Plato: The Laws
The Laws is Plato’s last, longest, and, perhaps, most loathed work. The book is a conversation on political philosophy between three elderly men: an unnamed Athenian, a Spartan named Megillus, and a Cretan named Clinias. These men work to create a constitution for Magnesia, a new Cretan colony. The government of Magnesia is a mixture of democratic and authoritarian principles that aim at making all of its citizens happy and virtuous.
Like Plato’s other works on political theory, such as the Statesman and the Republic, the Laws is not simply about political thought, but involves extensive discussions on psychology, ethics, theology, epistemology, and metaphysics. However, unlike these other works, the Laws combines political philosophy with applied legislation, going into great detail concerning what laws and procedures should be in Magnesia. Examples include conversations on whether drunkenness should be allowed in the city, how citizens should hunt, and how to punish suicide. Yet, the legal details, clunky prose, and lack of organization have drawn condemnation from both ancient and modern scholars. Many have attributed this awkward writing to Plato’s old age at the time of writing; nonetheless, readers should bear in mind that the work was never completed. Although these criticisms have some merit, the ideas discussed in the Laws are well worth our consideration, and the dialogue has a literary quality of its own.
In the 21st century, there has been a growing interest among philosophers in the study of the Laws. Many of the philosophical ideas in the Laws have stood the test of time, such as the principle that absolute power corrupts absolutely and that no person is exempt from the rule of law. Other significant developments in the Laws include the emphasis on a mixed regime, a varied penal system, its policy on women in the military, and its attempt at rational theology. Yet, Plato took his most original idea to be that law should combine persuasion with compulsion. In order to persuade citizens to follow the legal code, every law has a prelude that offers reasons why it is in one’s interest to obey. The compulsion comes in the form of a punishment attached to the law if the persuasion should fail to motivate compliance.
In addition, in the Laws Plato defends several positions that appear in tension with ideas expressed in his other works. Perhaps the largest difference is that the ideal city in the Laws is far more democratic than the ideal city in the Republic. Other notable differences include appearing to accept the possibility of weakness of will (akrasia)—a position rejected in earlier works—and granting much more authority to religion than any reader of the Euthyphro would expect. By exploring these apparent differences, students of Plato and the history of philosophy will come away with a more nuanced and complex understanding of Plato’s philosophical ideas.
Table of Contents
- Setting and Characters
- The Laws, Customs, and Political Structure of Magnesia
- The Relationship between the Laws and the Republic
- Overview of the Laws
- Book 1 and 2
- Book 3
- Book 4
- Book 5
- Book 6
- Book 7 and 8
- Book 9
- Book 10
- Book 11 and 12
- References and Further Reading
1. Setting and Characters
The dialogue is set on the Greek island of Crete in the 4th century B.C.E. Three elderly men are walking from Cnossos to the sacred cave and sanctuary of Zeus located on Mount Ida. This setting is crucially linked to the theme of the Laws. These three men are walking the path that Minos (a legendary lawgiver of Crete) and his father followed every nine years to receive the guidance of Zeus. As these men trace Minos’ steps, they seek to discover what the best political system and laws are. Like Minos, they too will found their political system on their understanding of the gods.
Each man is from a different Greek city-state (polis). Clinias is from Cnossos, Crete; Megillus is from Sparta; and the unnamed individual is from Athens. There is some speculation as to who this unnamed Athenian might be. Aristotle (Politics 2.6.1265a) thinks he is Socrates. Cicero (Laws 1.5.15) holds that he is Plato himself, while others speculate that he is supposed to remind the reader of the Athenian politician Solon. Another interpretation holds that the Athenian is unnamed because Plato doesn’t intend for him to represent any particular historical figure.
Setting aside the issue of who the Stranger is, readers might wonder whether they should interpret his views as Plato’s own. There is no easy and uncontroversial answer to the question. Indeed, it is a problem that pervades all of Plato’s work. Scholars adopt a variety of approaches towards this issue. Some scholars take the protagonist to represent Plato’s own view, while others hold that Plato’s view isn’t identified with any single character, but is found in the overall discussion indirectly. Furthermore, some interpreters maintain that Plato intentionally leaves his direct voice out of the dialogues because he isn’t interested in putting forth specific theses, but rather, is interested in generating thought about a set of related questions.
Although Spartans, Cretans, and Athenians are unified in the sense that they are all Greek, they differ culturally. Spartans and Cretans are from the Dorian ethnic group, while Athenians are Ionian. This is relevant for two reasons. First, the Ionians and Dorians have not always been on friendly terms. Indeed, this conflict culminates in the Peloponnesian war (431-404 BC). Second, Dorians are stereotyped as having an exclusive military focus and a distaste for intellectual pursuits, while Athenians are seen as being more artistic and philosophical. Both of these features will play out in the drama of the dialogue as each interlocutor will defend views characteristic of their home institutions and will behave in ways that are stereotypical of their culture.
2. The Laws, Customs, and Political Structure of Magnesia
Magnesia, the theoretical colony of Crete that is developed in the Laws, is a self-sufficient agricultural state located nine to ten miles from the sea. Its remote location will deter the influence of visitors, who might corrupt the culture of Magnesia. That being said, Magnesia will have a population of slaves and foreigners who carry out necessary tasks forbidden to citizens, such as trading and menial labor. The city will consist of 5,040 households. The Athenian is adamant about this number because it is divisible by any number from 1 to 12 (with the exception of 11), making it convenient for purposes of administration. Each household will be allotted to plots of land (one near the city center and one located further away) and these plots of land are inalienable to the holder’s family. The intention is to prevent members of the community from becoming wealthy at the expense of other citizens. Indeed, the city is designed in such a way to prevent citizens from becoming extremely wealthy or poor. Nevertheless, there will be four property classes based on the wealth one’s family accumulated before coming to Magnesia. Although the land will not be farmed in common, it is to be considered a part of the common property, and shareholders must make public contributions. Women will not be allowed to own property, but will be considered citizens and can hold political office. In fact, women are able to participate in the military as soldiers and can attend their own private common meals—two practices usually reserved for men in ancient Greece.
The political system of Magnesia will be mixed, blending democratic and authoritarian elements. This can be seen in how political offices are handled. There are a vast number of different political offices in Magnesia, some of which will be made up of the general citizen body. The benefit of this is that it will make the citizens feel that they have a stake in Magnesia. However, at the same time, there will be particular offices made up of more elite citizens. For example, the “guardians of the law” will supervise the general citizen body. In order to ensure that the guardians of the law are accountable for their conduct, there will be a powerful board of “scrutineers” that provide a check on their authority. The most distinguished office is the “nocturnal council,” which will be in charge of researching the philosophical nature of law and offering insight into how these features can be applied in Magnesia.
3. The Relationship between the Laws and the Republic
Although the Republic and the Laws share many similarities, those who come to the Laws after reading the Republic will likely be surprised at what they find insofar as these texts differ with respect to both content and style. In terms of style, the Laws has far less literary quality than Plato’s masterpiece, the Republic. This is partly a result of the fact that the Laws deals with the details of legal and governmental policies, while the Republic doesn’t; rather, the Republic focuses on politics and ethics at a much more general level. Furthermore, unlike Plato’s other works, the character Socrates is noticeably absent in the Laws.
Turning now to content, in the Republic, Socrates develops an ideal city, referred to as the Callipolis (literally, the beautiful or noble city). The Callipolis consists of three classes: a large working class of farmers and craftspeople, an educated military class, and a small number of elite philosophers who will rule the city. The military and ruler classes are called “guardians,” and they will not have any private property. Indeed, they will hold everything in common including women, men, and children. Unlike in the Callipolis, private property is allowed throughout Magnesia and political power spreads throughout the city. Another notable difference is that only philosophers possess fully-developed virtue in the Republic (and in the Phaedo) while in the Laws the Athenian says that correct legislation aims at developing virtue in the entire citizen body (1.630d-631d, 4.705d-706a, 4.407d, 6.770c, 12.962b-963a). To be sure, the political structure of the Callipolis secures the correct behavior of all citizens. However, because complete virtue involves knowledge, which only philosophers have, non-philosophers can only approximate virtue. In other words, the Laws seems to express more optimism than the Republic with respect to the average citizen’s ability to be virtuous.
This leaves readers to wonder what could explain these apparent differences. Although many different answers have been presented, the most prevalent answer is that the texts were written for two different purposes. The Republic represents Plato’s ideal vision of a political utopia, while the Laws represents his vision of the best attainable city given the defects of human nature. Aristotle, for example, holds that the Republic and the Laws share many of the same features, but that the Laws offers a system that is more capable of being generally adopted (Politics 2.6.1265a-b). Many scholars have supported this reading by pointing out that Magnesia is said to be the second best city, with the ideal city being one in which women, children and property are held in common (Laws 5.739a-740a). Additionally, this interpretation explains why the Laws goes into greater detail concerning day-to-day activities than the Republic does. Because the Callipolis is an unattainable utopia, there is no point to discussing the customs in any sort of detail, but because Magnesia is attainable, this is a worthwhile project. Trevor Saunders captures the essence of this interpretation when he says, “The Republic presents merely the theoretical ideal…The Laws describes, in effect, the Republic modified and realized in the conditions of this world” (1970, 28).
An alternative answer is that Plato changed his mind. On this reading, the views defended in the Laws are an advancement on the ideas expressed in the Republic. This reading denies that 5.739a-740a provides support for the claim that the Callipolis is the ideal city. Strictly speaking, the passage only says that the ideal city is one where everything is held in common, and in the Callipolis only the guardians hold things in common. This lends credence to thinking that the ideal city described in the Laws is not the Callipolis. Christopher Bobonich (2002) has argued that this new perspective is the result of Plato changing his mind about psychology, abandoning the view of the Republic in which the soul has parts and replacing it with a more unified conception of human agency and motivation. However, readers should note that this is merely a cursory discussion of a very large and important issue—there are many other ways to account for the differences between the texts.
4. Overview of the Laws
The Laws is made up of twelve books. Books 1 and 2 explore what is the purpose of government. This exploration takes the form of a comparative evaluation of the practices found in the interlocutors’ homelands. Through the course of this discussion, a preliminary account of education and virtue is offered. Book 3 examines the origins of government and the merits of different constitutions. At Book 3’s conclusion, it is revealed that Clinias is in charge of developing a legal code for a new colony of Crete, Magnesia. After discussing the appropriate population and geography of Magnesia, Book 4 analyzes the correct method for legislating law. Book 5 begins with various moral lessons and then shifts to an account of the correct procedure for founding Magnesia and distributing the land within it. Book 6 presents the details of the various offices and legal positions in Magnesia and ends by examining marriage. Book 7 and 8 discuss the musical and physical education of the citizens. Book 8 concludes with a discussion of sexuality and economics. Book 9 introduces criminal law and analyzes what factors should be taken into account when determining a punishment. Book 10 examines laws concerning impiety and presents an account of theology. Book 11 and 12 continue with the legal code. The Laws ends with an account of the “Nocturnal Council,” the “anchor” of the city.
5. Book 1 and 2
The dialogue begins with the Athenian inquiring into the origin of law, as to whether it comes from a divine or human being. Clinias states that Apollo is credited as the originator of Crete’s laws, while Zeus is credited as the founder of Sparta’s (624a-625a). The conversation shifts to the question of the purpose of government. Megillus and Clinias hold that the goal of government is to win in war, since conflict is an essential condition of all human beings (625ca-627c). Because the fundamental goal is victory in war, Clinias and Megillus maintain that the primary purpose of education is to make citizens courageous. The Athenian responds by pointing out that reconciliation and harmony among warring parties is superior to one group defeating another. This demonstrates that peace is superior to victory (627c-630d). Consequently, the educative system should not focus exclusively on cultivating courage in its citizens, but should develop virtue in its entirety, including not only courage but wisdom, moderation and justice as well (630d-631d). Indeed, courage, the Athenian argues, is the least important virtue (631d). The goal of law is to help its citizens flourish, and the most direct route to this is developing virtue in them.
It is during this discussion that the Athenian makes an important distinction between “divine” and “human” goods. Divine goods are the virtues, whereas human goods are things like health, strength, wealth, and beauty. Divine goods are superior to human goods in that human goods depend on divine goods, but divine goods do not depend on anything. The idea is that the virtues always contribute to human flourishing, but things that are commonly thought to do so, such as wealth and beauty, will not do so unless one possesses virtue. In fact, things like beauty and wealth in the hands of a corrupt person will enable him or her to act in ways that will lead to failure.
Now that the importance of virtue is established, the Athenian challenges his interlocutors to identify the laws and customs of their home cities that develop virtue. Megillus easily identifies the Spartan practices that cultivate courage. The Spartan’s educational method primarily focuses on exposing citizens to fear and pain so that they might develop a resistance to each (633b-c). The Athenian responds by pointing out that this practice does nothing to develop the resistance to desire and pleasure. He argues that the Spartans only have partial courage because complete courage involves not only overcoming fear and pain, but desire and pleasure as well (633c-d).
This leads to an inquiry into what customs Sparta and Crete have for developing moderation. Megillus expresses uncertainty, but suggests it likely has to do with gymnastics and common meals (essentially an all-male club with a military emphasis). The conversation becomes contentious as the Athenian says that these practices are the cause of the Dorian’s reputation for pederasty, homosexuality, and the vicious pursuit of pleasure (636a-e). (To see Plato express an alternative attitude towards these practices, readers should turn to the Phaedrus and Symposium.) Megillus defends the nobility of the Spartans, proclaiming that they do not get drunk and that they would beat any drunkard they encountered even if it were during the festival of Dionysus (636e-637a). The Athenian thinks this is bad practice, because under the appropriate conditions intoxication can help one cultivate moderation and courage.
In having the characters put forth the particular positions that they do, Plato is asking us to reflect on the way in which political institutions shape citizens’ values. For instance, Clinias and Megillus, who both come from cultures that center on the military, hold that human conflict is a fundamental part of human nature and courage is the greatest virtue. In contrast, the Athenian, who comes from a culture of art and philosophy, sees harmony, peace, and leisure as ideal. Hence, in order for citizens to cultivate the appropriate dispositions, it is essential that the city have the correct policies and that citizen receive the correct education.
b. Education and Moral Psychology
In defense of moderated intoxication, the Athenian offers an account of education and moral psychology. By education, the Athenian does not mean technical skills, but rather things that direct one towards virtue. The bulk of education is meant to instill the appropriate feelings in citizens so that they feel pleasure and pain with respect to the appropriate things. Just as the Spartan practice of exposing citizens to fear and pain can help cultivate the appropriate feelings with respect to pain, drinking parties can help citizens develop the appropriate feelings with respect to pleasure. The idea being that one can learn to resist negative pleasures and desires only by being exposed to these things. Supervised drinking parties provide a safe and inexpensive way to do this.
Megillus and Clinias are quite skeptical and ask the Athenian to explain how wine affects the soul. It is here that we get an account of moral psychology (644c-645c). The Athenian asks us to imagine a puppet made by the gods with various cords in it. These cords, which represent affections (pleasure, pain, and the emotions) in the soul, pull the puppet in various directions. One cord is sacred and golden. This cord represents reason or calculation and when one follows it, one is virtuous. However, because reason/calculation is soft and gentle it requires the assistance of the other cords (which are hard and violent) to move the puppet in the correct way. The general idea is that virtue not only requires reason/calculation, but also the cultivation of the correct feelings.
The puppet metaphor raises a number of philosophical issues surrounding strength of will (enkrateia) and weakness of will (akrasia). Roughly put, weakness of will is when one intellectually grasps that one should do a certain action, but one’s emotions and desires overrule this judgement, leading to ethical failure. Strength of will is the contrary phenomenon. Like the weak-willed person, the strong-willed person desires to do other than what they intellectual judge they should do. Unlike the weak-willed person, the strong-willed person overcomes these desires and behaves correctly. In the Protagoras (352a-c), Socrates denies the possibility of weakness of will and in the Republic the virtuous agent is not the strong-willed individual who overcomes contrary emotions, but one whose psychic forces exist in perfect harmony. On the face of it, the puppet metaphor raises trouble for both of these commitments. It presents a problem for the former because it suggests that the pull of reason/calculation can be overcome by the emotions (the hard and violent cords) (see also 3.689c and 9.734b). However, this interpretation does face the problem in that the cord called reason/calculation in the metaphor is itself described as an emotion/force, which raises doubts that Plato’s intent is to draw a contrast between reason and the emotions.
The puppet metaphor also raises problems for the view that virtue is harmony because virtue in the puppet metaphor involves mastering the pull of contrary cords. This suggests that virtue amounts to being strong-willed. However, in Book 2 the Athenian describes virtue as the agreement between pleasure and pain and the account that one grasps or reason (653a). This description is in line with thinking that virtue is a harmony in the soul between the different psychic forces.
Another issue disputed by scholars is whether the soul in the puppet metaphor consists of three parts as it does in the Republic. In the Republic (see also, the Phaedrus 246a-254e), the three parts of the soul are: the reasoning/calculating part, the spirited part, and the appetitive parts. Some scholars defend a continuity between the Laws and the Republic, while others argue that the metaphor suggests a bipartition between the rational and non-rational. In other words, in the Laws, the non-rational part of the soul subsumes both the appetitive and the spirited part. Additionally, other scholars have argued that in the Laws, Plato no longer treats the soul as having parts, but more as a unitary agent with different forces in it.
c. Happiness and Virtue
Book 2 continues the discussion surrounding drinking parties and education. Musical education forms the foundation of one’s character because it is through song and dance that one cultivates the appropriate affective responses (654a-d). By taking pleasure in virtuous actions depicted in song and dance, one begins to cultivate virtue (655d-655b). The contrary is true too, one will cultivate vice, if one takes pleasure in vicious actions depicted in song and dance (655b-656b). Because of this, it is paramount for the legislature to establish what music should be allowed in the city—a task that the Athenian believes is best handled by the elderly given their wisdom (658a-e).
One of the most important things music should teach is that justice produces happiness, while injustice produces unhappiness (660b-664b). Clinias and Megillus are skeptical about the connection between virtue and happiness. Clinias will concede that an unjust person lives shamefully, but does not think they live an unsuccessful life if they have wealth, strength, health, and beauty (661d-662a; compare Gorgias 474c-475e). The Athenian will respond by offering four arguments for why it is necessary that the legislators teach that happiness is linked to justice. The first argument is that a legislator who does not teach this to the citizens is sending contradictory messages (662c-663a). On the one hand, the legislators are telling citizens that they should be just so that they may live a good life, but, on the other hand, they are teaching them that they will be deprived of a benefit—namely, pleasure—by living justly. The second argument is that a legislator who does not teach this will find it impossible to persuade the citizens to be just (663b-c. The third argument is that the statement is true—justice is linked to happiness (663c-d). The fourth argument is that even if the doctrine were not true, it ought to be taught anyways because of the social benefits that it provides (663d-e).
Having secured the importance of teaching the connection between justice and happiness, the Athenian continues his discussion of symposium. He explains that drinking parties and drunkenness should be reserved for citizens in mid-to-late adulthood and must be supervised by a wise leader. The young have lots of energy and are already eager to participate in musical education. Thus, participating in drinking parties would overstimulate the youth and would lead to negative consequences. However, as one ages, one grows despondent and less interested in song and dance. Thus, drinking parties will return older adults to a youthful state in which they are more eager to participate in musical education (671a-674c).
6. Book 3
Book 3 surveys the success and failures of different political constitutions throughout history. Readers should bear in mind that the historical accounts given by Plato are not entirely accurate, but are rather being used to illustrate certain philosophical points.
a. The Origin of Legislation
The Athenian begins by talking about the traditional idea that developed culture is repeatedly annihilated by a great flood. From this flood emerged a primitive culture. During this time life was simple and peaceful. Because there were so few people, individuals were delighted to see each other and resources were abundant (678e-679a). Despite not having any formal law, people lived according to a political system called autocracy or dynasty (680b). In this system the eldest ruled, with authority being passed down through one’s parents.
Eventually, small clans merged together and formed cities. Once this happened, conflict arose because there were different elders, each claiming to having authority. In addition, each clan brought with them different religious customs. From this conflict, legislation arose (681c). Individuals were selected to represent the interests of the various clans that comprise the city. These representatives spoke to the respective leaders of the about what rules should be adopted (681c-d).
From these digressions into the origin of legislation three lessons can be drawn. First, cities and civilization are a natural development. The Athenian is rejecting the idea that the city and law are unnatural (see 10.888e-890a; Protagoras 320d-322d; Republic 358b-359b). Second, humans are not naturally opposed to one another as Clinias suggested in Book 1, but share mutual goodwill. Third, a necessary feature of legislation is the reconciliation of conflicts of interest (see Stalley 1983, 71-2).
After discussing the rise and fall of Troy, the Athenian turns to the history of the three allied Dorian states of the Peloponnese: Sparta, Argos, and Messene. The leaders and citizens of each state bound each other to oaths to respect each other’s rights and to come to each other’s aid if they should be threatened. However, the allegiance dissolved with only Sparta surviving the fallout with any kind of success. Why did the allegiance fail? The Athenian asserts that it was the result of a type of ignorance that is the discordance between one’s emotions and one’s judgments (689a-c). From this, it is agreed that no citizen who suffers this ignorance should have any degree of power (689c-e). This returns us to the discussion of education in Books 1 and 2, where we are told that in order for a city to flourish its citizens must cultivate the appropriate affective responses.
Argos’ and Messene’s respective leaders suffered from this type of ignorance and the negative consequences of this were exacerbated by the fact that they had absolute power (690d-691d). Sparta, in contrast, was safeguarded from disaster because it distributed political power between multiple actors (or positions of power), including two kings (rather than one), a council of elders, and officials chosen by lot (called ephors) (691d-692bc). Here, the Athenian is introducing the key political idea that a successful constitution will distribute power by mixing various ruling elements.
c. Persia and Athens
Having described a moderate political system in Sparta, the Athenian discusses two states that stand as opposites to each other: Athens and Persia. Athens represents the extreme democracy and Persia the extreme monarchy. According to the Athenian, Persia fluctuated between periods of success and failure. Under the ruler of Cyrus, there was a balance of freedom and subjection. Soldiers were granted freedom of speech and the king took council from wise citizens. The result was that the soldiers had positive feelings towards their leaders and the state was guided in a wise direction (694b-c). However, upon the death of Cyrus, disaster ensued. Cyrus’ sons were raised in luxury and were never properly educated (694c-b). Instead of blending freedom and subjection as their father did, his sons were violent and demanded submission (695b). Eventually, Darius took control of the empire and this process repeated itself. Darius salvaged the empire by embracing freedom and subjection, but when his pampered son, Xerxes, took over, the empire suffered (695d-e).
According to the Athenian, the history of Athens is very much the opposite of Persia. If Persia failed because its rulers did not grant enough freedom, Athens failed because it granted too much. When the Persians attacked the Greeks, out of fear and necessity the Athenians lived according to certain honor codes that bound the community together. During this time, Athenians would voluntarily submit themselves to authority and because of this Athens was successful in its defense (698b-700a). However, once the threat from Persia was gone, the fear and honor codes that held the community together and naturally restricted freedom, left as well. Athenians began to consider themselves as the authority on various matters and let pleasure guide them. This resulted in a community of ignorance and excess (700a-701d).
The Athenian’s point is two-fold. First, if a political system is to succeed it must be a mixture of subjection and freedom. It must grant enough freedom such that citizens are not oppressed and do not resent the leaders, but follow them willingly. Indeed, the political system should be concerned about the welfare of the entire citizen body. Nevertheless, a political system must grant authority only to those who are wise since the masses will simply pursue what they find most pleasant. Hence, there must be some restrictions on the freedom of citizens. Second, the only way to consistently achieve a balanced political system is if the citizens receive a proper education.
7. Book 4
a. Geography of Magnesia
At the end of Book 3, Clinias reveals that he is one of ten Cretans assigned to compose a legal code for a new colony, Magnesia. Book 4 begins the construction of this new colony. Magnesia will be located on an isolated Cretan island, roughly nine or ten miles inland. Although the terrain is rough, the land has many resources. The Athenian is pleased to find this out because it means that Magnesians will not require a significant amount of trading with different communities. This is beneficial because it will restrict foreign influence on the city (704a-705b).
b. Colonists and Legislation
Colonists will mostly come from Crete, though individuals from the greater Peloponnese will be welcome as well. Initially, this poses a problem. Magnesia will consist of individuals with different cultural customs, so how can these be reconciled under a single system of law? The Athenian’s solution at this stage of the argument is that a moderate dictator and a wise legislator should develop the legal code and constitution (709a-710e). The advantage of a dictatorship is that the laws and customs can easily be altered since power is located in one individual. It should be noted that after the dictator and legislator create the legal code, power will be transferred to various officials.
The next project is to describe what constitution this benevolent dictator will create. No straight answer is given, instead the Athenian proceeds to offer a myth of life during the time of Cronos (Zeus’ father). The myth explains that during Cronos’ rule, life was blessed and happy. Cronos, knowing that human nature is corrupt, put divine beings in charge of humans. This is similar to how humans rule over farm animals. The lesson is that one should not be ruled by one’s equal, but by one’s superior. The Athenian explains that although Cronos’ reign is over and divine beings no longer guide us, within human beings is a divine element, namely, reason. By following reason, the laws will mirror the divine rule that occurred during the time of Cronos and humans will be happy (713c-714a). This myth connects the reader back to the initial topic of the Laws, which concerns the connection between law and the divine. The Athenian is explicitly linking together reason, law, and the divine.
From the myth of Cronus, it is clear that the law should be rational, but who should it serve and where does its authority lie? The Athenian maintains that any law that does not serve the interest of the whole city is a bogus law (715b). For this reason, those who hold political positions will be called servants of the law rather than being called rulers. Since the law is connected to the divine, those who serve the interests of the city are really serving the gods (715c-d). From this it is clear that the law is to have authority over all citizens and that the law is fundamentally concerned about the welfare of the whole community and not any particular group or individual.
The initial framing of the laws comes directly from the legislator and the dictator. The Athenian remarks that this is the best and most efficient means to establishing good laws in the city. But if law comes entirely from the outside, why would a citizen follow it willingly? How is the Athenian not simply making the same mistake he accused the Persian leaders of making? The Athenian solves this problem by inventing the idea of a prelude in law.
He begins his explanation with a medical analogy in which he compares the medical practices of a free doctor with that of a slave doctor (720a-720e). The doctors differ in terms of whom they treat and how they treat them. The slave doctor primarily treats slaves and acts like a tyrant—simply issuing commands and forcing his patients into obedience. In contrast, the free doctor primarily treats free people and is attentive to his patients before he issues prescriptions. In fact, the free doctor will offer no prescription until he has persuaded his patient about what is the correct medical procedure. The slave doctor is like a tyrant, relying solely on compulsion; in contrast, the free doctor utilizes both persuasion and compulsion. The Athenian wants the legislator to be like the free doctor, using both persuasion and compulsion.
Persuasion is achieved by attaching preludes to the law. In musical compositions, preludes are brief musical performances that precede the main composition. Musical preludes are designed to complement the forthcoming performance so that it is better received by the audience. Similarly, the legislator can preface the law with brief statements that will make the citizens more cooperative and ready to learn, and thus more likely to accept the laws freely (722d-723a). Compulsion is achieved by attaching penalties to the law if citizens should choose not to comply.
The Athenian clearly wants citizens to obey the law voluntarily. He realizes that in order for this to happen the citizens must see the law as serving their interests and the preludes are meant to accomplish this. But what is the nature of the persuasion underlying the preludes? There are three main interpretations. The first interpretation is that the persuasion is rational. Defenders of this view maintain that the point of the preludes is to explain to citizens the actual reasons that underlie the law. The evidence in favor of this reading is mainly found in how the Athenian describes the preludes. When discussing the preludes, the Athenian repeatedly says that they involve teaching, learning, and reason (4.718c-d, 4.720d, 4.723a, 9.857d-e, 9.858d, and 10.888a). If this interpretation is correct, then the Laws presents a much more optimistic view of the average citizen than the Republic does. In the Republic, farmers and artisans do not receive philosophical training, but on this reading the citizens of Magnesia will come to grasp some of the underlying philosophical reasons behind the law.
The second interpretation holds that the persuasion is non-rational and does not appeal to citizens’ reason, but rather their emotion. The main evidence in support of this reading is found in the preludes themselves. Many (though not all) of the preludes are like conventional sermons, merely shaming the citizens into obedience. A favorite example of those who support the non-rational reading is the prelude to hunting laws. In this prelude, the Athenian simply asserts that only hunting land animals with horses, dogs, or on foot is worthy of courage, and that other forms of hunting such as trapping, are lazy and should not be done (7.823d-824b; see also 5.726a-734e, 6.772e-773c, 9.854b-c, 10.904e-905c, and 11.927a-d). The Athenian makes no attempt to explain why some forms of hunting are lazy, while others are courageous, nor does he explain why a lazy form of hunting is bad and not simply an efficient use of one’s time.
The third interpretation lies in the middle of the first two, it attempts to reconcile the rational and non-rational readings. Suppose that the preludes are described by the Athenian as appealing to reason and suppose that the actual preludes do not appeal to reason, but instead emotion. What could explain this inconsistency? Two answers present themselves and represent the main readings that could be classified as being in the middle. The first is that the Stranger is using the description of the preludes to offer an ideal of law according to which the citizens freely and rationally obey the law. However, due to the psychological limitations of humans, the actual preludes will not live up to this ideal. The second answer is more pragmatic. The Athenian wants citizens to be motivated to obey the law. He recognizes that citizens will be diverse in both their interests and intellectual abilities. Because of this, the lawgiver will have to appeal to different types of things in order to motivate citizens, some being rational, while others being non-rational.
8. Book 5
Having explained the concept of a prelude, the Athenian proceeds to offer a prelude which will preface the entire legal code of Magnesia. This prelude provides the moral foundation for the city, explaining the general duties of the citizens. These duties fall under three main headings: to the soul, to the body, and to other citizens. The prelude ends with an attempt to show that the virtuous life leads to the maximum amount of pleasure and the vicious life leads to the maximum amount of pain. Below provides an outline of the main ideas expressed in this section of Book 5.
The Athenian explains that the soul is the master of the body and because of this it should be given priority over the body. Nevertheless, most humans fail to do this, and instead pursue beauty, wealth, and pleasure at the expense of virtue, and as a result, they prioritize the body over the soul (726a-728d). Although humans should prioritize the soul over the body, they are also obligated to take care of their bodies. However, people do not honor the body by being extremely beautiful, healthy, and strong. Rather, they honor the body by achieving a mean between the extremes of each of these states. The same principle applies to wealth. Too much wealth will lead to feuds and greed, while too little wealth will make one vulnerable to exploitation (728d-729a).
Readers might find the idea of honoring the soul and body as being not only mystical sounding, but also wrong. After all, it might be good for me to be physically healthy, but it doesn’t seem like I’m violating a duty if I’m not. However, these oddities can be explained away if we consider three things. First, the Athenian’s division between honoring the soul and honoring the body maps on to the distinction he articulated in Book 1 between divine and human goods. Humans honor the soul by pursuing virtue. This is a divine exercise because the soul itself is divine (726a). Although the religious connection is important for Plato, this distinction is really between “internal” and “external” goods. Internal goods are the goods of the mind and character, while external goods are everything that is potentially good that lies outside the mind and character. For Plato, the value of external goods depends on the presence of internal goods, while the value of internal goods in no way depends on the presence of external goods. In other words, internal goods are good in every situation, while external goods are only good in some situations. Because of this, Plato finds it odd that humans devote so much time and energy to pursuing external goods and so little to achieving internal goods.
Second, Ancient Greek ethics is usually interpreted as egoistic in the sense that ethical inquiry centers on the question of what is the best life for an individual. In this framework, discussions about why one should become virtuous are put in terms of how virtue relates to well-being. In other words, the Ancient Greek ethicists argue that we have self-regarding reasons to become virtuous; namely, that virtue will help us live a successful and happy life. With this in mind, it makes sense that Plato would think that we are obligated to care for the soul and body, since the good life requires it.
Third, it is worth bearing in mind that the main ethical theories today have self-regarding features built into them and thus this idea is not entirely unique to Plato (and other Ancient Greek ethicists). The three main ethical theories today are virtue ethics (advocated by Plato), deontology, and consequentialism. Immanuel Kant, the inspiration for deontology, held that we have the duty of self-improvement, while consequentialism, in its most traditional form, holds that when determining how I ought to act, my own personal welfare is given a consideration.
After expressing that citizens ought to care for others, the Athenian offers a fascinating argument in defense of the virtuous life. The crux of the argument is that vice leads to emotional extremes, while virtue leads to emotional stability. Because emotional extremes are painful, it follows that the virtuous life will be more pleasant (732e-734e).
The Athenian aims to show that the virtuous life will lead to more pleasure than pain. In doing this, he hopes to undermine the all too common thought, that the life of vice, though morally bad, is still enjoyable.
b. Geography and Population
The remainder of Book 5 returns to discussing the structure of Magnesia. This discussion covers a wide array of topics, which include: the selection of citizens (735a-736e), the distribution of land (736c-737d and 740a), the population (737e-738b and 740b-744a), religion (738c-738e), the ideal state (739a-739e), the four property classes (744b-745b), administrative units of the state (745b-745e), the flexibility of the law in light of facts (745e-746d), the importance of mathematics (746d-747d), and the influence of the climate (747d-747e). The main philosophical ideas in this part of the book are covered in sections 3 and 4 above.
9. Book 6
a. Voting and Offices
With the geography and population of Magnesia established, the Athenian begins to describe the various offices in the city and the electoral process (751a-768e). The electoral process is quite complicated and difficult to understand, but typically has four stages: nomination, voting, casting lots, and scrutiny. All citizens who have served (or are serving) in the military will nominate candidates by writing their names on publicly displayed tablets. During this time, they are permitted to erase any names they find unsuitable. The names that appear most frequently will be assembled into a list from which citizens will cast their votes. This process will then repeat; the names of citizens who have the most votes will be assembled into another list. From this list, lots will be drawn to determine who gets the position. If the selected names pass scrutiny, they will be declared elected.
One might wonder what value casting lots adds to the electoral process, especially since the practice is no longer that common. In Plato’s time, casting lots was seen as a democratic process, while voting was seen as being more of an oligarchic process (Aristotle Politics 4.9.1294b8-13). The idea is that if all citizens are equal, then they all equally deserve to hold office; thus, the only fair procedure would be to have the office chosen randomly. To have citizens vote for a candidate, is to admit that some citizens are more qualified than others. Hence, the inclusion of lot casting is a concession to the egalitarian sentiment found in democracies.
This is most clearly seen in the Athenian’s discussion of equality (756e-758). The Athenian distinguishes between two types of equality: arithmetic equality and geometric equality (these are Aristotle’s terms, see Politics 5.1.1301b29-1302a8, Nicomachean Ethics 5.3.1131a25-5.5.1133b28). Arithmetic equality treats everyone as equal and corresponds to the lot, while geometric equality treats everyone based on their nature and abilities and corresponds more closely to voting. The Athenian maintains that geometric equality is the true form of equality since humans have different natures and to treat them as equal is actually a form of inequality. However, most citizens will not see things this way and thus the inclusion of the lot is a way to avoid dissension.
There are various offices described in Book 6, but three are worthy of note: the assembly, the council, and the guardians of the law. The assembly is open to all citizens who are serving or have served in the military. The main function is to elect members of the council and other officials, though there are other functions (753b, 764a, 767e-768a, 772c-d, 8.850b, 11.921e, 12.943c). The council comprises ninety members from each property class, totaling 360 members. The membership lasts one year and the main function is to conduct the day to day business of the state such as supervising elections and organizing the assembly (756b-758d). The guardians of the law are made up of thirty-seven citizens aged at least fifty. They will hold the position for at least twenty years and their primary function is to guard the law (752-755b). They guard the law by supervising both officials and ordinary citizens, by helping resolve difficult judicial cases, and by supplementing and revising the law. Within both the electoral process and the offices held, we see the Athenian’s attempt to develop a constitution that mixes various political elements.
The conversation abruptly shifts to the topic of marriage and child-rearing, with an aside on slavery. In continuing with his emphasis on moderation and mixed constitutions, the Athenian encourages people to marry partners who have opposite characteristics. Although people are attracted to those who are like them, citizens will be encouraged to put the good of the state above their own preferences. However, because citizens will find such laws to be excessively restrictive, the Athenian only wants to encourage, but not require, citizens to marry people with opposite qualities (773c-774a). If male citizens do not marry by the age of thirty-five, they will be subject to fines and dishonors.
These laws might strike one as rather draconian; nonetheless, one should keep in mind three things. First, the marriage laws in Magnesia are inspired by actual practices in Crete and Sparta. Second, the laws are less severe than the one’s expressed in the Republic in which there is no private marriage for the guardian class (that is, soldiers and philosophers). In the Republic, the guardians will consider each (appropriately aged) person of the opposite sex to be their spouse. Mating will be arranged by using a lottery. However, the lottery is rigged such that a select few will actually be controlling the sexual relationships so as to avoid incest, control the population, and implement eugenics (Republic 5.459d-460c). Of course, Plato does not provide the details of the marriage laws surrounding the working class citizens and for all we know these might have been similar to the ones in Magnesia. Third, for his time, Plato is actually progressive in his views of women. In Book 6, the Athenian advocates for the inclusion of women in the practice of common meals, an inclusion that Aristotle lists as something peculiar to Plato (Politics 2.12.1274b10-11). The Athenian emphasizes that a city cannot flourish unless all citizens receive a proper education.
10. Book 7 and 8
Traditional Greek education involved both musical and gymnastic training. Musical education includes all of the subjects of the Muses, subjects such as music, poetry, and mathematics. Gymnastics is education related to physical activity. It includes things like military training and sports. Books 7 and 8 provide the details of Plato’s account of education, which extends to both males and females. Education, for Plato, mostly comes in the form of play and its importance cannot be overstated. The following passage captures this idea, as well as Plato’s conservatism:
If you control the way children play, and the same children always play the same games under the same rules and in the same conditions, and get pleasure from the same toys, you’ll find that the conventions of adult life too are left in peace without alteration… Change, we shall find, except in something evil, is extremely dangerous (Saunders trans., 797a-c)
Below is a sketch of the main educative laws and principles.
a. Musical Education
The poetry and theatre allowed in Magnesia will mostly present images and sounds that provide positive moral lessons (814e-816d, 817b-817d). The underlying idea behind these restrictions is that humans will develop characteristics of the people they observe in poetry and theatre. If they see bad people doing well or acting as cowards, they will be more inclined to become bad and cowardly. There is a notable exception, however, in that comedy will be allowed as long as it is performed by slaves or foreigners (816d-e).
The Athenian’s policy concerning musical education extends the views discussed in Books 1 and 2 in two ways. First, the policies reflect the view that the character we develop is largely shaped by what we find pleasurable and painful. The art and entertainment in the city should be such that we take pleasure in good and beautiful things and are pained by bad and ugly things. Second, the inclusion of comedy reflects the lessons of the discussion concerning drunkenness; we can only learn to resist doing shameful behavior if we have some exposure to it.
All Magnesians will learn basic mathematics, with some advancing to study astronomy. This is significant because in the Republic, Plato says that it is through mathematics that we come to learn about non-sensible properties, which are the subject of philosophical thought (7.522c-540b). In the Republic, this study is commonly thought to be reserved for the most elite and talented citizens, while in the Laws a portion of it is given to the entire citizen body. This suggests that, on some level, all Magnesians will have some awareness of philosophy.
Physical education aims at achieving two things: (1) the development of good character traits and (2) military training. Because physical education is meant to provide military training, sports will be modified to emphasize this. For example, impractical and unrealistic techniques will be forbidden (796a, 813e, and 814d) and armed competitions will be emphasized (833e-834a).
It is clear enough how physical education could prepare one for the military, but how does it contribute to one’s character? There are two related ways in which physical movement affects one’s character. First, the Athenian argues that physical movement directly affects one’s emotions. For example, the Athenian insists that fetuses and infants must constantly be moved around so that their excessive fears and anxieties are purged (789b-791d). Another example of this kind of thinking is the Athenian’s claim that a moderate amount of physical hardship is required for children to develop virtue; too much luxury will make one spoiled and lack moderation, but too much hardship will make one misanthropic (791d-794a). Second, the Athenian maintains that humans take on the characteristics of the things that they imitate. Dancers will become graceful and courageous by imitating graceful and courageous movements, while they will become the opposite by imitating the opposite (814e-816e).
11. Book 9
In Plato’s so called “early dialogues,” Socrates defends the paradoxical claim that injustice is always involuntary because it is a result of ignorance. The evil doer actually desires what is good, so when they act wrongly, they are not doing what they actually want to do (Protagoras 352a-c; Gorgias 468b; Meno 77e-78b). We can break this paradoxical view into two claims:
Involuntary Thesis: No one is voluntarily unjust.
Ignorance Thesis: All wrongdoing is the result of ignorance.
In Book 9 of the Laws, Plato will grapple with both claims. On the one hand, the Athenian is adamant that the involuntary thesis is true, but on the other hand, he acknowledges that all lawgivers seem to deny it. Lawgivers treat voluntary wrongdoing as a more severe punishment than involuntary wrongdoing. Moreover, the concept of punishment seems to presuppose that the criminals are responsible for their actions and this seems to presuppose that they act voluntarily when they act unjustly. The Athenian, thus, faces a dilemma: he must either abandon the involuntary thesis or he must explain how the involuntary thesis is able to preserve the underlying thought in law that some crimes are accidental and others are not (860c-861d).
The Athenian refuses to abandon the involuntary thesis and attempts to resolve this difficulty by offering a distinction between injury and injustice. Injury explores what kind of harms were done to the victim and what the criminal owes to the victim, their family, or the state. Injustice explores the psychological conditions under which the crime was committed. He mentions three main conditions: anger (thumos), pleasure, and ignorance (862b-864c).
Although there is much scholarly debate surrounding this issue, the general idea appears to be that a criminal can harm someone voluntarily or involuntarily, but can never be unjust voluntarily. For example, I might intentionally bump my coffee cup so that it spills on your computer or I might accidentally do this. The former is a voluntary harm, while the latter is an involuntary harm. Accordingly, the former should be punished more severally than the latter. Nevertheless, even in the instance when I voluntarily damage your computer, I am not voluntarily unjust. This is because no one desires what is bad for them and injustice is bad for one, so no one desires injustice. If I truly knew what was good or was not overcome by pleasure or anger, I would not engage in vicious behavior because my soul would be just. Thus, Plato wants to preserve the voluntary thesis, while abandoning (or qualifying) the ignorance thesis by allowing for the possibility that anger and pleasure can move one to act unjustly.
Many scholars have pointed out that the Athenian appears to equivocate on the terms “voluntary” and “involuntary.” When discussing voluntary and involuntary harms the terms are used in the ordinary sense, reflecting what an agent actively or consciously desires and wishes. However, when discussing voluntary and involuntary injustice the terms are used in the Socratic sense, reflecting what an agent deeply desires and wishes. Hence, the ordinary sense only refers to conscious psychological states, while the Socratic sense can refer to unconscious states or what is entailed by desiring the good.
In any case, the Athenian’s overall point is clear. Punishment must not simply look to the harm that is caused, but must look to the psychological state under which injury resulted. This has the benefit of allowing for nuance when punishing agents since the degree of culpability can be found in the agent’s psychological state. An agent who deliberates and then kills someone should not be treated the same as someone who kills someone in anger or as the result of some unforeseen accident.
The Athenian’s distinction between injury and injustice accords with his commitment to punishment as a means of recompense for the victim and as a cure for criminality. The purpose of the former is rather self-explanatory, but more needs to be said about the latter. As the Athenian explained in Book 1, the purpose of legal codes is to make citizens happy. Since, happiness is linked to virtue, the law must try to make citizens virtuous. Seeing punishment as curative is really just an extension of this idea to the criminal. If justice is a healthy state of the soul, then injustice is a disease of the soul in need of curing via punishment. For passages that express this idea, see 5.728c, 5.735e, 8.843d, 9.854d-855b, 9.862d-863c, 11.933e-934c, 12.941d, and 12.957d. Unfortunately, the Athenian never explains how particular punishments will achieve this goal.
One might think that the Athenian’s curative view of punishment results in soft penalties, but this is far from true. Punishment will take six forms: death, corporal punishment, imprisonment, exile, monetary penalties, and dishonors. It is worth pointing out that the use of imprisonment as punishment in Greek society appears to be an innovation of Plato. One might wonder how capital punishment is compatible with a curative theory of punishment. The answer is that some people are beyond cure and death is best for them and the city (862d-863a). For Plato, psychological harmony, virtue, and well-being are all interconnected. Accordingly, the completely vicious who cannot be cured will always be in a state of psychological disharmony and will never flourish. Death is better than living in such a condition.
12. Book 10
Book 10 is probably the most studied and best known part of the Laws. The Book concerns the laws of impiety of which there are three varieties (885b):
Atheism: The belief that the gods do not exist.
Deism: The belief that the gods exist but are indifferent to human affairs.
Traditional Theism: The belief that the gods exist and can be bribed.
The Athenian believes that these impious beliefs threaten to undermine the political and ethical foundation of the city. Because of this, the lawgiver must attempt to persuade the citizens to abandon these false beliefs. If citizens refuse, they must be punished.
Clinias is surprised that atheists exist. This is because he thinks that it is well agreed by Greek and non-Greeks that certain visible celestial bodies are gods (885e). The Athenian takes Clinias to be too dismissive of atheists, attributing their belief to a lack of self-control and desire for pleasure (886a-b). The Athenian explains that the cause of atheism is not a lack of self-control, but, rather, a materialistic cosmology (888e-890a). Atheists believe that the origins of the cosmos are basic elemental bodies randomly interacting with each other via an unintelligent process. Craft, which is an intelligent process, only comes into effect later once humans are created. There are two types of craft. First, there are those that cooperate with natural processes and are useful such as farming. Second, there are those that do not cooperate with natural processes and are useless such as law and religion. Hence, Atheists hold that the cosmos is directed via blind random chance and things like religion and law are products of useless crafts.
The Athenian responds by defending an alternative cosmology, which reverses the priority of soul and matter. Readers should be warned that the argument is obscure, difficult, and probably invalid; let this merely serve as a sketch of the main moves in it. The Athenian begins by explaining that there are two types of motions. On the one hand, there is “transmitted motion,” which moves other things, but cannot move unless another motion moves it. On the other hand, there is “self-motion,” which moves itself as well as other things (894b-c). The first motion cannot be a transmitted motion or else there would have to be an infinite series of transmitted motion (894e). Additionally, imagine, for instance, that there was a complete rest, the only thing that could initiate motion again would be self-motion (895a-b). Thus, the first motion must be self-motion (895c).
Having established that the first cause is self-motion, the Athenian examines the nature of self-motion. He argues that a thing that moves itself must be said to be alive and whatever has a soul is alive (895c). In fact, the definition of soul is motion capable of moving itself (895e-896a). From this he concludes that soul is the first source of movement and change in everything and is prior to material things (896c-d). The Athenian asserts that if soul is prior to material bodies, then the attributes of soul (such as true belief and calculation) are also prior to material things (896d). Since soul is the cause of all things, it follows that it is the cause of both good and bad (896d). The Athenian concludes that since the soul dwells in and governs all moving things, it must govern the universe (896d-e).
The argument is not yet complete, however. At this point, even if the argument is sound, it does not establish that there are gods. At best, it only shows that there is at least one or two souls responsible for the motions in the world. The Athenian must show that the qualities that this self-moving soul possesses are divine and worthy of being called a god. This is what he does next by connecting the rationality of the soul with the divine and virtue (897b-899b).
The argument raises a number of interpretative and philosophical questions. One of the more tantalizing questions concerns Plato’s inclusion of a bad soul which is responsible for evil (896e). What is the nature of this bad soul and why does Plato include it? Most commentators have denied that the bad soul is anything like the devil; some hold it is cosmic evil in the universe generally, while others maintain it is located in humans. The inclusion of this issue is related to the problem of evil. The general worry is that if the world is governed by a rational, powerful, and good god (or gods), what explains the inclusion of evil in the world? Why would a rational, powerful, and good god allow for evil? Plato offers various answers. For example, in the Timaeus (42e-44d), evil is said to come from disorderly movements associated with necessity, in the Theaetetus (176a-b), evil is said to come from mortals, and in the Statesman (269c-270a), evil is said to come from god releasing control. Accordingly, the Laws is unique in that evil is explicitly tied to the soul. How we understand the nature of this evil soul will explain whether the view articulated in the Laws is compatible or incompatible with these other texts.
b. Deism and Traditional Theism
Having taking himself to refute atheism, the Athenian takes on deism and traditional theism. He notes that some youths have come to believe that the gods do not care about human affairs because they have witnessed bad people living good lives (899d-900b). The Athenian responds to this charge by arguing that the gods know everything, are all powerful, and are supremely good (901d-e). Now if the gods could neglect humans it would be through ignorance, lack of power, or vice. However, because the gods clearly are not like this, the gods must care about the affairs of humans (901e-903a).
However, the Athenian recognizes that not everyone will be moved by this argument and offers a myth that he hopes will persuade doubters (903b-905d). The myth declares that each part of the cosmos was put together with a mind towards the well-being of the whole cosmos and not any single part. Humans go wrong in thinking that the cosmos is created for them; in reality, humans are created for the good of the cosmos. After this, the Athenian describes a process of reincarnation in which good souls are transferred to better bodies and bad souls to worse bodies. Thus, the unjust will wind up with bad lives and the just will wind up with good lives in the end.
The first part of this myth is important for what it teaches us about Plato’s ethical theory. Ancient ethical theories are often criticized as being too egoistic; that is, they overly focus on the happiness of the individual and not on the contribution to the happiness of others. However, this myth reveals that, at least for Plato in the Laws, this is inaccurate. The myth moves individuals away from their own selfish concerns to the good of everyone generally.
After this, the Athenian swiftly dismisses traditional theism. He maintains that the gods are rulers since they manage the heavens (905e). But what type of earthly rulers do the gods resemble? If traditional theism were true, the gods would resemble petty and greedy rulers (906a-e). But this is an absurd conception of the gods, who are the greatest of all things (907b). Hence, traditional theism must be wrong.
Setting aside issues of how to understand Plato’s theology in the Laws, there is the general question of why Plato thinks impiety will undermine the political system of Magnesia. It is easy enough to see why the deist and traditional theist pose a threat. If the gods are indifferent to human affairs or can be persuaded, then either the gods do not care about citizens disobeying the law or they can be bribed out of caring. It is less clear why the Athenian is concerned about atheists, however. Although he thinks that cultural relativism is a consequence of the atheist’s cosmological views, he admits that not all atheists are vicious and some are good (908b-c). Whatever the answer is, it is clear that Plato thinks that belief in god is in some way tied to thinking that morality is objective. This is a surprising stance in light of the claims put forth in the Euthyphro in which it is argued that ethical truths do not depend on the gods. These two texts are not necessarily inconsistent with each other; nonetheless, there is clearly a tension that requires explanation (see Divine Command Theory).
13. Book 11 and 12
Book 11 and the beginning of 12 discuss various laws, which only have a loose relation to each other. Most of this section is relatively self-explanatory and does not warrant additional comment. This section addresses: property law (913a-915c), commercial law (915d-922a), family law (922a-932d), and miscellaneous laws (932e-960c). Within the discussion of miscellaneous laws, the Athenian discusses an important office, “the scrutineers” (12.945b-948b). The function of scrutineers is to audit the officials of the city and to punish them when necessary. The scrutineers play an essential role in the system of checks and balances in Magnesia. But what ensures that the scrutineers themselves are not corrupt? To ensure that the scrutineers are not themselves corrupt, they must be citizens with proven reputation for good character and capable of approaching matters impartially. However, if an official feels they are being unfairly treated by a scrutineer, they can accuse the scrutineers and a trial will be held to determine the truth.
b. Nocturnal Council
The Laws ends with a discussion of the “nocturnal council,” so named because they meet daily from dawn until sunrise (951c-952d, 961a-968e). The nocturnal council is an elite group of elderly citizens, who have proven their worth by winning honors and have traveled abroad to learn from other states. The nocturnal council plays three roles in the city. First, they will be in charge of supplementing and revising the law in light of changing circumstances, while still keeping with the original spirit of the law. Second, the nocturnal council will study the ethical principles underlying the law. This involves studying the nature of virtue itself, discovering the ways in which the individual virtues of moderation, courage, wisdom and justice are really one Virtue. In addition, members of the nocturnal council will study cosmology and theology. Third, they will explore how these philosophical and theological ideas can be applied to the law. They are to ensure that, as far as possible, the law is in harmony with the philosophical principles they have learned.
The nocturnal council will bring to mind the Republic’s philosopher rulers in charge of the Callipolis. How similar they are depends on what kind of authority is granted to the nocturnal council. In the Callipolis, the philosopher rulers have absolute power, but it is far from clear whether this is the case for the nocturnal council. Indeed, it is a subject of much dispute. The difficulty stems from the fact that a few passages suggest that the nocturnal council will be entrusted with unrestricted power (7.818c, 12.968c, 12.969b). That being said, much of the Laws issues warnings about unrestricted power (see especially 3.691a-d, 4.713c, 9.875a-b); thus, it would be strange for the book to end with a renunciation of this thesis.
14. References and Further Reading
a. Standard Greek Texts
- Burnet, J. (ed.), Platonis Opera. Vol. 5. (Oxford: Oxford Classical Texts, 1907).
- Des Places, É. and Diès, A. (eds. and trans.) 1951-1956. Platon: Oeuvres Complètes. Vols. 11-12. (Budé edn. Paris: Société d’ Édition Les Belles Lettres), 1951-1956).
b. English Translations
- Bury. R. G. Plato: Laws (Vol. 1 and 2). Loeb Classical Library, Plato Volume 10 and 11. (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press) English translation side by side with the Greek text.
- Pangle, T. The Laws of Plato, translated with Notes and Interpretative Essay. (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1980).
- A more literal translation of the text, matching English words and Greek words with precision.
- Griffith, T. Plato: The Laws. Cambridge Texts in the History of Political Thought, ed. M. Schofield (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2016)
- Saunders, T. Plato: The Laws, translated with an Introduction. (London: Penguin Books, 1970).
- A more stylized translation of the text that aims for readability. In addition, it breaks the text into smaller sections, offering a brief analysis of each.
c. General Discussions and Anthologies
- Bobonich, C. (ed.), Plato’s ‘Laws’: A Critical Guide. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2010).
- An anthology that surveys philosophical debates concerning the Laws. Chapter 1, authored by Malcom Schofield, provides a helpful overview of the Laws.
- Laks, A. “The Laws” in C. Rowe and M. Schofield, eds., The Cambridge History of Greek and Roman Political Thought. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998).
- A brief article that provides an overview of the Laws with a focus on political thought.
- Sanday, E. (ed), Plato’s Laws: Force and Truth in Politics. Studies in Continental Thought. (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2012).
- An anthology with chapters dedicated to each book of the Laws.
- Stalley, R. F. An Introduction in Plato’s Laws. (Indiana: Hackett Publishing, 1983).
d. Culture, Laws, and Context
- Cohen, D. “The Legal Status and Political Role of Women in Plato’s Laws.” Revue Internationale des Droits de l’Antiquité, 34 (1987): 27-40.
- An optimistic assessment of the role of women in the Laws.
- Morrow, G. Plato’s Cretan City: An Historical Interpretation of the Laws. (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1960)
- Details the various religious and political policies in the Laws, as well as placing them in a historical and cultural context.
- Nightingale, A. W. “Plato’s Lawcode in Context: Rule by Written Law in Athens and Magnesia.” Classical Quarterly 49 (1999): 100-122.
- Discusses the historical and cultural context underlying the laws of Magnesia.
- Nightingale, A. W. “Writing/Reading a Sacred Text: A Literary Interpretation of Plato’s Laws.” Classical Philology 88 (1993): 279-300.
- Offers a literary interpretation of the Laws.
- Okin, Susan M. “Philosopher Queens and Private Lives: Plato on Women and the Family.” Philosophy & Public Affairs 6 (1977): 345-369.
- Discusses how private property affects gender politics in Plato’s philosophy. Okin argues that Plato’s reintroduction of private property in the Laws results in more traditional roles for women than in the Republic.
- Peponi, A-E (ed.). Performance and Culture in Plato’s Laws. (New York: Cambridge University Press, 2013).
- Anthology that focuses on the culture and music in Plato’s Law.
- Reid, J. “The Offices of Magnesia.” Polis 37 (2020): 567-589.
- Saunders, T. J. Plato’s Penal Code. (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1991).
e. The Preludes
- Annas, J. Virtue and Law in Plato and Beyond. (New York: Oxford University Press, 2017).
- Baima, N. R. and T. Paytas. Plato’s Pragmatism: Rethinking the Relationship between Ethics and Epistemology. (New York: Routledge, 2021).
- Chapter 2 argues that the persuasion in the Laws is sometimes rational and truthful, and other times non-rational and deceptive.
- Buccioni, E. “Revisiting the Controversial Nature of Persuasion in Plato’s Laws. Polis 24 (2007): 262-283.
- Defends a middle reading of the preludes, which compares the use of rhetoric in the Laws to that of the Phaedrus.
- Bobonich, C. “Persuasion, Compulsion and Freedom in Plato’s Laws.” Classical Quarterly 41 (1991): 365-387.
- Defends the rational interpretation of the preludes.
- Laks, A. “Legislation and Demiurgy: On the Relationship between Plato’s Republic and Laws.” Classical Antiquity 9 (1990): 209-229
- Defends a middle reading of the preludes, according to which the preludes offer an ideal of law, but because of the psychological limitations of the citizens, the actual preludes involves are non-rational.
- Morrow, G. “Plato’s Conception of Persuasion.” Philosophical Review 62 (1953): 234-250.
- Defends a non-rational interpretation of persuasion.
- Stalley, R. “Persuasion in Plato’s Laws.” History of Political Thought 15 (1983): 157-177.
- Defends a non-rational interpretation of persuasion.
- Williams, D. L. “Plato’s Noble Lie: From Kallipolis to Magnesia.” History of Political Thought 34 (2013): 363-392.
- Argues that there is less political deception in Magnesia than in the Callipolis.
f. Ethics, Moral Psychology, and Political Thought
- Barker, E. Greek Political Theory: Plato and his Predecessors. (London: Methuen, 1960).
- A classic study of Plato’s political thought.
- Belfiore, E. “Wine and Catharsis of the Emotions in Plato’s Laws. Classical Quarterly 35 (1992): 349-361.
- Compares the moral psychology advanced in the Republic to that of the Laws. Argues that the moral psychology in the Laws shares commonalities with Aristotle’s view of the effects of poetry.
- Bobonich, C. Plato’s Utopia Recast: His Later Ethics and Poltics. (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2002).
- Examines Plato’s moral psychology from the Phaedo to the Laws and concludes that Magnesia is Plato’s new utopia.
- Bobonich, C. “Akrasia and Agency in Plato’s Laws and Republic.” Archiv für der Philosophie 76 (1994): 3-36.
- Argues that Plato does allow for weakness of will in the Laws.
- Klosko, G. “The Nocturnal Council in Plato’s Laws.” Political Studies 36 (1988): 74-88.
- Klosko, G. The Development of Plato’s Political Theory. (London, Methuen, 1986).
- Meyer, S. S. Plato: The Laws 1 & 2. Translated with an Introduction and Commentary. (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2015).
- Samaras, T. Plato on Democracy. (New York: Peter Lang Publishing, 2002)
- Part three discusses Plato’s political thought in the Laws.
- Sassi, M. “The Self, the Soul, and the Individual in the City of the Laws.” Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 35 (2008): 125-148.
- Discusses the moral psychology in the Laws.
- Saunders, T. J. “The Socratic Paradoxes in Plato’s Laws.” Hermes 96 (1968): 421-434.
- An influential article on voluntary wrongdoing in the Laws.
- Weiss, R. The Socratic Paradox and its Enemies. (Chicago: University of Chicago, 2006).
- Chapter 9 discusses Plato’s distinction between injury and injustice and relates it to the idea that justice is beautiful and injustice is shameful.
- Wilburn, J. “Tripartition and the Causes of Criminal Behavior in Laws 9.” Ancient Philosophy 33 (2013): 111-134.
- Discusses Plato’s account of moral psychology and its relation to Book 9.
- Wilburn, J. “Akrasia and Self-Rule in Plato’s Laws.” Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 43 (2012): 25-33.
- Presents an alternative reading of the puppet metaphor according to which it does not support weakness of will.
- Carone, G. R. Plato’s Cosmology and its Ethical Dimensions. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005).
- Chapter 8 discusses Plato’s account of cosmic evil in Laws 10.
- Mayhew, R. Plato: Laws 10. (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2008).
- Offers a line by line commentary and discussion of Book 10.
- Mohr, R. God and Forms in Plato. (Las Vegas: Parmenides, 2006).
- Chapters 8 and 11 focus on theology in the Laws.
- Powers, N. “Plato’s Cure for Impiety in Laws 10.” Ancient Philosophy 34 (2014): 47-63.
- Discusses how the context in which the Athenian presents his theology constrains the account given.
- Solmsen, F. Plato’s Theology. (Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1942).
- Trelawny-Cassity, L. “On the Foundation of Theology in Plato’s Laws,” Epoché: A Journal for the History of Philosophy 18 (2014): 325-49.
- Discusses Plato’s cosmology and theology in the Laws by connecting it to Plato’s methodology and ideas explored in the Phaedo, Statesman, Philebus, and Timaeus.
Nicholas R. Baima
Florida Atlantic University
U. S. A.