Edward Jonathan Lowe (1950-2014)
Edward Jonathan Lowe (usually cited as E. J. Lowe) was one of the most significant philosophers of the twentieth and early twenty-first century. He made sustained and significant contributions to debates in metaphysics, ontology, philosophy of mind, philosophy of language, philosophical logic, and philosophy of religion, as well as contributing important scholarly work in early modern philosophy (most notably on Locke).
Over the length of his career, Lowe published eleven single-authored books, four co-edited collections, and well over 300 papers and book reviews in journals and edited volumes. The range of topics covered in his published work is highly eclectic. Given this, and his prolific rate of publication, this article cannot aim to cover all of the questions that Lowe contributed work on. Instead, it will focus on some of his most significant contributions in metaphysics and ontology, and related topics in other areas of philosophy.
This choice of focus stems, in part, from Lowe’s strong belief in the inescapability of metaphysical questions. Lowe argued for the need to approach metaphysics, and philosophy more broadly, in a serious, systematic fashion, likening metaphysics to putting together the pieces of a gigantic jigsaw puzzle, working with, rather than trying to overrule or being secondary to, natural science.
Although the sections in this article focus on different topics, the highly systematic nature of Lowe’s work means that there are many potential points of intersection that could be drawn between them. In the interests of providing a navigable summary of Lowe’s work, this article highlights only some of these connections.
Table of Contents
- What Is Metaphysics?
- Mind, Persons, and Agency
- Other Work
- References and Further Reading
Lowe was born in Dover, England, on 24 March 1950. He went to Cambridge to study Natural Sciences in 1968, changing to History after one year and was awarded a BA (first class) in 1971. Lowe switched to studying philosophy and moved to Oxford. He was awarded his BPhil and DPhil degrees in 1974 and 1975 (supervised by Rom Harré and Simon Blackburn respectively). After briefly teaching at the University of Reading, Lowe moved to the University of Durham in 1980, where he would stay for the rest of his career until his death in 2014.
In the preface to The Possibility of Metaphysics, Lowe states that his ‘overall objective in this book is to help to restore metaphysics to a central position in philosophy as the most fundamental form of rational inquiry, with its own distinctive methods and criteria of validation’ (1998: iii). This section outlines Lowe’s view on what metaphysics is, how it relates to other areas of research and inquiry, and why metaphysics is, for Lowe, ‘unavoidable’. Understanding the inevitability of metaphysical inquiry, and the relationship of metaphysical research to other areas (including physics and the other natural sciences, but also to ‘common sense’ and ordinary perception) is crucial to understand Lowe’s motivation to defend various first-order metaphysical positions. As such, whilst important in its own right, the significance of Lowe’s views about these metametaphysical issues may only become clear later in this entry, once we begin to grapple with the first-order issues.
For Lowe, metaphysics has dual characterisations: as the science of the possible and the science of essence.
As the science of the possible, Lowe does ‘not claim that metaphysics on its own can, in general, tell us what there is. Rather—to a first approximation—I hold that metaphysics by itself only tells us what there could be’ (1998: 9; see also 2006a: 4–5, 2011a: 106; 2007b; 2008a; 2008b; Ms.). Metaphysics is, in part, the process of charting the domain of objective or real possibility, which Lowe holds, is ‘an indispensable prerequisite for the acquisition of any empirical knowledge of actuality’ (2011a: 100). That is, in metaphysics and ontology we explore how things might be—what is possible and compossible (what things could co-exist). This enquiry into the possible ways reality might be, in conjunction with empirical work, can allow us to get at what is actually the case for we must, for Lowe, understand what is possible before we can understand what is actual. In this way, metaphysics becomes indispensable, as a way to illuminate the features of reality that empirical scientific enquiry presupposes, but must be combined with that empirical enquiry to arrive at a full account of how reality is.
This claim about the science of the possible also leads Lowe to a position about the methods of metaphysics, holding that metaphysics’ method ‘is first to argue, in an a priori fashion, for the possibility—and compossibility—of certain sorts of things and then to argue, on partly empirical grounds, for the actuality of some of those things that are compossible’ (2011a: 105). Metaphysics is a holistic enterprise, not to be done in a piecemeal way, as the attempt to understand what things exist and, just as crucially, co-exist.
Lowe’s conception of metaphysics is not divorced from experience and empirical data. There is no clear boundary for Lowe between the work of the metaphysicians and that of the theoretical sciences. But this is not to say that there is not a distinctive role for the philosopher. For Lowe, ‘science presupposes metaphysics… Empirical science at most tells us what is the case, not what must or may be (but happens not to be) the case. Metaphysics deals in possibilities’ (1998: 5).
Lowe’s view holds that metaphysics, or more precisely ontology, comes in two parts: ‘one which is wholly a priori and another which admits empirical elements’ (2006a: 4). The a priori part of ontological theorising is best taken to be that part of metaphysics that is the ‘science of the possible’ described above. That is, the a priori part of ontology explores the realm of genuine metaphysical possibility, and what things could co-exist in a single possible world.
Note that the use of ‘possible world’ here is not intended to invoke a commitment to the concrete reality of possible worlds. Lowe rejects Lewis’ modal realism, denying that possible words, whether they exist or not, are objects (1988: 256). Rather, ‘possible world’ here is only used as a phrase to highlight that we can produce a number of theories that seek to describe how reality is, and call each of them a possible way that reality could be. The a priori part of ontology is thus devoted to exploring those possible ways that reality might be.
The ‘empirically conditioned’ part of ontology seeks ‘to establish, on the basis of empirical evidence and informed by our most successful scientific theories, what kinds of things do exist in this, the actual world’ (2006a: 4–5). Given that metaphysics is, in part, the science of the possible, we can see that for Lowe metaphysics differs in both its subject matter and methodology from the empirical sciences, but crucially the two exist ‘in a symbiotic relationship, in which each complements the other (2011a: 102; see Morganti and Tahko 2017).
By holding that one aspect of ontology is (predominantly) a priori, ontology is methodologically distinct from the empirical sciences. By holding that its subject matter is genuinely possible ways reality could be, its subject matter is distinct as empirical science does not concern itself with how reality could be, only with how it is. But crucially, as ontology has two aspects, and two tasks, it overlaps in one of those tasks with the empirical sciences. This is what gives rise to a truly symbiotic relationship, avoiding many of the issues that arise in other accounts that seek to give priority (epistemic, or otherwise) to either the empirical sciences or to metaphysics.
However, it also brings into focus why, for Lowe, no science can provide the map of reality. Natural sciences are focused on restricted domains, and on what is actual, but grasping what is actual requires us first to know what is possible (2006a: 4). Metaphysics is unavoidable, essential, and cannot be rejected (despite the various arguments that have attempted to do so). For Lowe, metaphysics provides the foundation for natural science, and without that grasp on what is possible, we cannot have knowledge of what is actual, nor come to recognise the implicit (or explicit) assumptions within natural science (see Mumford and Tugby 2013).
In parallel with the above, as the science of essence, Lowe takes metaphysics to be the task of saying what some entity is such that it is that entity—to provide the real definition for that entity (as opposed to the verbal definition; see Fine 1994). To enquire into the real definition of an entity is to attempt ‘to characterise, as perspicuously as possible, the nature or essence of some actual or possible being’ (2007a). Lowe takes this interest in real definition and ‘essence’ from Aristotle. For example, a characterisation of the essence of a circle—‘a perspicuous way of saying what it is, or would be, for something to be a circle’ (2007a)—is to be the locus of a point moving continuously at a fixed distance around another point. This is what it is, or world be, for something to be a circle.
This focus on essence has meant that Lowe is commonly listed as a key figure in the recent resurgence in ‘neo-Aristotelean’ approaches to metaphysics, taking metaphysics not to be primarily concerned with what exists (as in the neo-Quinean tradition), but rather with the essence of those types of entities that do exist, and the metaphysical relations that hold between them.
This conception of neo-Aristoteleanism should be distinguished from another conception, as discussed by Schaffer (2009). Under this alternative conception, neo-Aristoteleans need not accept essences into their ontology, but they do share the focus on how entities are related to each other, rejecting the neo-Quinean focus on what exists (for more on the neo-Aristoteleanism that Lowe endorsed, see Lowe 2013c, Novotný and Novák 2014, Tahko 2012).
We comment more specifically on Lowe’s notion of essence in a later section. However, it is important to see the links that exist for Lowe between metaphysics as the science of the possible, and metaphysics as the science of essence. To elucidate the essential nature of an entity is to provide the existence and identity conditions for that entity, or that kind of entity. The essence is what dictates what that entity is, or would be.
Note the ‘or would be’ in this account. Lowe is clear throughout his work that he is investigating what entities or kinds of entities would be like independently of whether any of them do actually exist. This is not to say that Lowe thinks that he is engaging in some conceptual analysis around the notion of, say, a circle. Rather it is to say that given that metaphysics is about what is possible, we must understand what it would be for something to be a circle so that we can then consider whether reality does in fact contain anything that fits that real definition. This again shows the connection between metaphysics as the science of the possible and metaphysics as the science of essence.
Another domain that is important to highlight in understanding the role and importance of metaphysics is that of language and formal logic. This is particularly the case given the central role in much of the analytic philosophy tradition given to first-order predicate logic with identity. Lowe is clear in his rejection, not of such logic per se, but its assumed dominance, and the types of ontological claims and distinctions that arise from this logical system. For example, Lowe rejects what Smith called ‘Fantology’, the view that the ‘key to the ontological structure of reality is captured syntactically in the “Fa” […] of first-order logic, where “F” stands for what is general in reality and “a” for what is individual (Smith 2005: 1; see also Smith 1997; Lowe 2013a: chapter 4).
The central problem with Fantology, for Lowe, is that it equips us with ‘a certain conception of reference and predication which is, from the point of view of serious ontology, extremely thin and superficial’ (2013a: 50). First-order predicate logic with identity only provides a restricted formal machinery that only allows for ontological distinctions between objects and properties, and between existence and identity. These distinctions are most certainly present in Lowe’s ontology; however, there are many more in addition to these two.
A further problem with Fantology comes from its adherents holding to Quine’s maxim that ‘to be is to be the value of a variable’. Lowe holds that ‘∃’ should be analysed as the ‘particular quantifier’ rather than as an existential quantifier. By so doing, the particular quantifier can quantify over non-existent objects, without having to accept Meinong-like distinctions. For expressing existence, Lowe prefers the use of a monadic existence predicate, ‘E!’. This logical machinery, he argues, better suits the ontological framework that he defends, and thus is to be preferred (see 2013: chapter 4).
This brings us to the main point for Lowe with respect to logic, and language. Understanding language and logic is important, and he does on occasion use arguments from natural language in particular to highlight ontological distinctions (for example between categorical and dispositional predication; see 2013a: chapter 5). But language, and logic, mislead. It is central to Lowe’s philosophical theorising that the hard work of ‘serious ontology’ must come first, and that ontological conclusions cannot be read off of our language or our logic. This is what motivated Lowe’s adoption of a version of sortal logic instead of first-order predicate logic. It is not that sortal logic is intrinsically ‘better’. It is that a version of sortal logic allows Lowe to express the ontological distinctions that he believes exist, which cannot be expressed perspicuously with the tools of first-order predicate logic (2006: chapter 4).
Therefore, in what follows when commenting on Lowe’s first-order views, it should be stressed that arguments that might initially seem to derive from grammatical or semantic points to ontological conclusions are not of the form: language expresses facts in this way; therefore, we should adopt the corresponding ontology. Instead, the move always has to be from ontology to a correct language or logical system.
This does not rule out that some distinctions appear in our natural language, in part, due to those distinctions being indicative of corresponding distinctions in reality (Lowe, personal communication). For example, the grammatical distinction between subject and object might exist in our language because there is a relevantly similar distinction in reality between objects and properties. This is not though to read the distinction off of our language; the case for an ontological distinction between objects and properties must stem from ontological rather than linguistic arguments.
As a last point on the more meta- or methodological parts of Lowe’s work, it is important to note the commitment to common sense in Lowe’s metaphysics. Common sense, for Lowe, is the starting point for many metaphysical and philosophical problems. All else being equal, Lowe often appeals to solutions that are the ‘least revisionary’ either with respect to how we perceive the world, or how we typically talk about the world. Coherence with common sense should be retained if possible, and only rejected if ‘moving away’ from common sense yields significant theoretical advantage. Metaphysics will not always follow common sense, but it can be our starting point, when combined with a respect for science that resists scientism. This sensitivity to common sense becomes further apparent in various places throughout the rest of this article.
For example: on the tensed view of time, ‘for what it is worth, I consider it to be a distinct merit of the tensed view of time that it delivers this verdict, for it surely coincides with the verdict of common sense’ (1998: 104); on intrinsic change, ‘it seems to me that if we have to accept one or other of these three solutions to the semantic problem of intrinsic change, then we had better opt for solution (ii), as this is clearly the least revisionary with respect to our common-sense talk of persistence through change’ (1998: 130); on predicates and properties, ‘the idea behind the proposal is the seemingly common-sense one that the property of being F is what all and only the Fs have in common’ (2006: 122); on four dimensionalism about objects, ‘I have grave doubts about the ultimate coherence of this view of things, suspecting that what superficial plausibility it possesses is parasitic upon our prior grasp of the very neo-Aristotelian or “common-sense” conception which it seeks to challenge’ (2009: 18); and on Quine’s ontological relativism, ‘it is not one that should be contemplated as long as the prevailing common-sense ontological scheme can be defended as viable, as I believe it can’ (2009: 90).
This acceptance of a role in our metaphysics for common sense is not to deny Lowe’s view that metaphysics should be approached as the study of the fundamental nature of reality in a serious and steadfastly realist way. Rather, it is to say that for Lowe it is not the case that metaphysicians have some infallible insight on eternal truths, insulated from the human perspective that otherwise might distort our claims. Metaphysics seeks to understand the nature of reality, whilst accepting that any claims about reality will be made from a particular perspective. We have a relation to reality, but ‘that we cannot stand outside ourselves to study that relation need not imply that it cannot be studied by us at all’ (1998: 4).
This last point serves as the basis on which Lowe rejects what he calls the neo-Kantian objection to metaphysics (2001: 4). Lowe argues that we are ourselves part of reality, and so are our thoughts. This means that claims that knowledge of how things really are is impossible are foundered on a contradiction. Metaphysics, and metaphysicians, must be ‘critical’ (2001: 5). Metaphysics may involve refining concepts, but this is to make those concepts more reflective of reality. That we have a particular viewpoint on the world does not stop this from being possible; rather, it just means that we must be careful to ensure that we are suitably critical.
At the heart of Lowe’s metaphysical (and much of his broader philosophical) work is his defence of a four-category ontology. This was developed over a long period of time, with its most extensive exposition in the 2006 book named for it. This ontology, Lowe argues, best allows for a balance between explanatory power and ontological parsimony, and, along with the equally central notion of ‘essence’, provides the basis for a unified account of a wide range of phenomenon (as it becomes clear in the remainder of this article).
(Note that in earlier work (1989) Lowe defended a three-category ontology but came to believe that an additional category was needed, and theoretically justifiable despite the additional ontological cost. Later, Lowe argues that ‘persons’ may be a further (fifth) fundamental category of entities (2008a). The status of persons is discussed in section 5.)
The four-category ontology explicitly takes its inspiration from the early work of Aristotle, most centrally in the Categories. As Lowe interprets Aristotle:
[Aristotle] articulates a fourfold ontological scheme in terms of the two technical notions of ‘being said of a subject’ and ‘being in a subject’. Primary substances […] are described as being neither said of a subject nor in a subject. Secondary substances—the species and genera to which primary substances belong—are described as being said of a subject but not in a subject. That leaves two other classes of items: those that are both said of a subject and in a subject, and those that are not said of a subject but are in a subject. Since these two classes receive no official names and have been variously denominated over the centuries, I propose to call them, respectively, attributes and modes. (2012a: 97)
Put into Lowe’s preferred terminology, the four-category ontology thus emerges from the intersection of two exhaustive and exclusive ontological distinctions: the first between entities that are substantial and non-substantial (that is, properties or relations), and the second between entities that are universal and particular. This leads to the view that all entities (actual and possible) are assigned to one of the following ontological categories: object (substantial particular), kind (substantial universal), attribute (non-substantial universal), mode (non-substantial particular).
A note on this terminology: Lowe preferred the terminology of ‘mode’ as he took inspiration (and the term) from Locke for his category of particular non-substantial entities. These are property- or relation-instances, and are elsewhere, including by Lowe, called ‘tropes’, ‘abstract particulars’, or ‘individual accidents’.
All four of these categories are equally basic or fundamental. Terms such as ‘universal’, ‘particular’, and ‘entity’—the all-encompassing category that all entities, both universal and particular, belong to—are taken to be transcategorial as they apply to entities from multiple categories.
The four fundamental categories are related to each other through patterns of instantiation and characterisation relations. A particular object is an instance of a kind—a particular tiger is an instance of the kind tiger; and a particular mode is an instance of the non-substantial universal or attribute—the particular redness, say of a particular ball, is an instance of the non-substantial universal redness. The instantiation relation thus tracks the distinction between universal and particular.
The characterisation relation holds along the other dimension of the four-category ontology, between the substantial and non-substantial. A particular redness characterises the particular substance whose redness it is, and the non-substantial universal (attribute) redness characterises the substantial universal (kind) tomato.
Taken together, these categories and relations can be summarised in what Lowe called the ‘Ontological Square’ (2006a: 18):
It should be stressed that these relations are not further elements of being. That is, the ‘relations’ of instantiation and characterisation are strictly ‘formal’. This connected to, but strictly not the same as, the form/content distinction in logic: ‘The ontological form of an entity is provided by its place in the system of categories, for it is in virtue of a being’s category that it is suited or unsuited to combine in various ways with other beings of the same or different categories’ (2006a: 48). Instantiation and characterisation (and other relations discussed below) are thus not relational properties—they are formal relations that illustrate how those entities they relate are. This means that formal relations metaphysically explain the nature of those entities they relate, without those relations themselves being further things (compare the notion of internal relation drawn from Moore 1919).
That these formal relations are not further elements of being also has an additional benefit for Lowe’s system in that it avoids the possible threat of Bradley’s Regress. Bradley’s Regress arises when we consider what explains the claim that objects and properties (or bundles of properties) are related (see Bradley 1893). If we conceive of such relations as distinct from their relata, then we would need to posit further relations to relate them to the original relata, and so on ad infinitum. The formal nature of instantiation and characterisation for Lowe ensures that this problem does not arise. The formal ontological relations are not distinct from the relata they relate, and hold purely in virtue of the existence and intrinsic nature of the relata.
Similarly, the categories themselves are formal and are not further elements of being. Rather the categories indicate the ontological form of the entities that fall under that category, and how those entities that fall under distinct categories are related to each other. The ontological categories therefore do not themselves exist.
The main reason for the non-existence of the categories themselves is that all entities that do exist must fall under one of these categories, but the categories themselves cannot be so analysed. In brief, the categories cannot be universals, as universals have particular instances as their kinds—if the categories were universals, then they would have to have universals (such as the kind dog) as instances. One way out of this is to posit the category of kinds as being a particular—say a set (an abstract particular object). However, this immediately raises the problem of requiring that this set—the set of the categories—is a member of itself. This is a sufficient problem for Lowe for him to reject this possibility.
One further possibility is to take the categories to be ‘higher-order’ universal, and therefore has the first-order categories as its instances. However, and leaving aside Lowe’s general reluctance to accept higher-order universals, the higher-order universals that the different categories would belong to would have to be different under Lowe’s system: the category of kinds would be a second-order universal as its instances are other kinds that are themselves universals; whilst the category of objects would be a first-order universal as its instances are particular substances. Given that the categories would not in fact be of the same order, they would not actually be the same kind, and therefore categories cannot be higher-order universals (2006a: section 3.3; see also Griffith 2015, Miller 2016).
To be clear, this is still a realist account of ontological categories, despite the categories not themselves being elements of being:
An object is different from a property or a mode in virtue of the intrinsic natures of these entities, quite independently of us and our ways of describing or thinking of things. We place things in different ontological categories correctly if we distinguish them rightly in respect of these intrinsic and objective differences between them. (2006a: 43–44)
As discussed in more detail below, we categorise correctly if we correctly account for the existence and identity conditions of an entity—or the essence of that entity—which will be in line with which of the categories the entity falls under.
For example, it is part of the essence of a mode that it depends for its existence and identity upon the object that it characterises and that it is an instance of an attribute. All modes are intrinsically different from all entities that fall under other categories due to these mind-independent existence and identity conditions.
The categories and the relations that hold between them create various forms of asymmetrical dependence relations. Particular modes are ontologically dependent on the particular substance that they are a mode of. Indeed, for Lowe, a mode can only be the mode that it is if it is a way that that particular substance is. For example, the particular mode of redness of a particular apple cannot characterise any other particular object. However, that particular object (the apple) could have been characterised by a different mode. Therefore, the particular object is only weakly dependent on the modes that characterise it, whilst the modes are strongly dependent on the particular objects that they characterise.
Similar asymmetrical dependency relations hold between the other categories. Some non-substantial universal (say, the attribute redness) is weakly dependent on the particular modes that are instances of it. The attribute redness would still exist if all of the actually existing redness modes did not exist, just so long as at least one redness mode did exist. The same is not the case for a particular mode, and so the mode is strongly dependent on the existence of the attribute that the mode is an instance of.
The role of dependency relations within this ontological system is important. However, Lowe holds that dependence is not so much a single relation as a family of relations, including, at least, rigid existential dependence, non-rigid existential dependence and also identity dependence. Dependence, though genuine, is not fundamental, but rather is ‘founded’ upon other formal ontological relations that are more ontologically basic (see Lowe 1994; Tahko and Lowe 2015).
It should be stressed that the non-fundamental nature of dependency should not lead us to think it is unimportant. The variety of dependency relations, and the ‘founded’ nature of dependence, allows for a wide range of intricately distinct dependence relations of differing modal and metaphysical strengths. This feature becomes clear throughout the whole of this article by discussing a range of formal ontological relations, and the key role that they play in differentiating entities and categories of entities.
Beyond the fundamental categories, Lowe argues that a complete metaphysical picture of the world will contain further categories, which are interrelated in a hierarchical structure. This allows Lowe to say that there are both more general but non-fundamental categories (‘substantial’, ‘non-substantial’, ‘entity’, ‘universal’, and ‘particular’), and less general non-fundamental categories (such as ‘concrete objects’ and ‘events’). This acceptance of a hierarchy of entities means that Lowe is not committed to the claim that there only exist fundamental entities. Instead, clearly non-fundamental entities (such as money, or a dog) can exist, and the task of the metaphysician is, in line with neo-Aristotelean claims, is to map how such entities are related to each other. It is the case that all of the fundamental categories are occupied, but ‘there is plenty of scope to debate whether or not various subcategories of those basic ones are filled in actuality’ (2006a: 44). Lowe provides an illustrative example of the hierarchical system he ‘favours himself’, but does note it as a ‘partial sketch’ at (2006: 8).
As noted in passing in the initial description, it is important to stress that Lowe sees this categorial scheme as applying to both actual and possible entities, and suggests that it is the role of the empirical sciences, not philosophers, to decide what entities are actual:
Metaphysics should not be in the business of dictating to empirical scientists precisely how they should categorise the theoretical entities whose existence they postulate. Metaphysics supplies the categories, but how best to apply them in the construction of specific scientific theories is a matter best left to the theorists themselves, provided that they respect the constraints which the categorial framework imposes. (2006a: 19)
Lowe defends the idea that particular objects cannot be mere bundles of properties (either of tropes or of universals), nor should be thought of as some mixture of a ‘mysterious substratum’ (2006a: 28, see also 2000b). Thus the view here is that objects are an irreducible and basic category of entity, which, as part of their essential nature, perform a ‘supporting-role’ for particular property-instances. Thus:
According to my conception of objects, an object is not a complex which is somehow constituted by a collection of particular properties together with some further entity which is itself neither a particular property nor a propertied object. The mistake is to suppose that an object is even partially constituted by its particular properties, as this inverts the true direction of ontological dependency between object and property. Particular properties are no more (and no less) than features or aspects of particular objects, which may indeed be selectively attended to through a mental process of abstraction when we perceive or think of particular objects, but which have no being independently of those objects and which consequently cannot in any sense be regarded as ‘constituents’ of objects. In this respect, the particular properties of an object differ radically from its parts, if it has any, for these are just further objects with particular properties of their own. (2006a: 97)
Justification for this view—for the additional posit in our fundamental ontology of particular substances or objects—comes largely from what Lowe sees as flaws or confusions in the competing views.
On the bundle theory, Lowe thinks that the problem is that if we take that view, we cannot provide adequate identity-conditions for property-instances: ‘Property-instances are ontologically dependent entities, depending for their existence and identity upon the individual substances which they characterize, or to which they “belong”’ (2006a: 27). They cannot ‘float free’ from an individual substance, as properties are ‘ways that objects are’.
On ‘substratum’ views, we are in danger of being committed to ‘bare particularism’, ‘or to the notion of a property-less “substratum” that somehow “supports” and “unites” the properties of a single object’ (2006a: 27). The mistake here is to think of individual substance as complex entities that are composed of a non-propertied substratum and some properties. Rather, Lowe thinks that particular substance are simple fundamental entities, that are weakly dependent on property-instances—in that all particular substances are some way, and so must be characterised by at one property-instance. But this does not make them complex, nor make the individual substance’s properties items that compose that individual substance. This also does not mean that objects cannot be composite. Some objects, living organisms for instance, may be made up of lesser substantial parts.
Together, these motivations lead Lowe to hold that we have reached ‘explanatory bedrock’ in the concept of ‘substance’ or ‘object’, and thus that we should accept the category of ‘individual substance’ into our ontology.
Some further comment is required on Lowe’s views about properties, particularly given his commitment to the existence of both universal and particular properties.
Properties are ways of being, or ways that objects are (2006: 90–91). The particular property of ‘redness’ thus is a way that some object is, and the universal property of redness is a way that more than one object is, such that those objects can be said to be the same colour. This means that properties are not objects as, in line with the above, they cannot exist independently. Properties are strongly dependent on objects, but objects only weakly so on properties.
Relational properties are non-formal and are also taken to be ways that objects are, but ways that two or more objects are such that they are related. As such, relational properties are further elements of reality, and do not hold purely in virtue of the nature of those entities they relate. For example, if ‘loving’ is a genuine existing relation such that ‘John loves Mary’ is true, then it is a non-formal relational property. The ‘loves’ relation tells us something about the way that John and Mary are.
Lowe is an ‘immanent’ realist about universals. This is because Lowe thinks that entities that do not exist ‘in’ space and time, such as transcendent universals, are causally inert and therefore cannot play the role in perception and causation that properties of objects are required to play (2006a: 98). However, Lowe rejects the view that an immanent universal is ‘wholly present’ in all of that universal’s instances, due to the view being committed to an ‘inexplicable mystery which borders on incoherence’, in having to hold that the same universal could be wholly present in two places at the same time.
Instead, Lowe supports a ‘weak’ doctrine of immanence which ‘just amounts to an insistence upon the instantiation principle—the principle that every existing universal is instantiated. Applied to a universal such as the property of being red, it implies that this universal must have particular instances which exist “in” space and time, but it doesn’t imply that the universal itself must literally exist “in” space and time’ (2006a: 99). This solution, though, requires a commitment to both the existence of (instantiated) universals and modes. We have already seen that this is something that Lowe is willing to endorse, but again it is of note that the holistic and systematic nature of Lowe’s ontological theorising is part of the reasoning that gives rise to these commitments.
It should additionally be noted, that in line with the comments above about Lowe’s views on the relationship between language and metaphysics, that Lowe does favour a somewhat sparse conception of properties, at least in the sense that he does not think that every meaningful predicate refers to real property (2006a: 122). In fact, Lowe generally is of the view that far fewer than all meaningful predicates express real properties; however, the job of the philosopher is not primarily to decide which predicates are the ones that express real properties. That, rather, is left to the more empirically informed aspect of our research, just so long as the overall ontological framework is taken into account when considering each case.
A further reason for the positing of non-substantial universals comes from the commitment to kinds, or substantial universals, for if there are kinds, then it cannot be that kinds are characterised by particular property-instances, but instead must be characterised by universal properties. What this means is that given that Lowe defends the existence of kinds (more on this in a moment), it must be that such kinds are characterised by universal properties, not by particular properties. A particular property, or mode, is instantiated by a particular substance, not some kind of object. Universal properties can only characterise universal substances, and particular properties can only characterise particular substances.
Perhaps the main reason that Lowe endorses the existence of universals comes from concerns about laws of nature, arguing that to account fully for such laws we must posit both substantial and non-substantial universals.
Lowe criticises one common universal-invoking account of laws: that natural laws are relations between universal properties as a second-order relation of necessitation (see Armstrong 1983). Under such views, the form of a law is ‘F-ness necessitates G-ness’ and this entails the constant conjunction amongst particulars that ‘For any x, if x is F, then x is G’. However, Lowe argues that laws do not in fact entail constant conjunctions amongst particulars, because ‘laws—apart, perhaps, certain fundamental physical laws—admit of exceptions, which arise from the possibility of interfering factors in the course of nature’ (2006a: 29).
Lowe argues that we should think of laws of nature as determining ‘tendencies’ in the particular objects that they apply to, which result from the complex interaction of multiple laws. This means, and leading from the ontological square above, laws consist, in the simplest cases, of kinds being characterised by some non-substantial universal or property, or, in two or more kinds being characterised by a relational universal. There is no need to invoke second-order necessitation relations, and we can more directly read the correct form of a law from our everyday talk: ‘The basic form of a law is not ‘F-ness necessitates G-ness’, but ‘Ks are F’, or ‘Ks are R-related to Js’, where ‘K’ and ‘J’ denote substantial universals, ‘F’ denotes a property and ‘R’ denotes a relation—that is, where ‘F’ and ‘R’ denote non-substantial universals (2006a: 30).
For example, if it is a law that ‘rubber stretches’ this is to say that things of kind ‘rubber’ is characterised by the non-substantial universal of ‘stretchiness’, or if it is a law that ‘Protons and electrons attract each other’ this is to say that the kind ‘proton’ and the kind ‘electron’ are characterised by the ‘attraction’ relation.
This account, additionally, has the benefit of distinguishing logically between statements of laws, and the corresponding generalisations—between ‘Violets are blue’ and ‘All (particular) violets are blue’ (2006a: 94). One is a statement of law; the other is a statement about all instances of a kind. That is, one tells us something about the nature or essence of the kind ‘violets’, whilst the other tells us something about all the particulars of that kind, which might be something that is not of the essence of the kind. For example, ‘all swans are white’ might be true in that all particular swans might be white. ‘Swans are white’, in contrast, is a statement about the kind swan and is false as the kind swan is not characterised by the property of whiteness—it is not part of the essence of that kind.
Thus, under this account, we have no need to invoke some new relation (in the formal or the ontological sense) to explain laws of nature—all that is required is the already posited relation of characterisation, but on this occasion holding between substantial and non-substantial universals instead of particulars. No further second-order necessitation relation is required.
Lowe does not think that laws of nature are (always) necessary states of affairs. This is because ‘natural’ or ‘physical’ necessity—that which laws of nature are about—is a species of ‘relative’ necessity: ‘a matter of what is necessarily the case given that some contingent truth obtains’ (2006a: 132). Natural necessity is therefore not the same as genuine metaphysical necessity. As it is the case, for Lowe, that all natural laws concerning a kind involve all and only those properties that belong to essence of that kind, the laws of nature may not be necessary in the metaphysical sense. For example, Lowe denies that it is part of the essence of water that it dissolves salt, as he thinks it possible that water—the same substance—could exist in a possible world in which it does not dissolve salt. Instead,
[a]t most we can say that if there is a law, in a given possible world, that water dissolves common salt, then it follows of necessity in that world that any particular quantity of water has a tendency or disposition to dissolve any piece of common salt with which it may come into contact. (2006a: 132)
This, of course, leaves open the question of what is the essence of water—this is discussed in section 4. However, we can see that laws of nature about water are only physically necessary as it could have been that water was different, ruling out the claims from being metaphysically necessary.
Kinds, or substantial universals, are, for Lowe, abstract objects. This is because kinds satisfy two plausible ways in which an entity might be thought to be abstract.
First, abstract could be contrasted with concrete, where a concrete entity exists in space and time, whilst an abstract entity does not. We should not take this to mean that abstract entities and concrete entities have different types of existence. Rather, to be abstract or concrete is to have certain sorts of properties, or better to essentially have certain sorts of properties. Thus, we can hold that an entity is concrete if it essentially has spatiotemporal properties or relations, and an abstract entity does not essentially have any spatiotemporal properties or relations. A table is concrete as a table essentially possesses some spatiotemporal properties (a particular table must be somewhere and somewhen), whilst numbers are abstract as they do not essentially have spatiotemporal properties.
Second, an abstract entity is one that is logically incapable of existing independently. Here, we mean metaphysically independent rather than being independent in thought. So an abstract entity is one that cannot exist independently of some further entity. For example, as we have seen, the particular shade of red of an apple might be thought to be incapable of existing without the further existing of some other properties of that apple, or the apple itself.
Thus, to give an example, the kind horse does not essentially possess any spatiotemporal properties even if particular horses do. As an immanent realist, Lowe does not think the kind is ‘wholly present’ where the instances are. The kind ‘horse’ also cannot exist independently of there being instances of that kind. This also is in line with the weak immanence thesis such that every existing universal is instantiated (2006: 99–100).
Thus, we can conclude that kinds must be objects, as to be an object is to have determinate identity conditions, where if x and y are objects, then there will be some ‘fact of the matter’ as to whether x is identical to y or not (1995: 511–513); and are abstract for the above two reasons. Note, that this does not mean that Lowe denies that there might be particular objects that are abstract. If numbers should be thought of as objects, then they would appear to satisfy the conditions of being abstract particular objects. Again, Lowe’s conception of ontology is such that it need not take a firm position on this in order to the delineate the categories and their formal characteristics. Instead, Lowe was keen to build a system first, and to later consider what entities, if any, fall under which categories.
Despite the focus on characterisation, and instantiation in the preceding discussion, they are not the only formal ontological relations that Lowe is committed to. The following will briefly summarise some other key formal ontological relations in Lowe’s system. Dependence will not be discussed directly, but this is not because Lowe had little to say about dependence. In fact, the opposite is true (see 1994, Tahko and Lowe 2015), though Lowe’s work on this is harder to provide an overview of in an accessible way. Rather, as noted above, dependence is taken by Lowe to be a family of relations, founded upon other formal relations, including those mentioned above, and those discussed in this section.
The relation of exemplification holds, diagrammatically, diagonally between particular objects, and non-substantial universals. Therefore, Lowe holds that an object can exemplify an attribute in two ways: the object may instantiate a kind, which is characterised by the attribute; or the object may be characterised by a mode which instantiates that attribute. Exemplification is thus not fundamental, as it can be analysed as two distinct patterns of instantiation and characterisation relations.
Though not fundamental, exemplification is important in Lowe’s system, and as is the distinction between the two ways in which an object might exemplify an attribute. This is because these two ways to exemplify an attribute express the distinction between occurrent (or categorical) and dispositional predication—the difference between saying ‘This stuff dissolves in water’ and ‘This stuff is dissolving in water’. For Lowe, both of those predications express the exemplification of the same attribute (non-substantial universal), but do so in distinct ways.
On Lowe’s view then, it is not strictly correct to distinguish between, as many do, between occurrent (or categorical) and dispositional properties. But, this distinction does have an ontological ground—it is not merely a difference in language:
A sentence of the form ‘a is occurrently F’ means ‘a possesses a mode of Fness’, whereas a sentence of form ‘a is dispositionally F’ means ‘a instantiates a kind K which possesses Fness’. Thus, according to this view, properties (in the sense of universals) primarily characterize kinds and only derivatively or indirectly characterize individual substances or objects. (2006a: 125)
This is an ontological difference in how this indirect characterisation occurs, although not one where the difference lies in there being distinct types of properties (compare Heil 2010 and the view that properties are ‘powerful qualities’).
Identity, for Lowe, is purely formal, rather than being a relational property. This is because whilst Lowe does not think that questions about self-identity are trivial, having to do with complex issues about identity conditions, nor are unimportant—it being in virtue of self-identity that objects are countable and can constitute a plurality; identity (and self-identity) is a necessary condition upon the existence of objects. This makes identity too fundamental to be something in the world, and rather describes how items are in the world.
As detailed in section 4, understanding the identity conditions of an object is a crucial aspect to understanding the essence of the object, as these identity conditions are supplied by the kind that the object instantiates, which is itself part of the essence of that object—an object cannot become a different kind of object without the original object ceasing to be.
The distinction between constitution and composition is important for many reasons, but perhaps in Lowe’s work this distinction is best known as being at the centre of the claim that that a statue and the lump of bronze that it is composed of are distinct. That is, Lowe’s defence that where there is a statue, there are two non-identical overlapping objects that are the statue and the lump of bronze (see 2009a: chapter 6; 2006a: 49–51).
Composition is a many-one relation that holds between a (non-simple) whole and (some) of its proper parts. A bronze statue is composed of the bronze atoms that are the proper parts of the statue. The conditions under which an object can be composed are given by the kind (at the relative level of composition) that the object is an instance of. Thus, the composition conditions of a bronze statue are different from the composition conditions of the bronze atoms (which are composed of sub-atomic particles) that compose the statue. Therefore, as an example, some bronze atoms compose a lump of bronze at a time t just in case (1) those bronze atoms are fused together over a period of time to which t belongs and (2) during that period there are no other bronze atoms with which any of them are fused. (2) ensures that the lump of bronze is ‘maximal’, meaning that during the period in which we are discussing the composition conditions of that lump of bronze, it cannot be fused to further bronze atoms—that is, the lump of bronze is not a proper part of some further larger lump of bronze (2006a: 50); and (2) also ensures that there cannot be two spatially coinciding objects of the same kind. Lowe rejects this due to the problems that such a possibility give rise to with respect to individuating those distinct objects (1998: 202; 2002a: 71).
From this Lowe concludes that a lump of bronze and the statue it composes have different composition conditions, as it is case that the condition on a statue must include its shape, whilst this is not the case for a lump of bronze. Furthermore, a statue can be composed of different lumps of bronze over its lifetime (1995b). This is not possible for a lump of bronze for if a lump of bronze were to lose one of its bronze atoms then it would cease to be that (original) lump of bronze. In this way, composition conditions are closely related to persistence conditions.
Constitution, for Lowe, is not identity, but rather is ‘the closest way in which two entities can be related while still remaining numerically distinct’ (2006a: 51). Perhaps the closest Lowe comes to providing a precise definition of constitution, though one explicitly restricted to cases in which both x and y are composite objects, is that ‘x constitutes y at time t just in case x and y coincide spatially at t and every component part of x at t is also a component part of y at t, but not every component part of y at t is also a component part of x at t’ (2009a: 89). Constitution can be said to result in the view that there can be two distinct spatially coinciding objects.
An example is perhaps the best way to get at Lowe’s conception here. Take again our statue and lump of bronze. The statue has the shape and weight it has in virtue of the shape and weight of the lump of bronze. The ‘in virtue’ of phrase is for Lowe ‘typically apt’ when constitution holds. But the lump of bronze constitutes the statue—they are distinct entities. We know they are distinct because they have distinct identity and existence conditions. This is not, though, discovered empirically—rather we know it because in grasping part of the essence of statues and lump of bronze, we know that they have distinct essences and thus are distinct entities (2008b: 46).
That constitution is not identity is also important for Lowe’s solution to the problem of Tibbles, raised by Geach (1980) in his argument for relative identity. Without going into full detail of the case, we want to say that both ‘Tibbles is a cat’ and ‘The lump of feline tissue, c, is a cat’ are true. This raises a puzzle if we imagine some proper part cn of c that contains all of c except for one hair. If ‘c is a cat’ is true, then presumably so is ‘cn is a cat’. Extending this, we now seem to have to accept, as the full example goes, 1001 different cats all sitting on the mat.
Lowe’s distinction between constitution and identity allows for a solution to this. Lowe argues that we must recognise that the sortal terms ‘lump of feline tissue’ and ‘cat’ have different criteria of identity associated with them. The removal of one part of a lump renders the remaining lump a different lump—we cannot take a hair away from c without destroying c. However, the same is not the case with Tibbles, as Tibbles might, as in other extensions to the example, lose its tail, but this would not destroy Tibbles.
This difference in the criterion of identity of c and Tibbles indicates to us that there are two different senses of the predicate ‘-is a cat’. c is a cat only in the sense of c constituting a cat, whilst Tibbles is a cat in the sense of Tibbles being an instance of the sortal kind ‘cat’. ‘-is a cat’ is not ambiguous once we recognise the distinction between the ‘is’ of constitution and the ‘is’ of instantiation (2009a: chapter 6).
Lowe’s views on persistence, temporary intrinsics, and change are perhaps best shown in a dialogue that he had with David Lewis in Analysis in the late 1980s. In these papers, Lowe outlines his rejection of temporal parts, and of Lewis’ still standard distinction between endurantism and perdurantism. In Lewis’ terminology, ‘something perdures iff it persists by having different temporal parts, or stages, at different times, though no one part of it is wholly present at more than one time; whereas it endures iff it persists by being wholly present at more than one time’ (Lewis, 1986: 202).
Lowe rejects this way of framing the question, and thereby rejects both endurantism (so conceived) and perdurantism. On endurantism, Lowe argues that, in parallel to the above arguments about universal properties, that ‘there is no useful notion of such a thing being “wholly present” at a time’ (1987a: 152). The issue is that ‘wholly present’ must be contrasted with the notion of ‘partially present’. However, if we were an endurantist on Lewis’ conception, the idea of a ‘partially present’ object simply makes no sense.
Lowe rejects perdurantism as he rejects the existence of temporal parts for ordinary, concrete objects, noting that he finds the notion ‘scarcely intelligible’ (1987a: 152; he accepts as possible, though without committing himself to, the view that events and processes have temporal parts; see 1998: 99–100).
More substantively, Lowe thinks that the only way to get some grip on the notion of temporal parts is by analogy to spatial parts. Lowe thinks that concrete things can only have spatial parts if the things are extended in space. Following the analogy, a concrete thing can only have temporal parts if it is extended in time. However, this means that the debate is no longer about endurantism or perdurantism:
the perdurance versus endurance debate doesn’t really hinge upon issues in mereology (the study of part–whole relations) as such, but rather upon the question of whether anything…is extended in time, in anything like the way in which things are extended in space. But this is at bottom a question about the nature of time, rather than a question about the nature of things existing in it. The question is whether we can properly talk about time as being some sort of dimension of reality, relevantly akin to the three dimensions of space. (1998: 102)
Indeed, Lowe, in a set of later papers (though clearly echoing the above sentiments), ultimately argues that the distinction between 3D (roughly endurantist views) and 4D (roughly perdurantist views) descriptions of the world ‘are equivalent in the sense of being intertranslatable without remainder, and [Lowe and McCall] take the position that there is no “fact of the matter” as to whether we live in a 3D or 4D world’ (2006c: 570; see also 2003b).
The main reason for this is that in the case of some particles that have no parts, and exist at only one time, we can describe those particles ‘indifferently’ as instantaneous 4D temporal parts, or as 3D objects that exist only at one time, with a one–one relationship between such descriptions (2006c). This claim should be considered alongside Lowe’s related but separate claim that perdurance and endurance account of persistence are in fact equally good at handing problems such as vagueness (see 2005b, a response to views expressed in Sider 2001 and Hawley 2001).
What then is Lowe’s view about persistence over time? To get at this, we must distinguish between the metaphysical and the semantic problems, as each requires their own answer—indeed, Lowe thinks that Lewis’ solution fails in part because it tries to provide both a semantic and metaphysical solution at once (1988).
The semantic problem is that of specifying the logical form of sentences ascribing temporary intrinsics to objects. Lowe’s solution is ‘adverbalism’. This solution to the correct form of such sentences is ‘a is-at-t F’—that is, that it is the having of a property that is relativised to a time. Thus, an object is not simply characterised by a property, but instead the relation of characterisation—or whatever relation holds between an object and a property that it has—is relativised to time. The main reason for Lowe’s endorsement of this is that he thinks it is the ‘least revisionary’ to our common-sense talk of objects persisting through change when compared to solutions that relativise the property such that it is in fact a relational property, and that relativise the object itself—that is posit temporal parts.
We can see the intuitive pull of this view when we (cautiously) consider the analogous case in spatial properties, as the sentence ‘The Thames is broad in London’ is best analysed to understand what we mean by that sentence as ‘The Thames is-in-London broad’. Again we can see that it is the ascription of a property is, in this case, spatially relativised (1988: 73–75).
The metaphysical problem of intrinsic change is the problem for how there can be objects for which the semantic problem arises—how there can be objects that can seemingly survive through change. To this problem, Lowe’s solution is that the identity over time of objects is founded in the preservation of certain relationships between that object’s constituent parts at any given time. Thus, a tree can survive a change in its properties because its ‘diachronic identity is consistent with a degree of replacement and/or rearrangement amongst its components, sufficient to allow for growth and maturation and so forth’ (1988: 76). This replacement or rearrangement explains how an object can change its shape and yet remain the same object as the change in shape can be explained as a change in the relations between the object’s constituent parts, and the shape of the object supervenes on these relations between its constituent parts.
There are two main consequences of this view (see Lewis 1988 for a discussion of both). First, Lowe has to deny that constitution is identity. However, we have already seen that Lowe accepts this claim independently. Second, Lowe is committed to there being fundamental particles that have their intrinsic properties unchangeably. This, again, is something Lowe is willing to accept, arguing that classical atoms and fundamental particles of modern physics are posited as having their properties unchangeably.
Note that the question of how much change an object can persist through—its persistence conditions—has not been addressed so far. Lowe’s proposed solution, as with other notions such as identity, composition, and existence conditions, is that an object inherits its persistence conditions from the kind that that object is an instance of, and in turn the kind has those specific conditions as it is part of the essence of that kind.
The topics of persistence and change are, of course, related to questions about the nature of time. For some of Lowe’s writings on time, see (1987b, 1992, 1998) where Lowe holds an adverbial view, or (2005b) where Lowe leans towards presentism.
As the last paragraph of the preceding section made clear, the notion of essence plays a significant role in Lowe’s metaphysics. This section outlines what Lowe means by essence, how we might some to know the essence of some entity, and it highlights some further crucial theoretical roles that essence plays for Lowe and his ‘serious essentialism’ thesis that essences exist, but are not further entities (see 2013a: chapter 8).
Lowe claimed that the closest that we have for a definition of what an essence is comes from Locke: ‘the very being of any thing, whereby it is what it is’ (Locke, 1975: III, III, §15). Alternatively, we can approach the notion via the Aristotelean idea of a ‘real definition’, as opposed to a ‘verbal definition’: ‘A real definition of an entity, E, is to be understood as a proposition which tells us, in the most perspicuous fashion, what E is—or, more broadly, since we do not want to restrict ourselves solely to the essences of actually existing things, what E is or would be’ (2012a: 104–105). To ask what the essence of an entity is to ask for the real definition. It is to ask for a definition of that thing.
Though heavily inspired by Locke, Lowe stresses that, contra Locke, essences are not further entities, since if all essences were entities, and all entities had essences, an infinite regress would arise. Further to this, essences are also not entities, as essences are, in a sense, the identity of an entity. This is because to express the essence of an entity is to express its identity and existence conditions (from which other knowledge such as the entities persistence conditions can be derived). Expressing these identity and existence conditions is to express what that entity essentially depends upon, which ultimately is to express its essence.
This might seem strange given the above quote about real definitions being understood ‘as a proposition’. However, the real definition may be a proposition, but only as this proposition expresses the essence of the entity. The essence is not a further entity of any kind: not a set of identity and existence conditions, or a proposition. Therefore:
To know something’s essence is not to be acquainted with some further thing of a special kind, but simply to understand what exactly that thing is. This, indeed, is why knowledge of essence is possible, for it is a product simply of understanding, not of some mysterious kind of quasi-perceptual acquaintance with esoteric entities of any sort. And, on pain of incoherence, we cannot deny that we understand what at least some things are, and thereby know their essences. (2013a: 147)
This insistence that an essence is not a further entity is one reason that Lowe’s account can be distinguished from perhaps the best-known account of essence, especially as it derives from the work of Kripke and Putnam. Under that account, essences are discovered a posteriori as the essence of an entity is what that entity consists of—the essence of water consists in its molecular make-up of H2O, or the essence of a living organism consists in its DNA. However, this makes the essence of an entity some further entity, opening the way for the possibility of an infinite regress once we ask what the essence of those further entities are.
Providing a clear illustrative example of an essence of an entity is difficult. Lowe thought that specifying or providing the real definition of an entity is incredibly hard, even though we can know aspects of the essence of entities. The one normally given, that Lowe borrows from Spinoza, is that of a circle:
Circle: A circle is the locus of a point moving continuously in a plane at a fixed distance from a given point. (2012a: 105; see Spinoza 1955)
This tells us what a circle is, and what Lowe termed its generating principle—what it takes for a circle to come into being. It is a necessary truth about circles because it is part of the essence of what it is to be a circle. However, importantly, not all necessary truths will be essential truths. This is because certain necessary truths, as mentioned above, are not metaphysically necessary, but only physically necessary.
That we can know something of the essence of non-existing things means that for Lowe essence precedes existence (2013a: 148). The reason that Lowe thinks this is tied to the metametaphysical claims is discussed in section 2—to find out if some X exists, we must first know what X is. This is not to deny that to understand the essence of something might have first discovered the existence of certain other kinds of things. For example, we knew what transuranic elements were before we discovered them, but only because we had already learned about the composition of other atomic nuclei and thus that what we were trying to find was elements with new combinations of protons and neutrons. Those transuranic elements could not even have been understood prior to the discovery of sub-atomic particles, but given that discovery we could come to know some part of the essence of some elements that we at that time had not empirically discovered.
Note, that this also counts against the a posteriori nature of the Kripke–Putnam view. Given that essences are not further entities, they are not things out in the world to be discovered. As we have seen, this is not to deny that there is perhaps some empirical knowledge required prior to understanding the essences of some entities. It is only to say that some a priori grasping of an entities essence is required first.
One major theoretical role that essences play in Lowe’s ontology is that, contra Kripke–Putnam essentialism, and in line with other supporters of (broadly conceived) Aristotelean essentialism (See Fine, 1994, 1995a, 1995b; Oderberg 2007, 2011; Koslicki 2012), essence is ontologically prior to modality. Essences should not be reduced to de re modal properties: ‘essences are the ground of all metaphysical necessity and possibility’ (2013a: 152; see also 2011b).
Much of the reason for this comes from Lowe’s arguments that other accounts, most prominently those built around the notion of ‘possible worlds’ are flawed. At heart, Lowe’s objection to such views is that they do not actually explain what they set out to—modal truths. This is because the very notion of a ‘possible world’ upon which such views must rely is itself highly obscure. Thus, in the end, have to resort to a form of modal primitivism whereby modal truths have to be taken to be brutely true or false. For this reason, Lowe argues that it is better to take essence to be the more fundamental notion, as essence can both be more readily independently grasped, and used to explain modality. (There is not space here for a full overview of Lowe’s criticisms of the various versions of alternative views; for more, see 2013a: chapter 8, 2008b; 2012c.)
A further major element in Lowe’s account of essence is his distinction between general and individual essences:
If X is something of kind K, then, X ’s general essence is what it is to be a K, while X’s individual essence is what it is to be the individual of kind K that X is, as opposed to any other individual of that kind. So suppose, for example, that X is a particular cat. Then X’s general essence is what it is to be a cat and X’s individual essence is what it is to be this particular cat, X. (2013a: 145)
The individual essence is required in addition to a general essence to ensure that being a particular entity is distinct from being just some entity of a particular kind. That is, as the general essence is shared by all entities that are Ks, the individual essence allows us to individuate between different Ks. Specifying the essence of an entity is to express that entity’s identity conditions, and identity conditions (or criterion of identity) are what allow us to individuate entities (see 1989; 2013a: chapter 5).
This distinction is closely tied to Lowe’s thesis of categoricalism—the view that one necessary condition on a thinker’s ability to pick out single objects in thought is the grasping of a categorial concepts under which the object is conceived to fall (2013a: 21).
The question this is answering is how can we comprehendingly have singular thoughts about objects. Categoricalism is the answer. For Lowe, we cannot have singular thoughts about, to use Lowe’s example, a cat, Oscar, unless we have already grasped that Oscar falls under the categorial concept of ‘living being’, as this would appear to be the narrowest general concept that Oscar could fall under.
Of course, Oscar falls under other categories also—such as animal, and cat—but these are subcategories of the more general category of living organism. This explains why we may have singular thoughts about Oscar even if we mistakenly believe that Oscar is a dog (because, say, we have misheard my neighbours and not actually seen Oscar ourselves). Categoricalism allows that we might mis-categorise objects as it only requires a sufficient grasp of the essence of an entity; but it does rule out situations in which we thought that Oscar was actually a piece of furniture. In such cases, it seems correct to say that we have not actually grasped the essence of Oscar at all.
One immediate objection here might be that we could use notions such a ‘thing’ or ‘entity’ in which case we would always, trivially, be able to grasp part of the essence of an entity. However, as noted above, notions like ‘thing’ and ‘entity’ are transcategorial. This means that they cannot provide us any essential knowledge about the entity in question. Transcategorial notions cannot allow for thinking about an object comprehendingly because the terms do not express categories, and therefore do not provide implicit or explicit knowledge of the relevant object’s criteria of identity.
We can see that categoricalism has a major consequence for Lowe—it means that Lowe thinks that we cannot think comprehendingly about any entity without first grasping some aspect of its essence. The requirements for grasping a part of an essence are minimal, and Lowe is explicit that he thinks that even young children are capable of doing this. But, crucially, because we do not require the ability to grasp the full essence of an entity to think comprehendingly about it, nor do we require empirical knowledge to grasp part of an essence of an object. As seen above, the statue and the lump of bronze are empirically identical, but we can distinguish them because we know what kind of thing they are—that is, what their identity and existence conditions are, and therefore what they essentially depend upon.
Alongside and intertwining with the above described complex ontological system, Lowe defended some less commonly held positions in the metaphysics of mind. This last section outlines some of the key aspects of these positions, though again noting that this due to space limitations must be taken as only a survey of his thinking on these matters, and, in particular, one overlooking significant negative arguments Lowe developed against the alternative positions.
These positions, especially his views on persons, are driven by what Lowe thinks about substances, properties, and other metaphysical and ontological topics already covered in this article. That is, there is a sense in which Lowe’s views about persons, agency, and the mind can be seen as an application to these debates of the metaphysical principles and views that Lowe defended. For example, throughout this section, the role of identity conditions is central. Similarly, in Lowe’s work on mental causation, universals play a significant role. This, of course, does not mean that we must accept Lowe’s positions in the philosophy of mind if we accept his broader ontological picture, or vice versa. Rather, this is only to highlight the intricate and systematic nature of Lowe’s philosophical views.
The non-identity of mental and physical states for Lowe ultimately comes from his claim that the two have different identity conditions, and, as seen above when discussing identity more broadly, if two entities have distinct identity conditions, then they cannot be entities of the same kind.
It can, of course, subsequently be asked in what way are the identity conditions for mental and physical states different. One difference that Lowe appeals to is that a physical state is, by its essential nature, a thing whose possession makes a difference to at least part of the space that the thing that possesses it occupies. For example, the property of being sitting is physical, as in virtue of possessing that property a person fills space in a particular way. In contrast, Lowe holds that there are no such spatial connotations for mental states. As such, mental and physical states have distinct identity conditions and thus cannot be of the same kind (2008a: 22–23).
Lowe in fact wishes to go further, stating that physicalism simply cannot be true and is an unintelligible thesis. One reason for this claim is that he thinks that truths about identity cannot be exciting in the way that physicalism would require. This is because identity statements can only intelligibly hold between entities of the same kind. However, ‘exciting identifications—of physical objects with mathematical objects, or of mental states with physical states—all violate this principle by trying to identify items of quite different kinds’ (2008a: 23, chapter 5).
Lowe, as we have seen above, holds that a substance is an individual or a bearer of properties. In the case of mental properties (such as pain and desire), this bearer is the subject of experience, with human persons being a prime example of such subjects (though note that for Lowe non-human animals might be also considered subjects of experience, and as such his non-Cartesian substance dualism is not inherently restricted to humans only). As well as this subject of experience, there also exists a physical body—a substance that is the bearer of physical properties. Persons are to be identified with the subject of experience rather than the biological organism. Two distinct substances exist (the person and the body), but they are not identical with each other‘a human person is not identical with his or her “organized body” nor with any part of it’ (2008a: 95–96; see also 1996: chapter 2). Indeed, for Lowe, the non-identity of the self with its body or any part of it implies that the self is a simple, non-composite substance (2001).
Famously, Descartes’ dualism additionally held that a person cannot be identified with the person’s brain or body as the person can only be the bearer of mental properties, and not physical properties. Lowe is clear that his version of dualism is not committed to this additional claim. Instead, Lowe rejects the idea that persons can only have mental properties:
this sort of [non-Cartesian] substance dualist may maintain that I [a person] possess certain physical properties in virtue of possessing a body that possesses those properties: that, for instance, I have a certain shape and size for this reason, and that for this reason I have a certain velocity when my body moves. (2008a: 95)
This, though, is not to say that every physical property of the body is also possessed by the person, as otherwise the view would collapse into the view that the person is the body.
Thus there are two distinct substances, a subject of experience (a person) and the physical body that the person possesses, and, contra Descartes, the person can be the bearer of psychological and physical properties. This has an important consequence that Lowe does hold that persons are not necessarily separable from their bodies, in the sense of being capable of disembodied existence. This is because Lowe thinks that it is part of the essence of what it is to be a human that we have bodies. If there were just disembodied minds, then that would not be a human.
As discussed in more detail in section 5d, Lowe’s non-Cartesian substance dualism is a form of interactionist dualism—he is committed to the claim that at least some mental events cause changes in the physical world.
Above we have largely just asserted in line with substance dualism that a person is not to be identified with their body. Lowe does provide arguments for this; here we focus on an argument that Lowe described as the strongest (2008a: chapter 5.2, see also 2010, 2014). The argument is as follows:
(1) I am the subject of all and only my own mental states.
(2) Neither my body as a whole nor any part of it could be the subject of all and only my own mental states.
(3) I am not identical with my body nor with any part of it.
Lowe takes (1) to be a self-evident truth (see 2006b for a defence of this from responses from certain psychopathological conditions). So it is (2) that requires a defence.
The defence comes from the assertion that that ‘no entity can qualify as the subject of certain mental states if those mental states could exist in the absence of that entity’ (2008a: 96). That is, mental states must have a subject, and it is not possible for the very same mental states to belong to a different subject than the one that the do in fact belong to.
However, the same cannot be said of the body. Whilst it may be true that if we were to lose some parts of our body then we might lose some mental states—we might lose certain sensations, though not always as shown through instances of ‘phantom pain’—we would still have in such cases many of the same mental states despite not having that bodily part. This means that many, if not all, of our mental states could exist even if our bodies, as a whole, did not exist. Our bodies might be different in terms of possessing different parts, but in those circumstances, we could still have the same mental states. This shows us, for Lowe, that the body as a whole cannot be the subject of mental states of all of and only our specific mental states, and thus why we cannot be identified with our bodies.
If this line of reasoning is accepted, it is further apparent that the physicalist cannot respond by saying that it is the brain, and not the body, that is identical to the self, as the same argument can be run, except replacing ‘body as a whole’ with ‘brain as a whole’ with the same conclusion.
To be clear, this is not a claim that if the brain were destroyed then our mental states would continue to exist. Lowe’s account is not committed to the view that the mind could continue to exist without the brain. Rather, Lowe’s claim is that a person’s mental states do not depend on any particular part of the brain in the way that they do depend on the person continuing to exist—that there is no part of the brain which is such that were any part of it destroyed (say, one neuron destroyed), then all of the person’s mental states would cease to be. The same cannot be said for the person, especially in light of Lowe’s claim that persons are simple, non-composite objects.
The unity of mental states with the subject that those mental states belong to thus, for Lowe, shows that the body cannot be identified with the person as the subject of experience.
Given the interactionist nature of Lowe’s dualism, a major issue that arises is arguments for the causal closure of the physical, and providing an understanding of the nature of mental causation.
A central part of Lowe’s case that mental causation is a real phenomenon, and not something that can be reduced to physical causation, is the recognition that mental causation is intentional, unlike physical causation. Physical causation does not have this feature, and Lowe argues that we need both sorts of causation in order to fully account for human behaviour. He writes:
Intentional causation is fact causation, while bodily causation is event causation. That is to say, a choice or decision to move one’s body in a certain way is causally responsible for the fact that a bodily movement of a certain kind occurs, whereas a neural event, or set of neural events, is causally responsible for a particular bodily movement, which is a particular event. The decision, unlike the neural event, doesn’t causally explain why that particular bodily movement occurs, not least because one cannot intend to bring about what one cannot voluntarily control—for, as I pointed out earlier, one cannot voluntarily control the precise bodily movement that occurs when one decides, say, to raise one’s arm. (2008a: 110)
The claim is this: we have voluntary control over certain actions as shown simply by our everyday experience of the world. A person cannot have voluntary control over the neural causes of a particular action, in part shown through the multiple realisability of neural causes. But, to understand why a particular event happened, it is not sufficient to know that an event of that kind occurred. For Lowe, only intentional causation can provide that kind of explanation, and, as we cannot intend to bring about what we cannot voluntarily control, it must be the case that there is a further, non-neural, mental cause of voluntary actions.
The mental decision, D, does not cause the particular bodily event, B, as it is the neural cause, N, that is causing the particular bodily movement. The occurrence of D is compatible with both B and B* occurring, as distinct particular bodily movements caused by N and N* respectively. However, D is required to fully explain why an event of the kind B occurred.
A significant upshot of this account of mental causation is that Lowe argues it means that we can avoid even the strongest form of arguments from the causal closure of the physical (see 2000c, 2003a, 2008a: chapters 2 and 3 for more extended discussions about the causal closure of the physical, including in-depth discussions of its various different forms). The form Lowe cites is as follows:
1) No chain of event-causation can lead backwards from a purely physical effect to antecedent causes some of which are non-physical in character.
2) Some purely physical effects have mental causes.
3) Any cause of a purely physical effect must belong to a chain of event-causation that leads backwards from that effect.
4) All of the mental causes of purely physical effects are themselves physical in character (from 2008a: 100–101, numbers changed from original).
In this form, Lowe rejects (3). It is not only event-causation that is involved in explaining the voluntary bodily movements of humans. We also require intentional-causation, but intentional-causation is fact-causation. Mental states are thus causally efficacious in determining what kind of event occurs, and, for Lowe, this is entirely compatible with the claim that some particular physical bodily movement, B, is caused by a particular neural event, N.
In the above, we have made use of the notion of a voluntary action, without expanding upon it. In this last section, we outline in brief Lowe’s view of willing action, and agent causation.
Lowe is clear that he thinks that strictly speaking there is no such thing as event causation. Rather, there is only agent causation—that is, only causation by agents which is agents acting in some manner. This means that whilst agent causation is in a sense primary, it not the case that the agent just causes the event qua agent, thereby rejecting classical agent causalism and libertarianism as both distinguish between different types of causation, whereas Lowe does not. Instead, the agent causes an event by willing, or having a volition to perform, some action.
An agent, in the above statement, can include inanimate objects. However, when it comes to humans, and voluntary human behaviour, the agent causes some event by willing to cause an event of that type. The act of willing is an event, ‘but not merely an event: it is an action of A’s—indeed, it is a primitive action of A’s, because it is not further analysable in terms of more basic actions of A’s and the consequences of such actions’ (2008a: 7; chapter 9).
Such willings, or volitions to do such-and-such, are for Lowe the most basic kind of action that a free agent can perform, and they are completely uncaused and spontaneous. The idea of uncaused events is of course controversial; however, Lowe argues that it is no more mysterious than the spontaneous decay of a radioactive atom. As before, it is important to see that Lowe is keen here to stress that in order to explain human action, uncaused volitions are a required posit, but also that such volitions are entirely consistent with modern science.
The relationship between the agent and their volitions, though, is a non-causal relation. The relation is ‘internal’: ‘to speak of “performing a volition” amounts to speaking of doing a doing, which is similarly tautologous. This is why it is less misleading simply to say something like “A willed to ϕ”, rather than “A performed a volition to ϕ”’ (2008a: 8).
Lastly, these volitions or acts of the will are performed in light of reasons. Free agents, such as humans, have a special place in the causal world precisely because our agent causation occurs in light of such reasons and rational reflection. Thus, Lowe’s account does not posit some special restricted notion of agent causation. All causation is agent causation, with agents causing events by acting in certain ways. What is special about humans (and potentially other free agents) is that they possess a distinctively rational power of willing certain events to be caused in light of reasons.
This summary of Lowe’s conception of persons and personal agency is admittedly very brief. However, it should be enough to indicate that Lowe’s views are a complex response to the apparent evidence of free choice or action in the world, whilst wishing to propose a theory that is consistent with modern science. Lowe’s views are certainly distinctive, and run counter much of the contemporary literature. For Lowe, the claims that some might find troublesome—non-Cartesian substance dualism, his conception of persons and agent causation amongst others—are warranted in virtue of the fact that Lowe thinks that the other views available and supported in the literature cannot adequately explain what they set out to explain. That is, Lowe’s views on this (and the above discussion of essence and ontology) need to be approached from the view that there is a certain range of phenomenon to be explained, and Lowe thinks that additional posits are required to explain those phenomena.
As stated, this summary of Lowe’s work has focused on issues in metaphysics, and related topics in philosophy of mind, logic and philosophy of language, focusing mainly on Lowe’s positive views on these topics. Lowe’s work has had numerous influences beyond the scope of this piece.
Some specific areas include his work on Locke (1986a, 1995a, 2005a, 2013b); the ontological argument (2007a, 2012b); truth and truth-making (2003c, 2007c, 2009c); reference (1993, 2012e, 2013a); vagueness (2005c, 2011c); intentionality (1978, 1980, 1982a, 1982b); predication (1986b, 2012d, 2013a); counterfactuals (1979, 1984, 1995c); and consciousness (1995d, 1996, 2006b). Lowe also wrote highly accessible general overviews of metaphysics (2002a) and philosophy of mind (2000a).
- 1978. ‘Neither intentional nor unintentional’, Analysis, 38: 117-18.
- 1979. ‘Indicative and counterfactual conditionals’, Analysis, 39: 139-41.
- 1980. ‘An analysis of intentionality’, Philosophical Quarterly, 30: 294-304.
- 1982a. ‘Intentionality and intuition: a reply to Davies’, Analysis, 42: 85.
- 1982b. ‘Intentionality: a reply to Stiffler’, Philosophical Quarterly, 32: 354-7.
- 1984. ‘Wright versus Lewis on the transitivity of counterfactuals’, Analysis, 44: 180-3.
- 1986a. ‘Necessity and the will in Locke’s theory of action’, History of Philosophy Quarterly, 3: 149-63.
- 1986b. ‘Noonan on naming and predicating’, Analysis, 46: 159.
- 1987a. ‘Lewis on perdurance versus endurance’, Analysis, 47: 152-4.
- 1987b. ‘The indexical fallacy in McTaggart’s proof of the unreality of time’, Mind, 96: 62-70.
- 1988. ‘The problems of intrinsic change: rejoinder to Lewis’, Analysis, 48: 72-7.
- 1989. Kinds of Being: A Study of Individuation, Identity and the Logic of Sortal Terms, Oxford and New York: Basil Blackwell.
- 1992. ‘McTaggart’s paradox revisited’, Mind, 101: 323-6.
- 1993. ‘Self, reference and self-reference’, Philosophy, 68: 15-33.
- 1994. ‘Ontological dependency’, Philosophical Papers, 23(1): 31-48.
- 1995a. Locke on Human Understanding, London and New York: Routledge.
- 1995b. ‘Coinciding objects: In defence of the “standard account”’, Analysis, 55: 171-8.
- 1995c. ‘The truth about counterfactuals’, Philosophical Quarterly, 45: 41-59.
- 1995d. ‘There are no easy problems of consciousness’, Journal of Consciousness Studies, 2: 266-71.
- 1996. Subjects of Experience, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- 1998. The Possibility of Metaphysics: Substance, Identity and Time, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- 2000. An Introduction to the Philosophy of Mind, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- 2000b. ‘Locke, Martin and substance’, Philosophical Quarterly, 50: 499-514.
- 2000c. ‘Causal closure principles and emergentism’, Philosophy, 75: 571-85.
- 2001. ‘Identity, composition and the self’, in Soul, Body and Survival, K. Corcoran (ed.), Ithaca: Cornell University Press, pp. 139-58.
- 2002a. A Survey of Metaphysics, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- 2002b. ‘Kinds, essence and natural necessity’, in Individuals, Essence and Identity: Themes of Analytic Metaphysics, A. Bottani, M. Carrara, and P. Giaretta (eds.), Dordrecht: Kluwer, pp. 189-206.
- 2003a. ‘Physical causal closure and the invisibility of mental causation’, in Physicalism and Mental Causation: The Metaphysics of Mind and Action, S. Walter, and H.-D. Heckmann (eds.), Exeter: Imprint Academic, pp. 137-54.
- 2003b. ‘3D/4D equivalence, the twins paradox, and absolute time’, with Storrs McCall, Analysis, 63: 114-23.
- 2003c. ‘Metaphysical realism and the unity of truth’, in Monism, A. Bachli, and K. Petrus (eds.), Frankfurt: Ontos Verlag, 2003, pp. 109-23.
- 2005a. Locke, London and New York: Routledge.
- 2005b. ‘Endurance versus perdurance and the nature of time’, Philosophical Writings, 10: 45-58.
- 2005c. ‘Identity, vagueness and modality’, in Thought, Reference, and Experience: Themes from the Philosophy of Gareth Evans, J. L. Bermudez (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 290-310.
- 2006a. The Four-Category Ontology: A Metaphysical Foundation for Natural Science, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- 2006b. ‘Can the self disintegrate? Personal identity, psychopathology, and disunities of consciousness’, in Dementia: Mind, Meaning and the Person, J. Hughes, S. Louw, and S. Sabat (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- 2006c. ‘The 3D/4D controversy: a storm in a teacup’, with Storrs McCall, Nous, 40: 570-8.
- 2007a. ‘The ontological argument’, in The Routledge Companion to Philosophy of Religion, C. Meister, and P. Copan (eds.), London and New York: Routledge, pp. 331-40.
- 2007b. ‘La métaphysique comme science de l’essence’, in Métaphysique contemporaine: propriétés, mondes possibles, et personnes, E. Garcia, and F. Nef (eds.), Paris: J. Vrin, pp. 85-117. Translated as ‘Metaphysics as the science of essence’.
- 2007c. ‘Truthmaking as essential dependence’, in Metaphysics and Truthmakers, J.-M. Monnoyer (ed.), Frankfurt: Ontos Verlag, pp. 237-59.
- 2008a. Personal Agency: The Metaphysics of Mind and Action, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- 2008b. ‘Two notions of being: Entity and essence’, Royal Institute of Philosophy Supplement, 83 (62): 23-48.
- 2008c. ‘Essentialism, metaphysical realism, and the errors of conceptualism’, Philosophia Scientiæ, 12 (1): 9-33.
- 2009a. More Kinds of Being: A Further Study of Individuation, Identity, and the Logic of Sortal Terms, Malden, MA and Oxford: Wiley-Blackwell.
- 2009b. Truth and Truth-Making, E. J. Lowe, and A. Rami (eds.), Stocksfield: Acumen.
- 2009c. An essentialist approach to truth-making, in Truth and Truth-Making, E. J. Lowe, and A. Rami (eds.), Stocksfield: Acumen, pp. 201-16.
- 2010. ‘Why my body is not me: the unity argument for emergentist self-body dualism’, in Emergence in Science and Philosophy, A. Corradini, and T. O’Connor (eds.), New York and London: Routledge.
- 2011a, ‘The rationality of metaphysics’, in Stance and Rationality, O. Bueno, and D. P. Rowbottom (eds.), Special Issue of Synthese, 178: 99-109.
- 2011b. ‘Locke on real essence and water as a natural kind: a qualified defence’, Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume, 85: 1-19.
- 2011c. ‘Vagueness and metaphysics’, in Vagueness: A Guide, G. Ronzitti (ed.), Dordrecht: Springer, pp. 19-53.
- 2012a. ‘Essence and ontology’, in L. Novak, D. D. Novotny, P. Sousedik, and D. Svoboda (eds), Metaphysics: Aristotelian, Scholastic, Analytic, Frankfurt: Ontos Verlag, pp. 93-111.
- 2012b. ‘A new modal version of the ontological argument’, in M. Szatkowski (ed.), Ontological Proofs Today, Frankfurt: Ontos Verlag, pp. 179-91.
- 2012c. ‘What is the source of our knowledge of modal truths?’, Mind, 121: 919-50.
- 2012d. ‘Categorial predication’, Ratio, 25: 369-86.
- 2012e. ‘Individuation, reference, and sortal terms’, in Perception, Realism, and the Problem of Reference, A. Raftopoulos, and P. Machamer (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 123-41.
- 2013a. Forms of Thought: A Study in Philosophical Logic, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- 2013b. Locke’s Essay Concerning Human Understanding, London and New York: Routledge.
- 2013c. ‘Neo-Aristotelian metaphysics: A brief exposition and defense’, in Aristotle on Method and Metaphysics, E. Feser (ed.), Palgrave Macmillan.
- 2014. ‘Why my body is not me: The Unity Argument for Emergentist Self-Body Dualism’, in Contemporary Dualism: A Defense, A. Lavazza and H. Robinson (eds.), New York: Routledge.
- 2015. ‘Ontological dependence’, with Tuomas Tahko, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
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J. T. M. Miller
Trinity College Dublin