Chrysippus (c. 280—207 B.C.E.)
Chrysippus was among the most influential philosophers of the Hellenistic period. He is usually thought of as the most important influence on Stoicism. A later Stoic catchphrase ran, “If Chrysippus had not existed, neither would the Stoa.” (Lives 292). Carneades, the fourth Chair of the New Academy, modified the phrase to, “If Chrysippus had not existed, neither would I.” (Lives 438) Chrysippus defended and developed an empiricist epistemology and psychology. He offered important alternatives to the metaphysical theories of Aristotle and Plato, defending a thoroughgoing materialist ontology. His views concerning freedom and determinism continue to generate interest, and he is thought to have endorsed a form of compatibilism countenancing both freedom of the will and a deterministic cosmos. His work in logic was considerable, as he developed, as an alternative to the logic of Aristotle, a kind of propositional logic. As an ethicist, he maintained that the life of human happiness and the life of virtue are one and the same. He seems to have thought virtue is best understood as related essentially, if not entirely reducible, to wisdom. And he thought wisdom derives especially from the study of natural philosophy. That Chrysippus would take wisdom to derive primarily from the study of natural philosophy may be explained, in part, by his conviction that the cosmos exists in accordance with proper ends.
Table of Contents
- Life and Times
- References and Further Reading
Chrysippus was born in Soli, near what is today known as Mersin, Turkey. He died in the 143rd Olympiad at the age of seventy-three (living c. 280-207 B.C.E.). Diogenes Laertius, in his Lives of the Philosophers, reports that before becoming a student of Cleanthes, Chrysippus used to practice as a long-distance runner (287 B.C.E.). He was a master dialectician. Most people thought, according to Diogenes Laertius, that if the gods took to dialectic, they would adopt no other system than that of Chrysippus (289 B.C.E.). Cleanthes had succeeded Zeno, who had founded the school at the Stoa Poikilê in 262 B.C.E. Chrysippus, having taught outside the school for a number of years, returned to succeed his former teacher in 230 B.C.E. Stoicism continued to flourish after his death, as the work begun by early Stoics was continued in the era of Panaetius and Posidonius, and later into the Roman Imperial period by thinkers such as Seneca, Epictetus, and Marcus Aurelius.
Chrysippus was a prolific writer. He is reported to have written more than 705 books (SVF 2.1). No single treatise remains, and we have something in the neighborhood of 475 fragments. Two doxographies stand out—Diogenes Laertius’ Lives of the Philosophers, hereafter, and above, (Lives), and pseudo-Plutarch’s Philosopher’s Opinions on Nature. Cicero writes several works that are of use in reconstructing Stoic thought: Academica, De Finibus, and De Natura Deorum, are among the most important. These contain summaries and critical evaluations of the views of the Hellenistic schools, and although Cicero identifies with the Academics, he is not without sympathy for Stoic philosophy. It is from these sources primarily that scholars have attempted to cobble together a set of fragments and testimonia that present a coherent picture of Stoicism and Stoic philosophers. The Stoicorum Veterum Fragmenta, hereafter (SVF), compiled in three volumes by H. von Arnim, is one of the more important collections of fragments in Greek and Latin, and it is customary to refer to Stoic fragments by making use of von Arnim’s volume numbers and numbering system. More recently, David Sedley and A.A. Long have produced an English translation and commentary of the principal sources of Hellenistic philosophy, The Hellenistic Philosophers, hereafter (LS). Corresponding Greek and Latin texts, with notes and bibliography, can be found in the second volume of this work.
Zeno, the founder of Stoicism, defined ‘presentation’ as an impression (phantasia) upon the soul (SVF I 58). That he neglected to indicate what he meant by ‘impression’ is suggested by the controversy between Cleanthes and Chrysippus concerning the exegesis of this term. Cleanthes maintained that an object impresses itself on the soul just as a signet ring impresses itself upon a wax seal—a metaphor Plato had made use of in the Theaetetus (191c8). Chrysippus rejects this model by arguing that if the soul were like a piece of wax (with only one surface exposed), it might only receive one impression at a time. Furthermore, every impression would be lost as the next image impinged upon the former. The soul, however, as Chrysippus argues, receives a number of impressions at once, and it does, in fact, retain some impression while receiving others (Lives 7.50). In place of the wax model, Chrysippus argues that the soul is more akin to air, as air is able to undergo a number of alterations simultaneously, as when a number of individuals are speaking at the same time in the same place. (In fact, the soul, according to Chrysippus, who was a thoroughgoing materialist, is a mixture of air and fire). Chrysippus seems, therefore, to accept an indirect realist view of perception, whereby an impression can represent an external object, i.e., a phantaston:
Chrysippus says that these four, [impression, impressor, imagination, and figment] are to be distinguished from one another. An impression is an affection occurring in the soul that reveals itself and its cause. Thus, when through sight we observe something white, the affection is what is engendered in the soul through vision; and it is this affection (pathos) that enables us to say there is a white object that activates us. The word ‘impression’ (phantasia) is derived from the word light (phõs); just as light reveals itself and whatever else it includes in its range, so impression reveals itself and its cause. (SVF 2.54)
Not every presentation is, however, accurate. Some presentations lack a corresponding ‘impressor’. Although we see what appears to be Clint Eastwood on the silver screen, nobody believes that Clint is actually up there (LS 236). Chrysippus considers a presentation such as this one to be the result of imagination, or a phantastikon. A presentation that is believed, but which lacks an underlying real object, as for example the dragoness of Hades as it appears to Orestes, would be classified as a figment, or a phantasma.
Imagination is an empty attraction, an affection in the soul which arises from no impressor…A figment is that to which we are attracted in the empty attraction of imagination; it occurs in people who are melancholic and mad. (SVF 2.54)
So how does the ruling element of the soul distinguish a real presentation from a mere figment? According to Diogenes Laertius, the Stoics maintained the following (Lives 155):
[W]ith respect to presentations, on the one hand there is the cataleptic, and on the other there is the non-cataleptic. The cataleptic, which they say is the criterion of things, is that which comes to be from an existent object, agrees with the real object itself, having been stamped and imprinted. The non-cataleptic does not come to be from the existent object, or if it does, fails to accord with that which exists; it is neither clear nor distinct.
A cataleptic (“apprehending” or “grasping”) presentation (i) comes from a real object (ii) accurately corresponds to that object, (iii) is imprinted on the sense faculty, and, as we might add, (iv) is clear and distinct. The Stoics, moreover, take the cataleptic impression to be the criterion by means of which one may discern fact from fiction. Needless to say, the Skeptics were eager to ask how it is that one may discern the cataleptic from the non-cataleptic. The conceptual landscape here is filled out aptly by Cicero in his Academica (2.83):
There are four headings to prove there is nothing that can be known, cognized, or grasped, which is the subject of this whole controversy. The first of these is that (i) some false impression does exist. The second is that (ii) it is not cognitive. The third is that (iii) impressions between which there is no difference cannot be such that some are cognitive and others not. The fourth is that (iv) no true impression arises from sensation that does not have alongside it another impression, no different from it, that is not cognitive. Everyone accepts the second and third of these. Epicurus does not grant the first, but you…[Stoics], with whom we are dealing, admit that one. The entire battle is about the fourth.
The Stoics seemed to have denied that a true and a false impression might nevertheless be qualitatively indistinguishable. But, as Cicero goes on to ask, what mark (notum) of a cataleptic impression might one have such that it could not be false? In response to Cicero’s question, the Stoics developed several strategies (Lives 162):
The standard of truth they claim is the cataleptic presentation, i.e., that which comes to be from a real object, according to Chrysippus in the twelfth book of his Physics, and to Antipater and Apollodorus. Boëthus, however, admits a plurality of standards, namely intelligence, sense-perception, appetency, and knowledge. But Chrysippus contradicts himself…and says that the criterion is sensation and preconception (prolepsis). And preconception is a natural concept of the universal. Again, certain others of the older Stoics make orthos logos the criterion; so also does Posidonius in his treatise On the Criterion.
The pivotal question for understanding Chrysippus’ epistemology seems to concern the meaning he attaches to prolepsis. On one reading, these preconceptions might be considered innate concepts. This reading, however, rings inconsonant with the empiricist leanings associated with the Stoics (SVF 2.83):
The Stoics say that whenever a person is born, the hegemonic part of his soul is like a sheet prepared to be written upon. Upon this he writes each one of his conceptions. The first method of inscription is via the senses. For by perceiving something, e.g., white, they have a memory of it when it has departed. And when many memories of a similar kind have occurred, we then say we have experience. For the plurality of similar experiences is experience. Some conceptions arise naturally in the previously mentioned ways without deliberation, others by means of our own instruction and attention. The latter are called merely conceptions. The former are called preconceptions (prolepseis) as well. Reason, for (possessing) which we are called rational, is said to be completed by means of our preconceptions during our first seven years.
The above passage suggests that Stoics viewed the mind as a tabula rasa. Concepts, or prolepseis, are acquired causally by the repetition of similar presentations. (See Aristotle’s Posteria Analytica II.9) Chrysippus seems to have thought that one might compare a given token presentation with the concept one has of the type thereof. When, for example, the sage rejects the presentation of a dragoness, one may note that the dragoness does not match the prolepsis one has of females. If this is his line of thinking, it is fair to say that Chrysippus is sanguine indeed with respect to the reliability of the cognitive mechanism responsible for the acquisition of prolepseis. Optimism at this level, however, accords well with the Stoic view that the world is constructed in accordance with reason (Lives VII.134):
[The Stoics] think that there are two principles of the universe—that which acts, and that which is acted upon. That which is acted upon is unqualified substance, i.e. matter; that which acts is the reason (logos) in it, i.e. god.
Understood in this way, Chrysippus’s view seems to share certain features with those more contemporary epistemologists who are keen to emphasize the proper function of one’s cognitive abilities—more so than one’s subjective relationship to a belief—in the production of beliefs that meet the requirements for warrant or knowledge. The Stoics saw the presence of the divine in terrestrial things. The epistemic faculties, like other faculties, are there for a reason.
The Stoics’ appreciation for logic probably originated with the school’s founder. Zeno studied with Stilpo the Megarian. And Megara was the home of a number of important philosophers engaging in a discipline that we would today call logic. Chrysippus, without question, is the philosopher most responsible for the logic associated with the Stoics. In the following section, we will consider some of the elements that set his logic apart from that of his predecessors, as well as the propositional logic that most students of philosophy are familiar with today.
One way of understanding Chrysippus’ contribution to logic is to see what Stoic arguments are not. Consider the following argument:
All mammals are warm-blooded animals.
All warm-blooded animals are sanguineous.
So: All mammals are sanguineous.
Aristotle called an argument of this variety a syllogism. He took it as evident that given the truth of the premises, the conclusion is likewise true. Indeed, one need not know the meaning of the terms in the argument to determine that the conclusion follows logically from the premises. One may simply consider the form of the argument:
All A are B A = mammals
All B are C B = warm-blooded animals
So: All A are C C = sanguineous
Logicians consider arguments wherein the conclusion follows from the premises, in just this way, to be valid. It is important to recognize that an argument’s having true premises provides neither necessary nor sufficient grounds for it to be valid. The following argument is valid, as the conclusion follows from the premises, even though the premises would rightly be resisted. The argument thereafter has true premises, but it is clearly invalid, as the premises may be true although the conclusion is false.
All trout are mammals. No viviparous animal is a trout.
All mammals are oviparous. No trout is a mammal.
So: All trout are oviparous. So: No viviparous animal is a mammal.
Consider, next, the following argument. It is clearly valid, but how would one fit it into an Aristotelian syllogism?
If Plato walks, then Plato moves. p = Plato walks.
Plato walks. q = Plato moves.
So: Plato moves.
Aristotle resisted the idea that there could be a scientific demonstration that concerned individuals. (Notice that the Aristotelian arguments above made use of classes). The argument currently under discussion resists an Aristotelian formulation, for the relata herein are propositions—Stoics called these ‘sayables’—rather than classes. In Aristotelian logic, the key connectives are ‘all’, ‘some’, ‘is’, and ‘is not’. In Chrysippus’ logic, the key connectives are ‘if’, ‘or’, ‘and’, and ‘not’. In the forms below, the former represents the form of our argument above; the latter a form that is clearly fallacious:
|If p, then q
|If p, then q
|p = Plato walks.
|q = Plato moves.
Stoics built arguments in this way. Following Aristotle’s lead in the Prior Analytics, they listed a number of indemonstrable modes of argument—forms whose validity is clearly not in question—to which, they were optimistic, all other valid arguments may be reduced. The following is a list of the five indemonstrable forms (the first four have names):
|If p, q; p; ergo, q.
|If p, q; not q; ergo, not p.
|Modus ponendo tollens:
|Either p or q; p; ergo not q.
|Modus tollendo ponens:
|Either p or q; not q; ergo p.
|Not both p and q; p; ergo, not q.
That the Stoics distinguished between simple and complex propositions should be clear from what has been said heretofore. The sayable Plato walks is simple, and the sayable If Plato walks, then Plato moves is complex, as the statements Plato walks and Plato moves are connected by the particles ‘if’ and ‘then’. But Chrysippus’s account of what makes complex ‘sayables’ true or false differs in interesting ways with the truth-functional accounts that many modern philosophers make use of (a sentence is truth-functional when the truth of the sentence is a function of the values of its subsentences). Consider ponendo tollens above and let the value of p be the car won’t start because of a dead battery, and the value of q be the car won’t start because of a bad alternator. When your mechanic asserts the disjunction of these claims, and subsequently finds the former to be true, an inference to the falsity of the latter is not deductively valid. (It might be that you have a bad alternator as well.) This is not the way that Chrysippus seems to have viewed the matter. The Stoics were keen to understand all legitimate disjunctions to present mutually exclusive alternatives, for example, p or q, but not both p and q:
But all the disjuncts must mutually conflict, and their contradictories…must also be mutually opposed. Of all disjuncts, one must be true, the other false. But if neither of them is true, or all or more than one of them are true, or the disjuncts do not conflict, or the contradictories of the disjuncts are not incompatible, then that is false as a disjunctive proposition (LS 301).
For Chrysippus the paradigmatically true conditional is one where the contradictory of the consequent conflicts with the antecedent. In the conditional below, the contradictory of the consequent is Plato does not move. And this claim can reasonably be said to be in conflict with our antecedent: Plato walks.
If (antecedent) Plato walks, then (consequent) Plato moves.
And although there is no detailed or precise account of how Chrysippus understood this notion of conflict, it is likely the case that the conflict in question is of the conceptual variety rather than mere empirical incompatibility (See LS 211). The type of conditional in question can be contrasted with the material conditional of the propositional calculus favored by many modern logicians, where a conditional is true provided the antecedent is false or the consequent is true (or is understood inclusively here). Consider the claim If we have pie, then we will have coffee. The contradictory of our consequent is We will not have coffee, and this claim does not present any real conflict with the antecedent of our claim, namely, We will have pie. Furthermore, a conditional of the material variety is truth-functional, that is, true just by virtue of the truth of its constituents. (The Stoics preferred to express claims of this sort as ‘it is not the case that we will have pie and not have coffee’.) Notice how a Chrysippean conditional, mutatis mutandis a Chrysippean disjunction, depends upon more than the truth-value of its constituents. Not only does it depend upon the contradictory of the consequent, it depends as well on a semantic understanding of what it is to conflict.
As we saw above, the Stoics classified certain kinds of sayables with reference to certain properties that are not part of linguistic form. In addition, Stoics classified sayables in terms of their modal properties, that is, possibility, necessity, impossibility, and non-necessity. (They also considered the properties of plausibility and probability as well (Bobzien 2003). For the Stoics’ account of modality, the Megarians are again an important influence (LS 231):
Diodorus defines the possible as ‘what is or will be’; the impossible as ‘what, being false, will not be true’; the necessary as ‘what being true, will not be false’; and the non-necessary as ‘what either is now, or will be false’.
An account such as this one fixes the possible to the temporal. If something is possible, say a sea-battle, then it occurs at some time. If something is impossible, say a triangle with less than three sides, then there will not be an instance of it at some time. The necessary sayable, for example, triangles have fewer than four sides, is that which will not be false at some time. And the non-necessary, Cypselus is ruling, is a claim that will be false at some time. One difficulty that accounts such as this face is that they do not explain sentences such as the following:
A golden mountain is at the top of Hannah Street.
This coat might have been shredded, but it was burned instead.
Sometimes we express a possibility that we believe will never actualize. Chrysippus offers a criticism similar in kind. He seems to argue that a jewel might never be smashed, but that insofar as one might receive credit for not smashing it, we would nevertheless consider it possible to smash the jewel (LS 235).
The set of modal definitions preferred by the Stoics is difficult to reconstruct. But there is some reason for thinking that Chyrsippus followed Philo in taking possible propositions to be those wherein the internal nature is capable of truth. Precisely what one is to make of the locution ‘internal nature is capable of truth’ is not known. But it is tempting to understand Chrysippus on the basis of his objections to Diodorus, and his account of conditionals, as saying something akin to “a proposition is possible if conceptually self-consistent, and (if) there are no external circumstances preventing it”. The remaining modalities would be defined in relation to the possible.
For reasons similar to those of the Epicureans, the Stoics were materialists. Only that which can affect or be affected may be said to exist, so the argument runs; and only that which is corporeal may affect or be affected (Academica I.39). Nevertheless, their view does admit of a kind of dualism, as everything in the cosmos is the result of an active principle, namely God, upon a passive, or causally inert, indeterminate substrate (Lives VII.134). And for Chrysippus, divine presence in terrestrial things comes in the form of pneuma–a fiery kind of air, or ether (Lives 7.138-9), which gives form and quality to that which is per se devoid of quality. Although the Epicureans, following in the tradition of Democritus and Leucippus, were arguing that everything is made up of the discrete and the indivisible (atomon), the Stoics maintained that the prima materia upon which the active principle exercised its influence is continuous, serving as the substrate for everything from basic continua such as earth, water, air, and fire, to individual organisms such as Socrates and Secretariat. Where the Peripatetic would characterize Secretariat as an individual substance or thing, and brown as a property, or modification, thereof; Chrysippus, and the Stoics in general, would consider Secretariat to be a property or modification of the passive element, and the brown color to be, in turn, a disposition thereof.
As Simplicius reports in his commentary on Aristotle’s Categories (SVF 2.369):
The Stoics see fit to reduce the number of primary genera, and others they take over with changes in the reduced list. For they make their division a fourfold one, into substrates, the qualified, the disposed, and the relatively disposed.
Thus, the Stoics recognized four main levels of existence, and, as Long and Sedley have argued, there is some reason for thinking that these categories originated with Chrysippus (165). The first category is that of substrate (hupokeimenon). To locate an entity in this first category is to assign it existence without reference to its qualities. This characterless substance is being, or ousia, in its primary sense. The next level of being is that of quality. To be more precise, this level of being is something qualified by the inseparable god, reason, or soul, that pervades the substrate, and on the account of Chrysippus, this takes the form of pneuma (LS 46A). In the second category the Stoics placed modifications or qualified substrates (poia) of the prima materia and, interestingly, it is in this category of qualities, or poia, that the Stoics include people, and organisms, in general. Organisms are, therefore in an important sense, adjectival in being. The third category concerns dispositions of the things that are qualified, or things that are qualified, disposed in some way (põs echonta). Grammatical knowledge, for example, would be a disposition of the grammarian. In the fourth category, the Stoics countenanced dispositions that are relatively so, or pros ti põs echonta. These dispositions bear a resemblance to the so called Cambridge properties that may change without any change to the item under consideration, as, for example, your being to the right of me may occur without my having changed my position.
The Stoics were, moreover, materialists. Only corporeals, or somata, exist. Existence, however, is not the highest ontological category. In the Sophist, Plato had suggested that for something x to be some thing was for x to exist. But the Stoics reject Plato’s suggestion, maintaining that reality may be divided on the one hand into corporeals (somata), which may be said to exist; and on the other hand into incorporeals (asomata), which may be said to subsist (SVF 1.65). The Stoics thought that the latter category was comprised of such things as time, place, void, and ‘sayable’ (lekta). The Stoics’ reason for saying that the incoporeals are real has, to be sure, a Meinongian ring. In order to be an object of one’s thought, a lekta, for example, must be something. Otherwise there is nothing one is ex hypothesi thinking about.
Understood in this way, the Stoic ontological classification implicitly rules out properties of a certain kind. Socrates and Glaucon, for example, both have the attribute of being a man. And this invites the question: Does this so called entity Man, under which both are said to be classified, exist? Plato on the received view (but see Grabowski 2008), and Aristotle, held that (i) the property of being a man exists independently of our recognition thereof, and, (ii) that the property, that of being a man, which belongs to Socrates, is numerically identical to the property, similarly described, which belongs to Callias. Though the philosophical literature on properties is less than univocal, in terminology and criteria, those who accept the received view, attributed here to Plato and Aristotle, are frequently referred to as Realists. Those who maintain that properties described in this way do not exist are frequently called Nominalists.
Chrysippus resolutely rejects the views of Plato and Aristotle concerning properties. But the committed Nominalist will have to say something about propositions which are taken to be true, and which, importantly, seem to refer to such entities, call them for present purposes, universals. Consider the following proposition:
(A) Man is a rational mortal animal.
Chrysippus, as we will see below, relies upon the truth of this proposition in his ethical philosophy. The advocate of this proposition, however, would seem to be committed to the universal Man. In order to avoid this ontological commitment, Chrysippus understands the claim as conditional rather than existential in form (LS 301):
(A*) If something is a man, that thing is a rational mortal animal.
Although (A*), as one might argue, is identical in meaning to (A), (A*) does not make use of the abstract term Man, and if (A*) does not require the use of the abstract term Man, Chrysippus needn’t countenance any entity to which the term may refer in order to count (A*) to be true. And, since he takes the meaning of (A) and (A*) to be one and the same, he can take (A) to be true as well. Of course, there are propositions in addition to (A) that one might consider orthodox, which seem to make reference to abstract entities. Chrysippus is optimistic that a similar kind of paraphrase will apply, mutatis mutandis, to these.
Having argued that one need not posit the existence of universals to account for certain propositions of the orthodox variety, Chrysippus developed an argument in support of the claim that the Platonic account is unintelligible (LS 30 E):
Indeed, Chrysippus too raises problems as to whether the Idea will be called a certain this (tode ti)…Namely: if someone is in Athens, he is not in Megara; <but man is in Athens; therefore man is not in Megara>. For man is not someone, since the universal is not someone; but we took him as someone in the argument. And that is why the argument has this name, being called the ‘Not-someone’ argument.
The argument is a little impressionistic, but we might begin to reconstruct it as follows:
(1) If someone (or something) is in Athens, he (or it) is not in Megara.
(2) Man is in Athens.
So: (3) Man is not in Megara.
The argument seems to be a reductio ad absurdum built upon the idea that the Platonist will accept claims (1) and (2). The acceptance of (1) and (2), however, with an application of modus ponens, entails something the Platonist will not willingly accept. At this point, the Platonist might feel pushed to claim that Man is not to be classified by the terms, that is, someone or something, in the first premise. This, however, comes dangerously close to conceding a point to which the Platonist is not entitled, that is, Man is not something. Perhaps a more appealing move for the Platonist would be to give up (1) maintaining that universals are something, and that they are things that may be found in objects that are in different places, such as Athens and Megara, at the same time. This of course flushes out the very queer nature of universals. It seems that countenancing universals countenances entities that may be located simultaneously in a number of places, if they are located at all. It is, of course, open to the Platonist to argue that the properties in question do not exist in space, so it is a mistake to say that they are ‘located’ in a number of places at the same time.
As Long and Sedley argue, the fourfold ontological distinction seems to have emerged in response to Academic criticism, and Chrysippus seems to have been the central respondent (172). The Academics had made use of an argument known as the Growing Argument, which is traced to the fifth-century comic poet named Epicharmus, in order to generate skepticism with respect to the idea that an organism may endure, or exist diachronically (LS 28A). The argument begins by making use of an analogy that may be adapted to suit our purposes as follows: Suppose that I have a stack of pennies in my garage on Tuesday, and I remove one of the pennies on Wednesday. The resultant stack of pennies in my garage is, arguably, not the same stack that was in my garage on Tuesday, but a new stack altogether. To drive the idea home, we might suppose that the stack is not composed, as it were, of pennies, but rather of fifty dollar bills. Suppose I promise Helena, on Tuesday, that she may have the stack of bills provided that she cleans the garage. Were I to remove one of the fifties before giving her the stack, she can fairly protest that I did not give her the same stack I had promised her. The moral to glean, then, is that when it comes to stacks or lumps, the removal (or addition) of one (or more) of the constituents results in the destruction of the old (or the generation of a new) lump or stack. As the Academics were inclined to point out, on the Stoic view, people are composed entirely of matter. And who can deny that in, say, drinking a cup of coffee, or a glass of wine, there is an influx (and later there will be an efflux) of material constituents? What is more, work central to Stoic cosmology involved the study of natural processes. Where growth and decay are among the most fundamental of these, the Academics challenged the idea that any coherent account may here be provided (Sedley 1982, 258).
Those who are familiar with John Locke’s treatment of diachronic identity, in The Essay Concerning Human Understanding, will spot a certain resemblance in Chrysippus’s response. For Chrysippus seems to believe that a single object may, under different descriptions, have incompatible properties ascribed thereto (Sedley 1982, 259). Under the description ‘this lump of matter’, one’s identity may change continually from one moment to the next. Under the description ‘this person’, this need not be the case. For Chrysippus, moreover, a thing’s constitutive matter is a hupokeimenon. And, as a substrate, as Chrysippus concedes, things do not exist diachronically. Nevertheless, lumps of matter possess unique sets of qualities, and may be classified under the second category of the Stoic ontology. These items can be said to be idiõs poioi, ‘peculiarly qualifieds’, which can indeed endure through time. It is in this way that living things are said to exist diachronically.
Having disarmed the Growing Argument in this way, Chrysippus seems to have taken his case on the offensive. The text we have to work with derives from Philo of Alexandria:
Chrysippus, the most distinguished member of their school, in his work On the Growing Argument, creates a freak of the following kind. Having first established that it is possible for two peculiarly qualified individuals to occupy the same substance jointly, he says: “For the sake of argument, let one individual be thought of as whole-limbed; the other as minus one foot. Let the whole-limbed one be called Dion, the defective one Theon. Then let one of Dion’s feet be amputated…”
Chrysippus’ thought-experiment here bears a striking resemblance to a more modern puzzle that has been discussed by David Wiggins (1968): consider a cat by the name of Tibbles, and focus for the moment on that portion of Tibbles that includes everything save Tibbles tale. Designate the portion that includes everything but Tibbles’ tale with the name Tib. Tibbles and Tib, heretofore, do not occupy the same space at the same time. Thus, Tibbles and Tib are not identical. Suppose, however, that we amputate Tibbles’ tale. Tibbles and Tib now occupy the same region of space. If Tibbles is still a cat, it will be difficult to discern a criterion by which one could deny that Tib is a cat. Nevertheless, Tibbles and Tib are distinct individuals as they have had different histories. Hence, two cats occupy, and of course don’t occupy (so runs the reductio), the same place. And the puzzle, for Wiggins, is to see where the reasoning has gone astray. Chrysippus’ puzzle is very similar: Dion and Theon are said to occupy the same substance (rather than the same space), and where Dion has a right foot, Theon lacks one. However, when Dion’s foot is amputated, Chrysippus’s approach is not that of considering the conclusion to be validly derived from faulty premises. Instead, Chrysippus rejects the idea that Theon continues to exist. By all appearances, Chrysippus seems to have argued that after the amputation, when a bystander poses the question ‘Whose foot has been severed?’ the only intelligible answer is: that of Dion. As Theon could not have lost a foot he never had, and whoever is being bandaged there just lost a foot, Dion is the better candidate for survival. Of course, the paradox cannot be said to be constructed on Stoic premises. Sedley argues that Chrysippus turns the Growing Argument back on the Academics by showing that although they assume that material growth and diminution are fatal to the idea of an enduring entity, diminution is indeed part of the condition of Dion’s enduring, while the undiminished, unchanged Theon is the one who perishes (1982, 270).
Providence plays the leading role in Stoic cosmology. An instance of causation is, after all, the operation of the active principle, namely god, on that which is passive or inert. This providence gives way, for Chrysippus, to an outlook on the cosmos that is very deterministic (SVF2.1000).
In On Providence book 4, Chrysippus says that fate is a certain natural, everlasting ordering of the whole: one set of things follows and succeeds another, and the interconnection is inviolable.
Chrysippus’s deterministic outlook invites the following question: If the cosmos is ordered in a deterministic fashion, and we are part of it, then it would seem that we are ordered in a deterministic fashion. Thus, our actions will follow the one upon the other in a succession where the nexus is never violable. And, if we may never deviate from the course ordered by fate, we never have the control to act otherwise. Chrysippus’s cosmology seems not to accommodate the view that we are sometimes morally responsible for our actions. Stoic philosophy is, however, a philosophy of moral rigor, so Chrysippus owes an answer. Epicurean philosophers maintained a minimal level of indeterminacy at the atomic level (De Rerum Natura 2.216). As we have seen, this option is not open to Chrysippus and, in any case, the indeterminacy view is not without difficulty. (As Hume argued in the Enquiry, one has no control over that which lacks a cause). The acceptance of determinism taken with an optimistic outlook concerning the possibility of free action suggests that Chrysippus countenances the latter as compatible with the former. Precisely how the two are going to be understood as compatible has, however, been the subject of some controversy.
One possibility for understanding Chrysippus’ view can be derived from the following text (Long and Sedley 62a):
They too [Zeno and Chrysippus] affirmed that everything is fated, with the following model: When a dog is tied to a cart, if it wants to follow it is pulled and follows, making its spontaneous act coincide with necessity, but if it does not want to follow it will be compelled in any case. So it is with men too: even if they do not want to, they will be compelled in any case to follow what is destined.
This passage has been interpreted in a variety of ways. One might understand the point to be as follows. The threat that fatalism or determinism poses for moral responsibility seems to enter with the idea that if we cannot act otherwise than we do, we are not free. But consider our dog Maddy, fettered as she is to her master’s cart. We may assume that she follows her master, who is pulling the cart, with a canine sense of alacrity, and that she would do so, in much the same way, even were she not tied to the cart. It seems that she freely follows her master when, nevertheless, she could not act otherwise. Read in this way, the passage is a counterexample to the claim that if one cannot act otherwise, one is not free.
Susanne Bobzien has argued that the simile was authored by neither Zeno nor Chrysippus, but instead has its source in the Roman Stoa, and although she does acknowledge that it is probably an interpretation of a number of verses belonging to Cleanthes (2001 354), she finds nothing in the passage that meets up with accommodating free will. The point of the passage, on her view, is simply that it is in vain that one revolts from what fate administers.
Another important passage for exegetes is the following:
For although assent cannot occur unless it is prompted by an impression, nevertheless, since it has that impression as its proximate, not its primary cause, Chrysippus wants it to have the rationale which I mentioned just now. He does not want assent, at least, to be able to occur without the stimulus of external force (for assent must be prompted by an impression). But he resorts to his cylinder and spinning-top; these cannot begin to move without a push; but once that has happened, he holds that it is thereafter through their own nature that the cylinder rolls and the top spins. “Hence”, he says, “just as the person who pushed the cylinder gave it its beginning of motion but not its capacity for rolling, likewise, although the impression encountered will print and, as it were, emblazon its appearance on the mind, assent will be in our power. And assent, just as we said in the case of the cylinder, although prompted from will, thereafter moves through its own force”.
The above passage is important in connection with Chrysippus’s epistemology, meeting up as it does with the issue of whether belief or acceptance is a voluntary process. But it may also hold a clue concerning Chrysippus’ account of free action in general. The idea seems to be that the cylinder needs to be pushed in order to be set in motion, and considerations of the Newtonian variety aside, the power to keep rolling is specific to its nature. And, just as the power to keep rolling is found in the nature of the cylinder, so too the power of assent or dissent issues from the agent’s power. Of course, one might object that one may have little to no control over the dispositions that drive one to assent or dissent. And, if one doesn’t haven’t any control over certain antecedent events, that necessitate certain other events, then it seems that one doesn’t have any control over the subsequent events either. That this latter claim is true is not obvious however (McKay and Johnson 1996): Suppose with fair dice I roll snake eyes. From this fact, it follows by necessity that I am playing dice. But does it follow that my playing dice was not up to me? I certainly cannot roll snake eyes without playing dice. But is my playing dice necessitated in the same way? Perhaps the way is unimpeded for Chrysippus to make use of a similar kind of reasoning in his account of free action.
As Aristotle observed, although most people agree that happiness or eudaimonia is the goal of life, there is less agreement concerning just what happiness consists in (1095a17). The Stoics agree with Aristotle that living a happy life is the end for the sake of which all things are done, and that such an activity is not done for the sake of anything else (SVF 3.16). Having set eudaimonia or eu zên as the summum bonum, the Stoics are left with the task of indicating wherein happiness consists. And, for the Stoics, happiness consists in nothing other than virtue (De Finibus III.44):
We deem health to be deserving of a certain value, but we do not reckon it a good; at the same time we rate no value so highly as to place it above virtue. This is not the same view held by the Peripatetics, who are going to say that an action which is both moral (honesta) and without pain is more desirable than the same action with pain. We [Stoics] think otherwise.
Nothing, then, is valued more than virtue. One might take happiness to be of a higher value than virtue, as the former may be thought of as a means to the latter, but this would be a mistake, for it seems that Chrysippus was willing to simply identify the virtuous life and the happy life (LS 63h):
He (Chrysippus) maintains that vice is the essence of unhappiness, insisting in every book that he writes on ethics and physics that living viciously is identical to living unhappily.
Of course, in identifying happiness with virtue, Chrysippus is obligated to provide an account of virtue. Zeno, the founder of the school at the Stoa Poikilê, had maintained that the final end of life was to live consistently and harmoniously (SVFI.79). His successor, Cleanthes, understood living consistently and harmoniously as living consistently with nature (SVF3.12.) Chrysippus further explicated the idea with the following formulation: “To live in accordance with one’s experience of the things which come about by nature” (SVF1.12). But it is still unclear what living in accordance with nature means. Friedrich Nietzsche, a German philosopher of the 19th century, attempted to parody the idea by saying:
According to nature you want to live? O you noble Stoics, what deceptive words these are…And supposing your imperative, “live according to nature,” meant at bottom as much as “living according to life”—how could you not do that? Why make a principle out of what you yourselves are and must be?
As we have seen, a fairly thorough determinism pervades the thought of the Stoics, and the course to understanding Chrysippus’s views on action is not without difficulty. So one might fairly ask the question: How might one not live according to nature? In order to understand what the Stoics have in mind, it is important to note that a recurring debate among philosophical circles in antiquity concerned whether what is good is so in virtue of nature (physis) or convention (nomos). As Aristotle points out in the Nichomachean Ethics, there is such diversity among opinions concerning which actions are just that they are thought to exist according to convention rather than nature (1094b 14-16). So, living in conformity with nature or with what is good by nature, contrasts with living in accordance with mere opinion, or convention, concerning what is good. Now, when Chrysippus says, one ought to live in accordance with one’s experience of the things which come about by nature, there is some reason for thinking the nature he has in mind is the nature that is peculiar to human beings. The proprium or nature of the human species is the use of reason. So it seems that Chrysippus’s position is that the man who lives in accordance with reason lives in accordance with virtue. This is a position that enjoys some popularity and that rings reminiscent of Aristotle’s in Nichomachean Ethics. The problem of accounting for free action has not, thus, been cleared away. Nor has the gap between is and ought, hereby, closed. But the imperative ‘live according to nature’ may simply mean ‘live according to your nature qua human being by living in accordance with reason’. And, as an account of virtue, this view had a few considerations in its favor.
Although Chrysippus’s views on virtue share a great deal with those of Aristotle, another clear similarity concerns the connections that Chrysippus and Socrates found to obtain among the cardinal virtues. Socrates seems to have thought that virtues may be reduced to one thing (Protagoras 361a-b), namely, the ability to discern good from evil. In the Laches, for example, it is suggested that courage may be reduced to wisdom by arguing that courage is the knowledge of what inspires fear and confidence. That which issues in fear is evil, and that which inspires confidence is good. Courage is, so the argument goes, knowledge of what is good and what is evil (198b2-199e). Arguments similar in kind reduce the other virtues to knowledge of good and evil, and Chrysippus seems to have retained Socrates’s line of thinking. Prudence is the knowledge of things to be chosen; temperance is the knowledge, for example, of that for which one must be resolute (SVF3.95). Of course, understanding virtue as reducible, in some way, to knowledge dovetails nicely with the idea that virtue is living in accordance with reason.
It is usually thought that the source of knowledge requisite for virtue, according to Chrysippus, is the study of natural philosophy. However, in recent years there has been some debate concerning whether or not the science of ethics, according to Zeno, Cleanthes, and Chrysippus depends crucially upon claims about the nature of the cosmos. A number of scholars now believe that the founders of Stoic philosophy should be freed from the interpretation that ethics relies heavily upon a cosmology that is un- controversially providential. Julia Annas, for example, finds it hard to swallow the idea that ethics depends on cosmology as it “…lead[s] us…to accept counterintuitive conclusions such as nothing but vice is bad, and that emotions like regret are all mistaken”. Accepting the view, however, that the Stoics did not think ethics inextricably tied to physics has its own set of counterintuitive consequences, for it becomes difficult to take them at their word in more than a few key texts. The following is taken from Plutarch (admittedly not the most charitable reader of Stoicism), from his De Stoicorum Repugnantis (LS 60A):
Again in his Physical Postulates, [Chrysippus] says, “There is no other or more appropriate way of approaching the theory of good and bad things or the virtues or happiness than from universal nature (koinê physis), and from the administration of the world”. And later: “For the theory of good and bad, things must be attached to these, since there in no other starting point or reference for them that is better, and physical speculation (physika theoria) is to be adopted for no other purpose than for the differentiation of good and bad things”.
A straightforward reading of Plutarch’s quotation here—this is the reading, for example, of Long and Sedley (LS 374)—is that an account of the rational and providential features of god, which pervade the natural world, are indispensable when determining that which constitutes the good of man. Read in this way, Chrysippus comes across as a teleologist countenancing the good, the scientific, and the pious lives to be one and the same.
The following lists some important work that has been done on Chrysippus and Stoic philosophy. It is not intended to be a comprehensive bibliography.
- Stoicorum Veterum Fragmenta in Four Volumes (Leipzig: Teubner, 1903-1924)
- This work, originally compiled by Hans von Arnim, consisted of three volumes of testimonia and fragments intended for individuals with a background in Latin and Greek literature. Volume one contains fragments relating to Zeno and his followers. Volume two contains fragments related to Chrysippus’s logical and natural philosophy. The third volume contains material related to Chrysippus’s ethical philosophy. A fourth volume containing general indices was added in 1924 by Maximillian Adler.
- The Hellenistic philosophers, Volume 1: Translations of the Principal Sources, with Philo-Sophical Commentary, by A.A. Long and D.N. Sedley, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1987.
- This work is probably indispensable for anyone interested in Hellenistic philosophy. It contains English translations and astute commentary. An accompanying volume contains the Greek and Latin texts from which the translations are derived.
- Josiah B. Gould, The Philosophy of Chrysippus, Albany, SUNY Press, 1970.
- This is one of the few monographs limited to discerning the thought of Chrysippus. It is a common starting point for exegetes interested in Chrysippus’s influence on Stoicism.
- Susanne Bobzien, Determinism and Freedom in Stoic Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2001.
- Although this work treats the issue of free action in Stoic thought in general, there is a great deal that focuses upon Chrysippus’s views specifically. A number of other articles by Bobzien, including the following, will also be rewarding:
- Susanne Bobzien, ‘Chrysippus and the Epistemic Theory of Vagueness’, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 102 (2002), 217-38.
- Susanne Bobzien,‘Chrysippus’s Theory of Causes’, Topics in Stoic Philosophy, ed. K. Ierodiakonou, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999, 196-242.
- Susanne Bobzien, ‘Logic’, Cambridge Companion to the Stoics, ed. Brad Inwood, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003, 85-123.
- J. Bowin, ‘Chrysippus’s Puzzle about Identity’, Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 24 (2003), 239-251.
- God and Cosmos in Stoicism, ed. Ricardo Salles Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2009.
- Readers interested in questions concerning nature, and how humans fit therein, will find a number of interesting essays in God and Cosmos. Recent interest in how humans fit into the environment has issued an interest in the Stoic conception of how humans fit into nature. Several of the essays in this work treat primarily Chrysippus’s views.
- Annas, J. ‘Ethics in Stoic Philosophy’, Phronesis, 52, 58-87.
- Caston, V. ‘Something and Nothing: The Stoics on Concepts and Universals’, Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 17, 145-213.
- Grabowski, F. Plato, Metaphysics and the Forms. Continuum Studies in Ancient Philosophy, New York/London: Continuum, 2008.
- McKay, Thomas and David Johnson (1996). “A Reconsideration of an Argument against Compatibilism”, Philosophical Topics 24: 113-122.
- Nietzsche, F. Beyond Good and Evil, in Basic Writings of Nietzsche, tr. and ed. Walter Kaufmann, New York: Modern Library, 1992: 205.
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