Constructive mathematics is positively characterized by the requirement that proof be algorithmic. Loosely speaking, this means that when a (mathematical) object is asserted to exist, an explicit example is given: a constructive existence proof demonstrates the existence of a mathematical object by outlining a method of finding (“constructing”) such an object. The emphasis in constructive theory is placed on hands-on provability, instead of on an abstract notion of truth. The classical concept of validity is starkly contrasted with the constructive notion of proof. An implication (A⟹B) is not equivalent to a disjunction (¬A∨B), and neither are equivalent to a negated conjunction (¬(A∧¬B)). In practice, constructive mathematics may be viewed as mathematics done using intuitionistic logic.
With the advent of the computer, much more emphasis has been placed on algorithmic procedures for obtaining numerical results, and constructive mathematics has come into its own. For, a constructive proof is exactly that: an algorithmic procedure for obtaining a conclusion from a set of hypotheses.
The historical and philosophical picture is complex; various forms of constructivism have developed over time. Presented here is a brief introduction to several of the more widely accepted approaches, and is by no means comprehensive.
Table of Contents
- Motivation and History
- Constructive Recursive Mathematics
- Bishop’s Constructive Mathematics
- Martin-Löf Type Theory
- Constructive Reverse Mathematics
- References and Further Reading
The origin of modern constructive mathematics lies in the foundational debate at the turn of the 20th Century. At that time, the German mathematician David Hilbert established some very deep and far-reaching existence theorems using non-constructive methods. Around the same time, the Dutch mathematician L.E.J. Brouwer became philosophically convinced that the universal validity of contradiction proofs for existence proofs was unwarranted—despite his early work in establishing the non-constructive fixed point theorem which now bears his name.
It is often the case that a classical theorem becomes more enlightening when seen from the constructive viewpoint (we meet an example of such a case—the least upper bound principle—in Section 1d. It would, however, be unfair to say that constructive mathematics is revisionist in nature. Indeed, Brouwer proved his Fan Theorem (see Section 2b) intuitionistically in 1927 (Brouwer, 1927), but the first proof of König’s Lemma (its classical equivalent) only appeared in 1936 (König, 1936). It is ironic that the Brouwer’s intuitionist position (see Section 2) has become known as anti-realist since it demands that every object be explicitly constructible.
Here is an example of a non-constructive proof that is commonly encountered in the literature:
There exist non-rational numbers
The proof is non-constructive because even though it shows that the non-existence of such numbers would be contradictory, it leaves us without the knowledge of which choice of
Constructive mathematics is often mis-characterized as classical mathematics without the axiom of choice (see Section 1f); or classical mathematics without the Law of Excluded Middle. But seen from within the discipline, constructive mathematics is positively characterized by a strict provability requirement. The consequences of adopting this stance—and rigorously implementing it—are far-reaching, as will be seen.
There are two conditions which are fundamental to every constructivist philosophy:
- The notion of `truth’ is not taken as primitive; rather, a proposition is considered true only when a proof for the proposition is produced.
- The notion of `existence’ is taken to be constructibility: when an object is proved to exist, the proof also exhibits how to find it.
To assert that
PEM: For any statement
P, either Por ¬P.
The assertion of PEM constructively amounts to claiming that, for any given statement
The Collatz conjecture. Define
Then for each natural number
At the time of writing this article, the Collatz conjecture remains unsolved. To claim that there is a proof of it is erroneous; likewise to claim that there is a proof that it leads to a contradiction is also erroneous. In fact, in Brouwer’s view (see Section 2), to assert PEM is to claim that any mathematical problem has a solution. Thus there are good philosophical grounds for rejecting PEM.
The following interpretation of logical connectives is now known as the Brouwer-Heyting-Kolmogorov (BHK) interpretation, and is widely accepted by constructivists.
|| We have a proof of
|| We have both a proof of
|| We have either a proof of
| We have an algorithm that converts any proof of
| We have a proof that
| We have an algorithm which computes an object
| We have an algorithm which, given any object
In particular, the interpretations for
The BHK interpretation characterizes a logic called intuitionistic logic. Every form of constructive mathematics has intuitionistic logic at its core; different schools have different additional principles or axioms given by the particular approach to constructivism.
Upon adopting only constructive methods, we lose some powerful proof tools commonly used in classical mathematics. We have already seen that the Principle of Excluded Middle is highly suspect from the constructivist viewpoint, as (under the BHK interpretation) it claims the existence of a universal algorithm to determine the truth of any given statement. This is not to say that PEM is constructively false, however. Both Russian recursive mathematics (in which PEM is provably false) and classical mathematics (in which it is logically true) are in a sense models, or interpretations, of constructive mathematics. So in a way, PEM is independent of constructive mathematics. Note, however, that if one is given a statement, it may be possible to prove PEM concerning that particular statement—such statements are called decidable. The point is that there is no general constructive method for doing so for all statements.
If PEM is not universally valid we also lose universal applicability of any mode of argument which validates it. For example, double negation elimination, or proof by contradiction. Again, it must be emphasized that it is only the universal applicability which is challenged: proof by contradiction is constructively just fine for proving negative statements; and double negation elimination is just fine for decidable statements.
However these limitations are in fact often advantages. In a lot of cases, constructive alternatives to non-constructive classical principles in mathematics exist, leading to results which are often constructively stronger than their classical counterpart. For example, the classical least upper bound principle (LUB) is not constructively provable:
LUB: Any nonempty set of real numbers that is bounded from above has a least upper bound.
The constructive least upper bound principle, by contrast, is constructively provable (Bishop & Bridges, 1985, p. 37):
CLUB: Any order-located nonempty set of reals that is bounded from above has a least upper bound.
A set is order-located if given any real
It is quite common for a constructive alternative to be classically equivalent to the classical principle; and, indeed, classically every nonempty set of reals is order-located.
To see why LUB is not provable, we may consider a so-called Brouwerian counterexample (see Section 2a), such as the set
In the late 19th century, the mathematical community embarked on a search for foundations: unquestionable solid ground on which mathematical theorems could be proved. An early exemplar of this search is Kronecker’s 1887 paper “Über den Zahlbegriff” (“On the Concept of Number”) (Kronecker, 1887), where he outlines the project of arithmetization (that is, founding on the fundamental notion of number) of analysis and algebra. It is perhaps in this work that we see the earliest instance of the constructive manifesto in mathematical practice. Kronecker was famously quoted by Weber (1893) as saying “Die ganzen Zahlen hat der liebe Gott gemacht, alles andere ist Menschenwerk.” (“The integers were made by God; all else is the work of man.”)
It has been said that “almost all mathematical proofs before 1888 were essentially constructive.” (Beeson, 1985, p. 418). This is not to say that constructive mathematics, as currently conceived of, was common practice; but rather that the natural interpretation of existence of the time was existence in the constructive sense. As mathematical concepts have changed over time, however, old proofs have taken on new meaning. There are thus plenty of examples of results which are today regarded as essentially non-constructive, but seen within the context of the period during which they were written, the objects of study that the authors had in mind allowed proofs of a constructive nature. One good example of this is Cauchy’s 1821 proof of the Intermediate Value Theorem (Cauchy, 1821; in Bradley & Sandifer, 2009, pp. 309–312); the classical interval-halving argument. The concept of “function” has, since then, expanded to include objects which allow for Brouwerian counterexamples (see Section 2a).
The first major systematic development of a constructive approach to mathematics is that of Brouwer and the intuitionists, introduced in the next major section. Some notable forerunners (who should perhaps not be thought of as intuitionists themselves) were Henri Poincaré, who argued that mathematics is in a way more immediate than logic, and Emile Borel, who maintained that the only objects that concern science are those that can be effectively defined (Borel, 1914). Poincaré argues that intuition is a necessary component of mathematical thought, rejects the idea of an actual infinite, and argues that mathematical induction is an unprovable fact (Poincaré, 1908).
As a result of techniques from ZF set theory, rigorous proofs have over time taken on non-constructive aspects. David Hilbert, contemporary of Brouwer and an opponent of Brouwer’s philosophy, deserves particular mention, since he was an early pioneer of highly non-constructive techniques. The debate between Brouwer and Hilbert grew fierce and controversial, which perhaps added fuel to the development of both constructivism (à la Brouwer) and formalism (à la Hilbert) (see, for example, van Heijenoort, 1976). The spectacular 1890 proof by Hilbert of his famous basis theorem (Hilbert, 1890), showing the existence of a finite set of generators for the invariants of quantics, was greeted by the German mathematician Gordan with another now-(in)famous phrase: “Das ist nicht Mathematik. Das ist Theologie.” (“That is not Mathematics. That is Theology.”) This is perhaps the most dramatic example of a non-constructive proof, relying on PEM in an infinite extension.
The method Hilbert exhibited there has become widely accepted by the mathematics community as a pure existence proof (that is, proving that non-existence of such an object was contradictory without actually exhibiting the object); however it was not admissible as a constructive technique. Weyl, one of Hilbert’s students (who Hilbert would eventually “lose”—perhaps temporarily—to intuitionism) commented on pure existence proofs, that they “inform the world that a treasure exists without disclosing its location” (Weyl, 1946). The Axiom of Choice, perhaps due in part to its regular use in many non-constructive proofs (and heavily implicated in many of Hilbert’s most influential proofs), has been accused of being the source of non-constructivity in mathematics.
The Axiom of Choice (AC) has been controversial to varying degrees in mathematics ever since it was recognized by Zermelo (1904). Loosely, it states that given a collection of non-empty sets, we can choose exactly one item from each set.
AC: If to each
xin Athere corresponds a yin B, then there is a function fsuch that f(x)is in Bwhenever xis in A.
Formally, given non-empty sets
Intuitively, this seems almost trivial, and the case where the non-empty sets are finite in size is indeed so, since one does not need the axiom of choice to prove that such a choice can be made in most formulations of set theory. However it becomes less clear when the size of the sets involved is very large or somehow not easily determined. In such cases, a principled, functional choice may not necessarily be made. Even in classical mathematics, the axiom of choice is occasionally viewed with some suspicion: it leads to results that are surprising and counterintuitive, such as the Banach-Tarski paradox: using the axiom of choice allows one to take a solid sphere in 3-dimensional space, decompose it into a finite number of non-overlapping pieces, and reassemble the pieces (using only rotations and translations) into two solid spheres, each with volume identical to the original sphere. Due to its controversial nature, many mathematicians will explicitly state when and where in their proof AC has been used.
Nonetheless, the BHK interpretation of the quantifiers seems to invite one to think about the existential quantifier
for some syntactically correct statement
It is no coincidence that the symbolic form of AC suggests that it is essentially a quantifier swap: AC states that if to each element of
The example set
If there is a name synonymous with constructive mathematics, it is L.E.J. Brouwer (Luitzen Egbertus Jan Brouwer; Bertus to his friends). In his doctoral thesis, Over de Grondslagen der Wiskunde (On the Foundations of Mathematics; Brouwer, 1907), Brouwer began his program of laying the foundations of constructive mathematics in a systematic way. Brouwer’s particular type of constructive mathematics is called “intuitionism” or “intuitionistic mathematics” (not to be confused with intuitionistic logic; recall Section 1c).
Shortly after the presentation of his thesis, Brouwer wrote a paper entitled “De onbetrouwbaarheid der logische principes” (“The Untrustworthiness of the Principles of Logic”; Brouwer, 1908), in which he challenged the absolute validity of classical logic: “De vraag naar de geldigheid van het principium tertii exclusi is dus aequivalent met de vraag naar de mogelijkheid van onoplosbare wiskundige problemen.” (“The question of validity of the principle of excluded third is equivalent to the question of the possibility of unsolvable mathematical problems.”; Brouwer, 1908, p. 156) In other words, PEM is valid only if there are no unsolvable mathematical problems.
In intuitionistic mathematics, mathematics is seen as a free creation of the human mind: a (mathematical) object exists just in case it can be (mentally) constructed. This immediately justifies the BHK interpretation, since any existence proof cannot be a proof-by-contradiction—the contradiction leaves us without a construction of the object.
According to Brouwer, the natural numbers and (perhaps surprisingly) the continuum, are primitive notions given directly by intuition alone. This connects to the idea of what Brouwer called free choice sequence, a generalization of the notion of sequence. It is perhaps ironic that when Brouwer initially encountered the idea of a free choice sequence, which had been a mathematical curiosity at the time, he rejected such sequences as non-intuitionistic (Brouwer, 1912). However, soon afterward he accepted them and was the first to discover how important they were to practical constructive mathematics (Brouwer, 1914). This is one of two major aspects which distinguishes intuitionistic mathematics from other kinds of constructive mathematics (the second being Brouwer’s technique of bar induction, which we do not explain in great depth here; though see Section 2b).
A free choice sequence is given by a constructing agent (Brouwer’s creative subject), who is at any stage of the progression of a sequence free to choose (or subject to mild restrictions) the next member of the sequence. For example, if one is asked to produce a binary free choice sequence, one may start “
The idea of a free choice sequence leads to some very strong commitments. Not immediately obvious is the principle of continuous choice. It states:
P⊆NN×Nand for each xin NNthere exists nin Nsuch that (x,n)is in P, then there is a choice function f:NN→Nsuch that (x,f(x))is in Pfor all xin NN.
Intuitively, the principle arises from the following considerations. Let
The principle of continuous choice is a restricted form of the classical axiom of choice (see Section 1f). This principle (together with the BHK interpretation) gives rise to a number of very strong consequences—perhaps the most (in)famous being that every function
If this seems outlandish, then remember that in intuitionistic mathematics the very ideas of “function” and “real number” are different from their classical counterparts. We now discuss a technique that originated with Brouwer which justifies, to some extent, these conceptions.
As we have seen, Brouwer rejected the principle of excluded middle. The intuitionist school further rejects appeal to so-called omniscience principles; logical principles which allow one to decide the truth of predicates over an infinite number of things. An illuminating example of such a principle is the limited principle of omniscience (LPO), which states that:
For each binary sequence
a1a2a3…, either an=0for all natural numbers nor there exists a natural number nsuch that an=1.
In symbols LPO states that, for any given binary sequence
For one familiar with computability, the above statement will already appear problematical. It says that there is an algorithm which, given an arbitrary binary sequence will in finite time determine either that all the terms in
However, (modern) computational issues aside, this was not the problem seen by the intuitionist. To Brouwer, the possible existence of choice sequences made this statement unacceptable. Since a constructing agent is free to insert a
Thus we see that the lesser principle of omniscience does not apply to binary sequences in intuitionist mathematics. Let us now turn to the real numbers. The decimal expansion of
But suppose we define a real number
The previous paragraph is a Brouwerian counterexample to the statement "every real number satisfies the law of trichotomy". Trichotomy is exactly the decision (disjunction) that every real number is either positive, zero, or negative. Under Brouwer's view, we may construct real numbers about which we simply do not have enough information at hand—even in principle—to determine their sign.
In addition to the use of intuitionistic logic and the principle of continuous choice, Brouwer's intuitionism involves one final central technique, bar induction. It is a technically challenging idea which we do not cover in depth here (see Beeson, 1985, p. 51 or Troelstra & van Dalen, 1988, p. 229 for detail; see also Bridges, Dent & McKubre-Jordens, 2012). Bar induction is a key principle which allowed Brouwer to prove his Fan Theorem; we will outline the theorem for the binary fan, demonstrating the significance of the fan theorem.
The (complete) binary fan is the collection of all (finite) sequences of
- A bar of the binary fan is a set of `cut-offs', such that for each infinite path
αthrough the fan there exists a natural number nsuch that the first nterms of αare `in the bar'.
- A bar of the binary fan is uniform if there exists a natural number
Nsuch that for each infinite path αthrough the fan, there is some k≤Nsuch that the first kterms of αare in the bar.
Note the quantifier shift: we go from "for each path there exists
FAN: Every bar of the binary fan is uniform.
The classical contrapositive of the fan theorem, well-known in graph theory, is König's Lemma: if for every
As mentioned, the fact that Brouwer's proof of the fan theorem (1927) was published nine years before König's proof of his Lemma (1936) shows the innaccuracy of the criticism sometimes held that constructive mathematics is revisionist. Indeed, as is shown by the Gödel-Gentzen negative translation (Gödel, 1933), every classical theorem may be translated into a constructive theorem (some of which are not very informative); and so constructive mathematics can be interpreted as a generalization of classical mathematics. If one adds PEM to intuitionistic logic, then the full classical system is recovered. (Of course, the reverse view may also be argued for—that classical mathematics is a generalization of constructive methods.)
In the 1930s, amidst developments in what is now known as computer science, concepts of algorithmic computability were formalised. The well-known Turing machines,
CMT: a function is computable if and only if it is computable by a Turing machine.
Markov's work, based in what he called normal algorithms (now known as Markov algorithms; Markov, 1954) was essentially recursive function theory employing intuitionistic logic. In this type of constructive mathematics, the groundwork for which was done in the 40s and 50s, Church's thesis is accepted as true (as it is to classical mathematicians, by and large). Moreover, in Markov's school, Markov's Principle of unbounded search is accepted:
MP: For any binary sequence, if it is impossible that all the terms are zero, then there exists a term equal to 1.
This reflects the idea that if it is contradictory for all the terms to be zero, then (although we do not have an a priori bound on how far in the sequence we must seek) eventually any machine that is looking for a
While MP may seem like a kind of omniscience principle, there is a distinct difference: the implication
Recursive function theory with intuitionistic logic and Markov's principle is known as Russian recursive mathematics. If Markov's principle is omitted, this leaves constructive recursive mathematics more generally—however, there appear to be few current practitioners of this style of mathematics (Beeson, 1985, p. 48).
A central tenet of recursive function theory, is the following axiom of Computable Partial Functions:
CPF: There is an enumeration of the set of all computable partial functions from
Nto Nwith countable domains.
Much may be deduced using this seemingly innocuous axiom. For example, PEM (and weakenings thereof, such as LPO) may be shown to be (perhaps surprisingly) simply false within the theory.
Constructive recursive mathematics presents other surprises as well. Constructivists are already skeptical about PEM, LPO, and other wide-reaching principles. However, some amazing (and classically contradictory) results can be obtained, such as Specker's theorem (Specker, 1949):
There exists a strictly increasing sequence
To be `eventually bounded away from a number
Of course such sequences cannot be uniformly bounded away from the whole of
Another interesting result is the constructive existence, within this theory, of a recursive function from
In 1967 Errett Bishop published the seminal monograph Foundations of Constructive Analysis (Bishop, 1967). Not only did this assuage the worries expressed by some leading mathematicians (such as Weyl) about the feasibility of constructive proofs in analysis, but it helped lay the foundation for a programme of mathematical research that has flourished since. It captures the numerical content of a large part of the classical research programme and has become the standard for constructive mathematics in the broader sense, as we will shortly see.
Bishop refused to formally define the notion of algorithm in the BHK interpretation. It is in part this quality which lends Bishop-style constructive mathematics (BISH) the following property: every other model of constructive mathematics, philosophical background notwithstanding, can be seen as an interpretation of Bishop's constructive mathematics where some further assumptions have been added. For example, intuitionistic mathematics is BISH together with bar induction and continuous choice; and (Russian) constructive recursive mathematics is BISH together with the Computable Partial Functions axiom and Markov's Principle. Even classical mathematics—or mathematics with classical two-valued logic—can be seen as a model of Bishop-style constructive mathematics where the principle of excluded middle is added as axiom.
Another factor that contributes to this versatility is the fact that Bishop did not add extra philosophical commitments to the programme of his constructive mathematics, beyond the commitment of ensuring that every theorem has numerical meaning (Bishop, 1975). The idea of preserving numerical meaning is intuitive: the numerical content of any fact given in the conclusion of a theorem must somehow be algorithmically linked to (or preserved from) the numerical content of the hypotheses. Thus BISH may be used to study the same objects as the classical mathematician (or the recursive function theorist, or the intuitionist). As a result, a proof in Bishop-style mathematics can be read, understood, and accepted as correct, by everyone (Beeson, 1985, p. 49) (barring perhaps the paraconsistentists, for whom the disjunctive syllogism, weakening, and contraction—accepted under BHK—portend trouble).
At heart, Bishop's constructive mathematics is simply mathematics done with intuitionistic logic, and may be regarded as "constructive mathematics for the working mathematician" (Troelstra & van Dalen, 1988, p. 28). If one reads a Bishop-style proof, the classical analyst will recognize it as mathematics, even if some of the moves made within the proof seem slightly strange to those unaccustomed to preserving numerical meaning. Further, BISH can be interpreted in theories of computable mathematics, such as Weihrauch's Type 2 effectivity theory (Weihrauch, 2000).
One (in)famous claim Bishop makes is that "A choice function exists in constructive mathematics, because a choice is implied by the very meaning of existence" (Bishop & Bridges, 1985, p. 12). The axiom is in fact provable in some constructive theories (see Section 5). However, Diaconescu has shown that AC implies PEM, so it would seem that constructivists ought to accept PEM after all (the proof in Diaconescu (1975) is actually remarkably simple). And as we have seen, for some constructivists it would actually be inconsistent to accept PEM. It thus seems that AC, while very important, presents a significant problem for constructivists. However, as we now discuss, such a conclusion is hasty and unjustified.
The key observation to make regards the interpretation of the quantifiers. AC comes out as provable only when we interpret the quantifiers under BHK: for then the hypothesis
Let us return to Bishop's statement at the start of this section, regarding the existence of a choice function being implied by the meaning of existence. The context in which his claim was made illuminates the situation. The passage (Bishop & Bridges, 1985, p. 12) goes on to read: "[Typical] applications of the axiom of choice in classical mathematics either are irrelevant or are combined with a sweeping use of the principle of omniscience." This also shows that blaming the axiom of choice for non-constructivity is actually a mistake—it is the appeal to PEM, LPO, or similar absolute principles applied to objects other than the finite which prevent proof from being thoroughly algorithmic. Some constructive mathematicians adopt various weakenings of AC which are (perhaps) less contentious; Brouwer, as we saw in Section 2, adopts Continuous Choice.
Bishop's view is that the Gödel interpretation of logical symbols accurately describes numerical meaning (Bishop, 1970). This view does not appear to have retained much traction with practitioners of BISH (Beeson, 1985, p. 49). Leaving the question of foundations open is, as mentioned, partly responsible for the portability of Bishop-style proofs.
Some work has been done on founding BISH. A set-theoretic approach was proposed in Myhill (1975) and Friedman (1977); Feferman (1979) suggested an approach based on classes and operations. Yet another approach is Martin-Löf's theory of types, which we visit in Section 5.
The Techniques of Constructive Analysis book (Bridges & Vîta, 2006) develops a Bishop-style constructive mathematics that revisits and extends the work from Bishop (1967) in a more modern setting, showing how modern proof techniques from advanced topics such as Hilbert spaces and operator theory can be successfully covered constructively. It is interesting to observe that, as a rule of thumb, the more ingenious a proof looks, the less explicit numerical content it tends to contain. Thus such proofs are usually more difficult to translate into constructive proofs. Of course there are exceptions, but the comparison between (say) Robinson's nonstandard analysis and Bishop's constructive methods appears to be a confusion between elegance and content propagated by some authors; see, for example, Stewart (1986) and Richman (1987).
In 1968, Per Martin-Löf published his Notes on Constructive Mathematics (Martin-Löf, 1968). It encapsulates mathematics based on recursive function theory, with a background of the algorithms of Post (1936).
However he soon revisited foundations in a different way, which harks back to Russell's type theory, albeit using a more constructive and less logicist approach. The basic idea of Martin-Löf's theory of types (Martin-Löf, 1975) is that mathematical objects all come as types, and are always given in terms of a type (for example, one such type is that of functions from natural numbers to natural numbers), due to an intuitive understanding that we have of the notion of the given type.
The central distinction Martin-Löf makes is that between proof and derivation. Derivations convince us of the truth of a statement, whereas a proof contains the data necessary for computational (that is, mechanical) verification of a proposition. Thus what one finds in standard mathematical textbooks are derivations; a proof is a kind of realizability (c.f. Kleene, 1945) and links mathematics to implementation (at least implicitly).
The theory is very reminiscent of a kind of cumulative hierarchy. Propositions can be represented as types (a proposition's type is the type of its proofs), and to each type one may associate a proposition (that the associated type is not empty). One then builds further types by construction on already existing types.
Within Martin-Löf type theory, the axiom of choice, stated symbolically as
is derivable. Recall that this would be inconsistent, if AC were interpreted classically. However the axiom is derivable because in the construction of types, the construction of an element of a set (type) is sufficient to prove its membership. In Bishop-style constructive mathematics, these sets are "completely presented", in that we need to know no more than an object's construction to determine its set membership. Under the BHK interpretation, the added requirement on the proof of
It is worth noting that sets construed in this theory are constrained by this realizability criterion. For example, in Martin-Löf's theory, the power set axiom is not accepted in full generality—the power set of
The program of Reverse Mathematics, instigated by Harvey Friedman (1975), aims to classify theorems according to their equivalence to various set-theoretic principles. The constructive equivalent was begun in a systematic manner by Ishihara (2006) and, separately and independently by W. Veldman in 2005.
The field has since had numerous developments, the interest of which lies mainly in the metamathematical comparison of different branches of constructive mathematics and the logical strengths of various principles endorsed or rejected by the different schools. This also points to the requirements on computational data for various properties to hold, such as various notions of compactness (Diener, 2008).
Principles whose classification is of interest include:
- The Uniform Continuity Theorem (UCT): Every pointwise continuous mapping of the closed interval
[0,1]into Ris uniformly continuous.
- Brouwer's fan theorem, and various weakenings thereof. (There is actually a hierarchy of fan theorems; see, for example, Diener, 2008.)
- The Anti-Specker property (AS): A sequence
(zn)n≥1of real numbers in [0,1]that is eventually bounded away from each point of [0,1]is eventually bounded away from all of [0,1](recall the discussion in Section 3a).
- Omniscience principles.
It should be noted that arguably the first author dealing with reverse-mathematical ideas was Brouwer, although he certainly would not have seen it as such. The weak counterexamples (see Section 2a) he introduced were of the form:
The philosophical commitments of constructivist philosophies (Section 1b) are:
- Truth is replaced by (algorithmic) proof as a primitive notion, and
- Existence means constructibility.
This naturally leads to intuitionistic logic, characterized by the BHK interpretation (Section 1c). Omniscience principles, such as the Principle of Excluded Middle (PEM), and any mode of argument which validates such principles, are not in general valid under this interpretation, and the classical equivalence between the logical connectives does not hold.
Constructive proofs of classical theorems are often enlightening: the computational content of the hypotheses is explicitly seen to produce the conclusion. While intuitionistic logic places restrictions on inferences, the larger part of classical mathematics (or what is classically equivalent) can be recovered using only constructive methods (Section 4); there are often several constructively different versions of the same classical theorem.
The computational advantage of constructive proof is borne out in two ways. Constructive proofs:
- embody (in principle) an algorithm (for computing objects, converting other algorithms, etc.), and
- prove that the algorithm they embody is correct (that is, that it meets its design specification).
The programme of constructive reverse mathematics (Section 6) connects various principles and theorems (such as omniscience principles, versions of the fan theorem, etc.), shedding light on constructive or computational requirements of theorems. Furthermore, the use of Brouwerian counterexamples (Section 2a) often allows the mathematician to distinguish which aspects of classical proof are essentially nonconstructive.
Throught the article, several schools of constructivism are outlined. Each is essentially mathematics with intuitionistic logic, philosophical differences notwithstanding. Different schools add different further axioms: for example, (Russian) constructive recursive mathematics (Section 3) is mathematics with intuitionistic logic, the computable partial functions axiom (and Markov's principle of unbounded search). Classical mathematics can be interpreted as Bishop's constructive mathematics, with PEM added.
The contrast between classical and constructive mathematicians is clear: in order to obtain the numerical content of a proof, the classical mathematician must be careful at each step of the proof to avoid decisions that cannot be algorithmically made; whereas the constructive mathematician, in adopting intuitionistic logic, has automatically dealt with the computational content carefully enough that an algorithm may be extracted from their proof.
In an age where computers are ubiquitous, the constructivist programme needs even less (pragmatic) justification, perhaps, than the classical approach. This is borne out by the successful translation of constructive proofs into actual algorithms (see, for example, Schwichtenberg (2009) and Berger, Berghofer, Letouzey & Schwichtenberg (2006)). The link between programming and abstract mathematics is stronger than ever, and will only strengthen as new research emerges.
An overview of constructivism in mathematics is given in both Troelstra & van Dalen (1988), and Beeson (1985). For further reading in intuitionism from a philosophical perspective, Dummett's Elements (1977) is the prime resource. The Bishop and Bridges book (1985) is the cornerstone textbook for the Bishop-style constructivist. For the finitist version, see Ye (2011), where it is shown that even a strict finitist interpretation allows large tracts of constructive mathematics to be realized; in particular we see application to finite things of Lebesgue integration, and extension of the constructive theory to semi-Riemannian geometry. For advances and techniques in Bishop-style mathematics, see Bridges & Vîta (2006). For an introduction to constructive recursive function theory, see Richman (1983); Bridges & Richman (1987) expounds the theory relative to other kinds of constructive mathematics. For an introduction to computable analysis, see, for example, Weihrauch (2000). For topology, Bridges & Vîta (2011) outlays a Bishop-style development of topology; Sambin (1987) and (2003) are good starting points for further reading in the recent development of point-free (or formal) topology.
- Beeson, M. (1985). Foundations of constructive mathematics. Heidelberg: Springer-Verlag.
- Berger, U., Berghofer, S., Letouzey, P. & Schwichtenberg, H. (2006). Program extraction from normalization proofs. Studia Logica, 82, 25–49.
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