Reduction and Emergence in Chemistry
Most talk of reduction and emergence figures in discussions about the relation between different physical theories, or between physics and biology. The aim of this article is to present a different perspective through which to examine reduction and emergence; namely, the perspective of chemistry’s relation to physics.
Very broadly, reduction is associated with the idea that the sciences are hierarchically ordered and unified. As a universal thesis, reductionism takes physics to be the most fundamental science in the sense that the laws and postulates of all other sciences can, at least in principle, be derived from and explained by physics. Metaphysically, this implies that things like molecules, cells, chairs and consciousness are nothing more than the physical stuff of which they are made. On the other hand, emergence is often associated with the idea that the special sciences and their postulated entities, properties, and so forth are somehow novel and partially autonomous from physics. On this view, while the special sciences comply with physical laws, they are nevertheless autonomous, and their postulated entities are over and above physical ones. In this context, one cannot explain away molecules, cells and their respective properties by reference only to physical stuff.
The philosophy of chemistry examines in detail whether reduction, emergence, or some other notion correctly characterises chemistry’s relation to physics and, in particular, to quantum mechanics. The philosophy of chemistry illuminates possible ways of thinking of chemistry’s relation to physics, but also of reduction and emergence. Moreover, understanding chemistry’s relation to physics has important implications for how one understands the relation between other sciences. For example, biology often refers to chemical entities and processes in order to explain biological phenomena. Given this, examining chemistry’s relation to physics contributes to understanding biology’s relation to physics. Furthermore, the notions of reduction and emergence are associated with more general philosophical questions about the unity or disunity of the sciences, but also about the very nature and structure of the world. Examining reduction and emergence with respect to chemistry can contribute to these issues. A case in point is the nature and reality of entities and properties in special sciences. For example, if chemical entities are reduced to those of physics, then one could formulate an argument against the existence of chemical entities. On the other hand, if chemical entities somehow emerge from physical ones, then this may suffice to support the reality of chemical entities and of their respective properties.
Table of Contents
- The Significance of This Topic in the Philosophy of Chemistry
- Reduction in Chemistry
- Emergence in Chemistry
- Beyond Reduction and Emergence
- References and Further Reading
What one means by reduction and emergence can vary extensively, and there are positions which argue for an understanding of chemistry’s relation to physics in a manner that goes beyond the dilemma between reduction and emergence. Nevertheless, all positions can be understood as addressing at least one of two distinct, yet often overlapping, questions:
- The question of the relation of the formalism of chemistry to that of physics. This is an epistemic question because it focuses on the relation between theories of chemistry and theories of physics.
- The question of the relation of the entities, properties, and so forth that are postulated by chemistry to the entities and so forth that are postulated by physics. This is a metaphysical question because it concerns the nature of chemical entities, properties, and so forth.
Chemistry’s relation to physics is examined with respect to different theories, concepts, entities, properties and phenomena of chemistry and of physics (Hendry 2012; van Brakel 2014). Given this, ‘to speak of “the relation between chemistry and physics” is nonsense: a whole variety of possible intertheoretical relations have to be addressed’ (van Brakel 2014: 34). Both chemistry and physics, understood as scientific disciplines, encompass various sub-disciplines and theories which have, among other things, distinct explanatory and heuristic goals. In light of this, various theories have been examined in the context of chemistry’s relation to physics, including: (a) the relation between thermodynamics and statistical mechanics (Hendry 2012: 369; Needham 2009); (b) the relation of chemistry to quantum mechanics; and, (c) the relation of organic chemistry to quantum chemistry (Goodwin 2013).
Given the above, it is not surprising that the relation between chemistry and physics involves examining the relation between different sets of entities, properties, and so forth that the relevant theories postulate. For example, chemistry’s relation to quantum mechanics has been examined with respect to (a) chemical elements and the periodic table (Scerri 2012b: 75-76); (b) molecular structure (Hendry 2010b; Weininger 194; Woolley 1976); (c) orbitals (Villani et al. 2018); (d) chemical reaction rates (Hettema 2017: 69-86); and (e) the chemical bond (Hendry 2008; Weisberg 2008). Another feature of chemistry’s relation to physics concerns examining how macroscopic substances are related to their constituents (van Brakel 2014: 34). Also, another feature involves examining the relation between the ‘vernacular and scientific use of substance names’ (van Brakel 2014: 34).
While none of the above features of chemistry’s relation to physics are independent from each other, each of them deserves its own article, as each involves addressing issues unique to its specific domain of inquiry. Given this, as well as the fact that reduction and emergence are mostly investigated with respect to chemistry’s relation to quantum mechanics, this article reviews reduction and emergence in the context of how chemistry and its postulated chemical entities relate to quantum mechanics and its postulated entities.
Before presenting the existing views on chemistry’s relation to quantum mechanics, it is useful to briefly specify the subject matter of the two relevant sciences. Chemistry is concerned with the composition and transformation of matter into new substances. It achieves the description, explanation, and prediction of the composition and reaction of matter by reference to entities, properties, and so forth that the theory postulates. In other words, chemistry uses concepts which are characteristic of the chemical description and which allegedly refer to entities, properties, and so forth that determine how matter is composed and reacts. Phenomena that are within the purview of chemistry are the rusting of metals, the properties of atoms and molecules, the boiling of water and the volatility of mercury. Quantum mechanics is the non-relativistic theory that describes microscopic systems (Palgrave Macmillan Ltd 2004: 1863). It is distinct from relativistic quantum mechanics and from quantum field theory. Quantum mechanics achieves the description, explanation, and prediction of microscopic systems by reference to entities and properties that the theory postulates. Phenomena that are within the purview of quantum mechanics are black-body radiation, the double-slit experiment, and the behaviour of a free particle under a magnetic field.
Note that quantum chemistry plays a very important role in understanding the relation between chemistry and quantum mechanics. In the Dictionary of Physics quantum chemistry is defined as the ‘branch of theoretical chemistry in which the methods of quantum mechanics are applied to chemical problems’ (Palgrave Macmillan Ltd 2004: 1845; see also Gavroglu and Simões 2012). In the literature on chemistry’s relation to quantum mechanics, it is not clear whether quantum chemistry is regarded as part of the higher-level theory or the lower-level one (that is, chemistry and quantum mechanics respectively). For example, Goodwin (2013) refers to the relation of quantum chemistry to quantum mechanics, implicitly suggesting that quantum chemistry is the higher-level (chemical) theory. On the other hand, there are philosophers of chemistry who compare the explanatory and predictive success of quantum chemistry with that of chemistry proper, thus implicitly suggesting that quantum chemistry is the lower-level theory.
2. The Significance of This Topic in the Philosophy of Chemistry
According to some members of the philosophy of chemistry community, chemistry is a special science that has not been considered in much detail with respect to its relation with other sciences, including physics (Scerri and Fisher 2015: 3). This is because the philosophy of science and the philosophy of physics take the relation between chemistry and physics to be an unproblematic relation of subordination of the former to the latter (for example van Brakel 2014: 13; Bensaude-Vincent 2008: 16). Epistemically, this broadly means that the descriptions, explanations, and predictions of phenomena that are provided by chemistry can at least in principle be derived from the theories of physics. Metaphysically, this broadly means that the entities, properties, and so forth that are postulated by chemistry are nothing over and above physical entities and properties.
There are two main reasons why physics may be considered ‘ontologically prior’ to chemistry (Hendry 2012: 367). First, if one takes physics to examine those things that make up chemical entities and properties, then this establishes the priority of physics in virtue of the existence of a mereological relation between chemical and physical entities (Hendry 2012: 367). Secondly, physics is considered a universal science in the sense that it sets out, at least in principle, to describe, explain, and predict everything in the world, and not just some subset of phenomena, like chemistry does (Hendry 2012: 367). Dirac’s famous quote is indicative of this stance towards chemistry and of chemistry’s status compared to physics:
The underlying physical laws necessary for the mathematical theory of a large part of physics and the whole of chemistry are thus completely known, and the difficulty is only that the exact application of these laws leads to equations much too complicated to be soluble. (1929: 714)
In light of this, some members of the community take the investigation of chemistry’s relation to physics to be a central issue in the philosophy of chemistry, as the answer that one gives with respect to this issue determines whether, and in what sense, chemistry is an autonomous scientific discipline (Chang 2015; Lombardi and Labarca 2005). For example, Chang states that
the relationship between physics and chemistry is one of the perennial foundational issues in the philosophy of chemistry. It concerns the very existence and identity of chemistry as an independent scientific discipline. Chemistry is also the most immediate territory that physics must conquer if its “imperialistic” claim to be the foundation for all sciences is to have any promise. (Chang 2015: 193)
Some members of the philosophy of chemistry community take the investigation of chemistry’s relation to physics to be central not only for establishing the autonomy of chemistry, but also for ensuring the legitimacy of the philosophy of chemistry as a worthwhile and autonomous field of philosophy (in particular see Lombardi and Labarca 2005; Lombardi and Labarca 2007; Scerri and Fisher 2015; Schummer 2014a: 1-2; van Brakel 1999). For example, Scerri and Fisher state that
the philosophy of chemistry had been mostly ignored as a field, in contrast to that of physics and, later, biology. This seems to have been due to a rather conservative, and at times implicitly reductionist, philosophy of physics whose voice seemed to speak for the general philosophy of science. It has taken an enormous effort by dedicated scholars around the globe to get beyond the idea that chemistry merely provides case studies for established metaphysical and epistemological doctrines in the philosophy of physics. These efforts have resulted in both definitive declarations of the philosophy of chemistry to be an autonomous field of inquiry and a number of edited volumes and monographs. (2015: 3)
Lombardi and Labarca state something similar regarding the ‘traditional assumption’ of reduction:
This traditional assumption not only deprives the philosophy of chemistry of legitimacy as a field of philosophical inquiry, but also counts against the autonomy of chemistry as a scientific discipline: whereas physics turns out to be a ‘fundamental’ science that describes reality in its deepest aspects, chemistry is conceived as a mere ‘phenomenological’ science, that only describes phenomena as they appear to us. (2005: 126)
Given the above, it is no surprise that chemistry’s relation to physics has received such attention in the philosophy of chemistry. This does not mean that all philosophers who investigate the relation of chemistry to physics do so with the intention of defending the legitimacy of the philosophy of chemistry or the autonomy of chemistry. In fact, many examine the question of chemistry’s relation to physics because they take it to be relevant to the investigation of other philosophical issues, such as the reality of chemical entities and the relation between biology and physics. For example, Needham believes that views regarding biology’s reduction to physics, as they are discussed in the philosophy of mind and biology, presuppose the successful reduction of chemistry to physics (Needham 1999: 169). Therefore, the question of the relation of chemistry to physics is central not only for chemistry and the philosophy of chemistry in the manner outlined above, but also for the sciences and general philosophy as well.
3. Reduction in Chemistry
Discussion of reduction with respect to chemistry primarily occurs in the context of the distinction between epistemological and ontological reduction. In the philosophy of chemistry, epistemological reduction requires ‘that the laws of chemistry be derivable from those of physics’ (Hendry and Needham 2007: 339). Ontological reduction ‘requires only that chemical properties are determined by “more fundamental” properties’ (Hendry and Needham 2007: 339). By and large, this distinction is accepted in the literature, though there are philosophers that argue that this distinction is not helpful in spelling out correctly the relation between the two theories (Needham 2010: 169; Hettema 2012b: 164). It is worth noting that Hendry and Needham prefer using the term ‘intertheoretic reduction’ instead of ‘epistemological reduction’ as they think that the former term captures best the sort of reduction that is investigated; namely a reduction which ‘involves logical relationships between theories, rather than knowledge’ (Hendry and Needham 2007: 339).
a. Epistemological, or Intertheoretic, Reduction
Discussion of epistemological, or intertheoretic, reduction primarily happens in the context of Nagel’s account of reduction. In the philosophy of chemistry, a Nagelian reduction is understood as requiring at least, in principle, the derivation or deduction of chemistry from quantum mechanics (Needham 2010: 164; Hettema 2017: 7). A Nagelian reduction consists of two ‘formal’ requirements, namely the ‘connectability and derivability’ of the two theories ((Scerri 1994: 160), see also (Hettema 2017: 7)). Moreover, the reduction of chemistry to quantum mechanics would fall under the cases of heterogeneous reductions. This is because ‘some typically chemical terms cannot be found in the quantum mechanical language’, thus requiring the existence of bridge laws (Scerri 1994: 160; see also Primas 1983: 5). A successful reduction would allegedly be sufficiently supported if the chemical properties of atoms and molecules can, at least in principle, be calculated by quantum mechanics ‘entirely from first principles, without recourse to any experimental input whatsoever’ (Scerri 1994: 162). Note that the latter form of quantum mechanics is often referred to as ‘ab initio quantum mechanics’ (Scerri 1994; Schwarz 2007).
In the philosophy of chemistry there has been debate on what the appropriate criteria are for a successful Nagelian reduction of chemistry to physics (see for example Hettema 2012a; 2017; Needham 1999; 2010; Scerri 1994). For example, Hettema claims that the use of the term ‘Nagelian’ with reference to the aforementioned understanding of reduction is to an extent misleading because Nagel was not so strict in his account of reduction:
Reduction is too often conceived of as a straightforward derivation or deduction of the laws and concepts of the theory to be reduced to a reducing theory, notwithstanding Nagel’s insistence that heterogeneous reduction simply does not work that way. (Hettema 2017: 1-2; see also Hettema 2012b: 146; Dizadji-Bahmani, Frigg and Hartmann 2010; Fazekas 2009; Klein 2009; Nagel 1979; van Riel 2011)
While Nagel’s account of reduction is the most widely discussed account in the philosophy of chemistry, there are other accounts from philosophy. They include Oppenheim’s and Putnam’s account of micro-reduction (Oppenheim and Putnam 1958; Hendry 2012: 368-369). Very briefly, according to this account of reduction, a theory T1 micro-reduces a theory T2 if (i) the phenomena that are explained by T2 can be explained by T1; and (ii) T1 describes the parts of the entities, properties, and so forth that are postulated by T2. According to Hendry, if ‘the micro reductive explanation takes the form of a deduction’, then Oppenheim’s and Putnam’s account is a kind of Nagelian reduction (Hendry 2012: 369).
Nagel, Oppenheim and Putnam take chemistry’s relation to physics to be a paradigmatic case of their respective accounts of reduction (Hendry 2012: 369). A large, though not the entire, part of the philosophy of chemistry literature discusses reduction by investigating whether these accounts of reduction correctly apply to chemistry’s relation to quantum mechanics. Popper’s understanding of reduction has also been investigated in the context of chemistry’s relation to quantum mechanics (Scerri 1998; Needham 1999).
The epistemological reduction of chemistry to quantum mechanics is primarily examined by looking at how quantum mechanics, via the Schrödinger equation, describes the chemical properties of atoms and molecules. Given this, it is useful to briefly present how quantum chemistry employs the Schrödinger equation in order to describe the chemical properties of atoms and molecules. This sub-section henceforth focuses on the non-relativistic Schrödinger equation since this is the one that is standardly employed for the description of atoms and molecules and that is discussed with respect to chemistry’s relation to quantum mechanics.
The Schrödinger equation is the ‘equation of motion for the wave function’ which describes ‘the state of a quantum-mechanical system, and (more generally) for the corresponding state-vector’ (Palgrave Macmillan Ltd 2004: 2029). The solutions of the time-dependent Schrödinger equation (Ψ(x,t)) are (potentially) the wavefunctions of the system under examination (that is of an electron, atom, molecule and so forth).
The generic form of the time-dependent Schrödinger equation is the following:
iħ ∂Ψ(x,t)/ ∂t = – (ħ2/2m)(∂2Ψ(x,t)/∂x2) + VΨ(x,t),
∂: partial derivative
Ψ(x,t): a system’s wavefunction
ħ: Planck’s constant
m: the system’s mass
V: potential energy
i: imaginary unit (square root of negative one)
If one assumes that a system’s potential energy is independent of time, then it is possible to solve the Schrödinger equation using the method of separation of variables (Griffiths 2005: 24). In this context, the resulting solutions are wavefunctions of the following form (Griffiths 2005: 24):
Ψ(x,t) = ψ(x)φ(t),
ψ: a function of position
φ: a function of time
Based on the ability to separate the variables of the Schrödinger equation, it is possible to formulate the time-independent Schrödinger equation, which is an equation independent of time and whose solutions are a system’s time-independent wavefunctions, ψ(x). These wavefunctions correspond to the stationary states of the system under examination.
The time-independent Schrödinger equation does not yield a unique solution (that is, one wavefunction) (Griffiths 2005: 27). It yields an infinite number of solutions (ψ(x1), ψ(x2), …), each of which corresponds to a different state of the system under examination. In accordance with the superposition principle, any linear combination of the solutions of the time-independent Schrödinger equation is also regarded as a wavefunction that represents a possible state of the system (Griffiths 2005: 27).
The stationary state of a system, through its wavefunction ψ(x), provides useful information about the total state of the system, Ψ(x,t). First, the probability density Ψ(x,t) equals ∣ψ(x)∣2. This means that knowledge of just the stationary state of a system, through the solution of the time-independent Schrödinger equation, provides the probability of finding the system at a particular region in space. Secondly, it is possible to calculate the expectation value of any dynamical variable of a state of the system through the stationary state of the system alone (Griffiths 2005: 26). Stationary states are states of definite total energy, E (Griffiths 2005: 26). Each solution to the time-independent Schrödinger equation is associated with a particular allowed total energy of the system (E1, E2, …). The wavefunction that is associated with the minimum total energy corresponds to the ground state of the system, whereas the wavefunctions whose total energies are larger correspond to the excited states of the system.
The time-independent Schrödinger equation for an isolated molecule provides an infinite number of solutions (that is, wavefunctions), each of which corresponds to different stationary states of the molecule. For example, a stable isolated molecule, in virtue of being stable, is said to be in the ground state. From this, it follows that it is represented by the wavefunction that is associated with the system’s ground state and that it has the minimum total energy.
The Hamiltonian operator plays a central role in the solution of the time-independent Schrödinger equation for quantum systems and isolated molecules in particular. When the system under examination is an isolated molecule, the Hamiltonian operator corresponds to the total energy of the molecule (that is, its eigenvalues are the total energy of each state of the molecule); hence it is called the molecular Hamiltonian. In principle, the molecular Hamiltonian operator includes all the factors that determine the kinetic and dynamic energy of the molecule. That is, it should take into account the kinetic energy of each nucleus and electron in the system, the repulsion between each pair of electrons and between each pair of nuclei, and the attraction between each pair of electron and nucleus.
Because of the mathematical complexity involved in the formulation of the Hamiltonian operator, atomic and molecular systems are examined within the framework of the Born-Oppenheimer approximation (henceforth BO approximation; also referred to as the adiabatic approximation). The BO approximation is a ‘(r)epresentation of the complete wavefunction as a product of an electronic and a nuclear part Ψ(r,R) = Ψe( r,R) ΨN(R)’ (IUPAC 2014: 179). The validity of the BO approximation is ‘founded on the fact that the ratio of electronic to nuclear mass […] is sufficiently small and the nuclei, as compared to the rapidly moving electrons, appear to be fixed’ (IUPAC 2014: 179).
Within the BO approximation, one can in principle formulate the Hamiltonian operator by positioning the nuclei at all the possible fixed positions. Each set of nucleonic positions corresponds to different quantum states of the system (hence to different wavefunctions) and to different values of the total energy, E, of the atom or molecule. However, in practice this process is not followed. By having prior knowledge of the quantum system that is under examination—for example, by knowing the chemical and structural properties of the examined molecule—only particular nucleonic conformations are considered when constructing the Hamiltonian operator.
The BO approximation is a feature of quantum mechanics which plays a central role in the investigation of chemistry’s relation to quantum mechanics (Bishop 2010: 173; van Brakel 2014: 31-33; Woolley 1976; 1978; 1991; 1998; Woolley and Sutcliffe 1977; Sutcliffe and Woolley 2012). It has often been invoked as putative empirical evidence for the rejection of chemistry’s reduction to quantum mechanics as well as for the support of the emergence of chemistry (see next sections). Solving the equation outside the BO approximation in order to describe atomic and molecular properties is currently investigated in chemistry and quantum chemistry (for example Tapia 2006). This implies that there are features of quantum mechanics which may further contribute to our understanding of chemistry’s relation to quantum mechanics (for example Woolley 1991).
Note that even when the nucleonic conformation is fixed in the manner represented by the BO approximation, calculating the solution of the Schrödinger equation remains a complicated task. Each nucleonic conformation is compatible with different quantum states of the system (and thus different wavefunctions). This is compatible with chemistry’s understanding of atoms and molecules because, even if the nuclei are fixed at particular positions, the electrons may behave in more than one possible way within an atom or molecule.
In light of the above, the Schrödinger equation is not solved analytically for all atoms and molecules. As Hendry states:
There is an exact analytical solution to the non-relativistic Schrödinger equation for the hydrogen atom and other one-electron systems, but these are special cases on account of their simplicity and symmetry properties. (Hendry 2010a: 212)
Instead, researchers have developed various approximate methods in order to solve it, most of which employ the BO approximation. In general, the development of computation has led to the proliferation of complex computational methods that solve the equation by following different mathematical strategies and by making different assumptions. These methods include the Valence Bond Approach, the Molecular Orbital Approach, the Hartree-Fock Method and Configuration Interaction.
Based on the above, there are philosophers who argue in favour of the epistemological reduction of chemistry to quantum mechanics. For example, Schwarz argues that ab initio quantum mechanics can in principle derive all ‘well-defined numerical properties’ of the chemical elements (Schwarz 2007: 168). Ab initio quantum mechanics refers to quantum mechanical methods that are ‘independent of any experiment other than the determination of fundamental constants. The methods are based on the use of the full Schrödinger equation to treat all the electrons of a chemical system’ (IUPAC 2014: 5).
While Schwarz does not examine chemistry’s relation to quantum mechanics in terms of a particular philosophical account of reduction (such as Nagel’s account of reduction), he advocates some sort of reductive relation between chemistry and quantum mechanics. He claims that the ‘difficulty’ of ab initio quantum mechanics to (in practice) derive certain chemical properties is due to the fact that ‘basic qualitative chemical concepts are so vaguely defined’ and ‘fuzzy’ (Schwarz 2007: 172, 174). Given the above, he believes that the periodic system is in a ‘transition phase’ from a primarily ‘empirical model of chemistry’ to ‘an understandable model based in physical theory’ (Schwarz 2007: 173).
The epistemological reduction of chemistry to quantum mechanics is alternatively supported by Bader’s Quantum Theory of Atoms in Molecules (QTAIM) (Bader 1990; Bader and Matta 2013; Matta and Boyd 2007; Matta 2013). The QTAIM provides a topological analysis of electron density through which one derives information regarding atomic and bonding properties. The QTAIM provides experimentally verifiable information regarding the properties of large molecules, by reconstructing their properties from ‘smaller fragments’ (Matta 2013). It is a scientific theory which ‘demonstrates that every measurable property of a system, finite or periodic, can be equated to a sum of contributions from its composite atoms’ (Bader 1990).
Bader takes the QTAIM to provide correct descriptions, explanations and predictions of the chemical properties of matter ((Bader 1990: vi), see also (Bader and Matta 2013), (Causá et al. 2014), (Hettema 2012a) and (Hettema 2013)). While Bader does not explicitly talk about the reduction of chemistry to quantum mechanics in philosophical terms, his account is regarded in the philosophy of chemistry as representing ‘a proper, (reductionist) basis for chemistry’ (Hettema 2013: 311). This is because, according to Bader and Matta, the QTAIM allegedly supports the claim that ‘chemistry is physics’ (Bader and Matta 2013: 254). However, Hettema argues that while Bader’s view of the QTAIM suggests that the QTAIM is related to chemistry in a manner that closely resembles Kemeny and Oppenheims’ reductive eliminativist account, the QTAIM fails to be a reductive theory of this sort (Hettema 2013). Moreover, Arriaga, Fortin and Lombardi argue that while the QTAIM manages to ‘provide a rigorous definition of the chemical bond and of atoms in a molecule, it appeals to concepts that are unacceptable in the quantum-chemical context’, thus failing to sufficiently support the reduction of chemistry to quantum mechanics (Arriaga et al. 2019: 125). Van Brakel makes a similar point, arguing that the QTAIM works only after postulating facts from chemistry (van Brakel 2014: 32), thus rendering it insufficient for the support of chemistry’s reduction to quantum mechanics.
b. Antireductionism with Respect to Chemistry
Many members of the philosophy of chemistry community reject the epistemological reduction of chemistry to quantum mechanics, as understood in terms of the aforementioned accounts. As Hettema states:
The idea that chemistry stands in a reductive relationship to physics still is a somewhat unfashionable doctrine in the philosophy of chemistry. (2017: 1)
Indeed, there are alternative and often incompatible positions in the philosophy of chemistry which argue, either explicitly or implicitly, against the reduction of chemistry to quantum mechanics. These antireductionist views can be divided into two main camps (Scerri 2007b). First are those positions which reject the reduction of chemistry tout court (Schummer 1998; Schummer 2014b; van Brakel 2000). That is, they ‘deny the whole enterprise’ of reducing chemistry to quantum mechanics on grounds that have to do with the unique methodological, classificatory or other epistemological features of chemistry (Scerri 2007b: 70). Philosophers that follow this antireductionist approach support, either implicitly or explicitly, the irreducibility of chemistry by arguing that chemistry, in virtue of being a science of substances which employs unique classificatory tools and concepts, cannot be reduced to a science which looks at the micro-constituents of those substances and which disregards the classificatory or methodological tools and concepts that are of interest to chemists.
In the second camp are those positions which examine in detail how quantum mechanics describes, predicts, and explains particular chemical entities, properties, and so forth (such as the chemical bond, molecular structure, orbitals and the periodic system). They consider how quantum mechanics describes particular chemical properties and through this analysis they implicitly or explicitly argue against the reduction of chemistry to quantum mechanics (Bogaard 1978; González et al. 2019; Hendry 1998; 1999; 2010a; 2012; Ramsey 1997; Scerri 1994; 1998; Woolley 1976; 1978; 1985; 1998; Woolley and Sutcliffe 1977; Weininger 1984; Woody 2000).
For example, Scerri evaluates the manner in which the Schrödinger equation is solved so as to yield accurate results about the properties of atoms and molecules. He claims that ab initio quantum mechanics has yielded relatively accurate results regarding the ground-state energy of particular atoms and has acknowledged the success of quantum mechanics in providing a mathematical analysis of chemical phenomena and in generating sufficiently accurate quantitative values of chemical properties such as bond strength and dipole moments (2007b; 2012). However, he takes that this does not sufficiently support the reduction of chemistry to quantum mechanics (Scerri 1994: 164). Specifically, the approximate methods that are employed for the solution of the Schrödinger equation—and without which a solution cannot be provided—involve the use of ad hoc assumptions which, in virtue of being ad hoc and reliant ‘on experimental data’, undermine the thesis that chemistry is reduced in a Nagelian manner to quantum mechanics (Scerri 1994: 165-168; see also Scerri 1991: 320-321). Note that Hofmann (1990) presents how models and approximations have been employed throughout the history of quantum mechanics for the description of chemical properties; see also Gavroglu and Simões (2012).
Scerri invokes the periodic table and the electronic configuration model as examples that support the failure of chemistry’s reduction to quantum mechanics (Scerri 2007b: 74; Scerri 2012b: 79-80; Scerri 1991).
Before presenting Scerri’s argument, it is useful to briefly define the chemical terms that his and subsequent analyses invoke. The electronic configuration is ‘a distribution of the electrons of an atom or a molecular entity over a set of one-electron wavefunctions called orbitals, according to the Pauli principle’ (IUPAC 2014: 317). An orbital, whether atomic or molecular, is a ‘(w)avefunction depending explicitly on the spatial coordinates of only one electron’ (IUPAC 2014: 1034). An atomic orbital is a ‘(o)ne-electron wavefunction obtained as a solution of the Schrödinger equation for an atom’ (IUPAC 2014: 124). Given that orbitals depend on the spatial coordinates of electrons, the electronic configuration of an atom provides a representation of the distribution of electrons in the atom. This is particularly important in chemistry because it serves as a basis for the explanation and prediction of the type of bonds that are formulated between atoms.
With respect to the periodic table then, Scerri’s claim is broadly the following. The manner in which chemical elements are ordered in the periodic table is partially explained and could be regarded as derived by quantum mechanics because quantum mechanics specifies the electronic configuration of the atoms of each element (Scerri 2012b: 75). However, there are certain features of the periodic table, such as the length of its periods, which are not deducible from quantum mechanics (Scerri 2012b: 77-78). Therefore, the derivation of the periodic table from quantum mechanics, and thus the reduction of chemistry, cannot be sufficiently supported.
Moreover, a Nagelian reduction ‘requires axiomatised versions of the theory to be reduced as well as the reducing theory’, which at least with respect to chemistry cannot possibly be argued for (Scerri 2006: 124). A similar point is made by Hettema regarding Nagelian reduction: ’chemistry is a field, whereas reduction tends to be a relation between individual theories, or between laws and theories’ (Hettema 2017: 1). Furthermore, quantum mechanics does not provide on its own ‘a conceptual understanding of chemical phenomena’ (Scerri 2007b: 74). Instead, chemists employ chemical models and theories in order to formulate sufficient descriptions, explanations, and predictions of chemical phenomena and properties. Another problem for the reduction of chemistry is that quantum mechanics is symmetric under time inversion, and thus cannot provide an explanation of why chemical entities evolve in time the way they do. It can only provide a ‘reductive description’ of chemical properties independent of time (Scerri 2007b: 78). In fact, while quantum mechanics provides numerical values to particular chemical properties, it does not provide a complete explanation of a system’s chemical behaviour (Scerri 2007b: 78).
Scerri also rejects the success of an approximate reduction of chemistry to quantum mechanics (1994; 1998). By approximate reduction, Scerri refers to Putnam’s analysis of reduction, which permits the reducing theory to be approximately and not exactly true (Scerri 1994: 161). That is, ‘the relationships postulated by the theory hold not exactly, but with a certain specifiable degree of error’ (Putnam 1965: 206-207). In this context, reduction is not undermined if ab initio quantum mechanics provides only approximate results of the value of atomic and molecular properties, as long as these results are accompanied by a specifiable degree of error. However, Scerri rejects approximate reduction as the errors ‘are seldom computed by independent ab initio criteria’ (Scerri 1994: 168). Scerri also examines approximate reduction in relation to Popper’s analysis of the reduction of chemistry. In this context, Scerri draws a very similar conclusion with respect to the approximate reduction of chemistry (Scerri 1998: 42).
Based on all the above, Scerri concludes that the reduction of chemistry is ambiguous since, depending on what the set criteria for a successful reduction are, chemistry’s reduction to quantum mechanics ‘is both successful and unsuccessful’ (Scerri 2007b: 76; Scerri 2012b: 80).
Other philosophers also argue that chemistry has failed to epistemically reduce to quantum mechanics by pointing out similar issues with respect to the quantum mechanical description of chemical phenomena (see Bogaard 1978; Hendry 1998; Hendry 2010b: 183; Primas 1983; Woolley 1976; 1998; Woolley and Sutcliffe 1977). For example, Primas argues that quantum mechanics is ‘incorrect and should be revised, partly because [it] seems incapable of rendering a robust account of concepts such as molecular shape’ (Hettema 2017: 53, see also Primas 1983). Bogaard points out that chemists disregard a number of features of the behaviour of subatomic particles when specifying an atom’s or molecule’s Schrödinger equation. These features include (a) the behaviour of subatomic particles (namely protons and neutrons); (b) the energetic contribution of the movement of the nuclei; and, (c) relativistic effects (Bogaard 1978: 346). Moreover, the fact that the Schrödinger equation is ‘adapted’ so as to provide an accurate description of each particular system challenges the view that quantum mechanics can, even in principle, deduce complete explanations of chemical phenomena (Bogaard 1978).
González et al. (2019) argue that there is a tension between the theoretical postulates of quantum mechanics and how molecular structure is understood in chemistry. In particular, Heisenberg’s uncertainty principle implies that a ‘quantum “particle” is not an individual in the traditional sense, since it has properties—those represented by its observables—that have no definite value’ (González et al. 2019: 36). Such a metaphysical understanding of quantum particles comes in contrast to chemistry’s understanding of molecular structure, which is defined ‘in terms of the spatial relation of the nuclei conceived as individual localised objects’ (González et al. 2019: 43). The failure of chemistry’s reduction is further supported by the fact that the Schrödinger equation cannot be solved analytically without the use of approximations and models (for example Bogaard 1978: 347; González et al. 2019; Hendry 2010b). These approximations and models are based on ‘theoretical assumptions drawn from chemistry’, thus rendering the quantum chemical description of complex atoms and molecules in a ‘loose relationship to exact atomic and molecular Schrödinger equations’ (Hendry 2010b: 183).
Lastly, Chang argues that since its advent, quantum chemistry was practiced in a manner that required the use of pre-quantum, chemical knowledge (Chang 2015; 2017). The views of Linus Pauling, one of the main founders of quantum chemistry, allegedly corroborate this argument, as Pauling took quantum chemistry to be ‘a direct continuation of nineteenth-century organic structural chemistry’ (Chang 2015: 197-198). Chang also claims that physics consists of many different branches and that the relation of those branches with more fundamental physical theories has not been decisively shown to be reductionist. In light of this, and given that chemistry’s relation to physics is examined in the context of a physical theory (that is, quantum mechanics) which is not the most fundamental theory in physics, one should not assume chemistry to be unproblematically reduced to physics (Chang 2015: 200; Chang 2017: 365). Thirdly, Chang looks at how chemistry is done in practice and claims from this that chemistry is very far from being ‘submitted’ to physics (Chang 2015: 201). This claim allegedly undermines the reduction of chemistry to quantum mechanics since quantum mechanics has never in practice been sufficient for the description, explanation or prediction of phenomena that are within the purview of chemistry (Chang 2015: 201-202).
c. Ontological Reduction
In light of the above objections against the epistemological reduction of chemistry, there are philosophers who have investigated whether it is possible to support chemistry’s ontological reduction to quantum mechanics in a manner that is consistent with the failure of chemistry’s epistemological reduction. Most notable is Le Poidevin, who formulated a detailed account for the ontological reduction of chemical properties which does not depend on the success of an epistemic reduction of chemistry to quantum mechanics. In fact, Le Poidevin accepts that chemistry has not been epistemically reduced to quantum mechanics and argues that, despite this, it can be argued that chemical elements are ontologically reduced to physical properties. He claims that the argument for the ontological reduction of chemical elements can be generalised to all chemical properties in the following manner:@
Chemical properties reduce to those properties variation in which is discrete, and combinations of which constitute the series of physically possible chemical properties. (Le Poidevin 2005: 132)
In particular, he takes that the discreteness of chemical elements as specified via the periodic table supports a combinatorial argument for their ontological reduction. According to this argument, ‘a finite number of fundamental entities combine together to give a discrete set of composite elements’ (Scerri 2007a: 929).
Le Poidevin’s argument is based on two premises. The first is the ‘combinatorial criterion for ontological reduction’, which states that
a property type F is ontologically reducible to a more fundamental property type G if the possibility of something’s being F is constituted by a recombination of actual instances of G, but the possibility of something’s being G is not contributed by a recombination of actual instances of F. (Le Poidevin 2005: 132)
The second premise concerns the ‘discreteness of chemical ordering’: ‘between any two elements there is a finite number of physically possible intermediate elements’ (Le Poidevin 2005: 132).
According to Le Poidevin, the combinatorial criterion for the ontological reduction of chemical properties is preferable to existing physicalist accounts regarding the ontological reduction of special science properties because it overcomes two insurmountable problems of physicalism. The first problem is the ‘vacuity problem’, according to which physicalism is in danger of becoming a trivial thesis depending on what one takes to be included in the domain of physics (Le Poidevin 2005: 121-122). The second problem is the ‘asymmetry problem’, according to which the supervenience relation, as postulated by physicalism, does not necessitate an asymmetric relation between higher and lower-level properties (Le Poidevin 2005: 122).
Scerri, Hendry and Needham are sympathetic towards Le Poidevin’s argument of the ontological reduction of chemical elements (Scerri 2007b: 76; Hendry and Needham 2007: 340). As Hendry and Needham state, the combinatorial argument establishes that ‘the discreteness of the elements is explained by the nomologically required discrete variation in a physical quantity, namely nuclear charge’ (Hendry and Nedham 2007: 34). However, all of them take that there are certain problematic features in Le Poidevin’s account.
First, the argument is allegedly not well-supported for all chemical properties. Scerri doubts that the combinatorial argument can be generalised so as to apply to all chemical properties because, unlike chemical elements, most chemical properties are not discreet (such as the solubility and acidity of elements) (Scerri 2007a: 929). Similarly, Hendry and Needham argue that the combinatorial argument is only investigated with respect to chemical elements, thus disregarding a large part of chemistry. This is a central shortcoming of Le Poidevin’s account because there are particular features of chemistry and of quantum mechanics which are often regarded as posing unique challenges to chemistry’s reduction to quantum mechanics. For example, the structure of molecules is a chemical property which some argue is not in principle derivable by quantum mechanics (Hendry and Needham 2007: 341-342). This is regarded problematic for the reduction of chemistry to quantum mechanics, whether epistemic or ontological. Another issue is how chemistry describes the rate of chemical reactions. Kinetic theory and thermodynamics play a fundamental role in explaining and describing the rate of chemical reactions, and thus need to be considered in the context of chemistry’s relation to quantum mechanics (Hendry and Needham 2007: 343-344). These are problems that concern particular chemical properties and which need to be tackled if any account of (ontological) reduction is to be well-supported for all chemical properties.
Secondly, Scerri takes that Le Poidevin’s attempt to circumvent any talk about the epistemic reduction between the two relevant theories is illusory. The latter takes that a ‘periodic ordering is a classification rather than a theory’, thus rendering his account of ontological reduction ‘theory-neutral’ (Le Poidevin 2005: 131). However, Scerri disagrees on this point as he takes reference to the periodic table to inevitably require the investigation of how chemistry and quantum mechanics are epistemically related (Scerri 2007a: 929). Hendry and Needham take this point a step further by suggesting that reference to a theory cannot be avoided when specifying the micro-constituents of chemical elements (Hendry and Needham 2007: 344). In fact, they argue that there is ‘a close evidential connection’ between epistemological and ontological reduction; one cannot entirely avoid the investigation of inter-theoretic reduction when seeking to provide sufficient empirical support to ontological reduction (Hendry and Needham 2007: 351).
Another objection to Le Poidevin’s account is that the combinatorial argument, even if correct, does not succeed in establishing the ontological reduction of chemistry to physics. The asymmetric relation that Le Poidevin allegedly establishes via his combinatorial argument establishes ‘only an asymmetrical relationship between the (actual) physical and the (merely possible) chemical’ (Hendry and Needham 2007: 349). Given this, such a relation does not preclude the possibility of chemical properties having novel causal powers, thus rendering Le Poidevin’s account consistent with non-reductive (metaphysical) accounts (such as emergentist accounts) (Hendry and Needham 2007: 350).
Hendry also offers independent support to the claim that chemistry fails to ontologically reduce to quantum mechanics, outside his critique of Le Poidevin’s account. Specifically, he assumes that ontological reduction involves the acceptance of the causal completeness of physics (Hendry 2010b: 187). Given this, it follows that ontological reduction is committed to the claim that only physical entities, properties, and so forth possess novel causal powers (Hendry 2010b: 187). Based on this understanding of ontological reduction, he argues that what he calls the ‘symmetry problem’ undermines the tenability of ontological reduction. The symmetry problem arises from the fact that, for any atom or molecule, the arbitrary solutions of the Schrödinger equation are spherically symmetrical (Hendry 2010b: 186). This comes in contrast to the asymmetry exhibited by polyatomic molecules and which chemistry invokes in order to explain many of their chemical properties, such as the acidic behaviour and boiling point of the hydrogen chloride molecule (Hendry 2010b: 186). The symmetry problem allegedly challenges the ontological reduction of chemistry because it undermines the tenability of the causal completeness of physics, namely the principle that every physical effect has a physical cause (Hendry 2010b: 187). This is because
- quantum mechanics is consistent with the view that the asymmetry of molecules ‘is not conferred by the molecule’s physical basis according to physical laws’ (Hendry 2010b: 187); and
- the symmetry problem ‘removes much of the empirical support that is claimed for’ the causal completeness of physics (Hendry 2010b: 187).
Lastly, it should be noted that there are positions which argue for the ontological autonomy of chemistry in a manner that is implicitly or explicitly incompatible with the ontological reduction of chemistry to quantum mechanics. This includes Lombardi and Labarca (2005) and Schummer (2014b) (see subsection 5b).
d. Alternative Forms of Reduction
Despite the arguments against chemistry’s epistemological and ontological reduction to quantum mechanics, there are philosophers who attempt to establish reduction. For example, Hettema states that ‘the widespread rejection of reduction by philosophers of chemistry might have been premature’ (Hettema 2012b: 147). Hettema argues that, contrary to how Nagel’s account of reduction has been understood and argued against in the philosophy of chemistry, Nagel was in fact not so strict about the requirements for reduction (Hettema 2014: 193; see also Hettema 2012a). In light of this, Hettema proposes ‘a suitable paraphrase of the Nagelian reduction programme’ which is ‘reinforced by a modern notion of both connectibility and derivability’ (Hettema 2017: 24) (italics are in the original text). Hettema’s position is a reductive account which advocates the existence of autonomous areas. Characterising Hettema’s account as a form of reduction is justified given the quotes just mentioned. Nevertheless, it should be noted that Hettema often refers to his proposal as one that advocates a form of unity (for example Hettema 2012b; 2017). In order to explicate his proposal, Hettema analyses the development of the reaction rate theory and presents, among other things, Eyring’s theory of absolute reaction rates (2017: 71-81; see also Hettema 2012b) (see also subsection 5a).
Needham has also investigated reduction and identified those aspects of Nagelian reduction which should be amended for a more convincing defence of chemistry’s reduction to physics to be achieved. As Needham states:
Chemistry is, perhaps, so entwined with physics that what would be left after removal of physics is but a pale shadow of modern chemistry. It is, perhaps, not even clear what the removal of physics from chemistry would amount to. (Needham 2010: 163)
Needham identifies the weaknesses of Nagelian reduction and examines whether historical developments in chemistry and physics are consonant with how reduction tells us that two theories are related (2010: 170). Based on such an analysis, he argues that it is possible to understand Nagelian reduction in a way that permits and takes into account the use of approximations in science (Needham 2010: 168-169).
4. Emergence in Chemistry
The emergence of chemistry was first discussed and defended by British Emergentists. British Emergentism defended the emergence of chemistry before the advent of quantum mechanics. With the development of quantum mechanics and quantum chemistry, the emergence of chemistry, as it was advocated by British emergentists, was mostly rejected in philosophy. However, in the contemporary literature the emergence of chemistry from quantum mechanics has been reformulated and supported on new grounds. Perhaps the most detailed and widely discussed account of emergence with respect to chemistry is Robin Hendry’s account of the strong emergence of molecular structure. However, there are also alternative understandings of emergence within the philosophy of chemistry.
a. British Emergentism in Chemistry
British Emergentism refers to a group of philosophers in the 19th and 20th centuries which is regarded as the first to provide a detailed and coherent philosophical account of emergence. Among the examples that British Emergentists invoked in order to support the existence of emergence is that of chemistry and in particular of chemical bonding. In particular, J. S. Mill argued that ‘the different actions of a chemical compound will never, undoubtedly, be found to be the sums of the actions of its separate elements’ (quote in McLaughlin 1992: 28; see also Mill 1930). C. D. Broad also advocated the emergence of chemistry on the grounds that it is not ‘theoretically possible to deduce the characteristic behaviour of any element from an adequate knowledge of the number and arrangement of the particles in its atom, without needing to observe a sample of that substance’ (Broad 1925: 70; see also McLaughlin 1992: 47; Hendry 2006: 176-180; Hendry 2010a: 210; Hendry 2010b: 185).
The putative empirical evidence that emergentists invoked for the support of the emergence of chemical bonding is the failure to deduce the chemical behaviour of elements from the entities and properties that constitute those chemical elements. Since one does not describe and predict how chemical elements are bonded to each other only with reference to the entities that compose them, then this suffices to support that chemical bonding is an emergent chemical property which exerts downward causal powers to the entities that constitute the relevant chemical elements (Scerri 2007a: 921).
The British Emergentists’ argument for the emergence of chemical bonding was formulated before the advent of quantum mechanics. According to McLaughlin, once quantum mechanics contributed to the understanding of atomic and molecular properties, including the chemical bond, the emergence of chemical bonding was no longer justified in the manner that British Emergentism advocated:
Quantum mechanical explanations of chemical bonding suffice to refute central aspects of Broad’s Chemical Emergentism: Chemical bonding can be explained by properties of electrons, and there are no fundamental chemical forces. (Mclaughlin 1992: 49; see also Scerri 2007a)
On the other hand, Scerri argues that McLaughlin is mistaken to reject the emergence of chemistry and rejects McLaughlin’s claims that
- there was no complete or adequate theory of chemical bonding before the advent of quantum mechanics; and
- quantum mechanics provided a complete theory of chemical bonding (Scerri 2007a: 922-923; see also Scerri 2012a).
In fact, Scerri claims that the quantum mechanical theory of chemical bonding should be viewed as continuous and as enhancing Lewis’s theory of chemical bonding (Scerri 2007a: 922-923). The advent of quantum mechanics does not refute pre-quantum, chemical theories of bonding, but rather offers a deeper understanding of chemical bonding. Chemistry remains vital in the description and explanation of the chemical behaviour of elements because quantum mechanics cannot offer by itself a complete account of chemical bonding and of the overall chemical behaviour of elements. While quantum mechanics provides quantitative information regarding particular chemical properties of elements and compounds, it ‘cannot predict what compounds will actually form’ (Scerri 2007a: 924). Quantum mechanics can neither provide an explanation of how atoms and molecules evolve in time, nor can it provide a complete explanation of their overall chemical behaviour (Scerri 2007b: 78). These two characteristics of quantum mechanics, apart from blocking the possibility of a ‘complete’ reduction of chemistry, also allegedly support the claim that chemical entities and properties emerge at a level ‘over and above what one would expect from the constituents of the system’ (Scerri 2007b: 77; see also Llored 2012: 254). What Scerri means by emergence is, however, unclear since he only specifies this notion contrary to physicalism and does not provide a detailed account of the emergence of chemistry.
b. Strong Emergence
Hendry formulates one of the most detailed and widely discussed accounts of emergence regarding chemistry. Hendry’s account focuses on a metaphysical understanding of emergence that has direct implications on the metaphysical relation between chemical and quantum mechanical entities and properties, as well as on the nature of molecular structure. His account of strong emergence is formulated in terms of downward causation, and the putative empirical evidence that supports his position is drawn from the manner in which quantum mechanics and chemistry each describe molecular structure.
According to Hendry, the structure of a molecule strongly emerges from its quantum mechanical entities in the sense that it exhibits downward causal powers. Specifically, ‘the emergent behaviour of complex systems must be viewed as determining, but not being fully determined by, the behaviour of their constituent parts’ (Hendry 2006: 180).
Strong emergence is supported by the ‘counternomic criterion for downward causation’ (Hendry 2010b: 189). According to this criterion, ‘a system exhibits downward causation if its behavior would be different were it determined by the more basic laws governing the stuff of which it is made’ (Hendry 2010b: 189). The manner in which quantum mechanics describes a molecule’s structure allegedly satisfies the counternomic criterion and thus supports the view that molecular structure strongly emerges.
In order to support this claim, Hendry makes a distinction between ‘resultant’ and ‘configurational’ Hamiltonians. A molecule’s resultant Hamiltonian takes into account all the intra-molecular interactions and is constructed using as input only fundamental physical interactions and the value of the physical properties of the entities (such as masses, charges, and so forth) (Hendry 2010a: 210-211). Given the resultant Hamiltonian, the so-called ‘Coulombic Schrödinger equation’ is constructed, which is a complete and exact description of the relevant molecule. However, the resultant Hamiltonian is in practice never used for the solution of the Schrödinger equation. This is primarily due to the equation’s mathematical complexity. Nevertheless, if the Coulombic Schrödinger equation were to be solved, it would not distinguish between different molecular structures (specifically that of isomers), and it would not explain the symmetry properties of a molecule. Instead, quantum explanations of molecular structure are based on the construction of ‘configurational Hamiltonians’ for the solution of the Schrödinger equation of a molecule (Hendry 2010a: 210-211). Configurational Hamiltonians are constructed on the basis of ad hoc assumptions which impose on the Schrödinger equation the molecular structure that is supposed to be derived from that equation. This situation satisfies the counternomic criterion because we did not recover a molecule’s ‘structure from the “resultant” Hamiltonian, given the charges and masses of the various electrons and nuclei; rather we viewed the motions of those electrons and nuclei as constrained by the molecule of which they are part’ (Hendry 2006: 183).
Hendry presents two examples that illustrate that the counternomic criterion is satisfied with respect to molecular structure. The first example concerns isomers (see also Bishop 2010: 172-173). Isomers are sets of molecules that contain the same number and kind of atoms, but whose atoms are arranged differently. This means that isomers differ only in terms of their structure. Isomers have distinct chemical descriptions and they are invoked for the explanation of a variety of physical and chemical phenomena. If one is to describe an isomer via the use of its resultant Hamiltonian, then the Coulombic Schrödinger equation is identical with the Coulombic Schrödinger equations that describe the other relevant isomers (Hendry 2017: 153). On the other hand, if one is to describe an isomer via the use of its configurational Hamiltonian, then the Schrödinger equation that is subsequently constructed, is not identical to those that describe the other relevant isomers. According to Hendry, this means that this example satisfies the counternomic criterion. He thinks it illustrates that the molecule’s behaviour, as this is described ‘by the more basic laws governing the stuff of which it is made’ (that is, via the resultant Hamiltonian) is different from its behaviour, as this is described by assuming certain chemical properties (namely, its structure) via the configurational Hamiltonian.
The second example that Hendry takes as empirical support for downward causation involves the symmetry properties of molecules. Similarly to the case of isomers, one cannot derive the different chemical symmetry properties from the relevant resultant Hamiltonian because ‘the only force appearing in molecular Schrödinger equations is the electrostatic or Coulomb force: other forces are negligible at the relevant scales. But the Coulomb force has spherical symmetry’ (Hendry 2017: 154).
As is the case with other accounts of strong emergence in philosophy of science, Hendry’s account of strong emergence overcomes the overdetermination problem by postulating that there are certain quantum mechanical effects which do not have purely quantum mechanical causes (Wilson 2015: 353). That is, accounts of strong emergence deny the causal completeness of the physical (CCP), which states that ‘every lower-level physically acceptable effect has a purely lower-level physically acceptable cause’ (Wilson 2015: 352). Instead of the CCP, Hendry proposes an alternative principle; namely the ‘ubiquity of physics’ (UP):
Under the ubiquity of physics, physical principles constrain the motions of particular systems though they may not fully determine them. (Hendry 2010b: 188)
This principle acts as a substitute for the causal completeness of the physical (CCP) which Hendry rejects and which is incompatible with his notion of strong emergence. UP allows for the physical principles (as these are formulated via the physical laws and theories) to ‘apply universally without accepting that they fully determine the motions of the systems they govern’ (Hendry 2010b: 188). According to Hendry, unlike UP, the CCP is not well supported by physics itself, and he follows Bishop in thinking it ‘does not imply its own causal closure’ (Bishop 2006: 45). Note that, given the rejection of the CCP, strong emergence, as understood by Hendry, is incompatible with not only some form of epistemic reduction but also with reductive and non-reductive physicalism.
A critique of Hendry’s account in the philosophy of chemistry literature is provided by Scerri, who argues that the putative empirical evidence invoked by the former for the support of strong emergence is merely a ‘theoretical rather than ontological issue’ (Scerri 2012a: 25).
c. Alternative Forms of Emergence
There are alternative accounts of emergence with respect to chemistry. These are mostly accounts which focus on the unique epistemological features of chemistry and propose an understanding of emergence that is primarily epistemic, rather than metaphysical. For example, Bishop and Atmanspacher (2006) formulate an account of ‘contextual emergence’ which they take to successfully apply in two separate cases: namely to the case of molecular structure and to that of temperature (see also Bishop 2010). With respect to molecular structure, they argue that quantum mechanics provides necessary but not sufficient conditions for the description of molecular structure. This implies that reduction is not the appropriate account to correctly specify the relation between the two relevant descriptions. In order to derive a lower-level (that is, quantum mechanical) description of molecular structure, one introduces sufficient conditions by specifying the particular context in which the relevant lower-level system is considered. This allegedly supports the claim that molecular structure is a novel property which is not derivable by the quantum mechanical description alone but rather emerges from it (Bishop and Atmanspacher 2006: 1774; see also Bishop 2010: 176-177; Llored 2012: 248).
Furthermore, Llored presents ‘a relational form of emergence which pays attention to the constitutive role of the modes of intervention and to the co-definition of the levels of organization’ (Llored 2012: 245). This is not a metaphysical account of emergence; as Llored states, his proposed account is ‘agnostic’ with respect to the ontology of chemistry and rather focuses on ‘what chemists do in their daily work’ (Llored 2012: 245). In particular, Llored looks at how ‘from the Twenties to nowadays, quantum chemical methods have been constitutively concerned with the links between the molecule and its parts’ (2012: 257) (italics are in the original text). Among other things, he presents and analyses the debate between Linus Pauling and Robert Mulliken who both ‘focused on the description and the understanding of the molecule, its reactivity, and thus its transformations’ (Llored 2012: 257). Llored argues that his proposed account of emergence is not one which advocates an asymmetric relation between higher and lower-level properties. Rather, both chemical and quantum mechanical properties ‘co-emerge’ (Llored 2014: 156). Chemical phenomena are understood ‘as relative to a certain experimental context, with no possibility of separating them from this context’ (Llored 2014: 156; see also Llored and Harré 2014).
5. Beyond Reduction and Emergence
Very few accounts consider the relation of chemistry to quantum mechanics without invoking some form of reduction or emergence. In fact, if we are to understand epistemic reduction and strong emergence as the two extremes of a spectrum of inter-theoretic accounts, then there is a variety of positions that have remained to this day relatively unexplored with respect to chemistry. Nevertheless, there are some philosophers who consider the possibility of understanding chemistry’s relation to quantum mechanics without reference to reduction or emergence. This section distinguishes between two main camps. First are those accounts which consider unity without reduction. Secondly, there are accounts which support the autonomy of chemistry without reference to some form of emergence.
a. Unity without Reduction
Two philosophers of chemistry have primarily examined chemistry’s relation to quantum mechanics in terms of unity without reduction. First, Needham examines unity without reduction by presenting Pierre Duhem’s ‘scheme’ of ‘unity without reduction’ (Needham 2010: 166). He states that
unity surely does not require reduction, intuitively understood as the incorporation of one theory within another. […] Consistency, requiring the absence of contradiction, and more generally in the sense of the absence of conflicts, tensions and barriers within scientific theory, would provide weaker, though apparently adequate, grounds for unity. (Needham 2010: 163)
According to Duhem’s scheme of unity, ‘(m)icroscopic principles complement macroscopic theory in an integrated whole, with no presumption of primacy of the one over the other’ (Needham 2010: 167). This implies that Duhem’s understanding of unity is incompatible with reductionism in the sense that it rejects that physics is the most fundamental science.
Moreover, Needham argues that positions on unity can be distinguished into four groups:
(i) Unity in virtue of reduction, with no autonomous areas,
(ii) unity in virtue of consistency and not reduction, but still no autonomy because of interconnections,
(iii) unity in virtue of consistency and not reduction, with no autonomous areas, and
(iv) disunity. (Needham 2010: 163-164)
Hettema engages in the discussion of unity with respect to chemistry and evaluates Needham’s scheme of unity (2017). In particular, Hettema takes that the first form of unity assumes a form of ‘reductionism in which derivation is strict and reduction postulates are identities’ (Hettema 2017: 277). Regarding the second form of unity, Hettema argues that it faces certain challenges. For example, in this form of unity ‘the nature of the “interconnections” is (..) not well specified in Needham’s scheme’ (Hettema 2017: 277). Moreover, ‘the theories of chemistry and physics are not as strongly dependent on each other as implied (though not stated) in position (ii) in the scheme’ (Hettema 2017: 277-278). Hettema rejects the third form of unity because it allegedly disregards the ‘idea that one science may fruitfully explain aspects of another’ (Hettema 2017: 278).
As already mentioned, Hettema proposes a novel account of reduction regarding the relation between chemistry and quantum mechanics (see subsection 3d). In the broader context of unity, Hettema takes his account to propose a form of unity that Needham’s scheme does not capture. Specifically, Hettema’s account does not support ‘a form of unity in virtue of reduction with no autonomous areas’ (in line with (i)) because, unlike (i), it does not require strict derivation nor the existence of identity relations between the reduced and reducing theory. Moreover, Hettema’s account does not advocate unity without reduction either. While he acknowledges that his account shares common features with non-reductive accounts of unity in the philosophy of science literature, he maintains that his account proposes a ‘naturalised Nagelian reduction’ (Hettema 2012b: 143).
Interestingly, there are two features that his account allegedly shares with certain non-reductive accounts of unity. First, Hettema takes his account of reduction to be compatible with an understanding of theories as ‘interfield theories’ which ‘use concepts and data from neighbouring fields’ (in line with Darden and Maull 1977) (Hettema 2012b: 160). In this context, absolute reaction rate theory is characterised as an interfield theory ‘where the theories comprising the interfield are in turn reductively connected’ (Hettema 2012b:168). There is no one-to-one relation between the reduced and reducing theory; rather there is a ‘net of theories’ where ‘connective and derivative links of a Nagelian sort exist between all these theoretical approaches’ (Hettema 2012b:168). As a result, the overall reduction of chemistry is specified in terms of a network of different theories that are reductively connected between them (Hettema 2012b:171). Secondly, Hettema takes his account to be compatible with Bokulich’s non-reductive account of ‘interstructuralism’, according to which two theories are related in virtue of the ‘structural continuities and correspondences’ between them (Bokulich 2008: 173; Hettema 2012b: 163). Indeed, Hettema identifies structural continuities in the case of the absolute reaction rate theory (Hettema 2012b: 171).
Lastly, Seifert (2017) advocates unity without reduction, arguing that chemistry and quantum mechanics are unified in a non-reductive manner because they exhibit particular epistemic and metaphysical inter-connections.
The autonomy of chemistry from quantum mechanics has been defended without reference to emergence in the form of pluralist accounts. Accounts of pluralism that have not been explicitly investigated with respect to chemistry’s relation to quantum mechanics are not presented here, such as Chang’s (2012). For example, Lombardi and Labarca argue for a ‘Kantian-rooted ontological pluralism’ which is based on Putnam’s account of internalist realism (Lombardi 2014b: 23; see also Lombardi and Labarca 2005; Putnam 1981). They claim that while the epistemological reduction of chemistry is in general rejected in the philosophy of chemistry, the ontological reduction of chemistry is more or less accepted (Lombardi and Labarca 2005: 132-133). They take the acceptance of chemistry’s ontological reduction to imply an antirealist or eliminativist view of chemical ontology and to undermine philosophy of chemistry’s relevance when it comes to investigating metaphysical issues (Lombardi and Labarca 2005: 134). In this context, they argue that a hierarchical view of ontology, where everything is grounded on more fundamental physical entities, should be substituted by a view of the world where ‘different but equally objective theory-dependent ontologies interconnected by nomological, non-reductive relationships’, coexist (Lombardi and Labarca 2005: 146; Lombardi 2014b).
There are various objections against this account of ontological pluralism (Needham 2006; Manafu 2013; Hettema 2014: 195-196; see also Lombardi and Labarca 2006). For example, Manafu argues that Lombardi and Labarca have insufficiently argued for the ‘equal’ reference of concepts that are postulated by different theories. This is because if a theory is reduced to, superseded by, or merely has different theoretical virtues from another theory, then it is not necessary that such a theory employs concepts that actually refer to things that exist (Manafu 2013: 227).
Schummer also argues in favour of a pluralist position. He claims that chemistry’s relation to physics should be understood in accordance to methodological pluralism (2014b). Chemistry and each of its sub-disciplines have distinct subject matters, pose different research questions and employ distinct methods and concepts. Even when it comes to concepts that are employed by both chemistry and physics, such as ‘molecule’ and ‘molecular structure’, Schummer argues that these concepts frequently have different meanings in each of the two disciplines and are employed in the context of radically distinct models, methods and research goals (Schummer 2014b: 260).
Given how chemistry’s relation to quantum mechanics has been investigated in the philosophy of chemistry so far, it is possible to draw the following conclusions. First, in the first decades of the 21st century, the philosophy of chemistry persistently argued that chemistry’s relation to quantum mechanics is not a reductive relation, as philosophers and physicists such as Nagel and Dirac commonly supposed. Another point drawn from this analysis is that one cannot correctly spell out the relation between the two sciences unless one takes into account the role of approximations, assumptions, models and idealisations in the two sciences.
Moreover, it is evident that more can be said about chemistry’s relation to quantum mechanics. There is substantial material from the philosophy of science which has not been considered with respect to chemistry and which could contribute to a richer and more accurate understanding of the relation between the two sciences. For example, given the alleged failure of Nagelian reduction, it would be interesting to examine whether a different understanding of epistemic reduction applies to the case of chemistry. Alternative accounts of epistemic reduction that take into account the unique models, idealisations, and practices that the special sciences employ would contribute to formulating a novel understanding of the relation of chemistry with quantum mechanics. Also, it is worth investigating whether chemistry and quantum mechanics are unified in a way that neither requires some form of epistemic or ontological reduction, nor collapses to a strongly emergent or pluralist worldview. Lastly, there are various understandings of pluralism which have not been applied to the case of chemistry and which could further support general accounts of pluralism in the sciences. All in all, more can be said about chemistry’s relation to quantum mechanics which can fruitfully contribute to one’s analysis of reduction, unity, pluralism and emergence.
7. References and Further Reading
- Arriaga, J. A. J., S. Fortin, and O. Lombardi. 2019, ‘A new chapter in the problem of the reduction of chemistry to physics: The Quantum Theory of atoms in Molecules’, Foundations of Chemistry, 21(1): 125-136
- Bader, Richard. 1990. Atoms in Molecules: A Quantum Theory (Oxford: Oxford University Press)
- Bader, R. F. W, and C. F. Matta. 2013. ‘Atoms in molecules as non-overlapping, bounded, space-filling open quantum systems’, Foundations of Chemistry, 15: 253- 276
- Bensaude-Vincent, Bernadette. 2008. Essais d’histoire et de philosophie de la chimie (Paris: Presses Universitaires de Paris Ouest)
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Vanessa A. Seifert
University of Bristol