A gymnasium near Athens and the site where Cynic philosophers taught.
Table of Contents
- Location, Structures, and Layout of Cynosarges
- Other Sanctuaries
- History of the Use of Cynosarges
- References and Further Reading
Cynosarges was located along the southern bank of the Ilissos river, not far from the ancient city wall (Diogenes Laertius 6.13 and [Plato] Axiochus 364d) in the deme of Diomeia (Hegesander of Delphi, FHG 4.413, Harpocration, Lexicon s.v. en Diomeois Heracleion; Telephanes, FHG 4.507; Herodian,Correct Pronunciation, s.v. Cynosarges; and Steph. Byz. s.v. Cynosarges). Scholarly debate over the precise location and boundaries of Cynosarges continues, but evidence for specific structures is discussed below.
The literary and epigraphic evidence attests many cult sanctuaries, a gymnasial area for exercise, apalaistra (wrestling school), parcels of land leased to private individuals for cultivation, and open space for equestrian activities.
The philosopher Diogenes of Sinope is said to have asked to be thrown from a bridge near the Cynosarges gymnasium when he was near the point of death (Aelian, Varia Historia 8.14.3). The bridge presumably spanned the Ilissos river.
The Cynosarges area belonged to Heracles (Pausanias 1.19.3, Hesychius s.v. Cynosarges and Suda, s.v.Cynosarges). A temple and altar dedicated to Heracles is attested (Pausanias 1.19.3, Suda, s.v. Es Cynosarges and s.v. Cynosarges; Apostolios, CPG 10.22; old scholia on [Plato] Axiochus 364a). Nearby there were altars for Alcmene and Iolaus, Heracles’ mother and companion respectively, and for Hebe, his consort in Olympus (Pausanias 1.19.3).
All the other deities associated with Cynosarges are closely connected with Heracles himself. There is attested a sanctuary to Antiochus, Heracles’ son and the eponymous hero of the Antiochid tribe (SEG III 115, 116, and 117), and a sanctuary of Diomos, the eponymous hero of the deme Diomeia and founder of the festival for Heracles (IG II2 1247). A statue and cult to Philip II of Macedon, whose family was allegedly founded by Heracles, was set up in Cynosarges during the 330s BCE (Clement of Alexandria,Protrepticus 4.54.5). A sanctuary of Hermes may have also existed (Palatine Anthology 6.143), but the evidence is slim.
During the Classical and Hellenistic periods, the gymnasium in Cynosarges was probably a large, open space dedicated to athletic and military training. None of the literary or epigraphic sources attest a built gymnasium in Cynosarges during this period. Excavations carried out in 1896-1897 by the British School at Athens uncovered a building of the Archaic period and a much larger building of the 2nd century CE on the southern bank of the Ilissos. The results of the excavation were never fully published, but J. Travlos has associated these buildings with Cynosarges and a gymnasium built by the Roman emperor Hadrian (Pausanias 1.18.9). Scholarly opinion remains divided on this identification with some preferring a location further downstream.
A wrestling school is attested for Cynosarges (Aelian, Varia Historia 8.14.3 and Diogenes Laertius 6.30.8). The palaistra may have been a building or simply an open area marked off for training in combat sports such as boxing and wrestling.
An area for walking is mentioned briefly in the pseudo-Platonic dialogue Axiochus (372a).
Leases for properties belonging to Heracles (Agora XIX L6) make it clear that a number of plots of arable land in the Cynosarges area were leased to private individuals for the benefit of Heracles’ cult during the fourth century BCE. The size of the plots themselves is unclear, buy the total value of the land described in the surviving leases has been estimated at approximately 2 talents.
The origin of the name “Cynosarges” appears to have been a mystery even in antiquity. According to a often re-told story, a “white” or “swift” dog snatched the sacrificial meats from the altar of Heracles (e.g., Hesychius, s.v. Cynosarges Suda, s.v. Es Cynosarges and Cynosarges, and Eustathius, Commentary on Homer’s Odyssey 2.11 p. 1430.54-59). The athletic facilities, cults, educational, and military uses of the area continued from the Archaic period to the siege of Athens in 200 BCE by Philip V of Macedon, whose army encamped in Cynosarges.
By the sixth century BCE, Cynosarges functioned as a cult center for Heracles and as a gymnasium used by the nothoi or offspring of mixed Athenian/non-Athenian parentage (Demosthenes, Against Aristagoras II 214, Harpocration, Lexicon s.v. notheia and cf. Suda, s.v. Antisthenes). The most famous of these nothoi was Themistocles (Plutarch, Themistocles 1.3), who allegedly encouraged his young friends who were not nothoi to use the grounds at Cynosarges themselves in order that there would be a blurring of the distinction.
There was also a connection between the nothoi and the cult of Heracles. The parasitoi who made offerings monthly along with the priest of Heracles were chosen from the nothoi (Athenaeus, The Wise Dinner Companions 6.234d-e). Heracles himself is said to have been considered a nothos as his mother was the mortal, Alcmene, and his father the god Zeus (Plutarch, Themistocles 1.3).
Cynosarges was also the site of the Heracleia, in which Heracles received sacrifices as an Olympian god (Aristophanes Frogs 650, SEG XLII 50, Demosthenes On the False Embassy 125, IG II2 1247, Harpocration, Lexicon s.v. Heracleia, and Suda, s.v. Heracleia). A priest of Diomos, the eponymous hero of the deme Diomeia and the founder of the these rites for Heracles, also took part in the superintendence of the festival (IG II2 1247.16-24. Polemon, fr. 78).
Cynosarges never seems to have attracted the level of organized philosophical discussion and study as the Lyceum and Academy, but it was commonly associated with Cynic philosophy. Socrates appears on his way out to Cynosarges in the pseudo-Platonic dialogue Axiochus (364a1-b1), but it is Socrates’ student Antisthenes whose association with Cynosarges would have a more lasting legacy. Antisthenes was reportedly himself a nothos –his mother was a Thracian–and thus had frequented the gymnasium since his youth (Suda, s.v. Antisthenes). After Socrates’ death in 399 BCE, Antisthenes taught a philosophy in Cynosarges that emphasized simplicity and austerity in life. It is debatable whether Antisthenes taught Diogenes of Sinope or not, but Diogenes is said to have taught and lived in the area of Cynosarges (Diogenes Laertius, 6.13, 6.30.8; Aelian, Varia Historia 8.14.3). Because Cynicism was more a way of life than a formal study of philosophy, no organized school seems to have developed in Cynosarges, which is absent in the lists of philosophical schools that were a part of the regular curriculum of young men during the Hellenistic and Roman periods.
Another group associated with Cynosarges was called The Sixty, who appear to have been a loosely organized comedy club that met in the sanctuary of Heracles (Athenaeus, The Wise Dinner Companions6.260b). Their fame in telling jokes had spread as far north as Macedon during the reign of Philip II (360-336 BCE), who reportedly sent them an enormous sum of money in exchange for a written account of their jokes (Athenaeus, The Wise Dinner Companions 14.614).
Cynosarges was also a critical strategic point in the Persian invasion of Attica in 480 BCE. After their defeat at Marathon, the Persian fleet reportedly sailed into the Saronic gulf and attempted a landing in the bay of Phaleron to the West of Athens. Herodotus (6.116) tells us that the victorious Athenians quickly marched from the sanctuary of Heracles at Marathon to another sanctuary of Heracles at Cynosarges (around 26.5 miles). The sight of the Athenian troops arrayed for battle only a few miles away caused the Persians to retreat.
Cynosarges also was used for military training (Diogenes Laertius 6.30.8 and SEG III 115, 116, 117) and equestrian exercises, as is attested by the orator Andocides (On the Mysteries 61), who said he broke his collarbone in a riding accident there.
The area was used as a camp by Philip V during his unsuccessful, but destructive siege of Athens in 200 BCE (Diodorus Siculus 28.7.1 and Livy 31.24.17-18). Since the sources mention no further activity in Cynosarges after 200 BCE, many believe that the area did not recover from this disaster.
- Billot, M.-F. “Le Cynosarges. Histoire, mythes et archéologie,” in Dictionnaire des Philosophes Antiques, R. Goulet, ed. (Paris 1994).
- Billot, M.-F. “Antisthène et le Cynosarges dans l’Athènes des Ve et IVe siècles,” in Le Cynisme ancien et ses prolongments: Actes du Colloque International du CNRS (Paris 22-25 juillet 1991). M.-O. Goulet-Cazé and R. Goulet, eds. (Paris 1993) 69-116.
- Walbank, M. “Leases of Public Lands. The Leasing of Public Lands in Attica and in Territories controlled by Athens,” in The Athenian Agora vol. XIX Inscriptions (Princeton 1991)
- Wycherley, R.E. The Stones of Athens. Princeton 1978.
- Travlos, J. Pictorial Dictionary of Ancient Athens (New York 1971).
- Judeich, J. Topographie von Athen2 (Berlin 1931). (Berlin 1931).
- Stuart, J. and N. Revett, The Antiquities of Athens. (London 1762 [repr. New York 1968])
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