Solomon Maimon (1753—1800)
The enigmatic philosopher, Solomon Maimon, is an important figure in the development of the movement referred to today as German Idealism. Immanuel Kant recognized Maimon as the critic who perhaps best understood his Critique of Pure Reason, and Fichte praises Maimon, wondering if later generations will look down on his own generation for having dismissed Maimon. Although Maimon is important in the development of post-Kantian German philosophy, he was largely ignored during his day and despite some attention by later German philosophers, he has remained largely unknown. This is more than likely due to the fact that his works are quite complex and lacking in systematicity, as well as due to the fact that German was not his first tongue and to the fact that he had a somewhat difficult personality. In the twenty-first century, his writings are receiving significantly more attention.
Table of Contents
- Maimon’s Life and Works
- The Problem of the Quid Juris
- The Thing-in-Itself and the Doctrine of Differentials
- The Thing-in-Itself and The Infinite Understanding
- Skepticism and the Quid Facti
- Transcendental Logic
- The Principle of Determinability
- Ethics and Legal Theory
- Maimon’s Influence
- References and Further Reading
Although there are some disputes about the year of Maimon’s birth, the accepted view is that he was born in 1753 near Sukoviborg (near Mir), Lithuania, in what is today Belarus. Solomon Maimon was not his given name at birth; rather, he was known as Shlomo ben Joshua. At around eleven years of age, he married and by the time he was fourteen, he was already a father. Beginning early in his life, he received training in Talmudic studies and became familiar with the Kabbalah as well as Hasidic texts and he came to revere Maimonides’ Guide to the Perplexed, a text that had great influence on him. In fact, when he changed his name in order to follow western European conventions, he adopted the surname of “Maimon” of out reverence for the great medieval Jewish philosopher. Feeling the need in his mid-twenties to study more science and philosophy, Maimon left his family behind and went West. He stopped briefly in Berlin but was not allowed to enter the city. For almost two years after his explusion from Berlin, Maimon lived as a beggar before settling in Posen and receiving a job as a tutor. He later left for Berlin again and was allowed into the city this time. He became friends with Moses Mendelssohn and other Jewish intellectuals, who, despite Maimon’s bad German and his lack of social graces, tolerated him because they recognized that he possessed a very sharp intellect. Maimon traveled again, staying for a short time in Amsterdam. Finding the Jewish community there to be too bourgeois for him in its tastes and interests, he returned to Germany. Maimon settled in Hamburg where he entered a high school (most likely between 1783-85) and pursued studies to improve his knowledge of math, science, and the German language. Matriculation records from a German high school (a “Gymnasium”) list a Solomon Maimon among its pupils, so it is likely that Maimon began referring to himself with this name and not “Shlomo ben Joshua” during this stay in Germany
It was after this period that Maimon began his philosophical writings. He moved from Hamburg to Breslau (Wroclaw) and took up a position as a tutor with a family. He wrote several textbooks in Hebrew, one on math and one concerned with Newton’s physics. He also translated Moses Mendelssohn’s Morgenstunden into Hebrew. At the end of the decade, Maimon traveled to Berlin yet again. It was at this point that he began his study of Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason. Kant’s friend, Marcus Herz, who was also a friend of Maimon’s, sent Kant Maimon’s draft of a commentary on the first Critique. Kant had no intention of reading through the commentary because he found himself too busy with other work. Yet, he later commented to Herz that a brief look through Maimon’s manuscript showed him that Maimon had understood the first Critique better than all of Kant’s other critics. With Kant’s “accolade” in hand, Maimon attained a legitimacy that opened several doors and publishing avenues for him. Maimon revised the manuscript and published it in 1790 as Versuch über die Transcendentalphilosophie, mit einem Anhang über die symbolische Erkenntnis und Anmerkungen [Essay on Transcendental Philosophy with an Appendix on Symbolic Knowledge, and Notes]. (Hereafter, this text will be cited as the “Versuch”)]. On the whole, the work is a set of criticisms of Kant’s first Critique but it also interspersed with criticisms of or elaborations on Maimon’s own commentary on Kant.. Between 1791 and 1800, Maimon went on to write nine other books and numerous articles published in some of the more prominent German-language journals of the day. Maimon lived in poverty for most of the early part of the 1790’s. For the last five years of his life, he was supported by Adolf von Kalkreuth, a noble with considerable interest in philosophy. Maimon lived on von Kalkreuth’s estate near Glogow, in what is today southwestern Poland. Maimon died on 22 November 1800. Supposedly, the Jewish citizens of Glogow disapproved of Maimon for not being a pious Jew and he was not allowed to be buried within the Jewish cemetery.
Maimon claims that there were several phases to his philosophical development. The first – and perhaps most important stage – was Maimon’s early encounter with Maimonides’ Guide to the Perplexed. It is because of Maimonides that Maimon falls under the spell of rationalistic schools of thought. Not only does Maimon obtain from Maimonides the idea that philosophy – and furthermore, human existence – should be about the attainment of truth, but he also takes from Maimonides the belief that religion and its doctrines must be consistent with philosophy. As will become evident from what is written below, many of the doctrines to which Maimon professes can be traced back to Maimonides. Secondly, in his early visits to Berlin, Maimon comes into contact with other, more recent thinkers also in the rationalistic tradition: the Leibnizian-inspired philosopher Christian Wolff, Leibniz, and Spinoza. At that time in Germany, Spinoza was seen as a very dangerous figure because the accepted view of his philosophy was that it necessarily led to atheism. Maimon disagreed and had a significant respect for Spinoza. Finally, Maimon came upon Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason in early 1787 and was awed by it. It was probably at this time that Maimon came into contact with English empiricism, and Hume in particular. As will be discussed below, a very important strand of Maimon’s thought is occupied with Humean skepticism. However, scholars differ as to whether or not skepticism ends up being Maimon’s settled view.
It is difficult to summarize Maimon’s views given that none of his works is systematic and that his views evolved somewhat over the 10 year period in which he was publishing his writings. In fact, it is this lack of systematicity – as well as Maimon’s German, which at times is extremely unclear – that has contributed to Maimon’s lack of recognition. Often his texts read like conglomerations of stream-of-consciousness thoughts, albeit very perceptive ones. He does, however, give a clue about his philosophy as a whole when he describes his thought as a “coalition system” [Koalitionssystem] in which he attempts to incorporate the main ideas of previous schools of thought or important thinkers. The extent to which these ideas actually can be made to fit into a coherent system is open for debate. Likewise, there is question among the scholars as to which school of thought Maimon ultimately sides. The question is not easily resolved.
Maimon’s work was only rediscovered in the mid-1800’s and it just beginning to receive the attention that it deserves. Until recently, he has achieved more notoriety because of his Autobiography, originally published in 1792-93, the first part of which is currently available in English. The book is noteworthy because, in addition to documenting Maimon’s travels and tribulations, it provides one of the very earliest depictions of life in an Eastern European Jewish community, a “stetl.” Despite the historical and “sociological” significance of this Autobiography, he should be seen first and foremost as a philosopher. Kant recognized Maimon’s talents and saw that Maimon was one of the few who seemed to understand the project of the first Critique. Due to the similarity of themes on which Maimon wrote in his Versuch über die Transcendentalphilosophie and themes that Kant addresses in the Critique of Judgment (1790), it is possible that Maimon’s thought had some influence on doctrines that Kant brings forth in this Critique. Fichte mentions Maimon by name in many places in his early work and there is no doubt that some of his doctrines are responses to Maimon’s view. In fact, Maimon is one of the first philosophers of that era to take the history of philosophy seriously and to attempt to show how his views are, in a certain respect, the culmination of developments within the evolution of philosophical thought. In order to understand the development of German Idealism, one must understand where Maimon fits into the movement. Maimon, however, merits attention for being more than just an important, yet underappreciated figure in the development of German Idealism. In particular, his worries about the gap between the quid juris and the quid facti need to be applied to all of the philosophies in the movement. It is not clear if any of the major figures of German Idealism – Fichte, Schelling, or Hegel – ultimately can or do give adequate responses to the problem of the quid juris. More importantly, these worries can be extended to any type of systematic philosophy or rationalistic system of thought. Maimon calls our attention to the fact that it is not enough if a system, a philosophical or scientific system for example, is internally coherent. Internal coherence only gives an answer to the question of the quid juris. What still needs to be shown is not simply how it is possible for such a system to map onto our empirical world, but that the given system does, in fact, map onto the world. Another way of looking at the issue is that Maimon is concerned with the status of science, in the broadest connotation of “science.” It is not enough for science to provide us with a good story or a coherent story about how the world is. Instead, science must give the correct story about how the world is and one that can completely justify its claims. The problem is – and here we return to the gap between the quid juris and the quid facti – science is still only giving us a good or seemingly accurate story.
Unfortunately, even given the stir that Kant’s first Critique caused when it was first published in 1781 and then again revised in 1787, philosophers and critics more often than not either misinterpreted Kant or simply did not understand his views. In the Versuch über die Transcendentalphilosophie, Maimon was able to put his finger on the heart of the problem of the whole of the Transcendental Analytic division of the first Critique. Maimon focused on the notorious “Transcendental Deduction of the Categories” section, in which Kant attempts to justify how intellect and sensation can be combined into cognition. This is the question of the “quid juris,”as Kant calls it. In short, what is at issue is not an actual demonstration that the intellect and sensation actually do combine to form a cognition – this is an issue of fact or the quid factis, as Kant labels it – but a demonstration of how it is possible for them to come together in a cognition. Maimon, unlike other Kant critics of the day and even many Kant supporters, astutely recognizes how central this issue is to Kant’s whole critical project. He understands that Kant is not trying to show that intellect and sensation actually do come together but rather that Kant wants to provide a justification for how it is possible that sensation and intellect can come together. As a result, Maimon makes this issue of the quid juris – and the related issue of the quid facti – a centerpiece of many of his own writings throughout his career. He actually sees the issue in terms of the broader problem of mind and body interaction. Thus, for Maimon the issue actually becomes how we are to be justified in thinking that mind – something supposedly non-physical and non-spatial – can interact with body, something physical and spatial. Kant tried to occupy a middle ground between the rationalist and empiricist schools and, thus, ends up maintaining that the form of cognition was a priori and came from the understanding, whereas the content of cognition was a posteriori, coming from sensation (or “intuition,” in Kant’s language) and, thus, the physical side. Maimon, like many contemporary Kant critics, holds that the section of the Transcendental Analytic referred to as the “Schemata,” is that section of the first Critique in which Kant tries to give his answer to the quid juris. Simply put, on this reading of the first Critique, it is in the very nature of time, as a schema of concepts, that the link between the a priori concepts of the understanding and the a posteriori given content from intuition is supposedly found.
Maimon disagrees. He maintains that if mind and body, or intellect and intuition, are two radically different sources of knowledge as Kant wants to maintain, then ultimately they can never to come together because they are so radically different by definition. In other words, if intellect and intuition are so different, as Kant wants to hold, then Kant already make it impossible for these two stems of knowledge to be unified. In contrast, Maimon’s claims that the only way in which intellect and intuition can be united is if they are of similar origin. Thus, he holds that the only solution to the quid juris is to assume that intellect and intuition must be alike. He does not follow along empiricist lines where concepts are but abstractions from sensations. Rather, he turns to the Leibniz-Wolff school for his solution to the problem. Maimon claims that, ultimately, sensation – or intuition, as Kant terms it – has its root in the understanding. For Leibniz and Wolff, sensation or intuition simply amounts to a confused form of conceptual knowledge; Maimon concurs.
In Kant’s system, the form of our knowledge is a priori and arises out of the nature of the understanding and the forms of intuition that we – as humans – possess are also a priori.. The content of our knowledge, at least of our empirical knowledge, comes from outside of us. Or, to be more precise, this material of our knowledge is the result of our intuitive faculty being affected by something outside of it. This “something” is none other than Kant’s notion of the thing-in-itself, an infamous tenet of Kant’s system. The problem is that Kant must rely on this idea of a thing-in-itself in order to account for what gives rise to our empirical knowledge. Unfortunately, we cannot know – in Kant’s formal definition of what it is “to know” – the thing-in-itself because knowledge for Kant always entails a combination of concepts and matter or content. In Kant’s system, we are forbidden from employing or extending categories beyond that of which we have intuition; this, in Kant’s system, would involve an illegitimate use of the categories. Hence, the thing-in-itself becomes problematic because, in Kant’s system, one is left in the situation that one can only speculate about, but not know, things-in-themselves. Furthermore, Kant must posit things-in-themselves because their existence ultimately plays the role of a criterion of truth in his system. The world of our sense experience, as opposed to, say, a world of our dreams, is real for Kant because the content of our sense experience ultimately refers back to something real: The thing-in-itself. This is what allows Kant to claim that “experience” has some foundation and is not just an illusion or chimera.
There are, however, two problems. First, knowledge – in Kant’s sense of the term – requires things-in-themselves but the very positing of things-in-themselves appears to be a contradiction because this seems to involve the extension of concepts to realms into which they are allowed to be extended. That is, in order to cognize things-in-themselves we must use concepts and discursive or conceptually-based knowledge. But things-in-themselves, by their very nature, are supposed to stand outside of conceptual knowledge. Second, and more seriously, the doctrine of things-in-themselves does not help to resolve the matter of the quid juris. That issue, as it will be remembered, concerns our justification for assuming that elements of cognition that arise out of the intellect can possibly be combined together with elements of cognition that arise empirically from the senses, or intuition, to use Kantian terminology. But if things-in-themselves stand beyond our ability to cognize them, then we cannot know if concepts and intuitions have come together in a way that truly reflects how things are.
Maimon criticizes Kant because he holds that Kant still has not adequately shown that we are justified in believing in the applicability of a priori concepts that have their seat in the understanding to elements that arise a posteriori from the senses. Kant, according to Maimon, simply assumes that we are affected “from without” by things-in-themselves, and, in so doing, assumes the connection between a priori form and a posteriori content
Maimon’s solution is 1) to have a criterion of truth that comes from within cognition itself, and 2) to show how it is possible no longer to have the potentially unbridgeable gap between understanding and sensation. As concerns the first point, Maimon simply believes that he is being true to the spirit of critical philosophy insofar as he draws the criterion of truth from within consciousness. As concerns the second point, Maimon looks back to the rationalist school, and to Leibnizian philosophy in particular. If sensation ultimately has its root in the understanding, as it does for Leibniz, then there no longer is an issue of how two seemingly different elements of cognition can be combined together.
As his model, Maimon looks to mathematics insofar as the content of mathematics is not given to it empirically, or so holds Maimon. In differential calculus in particular, he finds a way in which content can be generated out of form. In short, Maimon thinks that all differences in quantity can be reduced to some sort of quantitative relation. Hence, in Maimon’s philosophy, differentials play the same role that things-in-themselves play for Kant. Differentials are not some type of a basic ontological entity such as atoms or monads. Instead, differentials are the rules concerning the lawful relationship of objects. Differentials give us the rule for producing an object. Take, for example, a triangle whose sides have the lengths 3 cm, 4 cm, and 5 cm, respectively. The relationship between the sides and the angles in that triangle will be the same as the relationship in a triangle whose sides have the lengths 3 rods, 4 rods, and 5 rods, respectively. The relationship between the sides and angles of these two triangles will be the same, too, as that in a triangle whose sides measure 9 inches, 12 inches, and 15 inches, respectively. The differential would be the rule for producing a triangle with the relations of sides and angles exhibited by any of the aforementioned triangles. Maimon holds that all the content of our knowledge would have to be able to be derived from a differential as are the lengths of the sides of the triangle mentioned above. Accordingly, all qualia, all the content of what we know, would be able to be understood in terms of differentials. Hence, for example, the redness of an apple would not be “given” from without; rather, it would be a rule for producing what which we experience empirically as the red color of the apple.
In order to resolve the problem created by Kant’s doctrine of the thing-in-itself and in order to show just how the doctrine of differentials in Maimon’s philosophy can stand as a solution to the problem of the quid juris, it is necessary to understand Maimon’s notion of the infinite understanding.
As was hinted as earlier, Maimon does not have a criterion of truth that stands outside of consciousness. According to the commentator Hugo Bergmann, Maimon uses a doctrine that he finds in the Lebnizian philosopher Christian Wolff’s 1730 text entitled Ontologia. According to Bergmann, in that work, Wolff defines being as the completion of all possibility, that is, an object is fully actual when it is determined in all of its parts. Maimon uses this idea as the basis for his view of what the thing-in-itself must be. The object itself is no longer something outside of or beyond our cognition. The object is simply the sum of all predicates that can be attributed to it. In order to clarify this notion, Maimon employs a distinction between “presentation” (Darstellung) and “representation” (Vorstellung) that most likely comes from Mendelssohn. When the object is cognized as fully determined, it is known as it truly is, and is, thus, a “presentation.” When the object, however, is only partially cognized, it is not known in all of its determinations, and is, thus, a “representation.”
It is at this juncture that Maimon mentions the infinite mind. The object itself, as it actually is, that is, as presented, is the object insofar as it would be cognized by an infinite mind. The infinite mind does or would cognize objects in terms of differentials, that is, in terms of presentations. The infinite mind would not see objects as we humans see them, as given in space and time as well as insofar as they seem to be given from something outside of us. The infinite mind sees everything in terms of rational form, as quantified relations.
Several commentators mention the likely influence of Maimonides, as well as Spinoza, on Maimon’s doctrine of the infinite mind. In Book One, Chapter 68 of Maimonides Guide to the Perplexed, Maimonides – who, in turn looks back to Aristotle – calls God the intellectus, the ens intelligens, and the ens intelligible at one and the same time. God is the intellect, the thinking, and the thing that is being thought. In short, for Maimon, the thing-in-itself no longer is something that it outside of consciousness or in some other realm as that to which cognition must conform. Instead, the thing-in-itself would be the object as it would be cognized by an infinite mind, one that no longer needs to cognition as having two parts; matter, which is given to the understanding, and content, which is generated in and by the understanding. Maimon, in holding this view, sticks to the spirit of Kantian philosophy, as opposed to the letter insofar as he provides for a criterion of truth from within consciousness itself, one that need not refer to something beyond it, namely Kant’s infamous thing-in-itself.
There is some debate within Maimon scholarship as to whether the concept of the infinite mind is a “constitutive idea” or a “regulative idea” (in Kant’s sense of the terms). Cases can be made, especially when considering Maimon’s first book, the Versuch über die Transcendentalphilosophie on both sides of the issue. Some passages seem to point toward the infinite mind as something actual, whereas others point to it as a regulative idea, that is, a goal toward which we continually progress but that we can never fully attain. However, it seems that as Maimon’s view develops during the 1790’s that his view gravitates more toward the notion of the infinite mind as a regulative idea. That is, it is an ideal toward which we continually progress but which we can never fully attain.
For Kant, there are elements of cognition that are not reducible to one another: concepts and intuitions. Because Maimon ultimately tries to reduce matter or content to something rational – namely differentials – the question arises as to what status intuition has in his philosophy. His position has many similarities to Leibniz’ view of senation. For Maimon, space and time, ultimately are concepts that deal pertaining to diversity.
Yet, in order to make sense of Maimon’s view of intuition, one must first understand his view on the role of the imagination (Einbildungskraft). Human beings, in Maimon’s view, possess finite faculties of cognition, unlike an infinite mind that would have an infinite faculty of cognition. The infinite mind would not see objects in terms of a matter or content that was given to it and which has been taken up, synthesized and, hence, given a form according to concepts generated by the understanding. Instead, the infinite understanding would cognize all objects in terms of concepts and differentials, that is, in a wholly rational or quantitative manner. Unfortunately, we humans do not cognize, say, the color red or the flavor of an apple or the sound of middle C played on the piano in terms of differentials. Aspects of these, their conceptual qualities, may be described according to categories or there may be rational aspects of the experience of them. Yet, according to Maimon, we still cognize the world in terms of form – which is rational and generated by us – and content – irrational and given to us from somewhere else or by something else.
Because we do not see the world as an infinite understanding would see the world, that is, as wholly rationally and quantitatively, we must have recourse to something else to aid the understanding. This role, for Maimon, belongs to the imagination . The imagination literally fills in where the understanding stops. Thus, for example, when we do not perceive the difference between two objects wholly in conceptual terms, the imagination fills in by generating intuitions. So, when we do not see two objects as conceptually different, their difference is manifested by the imagination in terms of temporal and spatial differences. Maimon has Leibniz’ notion of the identity of indiscernibles in mind here. (If two objects are identical, then the must be indiscernible). For Leibniz, if two objects are different, then there must be a conceptual basis for their difference. This conceptual difference plays out as a difference in intuition when the mind that cognizes this difference cannot understand it conceptually.
For Kant, space and time are a priori forms of intuition. Furthermore, Kant views them as pure forms of intuition. It is possible, on Kant’s view, to think of space and time devoid of all objects or prior to any objects that fill them out. Conversely, Maimon’s conception is much closer to that of Leibniz, where space and time as intuitions represent the relations between two or more objects. A space and time devoid of objects is impossible on his view. Furthermore, space and time as concepts, upon which the intuitions rest, are simply notions of diversity. For Maimon, the infinite mind does not or would not cognize objects either spatially or temporally; the infinite mind’s cognition would stand outside of all space and time.
Although Maimon formulates a possible solution to the quid juris, there remains, on his view, an important issue that must be addressed. Here, again, we return to the issue of the quid juris and its related problem of the quid facti. In the infamous “Transcendental Deduction” section of Kant’s first Critique, Kant attempts to show how it is possible for a priori concepts – ones that have their origin in the understanding – to be able to be united with intuition whose content arises empirically. On Maimon’s interpretation of Kant, Kant’s “solution” to the problem of the quid juris, which has recourse to the origin and nature of time, fails. According to this interpretation, one which is not unique to Maimon, because time is a priori and pure, as a form of intuition, and because time underlies all intuitions, be they spatial or temporal, time serves as the bridge between a priori concepts and intuitions, pure or a posteriori. It must be remembered that from the outset of the Critique of Pure Reason, Kant claims that he is attempting to prove how synthetic a priori statements are possible, not that synthetic a priori statements exist (he simply assumes this latter point). In other words, he is trying to show how it can be possible that experience of the world, and in particular scientific accounts of that experience, can have an a priori, and, thus, objective ground. Thus, simply put, by looking to mathematics he assumes that scientific experience, that is synthetic a priori statements, in fact, do exist. His task, in the first Critique, is to give an account of how it is possible for this experience to be objective or, which is the same, to show how there can be synthetic a priori statements.
Unfortunately, Maimon holds that the quid facti – that there exist synthetic a priori statements — remains unanswered and that this, in fact, is really a more serious problem. In other words, Maimon claims that it is not enough merely to show how it is possible that concepts of the understanding can come to be connected with so-called intuitions, that is, something seemingly given from without. Maimon holds that it still remains to be shown that concepts of the understanding actually are connected with intuitions. In short, Maimon questions Kant’s basic assumption that scientific experience exists, that is, that there actually are synthetic a priori statements. Hume, could be correct, in Maimon’s view. That is, we seem to see regularity in the world and the world seems to operate according to laws (of physics, biology, chemistry, etc.). However, this does not guarantee that the regularity that we think we see in the world or the conformity of events to laws actually has its basis in the laws themselves (or in the understanding). Hume could be correct that cause and effect are simply the mind’s habit of associating together objects or classes of objects and this would not make our experience of the world any different. In the end, the problem of the quid facti still remains. While it may be the case that there is regularity in our experience of the world, the does not guarantee as a fact that the understanding lies as the basis of this regularity, that is, that this regularity and law-like behavior is objectively valid.
Hence, the highest principles of philosophy and science are still, in Maimon’s strict view, hypotheses. Mathematics is the only discipline in which both the form and matter of the knowledge involved in the discipline can be shown to be created according to objectively valid laws by the understanding. Science and philosophy can and do give us systems that are internally coherent, but this does not guarantee that such systems actually map onto the world. The systems that science and philosophy have given us, perhaps, give good stories as to how the seemingly regularity of the world has arisen. However, this does not guarantee that the universe is regular and it also does not guarantee that any law (especially laws generated by the understanding) necessitate the world coming to pass as it does. Again, Hume could be correct and the order that we think that we see in the world could be the consequence of a habit of the mind.
As a result, scholars are divided on how to understand Maimon’s philosophy on the whole. Some critics claim that as his thought and writing unfolded in the 1790’s, the problem of the quid juris faded and the problem of the quid facti came more and more into the spotlight. Such critics tend to understand Maimon’s philosophy ultimately as a skepticism (Kuntze, Erdmann). One critic (Atlas) thinks that Maimon simply leaves us between the two horns of a dilemma, extreme rationalism and skepticism. Finally, some critics (Cassirer, Beiser) think that Maimon may have found a solution to the two horns of the dilemma or a so-called “middle path.” On this interpretation, Maimon admits that the quid facti is as of yet resolved. However, at least on Beiser’s interpretation, Maimon’s rationalistic model (with the theory of the infinite mind and differentials) as an ideal to which, step by step, we get closer. We can never reach this goal, as only an infinite intellect could do so. However, it is a goal toward which we should and do progress.
As does Kant, Maimon holds that transcendental logic is in fact more basic than formal logic. The problem, on Maimon’s view, is that people traditionally hold logic to be a discipline that is independent from metaphysics. Maimon shows, however, that formal logic must, in fact, assume certain facts about reality, and, in particular, about objects. Hence, transcendental logic is prior to formal logic.
The standard view of formal logic is that it only deals with the form of judgments and abstracts from any content whatsoever. For example, the standard view is taken as holding that when one makes the claim that “If X implies Y and if Y implies Z, then X implies Z,” such a statement is true regardless of what is substituted in for “X,” “Y,” and “Z,” respectively. Furthermore, the standard view would be that the truth of this argument is solely a function of the form of the argument. According to Maimon, however, the problem with formal logic is by abstracting wholly from objects, it can only deal with one sort of diversity: negation. That is, in strict terms, if X is different from Y, then formal logic can only understand Y in terms of not-X. If “red” is symbolized by “X,” then formally, without any other assumptions, “blue” can only be symbolized as “not-X.” Similarly, “yellow” can only be symbolized as “not-X,” too. Be we know that yellow is not the same as blue.
Here is where, according to Maimon, transcendental logic underlies formal logic. Transcendental logic is a logic of content, whereas formal logic supposedly deals only with form. On Maimon’s view, in order for formal logic to be able to represent a diversity of objects – that is, in order that “blue” and “yellow” be not both symbolized by “not-X” and in order for them to be symbolized as, say, “Y,” and “Z,” respectively – then an actual diversity of objects must be assumed. This requires that the content of “X,” “Y,” and “Z” must be different, otherwise, the diversity of anything other than X could only be represented by “not-X.” Hence, Maimon claims that transcendental logic underlies formal logic and that formal logic must acknowledge that content does play a role for it.
Maimon shows himself to be a Kantian in spirit, as opposed to in letter, in the manner in which addresses the issue of logic and its relation to a system of philosophy and science. Maimon accepts Kant’s suggestion in the first Critique that a true science is one that could be derived from, and, hence, focused around one primary principle. In this respect, Maimon follows along the same lines as Reinhold and Reinhold’s “principle of consciousness,” for it is Reinhold in particular who claims that the Kantian philosophy needs to be systematized so that Kant’s claims can all ultimately be deduced from one main principle.
This principle, which Maimon labels the “principle of determinability” (Satz des Bestimmbarkeit), is related to his notion of transcendental logic, discussed above. What this principle, in theory, is supposed to achieve, is to provide a way for determining when thought is “really” true versus when it is only “formally” true. As an example, consider the statement: “all unicorns are one-horned.” Most would accept this statement as true on the basis that if one understands the concept “unicorn” and the concept “one-horned,” then one immediately sees that the statement must be true. The obvious problem is there are no unicorns. Hence, such a claim is only formally true and does not necessarily describe any feature of our world. If unicorns do indeed exist, then they must be one-horned. Yet, there are strong reasons for denying the existence of unicorns.
For Maimon, the principle of determinability holds that there is a determinable (Bestimmbare) that becomes determined by a determination (Bestimmung). The relationship between these two is one-sided. The determinable can be thought without the determination, whereas the determination can only apply to that particular determinable. Another way to view this is as the relationship between a subject and a true predicate. On Maimon’s account, the relation of determinability exists when this one-sided relationship holds. If the two can be thought apart from one-another, then the relationship of determinability does not exist and the judgment is not real; it is arbitrary. Thus, one cannot say with accuracy that “the table is sick.” Tables do not become sick and this is shown by the fact that “table” can be thought apart from “sick” just as much as “sick” can be thought apart from table. Accordingly, we do not speak – or think – correctly when we say that “the sick person is pale.” Both “sick person” and “pale” can be thought apart from each other and, hence, no relationship of determinability exists. To speak and to think properly, one needs to say that “the sick person’s color is pale.” Here, a relation of determinability exists because while one can think of “sick person” and never call to mind the concept of “paleness,” it is impossible to think of “paleness” without bringing in the concept of color. That is, “pale” is not a true determination of “sick person,” but rather “pale” is a determination of “color.” Likewise, “color” is a determination of “plane,” etc..
It must be remembered that Maimon holds that a subject or a determinable may only have one predicate or determination at any given time. As a result, true knowledge of an object would amount to a given chain of determinations going from the most particular determination up to the most general. In this respect, Maimon shows the influence of Leibniz on his philosophy because Maimon’s position amounts to the idea that the principle of sufficient reason now also becomes a standard or criterion for cognition. Every predicate or determination must be correctly lined to its proper subject or determinable and in doing so, one, literally, provides a sufficient reason as to why that particular determination and not some other must chosen. Thus, in a true science, we could move from the absolute particular or predicate all the way up to the most general statement or proposition. In such a fashion, the principle of determinability serves as a criterion for knowledge and in this respect Maimon again reflects the influence of rationalism on his thought.
The questions of the quid juris and the quid facti arise in Maimon’s writings on moral theory, too, and these are addressed in a series of journal articles and book chapters that appear between 1794 and 1800. In his article, “Versuch einer neuen Darstellung des Moralprinzips und Dedukzion seiner Realität” [“Attempt at a New Presentation of the Moral Principle and a Deduction of its Reality”] Maimon claims not to be offering a new moral principle from that of Kant, but rather a more cogent deduction of the moral principle. His main criticism of Kant’s deduction of the moral law in the Critique of Practical Reason concerns Kant’s use of the so-called “fact of reason” as a new starting point from which to begin moral philosophy. Although there are many different interpretations of what exactly this “fact of reason” is or entails, Maimon understands it to be the claim that all people feel themselves to be under moral constraint, which are the constraints of duty. Maimon agrees that people feel themselves to be under such moral constraint, but he denies that this moral constraint is necessarily the same thing as duty. In other words, he holds that although people may feel a compulsion [Zwang] to behave in a certain way, compulsion and duty [Pflicht] are, in fact, very different concepts.
So, Maimon sets out to provide a new foundation for duty. His strategy is to find something more basic than duty, yet out of which duty can be derived. He claims to have found this more basic “fact” in what he sees to be the drive in all humans for the cognition of truth. This “fact” is proven or guaranteed by the actual human condition (on Maimon’s view) that all humans strive after truth and Maimon assumes that this is undeniable. Furthermore, on his view, the essence of truth is universality or universal validity [Allgemeingültikeit]. On this conception, what makes something true is that fact that all rational beings, and especially an infinite being, could agree to the validity of the claim whose veracity is in question. In turn, the drive toward truth is based on an even more fundamental drive that all humans have: the so-called “drive toward making all representations universally valid” [Trieb zur Allgemeingültigmachung der Vorstellungen.].
Maimon, though, still needs to make an explicit connection between ethics and cognition. He achieves this insofar as he views reason as strictly instrumental in nature. In fact, reason and will are not separate faculties for Maimon. Reason can only tell us if action X is the best way to arrive at point B from point A, that is, if all people could, in theory, choose action X as the only means or the best means for arriving at Point B, as well as if arriving at point B as a goal is something that does not interfere with the goals of others. The good action, for Maimon, ends up being the universally valid action, the one to which all people, in theory, could assent.
Because willing now has a relation to truth, Maimon offers a slightly different formulation of that moral law than does Kant. His reformulated moral principle is: “Act so that your will can be thought of as the will of every rational being.” As it turns out, there are several differences of Maimon’s view from that of Kant. First, Kant’s Categorical Imperative focuses on the principle underlying willing – the maxim – whereas Maimon’s moral principle focuses on the act of willing itself. Second, Maimon literally means that an action would be wrong if every last rational being were not, at least in theory and when being rational, able to agree to it. For example, even if society as a whole wanted a convicted murderer to be put to death, it would be immoral to put the murdered to death, if this convicted murderer did not assent to such a punishment. Finally, Maimon holds that one cannot have duties toward oneself. That is, if one were the last remaining person on earth, then issues such as gluttony or suicide would no longer fall within the realm of morality because they would affect no other person but oneself.. For Maimon, morality becomes an issue only because of one’s relationship to other willing beings.
Parallel to the situation with his epistemology that was mentioned earlier, Maimon has, with this reformulation of the moral principle, given an answer to the question of the quid juris. That is, he has shown how it is possible to ground the moral law. In other words, he thinks that he has proven how the moral law possibly can affect us. However, the issue of the quid facti still remains because Maimon needs to show how, in fact, the moral law actually determines a person to behave in a certain manner. In this regard, Maimon goes in a different direction than Kant.
In his moral philosophy, Kant does not want to allow material principles to determine the will because he worries that any reliance on material principles amounts to a return to subjectivism. Material principles are simply principles arising from the content, as opposed to the form, of a person’s basis or reason for acting. To give an example, if one behaved in a certain manner because one desired happiness as one’s goal or because one wanted physical pleasure, then, on Kant’s view, material principles – happiness or pleasure – would be the determining ground of the will. Kant worries that all content turns out to be subjective and, thus, if any content becomes the “motive” for why a person acts, then that person acts on subjective grounds. In particular, Kant is worried about feelings (love, hate, envy) or abstract concepts (happiness, power) or states of mind (bliss, joy) as determininations of the will because all of these are “material,” and, hence, subjective. In other words, Kant holds that his version of the moral principle is universally valid specifically because its universality is derived from the form of the principle and not from the content of the situation in which one finds oneself. The only purely moral determining ground for the will, on Kant’s view, must be respect for the moral law. Anything else, such as love, compassion, etc, however, selfless it may seem to be, always ends up being subjective. Furthermore, Kant holds that we can only know after the fact that the moral law has determined one’s will and this is because it causes us pain or hurt, insofar as we did not behave in the manner in which we had originally desired to behave. Actually, he links “respect” for the moral law to the displeasure one feels in behaving against the way in which one wanted to behave.
Maimon finds Kant’s position unconvincing because he believes that the form of an action cannot ultimately serve as the motive for action. In short, on his view, the understanding or reason can never choose the ultimate goal for which we act. For Maimon, happiness or pleasure is, in the end, the reason for which we act. Fortunately, Maimon believes that there is one type of pleasure that is not subjective and which can serve as the basis for moral motivation. Loosely following Spinoza, Maimon believes that every increase in a being’s power is accompanied by a feeling of pleasure [Vergnügen]. True cognition, on his view, involves the ultimate increase in our power. Thus, every time a person performs a moral action, an action that is universally valid, the action is accompanied by a great pleasure. Hence, Maimon believes that the pleasure involved in moral action can serve as motivation to be moral and one that is not subjective at all.
As Maimon’s philosophy matures over his short writing career, he seems to move away from the view given above (somewhat paralleling what some commentators see happening in his epistemological views, too). By the time of the essay, the “Moral Skeptic” [Der moralische Skeptiker] of 1800, Maimon gives naturalistic account of ethics, seeing it basically in terms of legality, that is, as a way to protect peace and harmony between people in society. It seems as if in the domain of ethics that the issue of the quid facti still bothered Maimon and that he had to revise his account of why it is and how it is that people behave morally.
Related to, although different from his ethical theory, Maimon’s 1795 essay entitled, “Über die ersten Gründe des Naturrechts” [“On the First Grounds of Natural Law”] contains the clearest statement of Maimon’s legal theory. (Fichte goes out of his way to mention this essay in the introduction to his Foundations of Natural Right, published one year later). Maimon’s view is that legality and law aids in with the application and practice of morality. Often times, according to Maimon, there are situations in which no decision can be reached based solely on morality. It is in these cases that legality must be brought in to resolve the problem. For example, two people happen to come upon money on the sidewalk. A goodwill attempt to find the one who lost the money fails. Which of the two people can claim the money? In this case, morality cannot decide. Both people are morally justified in taking possession of the money as there is nothing immoral about one or the other pocketing the money. However, it is not possible for both to have the money. Law is supposed to aid such cases by setting down rules on how to resolves such situations.
Although Maimon’s career as a professional philosopher was short, his influence on what is now called “German Idealism” was significant. His acumen was recognized by important figures of the day such as Moses Mendelssohn, Kant, Kant’s student Marcus Herz, Reinhold, and Fichte. Fichte, in particular, recognized the importance of Maimon’s philosophy and he had written that his “respect for Maimon knows no bounds” and that later generations would look down on his own times for not giving Maimon his due. Maimon’s notion of logic and of intuition affected Fichte’s philosophy. Fichte’s attempt to secure the critical philosophy from skepticism was as much, if not more, of an answer to Maimon as it was to Aenesidemus-Schulze, a famous skeptic of the day. Fichte’s conception of the faculty of imagination is a development on Maimon’s view of this faculty. Maimon, as was shown above, revives rationalist doctrines found in Spinoza and Leibniz – the notion of an infinite mind, the idea of a complete concept, views about space and time, etc. – and many of these found their way back into Fichte’s own philosophy. In turn, subsequent idealist thinkers attempt to refine and ameliorate Fichte’s position. In many respects, the more important link in the development of German Idealism between Kant and Fichte was Maimon and not Reinhold or J. S. Beck, as the traditional view holds.
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