The term “neocolonialism” generally represents the actions and effects of certain remnant features and agents of the colonial era in a given society. Post-colonial studies have shown extensively that despite achieving independence, the influences of colonialism and its agents are still very much present in the lives of most former colonies. Practically, every aspect of the ex-colonized society still harbors colonial influences. These influences, their agents and effects constitute the subject matter of neocolonialism.
Jean Paul Sartre’s Colonialism and Neocolonialism (1964) contains the first recorded use of the term neocolonialism. The term has become an essential theme in African Philosophy, most especially in African political philosophy. In the book, Sartre argued for the immediate disengagement of France’s grip upon its ex-colonies and for total emancipation from the continued influence of French policies on those colonies, particularly Algeria. However, it was at one of the All African People’s Conferences (AAPC), a movement of political groups from countries in Africa under colonial rule, which held conferences in the late 1950s and early 1960s in Accra, Ghana, where the term was first officially used in Africa. At the AAPC’s “1961 Resolution on Neocolonialism,” the term neocolonialism was given its first official definition. It was described as the deliberate and continued survival of the colonial system in independent African states, by turning these states into victims of political, mental, economic, social, military and technical forms of domination carried out through indirect and subtle means that did not include direct violence. With the publication of Kwame Nkrumah’s Neo-colonialism: The Last Stage of Imperialism in 1965, the term neocolonialism finally came to the fore. Neocolonialism has since become a theme in African philosophy around which a body of literature has evolved and has been written and studied by scholars in sub-Saharan Africa and beyond. As a theme of African philosophy, reflection on the term neocolonialism requires a critical reflection upon the present socio-economic and political state of Africa after independence from colonial rule and upon the continued existence of the influences of the ex-colonizers’ socio-economic and political ideologies in Africa.
Table of Contents
- History of Neocolonialism
- Neocolonialism: Related Concepts
- Neocolonialism: The Last Stage of Imperialism
- The Myth of Neocolonialism
- Neocolonialism Today in Africa: The Era of Globalization
- References and Further Reading
Neocolonialism can be described as the subtle propagation of socio-economic and political activity by former colonial rulers aimed at reinforcing capitalism, neo-liberal globalization, and cultural subjugation of their former colonies. In a neocolonial state, the former colonial masters ensure that the newly independent colonies remain dependent on them for economic and political direction. The dependency and exploitation of the socio-economic and political lives of the now independent colonies are carried out for the economic, political, ideological, cultural, and military benefits of the colonial masters’ home states. This is usually carried out through indirect control of the economic and political practices of the newly independent states instead of through direct military control as was the case in the colonial era.
Conceptually, the idea of neocolonialism can be said to have developed from the writings of Karl Marx (1818-1883) in his influential critique of capitalism as a stage in the socio-economic development of human society. The continued relevance of Marxist socio-economic philosophy in contemporary times cannot be denied. The model of society as structured by an economic basis, legal and political superstructures, and a definite form of social consciousness that Marx presented both in The Capital (1972) as well as in the Preface to the Critique of Political Economy (1977) remains important to socio-economic theory. Marx presents theories which explain a certain kind of evil in capitalism. Today, capitalism has produced the multinational corporations that can assemble far more effective intelligence behind their often nefarious designs than any nation’s government can assemble to try to hold multinationals at bay. As things go now with the capitalist system, there is an indication that there are some foresights in some of Marx’s prognostication. The world seems to continue to acquiesce to the vast control of economic and political resources by the wealthiest 1%. No doubt, Marx’s prognostications have been vindicated in many ways than they have been refuted.
Consequent analysis by Sartre, in his critique of French economic policies on Algeria, was an attempt to combine his existentialist idea of human freedom with Marx’s economic philosophy in order to better establish his opposition to France’s economic colonization of Algeria. Proper coinage of the term neocolonialism in Africa, however, is attributed to Nkrumah who used it in his 1963 preamble of the Organization of African States (OAU) Charter and later, as the title of his 1965 book, Neocolonialism: The Last Stage of Imperialism.
In a simple context, neocolonialism is a class name for all policies, infrastructures and agents actively contributing to society, which indirectly serve to grant continuity to the practices known to the colonial era. The essence of neocolonialism is that while the state appears to be independent and have total control over its dealings, it is in fact controlled by outsider economic and political influences (Nkrumah1965, 7). The loss of control of the machineries of the states to the neocolonialists underlies the basis of Nkrumah’s discourse.
In his article “Philosophy and Post-Colonial Africa”, Tsenay Serequeberhan explicates the nature of neocolonialism in Africa in a manner that reveals how Europe propagates its policy of socio-economic and political dominance in post-colonial Africa. For Serequeberhan, neocolonialism in Africa is that which internally replicates in a disguised manner what was carried out during the colonial period. This disguised form constitutes the nature of the European neocolonial subjugation as it concerns the politics of economic, cultural, and scientific subordination of African states (Serequeberhan 1998, 13). With this, we can describe the general nature of neocolonialism as a divergence in national power—political, economic, or military—which is used rather lopsidedly by the dominant power to subtly compel the dominated sectors of the dominated society to do its bidding. The method and praxis of neocolonialism lies in its guise to enjoin leaders of the independent colonies to accept developmental aids and support through which the imperial powers continue to penetrate and control their ex-colonies. Through the guise of developmental aids and support, technological and scientific assistance, the ex-colonial masters impose their hegemonic political and cultural control in the form of neocolonialism (Serequeberhan 1998, 13). In such a situation, the leaders of the seemingly independent African states become minions to the whims and caprices of the ex-colonial lords or their multinational corporations in terms of the management of the affairs of the new states. Prima facie, it would seem that the neocolonial state is free of the influence of imperialists, and it appears to be governed completely by its own indigenes. In truth, though, the state remains under its former colonial masters and their accomplices. Being under the continued impression that the former colonialists are superior and more civilized, the leaders of the supposedly new independent states continue to practice and encourage the people to imbibe the ways and cultural practices, and more essentially the economic control, of the imperialists.
Within a neocolonial situation, therefore, the imperialists usually maintain their influence in as many sectors of the former colony as possible, making it less of an independent state and more of a neo-colony. To this end, in politics, economics, religion, and even education, the state looks up to its imperialists, rather than improving upon its own indigenous culture and practices. Through neocolonialism, the more technologically advanced nations ensure their involvement with low income nations, such that this relationship practically annihilates the potential for the development of the smaller states and contributes to the capital gain of the technologically advanced nations (Parenti 2011, 24).
In On the Postcolony, Achille Mbembe further examines the nature of neocolonialism in Africa and says that the underpinning theory on which neocolonialism rests consists of bald assertions with no tenable arguments to support it. Evidently, in his view, after colonialism has ended in Africa, the West did not consider that Africans were capable of organizing themselves socially, economically and politically. To Mbembe, the reason for holding such ideas and advancing them is simply because the African is believed to be intellectually poor and is reducible to the level of irrationality. In his words, the capacity for Africans to rationally organize themselves is “understood through a negative interpretation” (Mbembe 2001, 1). This interpretation reveals the African as never possessing things and attributes that are properly part of human nature, or rather (even if reluctantly granted the status of the human) those things and attributes are generally of lesser value, little importance, and of poor quality (Mbembe 2001, 1). In other words, since Africans and other people that are different in race, language, and culture from the West do not possess the power, the rigour, the quality, and the intellectual analytical abilities that characterize Western philosophical and political traditions (Mbembe 2001 2), it is then difficult to assume that they would have the rational capacity to organize themselves socially, economically and politically. In a rejoinder to this bald assertion and negative interpretation, Mbembe retorts that the West has always had insurmountable difﬁculties with accepting an African theory on the “experience of the Other”, or on the issue of the “I” of others to which the West seems to perceive as foreign to it. In other words, the typical Western tradition has always denied the existence of any “self” but its own. It has always denied the idea of a common human nature, such that, “a humanity shared with others, long posed, and still poses, a problem for Western consciousness” (Mbembe 2001, 2).
Fundamentally, this denial is not peculiar to the period of neocolonialism alone. It has a history that dates back to the period of the trans-Atlantic slave trade and colonialism. In his book, The Invention of Africa, V. Y. Mudimbe asserts that there are three methods that are representative of the colonial structure in Africa: the domination of physical space, the reformation of natives’ minds, and the integration of local economic histories into the Western perspective. This structure constitutes the three complementary aspects of the colonial organization which embraces the physical, human, and spiritual elements of the colonizing experience (Mudimbe 1988, 2). This colonial structure is aimed at emphasizing a historicity that promotes discourses on African primitiveness, which is used in justifying why the continent needed to be conquered and colonized in the first place (Mudimbe 1988, 20). Citing what Ignacy Sachs calls “europeocentricism”, Mudimbe says this model of colonialism is to “dominate our thought and given its projection on the world scale by the expansion of capitalism….it marks contemporary culture imposing itself as a strongly conditioning model for some and forced deculturation for others” (Sachs 1971, 22). In all of this, according to Mudimbe, europeocentricism is anchored on the denial of the “Other” in European consciousness. It continues to be a denial in spite of the assertion of the “existence of the other” in Paul Ricoeur’s meditation on the irruption of the other: “when we discover that there are several cultures instead of just one…be it illusory or real, we are threatened with destruction by our own discovery. Suddenly, it becomes possible that there are just others, that we ourselves are an “other” among others” (Ricoeur 1965, 278). To this end, if one accepts Ricoeur’s assertion on the existence of cultural pluralism one would be able to affirm the foundation of Mudimbe’s submission in his The Idea of Africa that in each continent, for example Africa, “there are natural features, cultural characteristics, and, probably, values that contribute to its reality different from those of, say, Asia and Europe” (Mudimbe 1994, xv).
It is based on this distinct reality of each culture that William Abraham in The Mind of Africa examines the problems and challenges that face post-colonial Africa vis-à-vis the continent’s interaction with Europe. Abraham acknowledges the existence of neocolonialism in Africa, but proposes an integrative form of culture whereby certain positive aspects of Western culture may be integrated with African culture in order to forge a common bond (Abraham 1962, 83). Abraham however emphasizes that in spite of the on-going social, economic and political change in Africa due to the impact of neocolonialism, Africa’s culture must be guarded from being eroded by Western influence and civilization, or what he refers to as “the externality of an outsider” (Abraham 1962, iv)
The above description of the nature of neocolonialism and its different dimensions sparsely elaborates on the themes of subjugation and an apparent imposition of a hegemonic economic, political, and social order mostly in the guise of trade relations or developmental aid grants by the imperialists. The attendant implication of this relates to how post-colonial African states have seemingly failed to apply themselves to the problems of self-maintenance.
Towards the late nineteenth century through to the latter half of the twentieth century, some European countries, such as Britain, France, Belgium, and Portugal, had colonized a large number of African nations, setting up economic systems that allowed for seemingly extensive exploitation. Decades after World War II, these European nations granted political independence to their colonies in Africa, but still found a way to retain their economic influence and power over the former colonies. From the 1950s when many African colonies began to gain independence, they soon realized that the actual liberation that they had anticipated was outlandish. So, in spite of the assumption of Africans to political leadership positions, Africans soon realized that the economic and political atmosphere were still under some form of control of the former colonial masters. By implication, post-colonial Africa continued to experience the domination of the Western styled economic model that was prevalent during the period of colonialism. It does appear that the former colonial masters only wanted to grant political independence to their former colonies, and did not want them to be liberated from colonialism. This is why it is inferred that the situation which informs the ideological implementation of neocolonialism in Africa began immediately after the political independence of most African states.
In postcolonial Africa, events and situations have revealed how neocolonialism was nurtured from the moment independence was granted. The elements of neocolonial influences that are apparent within the interactions continually exist between former colonial masters and their former colonies attest to this assertion. For example, the point could be made with regards to the ongoing interactions between France and Francophone African countries such as Cameroon, Togo and Ivory Coast, as well as between Britain and Anglophone African countries such as Ghana, Nigeria and the Gambia
In the case of Cameroon, particularly after the amalgamation of French Cameroon with Southern British Cameroon in 1961, the granting of political independence to Cameroon by France was dependent on certain negotiations on matters of defense, foreign policy, finance, and economy, as well as technical assistance. This resulted in the adoption and institutionalization of the French 5th Republic constitutional model, alongside French political, economic, monetary, and cultural dominance in the new Cameroon (Martin 1985, 192). Following the creation of the French Franc zone, which established the Franc CFA as the general currency for all Francophone countries, the West African colonies became tied in a fixed parity of 50:1 to the French franc, automatically granting the French government control over all financial and budgetary activities (Goldsborough 1979, 72). France also continued its military presence in Cameroon after independence. France established military and defense assistance agreements with Cameroon (Martin 1985, 193). Furthermore, the French institutionalized linguistic and cultural links with all its former colonies, thereby creating the “La Francophonie” heading which served as a platform for reinforcing the assimilation of the French language, culture and ideology (Martin 1985, 198).
Although Britain may have continued to maintain an indirect economic influence through multinational corporations on its former colonies, the direct effects of British’s neocolonial socio-political and political ideologies have diminished significantly over the years. However, the West in general maintains an indirect form of domination over all developing African countries through means such as loans from the World Bank or the International Monetary Fund (IMF). This form of neocolonialism is done through foreign aids or foreign direct investments where strict or severe financial conditionalities are imposed. Such conditionality often renders the neocolonial state subservient to the economic and sometimes political will of the foreign donor.
Clearly, from this brief history of neocolonialism in Africa, one can see that colonialism itself had an epochal dimension on the history of contemporary Africa. This is why the study of neocolonialism has become critical to the study of African history and politics. It is however more crucial to the field of African philosophy because of the need to reflect on the socio-political and moral impacts of neocolonialism on Africa.
Included in the themes of African Philosophy, especially African Social and Political Philosophy are the related concepts of neocolonialism, colonialism, imperialism and decolonization. This is rightly so because of the events and activities of European expansionists’ agenda that occurred, especially in Africa’s modern history. Although these epochal events preceded one another, the methods and praxis of colonialism, imperialism, and neocolonialism are only slightly different. Their common denominators include social, economic, political, and cultural subjugations of the colonized. However, the concept of decolonization differs essentially from the others. While others are conceptually linked with exploitation and domination, decolonization is a means for liberation, which could be through a social, cultural, political and economic form of revolution.
Broadly construed, the term colonialism can be described as the deliberate imposition of the rules and policies of a nation on another nation. Its strategy is the forced placement of a nation over another that gives room for the opportunity to exploit the colonized nation in order to facilitate the economic development of the colonialist home state.
A definition by Ronald J. Horvath sees colonialism as a “form of domination – the control by individuals or groups over the territory and/or behavior of other individuals or groups” (Horvath 1972, 46). Clearly, colonialism is a tool for expansion and a form of exploitation on all fronts. This is why Robert Young’s view on colonialism is that it “involved an extraordinary range of different forms and practices carried out with respect to radically different cultures, over many centuries” (Young 2001: 17).
The idea behind colonialism basically is the conquest and rule over a country or region by another, allowing for the exploitation of the resources of the conquered for the profit of the conqueror. Colonialism is an instrumental process through which a state acquires and maintains colonies in another territory. The outcome of this, which is the colonial stage of society, alters mildly or altogether the economic, political, social and even intellectual structure of the conquered state.
Between the 1860s and 1900s, Africa as a whole was subjected to various forms of aggression from Europe, ranging from diplomatic pressures to military invasions until almost all African states were finally conquered and colonized. The process of colonization came to its complete stage with invasions of the political, economic and socio-cultural spheres of the African societies.
The first attempts at colonization occurred when the Europeans began to seek trade pursuits outside their own continent, and thus discovered that many other nations, particularly in Africa, had wealth in natural resources which had potentials for their own economic gain.
We can simply say that the nature of Colonialism involves a forced relationship between an indigenous majority and a minority of foreign invaders. Of course, its history can be traced to slavery, where indigenous people, particularly of Africa, were forcibly and violently taken as slaves to plantations in Europe and the Americas. Through slavery, Africa’s sons and daughters in large numbers were violently seized and taken to Europe as sellable commodities (Nwolize 2001, 25). However, as slavery was ending in the 1850s, Europe was packaging another round of violent visitation against Africa. This invasion took off in earnest after the Berlin conference of 1884 – 1885. Colonialism came with further violence. Vandalism, murder, torture, looting, rape, death, and destruction were also the order of the day (Afisi 2009a, 62).
Certain perceived basic assumptions seem to have informed the colonial construction of African savagery which was used to justify the nature of colonial warfare. Works of enlightenment philosophers such as Frederick Hegel’s (1770-1831) Lectures on the Philosophy of World History (1975) and Immanuel Kant’s Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View (1798, 2006) essentially informed these assumptions. Hegel speculates about the continent of Africa and asserts that Africa proper “is enveloped in the dark mantle of Night”. To Hegel, “The peculiarly African character is difficult to comprehend, for the very reason that in reference to it, we must give up the principle which naturally accompanies all our ideas–the category of Universality” (1975, 174). Hegel here states that Africans’ lack the category of Universality and, also, situates the African at the level of irrationality. “The Negro,” Hegel writes, “exhibits the natural man in his completely wild and untamed state” (174). The African was, to Hegel, a complete moron who had no idea of decency and could not distinguish his right from left. Similarly, the racist proclivities of Kant lie in his denial of any intellectual endowments and rational abilities to non-white races.
In a further attempt to rationalize colonialism, Lucien Levy Bruhl (1985, 63) standardizes the colonial discourse when he commissioned rationality as a Western signature, and thus granting what he terms mystic or pre-logical thinking to non-Western peoples. These denigrating words in particular refer to the African. These arguments justify the colonialist’s actions and reasons for invading and conquering the territories of the perceived Dark Continent. With this invasion, the entirety of the lives of this indigenous majority came to depend solely upon the powerful invaders. The fundamental decisions affecting the lives of the indigenes were made by the colonial masters. The colonialists gradually perpetuated the socio-economic and political spheres of the state, and finally, the minds of the people. The conquered were made to believe that they were inferior and, as such, only the ways of the colonialists were worthy to be imbibed.
In his article, “Modern Western Philosophy and African Colonialism”, E. Chukwudi Eze queries the rationality that underlies the thoughts and assumptions that emanate from the European Enlightenment philosophers who promoted the ideals of individual freedom and the dignity of the human person on the one hand, and who, on the other hand, were associated with the thoughts and promotion of slavery and colonialism (Eze 1998, 217). For European Enlightenment philosophers, Africans were not in the same logical set as normal humans. Therefore, their advocacy for the ideals of humanity and democracy did not apply to Africans. This justified their arguments for the promotion of “imperial and colonial subjugation of non-European peoples” (Eze 1998, 218). This suggests that there is a distinction for the enlightenment philosophers between, in Cornel West’s words, “sterling rhetoric and lived reality” or, in Abiola Irele’s, between the “word and deed” (Eze 1998).
Refutations have been made against these assumptions, which suggest that Africa, in the words of Walter Rodney (1972), was developing at its pace before the advent of colonialism. However, due to the debilitating effects of colonial rule, African scholars and political thinkers were faced with the serious challenges of socio-political and cultural reconstruction of Africa. The colonialists had imposed European beliefs and values on Africa. Thus, European languages, belief systems, social, economic, and political systems replaced pre-colonial African ones. As a reaction to the effects of colonialism, there was the need to find an alternative ideology for decolonization. The reflective attitude and the thought process in the search of the ideology for decolonization resulted in the abstraction of different philosophical ideas and the development of theories in political philosophy. Consequently, what is known as African social and Political Philosophy started as a reaction to colonialism. This explains the reason why colonialism is an important theme in African philosophy.
Imperialism dates further back in history, as it is traced back to the disintegrated Roman Empire. Imperialism can be described as an orientation which holds that a country can gain political or economic power over another through imposed sovereignty or more indirect mechanisms of control. Imperialism does not focus only on political dominance, but also conquest over expansion. It is particularly focused on the acquisition of power by a state over another group of people. It is also described as a state policy, practice or advocacy of extending power and dominion, especially by direct territorial acquisition or by gaining political and economic control of other areas. As Michael Parenti describes it, Western European imperialism first took place against other Europeans such as when Ireland became the first colony of what later became known as the British Empire (Parenti 2011, 11). However, those who virtually faced the thrust of the European, North American, and Japanese imperial powers have been states in Africa, Asia, and Latin America (Parenti 2011, 13).
An understanding of the basic modus operandi of imperialism suggests that foreign governments can govern a territory without significant settlement, quite unlike colonialism in which settlement is a key feature. Imperialism is merely an exercise of power over the conquered regions without immigration of any form.
In his book Decolonising the Mind, Ngugi wa Thiong’o explicates the nature of imperialism, particularly as it affects the culture and language of the African. Wa Thiong’o asserts that imperialism has absolute effects on the economic, political, military, cultural and psychological wellbeing of the people affected. He describes the effect of imperialism on Africa from two main perspectives. First is the socio-economic and political effect of the imperialist tradition on “consolidated finance capital” (Wa Thiong’o 1986, 2). He maintains that the subjugation of Africa’s economic life is done through the use of multinational corporations, and particularly how most African countries have been lured into accepting loans from the International Monetary Fund (IMF). Wa Thiong’o’s concern about the IMF is that the economic life of every worker and peasant of such countries that have taken the loans are mortgaged forever. This is because as such countries continue to service the IMF loans, the organization is entrusted with the power to dictate the direction of the economic policies of those states. This can also be said of the imperialist domination of politics where it is ensured that African states rely on Western models of politics, policing, judiciary practice, and education.
Wa Thiong’o’s second perspective on the consequences of imperialism relates to what he calls “effect of cultural bomb” (Wa Thiong’o 1986, 3). According to him, imperialism uses a cultural bomb to isolate people and estrange them from their identity. This is done by annihilating the people from their heritage, their environment, their names and, above all, their language. Wa Thiong’o asserts that language remains the most essential vehicle through which the human soul can be held captive. In this case, the imperialists are fully aware of this essence and deliberately use “language as a means of spiritual subjugation” (Wa Thiong’o 1986, 9). So in Wa Thiong’o’s submission, this cultural and psychological form of imperialism remains the biggest weapons that undermine the value of the human person and erodes the dignity of the people’s identity. This form of imperialism has the tendency to make people embrace the imperialists’ alien culture, language, and way of life, and be far removed from their indigenous heritage and identity.
The study of the dignity of the African in every form is central to African philosophy. The need to embrace the value of Africa’s cultural heritage that is devoid of any form of imperialist subjugation is essential for the promulgation of African philosophy. It is in the light of this that, as a theme of African philosophy, the study of imperialism remains crucial to understanding its methods and its effects on the socio-economic, political, and cultural life of the African.
As a theme in African philosophy, the term decolonization connotes an ideology for true emancipation in post-colonial Africa. We talk of emancipation from cultural, economic, political, psychological forms of colonialism. African philosophers have consistently been concerned with the issue of liberation of the mind, spirit and body, as well as the emancipation of the African from all elements and influences of colonialism. It is as a result of these concerns that the study of decolonization is essential to the project of African philosophy.
The term decolonization can be described as the abolishment of colonialism and the enthronement of a people/nation’s powers over its own territories. It is typically referred to not merely as independence from colonialism but a total liberation from the influences and powers of imperial neocolonialism. It is a situation in which a new state acts under its own volition, free from the direct control of foreign actors. Decolonization refers to the ability or willingness of the previously colonized nation to become free from imperial rule in order to control its own domestic and international affairs. It is also the mechanism and/or ability of a people to be liberated from cultural and psychological domination of foreign influences.
In Africa, for instance, many theoretical assumptions informed the need to necessarily decolonize. In principle, we can trace the spark for an ideology for decolonization as beginning with the rise of communism in the former Soviet Union. The teachings of Marx, Frederick Engels (1820-1895), and Vladimir Lenin (1870-1924) against the exploitation of the masses remain the backdrop of this decolonization. The influences of the teachings of Frantz Fanon on decolonization cannot also be gainsaid. These teachings and influences seemed to have led to the conviction that informed the early African political thinkers on the need to radically decolonize and end the influences of neocolonialism. Some post-independent African thinkers, such as Leopold Sedar Senghor of Senegal, Sekou Toure of Guinea, Julius Nyerere of Tanzania, Obafemi Awolowo of Nigeria, and Kwame Nkrumah of Ghana, among others, were faced with the serious challenges of socio-economic, political, and cultural reconstruction of the postcolonial African states. They were faced with the task of liberating Africa from the imposition of neocolonial European values, languages, and belief systems, social, economic, and political systems which seemed to have replaced the pre-colonial African ones. Consequently, the principle of individualism, believed to have been a European signature, seemed to have replaced the African cultural context of brotherhood, which suggests a welfare system of communalism, collectivism, and egalitarianism; hence, the need for a search for an ideology for decolonization (Afisi 2009b, 33).
As noted above, among the writers on decolonization in Africa, Fanon was one of the prominent figures. In fact, his writings are notably extensive on the process and methods of decolonization and of true liberation. Central to Fanon is the idea that only through decolonization can there be true liberation. Fanon’s strong advocacy of decolonization results from his commitment to the preservation of individual human dignity.
Fanon’s works, Black Skin White Mask (1952) and The Wretched of the Earth (1962), contain radical critiques of the French colonization. He views colonialism as a forcible control of another state, with the word ‘force’ as key. Fanon accuses the colonizers of using force to exploit raw materials and labour from colonized countries. To justify their actions however, the colonial masters proclaim that the natives were savages and that European culture was the most ideal for adoption.
Fanon claims that the colonial situation is by definition a violent one. He condemns the violence inflicted on the colonized by the colonizer. However, he distinguishes between a threefold categorization of violence. This includes; physical, structural and psychological violence. Physical violence implies the somatic injury inflicted on human beings, the most radical manifestation of which is the killing of an individual. Structural violence reflects the fact of exploitation and its necessary institutional form of the colonial situation. Psychological violence is the injury or harm done to the human psyche (Fanon 1952, 39). This third categorization includes elements of indoctrination of various kinds and threats which tend to decrease the victims’ mental potentialities. As a way out of all of these, Fanon advocates a reprisal use of violence against the settlers to enable the colonized regain their self-respect. To him, since the colonial situation is itself a violent one, the colonial masses can only achieve liberation through replicated form of violence. True liberation, according to Fanon, must be accompanied by violence. His submission is that for liberation to be total, accurate and objectively achieved, it has to be accompanied by violence (Fanon 1962, 102).
In Fanon, decolonization requires violence on the part of the colonized. Violence plays a critical role in the decolonization struggle. The colonized must see violence in decolonization as that which leads not to retrogression, but liberation. Fanon sees decolonization as implementation of the concept of ‘the last shall be the first’. It is a psycho-social process, a historical process that changes the order of the world. Decolonization involves a struggle for the mental elevation of the colonized African people (Fanon 1962, 116). So, from all of this, Fanon contends that Africa is in need of true liberation which can only result from decolonization. In his submission, resisting a colonial power using only politics cannot be effective; violence is the best way to attain decolonization.
Arguing from a similar position, Kwasi Wiredu in his book, Conceptual Decolonization in African Philosophy contends that colonialism has not only affected Africa’s political society but also its mental reasoning. He advocates the need for Africans to go through a process of mental decolonization. Wiredu recommends the process of decolonization from two conceptual analyses: first, ‘avoiding through a critical conceptual self-awareness the unexamined assimilation in our thought… of the conceptual frameworks embedded in foreign philosophical tradition’, and second ‘exploiting as much as judicious the resources of our own indigenous conceptual schemes in our philosophical meditations…’ (Wiredu 1998, 117). For Wiredu, the most important function of post-colonial philosophy is what he refers to as “conceptual decolonization”. This simply implies “divesting African philosophical thinking of all undue influences emanating from our colonial past” (Wiredu 1998). Wiredu sees decolonization as a necessary tool for developing an authentic African philosophy that is devoid of any neo-positivist influences.
Wa Thiong’o, in his thinking, believes that decolonization can only take place in Africa when the “cultural bomb” is diffused. This process begins when “writing” is done in the various indigenous African languages. Such writings, which would enhance the renaissance of African cultures, must also carry with it the spirit and content of anti-imperialist struggles. This would ultimately help in liberating the mind of the people from foreign control (Wa Thiong’o 1986, 29). For total decolonization to occur, Wa Thiong’o enjoins writers in African languages to form a revolutionary vanguard in the struggle to decolonize the mind of Africans from imperialism.
After the independence of most African nations, Africans soon began to notice that their countries were being subjected to a new form of colonialism, waged by their former colonialists and some other developed nations. It is pertinent to mention that even though neocolonialism is a subtle propagation of social-economic and sometimes political activities of former colonial overlords in their ex-colonies, documented evidence has shown that a country that was never colonized can also become a neo-colonialist state. Countries such as Liberia and Ethiopia that never experienced colonialism in the classical sense have become neocolonial states by dint of their reliance on international finance capital, courtesy of its fragile economic structure (Attah, 2013:71). It is based on this that neocolonialism can be said to be a new form of colonial exploitation and control of the new independent states of Africa, and other African states with fragile economies.
Nkrumah views neocolonialism as a new form of subjugation of the economic, social, cultural, and political life of the African. His postulation is that European imperialism of Africa has passed through several stages, from slavery to colonization and subsequently to neocolonialism being the last stage of the imperialist subjugation and exploitation process. Nkrumah’s (1965) classic, Neo-colonialism: The Last Stage of Imperialism, is an analysis of neocolonialism in relation to imperialism. The book emphasizes the need to recognize that colonialism had yet to be abolished in Africa. Rather, it had evolved into what he calls neocolonialism. Nkrumah reveals the methods that the West used in its shift in tactics from colonialism to neocolonialism. In his words: “without a qualm it dispenses with its flags, and claims that it is ‘giving’ independence to its former subjects, to be followed by ‘aid’ for their development. Under cover of such phrases however, it devises innumerable ways to accomplish objectives formerly achieved by naked colonialism” (Nkrumah 1965). This explains the condition under which a nation is continually enslaved by the fetters of neocolonialism while being independent in theory, and yet being trapped outwardly by international sovereignty, so that it is actually directed politically and economically from the outside.
Nkrumah contends that neocolonialism is usually exercised through economic or monetary means. As part of the methods of control in a neocolonial state, the imperialist power and control over the state is gained through contributions to the cost of running the state, promotion of civil servants into positions that allow them to dictate and wield power, and through monetary control of foreign exchange by the imposition of a banking system that favors the imperial system.
Nkrumah further explains that neocolonialism results in the exploitation of different sectors of the nation, using different forms and methods: “[t]he result of colonialism is that foreign capital is used for the exploitation rather than for the development of the less developed parts of the world. Investment under neocolonialism increases rather than decreases the gap between the rich and the poor countries of the world” (Nkrumah 1965).
On the link between Neocolonialism and Imperialism, Nkrumah writes that neocolonialism is the worst and most heightened form of imperialism. For those who practice it, it ensures power without responsibility and unchecked exploitation for those who suffer it. He explains that neocolonialist exploitation is implemented in the political, religious, ideological, economic, and cultural spheres of society. He further provides details of the infiltration and manipulation of organized labour by agencies of the West in African countries. He discusses how the mass media is used as an instrument of neocolonialism in the following statement: “[w]hile Hollywood takes care of fiction, the enormous monopoly press, together with the outflow of slick, clever, expensive magazines attends to what it chooses to call ‘news’” (Nkrumah 1965). Religion too, according to Nkrumah, is distorted and used to support the cause of neocolonialism.
Nkrumah’s submission, however, is in the projection that as dangerous as neocolonialism is to the future of Africa, it would eventually, like colonialism, be defeated by the unity of all those who are being oppressed and exploited. He prescribes unity and awareness amongst all Africans.
Buttressing the above submission, Noah Echa Attah in his paper, “The historical conjuncture of neo-colonialism and underdevelopment in Nigeria” (2013), traces the root of underdevelopment in Africa, particularly in Nigeria, to the effects of neocolonialism. In his assertion, African countries have never been truly independent after colonialism had left because the idea of partnering with the ex-colonialists has continued to guide state economic policies. Foreign firms have continued to dominate the business sectors of the economy such that relatively few, but large and integrated foreign firms otherwise called multi-national corporations, have made themselves indispensable to the growth or otherwise of the economy. Local industries in Africa are extensions of metropolitan firms, such that the needed raw materials for the industries depend on very high import content of over 90% from the capitalist economies (Attah 2013, 76). Thus, the continued dependence of industrial investments in Africa on the capitalist intensive technology is strictly aimed at further developing the metropolitan economies.
Attah explicates how Western neocolonialists have collaborated with local bourgeoisie in Africa to perpetuate the exploitation of the people and state economies in Africa. According to him, most of the local bourgeoisie collaborators are not committed to national interest and development, and their aim is to ensure the continued reproduction of foreign domination of the African economic space. The local bourgeoisie are bereft of ideas capable of engendering growth and development. The objective of foreign capital, therefore, is to continue to co-opt the weak and nascent local bourgeoisie into its operations. “The co-optation of the local bourgeoisie into the network of foreign capital condemned the former to the position of ‘comprador’” (Attah 2013, 77).
Adducing from the above exposition, Attah also asserts that neocolonialism is a new form of imperial rule characterized by the domination of foreign capital. His claim is that instead of real independence, what Africa has is pseudo-independence with the trappings of the illusion of freedom. To him, neocolonialism in Africa is made possible due to the roles and actions of local bourgeoisie in collusion with foreign capital. He is concerned that the different African economies have become willing tools in the hands of the West because of their fragility. In many cases, the African states have inadvertently authorized the dependency of African economies on foreign capital, which is a necessary legitimacy for neocolonialism. Neocolonialism, Attah submits, leads to underdevelopment where the local bourgeoisie and the foreign capitals are interested in the economy for personal accumulation rather than national development of the neocolonialist state.
Thomas Molnar (1965) in his paper, “Neocolonialism in Africa?”, asserts that African nations continue to depend on the Western industrial nations for economic aid, loans, investment, market, and other technical assistance because they require this dependency for their development. He acknowledges that the colonial regime in Africa left Africa in destitution, not only materially but also in terms of education and technical training. Molnar also affirms that nobody will deny that the colonialist period sanctioned abuses and exploitation on Africa (Molnar 1965, 177).
However, in spite of the end of colonialism in Africa, Molnar is concerned that African economies have not been properly functional, independent of foreign aids and investments. He claims that the economic presence of the West is imperative for the future progress of Africa’s socio-economic and political stability. The assumption is that only fruitful economic arrangements with western industrialized countries may guarantee Africa’s future (Molnar 1965, 182).
Further, Molnar asserts that the call for decolonization in Africa took place in a hurried, haphazard way. Africans were unready and immature for economic and political independence as of the time it achieved it. As a result of this situation, the West is under obligation in post-colonial Africa to keep up its aid, not as a tribute paid for past colonial situation but as one half of a two-way process of cooperation (Molnar 1965, 183). For its development, Africa needs the West. Since the newly independent African countries will continue to be economically dependent on the West, neocolonialism is not a negative term. In fact, “neo-colonialism” is the only way of getting Africa to the take-off stage” (Molnar 1965, 183).
In a reaction to Molnar’s glorification of neocolonialism in Africa, Tunde Obadina’s article, “The Myth of Neocolonialism” (2000), which is a critical analysis of the colonial situation in Africa, and the myth surrounding indigenous growth and development in post-colonial Africa, gushes at the ‘apologist’ claim about the positive influences of colonialism. According to Obadina, these apologists contend that despite the exploitation of resources perpetrated by the colonialists, their overall influence on the African society in terms of reducing the economic gap between Africa and the West is positive. The argument here is that colonialism improved the living condition of Africans, providing necessary tools for civilization such as formal education, modern medicine, and enlightenment, including shaping the political organization. However, Obadina notes that in spite of these apologetic claims, Africa is still today considered a continent in economic and political crisis. However, the apologists are usually quick to point out that the failure of Africa’s development is due to the conscious or unconscious refusal to adopt the legacies of the colonialists. These apologists even go to the extent of saying that Africa is in such a state because they gained independence a lot sooner than was necessary for them.
Citing D.K Fieldhouse as one of the apologists, Obadina mentions that Fieldhouse is of the view that it would be difficult to imagine what would have become of African countries had the colonial rule not come. Fieldhouse had contended that pre-colonial Africa by itself lacked the capacity, social and economic organization to transform itself into modern states that would result in the establishment of advance economies. According to Fieldhouse, African states today would be a direct replica of what they were in the primitive days if they had not encountered the European culture and civilization.
Fieldhouse’s Eurocentric orientations result from the contention that Africans are by nature irrational, incompetent, and unable to produce anything useful. These orientations have gone to great extents to undermine Africa’s indigenous culture, tradition, religion and even philosophy. Even Gene Blocker opines that ‘the more philosophical African philosophy becomes, the less African it is in content and the more African it becomes, the less philosophical it is in content’ (Blocker 1987, 2).
In contrast to these apologetic arguments, Obadina points out that many nationalist African scholars have raised arguments to criticize the apologists’ positions on the basis that Africa would definitely have developed in a unique way, different from the European system. Obadina asserts that colonialism bore nothing but negative effects on Africa. According to him, Africans lived more ‘enriched’ lives before colonialism, and would have continued in that manner had they not been colonized. The effect of colonial rule has left the continent in a more dilapidated state; it has compromised the nations’ capabilities to develop. Obadina cites Walter Rodney’s assessments of how colonialism only succeeded in making Africa underdeveloped and, worse still, dependent on Western nations. The colonial juxtaposing of people from different cultures, ignoring the already established borders and redrawing Africa’s map created and still results today in various degrees of ethnic conflicts. Furthermore, colonialism undermined pre-colonial political systems which used to be effective for Africans and imposed foreign political concepts which include multi-party democracy. This, according to Rodney and many other critics, has left Africa in serious social and political crises. Obadina takes Nigeria as an example, which, because of its great population and natural resources, had qualities that seem to be leading eventually to her destruction. The party politics, according to Obadina, introduced by the colonialists was the major cause of ethnic conflicts in Africa.
Obadina acknowledges the difficulty in providing an objective analysis of the impact of colonialism in Africa. Despite this, he avers that colonialism in Africa may have some positives. However, what cannot be denied is the fact that it was something imposed, which had no regard for the existing structures already in place. Furthermore, colonial rule was not an idea geared towards the development of the colonized states in any way, but something established solely for the benefit of the colonial states.
Furthermore, Obadina forthrightly asserts that African nations are to be blamed for the continued reliance on their former colonial lords for economic and political direction. This neocolonial situation poses serious danger to the evolution of indigenous-based economic growth, and at the same time, has adverse effects on political stability. It has, according to him, hampered the growth of movements geared towards change. He believes that African nations, after independence, should have shut the door against imports and exports from the West and sought to develop themselves using their own resources, not dependent on foreign corporations. This would have, he says, improved Africa’s infrastructural levels of economic and political growth. In Obadina’s view, if African nations, for example, had pursued this independent economic agenda, they would have survived, because Cuba did so and survived. Obadina opines that the traditional agenda that came with colonialism was the false ‘idea of progress’. With this idea as the fundamental gospel, Africans were made to believe that their living conditions could be positively altered. This, among other things, smoothened their way into the continent, since, after all, it has been peoples’ desires for material improvement. It created in Africans the desire for Western civilization; but the West failed to hand over to Africans the tools for realizing such civilization.
Africa in the early 21st century is a neocolonial continent, according to Obadina. Africa continues to face the problem of dealing with the overbearing presence of Western civilization. In the quest for modernization, the focus is mostly on the Western world and there is little or no focus on the urgent need for internal changes in this same quest. Despite colonial rule in Africa ending only late near the end of the twentieth century, Obadina submits that African nations at the beginning of the 21st century have the responsibility to develop themselves by making changes in their internal structures using indigenous knowledge, while at the same time learning all they can from the influence of the Western world and putting these to use for their own benefit.
In all of these, African philosophers have continued to interrogate the idea of neocolonialism and its effects on Africa’s development. The outcomes of such interrogations continue to form content that need to be taught and studied within the project of African philosophy.
The heavy dependence on foreign aid and the apparent activities of the multinational corporations in Africa reveal that Africa at the beginning of the 21st century is still in a neocolonial stage of development. The activities of the corporations in Africa, particularly those from Europe and America reveal nothing short of economic exploitation and cultural domination. Early 21st century Africa is witnessing neocolonialism from different fronts, from the influences of trans-national corporations from Europe and America to the form of a new imperial China, which many African governments now seem obligated to. The establishment of the multinational corporations, and more recently Chinese interests in Africa through Chinese companies, appear mainly to exist for the benefits of the home economies of the neocolonialists than to infuse local African economies with cash to stimulate growth and increase local capacity.
In the Africa of the early 21st century, some scholars, such as Ali Mazrui, have opined that the new form of neocolonialism is globalization. Much as the way that neocolonialism has been variously described, Mazrui also describes how globalization “allows itself to be a handmaiden to ruthless capitalism, increases the danger of warfare by remote control, deepens the divide between the haves and have-nots, and accelerates damage to our environment” (Mazrui 2002, 59). This negative perspective on globalization, particularly as it relates to extreme capitalism, essentially corroborates the assertion by Michael Maduagwu that “globalization is only the latest stage of European economic and cultural domination of the rest of the world which started with colonialism, went through imperialism and has now arrived at the globalization stage” (Maduagwu 1999, 65).
Looking at globalization in this way, Oseni Afisi, also condemns it to the corridor of neocolonialism and cultural subjugation. Globalization becomes the imposition of a particular culture and value system upon other nations with the direct intent of exploitation. What this indicates is that globalization is indeed the engine room for the propagation of neocolonialism and new imperialism on the African soil. While colonialism has ended, the reality on the ground in Africa in the immediate years after it is that political independence in many African states has not culminated in the much desired economic and cultural freedom (Afisi 2011, 5).
Afisi further opines that the greatest venture upon which the negative impact of globalization in Africa rests primarily is the erosion of Africa’s cultural heritage. Upon this heritage hinges the political, economic, social, educational subjugation of the continent of Africa. The forcible integration of Africa into globalization through slavery and colonialism has led to the problem of personal identity and cultural dilemma for the African. Africa has had to be dependent upon Europe and America, and, more recently, upon China for its development and, one might add, the development of her identity and culture.
By contrast, Olufemi Taiwo, in Africa Must Be Modern: A Manifesto, has a radical position which seeks to have sufficient bearing on Africa’s consideration of the inherent benefits of globalization. Taiwo uncompromisingly defends globalization and suggests that its benefits must be harnessed by Africans. Taiwo berates the level of hostility that Africa has shown towards modernity, stating the regrettable impact of such hostility to the economic, social, and political development of the continent (Taiwo 2014). To Taiwo, Africa must address the challenges of modernity and globalization by embracing them instead of being hostile to them. As Taiwo further posits, Africa needs to fully engage with and derive benefits from globalization and its attendant capitalist democracy (Taiwo 2014).
In a similar vein, D. A. Masolo, in African Philosophy in Search of Identity, remarks that the needs and experiences of Africans today are conditioned by their peculiar cultural circumstances. The nature of these cultural circumstances is that the African of the post-colonial period has embraced modernity, science and technology as part of his/her culture. These African understand the world around them by being open minded and ridding themselves of any traction that may mold their thinking. This is the nature of African identity after colonialism, an identity which will aid in the intellectual construction of a modern African philosophy (Masolo 1994, 251).
As a theme of African philosophy, the term neocolonialism became widespread in use—particularly in reference to Africa—immediately the process of decolonization began in Africa. The widespread use of the term neocolonialism began when Africans realized that even after independence their countries were still being subjected to a new form of colonialism. The challenges that neocolonialism poses to Africa seem to be related to the socio-economic, cultural, and political development of the people and states of the continent. These challenges have, however, been attributed both positive and negative impacts on the continent.
On the whole, this article is an exposition of the theme of neocolonialism within the project of African philosophy. The introduction is a cursory look at the term “neocolonialism” with a view to clarifying the basic concept of the term. The history of neocolonialism is a historical analysis of the beginning of neocolonialism in Africa. This analysis reveals how the idea of neocolonialism was nurtured before independence was granted to most African states. No doubt, the term neocolonialism has some close relations to some other concepts. This explains the reasons the term colonialism, imperialism, decolonization, and globalization are essential to better understanding neocolonialism. Discussions about the negatives and some positives of colonialism and its offshoot neocolonialism in Africa are exposed in this article. This reveals that neocolonial elements may continue to be an integral part of Africa’s socio-economic, cultural, and political existence. However, some of the social and political philosophical questions which may continue to preoccupy the minds of Africans include: Can neocolonialism be abolished from Africa? Can the positives of neocolonialism outweigh the negatives, or vice versa, in terms of the impacts on the African economy? Will Africa ever be truly decolonized?
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Oseni Taiwo Afisi
Lagos State University