Robert Boyle (1627—1691)
Robert Boyle was one of the most prolific figures in the scientific revolution and the leading scientist of his day. He was a proponent of the mechanical philosophy which sought to explain natural phenomena in terms of matter and motion, rather than appealing to Aristotelian substantial forms and qualities. He was a champion of experimental science, claiming that theory should conform to observation and advocating openness in the publication of experimental results, the replication of experiments for empirical corroboration, and the importance of recording even those experiments that failed, at a time when these ideas were revolutionary. He defended and developed the distinction between primary and secondary qualities and supported it with detailed experimental evidence. With the help of his colleague Robert Hooke (1635-1703), he designed and improved an air pump capable of creating and sustaining a vacuum and used it to perform many famous experiments, investigating things like respiration, disease, combustion, sound, and air pressure. He discovered Boyle’s law, which shows that the volume and pressure of a gas are proportionally related. He used empirical evidence to refute both the four-element theory of Aristotle and the more recent three-principle theory of Paracelsus (1493-1541). Finally, many historians of science consider him to be the father of modern chemistry.
This article focuses on the philosophical significance of Boyle’s work, but it is important to note that Boyle was a polymath with diverse interests ranging from animal husbandry to underwater respiration, from the study of ancient languages to finding ways of extending the human lifespan. Furthermore, Boyle had both the intellect and the financial resources to pursue such a wide research agenda. Focusing on his philosophy, or even his chemistry, runs the risk of ignoring the true complexity of his thought. Nevertheless, much of Boyle’s work has had enduring philosophical significance.
Table of Contents
- Natural Philosophy
- Philosophy of Science
- Substance Dualism
- References and Further Reading
Robert Boyle was born on the 25th of January, 1627, at Lismore Castle, County Waterford, Ireland. He was the fourteenth child of Richard Boyle, the first Earl of Cork, who had come to Ireland from Canterbury, essentially penniless, in 1588. By the time of Boyle’s birth, through a series of shrewd and sometimes shady real estate ventures, Cork had become the wealthiest man in Ireland. This incredible wealth can be seen in Boyle’s lavish upbringing and education. After the death of his mother in 1630, Boyle’s daily care and supervision went to a local Irish woman, known today only as Nurse Allen. Allen raised Boyle, teaching him the Irish language, until his eighth year when he was sent away, along with his brother Francis, for a formal education at Eton.
After only three years at Eton, Cork decided to send Boyle, along with his brother Francis, on a grand tour of the continent under the tutelage of Isaac Marcombes. Marcombes was a renowned teacher from Switzerland and had just returned from a similar tour in which he had tutored Boyle’s older brothers. Boyle spent most of the tour in Geneva, at Marcombes’s home, where he studied a variety of subjects, including French, Latin, Italian, geometry, Roman history, philosophy, tennis, fencing, and horseback riding.
During his initial stay in Geneva in 1641, Boyle had a life-changing experience. One night during a terrible storm, he thought the Day of Judgment had come and that he had wasted his life on trivial pursuits. Boyle made an oath that he would dedicate himself to the Christian service of humanity if he was allowed to survive. The next morning, after the storm had passed, the young Boyle swore the oath again to demonstrate his sincerity. For the rest of his life he dedicated himself to various charitable endeavors. Even much of his later scientific work was directly motivated by what Boyle perceived as his religious duty. This event also led Boyle to a renewed dedication to his studies, as well as a lifelong aversion to swearing oaths. Later in life, for example, he declined the presidency of the Royal Society because it required swearing an oath. He even wrote a treatise, A Free Discourse Against Customary Swearing (1695).
During the grand tour, Boyle also travelled in France and Italy. They tried to visit Galileo, and Boyle studied Italian to read Galileo’s works in preparation, but the great scientist died before Boyle could meet him. The grand tour came to an end when Boyle received the news that his father had died. After sufficient finances were secured, Boyle returned to England and eventually settled at the family estate at Stalbridge, where he devoted himself to writing chivalric romances, a common literary form at the time, and moral treatises.
It is hard to determine when Boyle developed a serious interest in natural philosophy, but a few events are noteworthy. The Boyle scholar Michael Hunter puts it in the early1650s, warning against an interpretation that makes it seem inevitable that Boyle would become a scientist. However, we should not ignore events in Boyle’s life that indicate an early interest in natural philosophy, and the more one looks into the matter, the more a steady interest in natural philosophy becomes apparent. While it was not inevitable that Boyle would become a scientist, neither is it surprising.
Boyle had been familiar with the work of Aristotle, Bacon, and Galileo since his days at Eton. As early as 1646, events in Boyle’s life show an increasing interest in chemistry. An important letter to his sister Katherine Ranelagh (1615-1691) from May of that year shows that Boyle made a serious attempt to design and construct a chemical laboratory at Stalbridge. The attempt was unsuccessful, since an essential furnace was delivered “crumbled into as many pieces as we are into sects!” But the attempt itself is sufficient evidence of a serious interest in natural philosophy. Nevertheless, ethics was still Boyle’s primary philosophical concern during this period.
A trip to Leiden to attend his brother’s wedding in 1648 is also pertinent because at that time there was a thriving intellectual community of natural philosophers, with multiple schools of anatomy and the controversial mechanical philosophy of Rene Descartes (1596-1650) being discussed all over Holland. During this trip Boyle visited the University of Leiden and viewed an experiment on the nature of light in which the image of the city was projected onto the wall in the room of a high tower. This event may be the cause of the once-common view that Boyle studied there. However, these early experiences do pale in importance next to a conversion experience Boyle had in the early 1650s, when he essentially became a scientist. Boyle had found a way to combine his interests in natural philosophy with his pledge to dedicate his life to philanthropic pursuits.
He was encouraged in these endeavors by his older sister and best friend, the Lady Katherine Ranelagh (1615-1691). His relationship with Ranelagh would be the closest one of his life. Ranelagh was an important natural philosopher in her own right, respected and consulted by her contemporaries, who found a way to pursue her scientific research within the confines of the strict gender norms of seventeenth-century England. Later in life, at her London estate on Pall Mall, she would become Boyle’s intellectual companion, editor, and most trusted collaborator. In the early 1650s, her main contribution to Boyle’s philosophical development was her participation in the Hartlib Circle.
Samuel Hartlib (1600-1662) was a German polymath who moved to England in 1628 and recruited intellectuals and experts in all sorts of fields for a variety of religious philanthropic endeavors, including projects in medicine, public education, agriculture, animal husbandry, and translations of the Bible into other languages (Boyle would eventually help with projects to translate the Bible into Irish, Malay, and Algonquin). The members of the circle included Heinrich Appelius, Friedrich Clodius, Cheney Culpeper, John Dury, Theordore Haack, Godofred Hotton, Joachim Hubner, Katherine Ranelagh, Johann Moriaen, John Pell, William Petty, Johann Rulicius, John Sadler, George Starkey, and Benjamin Worsley. Hartlib, like Marine Mersenne (1588-1648), had a vast network of correspondence, with so many individuals that it is hard to establish a comprehensive list. However, it is important to note that by the time Boyle began participating in the circle, Ranelagh was already an established member. Furthermore, Ranelagh was a very important member, since out of the 766 names mentioned in Hartlib’s correspondence, Ranelagh’s is the sixth most mentioned. The group’s activities were inspired by the utopian writings of Francis Bacon (1561-1626), and it is Bacon who would have the single greatest influence on Boyle’s philosophy. The Hartlib Circle became a prototype of the modern scientific research society. It was eventually replaced by formal scientific societies, such as the Royal Society, of which Boyle was a founding member.
In 1652, Boyle briefly returned to Ireland to settle matters involving his inheritance. Although he was in Ireland only a short time, Hartlib recruited Boyle to work on a number of projects. Boyle was asked to create a Baconian natural history of Ireland, and research ways of developing new agricultural and animal husbandry techniques there, but these projects never got off the ground. By now, Boyle’s primary interest was to learn the empirically oriented chemistry of Jean Baptise Van Helmont (1580-1644). He was being helped in this endeavor through correspondence with the American alchemist George Starkey (1628-1665). However, unable to establish a chemical laboratory in Ireland, Boyle spent his time reading up to 12 hours a day and learning anatomy from William Petty (1623-1687), who had learned anatomy in Leiden before teaching it at Oxford, then following Cromwell to Ireland as Physician General.
Boyle’s serious investigations into natural philosophy really began when he became Starkey’s pupil. In Alchemy Tried in the Fire: Starkey, Boyle, and the Fate of Helmontian Chymistry (2002), William Newman and Lawrence Principe present a detailed analysis of Starkey’s influence on Boyle’s chemical education. They suggest using the term Chymistry to refer to the general group of issues concerning alchemy and chemistry in the early modern period, noting that the terms were then often used synonymously, while they have very different connotations in contemporary discourse.
Starkey was greatly influenced by Van Helmont, and Boyle eventually replicated many of Van Helmont’s experiments. By the time Boyle returned to England he was thoroughly absorbed in natural philosophy, wasting little time in moving to Oxford, networking with other scientists, and establishing the laboratory for which he is now famous. From this point, and for the rest of his life, Boyle was constantly conducting experiments. His published works, correspondence, and work notes—many of which survive—became full of detailed accounts of them. Boyle spent this important part of his career in one of the most thriving intellectual environments in the world at the time, working on a variety of projects involving both chemical analysis as well as experiments involving medicine, pneumatics, and hydraulics. He became involved with a group of like-minded, anti-Aristotelian, natural philosophers, which included John Locke (1632-1704) and eventually Isaac Newton (1643-1727), who regarded Boyle’s work on pneumatics as a paradigm of science.
The natural philosopher Robert Hooke (1635-1703) began his career as Boyle’s laboratory assistant. Together, they made improvements on the air-pump design made by Otto von Guericke (1602-1686), and produced a machine capable of evacuating most of the air from an observable glass chamber. They did a large number of experiments with it, and by presenting these to noble and socially influential audiences, they produced useful publicity for the scientific activities of the Royal Society. Inspired by Bacon’s conception of science, Boyle developed and used new technological instruments that enabled detailed, replicable observations which he thought revealed the hidden structure of the natural world.
Boyle also became close friends with the young John Locke, who went to Oxford in 1652 to study medicine. They even worked on a few medical projects together. Boyle had a significant influence on Locke’s philosophical development, including his distinction between primary and secondary qualities, and the difference between real and nominal essences.
Some of Boyle’s scientific claims were criticized by Thomas Hobbes (1588-1679), and the two philosophers became involved in a heated public debate over the role of experimental observation in natural philosophy. Poor health caused Boyle to move to London in 1668. There he lived with his sister Katherine for the rest of his life. For over twenty years they worked together on various projects in medicine, natural philosophy, and philanthropy. They received many important visitors who would come to witness his famous experiments.
Boyle died of grief a week after the death of his beloved sister, on December 31, 1691. Locke was the executer of his estate. He left funds to establish a series of annual lectures to defend Christianity against objections to its basic tenets. The lectures continue to this day.
Boyle considered natural philosophy to be an important part of philosophy. He believed God gave humans three books to aid in their salvation: “the book of scripture,” “the book of conscience, and “the book of nature.” In works such as Of the Study of the Book of Nature and Some Considerations Touching the Usefulness of Experimental Natural Philosophy (1663), Boyle argues that the natural world had been not only intentionally designed by God, but had been designed specifically to be understood, at least in part, by rational human minds. He believed that humans equipped with reason could make use of detailed observation, under controlled experimental conditions, to uncover the hidden structure of nature. Boyle’s efforts to bring chemistry out of the disreputable shadows of alchemy, as well as all sorts of other projects he undertook in natural philosophy, were justified as part of the theologically acceptable study of the natural world, God’s great automaton, the study of which Boyle believed too many people neglected. Boyle saw it as a religious duty to investigate natural phenomena and publish the knowledge he gained for the benefit of humanity. This Baconian approach to science can be seen throughout his research, including his chemical analyses of medicines, his investigations of air pressure, his study of human anatomy, his invention of the friction match, his efforts to expand the human lifespan, and even his work to advance agriculture and animal husbandry techniques.
Boyle seems to have spent nearly equal time doing experimental natural philosophy, studying the Bible as well as the ancient languages associated with it, and analyzing his own conscience. He put the same intellectually rigorous effort, aided by significant financial resources, into all three. Boyle’s entire philosophy, his metaphysics, his epistemology, and his ethics, are all intertwined with these three religiously motivated projects. Though Boyle is known today mostly for his work in various areas of natural philosophy, these achievements cannot be fully appreciated without understanding their place in Boyle’s religion.
It is important to emphasize that Boyle’s approach to natural philosophy, though influenced by Descartes, is more explicitly indebted to philosophers such as Francis Bacon and Pierre Gassendi (1592-1655). In the article “Pacere Nominibus: Boyle, Hooke and the Rhetorical Interpretation of Descartes” (1994), Edward Davis explores Descartes’s influence on Boyle during the 1660s, under the influence of Hooke, who taught Boyle Cartesian philosophy. However, it is misleading to describe Boyle as a Cartesian.
Descartes’s influence both occurred earlier and was also less extensive than this view implies. Boyle read Descartes’s Passions of the Soul in 1648, before his association with Hooke. While this has been downplayed as a minor work compared to Descartes’s Meditations on First Philosophy and the Principles of Philosophy, it does give an accurate and succinct presentation of Descartes’s philosophy, including his mechanical account of the human body. Furthermore, along with the works of Galileo and Gassendi, it represents one of Boyle’s earliest exposures to the mechanical philosophy. And while Boyle does later present many of his views in Cartesian terms and agrees with his basic dualistic and theist ontology, there are fundamental differences between their philosophies, such as their views on the essence of matter, the possibility of a vacuum, the role of experiment in science, and the possibility and extent of knowledge based on experience. On the other hand, Boyle had been exposed to Bacon’s conception of science since his time at Eton. The provost of Eton, Henry Wotton, was Bacon’s cousin. Furthermore, Bacon’s influence can be seen in the work of many of the members of the Hartlib Circle. Thus, it is more accurate to say that in natural philosophy Boyle was primarily a Baconian who agreed with Gassendi on many important issues, Descartes on others, and often expressed his ideas in Cartesian terms.
In works such as A Discourse on Things Above Reason (1681) and On the High Veneration Man’s Intellect owes to God (1684), Boyle distinguishes between demonstrative rational arguments and what can be inductively inferred from experience. Like Bacon, Boyle believed that theory should conform to observation. He tried to avoid premature metaphysical speculation—with mixed results—in favor of theories that could be tested by experiment. He agreed with Bacon’s claim in Novum Organum (1620) that the hidden structure of the natural world is too subtle to be penetrated by the Aristotelian, deductive approach to science, and that technology can aid in our investigation of the natural world. Boyle thought this approach yielded new scientific information that could be potentially used for the benefit of humanity. Boyle tried to put into practice something like the science Bacon envisioned in works such as Novum Organum (1620), and New Atlantis (1627).
Many areas of Boyle’s philosophy are intimately connected to his natural philosophy, including his rejection of scholastic Aristotelianism, his acceptance of the corpuscular mechanical philosophy, his work in chemistry, alchemy, medicine, and pneumatics, as well as his philosophical views regarding the nature of knowledge, perception, substance, real and nominal essences, causation, and alternative possible worlds.
Central to Boyle’s natural philosophy is his general rejection of scholastic Aristotelianism. In works such as About the Excellency and Grounds of the Mechanical Hypothesis (1674), he rejects Aristotle’s theory of motion as the actualization of a potential, as well as his distinction between natural and unnatural motion, holding that the local motion involved in the mechanical interactions of corpuscles was inherently more intelligible. He also rejected the scholastic notion of substantial form and used controlled experiments to investigate the Aristotelian terrestrial elements, forms, and qualities. For example, Boyle was the first philosopher to write an entire book about cold, a property the scholastics claimed to be one of the four primary qualities of matter, but had actually only discussed in the most general terms. Boyle’s book included all sorts of experiments he had conducted on the nature of cold, each described in meticulous detail.
Boyle rejected the scholastics’ deductive syllogistic approach to science. He agreed with Bacon that the natural world was too complex for the categorical syllogism to penetrate. He thought that scientific progress requires an inductive method that posits a hypothesis that can then be tested by experiment involving multiple controlled observations. Because the theories could be modified in light of new empirical evidence, Boyle believed the experimental method was fundamentally superior to the scholastic syllogistic model of science.
Boyle’s rejection of scholastic Aristotelianism in works such as The Sceptical Chymist (1661), and The Origin of Forms and Qualities (1666), was also based in part on his acceptance of the mechanical philosophy. This early modern philosophical movement sought to explain natural phenomena in terms of matter and motion, rather than, for example, the composition and proportion of Aristotelian terrestrial elements. Boyle thought mechanical explanations were inherently more intelligible than explanations based on the elemental model because they appealed to properties which themselves were more intelligible, such as size, shape, and motion, rather than to ultimately obscure causes such as real qualities or substantial forms. For Boyle, generation, corruption, and alteration could all be explained mechanically, as various types of interaction between microscopic particles of matter he called corpuscles.
This rejection of the elemental model of explanation also extended to other theories of natural philosophy that were popular in his day, such as the alchemical theory of Paracelsus (1493-1541), involving three chemical “principles”: salt, sulfur, and mercury, as well as even the more recent five-element theories of chemists such as Nicolas Le Fevre (1615-1669). When fire-analysis experiments revealed that some compound bodies could be reduced to five, rather than only four, homogenous elements, some natural philosophers thought this was evidence of a fifth element. Boyle rejected the elemental explanatory model altogether. Instead, he argued that there was only one kind of material substance, and what appear at the macroscopic level to be different elements are actually structural modifications of this universal matter’s mechanical properties.
In a similar way, Boyle also rejected the Aristotelian notion of natural motion. In Book 8 of the Physics, Aristotle argued that each element has a natural location in the universe and a natural tendency to return to this location. This was used to explain such things as why rocks fall and smoke rises. In contrast, Boyle argued that all matter was essentially passive and insensible, lacking any tendencies or dispositions beyond its mechanical properties. Matter can be acted upon but contains no internal force, source of motion, substantial form, or disposition.
The traditional Aristotelian qualities of hot, cold, wet, and dry could be mechanically explained in a similar way. For example, Boyle thought that heat was not a primary quality of matter, but instead a property that is reducible to a particular type of rapid corpuscular motion. The conception of heat as molecular motion is a direct descendent of this view. In a similar way, Boyle thought the power of a key to open a lock is not due to some real quality, substantial form, or occult power of the key; rather, it is an emergent power, ultimately reducible to the size, shape, and motion of the key and the lock, which Boyle called their mechanical affections.
It is important to note that Boyle’s objections against Aristotelian natural philosophy were usually directed more toward the views of his contemporary scholastics, such as Julius Caesar Scaliger (1484-1558), than those of Aristotle himself, for whom he had great respect. Boyle’s approach to ethics, for example, shows this respect was more than lip service, since it provides what is essentially an Aristotelian analysis of the causes of moral virtue. It is also important not to conflate the mechanical philosophy, the corpuscular hypothesis (Boyle’s own version of the mechanical philosophy), and the experimental philosophy (the method by which Boyle often tested theories).
Boyle coined the term Mechanical Philosophy and used it to describe any attempt to explain natural phenomena in terms of matter and motion, rather than in terms of substantial forms, real properties, or occult qualities. For Boyle, this included the work of a wide variety of philosophers that otherwise differed in many respects. His list of mechanical philosophers included the ancient atomists Democritus, Leucippus, Epicurus, and Lucretius—names synonymous with atheism at the time—as well as his contemporaries Galileo, Descartes, Gassendi, Hobbes, Locke, and Newton.
Boyle’s own corpuscular version of the mechanical philosophy makes him both an empirical representationalist and an indirect realist. Though Galileo’s The Assayer (1923) is likely the first early modern work to raise the influential distinction between primary and secondary qualities, Boyle developed this distinction and made it an important part of his natural philosophy. In the Origin of Forms and Qualities, among other works, he argued that our senses provide a representation of an independently existing, external physical world, which is ultimately composed of material particles moving through empty space. Boyle held that these corpuscles have mechanical affections, properties such as size, shape, and motion, which are the primary qualities of matter, real properties that exist in any bit of material substance, no matter how small. The secondary qualities we perceive, such as color, sound, taste, odor, and warmth, are mental perceptions that are produced by these primary qualities causally interacting with our sense organs, but do not actually exist as real qualities in the object of perception itself. Thus, perception involves information about the external world entering the brain as a result of the causal interaction between the conscious perceiver and the object perceived.
Boyle used the term “corpuscle” to describe the microscopic material particles, and their clusters, of which he believed the material world was composed. Boyle thought God has the power to infinitely divide matter, even if this is beyond our rational comprehension, but the actual physical world is composed of minima or prima naturalia, microscopic particles of matter which never are, as a matter of fact, divided. These basic corpuscles interact and combine to form larger and larger clusters until they form the ordinary macroscopic material substances with which we are familiar.
On the surface, Boyle’s mechanical philosophy seems very similar to Descartes’s, but their views differ in several important respects. Briefly looking at their differences helps us understand the uniqueness of Boyle’s view. Descartes argues that the “attribute,” or essence, of matter is extension in space. He also held that there is no real distinction between a substance and its attribute. Just as there is no body that lacks extension, Descartes held that there is no extension that lacks body. Descartes held that the universe was a plenum, completely filled with material substance. He even thought that the famous mercury vacuum created by Evangelista Torricelli (1608-1647), while devoid of air, was filled with “subtle matter”—particles small enough to penetrate the pores of the glass—and that we could deduce the existence of such particles from the nature of matter itself.
Boyle agreed that all matter was extended in space, but he wasn’t committed to Descartes’s elegant metaphysical system. Boyle thought theory had to be subordinate to observation. Extension, rather than being the essence of matter through which all other properties were mere modifications, is only another empirically manifest mechanical affection like size, shape, texture, arrangement, and solidity. For Boyle, empty space is not only logically possible but also empirically corroborated by experiments like those performed by Torricelli, Otto von Guericke (1602-1686), and himself, with Robert Hooke. Boyle also thought motion in empty space was more intelligible than in a plenum. Descartes had to resort to a complex theory of circular motion to explain it. Until there is empirical evidence to support the existence of subtle matter, Boyle believed its postulation violated Ockham’s razor.
Boyle believed that mechanical explanations were inherently more intelligible than those of the Aristotelians or the Paracelsians because they involved easily understandable concepts like size, shape, and motion. He thought the local motion involved in the mechanical interaction of corpuscles is inherently more intelligible than the Aristotelian conception of motion as the actualization of a potential. Boyle thought the appeal to substantial forms in natural philosophy produced explanations that were vacuous when compared to mechanical explanations. The Paracelsians seemed no better, appealing to vague notions such as the “archeus,” “astral beings,” and “blas.” Furthermore, being firmly rooted in alchemy, they were often secretive and intentionally obscure. However, explanations that appealed only to mechanical properties were clear, intelligible, and often had the advantage of being empirically testable.
In About the Excellency and Grounds for the Mechanical Hypothesis (1674), Boyle points out that no one appeals to substantial forms when mechanical explanations are available, as, for example, when one is shown how the moon is eclipsed by the shadow caused by the position of the earth relative to the sun. Likewise, there is no reason to appeal to witchcraft to explain how a concave mirror can project the image of a man into the air, once catoptrics is understood. Boyle thought Aristotelians and Paracelsians failed to realize that this mechanical approach can be applied to natural phenomena in general.
Boyle was interested in occult qualities, natural phenomena in which the effect is observable, but the cause is not, such as magnetic and electrical attraction. Boyle thought such phenomena could be explained mechanically in terms of corpuscular effluvia, the emission of small corpuscular clusters. In A Discourse of Things above Reason (1681), though, Boyle also recognized that some phenomena cannot be mechanically explained. These included the miracles featured in the Bible, as well as more traditional philosophical problems such as whether or not matter is infinitely divisible, how mind-body interaction is possible, and how human free will and moral responsibility can be compatible with divine foreknowledge. Perhaps these might be explained by future philosophical investigation, but they resist straightforward mechanical explanation.
The influence of the mechanical philosophy can be seen throughout Boyle’s other intellectual endeavors and provides his basic approach to philosophy. This influence is apparent in his metaphysical views on the nature of substance and causation, his defense of the corpuscular hypothesis, his epistemological views on role of experiment in scientific explanation and the limits of reason, and his theological views on the importance of studying the book of nature and its potential for medicine.
Boyle is considered by many to be the father of modern experimental chemistry. Through years of diligent work he became a skilled chemist. His interest and work in chemistry lasted from the early 1650s to the end of his life. His social status and efforts to show that natural philosophy was a theologically acceptable pursuit did much to make the science of chemistry socially respectable. Boyle’s most important contribution to chemistry is his systematic critique of both the Aristotelian and Paracelsian theories of natural philosophy.
In The Sceptical Chymist (1661), Boyle points out the limitations of fire analysis as a universal method of separating compound substances into their homogenous components, a method many Aristotelians and Paracelsians used. For example, a green stick burned in open fire seems to separate into four homogenous parts, demonstrating its compound nature: The smoke was the element of air being separated, the hissing and snapping of the sap indicated the water element, the quantity of fire grew as the stick burned, and the remaining ash was the element of earth that was left. Pacracelsians had a similar explanation, separating the stick into the chemical principles of salt, sulfur and mercury.
Boyle thought the separation could be better explained by the rapid mechanical bombardment of corpuscles from the fire onto the structure of the corpuscles composing the stick, setting them in motion. Chemical analysis revealed that the smoke and ash are not homogenous elements but are compound bodies themselves. Some compound substances, such as gold, could be burned for extended periods at extreme temperatures without separating into other homogenous substances. Furthermore, chemical distillation of other compound substances, such as raisins, could produce five homogenous substances.
Boyle was able to chemically sublimate several substances, such as sulfur, turning them from a solid state to a gas and back without going through a liquid phase. Boyle thought such experiments had serious consequences for the elemental model since, according to it, the release of a gas involved the separation of an element or chemical principle, which would require a diminution of the whole. If a substance can be turned back and forth from a solid to a gas again and again without any sign of disintegration, then such a diminution clearly has not taken place. The only alternative explanation on the elemental model would be that the substance has transmuted back and forth into different elements. However, if this is the case, then neither can be considered a true element.
Inspired by Bacon’s utopian model of science, Boyle tried to compile “experimental histories” of different substances. Some of these projects led to completed works, such as An Essay about the Origin and Virtues of Gems (1672) and Short Memoirs for the Natural Experimental History of Mineral Waters (1685). Others, such as the Philosophical History of Minerals, never came to fruition, though much of the research was completed. These projects were records of chemical experiments and other empirical observations concerning the given substance. The goal was to create a sort of publicly accessible database of the chemical analysis of every known substance. Boyle prioritized substances such as the traditional Aristotelian elements and Paracelsian chemical principles, “noble” metals like gold, and bodily fluids such a blood, due to their potential medical value. Concerning salt, a basic chemical principle according to the Paracelsians, Boyle claimed to be able to distinguish three different kinds, each of which he could chemically produce.
Boyle believed colors were caused by the mechanical properties of material corpuscles. In works such as Experiments and Considerations Touching Colours (1664) and New Experiments Concerning the Relation between Light and Air (1668), Boyle presents a chemical analysis of colors and light. He also analyzed samples of phosphorous he had acquired, which produce light chemically. Boyle achieved significant success in these endeavors, though this pales in comparison to the success of later philosophers on the nature of color. This line of investigation also led Boyle to discover things not directly related to color, such as a reliable method of distinguishing an acid from a base.
Developing an interpretation of a laboratory accident of Hennig Brandt, in 1680 Boyle saturated some coarse paper in phosphorous and drew a stick coated with sulfur across it, creating a steady flame. This was the first friction match. The creation of a reliable and eventually safe way to easily produce fire was a major technological advancement that changed the world.
Boyle spent the last twenty years of his life engaged, often with the help of Ranelagh, in the chemical analysis of medical recipes. These efforts did much to bring chemistry out of the shadows of alchemy and into the light of social respectability. Throughout his work in chemistry, Boyle advocated openness in the publication of experimental results, including even those experiments that were unsuccessful. Nonetheless, there were exceptions to this openness involving alchemy.
Many of the early modern philosophers, most notably Isaac Newton, had a significant interest in alchemy, and Boyle was no exception. Lawrence Principe in The Aspiring Adept: Robert Boyle and his Alchemical Quest (1998), and William Newman and Lawrence Principe in Alchemy Tried in the Fire: Starkey, Boyle, and the Fate of Helmontian Chymistry (2002), present a detailed analysis of Boyle’s alchemical pursuits, though one should also read Hunter’s account. The early Boyle scholars Henry Miles and Thomas Birch actually destroyed much of Boyle’s work in alchemy, fearing it would tarnish his reputation as a scientist. During his lifetime, however, Boyle’s interest in alchemy was extensive and well known. Though Boyle often tried to distance chemistry from its alchemical association, many of his projects in natural philosophy were clearly alchemical.
Boyle’s alchemical endeavors were motivated by three goals: to uncover the hidden nature of physical reality, to find “extraordinary and noble medicines,” and to acquire accurate accounts of supernatural events that might help convince religious skeptics. Boyle expressed an interest in finding the philosopher’s stone as early as 1646, though he mentions it more as a humorous exaggeration than a current project. In a letter to Ranelagh in May of that year, he complains that he is not destined to find the philosopher’s stone, since his initial attempts at chemical analysis had been so unsuccessful.
Boyle believed it was possible to transmute one substance into another, and this included the traditional alchemical quest of turning lead into gold. He believed the possibility of transmutation directly followed from the mechanical philosophy. If there is only one universal type of matter, and the differences between the macroscopic substances we perceive are the result of structural differences at the microscopic level, then it follows that causing changes in the structure and arrangement of corpuscles might cause substantial changes at the macroscopic level. Since gold and lead have similar macroscopic properties, there might be only a subtle difference between them at the microscopic level.
Boyle claimed to have witnessed the transmutation of lead into gold on more than one occasion. As early as 1652 he claimed to have acquired a quantity of philosopher’s mercury, a substance believed to be required for gold transmutation. Boyle also claimed to have turned gold into a base metal, using a powder given to him by a mysterious stranger. In some works, Boyle describes successful transmutation experiments on other substances. Boyle spent a great deal of time, effort, and financial resources in these pursuits, which included searching for the elixir of life, a medicine capable of curing all diseases and extending the human lifespan.
Boyle was hoodwinked on more than one occasion by charlatans who claimed to have alchemical knowledge or the rare substances required for his alchemical pursuits. The most notable incident involved a con man named Georges Pierre. Boyle eventually realized he was being had, and there is evidence that he was aware of the danger of such scams and viewed them as an unfortunate but necessary risk in the pursuit of alchemical knowledge, a risk that his unique wealth allowed him to take.
Influenced by Bacon’s utopian conception of science, Boyle thought scientific information, including his own detailed reports of chemical experiments, should be made public for the benefit of humanity. This allowed his experiments to be reproduced and the knowledge acquired to be used to help people, especially in areas such as medicine, where the benefit to the public was obvious and immediate. There were limits to this support of scientific openness, though. For example, Boyle was concerned that the publication of instructions for turning lead into gold could collapse the world economy, bringing social chaos. Upon Boyle’s death, Newton, also a dedicated alchemist, made attempts to obtain Boyle’s alchemical notes regarding the transmutation of lead to gold. Boyle had anticipated this and left detailed instructions in his will to prevent it.
Furthermore, despite Boyle’s support of scientific openness as well as his aversion to taking oaths, Boyle often employed secrecy in his alchemical pursuits. The sort of secrecy involved here, however, was a part of the cost of networking with other alchemists to share recipes and other experimental data, and was considered common practice in the world of alchemy. Most alchemists were secretive, and would exchange recipes and materials only if their secrets were kept. Boyle was justified in believing that, if he had refused to make such promises, other alchemists would not have shared their work with him. Nevertheless, this is a notable exception to his otherwise deep aversion to taking oaths, as well as his Baconian belief that scientific data should be open to the public for the benefit of humanity.
Boyle also had a deep interest in medicine. Though he never formally studied it, much of his research in natural philosophy was either directly medical in nature or motivated by medical goals, both practical and theoretical. He nonetheless distrusted physicians, after an event in his youth in which he became gravely ill when a physician at Eton gave him the wrong medicine by mistake. Furthermore, he generally rejected their Galen-based theories in favor of mechanical ones. He noted that chemical remedies often worked better than the Galenist practice of bloodletting, and that many of Galen’s views were based on claims about human anatomy that turned out to be incorrect. Boyle thought most patients were better off not seeking a doctor’s treatment.
At the same time, Boyle knew, respected, and was respected by many of the leading physicians of his day. Boyle’s London neighbor was Thomas Sydenham (1624-1689), one of the greatest physicians of the day. Sydenham read Boyle’s work and liked it so much that he dedicated his own book, Methodus Curandi Febris (1666), to him. He sometimes even asked Boyle and Ranelagh to accompany him on house calls. Boyle’s medical work was so respected that Oxford gave him an honorary Doctorate of Medicine, the only degree he ever received.
Boyle’s work in medicine is entwined with his work in natural philosophy. While the two should not be conflated, as Boyle worked on many nonmedical projects in natural philosophy, neither can be fully understood apart from the other. The development of Boyle’s interest in medicine coincided with his interest in natural philosophy in general, beginning around 1646, increasing in the mid-1650s, and lasting the rest of his life.
One of Boyle’s earliest published works was a collection of medical recipes entitled An Invitation to a Free and Generous Communication of Secrets and Receits in Physick (1655). Though Boyle worked on medical projects throughout his scientific career, a renewed interest in medicine began in the late 1660s. He would go on to steadily publish books on medical topics for the rest of his life, including Memoirs for the Natural History of Human Blood (1684), Of the Reconcileableness of Specifick Medicines to the Corpuscular Philosophy (1685), Some Receipts of Medicines (1688), Medicina Hydrostatica (1690), Experimenta et Observationes Physicae (1691), and Medical Experiments (1692).
Boyle worked with Locke on a few medical projects that are worth noting. Though early 21st century scholars remember Locke primarily for his work in epistemology and political philosophy, he considered himself first and foremost a physician. Boyle and Locke collaborated for several years to create a Baconian experimental history of human blood. This was part of a larger project of Boyle’s to create records of experimental observations regarding every known substance, with priority given to substances, such as blood, with potential value to medicine. Their work was interrupted while Locke was travelling or Boyle was ill, but their persistence resulted in the publication of Memoirs for the Natural History of Human Blood (1684).
A second medical project with Locke was the collection of data for testing the miasma theory of disease. This is particularly noteworthy because this theory proposes the mechanical explanation that disease is caused by noxious vapors moving in the air. The theory holds that these vapors act as a contagion, penetrating the bodies of those who come in contact with them through respiration. Boyle believed the contagions were composed of corpuscles and might originate deep underground, being released by human activity such as mining. Boyle and Locke hypothesized that these noxious corpuscular emanations were then spread far and wide by the wind. Believing disease and weather were linked, they collected data from physicians across the country on both the weather and the patients they had treated, looking for correlations. While this was a relatively minor project compared to some of Boyle’s other achievements, it is noteworthy since it attempted to use empirical data to test a mechanical explanation. One should not conflate the mechanical philosophy with the experimental philosophy, but the points where they intersect provide insight into Boyle’s philosophy.
Another medical collaboration in which Boyle participated was the race to find a cure for the Great Plague of 1666, an epidemic of bubonic plague which killed a fourth of London’s population, including Boyle’s former mentor George Starkey. Boyle’s belief in the miasma theory convinced him to leave London during this time. Despite this, Boyle was still part of a general effort to cure the plague that included Ranelagh, Sydenham, Locke, and many others. Boyle’s particular efforts primarily consisted of developing medical recipes he hoped would be useful to plague victims, which he then sent to Henry Oldenburg (1619-1677).
Boyle spent the last twenty years of his life engaged in medical research with his sister, Katherine Ranelagh. Through their vast network of correspondents, they would find medical recipes which they would then chemically analyze. Through medical research, Boyle found the clearest way to wed his passion for natural philosophy with his philanthropic goals.
Although he sometimes exaggerated his poor health, Boyle also suffered from very real and serious ailments including malaria, edema, seizures, kidney stones, toothaches, and deteriorating eyesight. He also suffered throughout his life from melancholy and complained of imaginative fits he described as “ravings.” During these episodes, he was carried away by his imagination, making it difficult to work. Boyle considered these ravings both a medical condition and a moral defect and spent years seeking a remedy. Since Boyle distrusted doctors and was an expert chemist, he often treated these illnesses with his own concoctions, sometimes making his condition worse. In 1670, Boyle suffered a severe stroke that left him partially paralyzed. He eventually recovered most of the mobility he had lost and continued working on his experiments.
In 1643, Evangelista Torricelli, a friend and advocate of Galileo, filled a glass tube with mercury, turned it upside down, and placed it in a basin of mercury. The level of mercury in the tube lowered, but some mercury remained in the tube, suspended by the weight of the air—the air pressure—pressing down on the surface of the mercury in the basin. Since the tube was airtight, Torricelli reasoned that the area in the tube above the mercury must be a vacuum. Through Marin Mersenne and his vast correspondence network, news of the experiment quickly spread throughout Europe.
Otto von Guericke (1602-1686) heard of the Torricelli experiment and designed a pump capable of producing an evacuated receiver so strong, due to the outward air pressure, that sixteen horses could not pull the two hemispheres of the receiver apart. Boyle had been interested in the nature of respiration for some time, so when he and Hooke, then Boyle’s laboratory assistant, heard of von Guericke’s impressive feat, they set about to create their own air pump. Boyle designed an improved model which featured a chamber made of glass, allowing direct observation of the phenomena within the evacuated receiver. Boyle first approached the scientific instrument-maker Ralph Greatorex (1625-1675) to build it, but when he failed Hooke took up the difficult challenge and succeeded.
From the spring through the fall of 1659, Boyle and Hooke performed dozens of experiments using the air pump and published the results in New Experiments Physico-Mechanical Touching the Spring of the Air and its Effects (1660). In this book, Boyle provides extremely detailed presentations of 43 of the experiments, giving compelling evidence for such claims as that air is a distinct substance from space, that air is elastic and has a spring, and that air pressure is so powerful that a glass vial of water placed in the receiver explodes when the air is removed. They demonstrated that air is required for phenomena such as combustion, respiration, and sound. They even placed a Torricellian barometer in the receiver, showing that the mercury does not remain suspended in the vacuum. Spring of the Air established Boyle’s scientific reputation. With its success, Boyle went from being an amateur gentleman interested in natural philosophy to being the leading scientist of the day.
The book highlighted Boyle’s genius for developing experiments that revealed important scientific information, and he also included detailed critiques of the other theories he had studied concerning the nature of air. The detail of his analysis astounded even other natural philosophers such as Henry Power (1623-1668), who claimed, “I never read any tract in all my life, wherein all things are so curiously and critically handled, the experiments so judiciously, and accurately tried, and so candidly and intelligently delivered.” It also influenced Newton, who saw it as a paradigm of scientific research.
At many of the early meetings of the Royal Society, Boyle was asked to replicate some of the experiments. Unlike other natural philosophers, Boyle had the financial resources to conduct the experiments and to repair the temperamental air pump when it broke. He even had an additional air pump made at considerable expense, which he gave to the Royal Society on May 15, 1661.
The book was also controversial, and it remains so to this day. Steven Shapin and Simon Schaffer explore the social construction of science, using the controversy between Hobbes and Boyle over the air pump experiments as their focal point in their influential book Leviathan and the Air Pump: Hobbes, Boyle and the Experimental Life (1985). However, one should also read Hunter’s account. The Jesuit Priest Francis Linus (1595-1675) tried to replicate some of the experiments and offered an alternative Aristotelian interpretation of the results, defending the view that nature abhorred a vacuum in Treatise on the Inseparable Nature of Bodies (1661). Christiaan Huygens (1629-1695) also reported that he could not replicate some of the experiments. Boyle praised Linus for his use of experiment, but pointed out the defects in his experimental practice in A Defense of the Doctrine Touching the Spring and Weight of the Air (1662). He added that further experiments with a J-shaped tube corroborated his claim that the reciprocal proportion between the pressure and volume of air was constant. This became known as Boyle’s Law.
This is controversial because Boyle appealed to experiments with the J tube actually performed by other natural philosophers like Henry Power and Richard Towneley (1629-1704). Furthermore, it was Hooke, rather than Boyle, who worked to find the precise numerical relation between air volume and pressure, while Boyle was more interested in the philosophical significance of the proportion being reciprocal and constant.
Even more significant was a series of objections raised by Boyle’s fellow mechanical philosopher Thomas Hobbes, upon which Leviathan and the Air Pump focuses. Hobbes offered a contrary mechanical interpretation that was consistent with observation. Like Descartes’s interpretation of the Torricelli experiment, Hobbes suggested that subtle matter was passing through microscopic pores in the glass so that the receiver was full of matter and not a true vacuum. Since it is possible to give an alternative mechanical explanation consistent with observation, Hobbes argued one cannot use experiments to decide between them. Furthermore, since multiple mechanical interpretations are possible for any experimental observation, observations are never completely independent of theory.
In An Examen of Mr. T. Hobbes his Dialogus Physicus De Natura Aeris (1662), Boyle replied by distinguishing between “matters of fact,” which can be tested, and mere “hypotheses,” which result from metaphysical speculation. It is possible that subtle matter penetrated the glass, but until there is empirical evidence to support this, positing the existence of subtle matter violates Ockham’s razor. Notably, by the early 21st century compelling evidence had emerged that an evacuated receiver contains billions of subatomic particles, such as neutrinos, far smaller than the pores of the glass.
Boyle also was motivated by a desire to show a theistic alternative to the equally mechanical materialism of Hobbes, Gassendi, and the ancient atomists, which was then strongly associated with atheism. For a time, Hobbes’s name was almost synonymous with atheism. Boyle had tried to show, since the early 1650s, that a mechanical philosophy could be compatible with Christianity.
In the end, Boyle wrote some ten books concerning his work with the air pump: New Experiments Physico-Mechanical Touching the Spring of the Air and its Effects (1660); A Defense of the Doctrine Touching the Spring and Weight of the Air (1662); An Examen of Mr. T. Hobbes his Dialogus Physicus De Natura Aeris (1662); New Experiments Concerning the Relation between Light and Air (1668); A Continuation of New Experiments Physico-Mechanical Touching the Spring and Weight of the Air and their Effects (1669); New Pneumatical Experiments about Respiration (1670); Of a Discovery of the Admirable Rarefaction of Air (1670); Flame and Air (1672); A Continuation of New Experiments Physico-Mechanical Touching the Spring and Weight of the Air and their Effects (1680); and The General History of Air (1692). Eventually, though, his attention shifted to medical chemistry.
Boyle was well known for his views on the role of experimental evidence in natural philosophy. Boyle’s philosophy of science was primarily influenced by Bacon. In Novum Organum (1620) and New Atlantis (1627), Bacon had challenged natural philosophers to employ an inductive scientific method based on the careful application of technology to make detailed empirical observations, instead of relying on the syllogistic approach favored in the Scholastic tradition, which made deductive inferences from universal principles. Bacon argued that if the universal principles themselves turned out to be false, the conclusions deduced from them would be unjustified. Instead of trying to anticipate what nature should be like according to reason, natural philosophers instead should make detailed observations of what nature is actually like. They should then interpret these observations and form inductive generalizations about the natural world. This approach to science allows observational evidence to have epistemic priority over theory, so that theories can be modified in the face of new empirical evidence. Bacon envisioned a future “history of qualities,” a sort of publicly accessible scientific database of empirical observations.
Boyle took this challenge seriously and developed an experimental method that used detailed observation, aided by new technology, to reveal nature’s hidden structure. This approach is apparent in his work in pneumatics, his chemical research to create experimental histories of substances, and his projects on cold, air, light, color, minerals, and gems. Many of these projects never came to fruition, but on some he worked steadily for years. For instance, Boyle’s natural history of Ireland never even got off the ground, but his empirical approach to the study of blood was fruitful and eventually led to medical advances which now routinely save lives. It is also important to note that this collection of empirical data is not the blind data collection of the “narrow inductivist conception of scientific inquiry” criticized by Carl Hempel in Philosophy of Natural Science (1966). Boyle prioritized the experimental investigation of substances with obvious benefit to society, and Boyle’s empirical data collection was hypothesis driven.
Boyle’s commitment to the mechanical philosophy was consistent with his views on the role of experiment in science. Boyle would often develop mechanical explanations of phenomena that served as hypotheses, for which he would then design experiments to test. He thought that testability was important in hypothesis development as well as in determining what questions science should pursue. He had a genuine talent for creating experiments designed to test theories, and in many cases this provided new scientific information. Following Bacon, Boyle tried to resist non-empirical metaphysical speculation and modify theories in the light of new experimental evidence. The results are mixed, but when he did engage in metaphysical speculation, such as in his treatment of the arguments for body-to-body occasionalism, he prefaced his remarks by noting that none of the theories he discussed could be empirically tested.
Comparison with Descartes on the role of experiment in natural philosophy is insightful. Experimental observation played a much different role for Boyle than it did for Descartes. Descartes is famous for conducting ingenious experiments, but rather than being used to test or falsify a hypothesis, they often played a part in the reduction of a complex scientific question into more basic ones. In Rules for the Direction of Mind (1628) and Discourse on the Method (1637), Descartes describes a scientific method that involves reducing a problem into more and more fundamental problems until a problem is reached that is so basic that a self-evident intuition solves it. One can then use this intuitive solution in a series of deductive inferences, solving the problems until one reaches a solution to the original one.
Furthermore, for Descartes, empirical observation was not a reliable method of testing hypotheses, since he believed the senses provide only confused modes of thought. The only properties of matter about which we can be certain, for Descartes, are the geometric properties of extended space. He believed this method of science could achieve the same level of certainty as mathematics since it restricted itself to clear and distinct deductions from matter’s geometric properties. For Descartes, physics is applied geometry.
By contrast, Boyle thought theory must be epistemically subordinate to observation, so he used experiments to test a theory. Instead of using them in a reductive process of finding self-evident intuitions, he designed experiments specifically to falsify or corroborate a claim. In this way, claims such as “air is needed for respiration” could be empirically supported, while claims such as “air is identical to space,” could be refuted. For Boyle, scientific knowledge was more likely to be inductively inferred than geometrically deduced.
Concerning Boyle’s general epistemology, in works such as A Discourse of Things above Reason (1681), Boyle distinguishes between things that can be known by reason and things that can be known through experience. Boyle also believed that at least some ideas are innate. Examples of innate ideas include the belief that contradictories cannot both be true, that the whole is greater than the part, and that every natural number is either odd or even.
Furthermore, Boyle believed that some truths are beyond a human’s capacity to understand. These are things which are true, and our intellect has sufficient cause to assent to them based on experience, authentic testimony, or mathematical demonstration, but when it reflects on them, it finds itself at a strange disadvantage. Boyle includes three kinds of beliefs in his taxonomy of things above reason.
The first kind he labels “incomprehensible” since it includes belief in things beyond our comprehension. For example, our finite minds cannot grasp the infinite nature of God. Boyle thinks we can comprehend that God exists and some of the things that God is not, but we cannot fully understand the boundless nature of his perfections. Boyle declares this to be truly supra-intellectual.
Boyle calls the second kind of thing above reason “inexplicable.” This includes beliefs for which we are unable to conceive of their manner of existing, or how the predicate can be applied to the subject. Boyle gives examples such as the infinite divisibility of matter and the incommensurability of the diagonal of a square to the length of its sides.
Boyle calls the final kind of thing above reason “unsociable,” but it might better be labeled “incompatible.” This class includes true propositions that seem incompatible with other propositions known to be true. For example, human free will seems to be incompatible with God’s foreknowledge of future events, but necessary for moral responsibility. Mind and body are distinct substances, but they seem to causally interact. Boyle thought these were real problems and had real solutions but were likely beyond a human’s finite capacity to understand, though he also thought philosophers should continue to try.
Like Descartes, Boyle believed that we could have knowledge of things that are beyond our capacity to clearly imagine, such as the mathematical properties of a chiliagon. We can demonstrate necessary truths about a 1000-sided object and show it has different properties that a 1001-sided object. Despite this, the images our minds form of these shapes are indistinguishable.
Boyle also distinguished between real and nominal essences, which, along with his work on primary and secondary qualities, influenced Locke’s epistemology. In A Free Enquiry into the Vulgarly Received Notion of Nature (1686), Boyle begins by listing all the ways the term “nature” is used. He then distinguishes between the “notional” sense, which is the way we choose to use words, from the way nature really is. Boyle also discusses the distinction in the Origin of Forms and Qualities (1666).
Boyle was a substance dualist, postulating that the universe consists of two types of substance: purely material corpuscles and nonphysical, conscious souls. Boyle accepted Descartes’s definition of substance as a type of entity that was not ontologically dependent on anything but God, whereas a mode is ontologically dependent on a substance. Shape, for example, cannot exist on its own, but is ontologically dependent on the bit of matter that has it.
Boyle’s dualism was influenced by Descartes, especially after his work with Robert Hooke, who taught him Cartesian philosophy, but there are important differences between their similar metaphysics. Descartes held that spatial extension was the “Attribute,” or essence, of matter, while thought was the essence of mind. Accordingly, all true properties of matter were modifications of extension, such as size, shape, and motion. In a similar way, since thought is the essential attribute of mental substance, all properties of mind are modes or types of thought.
Although Boyle agreed that thought was mental and matter was extended, he was not committed to Descartes’s elegant, rationally deduced substance-attribute-mode model. The mechanical affections Boyle associated with matter were derived from experience. For example, Boyle included solidity as another empirically based mechanical affection, but it is not clear how one can explain it as a mode of Cartesian spatially extended matter.
Boyle saw that bodies need some minimal force of resistance for mechanical interaction to be possible, though he emphasized such a force was nothing like a rational disposition or internal source of motion. Boyle also believed God gave matter the power to transfer motion upon collision, another potential problem for Descartes, since modes should not be able to transfer.
Likewise, for Descartes, the existence of a void or vacuum in space—that is, an area of space containing no matter whatsoever—is logically impossible. Since the attribute of body is extension, and there is no real distinction between a substance and its attribute, any extended area of space must contain body. Boyle’s views on the nature of the material world were more influenced by Bacon and Gassendi. He believed the elegance of a metaphysical system is not as important as its correspondence to empirical observation. He thought the air pump experiments supported the idea that a vacuum in space, devoid of all matter, was logically possible, and the existence of a vacuum should be posited until there was empirical evidence for the presence of matter in the evacuated receiver.
A final difference between Boyle’s dualism and that of Descartes was Boyle’s belief in animal consciousness. Descartes thought animals lacked a soul and were merely incredibly complex, divinely designed machines. Although they behaved as if they suffered, nonhuman animals lacked any conscious mental states. Descartes performed many animal dissections, including vivisections of live animals. Boyle saw the scientific need for vivisection since some anatomical features are only observable in living bodies. He even performed some during his sojourn in Ireland during the early 1650s. He gave up the practice, though, because of the observable suffering it caused. Boyle even had a preference for free-range chicken, but this may have been as much about flavor as chicken flourishing.
Boyle believed much instinctual behavior in nonhuman animals is purely mechanical, such as involuntary blinking when an eyelash is touched by a feather. Although he believed nonhuman animals were capable of conscious sensations, he thought they lacked rationality. Like other natural phenomena, nonhuman animal behavior sometimes seems rational, but, contrary to the scholastic Aristotelians, he thought the material world contained no rational dispositions.
Fundamental to Boyle’s philosophy is the belief that matter is passive, having no internal power, force, source of motion, or substantial form beyond the primary qualities of size, shape, solidity, and motion. He rejected the scholastic tendency to see intelligent dispositions everywhere in nature, such as the view that nature abhors a vacuum, or the view that an element has an internal disposition to move toward a natural location in the universe. Boyle acknowledged that the regularity seen in the natural world makes it sometimes seem like there is rational behavior, such as the regular motion of celestial bodies, or the tendencies of chemical substances to repeatedly behave in uniform ways. Despite this, he rejected the view that matter had power beyond its mechanical properties and sought to demonstrate how natural phenomena could be explained in terms of the motion of particles obeying certain laws of motion which he believed God had established. In works such as The Christian Virtuoso (1744), Boyle argued that the regularities we see in nature are a manifestation of God’s power and that divine volitions cause the laws of nature.
Boyle believed that the ultimate cause of motion is God, who created bodies, set them in motion, and maintained the laws of motion by divine will. God does grant matter certain basic powers such as solidity and the power to transfer motion to other bodies upon collision, but these are to be understood as unconscious mechanical properties rather than anything like mental dispositions or the internal sources of motion invoked by scholastic Aristotelian natural philosophy.
Boyle was aware of, and even sympathetic to, occasionalism, the view that God is the cause of anything that requires a cause. However, he never explicitly endorsed it. He does speak of it favorably in folios 38 to 40 of volume 10 of the Boyle Papers. While not explicitly endorsing it, Boyle presents three arguments intended to show that body-to-body occasionalism is not in itself absurd. Boyle does not here discuss mind-body occasionalism, but rather how God causally interacts with matter to create the natural world.
This is a minor discussion in his vast corpus, and should not be given undue emphasis. Its relevance to Boyle’s views on causation, though, makes it worthy of inclusion here. Boyle generally tried to avoid non-empirical metaphysical speculation or metaphysical system building, and he begins by pointing out that the issue cannot be settled by any testable experiment. Boyle then explicitly appeals to Ockham’s razor. Since God’s concurrence by itself is sufficient to cause the motion of bodies, it is superfluous, and even potentially impious, to attribute such power to finite bodies. If God wills a body to be in location a, and later wills it to be in location b, this alone is sufficient to move it. Attribution of a second cause to matter itself is not necessary.
Boyle’s second argument anticipates the philosophy of David Hume (1711-1776) by claiming that causation itself never appears to the senses. The power of one body to move another body is not directly observable. We only perceive that when one body hits another there follows a motion in the second body. This point is essential to Hume’s formulation of the problem of induction, supporting the claim that our belief in causation cannot be justified as a matter of fact. For Boyle, the fact that the power of causation is not manifest to the senses shows that it could be God. Therefore, occasionalism cannot be ruled out as absurd.
Boyle’s third argument is that it might not be even possible to conceive of one body communicating motion to another. If finite bodies are collections of modes ontologically dependent on the attribute of extension, for example, they should not be able to cause motion in another body. It thus should not be possible for us to conceive of a body transferring its motion to another body on collision. Occasionalism, therefore, cannot be ruled out as absurd since it actually seems more comprehensible than attributing the power of causation to finite bodies.
Boyle incorrectly labels Descartes as a sort of deist. Deists believed that, after the initial divine causal impulse, the universe ran on its own accord, obeying the laws of motion without the constant intervention of God. However, Descartes believed that God is constantly involved in creating the world through one continuous divine act. Boyle was aware of the similar body-body occasionalism of Louis De La Forge, in which God creates motion by recreating an object in different locations at different times. Boyle, however, seems to have preferred what Peter Anstey has described as “nomic occasionalism.” According to this type of body-body occasionalism, bodies are not totally passive but have basic, mechanical powers, such as solidity and the power to transfer their motion to other bodies upon collision. On this view, God causes the initial motion, preserves and conserves that motion, and determines the direction and speed of bodily motions before and after collisions. Like many of his contemporaries, Boyle believed that the laws of nature are divine volitions. In the case of miracles, though, God can suspend a law of nature, a further manifestation of divine power. Yet again, Boyle was cautious and hesitant to proclaim nomic occasionalism over deism, or the so-called cinematic occasionalism of De La Forge, pointing out that none of these views can be easily empirically tested.
In any case, it seems clear that Boyle’s occasionalism was confined to body to body interaction. Boyle thought that human minds were capable of genuine causal agency. This agency played an essential role in his views on the nature of moral responsibility, as well as his theological views about what is necessary for salvation. Our souls are connected to our bodies and somehow causally interact with them. Here again, Boyle is hesitant to commit himself to any specific theory beyond what can be experimentally tested. He believed that how mind-body interaction is possible, as well as how free will is consistent with divine foreknowledge, are likely mysteries beyond the ability of reason to solve.
By now it should be clear that the single most important influence on Boyle’s philosophy was his personal religious beliefs. His contributions to philosophy, chemistry, pneumatics, and medicine can be all interpreted as the development and fulfillment of a lifelong religious quest. Boyle thought there were three true books of wisdom, the “book of scripture,” the “book of nature,” and the “book of conscience.” He thought all three were important and spent nearly equal amounts of time and energy on each.
Boyle was christened at the chapel at Lismore Castle in Ireland as an infant and brought up as an Anglican protestant, though he was greatly influenced by Puritanism. The terrible storm Boyle witnessed on his grand tour with Isaac Marcombes was a transformative experience for Boyle, and many of his philosophical projects can be seen as attempts to fulfill the oath he took to survive it.
Boyle thought that, of the traditional arguments for the existence of God, the teleological argument was the strongest. Boyle acknowledged that the existence of God could not be rationally demonstrated, but he believed the natural world abounded with empirical evidence of God’s power and wisdom. He thought the incredible complexity and order of the universe was evidence of God’s existence. The vastness of the universe, and the speed with which the earth and celestial objects move, Boyle saw as evidence of God’s unbounded power. He thought that God’s constant concurrence was needed to sustain the universe’s existence.
He was particularly amazed by the human body and the bodies of nonhuman animals, which he interpreted as divinely constructed machines. Internal organs were smaller machines ingeniously and exquisitely designed to work together to sustain the life of the animal. Ignorant of natural selection, Boyle thought the incredible complexity of their mechanical structure was compelling evidence of God’s existence. In one early letter, Boyle claimed to have learned more about God’s creation dissecting fishes than in all the books he had read. At a macroscopic level, he thought that the climates of the different regions of the earth, and other geological features were intentionally designed to sustain the lives of various animals.
Boyle also used the famous clock at Stroudsburg as an analog to “this great automaton the world.” He thought the universe itself was intentionally designed by God to be understood by rational creatures, though parts of this creation are beyond human comprehension. Boyle believed that, since the universe was a manifestation of God’s greatness, one should study the book of nature as an aid to salvation.
Boyle also had a basic modal semantics. He believed God has the power to create alternative universes with different laws of nature. Boyle interpreted these possible worlds as potential divine creations. In addition to possible alternative creations of God, in Of the High Veneration Man’s Intellect Owes to God (1685), Boyle claims the size of the actual universe is so great that distant regions of space might have other areas, the size of our observable universe, that contain different planets and creatures, and even might have different laws of nature.
In the traditional theological debate between divine voluntarism, which holds that God’s will is prior to his reason, and divine intellectualism, which holds that God’s reason is prior to his will, Boyle has been often regarded as an important early modern voluntarist, but the label needs qualification. Boyle believed it was rash to claim that God’s acts had to conform to our finite conception of reason, and he generally rejected the a priori approach to theology advanced by many intellectualists. There is no way for us to deduce a priori which of the countless possible worlds God chose to create. Boyle thought we could learn about God’s magnificent creation through empirical observation. The problem with placing God’s reason above his will was that we are limited by our finite understanding of a priori truths. The ultimate contingency of the laws of nature calls for their empirical investigation, rather than a priori deduction. On the other hand, Boyle did not think God did things arbitrarily. He thought everything happened according to God’s divine plan, even if we could not completely understand it. Boyle’s rejection of intellectualism has more to do with the limits of our finite reason than a priority of God’s will over his reason.
Boyle believed everyone had the capacity for salvation. Boyle, Ranelagh, and other members of the Hartlib Circle collaborated on a number of projects to make the Bible available to more people, including overseeing the publication of translations of the Bible into Irish, Malay, and Algonquin. This has allowed much of the Algonquin language to be preserved. Such projects were controversial at the time, but Boyle saw them as part of his religious duty.
Boyle spent years mastering ancient Biblical languages to further his understanding of the Bible, including Greek, Syrian, Aramaic, and Arabic. He learned Hebrew to read the Torah and sought out Jewish scholars for advice on his translations. He argued for religious toleration, though he thought Christianity held the only path to salvation.
Boyle believed in the existence of supernatural creatures such as angels, demons, and witches. In Of the High Veneration Man’s Intellect Owes to God (1685), he claimed that angels, both good and evil, are rational but completely incorporeal, and that there could be as many species of angels and demons as there are nonhuman animals, with subtle moral differences between them. On the other hand, he also believed that most witch trials were unjust and not cases of real witchcraft. He tried to apply his empirical scientific method to the investigation of supernatural phenomena by creating a sort of database of reliable accounts of supernatural events, just as his Baconian histories of qualities were records of reliable experimental observations of natural substances. Boyle was convinced that enough reliable accounts of supernatural phenomena would make skepticism of Christianity seem unreasonable. He even saw to the publication of what he believed to be a true account of a poltergeist: Pearreaud’s Devil of Mascon (1658). He also tried to investigate what he thought to be a reliable account of precognition.
Despite a lifetime of religious pursuits, Boyle also had significant religious doubts. These doubts troubled him, and throughout his life he sought spiritual guidance from friends, family, and clergy. He worried that his wealth had been taken from Ireland unjustly and that his philanthropic endeavors were inadequate. He also feared that he had committed a sin against the Holy Ghost by ignoring opportunities to repent for self-acknowledged sins.
Boyle intended to write a book about atheism, but it was never completed. He left a substantial endowment in his will to start a series of annual lectures defending the existence of God and the basic tenets of Christianity against the dangers of atheism he perceived. The sermons started in 1692 and lasted steadily until 1935, after which time they were given frequently, but sporadically. Since 2005, they have been given every year once again.
Although Boyle is best known for his scientific endeavors, he was also fundamentally concerned with ethics. His earliest attempts at philosophy were in ethics, and ethics dominated his philosophy throughout the years he spent at his estate in Stalbridge during the 1640s, following his return to England from the grand tour with Isaac Marcombes. At some point during the late 1640s to early 1650s, Boyle had a conversion experience in which the focus of his work shifted permanently to natural philosophy. Nonetheless, he never abandoned his ethical concerns.
His most extensive ethical work is the Aretology, a systematic study of virtue. Written between 1645 and 1647 and never published during his lifetime, the treatise defends the claim that the key to human flourishing is the attainment of “felicity,” which Boyle understood as a supreme, sufficient, contenting happiness, ultimately achievable only after the death of the body and the contact of the soul with the divine. Felicity is the goal of eudaimonia because Boyle believes it is the only thing that is good in itself. Boyle rejects pleasure, honor, wealth, and even knowledge as approaches to achieving felicity, arguing instead that “to the palace of felicity the only highway is virtue.” This warrants the systematic study of moral virtue to which the title refers.
Boyle begins by claiming that the proper subject of moral virtue must be the rational soul rather than the affections of the senses. He then adopts a basically Aristotelian causal analysis of moral virtue, complimented with dashes of stoicism. Thus, the final cause of virtue is felicity, as we have seen. The material cause of virtue is the human soul. The formal cause of virtue is what Boyle terms “mediocrity,” the Aristotelian idea that a moral virtue is a mean between a vice of deficiency and a vice of excess, which one obtains only through habitual repetition until it becomes part of one’s character. The efficient cause of virtue is the most complex. Boyle sees it as a combination of God, the capacity that God gave us to develop virtue, mental habit, and living in accordance with right reason.
Boyle was greatly influenced by stoicism, having read the classic works under Isaac Marcombes. This influence is apparent throughout his moral treatises. Boyle’s ethics was also heavily influenced by Johann Alsted (1588-1638), a German Calvinist.
Boyle was a dedicated casuist, believing that a detailed analysis of his own conscience was just as important as the study of nature or the study of the Bible, and he devoted just as much of his time and effort to it. Boyle was just as meticulous in the analysis of his own conscience as he was at chemical analysis, scrutinizing his behavior, taking detailed notes, discussing them regularly with close friends and spiritual advisors such as Ranelagh, Locke, Gilbert Burnet (1642-1715), and Edward Stillingfleet (1635-1699).
Boyle’s intense examination of his own conscience likely goes back to the conversion experience he had during the night of the terrible storm on his grand tour, but it was probably also influenced by his study of stoicism. Boyle even provided a stipend for Robert Sanderson to help him publish his Lectures on Human Conscience, a book based on a series of lectures that Sanderson gave at Oxford in the 1640s. It is considered a classic in the field of casuistry.
Throughout his life, Boyle also suffered from manic fits he described as “ravings,” in which his imagination seemed to run away beyond his control, ravishing his attention. He found these fits of restless fancy disturbing and debilitating, and he made all sorts of efforts to treat these episodes both medically and by developing coping mechanisms to calm himself when the fits occurred.
Boyle scrutinized his daily moral behavior. For example, Boyle sometimes had to make promises of secrecy to obtain new alchemical recipes. This not only involved taking an oath, but also ran counter to his general advocation of openness in experimental data. These sorts of tensions gave Boyle and his spiritual advisors plenty of material to analyze. A full understanding of Boyle’s thought has to appreciate his equal dedication to the study of the book of nature, the book of scripture, and the book of conscience.
- The Works of Robert Boyle (Pickering & Chatto, 1999-2000), ed. Michael Hunter and Edward B. Davis.
- This fourteen-volume set is the definitive edition of Boyle’s work.
- Selected Philosophical Papers of Robert Boyle (Hackett, 1991), ed. M.A. Stewart.
- An excellent paperback edition of some of Boyle’s most important works.
- A Free Enquiry into the Vulgarly Received Notion of Nature (Cambridge, 1996), ed. Edward B. Davis and Michael Hunter.
- A paperback edition of this important later work by Boyle, with a good introduction and chronology.
- The Works of the Honourable Robert Boyle (Rivington, 1772), ed. Thomas Birch.
- This was the classic edition, but has been surpassed by the Hunter and Davis edition.
- An Invitation to a free and generous Communication of Secrets and Receits in Physick (1655)
- Some Motives and Incentives to the Love of God (Seraphic Love) (1659)
- New Experiments Physico-Mechanical, touching the Spring of the Air and its Effects (1660)
- Certain Physiological Essays (1661)
- The Sceptical Chymist (1661)
- Some Considerations touching the Style of the Scriptures (1661)
- A Defense of the Doctrine Touching the Spring and Weight of the Air (1662)
- An Examen of Mr. T. Hobbes his Dialogus Physicus De Natura Aeris (1662)
- Some Considerations Touching the Usefulness of Experimental Natural Philosophy (1663)
- Experiments and Considerations Touching Colours (1664)
- New Experiments and Observations Touching Cold (1665)
- Occasional Reflections upon Several Subjects (1665)
- Hydrostatical Paradoxes (1666)
- The Origin of Forms and Qualities (1666)
- New Experiments Concerning the Relation between Light and Air (1668)
- A Continuation of New Experiments Physico-Mechnical Touching the Spring and Weight of the Air and their Effects (1669)
- Of Absolute Rest in Bodies (1669)
- New Pneumatical Experiments about Respiration (1670)
- Cosmical Qualities (1670)
- Of a Discovery of the Admirable Rarefaction of Air (1670)
- The Usefulness of Natural Philosophy, II (1671)
- An Essay about the Origin and Virtues of Gems (1672)
- Flame and Air (1672)
- Essays of Effluviums (1673)
- The Saltness of the Sea (1673)
- The Excellency of Theology Compared with Natural Philosophy (1674)
- About the Excellency and Grounds of the Mechanical Hypothesis (1674)
- Some Considerations about the Reconcileableness of Reason and Religion (1675)
- Experiments, Notes, Etc., about the Mechanical Origin of Qualities (1675)
- Of a Degradation of Gold Made by an Anti-Elixir (1678)
- Experiments and Notes about the Producibleness of Chemical Principles (1680)
- A Continuation of New Experiments Physico-Mechnical Touching the Spring and Weight of the Air, and their Effects (1680)
- The Aerial Noctiluca (1680)
- New Experiments and Observations, made upon the icy Noctiluca (1682)
- A Discourse of Things Above Reason (1681)
- Memoirs for the Natural History of Human Blood (1684)
- Experiments and Considerations about the Porosity of Bodies (1684)
- Of the High Veneration Man’s Intellect owes to God (1684)
- Short Memoirs for the Natural Experimental History of Mineral Waters (1685)
- An Essay of the Great Effects of Even Languid and Unheeded Motion (1685)
- Of the Reconcileableness of Specifick Medicines to the Corpuscular Philosophy (1685)
- A Free Enquiry into the Vulgarly Received Notion of Nature (1686)
- The Martyrdom of Theodora and of Didymus (1687)
- A Disquisition about the Final Causes of Natural Things (1688)
- Some Receipts of Medicines (1688)
- Medicina Hydrostatica (1690)
- The Christian Virtuoso (1690)
- Experimenta et Observationes Physicae (1691)
- The General History of Air (1692)
- Medicinal Experiments (1692)
- A Free Discourse against Customary Swearing (1695)
- The Christian Virtuoso, The Second Part (1744)
- The Correspondence of Robert Boyle (Pickering & Chatto, 2001), ed. Michael Hunter, Antonio Clericuzo, and Edward B. Davis.
- This six-volume edition of Boyle’s correspondence is the standard in the field and a companion to the Pickering & Chatto edition of The Works of Robert Boyle.
- Boyle diligently kept diaries of his experimental work starting in the 1640s. Thanks to the work of Michael Hunter and Charles Littleton, these are available online at http://www.bbk.ac.uk/boyle/workdiaries/.
- Hunter, Michael. Boyle: Between God and Science (Yale, 2009).
- This is the best biography of Boyle to date, and includes important recent discoveries in Boyle studies.
- Hunter, Michael. Robert Boyle by Himself and His Friends (Cambridge, 1994).
- This edited volume of biographical and autobiographical essays about Boyle is noteworthy for the inclusion of fragments from William Wotton’s lost Life of Boyle.
- Maddison, R.E.W. The Life of the Honourable Robert Boyle (Taylor & Francis, 1969).
- This is another biography of Boyle with excellent coverage of Boyle’s Oxford period, but the coverage of Boyle’s early life is covered by reprinting Boyle’s own account as presented in the autobiographical An Account of Philaretus During his Minority (also included in Hunter 1994 above).
- Masson, Flora. Robert Boyle: A Biography (Constable and Company, 1914).
- An early biography of Boyle with many notable anecdotes.
- Alexander, Peter. Ideas, Qualities, and Corpuscles: Locke and Boyle on the External World (Cambridge, 1985).
- This is an exploration of Boyle’s profound influence on John Locke.
- Anstey, Peter. The Philosophy of Robert Boyle (Routledge, 2000).
- This is the first book-length treatment of Boyle’s philosophy.
- Anstey, Peter. “Boyle Against Thinking Matter,” in Late Medieval and Early Modern Corpuscular Matter Theories, Edited by Christoph Luthy, John Murdoch, and William Newman (Brill, 2001).
- Baxter, Roberta. Skeptical Chemist: The Story of Robert Boyle (Morgan Reynolds Publishing, 2006).
- Boas, Marie. Robert Boyle and Seventeenth-Century Chemistry (Cambridge, 1958).
- Boas-Hall, Marie. Robert Boyle on Natural Philosophy (Indiana University Press, 1965).
- DiMeo, Michelle. “‘Such a Sister Became Such a Brother’: Lady Ranelagh’s Influence on Robert Boyle,” Intellectual History Review 25.1 (2015), pp. 21-36.
- Eaton, William. Boyle on Fire: The Mechanical Revolution in Scientific Explanation (Continuum, 2005).
- This work explores the lasting influence of Boyle’s philosophy of science.
- Harwood, John. The Early Essays and Ethics of Robert Boyle (Southern Illinois University Press, 1991).
- This is the only book that presents a detailed analysis of Boyle’s ethics.
- Hunter, Michael. Robert Boyle Reconsidered (Cambridge, 1994).
- This edited volume of essays brought about a new appreciation of the significance of Boyle’s natural philosophy.
- Hunter, Michael. “How Boyle became a Scientist,” History of Science 33.1(1995), pp. 59-103.
- This article is a detailed account of how Boyle became a scientist.
- Hunter, Michael. Robert Boyle 1627-1691: Scrupulosity and Science (Boydell, 2000).
- This work is an in-depth exploration of the relationship between Boyle’s religious views and his natural philosophy. It includes Hunter’s essay, “How Boyle became a Scientist.”
- Hunter, Michael. Boyle Studies: Aspects of the Life and Thought of Robert Boyle (Ashgate, 2015).
- Kuslan, Louis, and A. Harris Stone. Robert Boyle: The Great Experimenter (Prentice-Hall, 1970).
- Although written for children, this short book is an excellent introduction to Boyle’s natural philosophy, with detailed explanations of several of his most important experiments.
- J.R. Jacob. Robert Boyle and the English Revolution: A Study in Social and Intellectual Change (Burt Franklin, 1977).
- Newman, William, and Lawrence Principe. Alchemy Tried in the Fire: Starkey, Boyle, and the Fate of Helmontian Chymistry (University of Chicago, 2002).
- Principe, Lawrence. The Aspiring Adept: Robert Boyle and His Alchemical Quest (Princeton, 1998).
- Sargent, Rose-Mary. The Diffident Naturalist: Robert Boyle and the Philosophy of Experiment (University of Chicago, 1995).
- Wojcik, Jan W. Robert Boyle and the Limits of Reason (Cambridge University Press, 2002).
- Ben-Chaim, Micahel. Experimental Philosophy and the Birth of Empirical Science (Routledge, 2004).
- Evan Bourke. “Female Involvement, Membership, and Centrality: A Social Network Analysis of the Hartlib Circle,” Literature Compass 14.4 (2017).
- David, Edward. Creation, Contingency, and Early Modern Science: The Impact of Voluntaristic Theology on Seventeenth Century Natural Philosophy (PhD Dissertation, Indiana University, 1984)
- Duddy, Thomas. A History of Irish Thought (Routledge, 2002).
- Frank, Robert G. Harvey and the Oxford Physiologists: A Study of Scientific Ideas (University of California Press, 1980).
- Garber, Daniel. Descartes’ Metaphysical Physics (University of Chicago Press, 1992).
- Garber, Daniel. Descartes Embodied: Reading Cartesian Philosophy through Cartesian Science (Cambridge University Press, 2000).
- Harrison, Peter. “Voluntarism and Early Modern Science,” History of Science 40.1 (2002), pp. 63-89.
- Harrison, Peter. The Fall of Man and the Foundations of Science (Cambridge University Press, 2007).
- Hempel, Carl. The Philosophy of Natural Science (Prentice Hall, 1966).
- Klaaren, Eugene. Religious Origins of Modern Science (William B. Eerdmans Publishing Company, 1977).
- Osler, Margaret. Divine Will and the Mechanical Philosophy: Gassendi and Descartes on Contingency and Necessity in the Created World (Cambridge University Press, 1994).
- Webster, Charles. The Great Instauration: Science, Medicine, and Reform 1626-1660 (Holmes and Meier Publishers, 1975)
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