being within itself, and ends in the contemplation of the divine above itself.
He further subdivided each of these three stages of contemplation into two, for a total of six steps. The first step in each stage focuses on that stage’s testimony to (per) the First Principle, the second to the presence of the First Principle in that stage. This pattern dissolves in the soul’s contemplation of the First Principle in Itself in the third stage. The first step on this stage focuses on the contemplation of the First Principle as the One God of the Christian tradition. The second stage focuses on the contemplation of the emanation of the One God in Three Hypostases or, more commonly, Persons. The ascent comes to its end in a seventh step in which the soul enters into an ecstatic union with the First Principle in Its perfect perichoresis with Its Eternal Art and Spirit. The philosophical core of the text is particularly apparent on steps one, three, and five, and the theological core on steps two, four, and six. The two come together on the seventh step.
It is also important to reiterate that Bonaventure insisted on the necessity of grace for the soul to achieve its goal contra Plotinus and his immediate heirs in classical antiquity, Porphyry, Iamblichus, and Proclus. Thus, Bonaventure included a series of prayers and petitions to the First Principle, the incarnation of the Eternal Art in the person of Christ, St. Francis, Bonaventure’s spiritual father, and other potential patrons to “guide the feet” of the pilgrim soul in its ascent into “that peace that surpasses all understanding” (Philippians 4:7) in its union with the First Principle.
The first step of the soul’s ascent consists in its rational reductio of the vestige of the physical realm of being to its efficient, formal, and final cause in the First Principle. Bonaventure relied on yet another reformulation of a Neo-Platonic triad to align each of these causes with particular properties of the First Principle: the power of the First Principle as the efficient cause that created the physical realm of being ex nihilo, the wisdom of the First Principle as the formal cause that formed the physical realm of being, and the goodness of that Principle as the final cause that leads it to its proper end in union with Itself. The rational soul relies on the testimony of the entire physical realm of being to achieve this union, “the origin, magnitude, multitude, plenitude, operation, order, and beauty of all things” (Bonaventure, Itinerarium 1.14), even though the rest of that realm will end in a final conflagration (Bonaventure, Breviloquium 7.4). It will have served its purpose and persist only in the memory of rational beings.
Bonaventure paired this philosophical argument with an analogy that takes the reader into the theological dimensions of the text: The power, wisdom, and goodness of God suggests some degree of distinction within the First Principle. The power of the First Principle points to God the Father as the efficient cause of all other things, Its wisdom to the Son, the Eternal Art, as the formal cause, and Its goodness to the Spirit as the final cause through “appropriation in the manner of speech” (appropriate loquendo). Bonaventure insisted that, properly speaking, the One God, the First Principle in Its perfect perichoresis with Its Art and Spirit, is the efficient, formal, and final cause of all things, but he also insisted that it is proper to attribute particular properties to each of the Divine Persons to distinguish them from one another. Nevertheless, he admitted that the analogical argument remained inconclusive. The rational soul, without the light of divine revelation, is able to realize that creation testifies to the power, wisdom, and goodness of the First Principle, but it is not able to realize that the power, wisdom, and goodness of that Principle testifies to Its existence in Three Persons.
The second step consists in the soul’s contemplation of the epistemological process, its apprehension, delight, and judgment of the sensory species of the physical realm of being. Its contemplation of this process reveals that it depends on the presence of the “light” of the Eternal Art in its cooperative effort to discern certain truth through the careful consideration of the propositions of the epistemological argument: It possesses certain truth, but it is fallible and the object of its knowledge mutable, so it relies on the “light” of the Eternal Art to render itself infallible and the object of its knowledge immutable. But the thrust of this step is the derivation of the first of three analogies between the epistemological process and distinct types of mysticism. If the soul looks at the “light” of the Eternal Art, so to speak, rather than the intelligible forms post rem it illumines, then the epistemological process becomes the occasion for an epistemic mysticism in which the soul apprehends, delights, and judges a Divine Species of the Eternal Art, although not the Eternal Art Itself, in its epistemological union with the Eternal Art.
The third step consists in the soul’s contemplation of itself as an image (imago) of the First Principle in its higher faculties of memory, intellect, and will. These, too, testify to the power of the First Principle as the efficient cause that created it ex nihilo, the wisdom of the First Principle as the formal cause that formed it, and the goodness of that Principle as the final cause that leads it to its proper end in its union with Itself. But the analogical argument is more prominent on this step. The rational soul is one substance (ousia) that consists of three distinct faculties, memory, intellect, and will, and this suggests that the First Principle, which is one in substance, consists of three distinct persons, Father, Son, and Spirit. But again, the analogical argument remains inconclusive without the benefit of the light of revelation.
The fourth step consists in the soul’s contemplation of its moral reformation into a more perfect image or similitude (similitudo) of the First Principle through its progress on the triplica via of purgation, illumination, and perfection in its practice of the virtues. Bonaventure insisted that its moral reformation depends on the presence of the Eternal Art in the person of Christ as a moral principle, similar to its dependence on the Eternal Art as an epistemological principle, to motivate and guide its pursuit of perfection. But the thrust of this step is the derivation of the second of three analogies between the epistemological process and distinct types of mysticism. The soul’s progress along the triplica via restores its “spiritual” senses. It is able to see, hear, smell, taste, and touch the Divine Species of the Eternal Art in the form of the mystical presence of Christ, delight in that Species, and judge the reasons for its delight in a type of nuptial mysticism, like “the Bride in the Song of Solomon,” Bonaventure explains, who “rests wholly on her beloved” (Song of Solomon 8:5)—a thinly veiled reference to the intimacy of sexual union.
The fifth step consists in the soul’s direct contemplation of the First Principle as Being Itself in its careful analysis of the propositions of his reformulation of the ontological argument. The concept of beings falls into three initial categories: non-being, being-in-potency, and being-in-act. The concept of non-being is a privation of being and presupposes the concept of being. The concept of being-in-potency presupposes the concept of being-in-act. If so, the concept of being-in-act depends on the concept of a “pure” act of being without potential and this final concept is being itself (ipsum esse). But this “pure” act of being does not fall within the category of the physical realm of being “which is mixed with potency”. It does exist within the intelligible realm of being, but not entirely so. If it existed in the rational soul and only in the soul, it would exist only as a concept, and thus possess “only a minimal degree of being”. And so, per the process of elimination, being itself is the Divine Being.
Bonaventure extended this ontological argument on the sixth step to provide rational justification for the theological doctrine of the One God in Three Persons. He began with the Neo-Platonic concept of the One (to Hen) as the Self-Diffusive Good. He derived this definition principally from the Neo-Platonic tradition, particularly Dionysius, for whom the “Good” was the perfect and preeminent name of God, the name that subsumed all other names (Dionysius, Divine Names 3.1 and 4.1-35). But he also derived it from his notion of the transcendental properties of being that “transcended” the traditional Peripatetic division of things into the categories of substance and accident and thus applied to all beings, physical, intelligible, and divine. He identified three and only three of these “highest notions” of being: unity, truth, and goodness—although he listed others, notably beauty, as second, third, or fourth order properties of being (Aertsen, “Beauty in the Middle Ages”). So, the Divine Being Itself, the highest Being, is also the highest unity, truth, and goodness. The good is self-diffusive per definitionem and the highest good, the most self-diffusive—a proposition he inherited from the Neo-Platonists. Thus, Divine Being Itself diffuses Itself in a plurality of Divine Hypostases, God the Father, Son, and Spirit.
Bonaventure brought his account of the soul’s ascent to its proper end in a direct encounter with the First Principle in Itself, in Its perfect perichoreses with Its Eternal Art and Spirit. He stands in a long tradition of philosophers who had attempted to provide a description of that mystical experience: Plato, Plotinus, Dionysius, and Bonaventure’s immediate predecessors, Hugh, Richard, and Thomas Gallus of the School of St. Victor. All of them have fallen short—perhaps necessarily so. Bonaventure began his attempt with an analogy of the epistemological process, the apprehension, delight, and judgment of the sensory speices, but he deliberately undermined his own effort. He relied on two rhetorical devices he derived from Dionysius’ Mystical Theology to do so. The first is a series of denials of the soul’s intellectual capabilities that he drew from Dionysius’ practice of negative theology, the soul sees, but it does so in a dark light, it hears, but in the silence of secrets whispered in the dark, it learns, but it learns in ignorance. The second is a series of metaphors, the fire of the affections of the will, the blindness of the intellect and its slumber, the hanging, crucifixion, and death of the soul’s cognitive faculties in its inability to comprehend the incomprehensible.
Bonaventure’s rhetoric, similar to the excess of Plato, Plotinus, and others in the same tradition, has supported a wide range of interpretation (McGinn, Flowering, 189-205). Some scholars emphasized the cognitive dimensions of the soul’s contemplation of the First Principle even if the object of its vision exceeded its cognitive capabilities in a vision, so to speak, of a light so bright it blinded the intellect so that it seemed to see nothing. Others emphasized the affective dimensions of the experience. The soul’s contemplation of the First Principle is a type of experiential knowledge in which the affections of the will outpace the intellect in “that peace which surpasses all understanding”. Still others disengaged the rational faculties of the soul from the experience in their entirety.
McGinn laid the groundwork for the current consensus that argues for a mean between these extremes. The soul’s cognitive faculties remain intact, but the object of their contemplation exceeds their capabilities. The soul knows, but it is an experiential knowledge, not propositional. It may even strive to know in the so-called proper, propositional intension of the concept—after all, it possesses the inclination to do so. But it fails. It knows the First Principle in Its eternal perichoresis with Its Art and Spirit in the sense that it experiences the real presence of that Principle. But it cannot apprehend that Principle, it cannot abstract an intelligible species of that Principle, it cannot imagine, compound, divide, estimate, or remember that Principle. Nevertheless, it experiences the immediate presence of that Principle, Its Art, and Its Spirit that remains forever inexplicable—an experience that ignites its affections to an unfathomable degree of intensity. “Let it be, let it be”, Bonaventure pleaded as he brought his account of the soul’s ascent to a close. “Amen” (Bonaventure, Itinerarium 7.6).
8. References and Further Reading
a. Critical Editions
- Doctoris Seraphici S. Bonaventurae Opera Omnia. 10 vols. Quaracchi: Collegium S. Bonaventurae, 1882-1902.
- This is the current standard critical edition of Bonaventure’s works. Since its publication, scholars have determined that a small portion of its contents are spurious. See A. Horowski and P. Maranesi, listed below, for recent discussions of the question.
- Breviloquium. In Opuscula Varia Theologica, 199-292. S. Bonaventurae Opera Omnia. Vol. 5. Quaracchi: Collegium S. Bonaventurae, 1882-1902.
- The Breviloquium is a short summary of Bonaventure’s philosophical theology.
- Christus unus omnium magister. In Opuscula Varia Theologica, 567-574. S. Bonaventurae Opera Omnia. Vol. 5. Quaracchi: Collegium S. Bonaventurae, 1882-1902.
- Christ the One Master of All is an academic sermon that contains a discussion of Bonaventure’s theory of the forms and divine illumination.
- Collationes in Hexaëmeron. In Opuscula Varia Theologica, 327-454. S. Bonaventurae Opera Omnia. Vol. 5. Quaracchi: Collegium S. Bonaventurae, 1882-1902.
- The Collations on the Six Days of Creation is Bonaventure’s final and one of his most important texts in philosophical theology. It remained unfinished at the time of his death. This reportatio of the Collationes contains a harsh criticism of Aristotle and the radical Aristotelians. See also DeLorme’s edition below.
- Collationes in Hexaëmeron et Bonaventuriana Quaedam Selecta. Edited by F. Delorme. In Bibliotheca Franciscana Scholastica Medii Aevi. Vol. 8. Quaracchi: Collegium S. Bonaventurae, 1934.
- DeLorme based his edition of the Collationes in Hexaëmeron on a single manuscript. It contains a less harsh criticism of Aristotle and the radical Aristotelians. Scholars remain divided on the question of which reportatio is more authentic.
- Commentarius in librum Ecclesiastae. In Commentarii in Sacram Scripturam, 1-103. S. Bonaventurae Opera Omnia. Vol. 6. Quaracchi: Collegium S. Bonaventurae, 1882-1902.
- Bonaventure’s Commentary on the Book of Ecclesiastes contains a discussion of the concept of non-being and the inherent nothingness of the world.
- Commentarius in I Librum Sententiarum: De Dei Unitate et Trinitate. Doctoris Seraphici S. Bonaventurae Opera Omnia. Vol. 1. Quaracchi: Collegium S. Bonaventurae, 1882-1902.
- The First Book of the Commentary on the Sentences is Bonaventure’s most extensive discussion of his philosophy and philosophical theology of the One God, the First Principle, in Three Persons.
- Commentarius in II Librum Sententiarum: De Rerum Creatione et Formatione Corporalium et Spiritualium . Doctoris Seraphici S. Bonaventurae Opera Omnia. Vol. 2. Quaracchi: Collegium S. Bonaventurae, 1882-1902.
- The Second Book of the Commentary on the Sentences contains Bonaventure’s most extensive discussion on creation.
- Commentarius in IV Librum Sententiarum: De Doctrina Signorum. Doctoris Seraphici S. Bonaventurae Opera Omnia. Vol. 1. Quaracchi: Collegium S. Bonaventurae, 1882-1902.
- The fourth book of the Sentences, On the Sacraments, contains Bonaventure’s exhaustive treatise on sacramental theology, but it also contains passages on his philosophy and philosophical psychology of the human person.
- Itinerarium mentis in Deum. In Opuscula Varia Theologica, 293-316. S. Bonaventurae Opera Omnia. Vol. 5. Quaracchi: Collegium S. Bonaventurae, 1882-1902.
- The Itinerarium is Bonaventure’s treatise on the soul’s ascent into God and his most popular work.
- Lignum vitae. In Opuscula Varia ad Theologiam Mysticam, 68-87. Doctoris Seraphici S. Bonaventurae Opera Omnia. Vol. 8. Quaracchi: Collegium S. Bonaventurae, 1882-1902.
- The Tree of Life is Bonaventure’s innovative life of Christ and an often neglected source for his virtue theory.
- Quaestiones disputatae de scientia Christi. In Opuscula Varia Theologica, 1-43. S. Bonaventurae Opera Omnia. Vol. 5. Quaracchi: Collegium S. Bonaventurae, 1882-1902.
- The Disputed Questions on the Knowledge of Christ contains information on philosophical psychology and epistemology. The fourth question is a detailed discussion of divine illumination.
- Quaestiones disputatae de mysterio Ss. Trinitatis. In Opuscula Varia Theologica, 45-115. S. Bonaventurae Opera Omnia. Vol. 5. Quaracchi: Collegium S. Bonaventurae, 1882-1902.
- The Disputed Questions on the Mystery of the Trinity contains a detailed series of debates on the existence and nature of the First Principle. The first article of each quesiton is philosophical. The second theological.
- Quaestiones disputatae de perfectione evangelica. In Opuscula Varia Theologica, 117-198. S. Bonaventurae Opera Omnia. Vol. 5. Quaracchi: Collegium S. Bonaventurae, 1882-1902.
- The Disputed Questions on Evangelical Perfection is an important text in moral philosophy and philosophical theology.
- Opusculam de reductione artium ad theologiam. In Opuscula Varia Theologica, 317-326. S. Bonaventurae Opera Omnia. Vol. 5. Quaracchi: Collegium S. Bonaventurae, 1882-1902.
- On the Reduction of the Arts to Theology contains a discussion of philosophy and its distinction from philosophical theology.
- De triplici via. In Opuscula Varia ad Theologiam Mysticam, 3-27. Doctoris Seraphici S. Bonaventurae Opera Omnia. Vol. 8. Quaracchi: Collegium S. Bonaventurae, 1882-1902.
- The Triple Way is Bonaventure’s treatise on spiritual and moral reformation.
- Doctoris Seraphici S. Bonaventurae Opera Theologica Selecta. 5 vols. Quaracchi: Collegium S. Bonaventurae, 1934-1965.
- This is a smaller edition of the Commentary on the Sentences and three short works, the Breviloquium, the Itinerarium, and the De reductione artium ad theologiam. The text is complete but the critical appartus is significantly reduced.
- Legenda Maior. In Analecta Franciscana 10 (1941): 555-652.
- This is the revised critical edition of the Longer Life of St. Francis, and another often neglected source for Bonaventure’s virtue theory.
b. Translations into English
- Bonaventure: The Soul’s Journey into God, The Tree of Life, The Life of St. Francis. Translated by E. Cousins. New York: Paulist Press, 1978.
- Cousins’ translations of these short but influential works is refreshingly dynamic but faithful.
- “Christ, the One Teacher of All”. In What Manner of Man: Sermons on Christ by Bonaventure, 21-55. Translated by Z. Hayes. Chicago: Franciscan Herald Press, 1974.
- Breviloquium. Edited by D. V. Monti. Works of Bonaventure. Vol. 9. St. Bonaventure, NY: The Franciscan Institute of St. Bonaventure University, 2005.
- Collations on the Hexaemeron. Edited by J. M. Hammond. Works of Bonaventure. Vol. 18. St. Bonaventure, NY: The Franciscan Institute of St. Bonaventure University, 2018.
- Commentary on Ecclesiastes. Edited by R. J. Harris and C. Murray. Works of Bonaventure. Vol. 7. St. Bonaventure, NY: The Franciscan Institute of St. Bonaventure University, 2005.
- Commentary on the Sentences: The Philosophy of God. Edited by R. E. Houser and T. B. Noone. Works of Bonaventure. Vol. 16. St. Bonaventure, NY: The Franciscan Institute of St. Bonaventure University, 2013.
- This rather large volume contains only a small selection of texts from the Commentary on the First Book of the Sentences.
- Disputed Questions on Evangelical Perfection. Edited by R. J. Harris and T. Reist. Works of Bonaventure. Vol. 13. St. Bonaventure, NY: The Franciscan Institute of St. Bonaventure University, 2008.
- Disputed Questions on the Knowledge of Christ. Edited by Zachary Hayes. Works of Bonaventure. Vol. 4. St. Bonaventure, NY: The Franciscan Institute of St. Bonaventure University, 1992.
- Disputed Questions on the Mystery of the Trinity. Edited by Z. Hayes. Works of Bonaventure. Vo. 3. St. Bonaventure, NY: The Franciscan Institute of St. Bonaventure University, 1979.
- Itinerarium Mentis in Deum. Edited by P. Boehner and Z. Hayes. Works of Bonaventure. Vol. 2. St. Bonaventure, NY: The Franciscan Institute of St. Bonaventure University, 2002.
- On the Reduction of the Arts to Theology. Edited by. Z. Hayes. Works of Bonaventure. Vol. 1. St. Bonaventure, NY: The Franciscan Institute of St. Bonaventure University, 1996.
- The Threefold Way. In Writings on the Spiritual Life, 81-133. Edited by F. E. Coughlin. Works of Bonaventure. Vol. 10. St. Bonaventure, NY: The Franciscan Institute of St. Bonaventure University, 2006.
- Works of Bonaventure. 18 vols. St. Bonaventure, NY: The Franciscan Institute of St. Bonaventure University, 1955.
- The Franciscan Institute of St. Bonaventure University, a major research center for Franciscan Studies, began to publish this series in 1955. The pace of publication has increased in recent years, but the series remains incomplete—Bonaventure authored a vast amount of material. This is the standard series of translations in English.
c. General Introductions
- Bettoni, E. S. Bonaventura. Brescia: La Suola, 1944. Translated by A. Gambatese as St Bonaventure (Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press, 1964).
- Bettoni’s St. Bonaventure is the best short work on Bonaventure’s life and thought. Unfortunately, it is out of print.
- Bougerol, G. Introduction a Saint Bonaventure. Paris: J. Vrin, 1961. Revised 1988. Translated by J. de Vinck as Introduction to the Works of St. Bonaventure (Paterson, NJ: St. Anthony Guild Press, 1963.
- Bougerol’s Introduction is an insightful commentary on the literary genres of Bonaventure’s works. Note that the English translation is of the first French edition, not the second.
- Cullen, C. M. Bonaventure. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2006.
- Cullen’s Bonaventure is the most recent comprehensive introduction to his life and thought.
- Delio, I. Simply Bonaventure. Hyde Park: New City Press, 2018.
- Delio’s Simply Bonaventure, now in its second edition, is intended for those with little or no background in medieval philosophy or theology.
- Gilson, É. La philosophie de saint Bonaventure. Paris: J. Vrin, 1924. Revised 1943. Translated by I. Trethowan and F. J. Sheed as The Philosophy of St. Bonaventure (London: Sheed and Ward, 1938. Reprinted 1940, 1965).
- Gilson’s Philosophy of St. Bonaventure is foundational. He was the first to insist on Bonaventure’s careful distinction between philosophy and theology and to identify Bonaventure as the principal representative of Christian Neo-Platonism in the Middle Ages. Note that the English translation is of an earlier edition.
- Aertsen, J. A. “Beauty in the Middle Ages: A Forgotten Transcendental?” Medieval Philosophy and Theology 1 (1991): 68-97.
- Aertsen, J. A. . Medieval Philosophy as Transcendental Thought: From Philip the Chancellor to Francisco Suárez. Leiden: Brill, 2012.
- Aertsen’s is an exhaustive study of the concept of the transcendentals with reference to Bonaventure and other philosopher-theologians in the latter Middle Ages. He refutes the widespread assumption that Bonaventure had listed beauty as a transcendental on par with the one, the true, and the good.
- Baldner, S. “St. Bonaventure and the Demonstrability of a Temporal Beginning: A Reply to Richard Davis.” American Catholic Theological Quarterly 71 (1997): 225-236.
- Baldner, S. “St. Bonaventure and the Temporal Beginning of the World.” New Scholasticism 63 (1989): 206-228.
- Baldner’s pieces are two of the more important relatively recent discussions of the question. See also Dales, Davis, and Walz.
- Bissen, J. M. L’exemplarisme divin selon saint Bonaventure. Paris: Vrin, 1929.
- This is the foundational study of Bonaventure’s exemplarism and remains unsurpassed in breadth. See also Reynolds.
- Bonnefoy, J. F. Une somme Bonaventurienne de Theologie Mystique: le De Triplici Via. Paris: Librarie Saint-François, 1934.
- This is the seminal analysis of Bonaventure’s treatise on the soul’s moral reformation.
- Bowman, L. “The Development of the Doctrine of the Agent Intellect in the Franciscan School of the Thirteenth Century.” The Modern Schoolman 50 (1973): 251–79.
- Bowman provides one of the few extensive treatments of Bonaventure’s doctrine of the agent intellect.
- Burr, D. The Spiritual Franciscans: From Protest to Persecution in the Century after Francis of Assisi. University Park, PA: The Pennsylvania State University Press, 2001.
- The first chapter provides a summary of the state of the conflict between the Fraticelli and the Conventuals during Bonaventure’s tenure as Minister General.
- Cullen, C. M. “Bonaventure’s Philosophical Method.” In A Companion to Bonaventure, 121-163. Edited by J. M. Hammond, J. A. Wayne Hellmann, and J. Goff. Leiden: Brill, 2014.
- Cullen provides a precise summary of Bonaventure as a philosopher and his method.
- Dales, R. C. Medieval Discussions of the Eternity of the World. Leiden: Brill, 1990.
- Dales locates Bonaventure in the larger stream of thought on this question. A companion volume includes the relevant Latin texts.
- Davis, R. “Bonaventure and the Arguments for the impossibility of an Infinite Temporal Regression.” American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly 70 (1996): 361-380.
- Delio, I. A Franciscan View of Creation: Learning to Live in a Sacramental World. St. Bonaventure, NY: The Franciscan Institute of St. Bonaventure University, 2003.
- Delio derives her sacramental view of creation from a careful consideration of the thought of Francis, Clare, Bonaventure, and Scotus.
- Gendreau, B. “The Quest for Certainty in Bonaventure.” Franciscan Studies 21 (1961): 104-227.
- Gendreau first proposed the current solution to the problem of Bonaventure’s theory of divine illumination. Compare with Speer.
- Horowski, A. “Opere autentiche e spurie di San Bonaventura.” In Collectanea Franciscana 86 (2016): 461-606.
- This is the most recent assessment of the current state of the critical edition of Bonaventure’s works. See also Maranesi.
- Houser, R. E. “Bonaventure’s Three-Fold Way to God.” In Medieval Masters: Essays in Honor of E. A. Synan, 91-145. Houston: University of St. Thomas Press, 1999.
- Houser’s analysis of Bonaventure’s arguments for the existence of God emphasizes their logical structure and highlights Bonaventure’s command of the formal logic of the Aristotelian tradition.
- Johnson, T. J., K. Wrisley-Shelby, and M. K. Zamora, eds. Saint Bonaventure: Friar, Teacher, Minister, Bishop: A Celebration of the Eighth Centenary of His Birth. St. Bonaventure, NY: The Franciscan Institute of St. Bonaventure University, 2020.
- A collection of papers delivered at a major conference to celebrate the eighth centenary of Bonaventure’s birth at St. Bonaventure University. It provides a thorough overview of the current state of research into Bonaventure’s philosophy, philosophical theology, and mysticism.
- Lang, H. “Bonaventure’s Delight in Sensation.” New Scholasticism 60 (1986): 72-90.
- Lang was the first to highlight the role of delight in Bonaventure’s account of the epistemological process.
- Malebranche, N. De la recherche de la verité. 1674-1675. Translated by T. M. Lennon and P. J. Olscamp, as The Search after Truth (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997).
- Malebranche presented his famous, or perhaps infamous, doctrine of the vision of God in Book 3. He was incorrect in his interpretation of Bonaventure’s epistemology. See Gendreau.
- Maranesi, P. “The Opera Omnia of St. Bonaventure: History and Present Situation.” In A Companion to Bonaventure, 61-80. Edited by J. M. Hammond, J. A. Wayne Hellmann, and J. Goff. Leiden: Brill, 2014.
- This is an indispensable assessment of the current state of the critical edition of Bonaventure’s works.
- McEvoy, J. “Microcosm and Macrocosm in the Writing of St. Bonaventure.” In S. Bonaventura 1274-1974, 2:309-343. Edited by F. P. Papini. Quaracchi: Collegium S. Bonaventurae, 1973.
- McEvoy places this theme in its wider context.
- McGinn, B. “Ascension and Introversion in the Itinerarium mentis in Deum.” In S. Bonaventura 1274-19cv74, 3:535-552. Edited by F. P. Papini. Quaracchi: Collegium S. Bonaventurae, 1973.
- McGinn, B. The Flowering of Mysticism. New York: Crossroad, 1998.
- McGinn provides a thorough introduction to the structure and content of Bonaventure’s Itinerarium in the context of the mystical practices of the latter Middle Ages with particular attention to the cognitive dimensions—or lack thereof—of the soul’s ecstatic union with the First Principle.
- McKenna, T. J. Bonaventure’s Aesthetics: The Delight of the Soul in Its Ascent into God (Lexington Books: London, 2020).
- This is the first comprehensive analysis of Bonaventure’s philosophy and philosophical theology of beauty since Balthasar’s Herrlichkeit (1961).
- Monti, D. V. and K. W. Shelby, eds. Bonaventure Revisited: Companion to the Breviloquium. St. Bonaventure, NY: The Franciscan Institute of St. Bonaventure University, 2017.
- A helpful commentary on Bonaventure’s own summary of his philosophical theology in the Breviloquium.
- Noone, T. “Divine Illumination.” In The Cambridge History of Medieval Philosophy, I: 369-383. Edited by R. Pasnau. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2010.
- Noone provides a helpful overview of the doctrine of divine illumination in the medieval west.
- Noone, T. “St. Bonaventure: Itinerarium mentis in Deum.” In Debates in Medieval Philosophy: Essential Readings and Contemporary Responses, 204-213. Edited by J. Hause. London: Routledge, 2014.
- Noone provides insight into Bonaventure’s sources for his analysis of the epistemological process.
- Panster, K. “Bonaventure and Virtue.” In Saint Bonaventure Friar, Teacher, Minister, Bishop: A Celebration of the Eighth Centenary of His Birth, 209-225. Edited by T. J. Johnson, K. Wrisley Shelby, and M. K. Zamora. St. Bonaventure, NY: The Franciscan Institute of St. Bonaventure University, 2021.
- Panster provides an insightful overview of the current state of research on Bonaventure’s virtue theory.
- Pegis, A. C. “The Bonaventurean Way to God.” Medieval Studies 29 (1967): 206-242.
- Pegis, an expert on Thomas Aquinas, was one of the first to recognize and clearly distinguish Bonaventure’s approach from Aquinas’.
- Quinn, J. F. The Historical Constitution of St. Bonaventure’s Philosophy. Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Medieval Studies, 1973.
- Quinn’s Historical Constitution includes a detailed historiographical essay on early approaches to Bonaventure’s thought. But he devotes most of the volume to an extensive if somewhat controversial analysis of Bonaveture’s epistemology—in spite of its title.
- Reynolds, P. L. “Bonaventure’s Theory of Resemblance.” Traditio 49 (2003): 219-255.
- Reynolds’ is an analytic approach to Bonaventure’s theory of exemplarity that highlights Bonaventure’s command of formal logic.
- Schaeffer, A. “Corrigenda: The Position and Function of Man in the Created World According to Bonaventure.” Franciscan Studies 22 (1962): 1.
- Schaeffer, A. “The Position and Function of Man in the Created World According to Bonaventure.” Franciscan Studies 20 (1960): 261-316 and 21 (1961): 233-382.
- Schaeffer’s remains one of the most detailed analyses of Bonaventure’s philosophy and philosophical psychology of the human person.
- Schlosser, M. “Bonaventure: Life and Works.” In A Companion to Bonaventure, 7-59. Edited by J. M. Hammond, J. A. Wayne Hellmann, and J. Goff. Leiden: Brill, 2014.
- Schlosser considers the current state of research on Bonaventure’s biography.
- Seifert, J. “Si Deus est Deus, Deus est: Reflections on St. Bonaventure’s Interpretation of St. Anselm’s Ontological Argument.” Franciscan Studies 52 (1992): 215-231.
- Seifert was the first to recognize the full force of Bonaventure’s version of the argument.
- Speer, A. “Bonaventure and the Question of a Medieval Philosophy.” Medieval Philosophy and Theology 6 (1997): 25-46.
- Speer provides a candid discussion of the question. See also Cullen on Bonaventure’s philosophical method.
- Speer, A. “Illumination and Certitude: The Foundation of Knowledge in Bonaventure.” American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly 85 (2011): 127–141.
- Speer provides further insight into Bonaventure’s doctrine of divine illumination. See also Gendreau.
- Tillich, P. Systematic Theology. 3 vols. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1973.
- Tillich acknowledges his debt to the mystical aspect Bonaventure’s doctrine of divine illumination in the introduction to the first volume of the series.
- Walz, M. D. “Theological and Philosophical Dependencies in St. Bonaventure’s Argument against an Eternal World and a Brief Thomistic Reply.” American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly 72 (1998): 75-98.
Thomas J. McKenna
U. S. A.