Bernardino Telesio (1509—1588)
Dubbed “the first of the new philosophers” by Francis Bacon in 1613, Bernardino Telesio was one of the most eminent thinkers of Renaissance Italy, along with figures such as Pico, Pomponazzi, Cardano, Patrizi, Bruno, Doni, and Campanella.
The young Telesio spent the early decades of his life under the guidance of his uncle Antonio (1482-1534), a fine humanist who was determined to go beyond the strict disciplinary division between literary and philosophical texts. Before the printing of the first edition of his principal work, De natura iuxta propria principia (On the Nature of Things According to their Own Principles) (Rome, 1565), Telesio assimilated the basics of ancient scientific thought (both Greek and Latin), as well as those of Plato’s and Aristotle’s Scholastic commentators. In the second half of the 16th century, he began to be recognized as an adversary of Aristotle’s thought, insofar as he upheld a conception of man and nature that attempted to replace the principles of Aristotle’s natural philosophy. His starting point was the definition of a new role for the notion of sense perception in animal cognition. Using the Stoic notion of spiritus (translating the Greek word pneuma), he criticized Aristotle’s hylomorphism. As a fiery substance and an internal principle of motion, spiritus is the principle of sensitivity: by the way of heat, it pervades the entire cosmos, so that all beings are capable of sensation. In addition to grounding Telesio’s epistemology, then, the notion of spiritus lies at the core of his natural philosophy. During the time span extending from 1565 to 1588, he overturned the traditional conception of the relationship between sensus and intellectus, as championed by the Scholastic followers of Aristotle. Telesio denied that human brain possesses a faculty able to grasp the forms or essentiae of natural beings from simple passive sensible data of experience. On the contrary, sense perception has an active role: it is the first form of understanding the natural world. It is by the “way of senses” that mental representations of natural things are selected and shaped. This process happens in strict cooperation with the corporeal principle of self-organization of the material soul. In human beings as well as in animals, brain is the main source of this principle, which governs the cognitive process without the support of a superior immaterial agent. This active form of “sentience” constitutes the primary causal connection between the brain and the external world. Founded on a reassessment of the categories of sense perception, Telesio’s philosophy of mind led to an empiricist approach to the study of natural phenomena.
Table of Contents
- Life and Times
- Psychology and Theory of Knowledge
- Influence and Legacy
- References and Further Reading
Bernardino Telesio was born in Cosenza (Northern Calabria) to Giovanni Battista, a noble man of letters, and Vincenza Garofalo, the daughter of a lawyer. Bernardino was the first-born of eight sons, and as a child was sent to his uncle Antonio (1482-1534) to be educated. In 1517, they went to the Duchy of Milan, where the young Telesio became acquainted with the most illustrious pupils of his uncle. He also met some eminent men of letters, like Matteo Bandello (1485-1561), who in his Novelle (1554) will recall Antonio’s knack for entertaining the members of the intellectual circles led by such gentlewomen as Camilla Scarampa Guidoboni (ca.1454-ca.1518) and Ippolita Sforza Bentivoglio (1481-ca.1520).
In 1523 Bernardino and Antonio moved to Rome, entering the intellectual milieu of the papal court and of the Vatican library, which was animated by philosophers and humanists such as Paolo Giovio (1483-1552), Marco Girolamo Vida (1485-1566), Marcello Cervini (1501-1555), Coriolano Martirano (1503- 1558), and Giovanni Antonio Pantusa (1501-1562). Bernardino left Studium Urbis in 1527, soon after the “sack of Rome”. Then he moved to Padua, where his uncle had been appointed professor of Latin by the municipality of Venice (October 17th, 1527).
During his early education, Bernardino was deeply influenced by his uncle. Antonio was a fine humanist, whose works largely circulated across Europe. To name an example, Antonio’s De coloribus libellus (Venice, 1528) rose to great fame. Following the Venetian first edition, at least ten editions of the work were released in Paris by scholar-printers such as Chrestien Wechel, Jacob Gazel and Robert Estienne (Stephanus); and a further five appeared in Basel. In particular, the Basel reprints were released by such renowned humanists as Hieronymus Froben and Johannes Herbst Oporinus. Thus, the young Bernardino could benefit from the mastery of some of the finest Italian connoisseurs of ancient Greek and Latin literature, soon becoming himself an expert reader of classic authors such as Virgil, Cicero, Seneca, Pliny, and Lucretius.
It is important to note that the materialist and empiricist approach Telesio displayed in his early works did not come out at first; the main source was an open-minded reading of the texts written by the early commentators of Aristotle’s works, such as Alexander of Aphrodisia, recently revisited by a new generation of scholars, such as, for example, Pietro Pomponazzi. At the University of Padua, the young Telesio could learn the new critical approach to Aristotle’s works. During the time spent in Padua and Venice, he did not gain the title of magister medicinae et artium, yet he started to develop a serious interest in mathematics, medicine, and natural philosophy.
At the end of the Venetian period (1527-1529), Telesio came back to Calabria. After some time spent in Naples (probably from 1532 or 1533 up to the spring of 1534, when his uncle passed away), Bernardino moved to Rome (1534-1535), living in the papal environment of Paolo III Farnese. Then, between 1536 and 1538 he spent a fruitful period of study at the Benedictine monastery of Seminara in the South of Calabria. There he began to develop his arsenal of anti-Aristotelian arguments, partly taken from Presocratic, Hippocratic, Epicurean and Stoic ideas. From there he went back to Rome, meeting some illustrious members of the papal court. Benedetto Varchi, Annibal Caro, Niccolò Ardinghelli, Ippolito Capilupi, Alessandro Farnese, Gasparo Contarini, Niccolò Gaddi, Giovanni Della Casa, and the Orsini brothers became soon acquainted with the philosopher of Cosenza. The significant number of letters written by these figures in the 1540s allows us to follow Bernardino’s movements between Rome, Naples, and Padua (Sergio 2014; Simonetta 2015). By the early 1540s, Telesio was already renowned as an anti-Aristotelian philosopher.
It was during that time that Telesio started to study Vesalius’s program of reform of the ancient ars medendi, including both Galen’s legacy and the Corpus Hippocraticum. Between 1541 and 1542, he spent some time in Padua, during which he met the anatomist and physician Matteo Realdo Colombo (1516-1559). Telesio’s interest in the nova ars medendi, and, more specifically, in physiology of sense perception, will be attested in a work “Contra Galenum” entitled Quod animal universum ab unica Animae substantia gubernatur, written in the 1560s, and posthumously edited and published by Antonio Persio (1542-1612) in Varii de naturalibus rebus libelli (Telesio 1590, [139-227]).
In the late 1540s he probably lived in the Neapolitan household of Alfonso Carafa (d. 1581), III Duke of Nocera, and in the early 1550s he came back to Cosenza. There, in 1553, he married Diana Sersale (d. 1561), a noblewoman belonging to the municipality of Cosenza. He soon became a leading figure in the city, laying foundations for the future creation of the “Accademia Cosentina” (Lupi 2011). In Cosenza, Telesio had such distinguished pupils as Sertorio Quattromani (1541-1603) and Iacopo di Gaeta (fl. 1550-1600); the philosopher and physician Agostino Doni (fl. 1545-1583); the orientalist Giovanni Battista Vecchietti (1552-1619); the future mayor of Cosenza, Giulio Cavalcanti (1591-1600); and Telesio’s first biographer, Giovan Paolo d’Aquino (d. 1612). In 1554 Telesio was elected mayor of Cosenza. Throughout the 1550s, he worked to improve the initial versions of his works, and, soon after the death of his wife (1561), he probably spent a second period of study at the Benedictine abbey of Santa Maria del Corazzo.
In the early 1560s Telesio became more familiar with the academic environment of Naples, where the works of Vesalius, Colombo, Cardano, Eustachius, Cesalpino, Fracastoro, and Jean Fernel featured prominently in the study of natural philosophy and medicine. There Telesio probably read the works of Giovanni Argenterio (1513-1572), professor of medicine in Naples from 1555 to 1560, one of the major contributors to the diffusion of new medical ideas in Southern Italy. Like Girolamo Fracastoro, Argenterio criticized the Galenic theories of contagion and diseases, contributing to the slow downfall of Galen’s authority. He also probably read the work of Giovanni Filippo Ingrassia (1510-1580), a Sicilian physician who received his scientific education at Padua—studying with Vesalius, Colombo, Eustachius, and Fracastoro—and who was also critical of Galen.
In 1563 Telesio went to Brescia, paying a visit to the Aristotelian Vincenzo Maggi (1498-1564). On that occasion, he submitted to Maggi the manuscript of the first edition of De natura iuxta propria principia. In 1565, Telesio’s masterpiece was published in Rome by the papal printer Antonio Blado. In the same period, he completed the draft of the most important of his medical writings—the aforementioned Quod animal universum ab unica animae substantia gubernatur. In the next year, the Neapolitan printer Matteo Cancer released a short treatise, Ad Felicem Moimonam iris, about the phenomenon of rainbow (Telesio 1566 and 2011). These latter two works were an early testimony to the wide range of Telesio’s philosophical interests, as much as to the originality of his method in the quest for the causes of natural phenomena. In the same year of the publication of De natura, one of Telesio’s brothers, Tommaso (1523-1569), accepted the position of Archbishop of Cosenza, a title initially offered to Bernardino by Pius IV.
Toward the end of the 1560s and the beginning of 1570s, Telesio’s philosophical reputation was becoming more and more widespread. In 1567 the humanist Giano Pelusio wrote a short poem, Ad Bernardinum Thylesium Philosophum, where the philosopher of Cosenza was compared to Pythagoras; during the next few years, Telesio was assisted by his disciple Antonio Persio in the publication of the second edition of De rerum natura (1570). In the same year three pamphlets were printed: De colorum generatione, De his quae in aere fiunt et de terraemotibus, and De mari liber unicus (Telesio 1981 and 2013). They were printed in Naples, where Telesio lived under the patronage of Alfonso and Ferrante Carafa (d. 1593).
Telesio’s fame grew in the 1570s: in 1572, Francesco Patrizi wrote an insightful review of Telesio’s De rerum natura (Objectiones), to which Telesio replied in a letter, Solutiones Tylesij; meanwhile, Antonio Persio wrote a reply entitled Apologia pro Telesio adversus Franciscum Patritium. Patrizi’s letter offered Telesio an occasion to point out some arguments of his cosmology and psychology: a) the universality of sensus rather than of the soul (anima, spiritus); b) the fiery and physical nature of the heavens, wherein the Sun is considered the source of motion as well as of the life of celestial bodies; c) the eternity of “celestial spheres” replacing the Platonic idea of creatio ex nihilo; d) the primacy of sense perception over the intellect in the cognitive process of animal understanding. Telesio’s understanding of nature championed the notion of universal sensibility (pansensism) over that of universal animation of things (panpsychism). What governs nature itself are just internal natural principles: there is no need for a divine intelligence in order to explain its inner processes and the variety of natural phenomena.
In the same years as when the correspondence between Telesio and Patrizi was published, the Florentine Francesco Martelli translated Telesio’s De rerum natura (Delle cose naturali libri due) and the treatises De mari and De his, quae in aere fiunt. Around the same period, the orientalist Giovan Battista Vecchietti spent a brief journey at Pisa, defending Telesio’s doctrines against the Aristotelians of the Studium. The temper of that young Telesian caught the attention of the Duke of Tuscany, Cosimo de’ Medici. Between 1575 and 1576 Antonio Persio published three works: Liber Novarum positionum (1575), Disputationes Libri novarum positionum, and Trattato dell’ingegno dell’huomo (1576). By 1577, Patrizi completed L’amorosa filosofia, a dialogue wherein the philosopher of Cherso mentions the acquaintance he had with Bernardino Telesio. In the late 1570s Telesio came back to Naples, and, at that time, the humanist Bonifacio Vannozzi, the rector of Pisa university, wrote a letter to Telesio, defining him as “our Socrates” (Artese 1998, 191).
Living in Naples in the first half of the 1580s, Telesio immersed himself in the production of the third edition of De rerum natura, printed in 1586. He dedicated the work to Ferrante Carafa, IV Duke of Nocera. In that edition, Telesio unpacked in nine books the earlier and later topics of his thought, from cosmology to psychology and moral philosophy. Meanwhile, his thought came to be renowned in England. During his Grand Tour of Italy (1581-1582), the mathematician Henry Savile bought a copy of the second edition of De rerum natura. Just a few decades later, Telesio’s works will have spread in the cultural circles of the early Jacobean England. James I Stuart and Francis Bacon owned copies of Telesio’s works, as did churchmen and royal physicians like John Rainolds ([Reynolds], 1549-1607; a translator of King James’s Bible) and Sir William Paddy (1554-1634, a fellow of the Royal College of Physicians of London), and aristocrats like Sir Henry Percy (1564-1632), IX Earl of Northumberland. Even if with different views and motivations, they all read Telesio’s writings. Moreover, his thought attracted the attention of the most eminent men of the “Northumberland circle”: Sir Walter Raleigh (1552-1618), Walter Warner (ca.1557-1643), Thomas Harriot (1560-1621), and Nicholas Hill.
In 1587, a Neapolitan lawyer, Giacomo Antonio Marta (1559-1628), wrote a pamphlet against Telesio, titled Pugnaculum Aristotelis contra principia Bernardini Telesii (1587). A few years later, the young Campanella, in his Philosophia sensibus demonstrata (Naples, 1591)—the most remarkable manifesto of Telesian philosophy—launched a fierce attack against Marta’s book. In the first pages of his work, Campanella made a summary of Telesio’s epistemology, pointing out the need to clarify the first grounds of the new method before commencing the inquiry into the main issues of natural philosophy. By means of Telesio, Campanella contributed—in his own way—to the development of the early modern debate about the scientific method (Firpo 1949, 182-183). The empiricist approach adopted by Telesio and Campanella did not yet have the complexity and articulation of Galileo’s method, composed by the “manifest experiences” (sensate esperienze) and “necessary demonstrations” (certe dimostrazioni); nonetheless, a number of early 17th century Italian writers did not hesitate to label the Calabrian thinkers as just as dangerous as the novatores of the Galenic circle.
On July 23rd, 1587, Telesio came back to Cosenza, and wrote his will, most likely because of ill health. He died a year later in October. Among the participants of the burial ceremony were Sertorio Quattromani, Giovan Paolo d’Aquino, the members of the “Accademia Cosentina” (Iacopo di Gaeta, Vincenzo Bombini, Giulio Cavalcanti and others), and the young Tommaso Campanella, at that time a friar of Ordo Praedicatorum, hosted in the convent of San Domenico in Cosenza. For the occasion, Campanella composed some verses dedicated to Bernardino (Al Telesio Cosentino, in Campanella 1622, n° 68).
Telesio’s natural philosophy is based on a new methodological approach to the study of nature. This is exactly what he points out in the first pages of his De natura (1565)—a work rightly characterized by some scholars as “Telesio’s masterpiece”. Such approach does not depend uniquely on his alleged modern “empiricism”. The main elements of Telesio’s “modernity” lie in his novel approach to psychology, animal physiology, and theory of science. On the one hand, Telesio offers a number of arguments for the similarity of animals and humans: for example, both animals and humans are able to perceive their own passions through the way of senses. On the other hand, the spiritus of humans is “purer” and “more abundant” than that of animals (Telesio 1586, VIII.14-15). Therefore, humans are better equipped than animals in the art of reasoning.
Telesio’s principal aim was to inquire the causes of natural phenomena without viewing those natural phenomena through the lenses of Platonic and Aristotelian metaphysics. As he states in the incipit of book I of De rerum natura (1570), “the construction of the world and the nature of the bodies contained in it should be not inspected by reason, as the Ancients did, but must be perceived by sense, and grasped from things themselves”. He did not belittle nor underestimate the role of reason. Nonetheless, he prioritizes the direct evidence that comes from the senses. The beginning of his natural philosophy lies in the experience deriving from sense perception, sensus being a cognitive power closer to natural things than reason itself. As Aristotle himself asserted, “there is nothing in the intellect that is not first in sense perception”. The first moves of Telesio’s thought were to develop this principle of classical empiricism in a new and more coherent way.
The perception of a physical object establishes a causal relation to the external world, and the first task of a scientist is to investigate the nature of that relation. In opposition to Aristotle, Telesio affirms that the ability of a sentient creature to reach knowledge of natural things is not “actualized” by the “form” of the perceived thing. He does not believe that all acts of sense perception simply mirror the natural beings of the external world. Rather, he thinks that knowledge of the world depends on the sensible data perceived by the sentient creature. That kind of affection (perceptio passionis) is the very starting point to reach knowledge of the world, as sense perception is the basic and most important property of all animals, while the act of understanding is nothing more than reckoning and reminding similarities and differences between previous sensations. In that perspective, Telesio abandoned the traditional doctrine of species, denying that natural things are the result of the combination of matter and form. According to him, the Peripatetic answer to the problem of human knowledge left unsolved the relation between causes and effects in the cognitive process. Once more, it is the concept of spiritus that lies at the core of Telesio’s psychology. As imperceptible, thin, fiery body, it constitutes our sensible soul (Telesio 1586, VII.4, and V.3); as anima sentiens of human bodies, it is present mainly in the nervous system, in order to guarantee the unity of the perception; consequently, it is the bearer of sensibility and movement (Telesio 1586, V.5., V.10, and V.12). In other words, Telesio provides a theory of mind where the spirit does produce actual internal representations in response to external stimuli—which are considered as passions—and to internal stimuli, which are the affections or the motions of spirit itself. Then, mental representations are simple reconstructions of the world. Telesio upheld that the material soul grasps natural beings by means of a corporeal, physical interaction with them. Consequently, scientific knowledge is not the result of a hierarchical process, nor does it consist in the gradual abstraction of similitudes or species (Telesio 1586, VIII.15-28). In some way, Telesio’s psychology anticipated the empiricist approach of the 17th century critics to Descartes’s doctrine of the cogito: in order to be aware of the knowledge of the natural things, humans do not need the intellectual self-consciousness of the sensible data coming from sense perception. Further, the editing process of sense perception can be improved only by sense perception, supported—when necessary—by the corporeal principle of spiritus.
Reasoning is nothing but the outcome of the self-organization of the “material soul” (spiritus) in cooperation with the “ways” or “means” of sense perception and the principal functions (memory, imagination) of the brain activated by the same principle of material soul. In order to follow their natural aim, that is, self-preservation (conservatio sui), both humans and animals are ruled by the opposed sensations of pleasure and pain, with the key function of the spirit at the core of bodily functions (Telesio 1586, VII.3; IX.2). In his early writings, Telesio did not directly challenge the theory of intelligible species of the Scholastic tradition; however, his opposition to that theory is evident in the basic principles of his psychology. They may be unfolded in five topics:
(a) intellectual cognition is based on a perceived similitude, which does not consist in a mental representation of an external object resulting from the encounter between the active intellect and passive sensation; rather, sense perception is an active operation of the spiritus, the material soul (Telesio 1586, V.34-47);
(b) the sensible data resulting from a perceptive experience has a cognitive role (as Campanella and Hobbes later explained, sensus is already a kind of iudicium; whereas understanding or imagination are nothing but “decaying sense”);
(c) the material agents involved in the cognitive process, from the “ways of sense” to the spiritus (“anima sentiens”), are merely corporeal (Telesio 1586, V.3-5, 10-12);
(d) the spirit is able to perceive because it can be subject to sensible, bodily alterations;
(e) since spiritus is the bearer of motion, a human soul does move in virtue of its own nature; what is at stake is indeed the concept of motion, in some way close to Lucretius’s atomism, even though Telesio himself does not show any intention to claim such a linkage. At the same time, Telesio’s theory excludes any mechanical approach to the physiology of sense perception: motion of bodies has to be explained through the physics of contact, and yet his theory of motion is still far from such kind of explanation that such modern authors as Gassendi, Descartes, and Hobbes later tried to provide.
Telesio’s naturalistic program, then, took sensation as a material process involving only material agents: (corporeal and) sensible objects, the “ways of sense” and the spiritus. Stating that an animal is ruled by one substance residing in its brain, Telesio abandoned Aristotle’s psychology and his threefold partition of the soul (intellective, sensitive, vegetative), as well as Galen’s partition of “pneumata” (animal, vital, natural) and his theory of “temperaments” (Telesio 1570, II.15). According to the Galenic system, the pneuma as a “transmitter substance” had a tripartite structure: a) the spiritus naturalis (pneuma physei) or vegetative, having its seat in the liver, and responsible for digestion, metabolism, production of blood and semen; b) the spiritus vitalis, localized in the heart, active in all kind of affections and motions; c) the spiritus animalis (psychei), situated in the brain, and responsible for the control and organization of the activity of the soul and of the intellect. Now, in the new system, both psychology and physiology, psyche and physis, were unified in one organic theory. Furthermore, the conception of the spiritus as a principle generated from the semen and diffused through the entire nervous system echoed some lines of Lucretius’s On the Nature of Things. Finally, locating the seat of the spirit in the brain, Telesio rejected Aristotle’s biological cardiocentrism (Telesio 1586, V.27).
In the 1586 edition of De rerum natura, Telesio introduced the notion of a divine soul (a deo immissa) to go along with the “material soul” (e semine educta) of his earlier thought (Telesio 1586, V.2-3). The idea of a divine soul capable of surviving the natural dissolution of the body is a conceptual device Telesio used with a twofold scope: on the one hand, Telesio could not deny that the concept of soul was a theological matter: Sacred Scripture teaches us that humans have a divine origin, infused by the Creator itself. Therefore, it would be unjust if God did not give to humans the prospect of an afterlife, as a remuneration for virtue and for vice experienced during the “mundane” lifetime (in that passage, it is evident that the source of Telesio’s argument is Book XIV of Marsilio Ficino’s Theologia Platonica de immortalitate animarum). On the other hand, Telesio remained faithful to the methodology of his early works: in 1586 he just pointed out the existence of a strict separation between the specific subjects of the philosopher’s and the theologian’s work. As a forerunner of the modern scientist, Telesio thought that the role of the philosopher was uniquely to inquire the secrets of nature “according its own principles”.
Telesio goes on to reject Aristotle’s definition of the soul as forma corporis, that is as the form and entelechy of an organic body (Aristotle, De anima II,1). According to Leen Spruit (1995), what matters here is the main topic of the formal mediation of sensible reality in intellectual knowledge. As it is well known, Aristotle regarded the mind as capable of grasping forms detached from matter (materia sensibilis). Aristotelian medieval commentators grounded that theory in the mediating role of representational forms called “intelligible species”.
According to Telesio, on the other hand, scientific knowledge of the world has to be necessarily mediated through sensible knowledge, which has an active role, whereas according to Aristotle the “materials” of sense perception play a passive role, from which the intellect grasps the form of each substance or natural being. Here lies another echo of Lucretius’s On the Nature of Things, where (in book III, ll. 359-369) he vigorously criticizes those philosophers who consider the senses as passive “gates” used by the soul.
As it is stated in the chapter V.2 of De rerum natura (1586), the spirit is what allows animals to perceive the external world, so it moves sometimes with the whole body, sometimes with single parts thereof. Probably inspired by the Aristotelian tradition of such authors as Alexander of Aphrodisias (on Aristotle’s Meteor. IV.8, for example), Telesio claimed that the “homeomerus” parts of the body (skin, flesh, tissues, blood, bones, and so forth) are the same for animals and humans: they differ in their appetites and needs, not in their calculations (logoi), and importantly, they all have the same kind of sense perceptions. Thus animal and human souls differ in degree, not in kind or quality.
Analogously, whereas Aristotle (in Meteor. book IV) asserted that all sensitive parts of the body must be homogeneous and be a direct composition of the four elements, in Telesio’s view, the variety of dispositions and functions of the different parts of the body had to be explained in the same way that the majority of the natural bodies are. In other words, the “homeomerous” mixtures cannot be considered as the “ultimate” parts of the “anhomeomerous” bodies (organs such as the eye, the heart, the liver, the lungs and so forth). Even though the spiritus is mostly present in the brain and in the nervous system, it is also spread throughout the entire body and, just like a brain, it was responsible for the motions, changes and the combination of different parts of the body. By the way of the sensus, the dynamics of attraction and repulsion provided for the constant balance of the living body.
Telesio eschewed metaphysical speculation; in his view, the most important task of the natural philosopher is to give attention to the observable phenomena in the natural world, looking for the causes of “sensible beings” (Telesio 1586, II.3). Thus it was in the spirit of the natural philosopher that he theorized that all natural things are the result of the two active and mutually antagonistic forces, “heat” and “cold”, acting upon matter, and thereby making possible the creation of inanimate and animate beings. Heat is responsible for the phenomena of elasticity, warmth, dryness, combustion, and lightness, as well as rarefaction of matter and motion and velocity of bodies; cold is responsible for the slowness of bodies in motion, and for their condensation, freezing and hardness. All the other natural phenomena (such as humidity or fermentation) are the results of combinations of different degrees of heat and cold. The interaction of heat and cold affects the nature of matter itself, a notion that Telesio intentionally left unclear. Taken per se, the concept of matter cannot be directly sensed, and its existence can simply be postulated, just like the notion of spiritus.
In this way Telesio rejected Aristotle’s view, according to which the two pairs of opposed qualities (cold/heat, and dry/humid), acting on the matter, gave rise to one of the four primary elements of natural beings (earth, air, fire, and water). According to Telesio, matter, as a physical, corporeal subjectum, has a merely passive role. In fact, what is important according to Telesio are the modifications of the subjectum, that is, the results of interactions between heat and cold (Telesio 1586, II.2).
On Telesio’s view, all things act according to their own nature, starting from the primary forces of cold and heat, by means of the ability to perceive each other. In order to sustain themselves, these primary forces and all beings which arise through their antagonistic interaction must be able to perceive themselves as opposite forces. In other words, they have to sense what is convenient and what is inconvenient or damaging for their own survival. Living bodies do not constitute a specific realm, separated from inanimate beings. They are all determined by the solar heat and the terrestrial matter. Again, it is important to note that sensation is not only a property of animate beings. Telesio’s philosophy can thus be described as a kind of pansensism: all beings, both animate and inanimate, are said to have the power of sensation. In fact, in the third edition (1586) of De rerum natura, the motion of celestial bodies will be explained by means of the principle of “self-preservation” (conservatio sui), in other words, the need to sustain the life itself of those bodies.
At the heart of Telesio’s cosmology, then, is the idea that nature is ruled by its own—internal, not external—principles. Consequently, the natural world does not need to be taken care of by any kind of divine intelligence. Heat and cold share the same “desire” to preserve themselves. The celestial spheres are made of matter, heat and cold (ivi, I.11-12, 8-9). Regarding the Ptolemaic system, Telesio rejected it as unnatural, probably because of the growing suspicion—in the 16th century cosmology—that it provided a mathematical device to “save the appearances,”, leaving unexplained the question of the actual natural causes of the planetary motions, as well as of other celestial phenomena. Beginning with the first edition of De rerum natura, Telesio’s objective was to replace Aristotle’s geocentrism with one of his own. At the cosmological level, the interplay between heat and cold involves the position of the Sun and of the Earth, being the seats and sources of heat and coldness, respectively. Because of its heat, the Sun was propelled into perpetual motion, whereas the Earth is immobile because of its coldness and its great weight. Consequently, the cosmic balance and harmony of the heavens depend on the struggle and equilibrium between the Sun and the Earth. Unlike Aristotle, Telesio upheld the fiery nature of the heavens. That moved the philosopher of Cosenza to deny the Aristotelian principle of a first-mover of the universe. Planetary motions are not the outcome of the patterns of motion between the several regions of the celestial spheres; rather, they are the consequence of a geocentric system ruled by thermal forces, wherein are still valid the ancient notions of densum and rarum.
Thus, Telesio chose heat and cold as the principal agents for knowledge of the world because together with prime matter (moles), they immediately affect bodies and their functions. As said before, the two primary bodies, the Sun and the Earth, are the subjects of Telesio’s argument. The former is the seat of heat, and the latter is that of cold (Telesio 1565, I.1-4). That statement literally expelled the idea of a creatio ex nihilo. Electing the Sun and the Earth as the celestial seats of heat and cold, Telesio defines the boundaries of the universe as the edges of the corporeal world (extrema corpora universi)Life itself depends on the right balance of heat and cold, and they are lastly called “forces of acting natures”, agentium naturarum vires (Telesio 1586 VII.9). The later Telesio, in fact, was firmly convinced that the world depended from the inner uniformity of nature and from its intrinsic virtue or “wisdom”.
Furthermore, against Aristotle, Telesio denied the theory of the locus as the limit of a body, taking into account the atomistic theory of space as an empty place filled by the bodies. By means of the two forces of heat and cold, and by affirming the idea of a space filled by matter, he abolished the Aristotelian theory of a cosmos divided into a sublunary world, in which generation and corruption take place, and a superlunary world with timeless regular movements. Moreover, he developed a critique of the Peripatetic theory of natural locus, pointing out that Aristotelians did not explain well the reason why the motion of heavy bodies becomes uniformly accelerated.
With the publication of his early works (1565, 1566, 1570), Telesio established himself as a key figure in the intellectual milieu of the late 16th to early 17th century Italy. Some of his theses were read, commented on, and debated by a number of Italian philosophers, physicians, and amateurs of science, such as Francesco Patrizi, Antonio Persio, Agostino Doni, Giordano Bruno, Giambattista Vecchietti, Latino Tancredi, Tommaso Campanella, Andrea Chiocco, Giulio Cortese, Francesco de’ Vieri, Alessandro Tassoni, and Marco Aurelio Severino. In the early 17th century his writings circulated around Europe, and were read by Francis Bacon, Marin Mersenne, René Descartes, Pierre Gassendi, Jean-Cécile Frey, Charles Sorel, Walter Warner, Thomas Hobbes, and others.
One of the first authors to officially criticize the philosophy of the “Telesians” is Francesco de’ Vieri (1524-1591), lecturer of Aristotelian philosophy at the University of Pisa. In 1573 he published in Florence a work on the vernacular, Trattato delle metheore, in three books. The same work, augmented with a huge fourth book of 200 pages, edited in 1582, contains a rehearsal of the principal topics of the fourth book of Aristotle’s Meteorologica, and, with the purpose of showing his Platonic reading of Aristotle’s philosophy, he took occasion to attack the “Telesians”, with the aim of persuading them with “their own arguments” (p. 227). His critique of Telesio and of the Telesians is particularly significant because he offers a reassessment of the Aristotelian notion of sensus through the key reading of the Platonic concept of pneuma (a word belonging to the Stoic and pre-Aristotelian lexicon). As said above, Telesio translates the Greek word pneuma into the Latin expression of spiritus or anima sentiens. Some pages after the aforementioned quotation, Verino states that God created souls as eternal beings (ab aeterno), because a soul is not grasped from the alteration of matter (p. 247). This is a clear reference to the Telesian idea of a spiritus grasped from a material seed (spiritusex semine educta). In a manuscript kept at the National Library of Florence (Magl. XII.11, f. 23), the same author attacked Telesio and his followers, who erroneously attribute to the sensus “all judgments about the natural things”. It is important to recall that when Francesco de’ Vieri published the 1582 edition of his book, Telesio’s philosophy had already reached, in Tuscany and across Italy, the apex of its fame.
In 1587, a year before Telesio’s death, the Spanish philosopher Oliva Sabuco de Nantes y Barrera published a book, Nueva filosofía de la naturaleza del hombre, where she elaborated on a psychophysiology of the human body deeply influenced by Telesio’s doctrines (Bidwell-Steiner 2012). Then, in 1588 Francesco Muti published a work entitled Disceptationum libri V contra calumnias Theodori Angelutii in maximum philosophum Franciscum Patritium, in quibus pene universa Aristotelis philosophia in examen adducitur, in which he defended Telesio, taking in consideration the quarrel that took place at Ferrara during 1584 and 1585 between Patrizi and Angelucci (Sergio 2013, 71-72, 74). In 1589, Sertorio Quattromani, the new founder of the “Accademia Cosentina,” published a summary of Telesio’s thought called La filosofia di Bernardino Telesioris tretta in brevità e scritta in lingua Toscana (Naples, 1591).
In the last decade of the 16th century, an important role was played by Antonio Persio (1542-1612). Among Telesio’s disciples, Persio was the one who worked on the Venetian edition of the Varii de naturalibus rebus libelli (Apud Felice Valgrisium, 1590). That edition included both the booklets already published in 1570 (De his, quae in aerefiunt et de terrae motibus; De colorum generatione; De Mari) plus a number of writings Telesio had left unpublished (De cometis et lacteo circulo; De iride; Quod animal universum ab unica animae substantia gubernator; De usure spirationis; De coloribus; De saporibus; De somno). Some years later, one of Telesio’s former disciples, Giovan Paolo d’Aquino, published Oratione in morte di Berardino [sic] Telesio Philosopho Eccellentissimo agli Academici Cosentini (Cosenza, per Leonardo Angrisano, 1596), the first biography of the philosopher of Cosenza.
As noted above, in 1591 Campanella wrote a stunning defense of Telesian philosophy against Giacomo Antonio Marta’s Pugnaculum Aristotelis. In his work, Campanella took occasion to unfold and reassess the principles of Telesio’s naturalism, somehow anticipating (in his Praefatio) the basic essentials of Galileo’s methodology (above all, the alliance between the “sensate esperienze” and the “certe dimostrazioni”). Another early modern thinker to note, Alessandro Tassoni, devoted a number of pages of his works to Telesio’s meteorology (Trabucco 2019).
In the first decades of the 17th century, in Italy, Telesio’s ideas entered a wider scientific context, a constellation populated by a number of scientists interested in the so-called “mathematization of the world”, such as Galileo and the network of his disciples and correspondents. However, the new mathematical trend of natural philosophy did not eclipse Telesio’s merits and the scientific value of his work. Authors such as Latino Tancredi, Colantonio Stigliola, Marco Aurelio Severino, and Tommaso Cornelio will continue to spread his thought. Especially in Southern Italy, Telesio’s name became the distinctive mark of a philosophical tradition dating back to the greatest authors of the ancient, pre-Aristotelian period, such as Pythagoras, Empedocles, Philolaus, Alcmaeon, Timaeus of Locri, and so forth.
Meanwhile, in England, Francis Bacon devoted some pages of his writings to Telesio: firstly in his Advancement of Learning (1605), then in De principiis atque originibus, secundum fabulas Cupidinis et Coeli (1613), and finally in his Sylva sylvarum. Bacon’s reading of Telesio’s philosophy mainly focused on the portrayal of Telesio as the restorer of Parmenides’s philosophy, freezing the Calabrian thinker in the role of an innovator who took inspiration from the Eleatic monism for the setting of his materialistic world-view (Rees 1977, De Mas 1989, Bondì 2001, Garber 2016). At same time, Bacon himself expressed some concerns about the limits of Telesio’s theory of matter. According to Lord Verulam, Telesio’s concept of matter lies unexplained in regards to its specific function in the processes of generation and transformation of natural beings. However, Bacon admired such authors as Telesio, Cardano, and Della Porta with respect to the notion of spiritus, the power of imagination, and the sympathy between animate and inanimate objects (Gouk 1984). In that way, it is fair to say that Bacon contributed to the construction of the mythical conception of Telesio as a freethinker deeply indebted to the pre-Socratic tradition, which is not to say that the myth is altogether misleading (see Giglioni 2010: 70).
Back in the European continent, some 17th century traces of Telesio’s legacy can be found in such authors as Marin Mersenne (Quaestiones celeberrimae in Genesim, Paris, 1623); Gabriel Naudé (Apologie pour tous les grand personnages qui ont esté faussement soupçonnez de magie, Paris, 1625; Advis pour dresser une bibliotheque, Paris, 1627); Jean-Cécile Frey (Cribrum philosophorum qui Aristotelem superiore et hacaetate oppugnarunt, in Opuscula varia nusquamedita, Paris, 1646); Charles Sorel (Le sommaire des opinions les plus estranges des novateurs modernes en la philosophie comme de Telesius, de Patritius, de Cardan, de Ramus, de Campanelle, de Descartes, et autres, in De la perfection de l’homme, où les vrays biens sont considérez et spécialement ceux de l’âme, Paris, 1655; reprinted in La science universelle, vol. 4, 1668); Guy Holland (The grand prerogative of human nature, namely, the soul’s natural or native immortality, and freedom from corruption, London, 1653); and Pierre Gassendi (Syntagma philosophicum, in Opera Omnia, vol. I, Paris, 1658).
Another testimony of the role of Telesio’s legacy in the 17th century Naples is contained in Tommaso Cornelio’s Progymnasmataphysica (Venetiis, 1663): compare the Progymn. II. De initiis rerum naturalium; the Epistolade Platonica Circompulsione, and Epistola M. Aurelij Severini nomine conscripta (repr. Venetiis, 1683, pp. 41-42, 140, 144, 146, and 190-191).
In the French context, Pierre Gassendi was one of the most important authors to give attention to the Cosentine thinker. In his writings such novatores as Telesio and Campanella are mentioned in regards to the theories of space and time as well as the theory of sensory qualities including heat and cold (Syntagma, in Opera, I, 245b), as well as in Gassendi’s tripartite conception of void—that is to say, the inane separatum, that is, the idea of an infinite void expanding beyond the atmosphere; the inane disseminatum, that is, the interparticle void between the basic corpuscles of bodies; and the inane coacervatum, that is, the interparticle void “cobbled” together by experimental means (Opera I, 185a-187a, 192a-196a, 196b-203a). On that subject, in Gassendi’s notion of vacuum coarcevatum, there is no way to explain how bodies may divide and separate at the level of basic particles without the supposition of that kind of void; here, Gassendi found evidently insufficient the explanation of Telesio according to which heat and cold are the active principles of matter (for further details, see Fisher 2005, and Henry 1979).
Finally, a specific debt towards Telesio is also identifiable in Thomas Hobbes’s works. In the first chapter of Leviathan (1651), Hobbes openly rejected the doctrine of species, and in successive chapters he asserted a cohesive relationship between sense, imagination and reasoning, consistent with the Telesian approach (a first trace of that influence dates back to the Elements of Law, Natural and Politic, written in 1640). What is more, the notion of “self-preservation” (conservatio sui) was reassessed in Hobbes’s anthropology. Telesio’s influence became more explicit in 1655 in Hobbes’s De corpore, sect. IV., chap. XXV. In the fifth article of that chapter, Hobbes unfolds the basic properties of sensation and cognition in the simplest structures of the organized matter in motion. In the same place he provides a suggestion which allows us to place his materialism close to the Renaissance pansensism advanced by Telesio and Campanella. After he explained in a general way his physiology of sensation and animal locomotion, he stated:
I know there have been philosophers, and those learned men, who have maintained that all bodies are endued with sense. Nor do I see how they can be refuted, if the nature of sense be placed in reaction only. And, though by reaction of bodies inanimate a phantasm might be made, it would nevertheless cease, as soon as ever the object were removed. For unless those bodies had organs, as living creatures have, fit for the retaining of such motion as is made in them, their sense would be such, as that they should never remember the same (Hobbes 1656, XXV.5, p. 226. On the subject, see Schuhmann 1988: 109-133; Sergio 2008: 298-315).
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