Lucius Annaeus Seneca (c. 4 B.C.E.—65 C.E.)
The ancient Roman philosopher Seneca was a Stoic who adopted and argued largely from within the framework he inherited from his Stoic predecessors. His Letters to Lucilius have long been widely read Stoic texts. Seneca’s texts have many aims: he writes to exhort readers to philosophy, to encourage them to continue study, to articulate his philosophical position, to defend Stoicism against opponents, to portray a philosophical life, and much more. Seneca also writes to criticize the social practices and values of his fellow Romans. He rejects and criticizes, among other things, the idea that death is an evil, that wealth is a good, that political power is valuable, that anger is justified. In Seneca’s philosophical texts, one finds a Stoic who attempts to live in accordance with the conclusions he reaches through philosophy. Though Seneca admits to falling short of this goal personally, his efforts have long been one of the attractions (though some have found these to be distractions) of his philosophical works.
Lucius Annaeus Seneca was born in Cordoba during the reign of Augustus. Because of his birth to a provincial nobleman of low rank, Seneca was quite removed from the workings of the powerful Roman elite, yet the course of his life would come to be shaped by his relationships—sometimes inimical, sometimes friendly—with the early Julio-Claudian Emperors. He was exiled by Claudius and then recalled. He was friend and tutor to Nero. This relationship itself eventually soured, and Seneca, under orders from Nero, committed suicide in 65 C.E.
Someone familiar with Seneca exclusively as a philosopher is likely to be shocked by the details of his personal life. How, one may wonder, should Seneca’s argument that poverty is not an evil be understood in light of the fact that Seneca was one of the wealthiest men in the world? And how should Seneca’s commitment to and claims about the value of living philosophically be understood in light of the fact that Seneca’s own life was riddled with controversy and intrigue? On the other hand, one familiar with Seneca’s life may well meet with wonder the philosophical positions to be found in his philosophical works. How, one may ask, could the person who had positioned himself as the advisor to the young and impressionable (ex hypothesi) Princeps of Rome be the same person who upholds the private life as superior to the public? How could a man whose life story seems impossible for any but the most flexible character be the author of texts upholding the value of integrity and self-mastery as against mastery by one’s circumstances? These and many other questions make a clear view of Seneca difficult. This article attempts to provide a general sense of Seneca’s life and works that can serve as a starting point for understanding Seneca’s legacy. The aim here is primarily to bring the difficulties into view, rather than to resolve them.
Table of Contents
- Life, Political Career, and Death
- Works and Thought
- References and Further Reading
1. Life, Political Career, and Death
Although the general outline of Seneca’s life is known, that many details remain unknown is surprising given both Seneca’s fame during his lifetime and the volume of his writing. On many points of detail about his life, scholars must take into consideration the available sources, some of which are from centuries after Seneca’s death and others which are hostile to his writings, and reconstruct a plausible account. Seneca’s birth is one of many such examples. Seneca was born in Cordoba, Spain. His father, Seneca the Elder, was a member of the Roman nobility whose family had immigrated to Spain. Seneca spent his earliest years with his mother Helvia at the family estates in Cordoba while his father was away in Rome. We do not know with certainty the year of Seneca’s birth, but the evidence from Seneca’s scant references to his own life suggest that he was born no earlier than 8 B.C.E. and no later than 1 B.C.E. Though some uncertainty is inescapable unless new evidence is discovered, the most common estimate for his birth is 4 B.C.E.
Seneca’s father, also Lucius Annaeus Seneca (the Elder), was a Roman nobleman of the equestrian class. The Elder’s enthusiasm for Roman politics and his enthusiasm for his two older sons’ potential in Roman society are plain in his Controversiae. Also plain is his insistence that the path for his middle son, our Seneca, was to be the normal cursus honorum (course of offices) and not the life of philosophical study. Seneca the Younger thus came to Rome very early, likely by age 5, to begin his training for Roman public life. Seneca’s early education is likely to have been typical of Roman elites at the time—focusing on language (both Greek and Latin) and traditional texts. Though his father would have been eligible for certain Roman offices, he seems instead to have devoted himself to forwarding the careers of his two oldest sons, Annaeus Novatus (later named Gallio upon adoption by L. Junius Gallio) and our Seneca. The Elder Seneca did not pressure his youngest son, Marcus Annaeus Mela, eventual father of Lucan, to pursue a political career.
Little is known with certainty about Seneca’s early life, particularly his personal life. Seneca presents himself in his philosophical works in a way that conceals personal details, however, in some cases, those he gives can provide helpful insight. His references, for example, to his former teachers—Attalus the Stoic, Fabianus the Sextian, and others—give some indication of his advanced training in philosophy and rhetoric. Scholars have found these references to his training, though sparse, crucial for understanding Seneca’s particular philosophical approach. Seneca does not, however, say enough about his personal experiences in Rome to help scholars in developing a robust biography. Further complicating matters is the fact that while Seneca is mentioned in histories from the ancient world, including those of Tacitus and Cassius Dio and the biographies of Suetonius, Seneca’s life as a whole is nowhere a topic of sustained focus.
We know that Seneca’s political career had a slow beginning. By the time Gaius (Calligula) Caesar died in 41 C.E., Seneca (now roughly 45 years old) had not yet advanced to the rank of Praetor, a rank for which he would have been eligible many years earlier. Seneca’s delayed progress or delayed entrance into the cursus honorum has been a matter of much research and speculation and has been explained by one or more of the following: Seneca’s recurring bouts of poor health, because of which he is thought to have spent a number of years in Egypt; his increasing interest in a philosophical, rather than public, life; his emerging reputation as a rhetorical talent; the tumultuous political environment during the time from Sejanus’ rise and fall until the ascension of Claudius in 41. Whatever the explanation, and whatever Seneca’s political ambitions may have been, they were stalled when, in 41, he was exiled by Claudius to the island of Corsica, where he would remain until 49.
Although Seneca’s guilt is not clearly attested in our sources, he was charged and convicted before the Senate for committing adultery with Julia Livilla, the sister of Gaius Caesar. Seneca tells us in the Consolation to Polybius (13.2) that he had been convicted and sentenced to death by the Senate but that Claudius had spared his life. Claudius’ intervention, perhaps, along with some other uncertainties about the case, suggest that the case against Seneca was, despite the Senate’s ruling, not decisive. The historian Cassius Dio (60.8.4, and Griffin, 32) argues that Seneca was essentially a casualty in an attempt by Messalina, Claudius’ wife, to be rid of Julia Livilla. On the other hand, Seneca was clearly a friend of Julia’s family. Her sister, Agrippina the Younger, would later be instrumental in reviving Seneca’s political career. Whatever the case, the occasion of Seneca’s exile marks the beginning of his involvement with the imperial family, which guides the course of his life thereafter.
Seneca’s exile ended with the help of Agrippina the Younger, now wife of Claudius, in 49 C.E. Upon Seneca’s return to Rome, he became the tutor of Agrippina’s son, the young Nero. Seneca’s role in Roman politics after his recall in 49 was largely unconventional. He was at first known as the ‘tutor’ (magister) of Nero and later became (along with Burrus) an influential advisor and speech-writer. In our records he is variously referred to as Nero’s ‘friend’ (amicus) and tutor. Neither of these titles had historically been associated with much political power, but it seems that Seneca likely played an important role in governing Rome, at least in the early years of Nero’s rule. It is difficult to know just which actions were taken on Seneca’s advice and which were not, though some ancient sources credit Seneca with the good policies and blame Burrus for the bad ones. Whatever the details of Seneca’s contribution, the first five years of Nero’s reign—the ‘quinquennium Neronis‘—have been noted for their successes. Here again, though, historians are divided on whether the successes of the first five years of Nero’s reign were genuine or merely successes in public relations, for which Seneca would have been well suited. As Nero matured, though, he began to rely less and less on Seneca’s advice. Eventually, Seneca was named as an associate in the failed Pisonian Conspiracy to overthrow Nero. In 65 C.E., Seneca was sentenced by Nero to commit suicide.
The circumstances of Seneca’s death are reported at length in Tacitus’ Annals (XV.60 ff.) and with less detail by both Cassius Dio and Seutonius. Indeed, Seneca’s death has been a topic of great intrigue and disagreement. Upon receiving word of his sentence, Seneca is reported to have acted calmly. He cut his wrists and legs to let his blood drain, but this proved ineffective because of his frail condition. He then took hemlock, which was also ineffective because of his poor circulation. He was then placed in a bath to improve his circulation and finally suffocated from the steam. As he had specified in his will, he was cremated without ceremony.
The setting and circumstances of Seneca’s death serve as a window into the difficulties of understanding the relation between his life and philosophical work. On the one hand his death seems to be modeled on that of Socrates in Plato’s Phaedo. His last moments are tranquil. He is described as being calm upon receiving the judgment of Nero and then meeting his death, which was, it seems, was preceded by dinner and conversation with his wife, Paulina, and friends. During the ordeal itself, he attempts to calm his friends by telling them to follow the “imago” (“pattern” or “image”) of his life. Seneca here likely means the image of a philosophical life that he has crafted in his works. But that picture of his life does not always fit comfortably with the rest of what we learn from our sources. Tacitus’ account of his death illustrates this. For while Seneca’s demeanor and actions remind us of Socrates’ death, the life that precedes this end bears little similarity to Socrates’. Seneca seems to have crafted a philosophical death, but in a context of great political intrigue. Whereas Socrates dies, at least partly, for his refusal to become involved in Athenian political affairs, Seneca dies, also at least partly, for the failure of his political maneuvers. Seneca seems to have known the sentence of death was coming. He may well have been involved, as alleged, in the Pisonian conspiracy. After his account of Seneca’s death, Tacitus reports a rumor that after the assassination of Nero, Piso was also to be put to death, and Seneca installed as princeps. Tacitus reports that Seneca is rumored to have known of this plan.
2. Works and Thought
Despite Seneca’s turbulent political career, he managed to produce and publish a great deal. His most famous and widely read works are his Letters to Lucilius. The Letters contain much that is of interest to students of Stoicism in general and have served for many as an entry point into Stoic philosophy. The Letters also show something of how Seneca thought philosophical principles could shape how one lives. In addition to the Letters, many other philosophical works—collected under the title ‘Dialogi’—survive. These treatises, some of which are incomplete, include three Consolations (Consolation to Marcia, Consolation to Helvia, Consolation to Polybius) and philosophical treatises on specific questions, topics, or themes (On Anger, On Mercy, On Leisure, On the Constancy of the Wise Person, On Providence, On Benefits). Seneca’s extended work, the Natural Questions, investigates various meteorological phenomena from the point of view of Stoic natural philosophy. In addition to his philosophical works, eight of Seneca’s tragedies survive along with a work that satirizes the deification of Claudius (The Apocoloycyntosis or ‘Pumpkinification’ of Claudius). It is known that Seneca wrote many other works that have been lost, including the public speeches that he wrote for Nero.
a. Seneca and Stoicism
Seneca’s philosophical outlook is best understood in terms of his particular circumstances. He, like many Roman philosophers of his time, was more interested in moral philosophy than in the other two branches of philosophy (dialectic, or logic, and physics) that had become standard in Hellenistic thinking about the parts of philosophy. While Seneca is clearly well-trained and widely read in all parts of philosophy, he chooses to focus on moral philosophy in his texts. With the exception of the Natural Questions, which is devoted entirely to the branch of philosophy called ‘physics’ (a branch that included natural philosophy as well as theology), much of Seneca’s work focuses on ethical matters. Also like other philosophers of his time, Seneca’s focus in moral philosophy has a clear practical emphasis. While discussions of theory and theoretical controversies abound in Seneca’s Letters and other works, his focus is consistently on how his theory—Stoicism—can be brought to bear on living one’s life. Seneca emphasizes the importance of this in Letter 89, where he encourages Lucilius (the addressee of the Letters) to indulge his wish to study logic so long has he refers everything that he learns to living a good life.
Seneca clearly sees himself as a Stoic. He commonly refers to the Stoic school as ‘ours’ and does much to defend the Stoics against certain Peripatetic and Epicurean attacks. Still, he is willing to disagree with the Stoics about certain matters in which he thinks a clearer or better argument is available. In Letter 33, for example, Seneca claims that he follows the teachings of the Stoics, but points out that the people who have discovered important truths in the past are not his masters (domini), but rather his guides (duces). Elsewhere, in his On Leisure, Seneca makes a similar point that he accepts the views of Zeno and Chrysippus (two early leaders of the Stoa) not just because Zeno or Chrysippus taught them, but because the arguments themselves lead to those positions.
He is also willing to make some concessions to the main adversary—the Epicurean. Seneca’s stance, especially toward Epicurus, has led readers to think that Seneca is best described as ‘eclectic’ rather than Stoic. His willingness to draw upon the philosophy of Epicurus, Plato, and others has seemed to some to betray the softness of his commitment to Stoicism. Seneca’s reply to this charge can be found in the passages from Letter 33 and On Leisure above. His focus is on the truth. He believes that, in some cases, the Epicurean or the Aristotelian has hit upon the truth. He is happy to acknowledge this to Lucilius and his readers but is nonetheless ready to point out that they have arrived at the truth for the wrong reasons. His treatise On Leisure illustrates this point. The question is whether the wise person ought to engage in public life or instead retire to pursue the work of retirement, which includes philosophical study. The Epicurean view is that the wise person will not engage in public life unless something interferes. The Stoic view is that the wise person will engage in public life unless something interferes. Seneca, though, argues that the importance of the projects of one’s private life (including the study of philosophy) can, in fact, trump the requirement to enter public life, even according to the Stoic view. This, he argues, shows that the pursuit of philosophical study and avoidance of public life are, in fact, recommended by the Stoics. The Epicureans’ overt call to avoid public life is mistaken, Seneca argues, because it assumes that a life devoted to politics cannot be harmonious with the philosophical life. Seneca concedes that in the actual world, as it is now, that is true, but points out that circumstances can change. In a world where public service would produce greater benefit to mankind than private, philosophical, work, a wise person would engage in the former.
Certain affinities between Seneca and his most famous fellow Roman philosophers—Marcus Aurelius and Epictetus – are commonly noted. All are concerned with the importance of living a philosophical life. All are, in the works that survive, more concerned with ethics than other branches of philosophy. These generalizations are accurate, but they obscure some features of Seneca’s philosophical works that distinguish him from these Roman Stoics. In particular, Seneca’s philosophical works were written for publication. In contrast, Epictetus did not write anything, and Marcus wrote for himself; Seneca, though, intended that his works be readthey were read widely during and after his lifetime.
A related and in some ways more significant feature of Seneca’s authorship is his decision not only to write for an audience, but to do so in Latin rather than Greek. In the generations both before and after Seneca, Greek remained the language of philosophical discourse. Two notable exceptions to this pattern are the Epicurean Lucretius’ epic poem De Rerum Natura (On the Nature of Things), and the philosophical works of Marcus Tullius Cicero. The efforts of Lucretius and Cicero to bring philosophy to Latin and to prove that Latin is sufficient for the task (a regular theme in Cicero’s works) largely failed. Seneca, however, does not seem to have had a goal of bringing philosophy to Latin. He has little interest, as Cicero did, in demonstrating that Latin could accommodate the Greek technical vocabulary. This has made Seneca’s texts particularly useless for those seeking to trace the history of particular terms or concepts through Classical and Hellenistic philosophy. On the other hand, Seneca’s approach makes it clear that he is not concerned with matters of concordance or with establishing or maintaining a particular paradigm of philosophical exposition. Seneca is, instead, doing philosophy in Latin (Inwood, 2005).
Though Seneca distinguishes himself from his peers in some respects, he nonetheless professes his allegiance to Stoicism. His commitment to the school can be seen most clearly in his frequent return to a number of core Stoic positions—particularly the positions defended in Stoic moral philosophy. The Stoic view of morality is distinguished from other Hellenistic and Classical philosophical schools by its commitment to the idea that an individual has absolute authority over her happiness. The Stoics reject the Aristotelian idea that one’s happiness (eudaimonia) is at least in part determined by things outside one’s control. Seneca stands with the Stoics in rejecting this view of happiness. He frequently returns to this theme in different contexts and emphasizes the importance of knowing what things are in one’s power and what things are not. Seneca agrees with the Stoics that virtue is sufficient for happiness. One’s virtue, unlike one’s circumstances, is within one’s power.
Knowledge of one’s nature is importantly connected, in Stoicism, with one’s knowledge of nature generally. Seneca often appeals to the importance of understanding nature in his works. He recommends, for example, that one who is setting off on a voyage say to himself that he will arrive at his destination unless something interferes. This statement is taken to reflect the understanding that whether one’s actions unfold as one wishes is not entirely within one’s control. Thus, Seneca urges that it would be a mistake to say “I will arrive at my destination.” Such a plan ignores the fact that many ships do not reach their destinations. The more one understands the nature of things, the more one understands what is in one’s power and what is not.
Indeed, the Stoics emphasize that to live well one must live according to nature. In Seneca’s texts, this emphasis provides the background for criticism of his culture and fellow Romans. To follow nature or live according to nature requires that one abandon many practices and values that have been taken up through acculturation. Seneca’s return throughout his philosophical writings to the dangers of public life, of crowds, and of social excesses relies on this point—that much of society is corrupt. To live as the mob supposes one should live is to stray from nature. Seneca notes, in Letter 46, that reason demands one live in accordance with one’s own nature, but this nature can be led astray.
b. Philosophical Substance and Literary Talent
Seneca’s literary talent was unmatched during his lifetime. His style appealed immediately to his Roman audience. Writing a generation after Seneca, Quintilian notes in his Institutiones that early in his career Seneca’s works were the only works being read. Quintilian’s treatment of Seneca’s texts is telling. In cataloguing the texts of other authors, he systematically omits Seneca’s contributions to each genre. Seneca’s works are given their own treatment because of their difficulty in being read judiciously. Quintilian praises Seneca’s works but recommends advanced training be completed prior to reading them.
With some modifications, this advice has been upheld by modern readers of Seneca. While he is often rated a philosophical amateur, no scholars would venture the similar claim about his literary talents. This realization, however, has led scholars of Seneca’s philosophical positions to take more care to understand the literary aims and constraints of his work. By all accounts, even from as early as Tacitus and Quitilian, Seneca’s prose style was both original and quite popular. His originality extends beyond the style of his sentences all the way to the organization of his philosophical treatises. He everywhere prefers a style of philosophical writing that more closely resembles conversation.
Seneca’s literary genius confronts readers of his text with a difficulty. Those interested in Seneca’s philosophy cannot simply ignore aspects of genre, style, and so on. For Seneca, these are importantly connected. Often the philosophical message of a treatise or letter is entangled with the norms of the genre in which he is working. At the same time, Seneca often presses against such norms to enlarge or bring into focus certain philosophical points. He claims, for example, that philosophical discourse can be appropriately undertaken as a conversation (Letter 75.1-2). To a great extent, Seneca’s philosophical texts reflect this preference: straightforward exposition is rare in his works. More frequently, his addressee is made to interrupt a point by asking a question or posing a challenge. In some cases, though, the demands of philosophical exposition require setting aside the genre’s norms. Seneca blames Lucilius, for example, in Letter 95 for its length and technical detail. This interplay between style and substance requires great care in interpreting Seneca’s philosophical achievements.
Seneca’s literary talents further complicate interpreting his philosophical works when one considers his controversial career. In some cases a careful interpretation of his work cannot ignore the immediate political context. The Apocolocyntosis, a scathing attack on Claudius, has clear political and public aims (though little of philosophical interest). His Consolation to Helvia, written to his mother during his exile, may well have been intended as a defense and request for recall. Similarly, he once mentions (Polybius 13.2) his trial and conviction, perhaps in an effort to remind Claudius of his innocence. These references to his own life, though rare, alert readers to the fact that his treatises may be constructed with many goals in mind: philosophical, but also personal, political, and literary. One can, for example, see the intermingling of aims in the opening passages of On Mercy, where Seneca praises Nero’s virtues. The praise of Nero’s character has both a philosophical and political goal: to encourage careful thinking about the importance, for a ruler, of cultivating mercy and to exhort the ruler of Rome to have mercy on those who may be thought to have wronged him.
c. The Letters to Lucilius
The Letters to Lucilius are Seneca’s most widely read and influential texts. The Letters contain much that is of interest to philosophers and to non-philosophers alike. 124 Letters have survived, divided into 20 books. It is likely that not all of the Letters have been preserved. The interpretation of Seneca’s Letters has been a matter of much disagreement among scholars.
The Letters themselves contain a wide variety of material ranging from apparently mundane discussions (for example, the dangers of crowds and public baths) to advanced technical discussions of Stoic theory. Seneca often makes use of something in everyday life to steer discussion to an ethical question or to some piece of moral advice. An over-arching interpretation of the Letters as a literary and philosophical work has eluded consensus among scholars. Still, a number of features of the Letters stand out as helpful for their interpretation. First, many groups of letters deal with common themes. Letters 5-10, for example, deal broadly with questions about living a philosophical life. Letters 94-5, the longest two letters of the work, deal with a technical question about the role of rules in moral reasoning. These are but two examples. There are few, if any, Letters the themes of which do not find echoes in others. Second, there is a noted trend as the letters progress toward longer, more technical, and more substantive philosophical discussions. This feature suggests that the Letters, aside from the apparently disparate themes and discussions along the way, also aim to demonstrate a philosophical education.
This aim is apparent early in the Letters. Seneca urges Lucilius in the first letter against the fault of wasting his time carelessly. In the second letter, he advises Lucilius on the correct approach to reading philosophical texts. In the fifth letter, he applauds Lucilius for persistence in his philosophical study but warns him to remain focused on the goal of philosophical study—that is, moral improvement—rather than the goal of many to simply make a show of philosophical talent. Seneca’s advice about philosophy—both how and what to study and how to apply it to one’s life—continues throughout the Letters. Scholars have long noted the apparent improvement of Lucilius as the Letters progress as evidence that Seneca means not simply to discuss philosophical progress but also to illustrate what it is like. The Lucilius of the early letters is not very sophisticated: the reader is made to suppose he is in the habit of requesting from Seneca pithy philosophical maxims to memorize. In Letter 33, Seneca chastises him for this and discontinues the practice of ending his letters with maxims. Later, in Letter 82, Seneca reports that he is happy with Lucilius’ progress. The later Letters also show Lucilius asking, apparently, more and more technical and difficult philosophical questions. Indeed, the later letters are, on the whole, considerably more philosophically rich than the early ones.
While Lucilius’ progress is arguably a theme that unites the letters, it is a theme that allows the philosophical discussions included in them to vary considerably. No one argument or position is systematically defended or articulated throughout the Letters as a whole. Instead, philosophical discussions are more localized, sometimes occupying the space of one letter, other times spanning a group of three or four. Sometimes a question addressed in one letter is picked up again much later. One can find in Seneca’s Letters various discussions of, to name a few, friendship, death, fate, poverty, moral theory, virtue, the good, argument, and much else. In all of his discussions, Seneca emphasizes the importance of being critical both of oneself and one’s way of living and of the received views, both popular and philosophical.
A brief account of the work’s first letter, though scarcely sufficient as a general introduction to the Letters, gives some indication of Seneca’s approach. The letter begins with some advice to Lucilius. He is to continue his efforts in devoting time to philosophical study. The theme of the Letter is just this—that too much time is wasted on worldly pursuits. Time flies, and as we delay what matters, life runs past. This theme is common in Latin literature: famous phrases like “tempus fugit” (from Vergil) and “carpe diem” (Horace) illustrate this. Seneca’s discussion of this offers no new philosophical insight. Still, as the letter continues, the philosophical point comes into view. The advice about wasting time generalizes to one’s life as a whole. To let one’s time slip away is to let oneself be occupied with things that are not really important. Seneca confesses that though he, too, wastes time, he has come to recognize when he is doing so. He counts this as progress and advises that Lucilius do what he can to keep what is really his.
As is typical of the Letters, this letter has Stoicism in view but does not heavy-handedly address or engage in Stoic theory. As a Stoic, Seneca is committed to the view that much of what one does in life is of little value. One’s day-to-day business contributes nothing to living a good life, unless one is considering the manner of his or her life. Seneca’s proposal that one should waste little, and be aware of what one is wasting, points to the Stoic view. What matters is acting virtuously, and this requires reflection on one’s actions. This is the first step to living well.
d. Anger, Grief, and the Therapy of Emotions
A defining principle of Stoicism is the claim that the mind is wholly rational, unlike Platonists and Aristotelians who posited a mind composed of both rational and non-rational parts. According to the Platonic/Aristotelian account of human psychology, emotions such as anger and fear could be explained by appeal to the non-rational parts of the mind, but on the Stoic view of the mind, no similar appeal can be made: Stoic theory suggests no non-rational aspects of the mind. The whole—unitary—mind is implicated in its actions. This feature of the Stoic theory has important implications for both its account of and its evaluation of emotions.
The Stoics view emotions as irrational movements of the mind. Since there are no non-rational parts of the mind, the Stoics understand a movement to be ‘irrational’ when it is contrary to right reason. Anger is a state in which one is not guided by correct reasoning. Fear is a state in which one is not guided by correct reasoning. And so on. Hence, emotions are states of mind that are contrary to right reason. One who is not angry would think and act differently than one who is. At least in the case of the perfect moral agent, these actions—that is, of someone who is not angry—would be fully guided by correct reasoning. The Stoics explain that the emotions arise when one assents to certain kinds of false statements about the world. Consider the following judgments one may make in response to having one’s car stolen:
S1: My car has been stolen.
S2: It is bad to have one’s car stolen.
S3: It is appropriate to respond to having one’s car stolen in an emotional way.
In an ordinary case, the Stoics claim, one’s episode of anger can be explained by appeal to these three propositions. One first encounters some state of affairs, articulates it, and assents to it—S1. One often goes on to form a secondary articulation, along the lines of S2, about the goodness or badness of this state of affairs. If one assents to this statement, one often continues to react in a way that somehow corresponds to the judgment reflected in S2. ‘S3’ is not exactly what one assents to. Instead, S3 is meant to capture something about the angry person’s response. Consider, for example, that an angry person might well scream “in anger” or do some violence to his surroundings or the like. The analysis of anger is meant to capture (via S3) this feature of anger (and other emotions).
According to Stoic theory, judgments of the form S2 and S3 are nearly always false. The Stoics hold that the only good is virtue and that the only evil is vice. All else is indifferent. According to this theory of value, having one’s car stolen is not bad; thus S2 is false. Similarly, since nothing bad has happened, the course of action sanctioned by S2 and S3 is illegitimate. No emotional response is appropriate.
Seneca devotes much of his philosophical work to advancing these aspects of Stoicism. The chief concern behind the Stoic theory of emotions and the theory of value is that until one removes such false beliefs about value, one will not succeed in living a happy life. It is with this that Seneca concerns himself in his philosophical work. He aims, for example, in On Anger to help his readers avoid becoming angry, and offers what little advice there is to help those who are angry stop being so. In the Consolations, he is concerned with helping his readers avoid the life shattering effects of grief. Elsewhere, Seneca works to help people let go of their fear of death.
In his Consolations in particular, as well as in his treatise On Anger and other works, Seneca is clearly more often concerned with helping people avoid experiencing emotions. As a Stoic, he is committed to the idea that emotional experiences involve false judgments. Still, Seneca does not typically concern himself with explicating the theory itself. While our reports from Greek doxagraphers and from Cicero preserve the outlines of the theory, Seneca feels no need to repeat it. One noteworthy exception to this is Seneca’s On Anger. Here (in Book II.1.4) Seneca explains the structure of an emotional experience. His explanation attempts to show that anger is voluntary despite the fact that one cannot entirely control the way things appear.
Seneca’s strategy is to explain anger in terms of three ‘movements’. The first movement, he says, is involuntary. It is the moment when the mind articulates some state of affairs—that ‘having my car stolen is a bad thing’. This may correspond, in some cases, with an elevated heart rate, a sinking feeling in one’s stomach, or the like. This initial experience is, Seneca claims, beyond one’s immediate control, but it is not anger. To be angry, one must “assent” to the proposition. That is, one must sanction the assertion that “such and such is a bad thing.” Once the assent is given, one is angry.
In distinguishing the first, involuntary, movement of anger from anger itself, Seneca seems to be responding (or reporting his source’s response) to an objection to the Stoic view. The Stoics claim that the wise person—the Sage—will not become angry (or experience any emotion) but cannot deny that the Sage will, for example, flinch at the loud bark of a dog or the sudden loud clap of thunder. Why, the objector may say, would the Sage flinch? To flinch is to assent to the proposition that something bad has happened. By separating the involuntary from the voluntary, Seneca answers this criticism.
While Seneca occasionally addresses theoretical matters in this way, he more commonly focuses on an issue—in this case, the emotions—from a different perspective. Seneca largely favors discussing issues from the perspective of the person who is making moral progress, rather than from the perspective of the wise person. This stands in contrast to the focus of other surviving Stoic texts which tend to focus on the morally perfect agent—the ‘Sage’—and her qualities. Those texts often characterize the Sage in a way that sets her very much apart from normal human beings. Seneca’s concern, however, is with the circumstances of those who are aspiring to be and do better.
This orientation can be seen very clearly in passages or whole works (like On Anger, Consolation to Marcia, and others) where he aims to help those who are imperiled by emotions. The aim of these works is not to point out that the Sage does not experience anger or grief, nor is the aim even primarily to say why the Sage does not experience these emotions. Instead, the aim is to appeal to those who are not wise and to offer them advice, informed of course by Stoic theory, to help them re-orient their thinking about their circumstances. In On Anger, for example, Seneca advises that an angry person look in the mirror. Clearly, this person will not find a Sage in the mirror. Instead, Seneca thinks, he will find something in his appearance that does not resonate well with his thinking about himself. Elsewhere, Seneca advises that the person who is grieving consider the difference an audience makes. When one finds that one grieves more in the presence of an audience, Seneca thinks this will force one to reflect on what the grief is really about. Is one’s grief, in other words, directed at the one who is gone or at oneself? These kinds of strategies for dealing with emotions are, in any case, very far removed from arguments about the value of the emotions and still further removed from theoretical accounts of the nature of the emotions. Seneca is convinced that the Stoic view is right, and he finds support for this conclusion in less theoretical, and more practical, aspects of human life.
e. Natural Philosophy
The received view of the Roman Stoics according to which the Romans were only concerned with ethics must be put aside in Seneca’s case. The opening lines of the Natural Questions articulate a view about the importance of physics that shows Seneca to be a clear exception. The very existence of the Natural Questions, one of Seneca’s longest philosophical treatises, shows this as well. He notes that “the difference between philosophy and other areas of study is as great as the difference, within philosophy itself, between the branch concerned with humans and the one concerned with the gods” (Praef.1, Hine, trans.). Seneca’s reference here to the branch concerned with the gods is a standard characterization of the ‘physics’, one of the three Hellenistic divisions of philosophy that Seneca inherits. For the Stoics, the study of physics, or natural philosophy, included the study of the divine. In Letter 88, Seneca claims that the liberal arts, here noted as the ‘other areas of study’, are only important insofar as they prepare the mind for philosophical study. Seneca’s claim at the beginning of the Natural Questions, then, suggests that all philosophical study ultimately aims at understanding of the gods. Even the “branch concerned with humans” (that is, ethics) has an aim beyond itself. According to the Stoic view, full moral progress requires a complete understanding of the nature of the divine. Seneca’s claims here, and elsewhere in the Natural Questions, suggest that he embraces the full range of Stoic philosophy despite the fact that most of his philosophical attention is devoted to matters central to the ‘branch concerned with humans.’
The outlines of Stoic physics are well documented in early sources. The Stoics are materialists, compatibilists, and theists. In the most general sense, the Stoics hold that the cosmos is entirely composed of matter but that certain forms of matter (fire, aether) are endowed with creative capacity. The human being’s mind is itself a composition of these elements. According to the Stoic view, the cosmos is a mind writ large, in the sense that the movements and developments in nature at the cosmic level are the result of guiding intelligence. For this reason, the Stoics regard “god,” “nature,” “fate,” “providence,” as roughly equivalent expressions. All refer to the active and creative element in the cosmos. To live according to nature ultimately requires that one come to adopt, or understand, the natural world from this cosmic perspective.
The surviving portions of Seneca’s Natural Questions are a survey of various meteorological phenomena undertaken in light of the broader Stoic understanding of the nature of the cosmos. Though the discussions are often narrowly focused on particular meteorological phenomena and their explanation, Seneca occasionally pauses to take a wider view. He considers, for example, the role that reflective surfaces (mirrors) play—and are supposed to play—in moral improvement (I.17 ff.). He explains the Stoic view that reason is the same for both gods and humans (Praef. 14). In a discussion of the cause of lightening (II.45), Seneca points to the Stoic view that “Jupiter,” “Providence,” “Fate,” and so on are all names for the active, divine element that shapes the universe.
The Natural Questions is an unfinished work. Passages like those above suggest that Seneca may have been revising or finishing the work with the aim of more carefully connecting his findings about meteorological phenomena to Stoic physics. They also suggest that, at least in some moments, Seneca may have been interested in providing a Stoic alternative to Lucretius’ explanation of many of the same phenomena in De Rerum Natura. The Stoic claim that the happenings of the natural world are guided by reason stands in stark contrast to the Epicurean view, articulated by Lucretius, that the world is generated and organized by chance.
f. Non-philosophical Works
Seneca wrote much besides his philosophical texts; however much of his work has been lost. Lost are all of his speeches, including those he penned for Nero. Also lost are some philosophical treatises, though some fragments survive from a treatise on marriage. The surviving non-philosophical works include the Apocolocyntosis, a work satirizing the deification of Claudius, and eight tragedies: Agamemnon, Hercules Furens, Medea, Thyestes, Oedipus, Phaedra, Phoenisse, and Troades. Scholars have long disagreed about the relation between Seneca’s philosophical prose and his tragic poetry. At one end of the spectrum, some ancient sources regarded the author of the tragedies to be a different Seneca altogether. While there is agreement now that our Seneca authored the tragedies, the relation between these works and his philosophical treatises is less agreed upon. On the one hand the tragedies are clearly concerned with many Stoic themes that Seneca addresses in his philosophical works. Despite this point of intersection, though, the tragedies do not seem to say the same about these themes. The most striking theme in this regard is the attention in the tragedies to the role of anger and other emotions. While the philosophical works (especially On Anger) attempt to persuade the reader to avoid becoming angry, the tragedies sometimes seem to elicit our sympathies for those who are angry and acting in anger. Similarly, as one commentator notes, the tragedies are rife with Stoic pronouncements (for example, “follow nature” Phaedra, 481) that are put forward in a manner inconsistent with the Stoic principles to which they give voice.
The Phaedra illustrates the second phenomena quite clearly. The title character, wife of Theseus, has fallen in love with her stepson, Hippolytus. After a failed effort to overcome her feelings for the boy, Phaedra’s cause of seducing Hippolytus is taken up by the Nurse, who agrees to help in order to prevent Phaedra’s suicide. The Nurse urges Hippolytus to “follow nature” as his guide. The Stoic imperative to follow nature is ordinarily understood as an injunction to live a life according to reason, to be virtuous, and to shun the circumstances of fortune. Here, though, the Nurse employs the phrase to encourage Hippolytus to do what most people do—namely, to pursue the pleasures of sex (Wilson, 2010). Hippolytus himself in this play seems, initially at least, to come closest to the Stoic ideal. In a long passage in Act II, he explains his love for the countryside and mountaintops, places in which he can be truly free from anger and other passions and from the vices that corrupt those who spend their time in society. Yet his peace comes at the price of seclusion and for the wrong reasons. The would-be sage seeks the isolation of the woods because of his hatred for all women. He notes that whether his hatred stems from “reason, nature, or passion” (567), it pleases him to hate them all.
The focus in the tragedies on the destructive force of emotions (especially anger) is plain. As one commentator notes, anger guides the action in all of Seneca’s plays (Wilson, 2010). In the Phaedra, Theseus’ anger at his son leads him to seek Hippolytus’ death. (Phaedra, whose advances were rejected by Hippolytus, has lied to her husband, accusing Hippolytus of raping her). In the Medea, Medea’s anger at Jason leads her to murder her own children. In the Thyestes, Atreus’ anger leads him to murder Thyestes’ children and feed them to him. While these portrayals of emotion forge a connection between the tragedies and the prose works, what that connection is remains unclear. How, for example, should one understand the significance of Phaedra’s, “What can reason do? Passion, passion rules!” (trans., Wilson) given Seneca’s claim elsewhere (On Anger II.1.4) that passions are voluntary?
Scholars have taken a number of positions on these issues. Some have argued that there is no connection between the tragedies and the philosophical works, while others have sought to show that the tragedies contain important philosophical lessons. Arguments of the latter kind are varied. Some have held that the tragedies are meant to illustrate the destructive influence of passions; others have argued that the tragedies should be read in light of Seneca’s Stoic metaphysics. These scholars emphasize the role of fate, providence, and divination in the tragedies. Finally, one scholar has argued that the guiding philosophical concern in the tragedies is epistemological (Staley, 2010). On this view, Seneca’s tragedies, offer a kind of ‘clarification’ of the cognitive processes of those who are under the sway of passions.
Whatever relation they are ultimately thought to have to his philosophical works, Seneca’s tragedies, his Apocolocyntosis, and his lost speeches serve to alert readers of his philosophical works to his literary talent. Scholars have rarely attempted a full account of all his works undertaken with the aim of clarifying or even producing an account of Seneca the author. The difficulty of such an undertaking suggests that caution is needed in assuming that Seneca is primarily a philosopher. Seneca appears to have been comfortable writing in many genres. His comfort, moreover, provides a further clue that Seneca’s life was either plagued by or fortunate in (depending on how one sees it) his constant contact with both philosophy and with the politics and culture of Rome.
g. Criticism and Influence
Both Seneca’s life and his works have been targets of criticism since his own lifetime, during which, of course, he was charged and convicted of both adultery and conspiracy. Though the evidence in neither of these cases is clearly decisive, they added to the growing criticism that Seneca’s way of life undermined his philosophical message. This criticism gained more traction from the fact that Seneca, who writes that poverty is not an evil, was one of the wealthiest men in the world. This criticism of Seneca was first made publicly by Publius Suilius, a political enemy of Seneca who was, according to Tacitus, angered by Nero’s revival of a law against pleading for money. Suilius, it seems, believed that this revival resulted from Seneca’s influence. Tacitus reports that Suilius taunted Seneca publicly, reminding the Roman elites of Seneca’s affair with Julia Livilla, and most importantly, asking the following question of his fellow Romans: “By what kind of wisdom or maxims of philosophy had Seneca within four years of royal favour ammassed three hundred million sesterces?” (Tacitus, Annals XIII.42, Church & Brodribb, trans.). Although little independent evidence exists to confirm Suilius’ claim about the extent of Seneca’s wealth or how he acquired it, this passage from Tacitus’ Annals has served as a source for many readers of Seneca since its publication. The result is that Seneca’s political enemy has in a way won the battle of public opinion. Scholars have noted that some caution is needed in evaluating this charge against Seneca, but the fact that Seneca was very wealthy and at the same time wrote that one should be content with what one has—and that poverty is, in itself, no evil—has been a lasting criticism.
This example denotes a broader line of criticism that Seneca is inconsistent. His wealth and his pronouncements about the value of poverty are but one example. To this can be added his praise of the philosophical life together with his recurrent involvement in Roman politics. Seneca is made, in Tacitus, to plead his case for retirement before Nero, yet Seneca is clearly (in both the Consolation to Helvia and to Polybius) eager to return to Rome during his period of exile. Seneca seems, then, to have little but praise for the philosophical life withdrawn from the business of Rome, yet cannot fully embrace that life himself. In his On Mercy, Seneca encourages the young emperor Nero to take to heart the point that while many may have the power to put others to death, he alone has the power to give life (that is, to allow life where the punishment of death is justified), yet Seneca may well have been party to Nero’s assassination of his own mother. At the very least, Seneca was unable to stop Nero. Again, Seneca upholds the importance of freedom from emotion in living a happy life. He encourages daily exercises to rid oneself of anger and other emotions, yet he writes tragedies in which unbridled emotions are the central focus. He encourages his readers to reflect on what is really theirs and to distance themselves from the inner workings of the political mob, yet he writes a political satire (the Apocolocyntosis) which assumes detailed knowledge of the inner workings of imperial court under Claudius. Finally, Seneca is reported to have written Nero’s address for the funeral of Claudius. While this work is lost to us, it is unlikely that it had much in common with the Pumpkinification of Claudius, which he must have penned at around the same time.
These features of Seneca’s life and work have been both targets for criticism and spurs for investigation. To his credit, Seneca denies (even in the Letters, some of his latest works) that he is close to living a fully philosophical life. He works toward this goal but falls short. Notwithstanding his own profession of philosophical failure, the spirit of his philosophical works seems clearly (to the extent that we can see clearly into his life) undermined by his role in Roman life. A number of views can be taken here. Perhaps Seneca simply fails to live the philosophical life he aspires to live. Perhaps his philosophical ambitions were really secondary to his political ambitions. While many scholars have noted the inconsistencies and many have rejected Seneca’s work on the grounds of hypocrisy, some scholars (notably Emily Wilson) have challenged this view. Wilson notes that, “The most interesting question is not why Seneca failed to practice what he preached, but why he preached what he did, so adamantly and so effectively, given the life he found himself leading” (Wilson, 2014).
A final and more philosophically substantive criticism also relies on a claim that there is some disparity between what Seneca advises and what Seneca does. This criticism, articulated by J. M. Cooper, argues that Seneca’s aim to guide his reader toward moral improvement is ultimately undermined by his advice to avoid the study of logic. Stoic theory requires that one have knowledge of ethics, physics, and logic. The Stoics, in fact, have much to say about the important interconnections among these three branches of study. Though one may begin with ethics, one’s philosophical study is simply not complete unless one has mastered the arguments forms that fall under the scope of logic. Despite this, Seneca repeatedly tells his readers, particularly in the Letters, that the study of advanced logic, including Zeno’s syllogisms and certain logical fallacies, are a waste of time. In doing so, Seneca is advising his readers to avoid something that is, according to his own theory, necessary for moral progress.
Despite these criticisms, Seneca’s works have been widely read since his own lifetime. Seneca’s works, along with Cicero’s, were much more readily accessible to medieval Europeans who no longer read Greek. Thus, Seneca served for a long time as one of only a few sources for Stoic philosophy. Seneca’s works were well received by Christian thinkers in the Early Middle Ages. This was no doubt partly due to the forged correspondence (long thought to be genuine) between Seneca and the apostle Paul. Partly though, Seneca’s acceptance by Christian thinkers was surely due to similarities between Christian and Stoic doctrines. Seneca’s doctrine of the first movements of emotions—those experiences of being drawn toward something or the initial experience that precedes becoming angry or grief stricken – find welcome reception in Christian thinkers who are working on accounts of temptation and the original failings of human nature.
During and after the Renaissance, Seneca’s works continued to be read widely. How much Seneca alone, apart from other surviving Stoic sources (including Cicero’s philosophical works), influenced a particular philosopher’s thinking is difficult to tell, but Seneca was clearly read. Descartes, for example, used Seneca’s On the Happy Life as the basis for the ethical view he develops in his correspondence with Princess Elizabeth. A near contemporary of Descartes, Justus Lipsius, relied on Seneca’s philosophy heavily in his attempt to develop a new form of Stoicism suitable to his age. One can find many references to Seneca in the works of philosophers throughout the history of philosophy in Europe. Seneca’s influence and importance can perhaps be seen most clearly in cases where philosophers identify with Seneca’s philosophical views and at the same time sympathize with the circumstances of his life. Thomas More, for example, who was also an advisor to a powerful monarch, read Seneca widely. It has been noted that one source for More’s Utopia was likely Seneca’s (incomplete) treatise De Otio (On Leisure). There, Seneca notes that the ideal state is “no place” (nusquam).
The influence of Seneca’s work, especially his account of the emotions and their therapy, can be seen in the work of philosophers such as Foucault and Pierre Hadot, who have both developed accounts of living philosophy. This includes focus on the source of one’s troubling emotions—anxiety, fear, anger—and how philosophy can address these. In psychology, the Stoic account of the emotions as cognitive has been influential in the development of cognitive therapies. Albert Ellis, for example, who developed rational emotive behavioral therapy (REBT), was heavily influenced by Stoic views of the emotions, and especially by Seneca.
3. References and Further Reading
a. Texts and Translations
All of Seneca’s works are available in English translation. For many years, the Loeb Series, which includes Latin and English side by side, translated by Gummere (Letters) and Basore (Dialogi or Moral Essays) were the standard English translations. New translations of particular works or selections of letters have been published. Inwood’s 2007 collection contains extensive philosophical commentary on a collection of 17 philosophically substantive Letters.
- Campbell, Robin, trans. Seneca: Letters from a Stoic. Penguin Classics. 2004.
- Inwood, Brad, trans. Seneca: Selected Philosophical Letters. Oxford; New York: Oxford University Press, 2010.
- Seneca, Lucius Annaeus. Epistulae Morales (Letters). Trans. Richard M. Gummere. London: Harvard University Press, 1917. 3 vols. Loeb.
- Seneca, Lucius Annaeus. Moral Essays. Trans. John W. Basore. Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, 1928. 3 vols. Loeb.
- Seneca, Lucius Annaeus. Tragedies. Trans. John G. Fitch. Annotated edition. Cambridge, Mass: Harvard University Press, 2002. 2 vols. Loeb.
- Wilson, Emily, trans. Seneca: Six Tragedies. Oxford World’s Classics. New York: Oxford University Press, 2010.
An effort to produce new translations of all of Seneca’s works is currently underway through the University of Chicago Press. As of 2015, the following four volumes were available.
- Seneca, Lucius Annaeus. Anger, Mercy, and Revenge. Trans. Robert Kaster and Martha Nussbaum. Chicago: London: University of Chicago Press, 2010.
- Seneca, Lucius Annaeus. Hardship and Happiness. Trans. Elaine Fantham et. al. Chicago ; London: University Of Chicago Press, 2014.
- Seneca, Lucius Annaeus. Natural Questions. Trans. Harry Hine. Chicago; London: University Of Chicago Press, 2010.
- Seneca, Lucius Annaeus. On Benefits. Trans. Miriam Griffin and Brad Inwood. Chicago: University Of Chicago Press, 2011.
b. Secondary Literature
- Bartsch, Shadi and Wray, David, eds. Seneca and the Self. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2009.
- A collection of essays evaluating Seneca’s contribution to the modern notion(s) of the Self.
- Cooper, John M. Knowledge, Nature, and the Good: Essays on Ancient Philosophy. Princeton University Press, 2009.
- Chapter 12, “Moral Theory and Improvement: Seneca,” argues that Seneca’s dislike for logic is incompatible with his Stoic allegiance.
- Fitch, John G., ed. Oxford Readings in Classical Studies: Seneca. New York: Oxford University Press, 2008.
- A collection of essays on many aspects of Seneca’s work—both philosophical and poetic.
- Griffin, Miriam T. Seneca: A Philosopher in Politics. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1992.
- An extensive study of what Seneca’s philosophical writings can tell us about his role as a political agent.
- Hadot, Ilsetraut. Seneca und die Griechisch-Römische Tradition der Seelenleitung. Berlin: Walter De Gruyter & Co., 1969.
- Places Seneca’s work as a spiritual advisor to his audience in the context of Greco-Roman spiritual advice literature from Homer to Seneca.
- Inwood, Brad. Reading Seneca: Stoic Philosophy at Rome. Oxford; New York: Oxford University Press, 2008.
- A collection of essays that explicate Seneca’s thinking about a number of philosophical problems.
- Ker, James. The Deaths of Seneca. New York: Oxford University Press, 2009.
- An examination of Seneca’s life and work through the lenses of the various accounts of his death, both ancient and later.
- Romm, James. Dying Every Day: Seneca at the Court of Nero. New York, Vintage Books, 2014.
- A biography aimed at reconciling the apparently incompatible versions of Seneca—the wealthy man who praises poverty, the philosopher who is so engaged in politics, and so forth. Romm focuses consistently on the role that death and thinking about death play in Seneca’s life and works.
- Wilson, Emily. The Greatest Empire: A Life of Seneca. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2014.
- A biography of Seneca informed by what is known about the dates of his philosophical and non-philosophical works. Wilson aims to explain, as much as possible, various tensions in the reception of Seneca.
- Volk, Katharina, and Gareth D. Williams. Seeing Seneca Whole: Perspectives on Philosophy, Poetry, and Politics. Brill, 2006.
- A collection of essays from a variety of standpoints—philosophical, literary, historical—aimed at clarifying Seneca’s status as an author of many genres.
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