Hunhu/Ubuntu in the Traditional Thought of Southern Africa

Philosophically, the term Hunhu or Ubuntu emphasizes the importance of a group or community. The term finds a clear expression in the Nguni/Ndebele phrase: umuntu ngumuntu ngabantu (a person is a person through other persons). This article reflects upon Hunhu/Ubuntu as a traditional, indigenous philosophy of Southern Africa by focusing particularly on its distinctive features, its components, and its methods of employment in the public sphere.

The term Ubuntu/Botho/Hunhu is a Zulu/Xhosa/Ndebele/Sesotho/Shona word referring to the moral attribute of a person, who is known in the Bantu languages as Munhu (among the Shona of Zimbabwe), Umuntu (among the Ndebele of Zimbabwe and the Zulu/Xhosa of South Africa), Muthu (among the Tswana of Botswana), and Omundu (among the Herero of Namibia), just to name a few of the Bantu tribal groupings. Though the term has a wider linguistic rendering in almost all the Bantu languages of Southern Africa, it has gained considerable philosophical attention in Zimbabwe and South Africa, especially since the 1990s, for the simple reason that both Zimbabwe and South Africa needed home-grown philosophies to move forward following political disturbances that had been caused by the liberation war and by apartheid, respectively.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. About the Sources
  3. Hunhu/Ubuntu and Ethno-Philosophy
  4. The Deployment of Hunhu/Ubuntu in the Public Sphere
  5. The Distinctive Qualities/Features of Hunhu/Ubuntu
  6. The Components of Hunhu/Ubuntu Traditional Philosophy
    1. Hunhu/Ubuntu Metaphysics
    2. Hunhu/Ubuntu Ethics
    3. Hunhu/Ubuntu Epistemology
  7. Conclusion
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

The subject of Hunhu/Ubuntu has generated a lot of debate within public and private intellectual discussions, especially in South Africa and Zimbabwe where the major focus has been on whether or not Hunhu/Ubuntu can compete with other philosophical world views as well as whether or not Hunhu/Ubuntu can solve the socio-political challenges facing the two countries. Hunhu/Ubuntu is also a key theme in African philosophy as it places an imperative on the importance of group or communal existence as opposed to the West’s emphasis on individualism and individual human rights. Thus, as an aspect of African traditional philosophy, Hunhu/Ubuntu prides in the idea that the benefits and burdens of the community must be shared in such a way that no one is prejudiced. Rather, everything is done to put the interests of the community ahead of the interests of the individual. To this end, the traditional philosophical meaning of the term Hunhu/Ubuntu/Botho is sought and its importance in the academy is highlighted and explained. This vantage point looks at how the concept is deployed in the public sphere as well. It also gives an elaborate analysis of the qualities/features of Hunhu/Ubuntu as exemplified by John S Pobee’s expression: Cognatus ergo sum which means I am related by blood therefore I exist (Pobee, 1979: 49). Finally, this article outlines and thoroughly explains the components cognate to Hunhu/Ubuntu as an aspect of ethno-philosophy, namely: Hunhu/Ubuntu Metaphysics, Hunhu/Ubuntu Ethics, and Hunhu/Ubuntu Epistemology.

2. About the Sources

Many scholars have written about Ubuntu and it is only fair to limit our discussion to those scholars who have had an interest in the philosophical meaning of the term in Southern African Thought. In this category, we have first generation scholars of Ubuntu such as Mogobe Bernard Ramose (1999; 2014), who is credited for his definition of Ubuntu as humaneness, Stanlake Samkange and Tommie Marie Samkange (1980), who link Hunhu/Ubuntu with the idea of humanism, and Desmond Tutu (1999), who sees Ubuntu as a conflict-resolution philosophy. These four are regarded as first generation scholars of Ubuntu because historically, they were among the first black philosophers hailing from Africa to write about Hunhu/Ubuntu as a philosophy. They also started writing as early as the 1980s and early 1990s and they regarded Ubuntu, inspired by the traditional southern African thought, as a human quality or as an attribute of the soul.

We also have second generation scholars of Ubuntu such as Michael Onyebuchi Eze (2010), who is credited for his critical historicisation of the term Ubuntu, Michael Battle (2009), who is credited for some deep insights on the linguistic meaning of the term Ubuntu as well as his famous claim that Ubuntu is a gift to the Western world, Fainos Mangena (2012a; 2012b), who is credited for defining Hunhu/Ubuntu and extracting the idea of the Common Moral Position (CMP) from it , and Thaddeus Metz (2007), whose search for a basic principle that would define African ethics has attracted a lot of academic attention. Moreover, Christian BN Gade (2011; 2012; 2013) has taken the discourse of Hunhu/Ubuntu to another level by looking at the historical development of discourses on Ubuntu as well as the meaning of Ubuntu among South Africans of African Descent (SAADs). Finally, we have Martin H Prozesky, who has outlined some of the distinctive features of Hunhu/Ubuntu philosophy that are important for this entry point.

3. Hunhu/Ubuntu and Ethno-Philosophy

In order to define Hunhu/Ubuntu and show its nexus with ethno-philosophy, it is important that we first define ethno-philosophy. To this end, Francis E.A. Owakah (2012: 155) defines ethno-philosophy as a system of thought that deals with the collective worldviews of diverse African peoples as a unified form of knowledge based on myths, folk wisdom, and the proverbs of the peoples. From the above definition, we can pick up two important points; the first point is ethno-philosophy as a “system of thought” and the second point is “the collective world views of diverse African peoples” and that they are a unified form of knowledge. This means that the diversity that characterises African peoples, in terms of geographical location, history, and ethnicity, does not take away the fact that Africans have “a unified form of knowledge” that is based on group identity or community. Now, this is what qualifies Ubuntu as an important aspect of ethno-philosophy.

This section defines Ubuntu as well as traces its historical roots in Southern African cultures. To begin with, the term Ubuntu comes from a group of sub-Saharan languages known as Bantu (Battle 2009: 2). It is a term used to describe the quality or essence of being a person amongst many sub-Saharan tribes of the Bantu language family (Onyebuchi Eze 2008: 107). While Battle does not refer to the Shona equivalence of the word Ubuntu, and recognises the words Ubuntu and Bantu by the common root of –ntu (human), Ramose uses the Zulu/isiNdebele word Ubuntu concurrently with its Shona equivalent – Hunhu – to denote the idea of existence. For Ramose, Hu– is ontological, while –nhu is epistemological and so is Ubu– and –ntu (1999: 50). Having lived in Africa and Zimbabwe, Ramose is able to know with some degree of certainty the ontological and epistemological status of the words Hunhu and Ubuntu. It sometimes takes an insider to be able to correctly discern the meanings of such words.

 Hunhu/Ubuntu also says something about the character and conduct of a person (Samkange and Samkange 1980: 38). What this translates to is that Hunhu/Ubuntu is not only an ontological and epistemological concept; it is also an ethical concept. For Battle, Ubuntu is the interdependence of persons for the exercise, development, and fulfilment of their potential to be both individuals and community (2009;2). Desmond Tutu captures this aptly when he uses the Xhosa proverb, ungamntu ngabanye abantu, whose Shona equivalence is munhu unoitwa munhu nevamwe vanhu (a person is made a person by other persons). For Gade, this proverb means that each individual’s humanity is ideally expressed in relationship with others. Onyebuchi Eze (2008: 107) argues in support of Gade when he says:

More critical…is the understanding of a person as located in a community where being a person is to be in a dialogical relationship in this community. A person’s humanity is dependent on the appreciation, preservation and affirmation of other person’s humanity. To be a person is to recognize therefore that my subjectivity is in part constituted by other persons with whom I share the social world.

In regard to the proverbial character of Ubuntu, Ramose remarks that, “Ubuntu is also consistent with the practices of African peoples as expressed in the proverbs and aphorisms of certain Nguni languages, specifically Zulu and Sotho” (Ramose quoted in van Niekerk 2013).

In his definition of Ubuntu, Metz (2007: 323) follows Tutu and Ramose when he equates Ubuntu with the idea of humanness and to the maxim a person is a person through other persons. This maxim for Metz “has descriptive senses to the effect that one’s identity as a human being causally and even metaphysically depends on a community.” With this submission, Metz agrees with Ramose, Samkange and Samkange, and Gade that Ubuntu is about the group/community more than it is about the self.

It may be important, at this juncture, to briefly consider the historical roots of the term Ubuntu in order to buttress the foregoing. To begin with, in his attempt to trace the history of the idea of Ubuntu, Michael Onyebuchi Eze (2010: 90) remarks thus when it comes to the idea of Ubuntu, “history adopts a new posture…where it is no longer a narrative of the past only but of the moment, the present and the future.” Other than asking a series of questions relating to “history as a narrative of the moment, present and future,” he does not adequately explain why this is so. Instead, he goes further to explain the view of “history as a narrative of the past.” As a narrative of the past, Onyebuchi Eze observes thus:

Ubuntu is projected to us in a rather hegemonic format, by way of an appeal to an unanimous past through which we may begin to understand the socio-cultural imaginary of the “African” people before the violence of colonialism; an imagination that must be rehabilitated in that percussive sense for its actual appeal for the contemporary African society (2010:93).

 Onyebuchi Eze seems to be suggesting that there is too much romanticisation of the past when it comes to the conceptualisation and use of the term Ubuntu. He seems to question the idea of the unanimous character of Ubuntu before “the violence of colonialism” reduced this idea to some kind of imagination that should not have a place in contemporary African society. We are compelled to agree with him to that extent. Thus, unlike many scholars of Ubuntu who have tended to gloss over its limitations, Onyebuchi Eze is without a doubt looking at the history of this concept with a critical eye. One of the key arguments he presents which is worthy of our attention in this argument is that of the status of the individual and that of the community in the definition and conceptualisation of Ubuntu.

While many Ubuntu writers have tended to glorify community over and above the individual, Onyebuchi Eze (2008: 106) is of the view that “the individual and the community are not radically opposed in the sense of priority but engaged in contemporaneous formation.” Thus, while we agree with Onyebuchi Eze that both the individual and the community put together define Ubuntu, we maintain that their relationship is not that of equals, but that the individual is submerged within the community and the interests and aspirations of the community matter more than those of the individual. This, however, should not be interpreted to mean that the individual plays an ancillary role in the definition of Ubuntu. Below, we outline and explain the qualities/features of Hunhu/Ubuntu as an aspect of ethno-philosophy.

4. The Deployment of Hunhu/Ubuntu in the Public Sphere

Hunhu/Ubuntu has dominated the public discourse especially in Zimbabwe and South Africa where it has been used to deal with both political and social differences. In Zimbabwe, for instance, Hunhu/Ubuntu has been used to bring together the Zimbabwe African National Union Patriotic Front (ZANU-PF) and Patriotic Front Zimbabwe African People’s Union (PF ZAPU) after political tensions that led to the Midlands and Matabeleland disturbances of the early 1980s which saw about 20,000 people killed by the North Korean-trained Fifth Brigade. The 1987 Unity accord was done in the spirit of Ubuntu where people had to put aside their political differences and advance the cause of the nation.

The Global Political Agreement of 2008 which led to the signing of the Government of National Unity (GNU) also saw Hunhu/Ubuntu being deployed to deal with the political differences between ZANU-PF and the Movement for Democratic Change (MDC) formations as a result of the violent elections of June 2008. This violence had sown the seeds of fear to the generality of the Zimbabwean population and so it took Hunhu/Ubuntu to remove the fear and demonstrate the spirit of “I am because we are; since we are therefore I am” (Mbiti, 1969: 215). The point is that the two political parties needed each other in the interest of the development of the nation of Zimbabwe.

In South Africa, Desmond Tutu, who was the Chairperson of the Truth and Reconciliation Commission (TRC), which was formed to investigate and deal with the apartheid atrocities of the 1990s, demonstrated in his final report that it took Ubuntu for people to confess, forgive and forget. In his book: No Future without Forgiveness, published in 1999, Tutu writes, “the single main ingredient that made the achievements of the TRC possible was a uniquely African ingredient – Ubuntu.” Tutu maintains that, what constrained so many to choose to forgive rather than to demand retribution, to be magnanimous and ready to forgive rather than to wreak revenge, was Ubuntu (Tutu quoted in Richardson 2008: 67). As Onyebuchi Eze (2011: 12) would put it, “the TRC used Ubuntu as an ideology to achieve political ends.” As an ideology, Ubuntu has been used as a panacea to the socio-political problems affecting the continent of Africa, especially the Southern part of the continent. This means that Hunhu/Ubuntu as the traditional thought of Southern Africa has not been restricted to the academy alone but has also found its place in the public sphere where it has been utilised to solve political conflicts and thereby bring about socio-political harmony. To underscore the importance of Ubuntu not only as an intellectual and public good, Gabriel Setiloane (quoted in Vicencio 2009: 115) remarks thus, “Ubuntu is a piece of home-grown African wisdom that the world would do well to make its own.” This suggests the Southern African roots of Ubuntu as a traditional thought.

5. The Distinctive Qualities/Features of Hunhu/Ubuntu

While Martin H Prozesky (2003: 5-6) has identified the ten qualities that are characteristic of Hunhu/Ubuntu, it is important to remark that these ten qualities are not exhaustive. Our justification of using Prozesky’s ten qualities is that they aptly capture the essence of Ubuntu as an aspect of ethno-philosophy. This article begins by outlining Prozesky’s ten qualities before attempting to explain only four of them, namely humaneness, gentleness, hospitality and generosity. Prozesky’s ten qualities are as follows:

  1. Humaneness
  2. Gentleness
  3. Hospitality
  4. Empathy or taking trouble for others
  5. Deep Kindness
  6. Friendliness
  7. Generosity
  8. Vulnerability
  9. Toughness
  10. Compassion

Hunhu/Ubuntu as an important aspect of ethno-philosophy is an embodiment of these qualities. While Ramose uses humaneness to define Hunhu/Ubuntu, Samkange and Samkange use humanism to define and characterise the same attributes. The impression one gets is that the former is similar to the latter. But this is far from the truth. Thus, with regard to the dissimilarity between humaneness and humanism, Gade (2011: 308) observes:

I have located three texts from the 1970s in which Ubuntu is identified as ‘African humanism.’ The texts do not explain what African humanism is, so it is possible that their authors understood African humanism as something different from a human quality.

Granted that this is may be the case, the question then is: What is the difference between humaneness and humanism, and African humaneness and African humanism as aspects of Hunhu/Ubuntu philosophy? While humaneness may refer to the essence of being human, including the character traits that define it (Dolamo 2013: 2), humanism, on the other hand, is an ideology; an outlook or a thought system in which human interests and needs are given more value than the interests and needs of other beings (.. Flexner 1988: 645).Taken together, humaneness and humanism become definitive aspects of Hunhu/Ubuntu only if the prefix ‘African’ is added to them to have African humaneness and African humanism respectively. African humaneness would then entail that the qualities of selflessness and commitment to one’s group or community are more important than the selfish celebration of individual achievements and dispositions.

African humanism, on the other hand, would then refer to an ideology, outlook or thought system that values peaceful co-existence and the valorisation of the community. In other words, it is a philosophy that sees human needs, interests, and dignity as of fundamental importance and concern (Gyekye 1997: 158). Gyekye maintains that African humanism “is quite different from the Western classical notion of humanism which places a premium on acquired individual skills and favours a social and political system that encourages individual freedom and civil rights” (1997: 158).

Thus, among the Shona people of Zimbabwe, the expression munhu munhu muvanhu, which in Ndebele and Zulu languages translates to umuntu ngumuntu ngabantu, both of which have the English translation of “a person is a person through other persons,” best explains the idea of African humanism (compare Mangena 2012a; Mangena 2012b; Shutte 2008; Tutu 1999).

In regard to the project of defining and characterising African humanism, Onyebuchi Eze (2011: 12) observes that:

As a public discourse, Ubuntu/botho has gained recognition as a peculiar form of African humanism, encapsulated in the following Bantu aphorisms, like Motho ke motho ka batho babang; Umuntu ngumuntu ngabantu (a person is a person through other people). In other words, a human being achieves humanity through his or her relations with other human beings.

Whether one prefers humaneness or humanism, the bottom line is that the two are definitive aspects of the philosophy of Hunhu/Ubuntu which places the communal interests ahead of the individual interests. Of course, this is a position which Onyebuchi Eze would not buy given that in his view, the community cannot be prioritised over the individual as:

The relation with ‘other’ is one of subjective equality, where the mutual recognition of our different but equal humanity opens the door to unconditional tolerance and a deep appreciation of the ‘other’ as an embedded gift that enriches one’s humanity (2011: 12).

Some believe that what distinguishes an African of black extraction from a Westerner is the view that the former is a communal being while the latter prides in the idea of selfhood or individualism. To these people the moment we take the individual and the community as subjective equals [as Onyebuchi Eze does] we end up failing to draw the line between what is African from what is fundamentally Western. Having defined humaneness, this article will now define and characterise the quality of gentleness from the perspective of Hunhu/Ubuntu. Gentleness encompasses softness of heart and the ability to sacrifice one’s time for others. Thus, being gentle means being tender-hearted and having the ability to spend time attending to other people’s problems. Gentleness is a quality of the tradition thought of Hunhu/Ubuntu in that it resonates with John S Mbiti’s dictum: “I am because we are; since we are therefore I am” (1969: 215). The point is that with gentleness, one’s humanity is inseparably bound to that of others. Eric K Yamamoto (1997: 52) puts it differently in reference to the altruistic character of Ubuntu philosophy when he remarks that:

Ubuntu is the idea that no one can be healthy when the community is sick. Ubuntu says I am human only because you are human. If I undermine your humanity, I dehumanise myself.

Both the definition of gentleness provided above and Mbiti’s dictum are equivalent to Yamamoto’s understanding of gentleness in that they both emphasise on otherness rather than the self. The attribute of hospitality also defines Hunhu/Ubuntu philosophy. Hospitality generally means being able to take care of your visitors in such a way that they feel comfortable to have you as their host and the relationship is not commercial. However, the Western definition of hospitality is such that the host goes out of his or her way to provide for the needs of his guests in return for some payment. This, however, should not be interpreted to mean that the Westerner is not hospitable outside of commerce. No doubt, they can also be hospitable but it is the magnitude of hospitality that differs.

In the case of the Shona/Ndebele communities in Africa where hospitality is given for free as when one provides accommodation and food to a stranger at his or her home, the magnitude is high. Coming to the idea of hospitality in Africa, it is important to note that in a traditional Shona/Ndebele society a person having traveled a long distance to visit a relative would sometimes get tired and hungry before they got to their relative’s home. During their short stay (in transit), they would be provided with food, accommodation, and warm clothes (if they happened to travel during the winter season).

Among the Korekore-Nyombwe people of Northern Zimbabwe, strangers would be given water to drink before asking for directions or before asking for accommodation in transit. The implication was that the stranger would have travelled a very long distance and was probably tired and thirsty and so there was need to give them water to quench their thirst. Besides, water (in Africa) symbolises life and welfare and so by giving strangers water, the hosts were saying that life needed to be sustained and that as Africans, we are “our brothers’ keepers.” Thus, Hunhu/Ubuntu hospitality derives its impetus from this understanding that the life and welfare of strangers are as important as our own lives and welfare.

Now, this is different from the idea of home and hospitality among Western Cosmopolitans, who consider home to be a place of privacy. Most homes in the West have durawalls or high fences to maximise the privacy of the owner and so a stranger cannot just walk in and be accommodated. This is quite understandable because in Western societies, the individual is conceived of as the centre of human existence and so there is need to respect his or her rights to privacy. In the West, the idea of a stranger walking into a private space is called trespassing and one can be prosecuted for this act. And yet in African traditional thought in general, and in the Shona/Ndebele society in particular, the idea of trespassing is not conceptualised in that way.

In fact, in pre-colonial Shona/Ndebele society the community was at the centre of human existence and that is why the pre-colonial Shona/Ndebele people would easily accommodate strangers or visitors without asking many questions. However, due to the colonisation of Africa, some Africans have adopted the Western style of individual privacy, but this is contrary to Hunhu/Ubuntu hospitality which is still being practiced in most Shona/Ndebele rural communities today. The point is that philosophies of hospitality, identity, and belonging are more clearly played out on the home front than in the public sphere. The home is the citadel of values and norms that define a people’s culture and so in the case of Southern African traditional thought, Hunhu/Ubuntu begins at home while in the case of Western civilisations, notions of individual identities and rights also begin at the home front. The point is that one cannot only limit and truncate the idea of hospitality to the public sphere.

The last attribute to be discussed in this section is generosity. Generally, generosity refers to freedom or liberality in giving (Flexner 1988: 550). The attribute of generosity in Southern African thought is best expressed proverbially. In Shona culture, for instance, there are proverbs that explain the generosity of the Shona people or Vanhu. Some of these include: Muenzi haapedzi dura (A visitor does not finish food), Chipavhurire uchakodzwa (The one who gives too much will also receive too much), Chawawana idya nehama mutogwa unokangamwa (Share whatever you get with your relatives because strangers are very forgetful), and Ukama igasva hunazadziswa nekudya (Relations cannot be complete without sharing food).

These proverbs not only demonstrate that the Bantu people are generous people, they say something about the Hunhu/Ubuntu strand that runs through the traditional thought of almost all the Bantu cultures of Southern Africa whereby everything is done to promote the interests of the group or community. The proverbs show that the Bantu people are selfless people as summarised by the Nguni proverb which we referred to earlier, which says: Umuntu ngumuntu ngabantu (Shutte 2008, Tutu 1999)  or as they put it in Shona: Munhu munhu muvanhu, translated to English as “a person is a person through other persons.” Without the attribute of generosity, it may be difficult to express one’s selflessness.

The next section identifies and explains the branches of hunuu/ubuntu traditional philosophy in order to buttress the foregoing argument.

6. The Components of Hunhu/Ubuntu Traditional Philosophy

This section will give an outline of the components of Hunhu/Ubuntu traditional philosophy showing how these are different from the branches of Western philosophy. These components will be outlined as Hunhu/Ubuntu metaphysics, Hunhu/Ubuntu ethics, as well as Hunhu/Ubuntu epistemology. The objective will be to show that while Western philosophy is persona-centric and is summarised by Descartes’ famous phrase, Cogito ergo sum which when translated to English means “I think therefore I am,” Hunhu/Ubuntu traditional philosophy is communo-centric and is summarised by Pobee’s famous dictum, Cognatus ergo sum, which when translated to English means “I am related by blood, therefore I exist.” In much simpler terms, while Western philosophy emphasises the self and selfhood through the promotion of individual rights and freedoms, Hunhu/Ubuntu traditional thought emphasises the importance of the group or community through the promotion of group or communal interests.

a. Hunhu/Ubuntu Metaphysics

Before defining and characterising Hunhu/Ubuntu metaphysics, it is important to begin by defining the term Metaphysics itself. For lack of a better word in African cultures, the article will define metaphysics from the standpoint of Western philosophy. The article will then show that this definition, though, will give us a head-start; it can only partially be applied to non-Western cultures. To begin with, in the history of Western philosophy, Metaphysics is by far regarded as the most ancient branch of philosophy and it was originally called first philosophy (Steward and Blocker 1987: 95). The term Metaphysics is only but an accident of history as it is thought to have resulted from an editor’s mistake as “he was sorting out Aristotle’s works in order to give them titles, several decades after Aristotle had died. It is thought that the editor came across a batch of Aristotle’s writings that followed The Physics and he called them Metaphysics, meaning After Physics” (1987: 96).

Metaphysics then became that branch of philosophy that dealt with the nature of reality. It asked questions such as: What is reality? Is reality material, physical, or an idea? As one tries to answer these questions, a world is opened to him or her that enables him or her to identify, name, and describe the kinds of beings that exist in the universe. Thus, two words define being, namely: ontology and predication. While pre-Socratics such as Thales, Anaximander, Anaximenes, Heraclitus, Parmenides and others defined being in terms of appearance and reality as well as change and permanence; Classical philosophers such as Socrates/Plato and Aristotle defined change in terms of form and matter.

While form was more real for Socrates/Plato and existed in a different realm than that of matter, Aristotle argued that both form and matter together formed substance, which was reality. Although the idea of being has always been defined in individual terms in the history of Western philosophy, it was given its definitive character by the French Philosopher, Rene Descartes, who defined it in terms of what he called Cogito ergo sum which when translated to English means “I think therefore I am.” Thus, the individual character of Western philosophy was firmly established with the popularisation of Descartes’ Cogito. A question can be asked: Does this understanding of metaphysics also apply to non-Western cultures? The answer is yes and no. Yes in the sense that in non-Western cultures being is also explained in terms of appearance and reality as well as change and permanence; and no in the sense that non-Western philosophies, especially the Hunhu/Ubuntu traditional philosophy of Southern Africa has a communal character, not an individual character. Having said this, so what is Hunhu/Ubuntu metaphysics?

 Hunhu/Ubuntu metaphysics is a component of Hunhu/Ubuntu traditional philosophy that deals with the nature of being as understood by people from Southern Africa. As we have already intimated, in Southern African traditional thought, being is understood in the communal, physical, and spiritual sense. Thus, a human being is always in communion with other human beings as well as with the spiritual world. Sekou Toure has called this “the communion of persons” whereby being is a function of the “us” or “we” as opposed to the “I” as found in “the autonomy of the individuals” that is celebrated in the West and is especially more revealing in Descartes’ Cogito. Pobee (1979) defines the African being in terms of what he calls Cognatus ergo sum which means “I am related by blood, therefore I exist.” What this suggests is that in Southern Africa, just like in the rest of Sub-Saharan Africa, the idea of being is relational.

Coming to the communion of human beings with the spiritual world, it is important to remark that the idea of being has its fullest expression through participation. Just as Socrates/Plato’s matter partakes in the immutable forms, being in the Shona/Ndebele society depends solely on its relationship with the spiritual world which is populated by ancestral, avenging, and alien spirits, with the greatest spiritual being called Musikavanhu/Nyadenga/unkulunkulu (The God of Creation). The greatest being works with his lieutenants, ancestors, and other spirits to protect the interests of the lesser beings, Vanhu/Abantu. In return, Vanhu/Abantu enact rituals of appeasement so that it does not become a one-way kind of interaction. It is, however, important to note that while Socratic/Platonic Metaphysics is dualistic in character, Hunhu/Ubuntu Metaphysics is onto-triadic or tripartite in character. It involves the Supreme Being (God), other lesser spirits (ancestral/alien and avenging), and human beings.

b. Hunhu/Ubuntu Ethics

 Hunhu/Ubuntu ethics refer to the idea of Hunhu/Ubuntu moral terms and phrases such as tsika dzakanaka kana kuti dzakaipa (good or bad behaviour), kuzvibata kana kuti kusazvibata (self-control or reckless behaviour), kukudza vakuru (respecting or disrespecting elders), and kuteerera vabereki (being obedient or disobedient to one’s immediate parents and the other elders of the community), among others. In Shona society people say: Mwana anorerwa nemusha kana kuti nedunhu (It takes a clan, village, or community to raise a child). Having defined Hunhu/Ubuntu ethics, it is important to distinguish them from Hunhu/Ubuntu morality which relates to the principles or rules that guide and regulate the behaviour of Vanhu or Abantu (human beings in the Shona/Ndebele sense of the word) within Bantu societies.

What distinguishes Hunhu/Ubuntu ethics from Western ethics is that the former are both upward-looking/transcendental and lateral, while the latter are only lateral. This section will briefly distinguish between an upward-looking/transcendental kind of Hunhu/Ubuntu ethic from a lateral kind of Hunhu/Ubuntu ethic. By upward-looking/transcendental, it is meant that Hunhu/Ubuntu ethics are not only confined to the interaction between humans, but they also involve spiritual beings such as Mwari/Musikavanhu/Unkulunkulu (Creator God), Midzimu (ancestors) and Mashavi (alien spirits). Thus, Hunhu/Ubuntu ethics are spiritual, dialogical and consensual (compare Nafukho 2006). By dialogical and consensual it is meant that the principles that guide and regulate the behaviour of Vanhu/Abantu are products of the dialogue between spiritual beings and human beings and the consensus that they reach. By lateral it is meant that these principles or rules are crafted solely to guide human interactions.

As Mangena (2012: 11) would put it, Hunhu/Ubuntu ethics proceed through what is called the Common Moral Position (CMP). The CMP is not a position established by one person as is the case with Plato’s justice theory, Aristotle’s eudaimonism, Kant’s deontology or Bentham’s hedonism (2012: 11). In the CMP, the community is the source, author and custodian of moral standards, and personhood is defined in terms of conformity to these established moral standards whose objective is to have a person who is communo-centric rather than one who is individualistic. In Shona/Ndebele society, for instance, respect for elders is one of the ways in which personhood can be expressed with the goal being to uphold communal values. It is within this context that respect for elders is a non-negotiable matter since these are the custodians of these values and fountains of moral wisdom.

Thus, one is born and bred in a society that values respect for the elderly and he or she has to conform. One important point to note is that the process of attaining the CMP is dialogical and spiritual in the sense that elders set moral standards in consultation with the spirit world which, as intimated earlier, is made up of Mwari/Musikavanhu/Unkulunkulu (Creator God) and Midzimu (ancestors), and these moral standards are upheld by society (2012: 12). These moral standards, which make up the CMP, are not forced on society as the elders (who represent society), Midzimu (who convey the message to Mwari), and Mwari (who gives a nod of approval) ensure that the standards are there to protect the interest of the community at large.

Communities are allowed to exercise their free will but remain responsible for the choices they make as well as their actions. For instance, if a community chooses to ignore the warnings of the spirit world regarding an impending danger such as a calamity resulting from failure by that community to enact an important ritual that will protect members of that community from say, flooding or famine, then the community will face the consequences.

c. Hunhu/Ubuntu Epistemology

What is epistemology? In the Western sense of the word, epistemology deals with the meaning, source and nature of knowledge. Western philosophers differ when it comes to the sources of knowledge, with some arguing that reason is the source of knowledge while others view experience or the use of the senses as the gateway to knowledge. This article will not delve much into these arguments since they have found an audience; instead, it focuses on Hunhu/Ubuntu epistemology. However, one cannot define and characterise Hunhu/Ubuntu traditional epistemology without first defining and demarcating the province of African epistemology as opposed to Western epistemology.

According to Michael Battle (2009: 135), “African epistemology begins with community and moves to individuality.” Thus, the idea of knowledge in Africa resides in the community and not in the individuals that make up the community. Inherent in the powerful wisdom of Africa is the ontological need of the individual to know self and community (2009: 135) and discourses on Hunhu/Ubuntu traditional epistemology stems from this wisdom. As Ramose (1999) puts it, “the African tree of knowledge stems from Ubuntu philosophy. Thus, Ubuntu is a well spring that flows within African notions of existence and epistemology in which the two constitute a wholeness and oneness.” Just like Hunhu/Ubuntu ontology, Hunhu/Ubuntu epistemology is experiential.

In Shona society, for instance, the idea of knowledge is expressed through listening to elders telling stories of their experiences as youth and how such experiences can be relevant to the lives of today’s youth. Sometimes they use proverbs to express their epistemology. The proverb: Rega zvipore akabva mukutsva (Experience is the best teacher) is a case in point. One comes to know that promiscuity is bad when he or she was once involved in it and got a Sexually Transmitted Infection (STI) among other bad consequences. There is no doubt that this person will be able to tell others that promiscuity is bad because of his or her experiences. The point is that Hunhu/Ubuntu epistemology is a function of experience. In Shona, the elders also say: Takabva noko kumhunga hakuna ipwa (We passed through the millet field and we know that there are no sweet reeds there). The point is that one gets to know that there are no sweet reeds in a millet field because he or she passed through the millet field. One has to use the senses to discern knowledge.

7. Conclusion

In this article, the traditional philosophy of Hunhu/Ubuntu was defined and characterised with such a view to show that Africa has a traditional philosophy and ethic which are distinctively communal and spiritual. This philosophy was also discussed with reference to how it has been employed in the public sphere in both Zimbabwe and South Africa. The key distinctive qualities/features of this traditional philosophy were clearly spelt out as humaneness, gentleness, hospitality and generosity. This philosophy was also discussed within the context of its three main components, namely; Hunhu/Ubuntu metaphysics, Hunhu/Ubuntu ethics, and Hunhu/Ubuntu epistemology. In the final analysis, it was explained that Hunhu/Ubuntu metaphysics, Hunhu/Ubuntu ethics, and Hunhu/Ubuntu epistemology formed the aspects of what is known today as traditional Southern African thought.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Appiah, K.A. 1992. In My Father’s House: Africa in the Philosophy of Culture. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • A thorough treatise of the idea of Africa in the philosophy of culture

  • Battle, M. 2009. Ubuntu: I in You and You in Me. New York: Seasbury Publishing
  • A discussion of Ubuntu and how this idea has benefitted the Western world.

  • Dolamo, R. 2013. “Botho/Ubuntu: The Heart of African Ethics.” Scriptura, 112 (1), pp.1-10
  • A thorough treatise on the notion of Ubuntu and its origin in Africa

  • Eze, M.O. 2011. “I am Because You Are.” The UNESCO Courier, pp. 10-13
  • A Philosophical analysis of the idea of Ubuntu

  • Eze, M.O. 2010. Intellectual History in Contemporary South Africa. New York: Palgrave Macmillan
  • A detailed outline of the definition and characterization of intellectual history in Contemporary Africa

  • Eze, M.O. 2008. “What is African Communitarianism? Against Consensus as a regulative ideal.” South African Journal of Philosophy. 27 (4), pp. 106-119
  • A philosophical discussion of the notions of community and individuality in African thought

  • Flexner, S et al. 1988. The Random House Dictionary. New York: Random House.
  • One of the best dictionaries used by academics

  • Gade, C.B.N. 2011. “The Historical Development of the Written Discourses on Ubuntu.” South African Journal of Philosophy, 30(3), pp. 303-330
  • A philosophical discussion of the historical development of the Ubuntu discourse in Southern Africa

  • Gade, C.B.N. 2012. “What is Ubuntu? Different Interpretations among South Africans of African Descent.” South African Journal of Philosophy, 31 (3), pp.484-503
  • A case-study on how South Africans of African descent interpret Ubuntu

  • Gade, C.B.N. 2013. “Restorative Justice and the South African Truth and Reconciliation Process.” African Journal of Philosophy, 32(1), pp. 10-35
  • A philosophical discussion of the origins of the idea of Restorative Justice

  • Gyekye, K. 1997. Tradition and Modernity: Reflections on the African Experience. New York: Oxford University Press
  • A philosophical rendition of the concepts of tradition and modernity in Africa

  • Hurka, T. 1993. Perfectionism. New York: Oxford University Press
  • A discussion on the notion of perfectionism

  • Makinde, M.A. 1988. African philosophy, Culture and Traditional Medicine. Athens: Africa Series number 53.
  • A thorough treatise on culture and philosophy in African thought

  • Mangena, F. 2012a. On Ubuntu and Retributive Justice in Korekore-Nyombwe Culture: Emerging Ethical Perspectives. Harare: Best Practices Books
  • A philosophical discussion of the place of Ubuntu and culture in the death penalty debate

  • Mangena, F. 2012b. “Towards a Hunhu/Ubuntu Dialogical Moral Theory.” Phronimon: Journal of the South African Society for Greek Philosophy and the Humanities, 13 (2), pp. 1-17
  • A philosophical discussion of the problems of applying Western ethical models in non-Western cultures

  • Mangena, F. 2014. “In Defense of Ethno-philosophy: A Brief Response Kanu’s Eclecticism.” Filosofia Theoretica: A Journal of Philosophy, Culture and Religions, 3 (1), pp.96-107
  • A reflection on the importance of ethno-philosophy in the African philosophy debate

  • Mangena, F. 2015. “Ethno-philosophy as Rational: A Reply to Two Famous Critics.” Thought and Practice: A Journal of the Philosophical Association of Kenya, 6 (2), pp. 24-38
  • A reaction to the Universalists regarding the place of ethno-philosophy in African thought

  • Mbiti, J.S. 1969. African Religions and Philosophy. London: Heinemann
  • A discussion of community in African philosophy

  • Metz, T. 2007. “Towards an African Moral Theory.” The Journal of Political Philosophy, 15(3), pp. 321-341
  • A philosophical outline of what Thaddeus Metz perceive as African ethics

  • Nafukho. F.M. 2006. “Ubuntu Worldview: A Traditional African View of Adult Learning in the Workplace.” Advances in Developing Human Resources, 8(3), pp.408-415
  • A thorough treatise on the three pillars of Ubuntu

  • Owakah, F.E. A. 2012. “Race Ideology and the Conceptualisation of Philosophy: The Story of Philosophy in Africa from PlacideTempels to OderaOruka.” Thought and Practice: Journal of the Philosophical Association of Kenya (Special Issue), 4 (2), pp. 147-168.
  • A discussion of the ideas of race and philosophy in the works of Tempels and OderaOruka.

  • Pobee, J.S. 1979. Towards an African Theology. Nashville: Abingdon Press.
  • A theological discussion of the notions of community and individuality in African thought

  • Prozesky, M.H. 2003. Frontiers of Conscience: Exploring Ethics in a New Millennium. Cascades: Equinym Publishing
  • An outline of Ubuntu’s ten qualities

  • Ramose, M.B. 1999. African Philosophy through Ubuntu. Harare: Mond Books.
  • A thorough discussion on the nature and character of Ubuntu

  • Ramose, M.B. 2007. “But Hans Kelsen was not born in Africa: A reply to Metz.” South African Journal of Philosophy, 26(4), pp. 347-355
  • Ramose’s response on Thaddeus Metz’s claim that African ethics lack a basic norm

  • Ramose, M.B. 2014b. “Ubuntu: Affirming Right and Seeking Remedies in South Africa.” In: L Praeg and S Magadla (Eds.). Ubuntu: Curating the Archive (pp. 121-1346). Scottsville: University of KwaZulu Natal Press
  • A discussion of Ubuntu as affirming right and wrong in South Africa

  • Richardson, N. R. 2006. “Reflections on Reconciliation and Ubuntu.” In: R Nicolson (Ed.). Persons in Community: African Ethics in a Global Culture. Scottsville: University of KwaZulu Natal Press.
  • A discussion on reconciliation in light of the Truth and Reconciliation Commission in South Africa.

  • Samkange, S and Samkange, T.M. 1980. Hunhuism or Ubuntuism: A Zimbabwean Indigenous Political Philosophy. Salisbury: Graham Publishing
  • A philosophical handbook on notions of Hunhu/Ubuntu in Zimbabwe

  • Steward, D and Blocker H.G. 1987. Fundamentals of Philosophy. New York: Macmillan Publishing Company
  • A discussion of key topics in Western philosophy

  • Shutte, A. 2008. “African Ethics in a Globalizing World.” In: R Nicolson (Ed.). Persons in Community: African Ethics in a Global Culture (pp. 15-34). Scottsville: University of KwaZulu Natal Press
  • A philosophical discussion of African ethics and its place in the globe

  • Taylor, D.F.P. 2013. “Defining Ubuntu for Business Ethics: A Deontological Approach.” South African Journal of Philosophy, 33(3), pp.331-345
  • An attempt to apply Ubuntu in the field of Business in Africa

  • Tutu, D. 1999. No Future without Forgiveness. New York: Doubleday
  • A philosophical discussion of the findings of the Truth and Reconciliation Commission in South Africa.

  • van Niekerk, J. (2013). “Ubuntu and Moral Value.” Johannesburg (PhD Dissertation submitted to the Department of Philosophy, University of Witwatersrand).
  • A philosophical rendition of the discourse of Ubuntu and moral value.

  • Yamamoto, E.K. 1997. “Race Apologies.” Journal of Gender, Race and Justice, Vol. 1, pp. 47-88
  • A critical reflection on the nexus of Ubuntu, race, gender and justice

  • Vicencio, C.V. 2009. Walk with Us and Listen: Political Reconciliation in Africa. Cape Town: University of Cape Town Press
  • A philosophical discussion of political reconciliation in Africa.


Author Information

Fainos Mangena
University of Zimbabwe