Locke: Knowledge of the External World
The problem of how we can know the existence and nature of the world external to our mind is one of the oldest and most difficult in philosophy. The discussion by John Locke (1632-1704) of knowledge of the external world have proved to be some of the most confusing and difficult passages of his entire body of philosophical work. Difficulties develop on several fronts.
First, in his main work in epistemology, An Essay Concerning Human Understanding, Locke seems to adopt a representative theory of perception. According to Locke, the only things we perceive (at least immediately) are ideas. Many of Locke’s readers have wondered, how can we know the world beyond our ideas if we only ever perceive such ideas?
Second, Locke’s epistemology is built around a strict distinction between knowledge and mere probable opinion or belief. Locke appears to define knowledge, however, so as to rule out the possibility of knowledge of the external world. His definition of knowledge as the perception of agreement between ideas has seemed to many of his readers to restrict knowledge to our own thoughts and ideas. Locke himself, however, emphasizes that knowledge of the external world is neither based on inference or reasoning nor is it based on reflecting on ideas somehow already in the mind. Instead, it is achieved through sensory experience. Thus, knowledge of the external world, even as Locke himself describes it, is clearly not a matter of merely knowing facts about our own minds.
Third, many of the special difficulties of understanding how knowledge of the external world is possible stem from what seem to be devastating skeptical arguments against the possibility of such knowledge. Locke’s approach to skepticism, however, has seemed unfocused and possibly in tension with itself. Locke alternately suggests that skepticism cannot be refuted even if we have at least some good reasons to believe it is mistaken, that genuine skepticism is not psychologically possible for human beings, and that skepticism is incoherent.
Ultimately, examining Locke’s discussions around knowledge of the external world can prove one of the most rewarding points of entry into Locke’s theoretical philosophy. Understanding what Locke thinks knowledge of the external world is and how it fits within his broader epistemology and theoretical philosophy requires probing beyond his epistemology and into the depths of his accounts of perception, representation, and the contents of thought. Properly appreciating his position vis-a-vis skepticism likewise leads to issues concerning Locke’s views on the fundamental nature of reality and our limited ability to grasp it. We can know that there is an external world but not much, if anything, about the nature of the world itself.
Table of Contents
- What is Locke’s Category of Sensitive Knowledge?
- Sensitive Knowledge and Locke’s Broader Epistemology
- Locke’s Definition of Knowledge
- Sensitive Knowledge as Incompatible with Locke’s Definition of Knowledge
- Sensitive Knowledge and Locke’s Theory of Representation
- Simple Ideas of Reflection and Cognitive Faculty Indicators
- Sensitive Knowledge as Assurance rather than Strict Knowledge
- Analyzing Knowledge rather than Defining its Subject Matter
- Sensitive Knowledge and Direct Perception
- Sensitive Knowledge and Skepticism about the External World
- References and Further Reading
- Primary Texts
- Secondary Literature
- Sensitive Knowledge as Incompatible with Locke’s Definition of Knowledge
- Sensitive Knowledge and the Semantics of Ideas
- Sensitive Knowledge as an Agreement between Ideas
- Locke and Direct Perception
- Sensitive Knowledge as Assurance
- Locke’s Account of Knowledge as an Analysis
- Sensitive Knowledge and Skepticism
- Further Reading
Suppose that you’re waiting with a friend in a hallway to go into a meeting. While furiously making last minute adjustments to the presentation the two of you are about to give, she asks, “My throat is dry, are there any water fountains around?” You look up and down the hallway, see one at the north end of the hallway and reply, “There’s a water fountain over there.” Your friend gets up, walks to the fountain, and takes a drink.
It seems to many people and many philosophers—including John Locke—that when you said, “there’s a water fountain over there,” you expressed some knowledge to your friend. She acted on that knowledge and quenched her thirst. Your helpful statement expressed a paradigmatic instance of knowledge of the external world. According to Locke there are two main questions to ask about any kind of knowledge, including cases like the knowledge of the external world you shared with your friend. First, what do you know? Second, how do you acquire or achieve such knowledge? This section will explore Locke’s answers to the what and the how of knowledge of the external world.
For now we will simply suppose that you did have some knowledge of the external world to share with your friend. Section three below will examine Locke’s replies to various skeptical worries to the effect we have no such knowledge. Assuming that you did have some knowledge to share, what exactly did you know and share with your friend? Or, as we might put it in more technical terms, what is the content of your knowledge in this case? More generally, what do we know in cases of knowledge of the external world?
According to Locke, knowledge of the external world is knowledge of ‘real existence.’ Knowledge of real existence is knowledge that something really exists and is not a mere figment of your imagination. Locke argues that we can know three different kinds of things really exist. First, each person can know their own existence at any given time. I can know now that I exist at this time. You can know, as you read this, that you exist while you read this. Locke’s claim here is reminiscent of Descartes’ claim that we know our own existence in every act of thinking—even when we doubt our own existence. Second, Locke believes that we can know that God exists. Locke offers a proof of God’s existence in Book IV, chapter 10 of the Essay. Third, we can know that other things distinct from our minds really exist. When you said to your friend that there was a water fountain over there, the knowledge of real existence you expressed was of this third kind. As you looked at the fountain you knew that there was then something distinct from your mind really existing—the water fountain. That’s not to say this was the only other thing you knew to exist at that time. Presumably you also knew many other things distinct from your mind to exist at that time: the floor you were standing on, the hallway you waited in, the doors in the hallway, etc. The knowledge you shared with your friend, however, concerned the existence of the water fountain. You knew that the water fountain existed distinct from your mind. In general, knowledge of the external world is knowledge of the existence of a thing distinct from one’s mind.
Locke gives a somewhat unusual name to knowledge of the external world. It is often called ‘sensory knowledge,’ but Locke calls such knowledge ‘sensitive knowledge.’ He uses this phrase to mark the distinct way that we achieve knowledge of the external world. There is something special, according to Locke, about how knowledge of the external world is achieved that sets it apart from how knowledge of other matters, such as mathematical knowledge, is achieved. Knowledge of the external world is known ‘sensitively’—rather than ‘intuitively’ or ‘demonstratively.’ Locke calls these three ways of coming to knowledge the three degrees of knowledge. Before examining what Locke means when he says that knowledge of the external world is achieved sensitively, it is helpful to consider the other ways Locke believes we come to knowledge—the other ‘degrees’ of knowledge.
According to Locke, knowledge of the external world is different than what he calls intuitive knowledge. Intuitive knowledge is knowledge that we grasp immediately and without any need for proof or explanation. For example, anyone who has ideas of the colors white and black and compares those ideas immediately knows that white is not black. This is the kind of knowledge we often have concerning the meanings of words, at least when words are given explicit definition. To use one of Locke’s examples, if ‘gold’ is defined as a yellow metal, then we can know that gold is yellow. In calling knowledge of the external world ‘sensitive knowledge’ Locke is again marking that such knowledge is distinct from intuitive knowledge.
Locke also holds that knowledge of the external world is different than the kind of knowledge we achieve through proofs or argument. When someone proves that the sum of the three interior angles of a triangle is equal to the sum of two right angles through a proof with multiple steps, Locke calls such knowledge demonstrative knowledge. Locke would say that such a person has demonstrated their conclusion. Demonstrative knowledge, for Locke, is knowledge arrived at by what is called a ‘deductive argument’ today. Locke calls knowledge of the external world ‘sensitive knowledge’ to mark that he does not take it to be a kind of demonstrative knowledge. Knowledge of the external world is not arrived at by any such argument or proof.
Knowledge of the external world is not achieved through thinking about the definitions of our terms or comparing ideas that we have already acquired. Knowledge of the external world doesn’t rest on any proof of the external world. Instead, knowledge of the external world is achieved in sensory experience. It is through the entrance of an idea into our mind through the senses that we have knowledge of the external world. Locke writes, “’Tis therefore the actual receiving of ideas from without that gives us notice of the existence of other things and makes us know that something doth exist at that time without us which causes that idea in us…” (E Book IV, chapter 11, section 2). Suppose that the water fountain you saw was newly installed and had a fresh coat of crimson paint. As you looked at the water fountain and light reflected from the fountain to your eyes an idea of that distinct crimson color entered your mind. According to Locke, as the sensation of that color entered your mind you knew that something crimson existed distinct from your mind by its somehow producing that sensation in you.
Your knowledge of the existence of something crimson is therefore acquired in a way distinct from either intuitive or demonstrative knowledge. It does not depend on a proof or on comparing ideas already existing in your mind. Such knowledge is achieved upon looking at the water fountain and the water fountain’s effect on your mind through your senses.
So far, then, we have seen both the what and the how of knowledge of the external world according to Locke. What we know is real existence. How we know it is through sensation—through the reception of ideas into our minds. The what and the how combine to place some severe limits on what Locke thinks we can know about the external world.
First, our knowledge of the external world only extends as far as current sensory experience. As you look at the water fountain you know that it now exists. When you look away from the water fountain as you turn back to your friend, you no longer know that it now exists. You only now know that it existed when you were looking at it. Similarly, you do not know that it existed before you looked at it. Locke does think that it is highly probable for you that the water fountain existed before and after you look at it. Indeed, he thinks that it is nearly, if not completely, impossible for you to avoid believing that the fountain existed before you saw it and continues to exist after you turn away. Your belief that the water fountain exists when you are not looking at it, then, is both rational and psychologically compelling, according to Locke. Our knowledge extends over relatively little of the world we ordinarily believe to exist. We only know to exist the sensible objects of our immediate sensory environment that are currently affecting us.
Second, we only know the world as it appears to us through our senses. We do not know its underlying nature as it is in itself. This point can be helpfully illustrated by considering a new case. Suppose, for example, that you go on a field trip to gold country. You and the rest of the class dip a sieve into the river and sift out a few flakes of a yellowish metal. The class then goes into a mine, chips off chunks of rock, crush them up, and sift out more pieces of yellowish metal from the crushed stone. At the end of the field trip the class spreads all of the collected pieces of yellowish metal in front of them. As you survey the spread of hunks of yellowish metal you can know that there now exist several distinct objects that affect your mind by producing certain ideas in it—sensations of yellow, solidity, etc. What you do not know is that there is some underlying nature that now exists in each of these hunks of stuff. Moreover, you do not know that they all have the same underlying nature. We are ignorant, in other words, about both the underlying nature of each individual object as well as whether the objects that appear similarly to us have similar underlying natures. There may be tremendous evidence supporting the theory that describes the underlying microstructure of these hunks of stuff and even explains why a microstructure of that type produces the appearances you now see. Such microstructure or underlying nature, however, is not part of how the hunks of stuff now appear to you. Thus, while it may be overwhelmingly probable that some underlying common nature exists in all of the things spread before you, you do not know that that nature exists before you.
One way to make vivid the drastic nature of this limitation on knowledge of the external world is to consider different possible uses of a word like ‘gold.’ If we use the word ‘gold’ to refer to an underlying nature, such as underlying chemical or atomic structure, then on Locke’s view we do not know that gold exists. The belief that gold exists would be a very rational one to hold, based on all of the evidence we have to support our best physical and chemical theories. Nevertheless, such a belief would not be knowledge. If, on the other hand, we use the word ‘gold’ to pick out a category of things which appear to us in a certain distinct way, we may know that gold exists when we experience it. So, for example, if I use ‘gold’ to mean a heavy, yellowish, metallic-feeling thing, then I may know that gold exists when I experience a heavy, yellowish, metallic-feeling thing. Insofar as people use ‘gold’ in the former sense to pick out a chemical or physical kind, rather than in the latter sense to describe a category of thing with a particular sensory appearance, then we do not know that gold exists. In the terminology Locke develops in the Essay, one way to understand this point is that while we can never know that any particular ‘real essence’ exists, we can know that a kind of thing with a certain nominal essence exists.
Third, knowledge of the external world does not extend to other minds. Recall that Locke takes knowledge of the external world to be sensitive knowledge. Sensitive knowledge is achieved as a result of things operating on us through our senses. Locke does not think that other minds affect us directly through our senses. (Our own mind produces ideas in us through what Locke calls reflection, a kind of inner sense directed at our own mind.) At best, the minds of other creatures, including other human beings and other people, affect the behavior of such creatures’ bodies. Those bodies then affect our minds through our senses. As a result, no other minds directly produce ideas in our minds through our senses. Locke does think it overwhelmingly probable, given the similarity of the behavior of other human beings to one’s own behavior, that other human beings, at least, have minds (see 4.11.12). Moreover, believing that other human beings (or even other ‘lower’ animals) have minds may be psychologically irresistible for us (that is, solipsism may not be a real psychological option for us). So, as in the case of believing that objects continue to exist when we don’t experience them, Locke sees belief in other minds as both rationally and psychologically compelling but he does not see it as knowledge.
Overall, then, we can sum up Locke’s account of the how and the what of knowledge of the external world as follows:
What: in particular instances of knowledge of the external world we know the existence of a thing external to our mind. When you saw the water fountain, for example, you knew that a crimson thing, that is a thing with a power to produce a certain sensation in you, then existed.
How: in particular instances of knowledge of the external world we know the existence of a thing with various powers to affect our mind by producing ideas in our mind by virtue of our awareness of the entrance of those ideas into our mind. When you saw the water fountain, for example, you knew that a thing produced a certain visual idea in your mind at that time; that a crimson sensation was then entering your mind.
In section 1 we explored what sensitive knowledge is: what do we know? how do we know it? what are some of the—perhaps surprising—limitations Locke places on sensitive knowledge? This section will explore what has seemed to many to be one of the most puzzling aspects of Locke’s discussion of sensitive knowledge—its compatibility with Locke’s own definition of knowledge. This is a question of how to integrate Locke’s discussion of sensitive knowledge with his broader epistemology. There is a large range of opinion among Locke scholars on whether Locke’s definition of knowledge is compatible with sensitive knowledge, but until very recently most of it was overwhelming pessimistic. Most of Locke’s readers have thought that sensitive knowledge can’t fit under Locke’s official definition of knowledge and is incompatible with his broader epistemology. More recently, however, Locke scholars have attempted to explain how sensitive knowledge can be explained in the terms of Locke’s official definition of knowledge.
After introducing Locke’s definition of knowledge and laying out its prima facie incompatibility with sensitive knowledge, this section will briefly explain various attempts that have been made to integrate sensitive knowledge with Locke’s epistemology.
The final Book of the Essay is dedicated to knowledge and opinion. Locke begins Book IV with a definition of knowledge. To appreciate the potential tension between the definition of knowledge and sensitive knowledge it is worth quoting the definition at length. Locke writes:
Knowledge then seems to me to be nothing but the perception of the connection and agreement, or disagreement and repugnancy of any of our ideas. In this alone it consists. Where this perception is, there is knowledge, and where it is not, there, though we may fancy, guess, or believe, yet we always come short of knowledge. E IV.i.2 (emphases original)
Locke and his readers frequently shorten this definition of knowledge by calling knowledge the perception of agreement of ideas. This entry will adopt that convention.
There are important questions about Locke’s definition of knowledge that bear on its compatibility with sensitive knowledge. Foremost is how to resolve an ambiguity in the definition. There are two ways to read the second ‘of’ in ‘the perception of agreement of ideas.’ First, one could read it as saying that knowledge is the perception of agreement of ideas with something or other, not necessarily another idea. Second, one may read the definition as stating that knowledge is the perception of agreement between ideas—the perception of agreement of one idea with another idea. As we will see below in section 2.7, one route to resolving the tension between sensitive knowledge and Locke’s definition of knowledge is to adopt the first interpretation of the definition. Most of Locke’s readers, however, have rejected this option. In the margin next to the paragraph following the definition of knowledge, Locke noted in his personal copy of the Essay that knowledge is the perception of agreement between two ideas. Following this lead, nearly all of Locke’s readers have taken the second reading, that Locke defines knowledge as the perception of agreement between ideas.
Having fixed an interpretation of Locke’s definition of knowledge, we can now turn to bringing out the tension between Locke’s definition of knowledge and sensitive knowledge. To begin, one might wonder: what does an agreement between two ideas tell us about what exists beyond those ideas? Knowledge of the external world, according to Locke, is knowledge of the existence of something distinct from our mind (and so, of course, distinct from the ideas in our mind). Even Locke himself notes that the mere existence of an idea of something does not guarantee the existence of what that idea is an idea of. Merely having an idea of a freshly painted crimson water fountain does not guarantee that a freshly painted crimson water fountain really exists. At this point, if there is to be any hope, we ought to take a step back and ask: what are the two ideas that agree in sensitive knowledge? It seems clear that if I know the crimson water fountain exists, my idea of it will be one of the ideas. What is the second idea?
We might start making progress on this question by considering the content of sensitive knowledge. As detailed in section one above, we know that a thing exists distinct from our mind. For example, when you saw the freshly painted crimson water fountain down the hall, you knew that a crimson thing really exists. Perhaps, then, sensitive knowledge involves the perception of agreement between the idea of a thing and the idea of real existence. When you look down the hall and know the water fountain exists you perceive an agreement between your idea of the crimson water fountain and the idea of real existence.
One difficult question facing this view is that it’s not clear how to make sense of the idea of real existence agreeing with the idea of anything (except, perhaps, the idea of God). The problem here can be made vivid by adopting a particular understanding of what it is for ideas to agree. On a popular way of interpreting Locke’s account of knowledge, perceiving an agreement between ideas is perceiving some sort of connection between the ideas. In proving, for example, that the sum of the interior angles of a triangle is equal to the sum of two right angles, one perceives through a series of steps that the ideas are connected by the relation of equality. But what would the connection between the idea of real existence and the idea of a thing, such as your idea of the freshly painted crimson water fountain, be? It certainly can’t be that the idea of the freshly painted crimson water fountain entails the idea of real existence since it isn’t necessary that the water fountain exists. Again, contrast sensitive knowledge with intuitive knowledge of the meaning of a term. If ‘gold’ is defined as a yellow metal, then, the idea of yellow is entailed by the idea of gold; it is contained within it. Any thing that is a yellow metal is yellow. But in the case of my idea of the crimson water fountain it’s not true that anything that is a crimson water fountain really exists. The crimson water fountain between the houses of Santa Claus and the Easter Bunny, for example, doesn’t really exist. What, then, is the connection between the ideas perceived to agree in sensitive knowledge and how is such a connection perceived through sensory experience?
We might try to sum up the problem facing Locke’s account as follows. Locke’s definition of knowledge appears to make all knowledge a priori. That is, it seems to make all knowledge depend on reflecting and comparing our ideas to one another in an attempt to understand relations between our ideas. But knowledge of the external world is patently not a priori. What (contingently, at least) exists in the world can’t be known to exist merely by reflecting on our own thoughts. In the remainder of this section, we’ll explore various approaches to the question of whether and how Locke’s definition of knowledge can accommodate sensitive knowledge. As we will see, the question of how to integrate sensitive knowledge with Locke’s account of knowledge brings us to consider many central aspects of Locke’s theoretical philosophy beyond his epistemology.
One tradition that stretches back to Locke’s first readers is simply that Locke bungled his epistemology. One of Locke’s most public critics was Edward Stillingfleet, Bishop of Worcester. Locke and Stillingfleet corresponded in a series of public letters. One of the very first criticisms Stillingfleet leveled at Locke was that his definition of knowledge in terms of ideas makes knowledge of the real world, including even knowledge of its existence, impossible. This criticism persisted even into the twentieth century. Locke, such readers maintain, makes all knowledge a priori. Knowledge of the external world is not a priori. Therefore, Locke’s definition makes knowledge of the external world impossible. Locke’s repeated insistence that we do have sensitive knowledge despite its incompatibility with his definition, such readers maintain, is a result either of his failure to recognize the problem or of a dogmatic insistence that we have such knowledge. The former option is not particularly plausible in light of Locke’s correspondence with Stillingfleet. In fact, Locke responds to Stillingfleet’s charge by describing the ideas perceived to agree in sensitive knowledge. We will shortly have a chance to consider Locke’s response in section 2.4 below. For now it is enough to recognize that Locke surely did not simply miss the apparent problem. That leaves us with the second option. Locke, on this view, brought out a tension with excruciating clarity but was not able to resolve it and instead merely wallowed in it clinging to both sources of the tension.
Though historical figures are as prone to error and clinging to positions they cannot adequately defend as any of us, it is generally best to explain such error or dogmatic clinging rather than simply leave it as unexplained brute failure. Those who think that Locke simply crashed headlong into the tension between knowledge of the external world and his definition of knowledge without offering much in the way of resolution often explain Locke’s position as a result of his particular period in history. Locke, on these views, found himself caught between the expanding and improving new science, and its mechanistic world view, on the one hand, and an old epistemological paradigm with its emphasis on certainty, on the other. The tension between Locke’s claims about sensitive knowledge and his definition of knowledge reflects this broader tension at large during Locke’s life between the changing shape and power of empirical inquiry and attitudes about knowledge.
A second approach to making sense of Locke’s claim that we have sensitive knowledge despite its apparent tension with his definition of knowledge attempts to find resolution in Locke’s philosophy of mind. The basic aim of this approach is to show how sensitive knowledge fits with the broader spirit of Locke’s philosophy even if it runs against the letter of his epistemology. Locke, on these views, supplements his official definition of knowledge with a tacit reliabilism about knowledge when it comes to knowledge of the external world. The groundwork for Locke’s reliabilism is to be found in his account of the meaning of a special kind of idea. To appreciate this approach it will help to take a step back and consider in some detail Locke’s account of how the mind comes to acquire its ideas.
Locke’s aim in Book II of the Essay is to demonstrate how all of our ideas can be acquired through experience. To this end, Locke divides ideas into simple and complex ideas. Simple ideas are passively received by the mind and have no other ideas as parts. So, for example, when I bite into a pineapple I might receive several different simple ideas. One such idea would be the taste of the pineapple. Another might be the feeling of solidity or resistance as I bite into it. Yet another might be the particular wet, slippery texture of the fruit in my mouth, etc. After I’m done chewing it, I might notice a particular sticky texture left on my fingers where I held the fruit. The taste, the various textures, the different shades of yellow, all are different simple ideas for Locke. More specifically, these are all simple ideas of sensation; simple ideas produced in the mind by things outside of the mind operating on it through the senses. Locke also holds that we have simple ideas of reflection. Simple ideas of reflection are ideas of the mind’s own operations. They are ideas produced in the mind when those operations are active. Reflection, Locke thinks, is like our outer senses but directed at the mind’s own activity rather than at an external world. All of these simple ideas of reflection and sensation are passively received by the mind.
Complex ideas are ideas produced by the mind operating on ideas that are somehow already in the mind, whether simple or complex. One way to form complex ideas is by putting two ideas together. One might, for example, combine the visual appearance of a banana with the taste of a pineapple in imagining a ‘pineana.’ Or one might compare a fruit fly crawling on a pineapple to the pineapple itself to form the idea of the larger than relation. Or, one might combine ideas of certain bodily movements corresponding to certain forms of music to make the idea of a dance. All of these would be complex ideas. The operations Locke most frequently discusses are operations of combining ideas, comparing ideas, and abstracting ideas.
The central thrust of Locke’s account of the origins of our ideas is that given a certain set of simple ideas and a certain set of mental operations we can explain how we get all of the ideas we have. Sensation, reflection, and operations of the mind can explain all of the ideas human beings have according to Locke. That is, all of the contents of our thoughts can be traced to origins in sensation or reflection and some combination of mental operations.
Locke’s category of simple ideas is relevant to sensitive knowledge because it occupies a special place within his broader theory of ideas. Simple ideas of sensation are unique among all ideas in that they both represent the external world as well as represent their object perfectly. Some of Locke’s readers have concluded that this unique place in Locke’s theory of ideas makes simple ideas of sensation ripe for use in understanding Locke’s claims about sensitive knowledge.
We can consider each of these features of simple ideas—that they represent external reality and that they represent it perfectly well—in comparison to other ideas. Simple ideas are produced in our minds by other things operating on us. As a result, Locke claims, they represent the power to produce those ideas—that is, the object a simple idea perfectly represents is the power to produce that idea. Simple ideas are not the only ideas that represent mind-independent reality, however. Our ideas of things, whether particular individuals or kinds of things, also represent mind-independent reality. Locke calls this type of idea ideas of substances and they are complex ideas. For example, my idea of a particular individual horse, Mr. Ed, is an idea of a substance. It is an idea of a particular thing which has various qualities. Ideas of substances are therefore ideas that represent (or at least purport to represent) extra-mental reality.
We have other ideas besides simple ideas and ideas of substances, however. We also have ideas of relations and modes. For reasons that go beyond the scope of this entry, Locke does not take our ideas of either kind to represent mind-independent reality. Simple ideas and ideas of substances alone among all ideas represent the external world.
Though simple and substance ideas are alike in representing the external world, they differ with respect to how well they represent the world. Only simple ideas, according to Locke, represent the external world perfectly. Whether an idea of a particular individual substance (Mr. Ed) or an idea of a kind of substance (horses), our ideas of substances all fail to some degree in representing what they aim to represent. To see this difference, we can first consider why simple ideas represent their object perfectly. According to Locke, simple ideas represent the power to produce those ideas in us. That is all they represent. Ideas of substances, by contrast, purport to represent an individual or kind of individual. To do so requires representing that individual or kind as having all and only the qualities it in fact has. If my idea of Mr. Ed does not include an idea of the color of his eyes, then my idea of Mr. Ed falls short of representing Mr. Ed as he really is. It is not, in Locke’s terms, an adequate idea. Similarly, if my idea of Mr. Ed represents him as having a dark spot above his tail, but Mr. Ed does not have such a spot, my idea is again an inadequate idea. Now, to have an adequate idea of a particular substance or kind of substance would be to represent not only all of its sensible qualities—that is, ideas of all of the ways in which it can affect our senses—but also to have ideas of all of its abilities to affect other things. It seems clear—at least in Locke’s mind—that no amount of humanly possible experimentation could ever reveal that degree of detail. At the very least, we simply cannot bring any given thing to interact with all of the other things in the universe to understand the effects it may have on them or them on it.
Simple ideas of sensation, then, stand alone as ideas that both represent the external world and perfectly represent it. For that reason it has seemed to some that simple ideas of sensation are fit to explain sensitive knowledge. Namely, Locke can combine this externalism about content with an externalism about knowledge. Simple ideas have external content in the sense that they represent their cause. Such ideas are fit for knowledge of the external world because inferences from effects to causes is of sufficient reliability to count as knowledge.
Even if one grants this interpretation of the external content of simple ideas, there are different ways of filling in the details. How the details of this content are filled in, moreover, has implications for the content of sensitive knowledge.
One possibility is that simple ideas are what M.R. Ayers calls ‘blank effects.’ The presence of a particular simple idea in your mind on a specific occasion indicates nothing but a power to produce that idea in you at that time. The causes of that idea across different occasions may have nothing in common, and may bear no similarity to one another outside of their ability to produce that idea in your mind.
A second possibility is that simple ideas represent something like their normal or designated cause. The cause may be ‘usual’ or ‘normal’ in any number of senses. It may be the cause that God has ordained for an idea. It may be the cause that most often produces the idea. It may be the cause that was naturally designed to produce the idea. Which of these readings a proponent of this interpretation adopts is not especially important for the purposes of this entry. What is important is that what is meant by the power to produce an idea in this sense is a particular kind of structure in the world.
To illustrate the difference between these interpretations consider the following comparison. Take a particular sweet taste—say, the taste of the glaze on a donut—and a particular non-sweet taste—say, the taste of Tabasco hot sauce. Now consider the effects of the so-called Miracle Berry. If one eats a miracle berry, tabasco sauce will taste like donut glaze and donut glaze will taste like Tabasco sauce. Consider this sequence.
T0: Taste some Tabasco sauce producing the simple idea of the taste of Tabasco in one’s mind.
T1: Eat a miracle berry
T2: Taste some Tabasco sauce producing the simple idea of the taste of donut glaze in one’s mind.
On blank effect readings, powers to produce simple ideas are fully perceiver-relative entities.As a result, the Tabasco sauce has two different powers at T0 and T2. At T0 it has the power to produce the idea of the taste of Tabasco. At T2, because of the effects of the miracle berry, it now has the power to produce the idea of the taste of donut glaze and no longer has the power to produce the idea of the taste of Tabasco.
By contrast, one may think that Locke’s simple ideas have some stronger, more external content. On this stronger reading the ‘power to produce an idea’ is something like the chemical structure that is the usual cause of a certain idea. On this reading, the Tabasco sauce has the same powers at T0 and T2 because it has the same chemical structure and would have the same effect on a normal perceiver.
Recent Locke scholars such as MR Ayers and Martha Bolton have paired externalism about the content of simple ideas with externalism about the knowledge such ideas allow for. On the blank effects reading, if you judge that the cause of a simple idea exists on the basis of my having that simple idea, you cannot fail to be wrong. Such judgments are perfectly reliable and therefore ought to be regarded as knowledge. If you are blindfolded, unknowingly ingest a miracle berry, sample some Tobasco sauce and then judge that you have tasted some donut glaze you are, in a sense, correct and have sensitive knowledge. You have tasted something with the power to produce the simple idea of the taste of donut glaze in you. That is all, on this view, the knowledge of the external world we have: there exist certain powers to affect our minds by producing ideas in us. On this reading we only know the world in relation to ourselves.
On the stronger, more external readings, if you judge that the cause of a simple idea exists on the basis of having that simple idea, you are normally right. According to these views, however that ‘normally’ is cashed out, it will be good enough for such beliefs to amount to knowledge even if they aren’t perfectly reliable because we can be in unusual perceptual circumstances. If you are blindfolded, unknowingly ingest a miracle berry, sample some Tobasco sauce, and then judge that you tasted some donut glaze you are wrong and do not have sensitive knowledge. You have not sampled the usual cause of that idea. When you do, however, taste some actual donut glaze and on that basis judge that there is something with the power to produce the idea of the taste of donut glaze in you, you are right and do have knowledge. This reading of Locke makes his view more similar to that of contemporary externalist epistemologies which deny that having knowledge entails that one knows that one has knowledge (the so-called KK principle). The blank-effects reading, by contrast, remains compatible with knowing that one knows.
Understanding sensitive knowledge in light of his semantics for simple ideas does not ultimately reconcile sensitive knowledge with Locke’s definition of knowledge. Rather, doing so highlights how Locke has resources from his philosophy of mind and its account of the content of thought to supplement his official definition of knowledge with a kind of reliabilism about knowledge. Approaches under this umbrella diverge in how reliable they take such judgments about the existence of the cause to be, where the reliability depends on the external content of Locke’s simple ideas.
Some Locke scholars have attempted to reconcile Locke’s definition of knowledge with sensitive knowledge. They attempt to make sense of sensitive knowledge as the perception of agreement between ideas by finding a connection between the idea of real existence and the idea of a sensible object, such as the water fountain from section one. Interpretations developed by Newman, Allen, and Nagel attempt to draw this connection through an idea of reflection.
To understand this approach, it will be helpful to consider a part of Locke’s theory of ideas only briefly mentioned in 2.3. Recall that we receive simple ideas through two channels according to Locke’s theory of ideas: sensation and reflection. Simple ideas of sensation are produced by objects external to our mind operating on us through our senses. Ideas of reflection, by contrast, are received into the mind by a kind of inner sense—the mind’s awareness of its own activities. The aforementioned interpreters claim that ideas of reflection function as a kind of cognitive faculty indicator analogous to something like a time stamp on a video or photograph. Recording devices frequently time stamp what they record. That is, the recording produced by the device includes information about the time it was recorded. These interpretations attribute a similar view to Locke when it comes to the mental faculty by which an idea comes to be in the mind. The mind, in being aware of its activities, stamps any given idea with an idea of the faculty by which the former is produced in the mind on that occasion. This cognitive faculty indicator provides the connection between the idea of the sensible object and the idea of real existence.
According to Locke, a sensory experience of the sun is manifestly different from a memory of the sun. In fact, Locke claims that a sensory experience of the sun is as distinct from a memory of the sun as it is from a sensory experience or memory of the moon. According to those like Allen, Nagel, and Newman, Locke explains this difference as a matter of each way of thinking about the sun involving distinct ideas of reflection. Looking at the sun in the middle of a cloudless day, the idea of the sun is ‘stamped’ with the idea of actual sensation. The idea of actual sensation is an idea of reflection; an idea of the mental faculty responsible for producing the idea of the sun in the mind at that time. Later that night when remembering how the sun looked at midday, an idea of the sun is again in the mind but this time it is stamped with the idea of memory. The idea of memory is likewise an idea of reflection; an idea of the mental faculty active in producing the idea of the sun in my mind at this later time.
According to this line of interpretation, there are three ideas involved in any given instance of sensitive knowledge. First, there is the idea of the sensible object—the idea of the sun or your idea of the water fountain. Second, there is the idea of sensation. This is an idea of reflection. Third, there is the idea of real existence. The idea of sensation functions as an intermediary connecting the idea of the sensible object to the idea of real existence. The connection between the idea of sensation and the idea of real existence is supposed to be the kind of a priori connection involved in intuitive and demonstrative knowledge. If you are having a sensation then the cause of that sensation exists outside of your mind. Sensation just is being affected by the external world. Given that an idea is stamped with the reflective idea of sensation, then we can safely infer that the cause of the idea so-stamped exists outside of our mind. The connection between the idea of sensation and the idea of the sensible object is not like this—and it is not clear exactly what this relation is according to Locke (possibly co-occurrnce in the mind or some special mode of binding). The important point to note is just that the agreement between the idea of sensation and the idea of real existence is a different kind of agreement than that between the idea of sensation and the idea of the sensible object.
Interpreters disagree on what to make of this difference in the relation between the three ideas involved in sensitive knowledge. Newman suggests that the relation between the idea of actual sensation and the idea of the sensible object (the idea of the sun) only yields a probable opinion and not strict knowledge. Newman emphasizes that the involvement of probable opinion as a component of sensitive knowledge explains Locke’s claims that sensitive knowledge is the least certain of all forms of knowledge. Nagel and Allen, by contrast, hold that both the relation between the idea of actual sensation and the idea of the sensible object as well as the connection between the idea of actual sensation and the idea of real existence are knowledge conferring connections.
The textual motivation for these views comes from Locke’s exchange with Stillingfleet. In section 2.2 above, we saw that Stillingfleet pressed Locke on whether his account of knowledge could handle knowledge of the existence of the external world. Locke responded by describing the ideas perceived to agree in sensitive knowledge. It is worth considering the complete passage:
Now the two ideas that in this case are perceived to agree and do thereby produce knowledge are the idea of actual sensation (which is an action whereof I have a clear and distinct idea) and the idea of actual existence of something without me that causes that sensation. The Works of John Locke, vol. 4, p. 360.
According to these views, when Locke says that one of the ideas perceived to agree in sensitive knowledge is ‘the idea of actual sensation,’ he is naming an idea of reflection, an idea of an operation of the mind. The phrase as it appears in the passage, however, is ambiguous. Locke may be saying that one of the ideas perceived to agree in sensitive knowledge is a sensation—in Locke’s official terminology of the Essay, a simple idea received through sensation—rather than an idea of a certain operation of the mind. Indeed, Locke seems to refer back to this idea as a sensation rather than as an idea of reflection when naming the second idea perceived to agree in sensitive knowledge. He calls it an idea of something that causes ‘that sensation.’ An idea of reflection such as the idea of sensation or the idea of memory is not a sensation. Proponents and opponents of the simple idea of reflection approach give this passage and other similar passages from the Essay and Locke’s correspondence much attention.
In addition to textual worries, one might have philosophical worries about understanding sensitive knowledge as dependent on the reflective idea of sensation. Namely, it might seem to leave Locke open to obvious skeptical objections. On what grounds should we trust our cognitive faculty indicator? Just as one might doubt that a sensory idea really is produced by something external to our minds, one might worry that our ideas of reflection do not accurately track which mental faculties were responsible for producing an idea in our mind. This kind of skeptical doubt, however, is separate from the attempt to sketch how Locke’s definition of knowledge can fit with sensitive knowledge. After all, one might doubt demonstrative knowledge or intuitive knowledge as well. We will return to Locke’s replies to skepticism in section three below.
Sam Rickless has recently advanced what he calls the assurance view of sensitive knowledge. Like the approaches discussed in 2.2 and 2.3, Rickless does not think that sensitive knowledge can be reconciled with Locke’s account of knowledge. However, Rickless argues that Locke himself did not think that sensitive knowledge was, strictly speaking, knowledge after all. As illustrated in 1.2, part of the point of Locke’s discussion of sensitive knowledge is to mark it off as distinct from other forms of knowledge. The philosophical motivation for the assurance approach lies in taking Locke’s definition of knowledge to give knowledge an a priori nature. It simply runs contrary to such a definition that we might know the existence of a contingent, finite object distinct from our minds.
The textual basis of the assurance approach lies in some of the key phrases Locke uses to describe sensitive knowledge. Locke calls sensitive knowledge a kind of ‘assurance.’ ‘Assurance’ is a term that Locke later uses in Book IV of the Essay as a name for mere probable opinion that falls short of knowledge. Similarly, Locke says that sensitive knowledge ‘passes under’ the name of knowledge rather than straightforwardly calling it knowledge. Finally, as noted above, Locke believes that sensitive knowledge is less certain that intuitive or demonstrative knowledge. It seems difficult to understand how sensitive knowledge could be less certain but nevertheless knowledge. Rickless suggests that we can make sense of the lesser certainty of sensitive knowledge by recognizing that it is not knowledge, strictly speaking, at all.
Another approach of note developed during the late twentieth century in the work of Ruth Mattern and then David Soles. Mattern and Soles attempt to reconcile sensitive knowledge with Locke’s definition of knowledge by developing the claim that Locke’s definition of knowledge is merely an analysis of knowledge rather than a description of the subject matter of knowledge. In other words, when Locke defines knowledge as the perception of agreement between ideas he is not claiming that knowledge is about ideas or relations between ideas. Rather, Locke’s definition of knowledge expresses what we do when we achieve knowledge about whatever subject matter we’re interested in: the existence of a thing, the relation between two mathematical objects, etc. Knowledge is grasping the truth of a proposition, seeing that a proposition is true. Locke’s definition of knowledge merely says the same using the Essay’s favored terminology of ideas.
An important consequence of this view is that it pushes back against the claim that all knowledge is of an a priori nature for Locke. His definition in and of itself merely says that knowledge is grasping the truth of a proposition. There may be many ways to ‘grasp’ or perceive the truth of a proposition that do not involve merely thinking about our own ideas. In other words, Locke’s definition leaves open the scope of our knowledge, the ways in which we can perceive any given truth. We might perceive the truth of some propositions using a priori methods, as happens in mathematics. However, there might be other ways of perceiving the truth of a proposition and so coming to knowledge.
Though both Mattern and Soles emphasize this consequence of their view, neither develops in detail how Locke might think we perceive the truth of the kinds of existential propositions known in sensitive knowledge. What sets their approach apart from those mentioned thus far, however, is that rather than try to fit sensitive knowledge to a more widely accepted understanding of Locke’s definition of knowledge, Mattern and Soles take the root of the problem of incorporating sensitive knowledge within Locke’s epistemology to lie in a widespread misunderstanding of Locke’s definition of knowledge.
Finally, John Yolton pioneered an approach to the problem of incorporating sensitive knowledge within Locke’s epistemology based on his larger project of developing an interpretation of Locke’s entire Essay as offering a direct realist theory of perception. At the core of Yolton’s view is a radical departure from Locke scholarship regarding the nature of Locke’s ideas. Ideas, according to Yolton, are acts rather than objects. On Yolton’s view, sensitive knowledge just is perceiving the agreement of an idea with a thing itself. It therefore trades on an interpretation of Locke’s definition of knowledge which is out of favor within current Locke scholarship, as noted above. Namely, that Locke’s definition of knowledge treats knowledge as the perception of agreement between an idea and some thing, not necessarily another idea. With his direct perception interpretation in the background, Yolton is positioned to say that sensitive knowledge can be a perception of agreement between an idea and a really existing thing itself. Yolton’s direct perception interpretation—if not his reading of Locke’s definition of knowledge—has been developed and defended in recent work by Tom Lennon, which will be noted in the annotated bibliography below.
Section 1 explored what Locke takes knowledge of the external world to be, its content and the means by which it is achieved. Section 2 focused on the relationship between Locke’s discussion of knowledge of the external world and his broader epistemology. Knowledge of the external world, however, is often best known for its perplexing relationship with skepticism. This section will explore Locke’s attitude towards and arguments against skepticism.
Locke himself is well aware of skeptical worries about the external world. Each time he brings up sensitive knowledge in the Essay, he follows his introduction of the topic with a discussion of skeptical worries. This section will explore three threads in Locke’s response to the skeptic. First, we will consider what Locke calls ‘concurring reasons.’ These are reasons that Locke takes to support sensitive knowledge, though it appears that he does not think any ordinary instances of sensitive knowledge are based on these reasons. Second, Locke believes that sensitive knowledge is not susceptible to practical doubt. Even if one says that one doubts that the external world exists, sensory experience unfailingly guides human actions. That is, no one can act as if they doubted what their senses tell them about the external world. Third, Locke seems to think that the skeptic, at least in her stronger forms, is self-undermining.
Locke notes that in addition to knowing the existence of a thing when we see it, we have four ‘concurrent reasons’ that further support sensitive knowledge. Some of these reasons commonly crop up in discussions of skepticism in the early modern period from Descartes to Hume.
The first reason that Locke offers is that sensations depend on having senses. People without the requisite sensory organs fail to have the relevant ideas. Merely having the organs isn’t sufficient for having the ideas—a person with eyes sees no colors in the dark. So, it would seem that an external object to the senses is necessary for sensations.
To a skeptic, this is not likely to be especially convincing. After all, the skeptic doubts the very basis of claims that we have sensory organs or that sensory organs themselves are not sufficient for sensations—sense-based observations. Locke’s point here presupposes the veracity of observations of sensory organs and instances of failing to have certain ideas in certain external world conditions.
The second reason Locke offers as concurrent with sensitive knowledge is that sensations are manifestly different than other forms of thought, such as memory or imagination. As we saw above in section 2.4, Locke takes a memory of the sun to be as different from a sensory experience of the sun as a memory of the moon. One way that Locke makes this point vivid concerns our passivity in sensory experience. We can neither produce a sensory experience at will nor prevent ourselves from having a sensory experience at will. When you look up the hall with open eyes it is not up to you whether you see a crimson water fountain. Your mind is simply acted upon. By contrast, we do often exercise voluntary control over memories. We recall previous thoughts and experiences and create new things in thought at will.
A skeptic could, of course, question the force of this reason. The skeptic may point out that we could be passive in sensory experience in our dreams and hallucinations, or because we are disembodied brains in vats. Indeed, the skeptic may insist, we may be wholly non-physical minds subject to the whims of a malicious demon. Nevertheless, even if our passivity with respect to sensation doesn’t prove that the external world exists, Locke may offer it as at least a point that can be built on as part of an argument that the best explanation of our sensory experience is an external world.
The third concurrent reason Locke offers concerns the special connection between sensory experience and pleasure and pain. Locke points out that pleasure and pain are uniquely connected to sensory experience. Remembering the warmth of the sun doesn’t bring the same pleasure as basking in it. Remembering the burn of the fire doesn’t bring the same pain as did reaching in to save a child’s cherished toy accidentally flung into the flames. The value of this reply and its more precise argument against the skeptic will be explored below in section 3.2.
The final, and fourth concurrent reason Locke offers is a very familiar one. Our senses, Locke points out, tend to confirm and mutually support one another. We can touch what we see to verify that what we see really exists. Again, this sort of consideration is not on its own decisive against a skeptic. After all, a malicious demon could arrange the same sort of consistency. However, this kind of consideration can be regarded as a concurrent reason to our sensitive knowledge insofar as the mutual support of our senses is a point that can be part of a larger case in favor of the existence of an external world. Perhaps the best explanation—if not the only possible explanation—of both our passivity and the coherence of our sensations is that an external world is the cause of them.
One of the most interesting aspects of Locke’s concurrent reasons, however, is that they are offered by Locke as reasons supporting the truth of the content sensitive knowledge. That raises a question about sensitive knowledge itself. Does Locke think that instances of sensitive knowledge themselves rest on any reasons? Do we infer the existence of some thing distinct from our minds on the basis of some premise concerning the ideas we have at the time? If Locke does think that sensitive knowledge is based on some reasons, he never clearly articulates what those reasons are or how they are acquired. Perhaps, then, sensitive knowledge is non-inferential and not based on any reasons. Shelley Weinberg has developed an account of sensitive knowledge as non-inferential. Indeed, a non-inferential view of sensitive knowledge seems to fit neatly with the contrast observed in section one above which Locke draws between sensitive and demonstrative knowledge. Demonstrative knowledge, recall, is knowledge achieved by reasoning from premises.
A consequence of taking sensitive knowledge to be non-inferential is that the skeptic cannot be proven wrong—we cannot prove the existence of an external world even if we know it to exist in sensitive knowledge. These concurrent reasons at best make it probable that the external world exists. The concurrent reasons Locke offers, then, are not intended to provide a decisive defeat of the skeptic as part of a proof of the external world. Instead, they provide what Locke takes to be the strongest rational support possible.
In addition to emphasizing the special connection between sensory experience, on the one hand, and pleasure and pain, on the other, Locke repeatedly remarks that skepticism can be cured by fire. Locke writes:
For he that sees a candle burning, and hath experimented the force of its flame by putting his finger in it will little doubt that this is something existing without him which does him harm and puts him to great pain: which is assurance enough when no man requires greater certainty to govern his actions by that what is as certain as his actions themselves. And if our dreamer pleases to try, whether the glowing heat of a glass furnace be barely a wandering imagination in a drowsy man’s fancy by putting his hand into it he may perhaps be wakened into a certainty greater than he could wish that it is something more than bare imagination. E IV.xi.8.
Locke’s point in this and similar passages seems to be that the deliverances of our sense are connected with pleasure and pain in such a way as to make it impossible to doubt our senses for the purposes of guiding our actions. A skeptic, for example, may deny that the glass furnace exists, but if she sticks her hand into the furnace she will irresistibly act on the deliverances of her senses. She will move her hand away from where she perceives the furnace to be, betraying that she in fact accepts what her senses tell her about the world. For the purposes of guiding her action, then, even the skeptic takes the deliverances of her senses to be real.
How strong this serves as a rejoinder to the skeptic is not immediately clear. The skeptic may reply that though they are compelled to act in certain cases this doesn’t mean that they genuinely accept the deliverances of the senses. Or, perhaps more strongly, the skeptic may reply that though they are compelled to assent to what the senses convey, such assent is not rational or reasonable. It is more like a reflex than an action.
Jennifer Nagel has argued that Locke anticipates this kind of response from the skeptic. Locke, according to Nagel, argues that all it is to treat something as really existing is to treat it as action guiding. Locke, in other words, might be taken to collapse the distinction between real existence and real for practical purposes of guiding our action with respect to pleasure and pain. This move by Locke taps into one of Locke’s earliest diagnoses of skepticism: it is rooted in an excessive demand on our rational faculties that derives from insufficient appreciation of the purpose of our faculties.
The purpose of our cognitive faculties, Locke suggests in the Essay’s introduction, is to secure happiness both in this world and beyond. Insofar as our senses provide a guide to securing pleasures and avoiding pains, the senses fulfill their purposes and achieve all the knowledge we can reasonably hope for. A skeptic, then, who hopes for more knowledge over and above guidance with respect to pleasure and pain simply demands too much. Even the skeptic can’t practically deny that our senses do give us knowledge of how to guide our actions with respect to pleasure and pain. That is all there is to knowledge of real existence.
Ultimately, a reply to skepticism based on collapsing real existence with action guidance is only as strong as that collapse. Any form of skepticism that takes knowledge of real existence to be more than knowledge of how to pursue pleasure and avoid pain will remain unmoved. Locke’s view could be more convincing if it were accompanied by a defense of his views about the purpose of our cognitive faculties.
A final line of response to skepticism can be found in Locke’s discussion of sensitive knowledge. When Locke mentions skeptical worries he tends to dismiss them as unworthy of—or possibly as themselves ruling out—serious response. Here are two examples:
If anyone say a dream may do the same thing and all these ideas may be produced in us without any external objects he may please to dream that I make him this answer, 1. that ’tis no great matter whether I remove his scruple or no: where all is but dream, reasoning and arguments are of no use, truth and knowledge nothing… E IV.ii.14
For I think nobody can, in earnest, be so skeptical, as to be uncertain of the existence of those things which he sees and feels. At least, he that can doubt so far, (whatever he may have with his own Thoughts) will never have any controversy with me; since he can never be sure I say anything contrary to his opinion. E IV.xi.3
Locke seems to suggest in these passages that the skeptic is in some way self-undermining. In raising the possibilities they do, they somehow undermine the ability to even coherently talk about knowledge of the external world. Keith Allen has recently developed an argument that connects the account of sensitive knowledge as a perception of agreement between ideas, discussed in section 2.4 above, with this line of anti-skeptical response.
Section 2.4 considered an approach to reconciling Locke’s definition of knowledge with sensitive knowledge through Locke’s category of ideas of reflection. According to this approach, all of our ideas are stamped with an idea of reflection that tells us which of our mental faculties was responsible for producing the idea in our minds at that time. When we have a sensory experience of some object, like the crimson water fountain in section one, our idea of that object agrees with the idea of actual sensation, which itself agrees with the idea of real existence.
As Locke understands the kinds of skeptical doubts in the above mentioned passages, skepticism amounts to doubting the veracity of our ideas of reflection. That is, radical skepticism amounts to doubting that when an idea of a crimson water fountain is stamped with the idea of actual sensation, the idea of the crimson water fountain really is received through sensation. Instead, the idea might be produced in the mind by the mind itself recalling or imagining the idea (unbeknownst to itself). Ideas of reflection provide us with our only way of understanding our mind, however. We have no access to our minds or their activities other than through ideas of reflection. To doubt the veracity of an idea of reflection is therefore to doubt the very possibility of even talking about activities of the mind like knowledge. In doubting whether our ideas of reflection really do tell us about the activities of the mind, then, the skeptic renders useless all talk of knowledge whatsoever.
When Locke says that it matters not whether he replies to the skeptic, Allen argues, he is pointing out this way in which the skeptic’s argument is self-undermining. The skeptic’s goal is to challenge whether we have the knowledge we take ourselves to have. In raising the doubts that they do, however, the skeptic undermines their ability to talk about knowledge at all. Without being able to talk about knowledge the skeptic renders the very doubts they raise about knowledge empty and meaningless.
The force of this response depends on the strength of the skepticism confronted. This reply is only addressed at the most radical of skeptics—the kind of skeptic who challenges that the reflective idea of sensation tells us anything at all about the means by which an idea was produced in the mind. Such a skeptic doubts even the connection between a mind and its thought. A less radical skeptic may simply suggest that on any given particular occasion in which you think you have sensitive knowledge, you do not. A moderate skeptic of this kind would simply note that the reflective idea of sensation is not infallible, it is at best reliable. There are occasions, then, when an idea of a sensible object is stamped with a reflective idea of sensation but the idea of the sensible object is not in fact produced in the mind via sensation. This more moderate worry does not threaten to completely undermine our ability to understand our own minds via ideas of reflection but it does seem to undermine any given instance of sensitive knowledge. There need be no difference in terms of the ideas in your mind when you look up the hall and see a crimson water fountain and when you hallucinate one. Generally, it’s true, the latter will not be stamped with a reflective idea of sensation but on occasion it can be. So far as is possible to tell from one’s own subjective perspective, any given instance of sensitive knowledge might be one of the mistaken cases. Thus, though we cannot be generally mistaken about the existence of the external world we can be mistaken in any particular case.
A theme that emerges from Locke anti-skeptical arguments is the way in which Locke’s account of what it is to have knowledge of the external world comes apart from how skeptical worries are to be engaged. Individuals can have sensitive knowledge even if they can’t draw on the lines of argument Locke himself develops in the Essay. Indeed, in no case is skepticism refuted, or proved wrong. Rather, the skeptic is pushed back with arguments that support a probable opinion that skepticism is mistaken. Locke makes this point explicit when it comes to his ‘concurrent reasons.’ They are reasons both independent of our sensitive knowledge as well as not capable of proving the skeptic wrong. Locke’s other lines of anti-skeptical argument carry the same theme.
Locke’s point that the skeptic can’t doubt their senses in practice emphasizes that even someone committed to skeptical doubts has sensitive knowledge. The force of this response, however, rests on claims about the fundamental nature and purpose of our cognitive faculties that seem beyond the scope of knowledge. Finally, the claim that the radical skeptic is self-undermining likewise divorces the having of sensitive knowledge from anti-skeptical argument. Even the radical skeptic, on this argument, is not so much refuted through a reductio ad absurdum argument as she is set aside as incoherent or not worth serious engagement.
A second theme in Locke’s anti-skeptical argument is that his primary emphasis is merely on the externality or distinctness from our mind of sensible objects. The skeptic Locke engages in the pages of the Essay is one who suggests that what seem to be sensory experiences are in fact nothing but the product of our own mind as a kind of dreaming or mere imaginations. So, even if Locke succeeds in rebuffing the worry that the mind itself is responsible for its sensory experiences, it is not clear how far that takes him against other nearby worries.
For example, Locke’s replies to the skeptic seem to leave us well short of knowing even that there is a distinctly physical as opposed to merely external world. To appreciate this issue and the fine line Locke attempts to draw, consider three claims that Locke holds. First, we cannot know the fundamental nature of any kind of thing, even the nature of our own minds. Second, we know the existence of things distinct from our minds. Third, we know the existence of physical objects (bodies) through sensation. These three claims encapsulate Locke’s rejection of a Cartesian account of the world and our knowledge of it. On a Cartesian view, not only do we know the existence of an external world but we also know its fundamental nature. Locke accepts, nevertheless, that we know bodies to exist distinct form our own minds as thinking things. The difficulty of making sense of Locke’s view can be highlighted by considering Locke’s position vis-a-vis idealist metaphysics. It is not clear, for example, how or whether the position Locke stakes out in holding these three claims is incompatible with an idealist metaphysics—such as Berkeley’s—that gives particular physical objects an existence external to and independent of any particular finite mind. Descartes’ position, on the other hand, stands in clear contrast with the metaphysics of Berkeley. Thus, though Locke’s reply to the skeptic may carry weight against someone who denies there is an external world, it is more difficult to understand how Locke can claim that we know physical objects to exist. Satisfactorily addressing this question for Locke takes us beyond the scope of this entry and into untangling the relationships between what Locke calls nominal essences, real essences, and substance.
Locke’s discussion of knowledge of the external world brings us to confront many of the central themes in Locke’s philosophy. Locke thinks of knowledge of the external world as sensitive knowledge of real existence. That is, it is knowledge that some object exists distinct from our mind and affects our mind by producing certain ideas in it. This knowledge is achieved through sensory experience. It is neither the result of reflecting on ideas already in our mind nor of deductively reasoning from some premises.
Integrating sensitive knowledge with Locke’s broader epistemology is no easy task. Locke’s definition of knowledge appears to make all knowledge a priori, but knowledge of the external world is patently not a priori knowledge like knowledge of mathematical truths—even by Locke’s own lights. It is empirical knowledge gained through experience. Locke nevertheless insists that we have sensitive knowledge. Efforts to understand the place of sensitive knowledge in Locke’s epistemology as a whole lead to probing not only important questions about his definition of knowledge—such as whether it really does make all knowledge a priori—but also his philosophy of mind and accounts of representation and mental content. Indeed, efforts on these issues have led to very radical rethinks of Locke’s entire philosophy such as Yolton’s effort to understand Locke’s theory of perception in direct perception terms.
Finally, Locke’s account of sensitive knowledge is intimately related to but significantly distinct from his reply to skepticism. Locke does not think that particular instances of sensitive knowledge—such as when you know that the paper (or screen) you’re reading from exists—depend on being able to defeat skeptical doubts. Indeed, Locke does not seem to think that the skeptic can be fully defeated or demonstratively proved wrong. Rather, skeptical worries can be pushed back using the probable arguments embodied in Locke’s concurrent reasons with sensitive knowledge. Our passivity in sensation and the coherence of our sensation seem to call out for explanation. The best explanation, Locke seems to think even though he does not explicitly argue the point, is the existence of an external world. Locke rejects other forms of skepticism as either grounded on unacceptable assumptions or else as containing the seeds of their own incoherence. Ultimately none of Locke’s anti-skeptical arguments are likely to convince a dug-in skeptic. But in this failure, Locke is surely not alone, even among other canonical figures in the history of philosophy.
- Locke, John. An Essay Concerning Human Understanding (ed. Peter Nidditch). Oxford University Press, 1975.
- This is the standard scholarly edition of the Essay. It includes an editorial system to note revisions made to the Essay from the first through sixth editions of the Essay as well as references to the translation of the Essay into French by Pierre Coste.
- Locke, John. The Works of John Locke (ed. Thomas Tegg), 1823.
- The collection is contained in nine volumes and includes Locke’s writings and correspondence on many topics, from philosophy, to economics, to religion. Most relevant to this entry, Locke’s correspondence with Stillingfleet is in the fourth volume.
Entries are organized by topic, including the context of their mention in this entry.
- Woolhouse, Roger. ‘Locke’s theory of knowledge,’ The Cambridge Companion to Locke, ed. Vere Chappell, p. 146-171. Cambridge University Press, 1994.
- This is a very accessible entry on Locke’s epistemology. Woolhouse spends time in the entry developing the distinct incompatibility between sensitive knowledge and the definition of knowledge.
- Jolley, Nicholas. Locke. Oxford University Press, 1999.
- Jolley’s book is a short, easily approachable introduction to the whole of Locke’s thought. In the book Jolley not only develops an argument that sensitive knowledge is incompatible with Locke’s theory of knowledge but the broader point that the epistemology Locke develops in Book IV of the Essay is incompatible with the empiricist philosophy of mind and language developed in the first three books of the Essay.
- Ayers, Michael. Locke: Epistemology and Ontology. Routledge. 1993
- Ayers’ book is one of the most influential books in recent Locke scholarship and ranges over the whole of Locke’s metaphysics and epistemology. In many places Ayers attempts to draw connections between Locke’s views and current views and issues in philosophy. It is a near must-read for anyone interested in Locke’s theoretical philosophy. It also contains the formation of the blank effect view of the semantics of simple ideas and an explanation of how the blank effect view could help to make sense of Locke’s claims about sensitive knowledge.
- Bolton, Martha. ‘Locke on the Semantic and Epistemic Role of Simple Ideas of Sensation,’ Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, Vol. 85, Issue 3, p. 301-321. 2004.
- Bolton’s article is a very clear development of the connection between the epistemic and semantic features of simple ideas of sensation mentioned in section 2.3. She also directly engages and discusses the ‘blank effect’ view from Ayers.
- Ott, Walter. ‘What is Locke’s theory of representation?’ British Journal for the History of Philosophy, Vol. 20, Issue 6, p.1077-1095. 2012.
- Ott is a leading scholar on Locke’s theory of representation in both mind and language. This 2012 piece is a nice high level introduction to the issues surrounding Locke’s theory of representation and spells out in detail some of the possible ways of understanding externalist content for Locke’s ideas.
- Allen, Keith. ‘Locke and Sensitive Knowledge,’ Journal of the History of Philosophy, Vol. 51, Issue 2, p.249-266. 2013.
- Allen’s article is notable not only for its clear account of the way in which sensitive knowledge can be made compatible with Locke’s definition of knowledge but also for its very in-depth discussion of how that account of knowledge supplies Locke with a powerful response to the radical skeptic.
- Nagel, Jennifer. ‘Sensitive Knowledge: Locke on Skepticism and Sensation.’
- Nagel’s article has been in circulation online for some time. After developing an account of sensitive knowledge similar to Allen’s, Nagel provides an in-depth account of how Locke develops the point that the skeptic cannot doubt her senses in practice. Nagel also provides useful historical context as to why Locke would’ve thought such a response to the skeptic powerful in light of the kind of skepticism that was popular in the late 17th century.
- Newman, Lex. ‘Locke on Sensitive Knowledge and the Veil of Perception—Four Misconceptions,’ Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, Vol. 85, Issue 3, 273-300. 2004.
- Newman’s article on sensitive knowledge is a careful and methodical look at how sensitive knowledge is compatible not only with Locke’s definition of knowledge but also with attributing to Locke a representational (rather than direct) theory of perception. Newman’s article also contains very detailed argument in favor of the ‘between-ideas’ formulation of Locke’s definition of knowledge mentioned above in section 2.1.
- Newman, Lex. ‘Locke on Knowledge,’ The Cambridge Companion to Locke’s ‘Essay Concerning Human Understanding,’ ed. Lex Newman, 313-351. Cambridge University Press, 2007.
- Newman’s general article on knowledge is very accessible entry point into Locke’s broader epistemology. It concludes with a shorter more easily digested presentation of the view of sensitive knowledge developed in the 2004 paper above.
- Yolton, John. Locke and the Compass of Human Understanding. Cambridge University Press, 1970.
- Yolton’s book contains some of the earliest and clearest attempts to develop a direct perception interpretation of the Essay. Yolton also in this book develops the interpretation of Locke’s definition of knowledge as an agreement between an idea and some thing else, not necessarily an idea. Putting these two points together, Yolton argues that sensitive knowledge neatly fits within Locke’s definition of knowledge
- Lennon, Thomas. ‘Through a Glass Darkly: More on Locke’s Logic of Ideas,’ Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, Vol. 85, Issue 3, p. 301-321. 2004.
- Lennon, Thomas. ‘The Logic of Ideas and the Logic of Things: A Reply to Chappell,’ Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, Vol. 85, Issue 3, p. 356-360. 2004.
- Lennon, Thomas. ‘Locke on Ideas and Representation,’ the Cambridge Companion to Locke’s ‘Essay Concerning Human Understanding,’ ed. Lex Newman, 231-257. Cambridge University Press, 2007.
- All three of these articles by Lennon develop in great detail both the textual and philosophical cases for a direct perception interpretation of Locke’s theory of ideas. The 2007 article from the Cambridge Companion is the most accessible of the bunch and takes on some of the most straightforward objections to the theory.
- Rickless, Samuel. ‘Is Locke’s Theory of Knowledge Inconsistent?’ Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, Vol. 7, Issue 1, p. 83-104. 2008.
- Rickless, Samuel. ‘Locke’s “Sensitive knowledge”: Knowledge or Assurance?’ Oxford Studies in Early Modern Philosophy, Vol. 7. Forthcoming.
- Rickless’ articles provide a sustained, thorough, and creative argument for the claim that Locke does not really think that sensitive knowledge is a kind of knowledge. Rickless provides both textual and philosophical motivation for his interpretation. The second, forthcoming article addresses some of the criticisms that have been made of his view by Allen, Nagel, and Owen.
- Owen, David. ‘Locke on Sensitive Knowledge.’
- This is an unpublished manuscript from David Owen, a leading scholar in early modern philosophy. This article is an accessible argument against Rickless’ assurance interpretation.
- Mattern, Ruth. ‘Locke: “Our Knowledge, Which All Consists in Propositions”.’ Canadian Journal of Philosophy, Vol 8, 677-695. 1978. Reprinted in Locke, ed. Vere Chappell, p. 266-241. Oxford University Press, 1998.
- Mattern’s article marks an important first attempt to understand Locke’s definition as compatible with sensitive knowledge on the grounds that the definition of knowledge is just a statement that knowledge is grasping the truth of a proposition in the Essay’s terminology of ideas.
- Soles, David. ‘Locke on Knowledge and Propositions,’ Philosophical Topics, Vol. 13, Issue 2, p.19-29. 1985.
- Soles, David. ‘Locke’s Empiricism and the Postulation of Unobservables,’ Journal of the History of Philosophy, Vol. 23, Issue 3, p. 339-369. 1985.
- Both of Soles’ articles, but especially the first listed above, very clearly articulate the difference between offering an analysis of knowledge and defining knowledge by describing the subject matter of knowledge. Soles clearly articulates the distinction and how understanding Locke’s definition of knowledge as an analysis makes it clearly compatible with sensitive knowledge.
- Weinberg, Shelley. ‘Locke’s Reply to the Skeptic,’ Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, Vol. 94, Issue 3, p.389-420. 2013.
- Weinberg’s article develops the distinct way in which sensitive knowledge is non-inferential. In light of the non-inferentiality of sensitive knowledge, Weinberg goes on to discuss the lines of response open to Locke.
For those with further interests in the topics of Locke on perception or sensitive knowledge, it is worth reading a special issue of Pacific Philosophical Quarterly edited by Vere Chappell on the topic of Locke’s veil of perception. Several entries above are from this edition—Volume 85, Issue 3. What year? In addition to the entries listed above, there is an introduction to the volume and commentary on each article from Vere Chappell.
- Bolton, Martha, ‘The Taxonomy of Ideas in Locke’s Essay,’ The Cambridge Companion to Locke’s ‘Essay Concerning Human Understanding,’ ed. Lex Newman, 67-100. Cambridge University Press, 2007.
- An accessible general introduction to Locke’s theory of ideas. In the discussion of Locke’s account of the representational content of ideas, it was noted that Locke takes modes and relations to be mind-dependent. For more on the difference between simple ideas and substances ideas, on the one hand, and ideas of modes and relations on the other, it is helpful to look at Locke’s discussion of what he calls the reality, adequacy, and truth of ideas.
- Stuart, Matthew. Locke’s Metaphysics. Oxford University Press, 2013.
- For those interested in more on Locke’s metaphysics, including the mind-dependence of modes and relations, a recent work with an exceptional ability to bring contemporary analytical tools to Locke’s philosophy.
- Newman, Lex (editor). The Cambridge Companion to Locke’s ‘Essay Concerning Human Understanding.’ Cambridge University Press, 2007.
- A broad look at several topics in Locke’s theoretical philosophy, including several articles relevant to Locke’s discussion of nominal essence, real essence, and substance. Thearticles by Ed McCann, Margaret Atherton, Michael Losonsky and Lisa Downing are especially relevant to questions of the way in which Locke can make sense of the claim that there is a physical world external to and distinct from our minds.
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