The Theory-Theory of Concepts

The Theory-Theory of concepts is a view of how concepts are structured, acquired, and deployed. Concepts, as they will be understood here, are mental representations that are implicated in many of our higher thought processes, including various forms of reasoning and inference, categorization, planning and decision making, and constructing and testing explanations. The view states that concepts are organized within and around theories, that acquiring a concept involves learning such a theory, and that deploying a concept in a cognitive task involves theoretical reasoning, especially of a causal-explanatory sort.

The term “Theory-Theory” derives from Adam Morton (1980), who proposed that our everyday understanding of human psychology constitutes a kind of theory by which we try to predict and explain behavior in terms of its causation by beliefs, intentions, emotions, traits of character, and so on. The idea that psychological knowledge and understanding might be explained as theory possession also derives from Premack & Woodruff’s famous 1978 article, “Does the Chimpanzee Have a Theory of Mind?” A Theory-Theory in general is thus a proposal to explain a certain psychological capacity in terms of a tacit or explicit internally represented theory of a domain. The Theory-Theory of concepts, however, goes beyond the mere claim that we possess such theories, saying in addition that some or all of our concepts are constituted by their essential connections with these theories.

The origins of the Theory-Theory involve several converging lines of investigation. First, it arose as part of a general critique of the formerly dominant prototype theory of concepts; second, it was an empirically-motivated response to the shortcomings of the developmental theories of Piaget and Vygotsky; and third, it involved applying ideas from Kuhn’s philosophy of science to explain phenomena having to do with the development of cognition in individuals. While the theory has often been vaguely formulated, due in large part to the open-endedness inherent in the central notion of a theory, there are substantial bodies of empirical evidence that underlie the main tenets of the view. In particular, the Theory-Theory has been responsible for largely displacing the notion that cognitive development starts from a simple base of perceptual primitives grouped together by similarity. Rather, it is guided by domain-specific explanatory expectations at many stages, and these expectations can be seen to function in adult reasoning and categorization as well. While strong versions of the Theory-Theory have been subject to numerous objections, these contributions endure and continue to shape what many scholars claim are the best existing models of higher cognition.

Table of Contents

  1. Background
  2. The Theory-Theory
    1. Origins of the View
    2. Theories Defined
    3. Concepts in Theories Versus Concepts as Theories
  3. Support for the Theory-Theory
    1. Cognitive Development
    2. Adult Categorization, Inference, and Learning
  4. Relations to Other Views
    1. Relations to Essentialism
    2. Relations to Causal Modeling Approaches
  5. Objections to the Theory-Theory
    1. Holism
    2. Compositionality
    3. Scope
  6. Disanalogies Between Development and Science
  7. Conclusions
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Background

The Theory-Theory emerged in part as a reaction to existing trends in the psychology of concepts and categorization, which during the late 1970’s was dominated by the prototype theory of concepts. Exemplar models were also being developed during this time, but the prototype theory encapsulated many of the views which were the foils against which the Theory-Theory developed its main assumptions.

Prototype theory derives in large part from the work of Eleanor Rosch and her collaborators (Rosch, 1977; Rosch & Mervis, 1975; see Smith & Medin, 1981 for historical perspective and Hampton, 1995 for a canonical statement of the view). These theories assume that concepts represent statistical information about the categories that they pick out. The concept tree represents the properties that people take to be typical of trees: they have bark, they can grow to be relatively tall, they have green leaves that may change color, they have a certain silhouette, birds often nest in them, they grow potentially edible fruits, and so on. These comprise the tree prototype (or stereotype).

This stereotype is acquired by a process of abstraction from examples: individual trees are perceptually salient parts of the environment, and by repeated perception of such category instances, one gradually forms a summary representation that ‘averages’ the qualities of the trees one has observed. This summary is often represented as a list of features that belong to category members. Properties that are more frequently perceived in the instances will be assigned a greater feature weight in the prototype. This process of concept acquisition is often portrayed as a passive one.

Finally, novel objects are categorized as falling under a prototype concept in virtue of their similarity to the prototype—that is, by how many features they share with it (weighted by those features’ importance). Similarity computations also explain other phenomena, such as the fact that some objects are better examples of a category than others (flamingos and penguins are atypical birds since they lack most of the prototypical bird features).

The prototype theory has several characteristics which made it a fitting target for Theory theorists. First, it suggests that concepts have a basically superficial nature. Often, though not invariably, features in prototypes were assumed to be readily perceivable. Prototype theory was thus affiliated with a certain empiricist bent. This was reinforced by the fact that prototypes are acquired by a simple statistical-associative process akin to that assumed by classical empiricists. Second, prototype theory involved a relatively impoverished account of conceptual development and deployment. Concepts passively adjust themselves to new stimuli, and these stimuli activate stored concepts in virtue of their resemblances, but there is little role for active revision or reflective deployment of these concepts. In the wake of the anti-empiricist backlash that gave rise to contemporary cognitive science, particularly in cognitive-developmental psychology, these assumptions were ripe for questioning.

2. The Theory-Theory

a. Origins of the View

The Theory-Theory itself has a somewhat complicated origin story, with roots in a number of philosophical and psychological doctrines. One is the reaction against stage theories of cognitive development, particularly Piagetian and Vygotskian theories. Stage theories propose that children’s cognitive development follows a rigid and universal script, with a fixed order of transitions from one qualitatively distinct form of thought to another taking place across all domains on the same schedule. Each stage is characterized by a distinctive set of representations and processes. In Piaget’s theory, children move through sensorimotor, preoperational, concrete operational, and formal operational stages from birth to roughly 11 or 12 years old. Similarly, Vygotsky held that children move from a stage of representing categories in terms of sensory images of individual objects, through a stage of creating representations of objectively unified categories, and finally a stage of categories arranged around abstract, logical relationships.

While Piaget and Vygotsky’s stage theories differ, both hold that early childhood thought is characterized by representation of categories in terms of their perceivable properties and the inability to reason abstractly (causally or logically) about these categories. Early childhood cognition, in short, involves being perceptually bound. While the empirical basis and explanatory structure of these theories had been challenged before (see R. Gelman & Baillargeon, 1983 and Wellman & Gelman, 1988 for review), Theory theorists such as Carey (1985), Gopnik (1988, 1996), Gopnik & Meltzoff (1997), and Keil (1989) went beyond providing disconfirming evidence and began to lay out an alternative positive vision of how cognitive development proceeds.

A second root of the Theory-Theory derives from philosophy of science, particularly from Kuhn’s account of theory change and scientific revolutions. Kuhn’s view is too complex to summarize here, but two aspects of it have been particularly influential in developmental psychology.

One is Kuhn’s notion that theory change in science involves periods of ‘normal science’, during which a mature theory is applied successfully to a range of phenomena, and periods of ‘paradigm shifting’. A paradigm shift occurs when counterevidence to a theory has built up beyond a certain threshold and it can no longer be adequately modified in response, consistent with its not becoming intolerably ad hoc. In paradigm shifts, new explanatory notions and models take center stage, and old ones may be pushed to the margins or adopt new roles. New practices and styles of experimentation become central. These changes are relatively discontinuous compared with the usual gradual accumulation of changes and modifications characteristic of science.

A second, connected with this notion of a paradigm shift, is the Kuhnian doctrine of incommensurability. This is the idea that when new theories are constructed, the central explanatory concepts of the old theory often change their meaning, so that a claim made before and after a paradigm shift, even if it uses the same words, may not express the same proposition, since those words now express different concepts. The concept of mass, as it existed in pre-relativistic physics, no longer means the same thing—indeed, we now need to distinguish between uses of ‘mass’ that pick out rest mass and those that pick out relativistic mass. Often this involves creating new concepts that cannot be captured in the conceptual vocabulary of the old theory, differentiating two concepts that were previously conflated, or coalescing two previously distinct concepts into one. In all of these cases, the expressive vocabulary of the new conceptual scheme is not equivalent to that of the old scheme. Theory theorists have often adopted both the Kuhnian claim about paradigm shifts as a model for understanding certain phenomena in development, and the associated claim of semantic or conceptual incommensurability (Carey, 1991).

A third root involves what Keil (1989) dubs the rejection of ‘Original Sim’. Original Sim is roughly the view of category structure and learning suggested by prototype theory, particular  an empiricist one. This view is most clearly defended by Quine (1977), who proposes that children begin life with an innate similarity space that is governed by perceptual information, and over time begin to develop theoretical structures that supersede these initial groupings. On this empiricist perspective, children’s first concepts should be bundles of perceptual features, typically consisting of intrinsic rather than relational properties, and categorization should be simply a matter of matching the perceived features of a novel object to those of the concept. Inductive inferences concerning a category are within reach so long as they are confined to these observable properties, and objects share inductive potential to the extent that they are similar to the perceptual prototype. Moreover, these perceptual prototypes are assumed to be acquired by statistical tabulation of observed co-occurrences in the world, in a relatively theory-free way; seeing that certain furry quadrupeds meow is sufficient for constructing a cat concept that encodes these properties. It is only at later stages of development that concepts reflect understanding of the hidden structure of categories, and come to enable inductions that go beyond such similarities.

Fourth, Theory-Theory is often motivated by the hypothesis that certain concepts (or categories) have a kind of coherence that makes them seem especially non-arbitrary (Murphy & Medin, 1985; Medin & Wattenmaker, 1987). The categories of diamonds, sports cars, or otters seem to be relatively ‘coherent’ in the sense that their members bear interesting and potentially explainable relations to one another: diamonds are made of carbon atoms whose organization explains their observable properties, otters share a common ancestry and genetic-developmental trajectory that explain their phenotype and behavior, and so forth. On the other hand, the category of things on the left side of my desk, or things within 100 feet of the Eiffel Tower, or things that are either electrons or clown wigs, do not. They are simply arbitrary collections.

Feature-based theories of concepts, such as prototype theory, seem to have particular difficulty explaining the phenomenon of coherence, since they are inherently unconstrained and allow any set of properties to be lumped together to form a category, whereas our concepts often appear to represent categories as involving more than merely sets of ad hoc co-instantiated properties. They include relations among these properties, as well as explanatory connections of various sorts. We don’t merely think of sports cars as expensive artifacts with four wheels, big engines, a sleek shape, and bright coloration, which make a loud noise as they roar past at high speed. These features are explanatorily connected in various ways: their shape and engine size contribute to their speed, their engines explain their noisiness, their speed and attractive appearance explain their costliness, and so on. Insofar as these explanatory relations among properties are represented, concepts themselves are more coherent, reflecting our implicit belief in the worldly coherence of their categories. Theories are the conceptual glue that makes many of our everyday and scientific concepts coherent, and models of concepts that fail to accord theories an important role are missing an account of a crucial phenomenon (however, see Margolis, 1999 for detailed criticism of this notion).

From this survey, it should be clear that the development of Theory theories of concepts has been driven by a host of different motivations and pressures. Hence there exist many flavors of the view, each with its own distinctive formulation, concerns, and central phenomena. However, despite the fact that the view lacks a canonical statement, it possesses a set of family resemblances that make it an interesting source of predictions and a robust framework for empirical research, as well as a unified target of criticism.

b. Theories Defined

The first essential posit of these views is the notion of a mentally represented theory. Theories are bodies of information (or, as psychologists and linguists sometimes say, bodies of knowledge) about a particular domain. Such theories have been posited to explain numerous psychological capacities: linguistic competence results from a theory of the grammar of English or Urdu; mental state attribution results from a theory of mind; even visual perception results from a theory of how 3-D objects in space behave in relation to the observer. But theories are not just any body of information held in memory. What makes theories distinctive or special? Keil (1989, p. 279) called this “the single most important problem for future research” in the Theory-Theory tradition.

Gopnik & Meltzoff (1997, pp. 32-41) give what is probably the most comprehensive set of conditions on theories. These conditions fall into three categories: structural, functional, and dynamic. Structurally, theories are abstract, coherent, causally organized, and ontologically committed bodies of information. They are abstract in that they posit entities and laws using a vocabulary that differs from the vocabulary used to state the evidence that supports them. They are coherent in that there are systematic relations between the entities posited by the theory and the evidence. Theories are causal insofar as the structure that they posit in the world to explain observable regularities is ordinarily a causal one. Finally, they are ontologically committed if the entities that they posit correspond to real kinds, and also support counterfactuals about how things would be under various non-actual circumstances. Some of these conditions are also advanced by Keil (1989, p. 280), who proposes that causal relations are central to theories, especially where they are homeostatic and hierarchically organized.

Functionally, theories must make predictions, interpret evidence in new ways, and provide explanations of phenomena in their domain. The predictions of theories go beyond simple generalizations of the evidence, and include ranges of phenomena that the theory was not initially developed to cover. Theories interpret evidence by providing new descriptions that influence what is seen as relevant or salient and what is not. And crucially, theories provide explanations of phenomena, understood as an abstract, coherent causal account of how the phenomena are produced and sustained. Theories are essentially related to the phenomena that make up their domain; hence in Keil’s developed view, there is a key role for associative relations in providing the raw data for theoretical development as well as a ‘fallback’ for when theories run out (Keil, 1989, p. 281).

Last, theories are not static representations, but have dynamic properties. This follows from the fact that they develop in response to, and may gain in credibility or be defeated by, the empirical evidence. The sorts of dynamic properties that characterize theories include: an initial period involving the accumulation of evidence via processes of experimentation and observation, the discovery of counterevidence, the possible discounting of such evidence as noise, the generation of ad hoc hypotheses to amend a theory, the production of a new theory when an old one has accumulated too much contrary evidence or too many ugly and complicated auxiliary amendments.

c. Concepts in Theories Versus Concepts as Theories

Once the central explanatory construct of a mental theory is clear, two varieties of the Theory-Theory need to be distinguished. These views differ on the nature of the relationship between concepts and theories.

On the concepts in theories view, concepts are the constituents of theories. Theories are understood as something like bodies of beliefs or other propositional representations, and these beliefs have concepts as their constituents. The belief that electrons are negatively charged is part of our theory of electrons, and that belief contains the concept electron as a part (as well as has negative charge). The set of electron, involving beliefs that meet the sorts of constraints laid out in section 2b, constitute one’s theory of electrons. These beliefs describe the sorts of things electrons are, how they can be expected to behave, how they are detected, how they relate to other fundamental physical entities, how they can be exploited for practical purposes, and so on. For the concepts in theories view, concepts function much like theoretical terms.

On the concepts as theories view, on the other hand, the constituency relations run the opposite direction. Concepts themselves are identified with miniature theories of a particular domain. For instance, Keil (1989, p. 281) proposes that “[m]ost concepts are partial theories themselves in that they embody explanations of the relations between their constituents, of their origins, and of their relations to other clusters of features.” So the concept electron would itself be made up of various theoretical postulates concerning electrons, their relationship to other particles, their causal propensities which explain phenomena in various domains of physics, and so on. Concepts are not terms in theories, they are themselves theories.

As stated, the concepts in theories view is scarcely controversial. If people possess mentally represented theories at all, then those theories are composed of beliefs and concepts, and so at least some of our concepts are embedded in theory-like knowledge structures. Call this the weak concepts in theories view. A strong concepts in theories view, on the other hand, says that not only are concepts embedded in theories, but they are also individuated by those theories. Carey (1985, p. 198) seems to hold this view: “Concepts must be identified by the roles they play in theories.” This is just to say that what makes them the very concepts that they are is their relationships (inferential, associative, causal, explanatory, and so forth.) with the other concepts and beliefs in the theory. There are many ways of carving out different notions of inferential or theoretically significant roles for concepts to play, but on all of them, concepts are constituted by their relations to other concepts and to the evidence that governs their conditions of application.

A consequence seems to be that if those relationships change, or if the theory itself changes in certain respects, then the concepts change as well. The change from a view on which atoms are the smallest, indivisible elements of matter to one on which atoms are made up of more fundamental particles might represent a sufficiently central and important change that the concept atom itself is no longer the same after such a transition takes place; similarly, perhaps the victory of anti-vitalism entailed a change in the concept life from being essentially linked with a particular irreducible vital force to being decoupled from such commitments. Notice that this consequence also applies to the concepts as theories view. If a concept is identified with a theory (rather than being merely embedded in it), it seems as if, prima facie, any change to the theory is a change to the concept.

The concepts as theories view poses separate difficulties of its own. On this view, concepts are extremely complex data structures composed of some sort of theoretical principles, laws, generalizations, explanatory connections, and so on. What status do these have? A natural suggestion is to regard all of these as being beliefs. But this view is straightforwardly incompatible with a view on which concepts are the constituents of beliefs and other higher thoughts. It is mereologically impossible both for concepts both be identified with terms in theories and with theories themselves. We would need some other way of talking about the representations that make up beliefs if we choose to regard concepts as simply being miniature theories.

Despite the differences between these two views, the empirical evidence taken to support the Theory-Theory does not generally discriminate between them, nor have psychologists always been careful to mark these distinctions. As with many debates over representational posits, the views in question generate differing predictions only in combination with supplementary assumptions about cognitive processing and resources. However, there may be theoretical reasons for preferring one view over the other; these will be discussed further in section 5.

3. Support for the Theory-Theory

a. Cognitive Development

Much of the support for the Theory-Theory comes from developmental studies. Carey (1985) largely initiated this line of research with her investigations of children’s concepts of animal, living thing, and kindred biological notions. For example, she found that major changes occur in children’s knowledge of bodies and their functioning from four to eleven years old. The youngest children understand eating, breathing, digesting, and so forth, mainly as human behaviors, and they explain them in terms of human needs, desires, plans, and conventions. Over time, children build various new accounts of bodies, initially treating them as simple containers and finally differentiating them into separate organs that have their own biological functions. In Carey’s terms, young children start out seeing behavior as governed by an intuitive psychological theory, out of which an intuitive biology develops (1985, p. 69).

The centrality of humans to young children’s understanding of living things can be seen in several studies. Four and five year olds are reluctant to attribute animal properties—even eating and breathing—to living beings other than humans. When asked to name things that have various properties of living things, children overwhelmingly pick ‘people’ first, followed by mammals, and then a few other scattered types of creatures. The primacy of people in biology carries over to judgments of similarity, with adults displaying a smooth gradient of similarity between people and other living things and six year olds seeing a sharp dividing line between people and the rest of the animal kingdom, including mammals. Finally, in inductive projection tasks people are clearly paradigmatic for four year olds: if told that a person has an organ called a spleen, they will project having a spleen to dogs and bees, but rarely the opposite. By age 10, people are seen as no longer unique in this respect. So young children’s theory of life is focused initially around humans as the paradigm exemplars, and only later becomes generalized as they discover commonalities among all animals and other living things. Indeed, the very concept living thing comes to be acquired as this knowledge develops.

Keil (1989) added to the evidence with many striking results concerning how children’s concepts of natural kinds, nominal kinds, and artifacts develop from kindergarten onwards. He finds compelling evidence for what he initially called a ‘characteristic-to-defining’ shift in conceptual structure. Characteristic features are akin to prototypes: compilations of statistically significant but possibly superficial properties found in categories. Defining features, on the other hand, are those that genuinely make something the kind of thing that it is, regardless of how well it corresponds to the observed characteristics.

In a series of discovery studies, Keil (1989) gave children descriptions of objects that have the characteristic features belonging to a natural kind, but which were later discovered to have the (plausible) defining features of a different kind; for example, an animal that looks and acts like a horse but which is discovered to have the inside parts of cows as well as cow parents and cow babies. While at age five, children thought these things were horses, by age seven they were more likely to think them cows, and adults were nearly certain these were cows. Defining features based on biology (internal structure, parentage) come to dominate characteristic features (appearance, behavior).

In a related series of transformation studies, children heard about a member of a natural kind which underwent some sort of artificial alterations to its appearance, behavior, and insides; for example, a raccoon that was dyed to look like a skunk and operated on so that it produces a foul, skunk-like odor. Five-year olds thought these transformations changed the raccoon into a skunk, while seven year olds were more resistant, and nine year olds were nearly sure that such changes in kind weren’t possible. This effect was notably stronger for biological kinds than mineral kinds; however, children at all ages strongly resisted the idea that a member of a biological kind could be turned into something from a different ontological category (for example, an animal cannot be turned into a plant). Finally, some kinds of transformations are more likely to change a thing’s kind: among five year olds, alterations to internal or developmental features along with permanent surface parts are more effective than temporary surface changes or costumes, and internal changes retain their influence until at least age nine.

In Keil’s view, this shows that children may start out with a comparatively impoverished theory of what makes something a member of a biological kind (or a mineral kind, social kind, or artifact kind), but this theory is enriched and deepened with more causal principles governing origins, growth, internal structure, reproduction, nutrition, and behavior. As this network of causal principles becomes more enriched they recognize that the category members are defined by the presence of these theoretically significant linkages rather than by the more superficial features that initially guided them. ‘Primal theories’ develop into more mature folk theories in different domains according to their own time course.

Finally, Gopnik & Meltzoff (1997) survey a range of domains to argue for the early emergence of theories. To take one example, they argue that children’s understanding of objects and object appearances starts off as highly theoretical and develops in response to new experience until they achieve adult form. Six-month olds, for instance, fail to search for objects that are hidden behind screens, and they show no surprise when an object moves behind a screen, fails to appear at a gap in the middle of the screen, but then appears whole from behind the other side of the screen. These behaviors only emerge at 9 months. Gopnik & Meltzoff explain this change by claiming that the infants come to understand that occlusion makes objects invisible. Until 12 months, however, they continue to make the ‘A-not-B’ error, which involves searching for an object under the first occluder it disappeared behind, rather than the last one. They ascribe this failure to children’s adherence to an auxiliary hypothesis of the form: objects will be where they appeared before. This rule is abandoned when it comes to conflict with the evidence and the child’s developing theory of object behavior. In addition, from ages 12 to 18 months, children begin to systematically play (‘experiment’) with hiding and invisible displacement, suggesting that they are interested in generating evidence about this developing cognitive domain. This in turn strengthens the analogy between cognitive development and active theorizing by adult scientists.

b. Adult Categorization, Inference, and Learning

Murphy & Medin (1985) argued in largely abstract fashion that categorization should be seen as a process of explaining why an exemplar belongs with the rest of a category. A man who jumps into a swimming pool while fully clothed at a party is plausibly drunk, even though these are not features of drunks in general—or they certainly are not stored as such in one’s default drunk concept. Theories and explanatory knowledge are required to focus on the relevant features of categories in a variety of tasks and contexts. Research with adults has tended to support this perspective.

One significant piece of evidence that comports with the general Theory-Theory perspective is the causal status effect (Ahn & Kim, 2000). The effect is the tendency of participants to privilege causally deeper or more central properties in a range of tasks including categorization and similarity judgment. For example, if people are taught about a person who has a cough caused by a certain kind of virus, and then given two other descriptions, one which matches in the cause (same virus) but not the effect (runny nose), and another that matches in the effect (cough) but not the cause (different virus), common causal features make exemplars more similar. Matching causal features can even override other shared features in categorization. If taught about an example with a cause that produces two effect features and two other examples, one of which shares the cause only and the other of which shares both effects, a majority of participants group the common cause exemplar with the original, even though they differ in most features.

Murphy (2002) reviews an extensive body of evidence showing that background knowledge has a pervasive effect on category learning, categorization, and induction. To take two examples, consider artificial category learning and category construction. In learning studies, participants are given two categories that are distinguished by different lists of features. The features that describe a more ‘coherent’ category in which the features are very plausibly related to each other (for example, ‘Made in Norway, heavily insulated, white, drives on glaciers, has treads’) were played against those that describe a more ‘neutral’ category. Participants found the coherent categories much easier to learn, and retained more information about them. Similarly, if given the ability to freely sort these items into categories they tended to group the coherent category members together even when they shared only a single feature. Background knowledge concerning the likely relationships among these features plays an essential role in learning and categorizing, even when it is not explicitly brought up in the experiment itself. This further undermines the prototype theory’s account of learning as a process of atheoretical tabulation of correlations.

4. Relations to Other Views

a. Relations to Essentialism

The Theory-Theory is closely related to psychological essentialism (henceforth just ‘essentialism’), the claim that people tend to represent categories as if they possessed hidden, non-obvious properties that make them the sorts of things that they are and that causally produce or constrain their observable properties (Medin & Ortony, 1989). These essences need not be actually known, but may be believed to exist even in the absence of detailed information about them. Concepts may include either conjectures as to what their essential properties might be, or else blank ‘essence placeholders’ that govern in the absence of these as-yet-unknown essential properties. Commitment to essences may be viewed as a kind of theoretical commitment, insofar as essences are causally potent but unobserved properties that structure and explain observable properties of categories. More generally, it is the commitment to there being a certain kind of causal structure underlying the categories we commonly represent.

There is a large body of evidence that supports the psychological essentialist hypothesis (Gelman, 2003, 2004; see Strevens, 2000 for criticism). For example, children’s inductions are governed by more than superficial resemblances among objects. In a standard inductive projection paradigm, participants are presented with a triad of pictures of objects only two of which perceptually resemble each other (for example, a leaf, a leaf-shaped insect, and a small black insect) and two of which share a verbal label (for example, both insects, while dissimilar, are called ‘bugs’, and the leaf is called a ‘leaf’). They are then told that one object of the resembling pair has a certain property and asked to project the property to the third object. By 30 months, children will project properties on the basis of labeled category membership rather than similarity. This effect does not depend on the precise repetition of the verbal label (that is, synonyms work just as well), and it tends to be more powerful in natural biological kinds than in artifacts. Even among 16- to 21-month olds one can find similar effects: behaviors displayed with one sort of toy animal (barking, chewing on a bone, and so forth.) will be imitated with a perceptually dissimilar animal if they are given a matching label. This suggests that induction is not entirely governed by superficial properties even among very young children.

Children may entertain more specific hypotheses about what the underlying category essences are as well. In Keil’s transformation studies, some participants, when debriefed, maintained that parentage was important to determining kind membership. In a number of studies, Gelman and her collaborators (see, for example, Gelman & Wellman, 1991) have shown that among four to five year olds, insides have a special theoretical role to play. Children can distinguish similar-appearing objects (pigs and piggy banks) from those that have similar insides, and they judge that removing a creature’s insides both removes its category-typical behaviors and also makes it no longer the same kind of thing. Removing outsides or changing a transitory property has little effect on membership or function.

These studies provide further evidence that the Original Sim has at best a weak grip on young children. Moreover, they reinforce the claim that categorization can sometimes be dominated by an early-emerging understanding of biology that treats stereotypical properties as non-dispositive. Gelman’s own robust psychological essentialism includes further claims such as that category boundaries are invariably taken to be sharp rather than fuzzy, and that essences invariably focus on purely internal properties. Whatever the status of these additional claims, the broader moral of the essentialism literature is in line with the proposals made by Theory theorists. Children come prepared to learn about deeper causal relations in many domains and they readily treat these relations as important in categorizing and making inductions.

b. Relations to Causal Modeling Approaches

In recent years much attention has focused on the role of causality in cognition, and consequently theories of cognitive performance that emphasize causal modeling have gained prominence. The idea that concepts might be identified (at least in part) with causal models has grown out of this tradition.

The theory of causal models is a formally well-developed and quantitatively precise way of describing probabilistic and causal dependency information, particularly in graphical form (for accessible introductions, see Gopnik & Shulz, 2007; Glymour, 2001; Sloman, 2005). Briefly, a causal model of a category depicts part of the relevant causal information about how things in the domain are produced, organized, and function. A causal model of a bird notes that it has wings, a body, and feathers, but also encodes the fact that those features causally contribute to its being able to fly; a causal model of a car depicts the fact that it is drivable in virtue of having wheels and an engine, that it can transport people because it is drivable, and that it makes noise because of its engine. These structures can be represented as sets of features connected by arrows, which indicate when the presence of one property causes or sustains (and therefore makes more probable) the presence of another. These directed causal graphs provide one possible representational format for concepts.

For example, Chaigneau, Barsalou, & Sloman (2004) have proposed the H I P E theory of artifact categorization, which states that artifacts are grouped according to their Historical role, the Intentions of the agents that use them, their Physical structure, and the Events in which they participate. On H I P E, artifact concepts are miniature causal models of the relations among these properties, all of which may potentially contribute to making something the kind of artifact that it is. Similar sorts of models could be developed for natural kind concepts. Indeed, essentialism itself is one form that a causal model can take: the essence is the ‘core’ of the concept, and it causally produces the more superficial features. Causal model theory is a generalization of this idea that allows these graphs to take many different forms.

Causal model theory is best seen as one form that the Theory-Theory can take (Gopnik & Schulz, 2004; Rehder, 2003). It shares that view’s commitment to causal-explanatory structure being central to concepts. While it is tied to a more specific hypothesis about representation than Theory-Theory in general (the formalism of directed causal graphs), this is also a strength, since these models are part of a well-developed framework for learning and processing. Causal model theory gives the Theory-Theory the resources to develop more wide-ranging and detailed empirical predictions concerning categorization, induction, and naming.

It is also worth noting that causal model theory may give the concepts as theories view the resources to answer the mereological objection it faces. The components of causal models can be seen as features representing properties, connected by links representing causal relations. Many models of concepts take them to be complex structures composed of features in this way. If we see causal models as miniature theories, then we can view concepts as theories if we identify them with such models. Adopting this approach eliminates any potential problems about concepts being both the constituents of beliefs and also being composed of beliefs.

5. Objections to the Theory-Theory

a. Holism

The holism objection focuses on the fact that the individuation conditions for concepts are closely tied to those for theories. They are holistic, meaning that a concept’s identity depends on its relations to a large set of other representational states. This position is suggested by Murphy & Medin’s comment that “[i]n order to characterize knowledge about and use of a concept, we must include all of the relations involving that concept and the other concepts that depend on it” (1985, p. 297). This gives rise to problems concerning the stability of concepts. The objection may be put as follows. Suppose concepts are identified by their relation to theories. Then changes in theories entail changes in concepts: if C1,…,Cn are constituted by their relation to T1, and T1 changes into T2, then at least some of C1,…,Cn will have to change as well, so long as the changes in the theories occurs in the parts that contribute to individuating those concepts. And it is part of the developmental and dynamical account of the Theory-Theory that such transitions in theories take place. So according to the Theory-Theory, concepts are unstable; they change over time, so that one does not have the same concepts before a revision in theory that one has afterwards.

The conclusion is particularly objectionable if one assumes that there will be many changes to theories, so that concepts also change frequently. But there are reasons to want concepts to be more stable than this. First, one wants to be able to compare concepts across individuals with different theories. A young child may not have the fully developed life concept, but she and I can still have many common beliefs about particular living things and their behavior, even if she does not represent them as being alive in the way that I do (that is, even if her understanding of life is impoverished relative to mine). Second, the rationality of theory change itself depends on some intertheoretic stability of concepts: Rejecting theory T1 may involve coming to believe that belief B formulated using T1’s concepts is false. So now that I believe T2, I reject B. But if changing from T1 to T2­ involves changing the concepts involved in B, I can no longer even formulate that belief, since I now lack the required conceptual resources. So we are at a loss to describe the rational nature of the transition between theories.

What this suggests is that belief attributions are often stable across theory changes; or at least, not every change in one’s background theory should change many or all of one’s concepts (and hence beliefs). Some sort of independence from belief is required. The problem is that concepts are individuated by their roles, which in turn are determined by the causal, inferential, and evidential roles of the propositions that contain them, and these are precisely what change as theories do (Fodor, 1994; Margolis, 1995).

This problem faces both the strong concepts in theories view and the concepts as theories view, but the weak concepts in theories view is immune to it, since it allows that concepts may participate in theories without being individuated by them. Two responses to the holism objection are typical. First, some Theory theorists (for example, Gopnik & Meltzoff, 1997) have embraced it. It is, they suggest, not implausible that young children are to a certain degree incomprehensible to adults, as would be predicted if their world view is incommensurable with ours (Carey, 2009, p. 378). Second, others have attempted to avoid this conclusion by distinguishing respects in which concepts may change (such as narrow content or internal conceptual role) and respects in which they may remain stable (such as wide content or reference). This dual-factor approach is also adopted by Carey (2009). The unstable respects are those that differ with background theories, while the stable respects provide continuity so that concepts can be identified across changes and differences in view. The success of this approach depends on whether the stable respects can do the relevant explanatory work needed in psychological explanation and communication.

b. Compositionality

A representational system is compositional if the properties of complex symbols are completely determined by the properties of the simpler symbols that make them up, plus the properties of their mode of combination. So predicate logic is compositional, since the semantic value of ‘Fa’ is determined by the semantic values of the predicate ‘F’ and the individual constant ‘a’. Similarly ‘Fa & Fb’ is semantically determined as a function of ‘Fa’, ‘Fb’, and the interpretation of conjunction. Many have argued that thought is compositional as well (Fodor, 1998), which entails that the properties of complex concepts derive wholly from the properties of their constituents.

If thought is compositional, and concepts are the constituents of thoughts, then whatever concepts are must also be compositional. So if concepts are (or are individuated by) theories, then theories must similarly be compositional. However, there are good reasons to think that theories are not compositional. A standard example is the concept of pet fish. The fish might come from the theory of folk biology, while pet might derive from a theory of human social behavior (since keeping pets is a sociocultural fact about humans). If the strong concepts in theories view is right, their content is determined by their inferential role in each of these theories. But pet fish has a novel inferential role that is not obviously predictable from those roles taken individually. Instances of pet fish, for example, are typically thought to live in bowls and feed on flakes, neither of which is true of pets or fish in general. This information is not derived from one’s ‘pet theory’ or ‘fish theory’. It is therefore not compositional. The same point can be made about the concepts as theories view. If one’s causal models of pets and fish do not somehow encode this information in the features that make them up, then it cannot be derived compositionally by putting them together. Since examples like this can be multiplied indefinitely, the Theory-Theory cannot account for the general compositionality of thought.

While many psychologists have simply ignored these concerns, several responses are possible. Here are two. First, one can divide concepts into two components, a stable compositional element and a non-compositional element (Rips, 1995). The compositional element might be thought of just as a simple label, while the non-compositional element includes theoretical and prototypical information. One part has the job of accounting for concept combination, the other has the job of accounting for categorization and inductive inference. Second, one can try to weaken the compositionality requirement. Perhaps concepts are required only to be compositional in principle, not in practice; or else compositionality might be viewed as a fallback strategy to be employed when there is no other information available about the extension of a complex concept (Prinz, 2002; Robbins, 2002). Whichever approach one takes, the compositionality objection highlights the fact that while the Theory-Theory has impressive resources for explaining facts about development and concept deployment, concept combination is more challenging to account for.

c. Scope

The scope objection is one that faces nearly every theory of concepts. In general, where such a theory proposes an identification of the form ‘concepts are K’, where ‘K’ is a kind of mental structure or capacity, the question can be raised: are all concepts like this? Or are there cases where someone might possess the relevant concept but not possess K? For instance, if concepts are prototypes, then there must be the right sort of prototype for every concept we can use in thought. A theory has satisfactory scope if there exists the right sort of K for every concept that we are capable of entertaining.

For the Theory-Theory, the problem seems to be that there are too few theories. We have concepts such as car, computer, gin, lemur, and nightstick. Perhaps for some of these we have theories, at least of a highly sketchy nature. But it is less clear that we have these for other concepts. One might have the concept higgs boson (from reading newspaper articles about the Large Hadron Collider) but have essentially no interesting knowledge of the Standard Model of particle physics. One might have the concept true but not have a theory of truth. One might have the concept billiards but know nothing of the game’s rules or conventions (‘that game they play in the UK that resembles pool’). If the Theory-Theory identifies each concept with a domain-specific theory, these scope challenges are serious. Denying that we have these concepts in virtue of lacking the relevant knowledge is unappealing.

One possible response is to restrict the scope of the Theory-Theory itself. Carey (1985) takes this tack. She does not think that every concept must be associated with a proprietary theory. Rather, concepts are embedded in relatively large scale theories of whole cognitive domains: “there are only a relatively few conceptual structures that embody deep explanatory notions—on the order of a dozen or so in the case of educated nonscientists. These conceptual structures correspond to domains that might be the disciplines in a university: psychology, mechanics, a theory of matter, economics, religion, government, biology, history, and so forth.” (Carey, 1985, p. 201). This approach, favored by other domain theorists, gives this version of the concepts in theories view a slight advantage over the concepts as theories view, since the latter is more clearly vulnerable to the scope objection. A defender of the concepts as theories view might fall back to the position that even very sketchy or minimal understanding of the causal principles at work in a category can count as a theory, as, even in these cases, we meet the minimal concept possession conditions, and our understanding is often equally superficial (Rozenblit & Keil, 2002).

d. Disanalogies Between Development and Science

The Theory-Theory relies heavily on the notion that what children do in constructing their knowledge of the world is quite literally like what scientists do in producing, testing, and revising the theories that constitute scientific knowledge. This implies that there is substantial cognitive continuity across development, so that infants and young children, along with older children and adults, employ the same theory-construction mechanisms that operate on prior theoretical representations plus new evidence to produce revised and, with luck, improved theories.

Many have challenged this picture on the grounds that what children do is not in fact sufficiently similar to what scientists do for them to be seen as instances of the same cognitive or epistemic process. These complaints are summarized by Faucher, Mallon, Nazer, Nichols, Ruby, Stich, & Weinberg (2002). They argue that scientific theory revision is a process that is inseparable from a host of cultural factors. For example, there are norms governing how one ought to gather and weigh evidence, as well as how one should revise one’s beliefs, and these govern the practice of science differently across times and cultures. Moreover, theories are usually socially transmitted (in the classroom, the lab, and in less formal contexts) along with these norms. So in science, society and mind interpenetrate in such a way that individual cognition needs to be receptive to external sources of authority, both with respect to theoretical knowledge and epistemic norms. The simple picture of theory revision as involving only initial theories and evidence should be rejected.

There are at least two possible responses to this anti-individualistic argument. One is to argue that while these social factors play a role in adult science, the essential core of scientific practice remains the adjustment of theories under the influence of evidence. Normative factors can eventually come to help us perform these tasks better or in ways that fit in more productively with the surrounding culture, but the basic mechanism of evidence-based revision must be present in any case. And the evidence suggests that it is operative even before these social factors have an effect. A second response would be to argue that this picture is in fact a correct and welcome revision to the overly simplistic view originally proposed by Theory theorists. We should expect there to be substantial cultural influences on children’s cognition, and some of the cross-cultural studies cited by Faucher et al. provide evidence in favor of this hypothesis. So we should enrich the Theory-Theory view of children’s early cognition, not abandon it entirely.

6. Conclusions

The Theory-Theory consists of many interrelated claims about concept individuation, structure, development, and processing. The claim that development of concepts and domain knowledge in children is driven by causal-explanatory expectations, perhaps of an essentialist sort, has been most extensively investigated. While there are some attempts to explain these data by appeal to empiricist principles (Smith, Jones, & Landau, 1996), the Theory-Theory has strong support here. Studies with adults also suggest that causal information is often important to categorization. The behavior of both adults and children has been characterized using the framework of causal models, enabling Theory theorists to frame their view in a formally precise way. Many of the assumptions that trouble the account, such as the strong concepts in theories view that generates the problems of holism and incommensurability, turn out not to be essential to its empirical success. The greatest problem the view faces may be one of scope, but this challenge is arguably faced by all other theories of concepts currently in contention (Machery, 2009; Weiskopf, 2009). Whether or not a thoroughgoing Theory-Theory perspective is ultimately vindicated, its key insights will have to be incorporated by any future comprehensive theory of concepts.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Ahn, W., & Kim, N. S. (2000). “The causal status effect in categorization: An overview.” In D. L. Medin (Ed.), Psychology of Learning and Motivation, Vol. 40 (pp. 23-65). New York: Academic Press.
  • Carey, S. (1985). Conceptual Change in Childhood. Cambridge: M I T Press.
  • Carey, S. (1991). “Knowledge acquisition: enrichment or conceptual change?” In S. Carey & R. Gelman (Eds.), The Epigenesis of Mind (pp. 257-291). Hillsdale, N J: Erlbaum.
  • Carey, S. (2009). The Origin of Concepts. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Chaigneau, S.E., Barsalou, L.W., & Sloman, S. (2004). “Assessing the causal structure of function.” Journal of Experimental Psychology: General, 133, 601-625.
  • Faucher, L., Mallon, R., Nazer, D., Nichols, S., Ruby, A., Stich, S., & Weinberg, J. (2002). “The baby in the labcoat: Why child development is an inadequate model for understanding the development of science.” In P. Carruthers, S. Stich & M. Siegal (Eds.), The Cognitive Basis of Science (pp. 335-362). Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Fodor, J. (1994). “Concepts: A potboiler.” Cognition, 50, 95-113.
  • Fodor, J. (1998). Concepts. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Gelman, R., & Baillargeon, R. (1983). “A review of some Piagetian concepts.” In J. H. Flavell and E. Markman (Eds.), Cognitive Development: Vol. 3 (pp. 167-230). New York: Wiley.
  • Gelman, S. (2003). The Essential Child. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Gelman, S. (2004). “Psychological essentialism in children.” Trends in Cognitive Sciences, 8, 404-409.
  • Gelman, S., & Wellman, H. (1991). “Insides and essences: Early understandings of the nonobvious.” Cognition, 38, 213-244.
  • Glymour, C. (2001). The Mind’s Arrows. Cambridge: M I T Press.
  • Gopnik, A. (1988). “Conceptual and semantic development as theory change.” Mind and Language, 3, 197-217.
  • Gopnik, A. (1996). “The scientist as child.” Philosophy of Science, 63, 485-514.
  • Gopnik, A., & Meltzoff, A. (1997). Words, Thoughts, and Theories. Cambridge: M I T Press.
  • Gopnik, A., & Schulz, L. (2004). “Mechanisms of theory-formation in young children.” Trends in Cognitive Science, 8, 371-377.
  • Gopnik, A., & Schulz, L. (Eds.) (2007). Causal Learning. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Hampton, J. A. (1995). “Similarity-based categorization: The development of prototype theory.” Psychologica Belgica, 35, 103-125.
  • Keil, F. C. (1989). Concepts, Kinds, and Cognitive Development. Cambridge: M I T Press.
  • Machery, E. (2009). Doing Without Concepts. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Margolis, E. (1995). “What is conceptual glue?” Minds and Machines, 9, 241-255.
  • Margolis, E. (1999). “The significance of the theory analogy in the psychological study of concepts.” Mind and Language, 10, 45-71.
  • Medin, D., & Ortony, A. (1989). “Psychological essentialism.” In S. Vosniadou & A. Ortony (Eds.), Similarity and Analogical Reasoning (pp. 179-195). Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Morton, A. (1980). Frames of Mind. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Murphy, G. (2002). The Big Book of Concepts. Cambridge: M I T Press.
  • Murphy, G., & Medin, D. (1985). “The role of theories in conceptual coherence.” Psychological Review, 92, 289-316
  • Medin, D., & Wattenmaker. (1987). “Category cohesiveness, theories, and cognitive archeology.” In U. Neisser (Ed.), Concepts and Conceptual Development (pp. 25-63). Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Premack, D., & Woodruff, G. (1978). “Does the chimpanzee have a theory of mind?” Behavioral and Brain Sciences, 1, 515-526.
  • Prinz, J. (2002). Furnishing the Mind. Cambridge: M I T Press.
  • Quine, W. V. (1977). “Natural kinds.” In S. Schwartz (Ed.), Naming, Necessity, and Natural Kinds (pp. 155-175). Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Redher, B. (2003). “A causal-model theory of conceptual representation and categorization.” Journal of Experimental Psychology: Learning, Memory, and Cognition, 29, 1141-59.
  • Rips, L. (1995). “The current status of research on concept combination.” Mind and Language, 10, 72-104.
  • Robbins, P. (2002). “How to blunt the sword of compositionality.” Nous, 36, 313-334.
  • Rosch, E. (1977). “Human categorization.” In N. Warren (Ed.), Advances in Cross-Cultural Psychology: Vol. 1 (pp. 1-49). London: Academic Press.
  • Rosch, E., & Mervis, C. (1975). “Family resemblances: Studies in the internal structure of categories.” Cognitive Psychology, 7, 573-605.
  • Rozenblit, L., & Keil, F. (2002). “The misunderstood limits of folk science: An illusion of explanatory depth.” Cognitive Science, 26, 521-562.
  • Sloman, S. (2005). Causal Models. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Smith, E. E., & Medin, D. (1981). Concepts and Categories. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Smith, L., Jones, S., & Landau, B. (1996). “Naming in young children: A dumb attentional mechanism?” Cognition, 60, 143-171.
  • Strevens, M. (2000). “The essentialist aspect of native theories.” Cognition, 74, 149-175.
  • Weiskopf, D. (2009). “The plurality of concepts.” Synthese, 169, 145-173.
  • Wellman, H., & Gelman, S. (1988). “Cognitive development: Foundational theories of core domains.” Annual Review of Psychology, 43, 337-375.

Author Information

Daniel A. Weiskopf
Georgia State University
U. S. A.

Lucian Blaga (1895—1961)

Lucian BlagaLucian Blaga was a prominent philosopher in Eastern Europe during the period between the two world wars. Trained in both Eastern Orthodox theology and classical philosophy, he developed a “speculative” philosophy that includes books on epistemology, metaphysics, aesthetics, philosophy of culture, philosophical anthropology, philosophy of history, philosophy of science, and philosophy of religion. A chair in philosophy of culture was created for him at the University of Cluj, a leading Romanian university of the period, now Babes-Bolyai University.

Unfortunately, the height of Blaga’s career coincided with WWII, after which Romania was occupied by Soviet troops that installed a socialist government. The new government removed Blaga and many other professors from their university posts. Although Blaga was forbidden to teach and publish, he continued to study and write. Eventually thirty-four of his books of philosophy were published. At the heart of his philosophical publications are four trilogies that constitute a systematic philosophy, a feat that has rarely been attempted since Hegel. He also published books of poetry and theater, plus one novel.

Today Blaga is a national figure in Romania, but because of the unfortunate circumstances surrounding his career, he is barely known to the outside world. However, because of his creativity and systematic vision, his work is being actively studied in Europe in the 21st century. There are those who argue that this mid-20th century philosopher can make valuable contributions to issues that philosophers are still struggling with today.

This article begins by explaining Blaga’s intellectual formation, which provides a context for understanding his philosophy. It then introduces the main features of his philosophical system and provides a bibliography of primary and secondary sources for further study.

Table of Contents

  1. Biographical Sketch
  2. Philosophy of Philosophy
  3. Epistemology
  4. Metaphysics
  5. Other Philosophical Issues
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
      1. English
      2. Romanian
      3. Other Languages
    2. Secondary Sources in English

1. Biographical Sketch


Lucian Blaga (1895-1961) was the son of a village priest. The village was Lancram, an ethnically Romanian village on the eastern edge of the Austro-Hungarian Empire. The priest was Isidor Blaga, an avid reader who seems to have enjoyed studying German philosophy as much as Orthodox theology. Isidor only reluctantly accepted the priestly vacancy in Lancram that was created by the premature death of his own father. A lack of finances to continue his education made this choice a necessity, but the priestly vocation was not Isidor’s original goal: he seems to have harbored more academic aspirations. His interest in higher learning, his interest in philosophy and his personal library would leave a profound imprint on his youngest son.

Life in the Romanian village too left a profound imprint on Blaga. A Romanian village of the late nineteenth and early twentieth century was essentially unaltered from medieval times. There was no industry and little mechanization to speak of. The economy was agricultural. The only schooling was a one-room primary school. Yet, a wealth of traditional wisdom preserved in legends, ballads, poems, and perhaps especially the multitude of proverbs and aphorisms that Lucian Blaga later collected and published in several volumes, provided its own kind of philosophical insight. The culture of the Romanian village would be the subject of Blaga’s acceptance speech given at his induction into the Romanian Academy in 1936.

Because of the dismal academics of the village elementary school and the complete lack of a high school, Isidor and his wife, Ana, sacrificed to send Lucian to private boarding schools. The urban centers in Transylvania were either Hungarian or German, and as a result the best educational opportunities were in Hungarian or German schools. The first school that Blaga attended was a German boarding school in the nearby town of Sebes. Here he studied in German and read important German thinkers. Blaga next enrolled in the prestigious Andrei Saguna High School in the city of Brasov where he studied German, Hungarian, Latin, and Greek. He was particularly interested in the natural sciences, the philosophy of science, and also world religions. A senior thesis was required for graduation from Andrei Saguna: Blaga’s was on Einstein’s relativity and Poincare’s non-Euclidean geometry.

Blaga intended to enroll in a German university upon graduation, but the onset of WWI prevented this. He took the only option open to him besides military service: he enrolled in the Romanian Orthodox seminary in Sibiu, another Transylvanian city. Although he neither enjoyed nor excelled at the more pastoral aspects of the seminary curriculum, he surpassed his classmates in the theoretical areas of study. During this period he especially increased his understanding of philosophy of religion and the history of art.

Blaga completed his undergraduate degree in 1917 and enrolled in the PhD program in philosophy at the University of Vienna. During this time he published his first two books, a book of poetry and a book of aphorisms, which sold well in Romania and helped him finance his studies. He successfully defended his dissertation in November of 1920. It was titled Kultur und Erkenntnis (Culture and Knowledge).

Blaga’s life experiences growing up in a multicultural region (Transylvania was populated by Romanians, Hungarians, Germans, Gypsies, and several smaller minority groups); experiencing the contrast between the peasant village and the modern city; and studying Eastern Orthodox theology and liturgy side by side with European philosophy, history, and science spawned in him a philosophical outlook that gives prominent place to philosophy of culture. Within the broad framework of culture Blaga finds places for science, art, history, and religion.

Blaga’s philosophical system interacts with the theories of classical and contemporary philosophers and intellectuals. These range from the pre-Socratics through early twentieth century philosophers like William James, Edmund Husserl, and Henri Bergson, and also intellectuals such as Albert Einstein, Sigmund Freud, and Paul Tillich. The influence of Plotinus, Kant, and the German Romantics is clearly evident. But Blaga’s philosophy is not merely an attempt to synthesize the insights of other thinkers. It is a systematic and integrated attempt to address the issues that occupied the leading minds of his day.

Blaga’s early philosophical career involved research and publication rather than teaching. He published many articles and a number of books, and served as an editor for several literary magazines. His publications range from fiction to philosophy. His first book of philosophy, Filosofia stilului (The Philosophy of Style), was published in 1924. He also served his country as a statesman. In 1936 he was inducted into the Romanian Academy (a prestigious research institution). Finally in 1938 a special chair of philosophy of culture was created in his honor at the University of Cluj, a leading Romanian university in Transylvania. His inaugural essay was titled Despre plenitudinea istorica (Concerning Historical Fullness). He taught at the University of Cluj until 1949, when he was removed from his post by the newly installed Socialist government of Romania. After this he was not permitted to teach and was only permitted to publish under strict supervision. After his death in 1961 a number of his works were permitted to be posthumously published, and since the fall of Romanian communism Blaga’s entire oeuvre has been republished.

2. Philosophy of Philosophy


Some philosophers philosophize about a range of topics without ever turning their analytic skills to an analysis of philosophy itself. In contrast to this, Blaga begins his systematic philosophy with an entire book dedicated to a critical discussion of philosophy. The title of this book is Despre constiinta filosofica (Concerning Philosophical Consciousness). It describes philosophy as a creative and constructive attempt to understand reality. Therefore Blaga views the construction of a systematic metaphysics as the pinnacle of the philosophical enterprise.

At the same time, Blaga rejects the notion that a philosophical system can ever provide an ultimate analysis of reality. All philosophical systems are creative interpretations that attempt to express reality symbolically through human language. But despite this apparent futility inherent in the philosophical task, Blaga views the attempt to “reveal” ultimate reality as the activity that brings humans closest to fulfillment.

The philosophical method is characterized by the utilization of logic and the attempt at objectivity, but subjectivity and style also have their place. Blaga elucidates the proper function of each. He argues that every philosophical system has a central thesis that orients the system. He names the orientation that this point provides the “transcendental accent.” This accent is an expression of the style of the philosopher who created it. For example, the knowledge of the Ideals, which serves as the transcendental accent in Plato’s philosophy, seems to reflect Plato’s own expansive personality and his drive to understand the many disparate aspects of his world.

It is not only the individual who is affected by controlling themes: such beliefs affect entire cultures. Sometimes these themes enter the public subconscious and are called “common sense.” Blaga recognizes that common sense beliefs often preserve wisdom based upon a wealth of experiences, but also warns that they sometimes preserve the prejudices and mistakes of previous generations. He then makes an important and controversial observation about the relationship of philosophy to common sense: whereas many Anglo-American philosophers have taken it upon themselves to defend common sense, Blaga argues that a philosopher must shun the conformist impulse underlying belief in common sense. A philosopher sometimes needs to attack common sense beliefs in order to open up a space for greater understanding.

This position vis-à-vis common sense could be taken as an indication that Blaga views philosophy as a realist rather than a constructivist attempt to understand reality. This would be at least partially mistaken, however. Blaga views philosophy as a creative activity that is justified even when its results are mistaken, since it deepens and enriches the understanding of the problematic of the human spirit. Thus philosophical speculation is justified quite apart from the truthfulness of its theories. Philosophy is justified by its fruitfulness, vision, suggestiveness, foresight, and how it stirs the soul, even if its theories never attain complete perfection.

This seems to suggest that philosophy is closer to art than to science, a view that would displease many analytic philosophers. Blaga finds both differences and similarities between philosophy and science. The primary difference between philosophy and science is methodological. Both begin with a set of objective data (the aria) and with certain presuppositions about how the data will be handled (the interior horizon of the problem). But while the data of science is very specific and the presuppositions are detailed and complex, the data of philosophy includes all of human experience and the presuppositions are very general. Because of this, a scientific investigation is very closely controlled by its initial data and its presuppositions; while philosophical investigation is open to many creative solutions that the scientist would not consider. Initially this might seem like a disadvantage, since it seems like an admission of the undisciplined nature of philosophical investigation in comparison to the fairly rigid discipline of the natural sciences. However, it also has a significant strength: Blaga points out that because of the very specific aria and interior horizon of a scientific investigation, science methodologically anticipates its solutions much more than philosophy does. Hence philosophy is more open to discovering the unexpected.

3. Epistemology

This discussion of the difference between philosophy and science draws on several ideas that Blaga elaborates in his epistemology. His primary works on this subject are the three books that comprise his “Trilogy of Knowledge”: Eonul dogmatic (The Dogmatic Age), Cunoasterea luciferica (Luciferic Cognition), and Cenzura transcendenta (Transcendent Censorship). These books analyze, with surprising lucidity, the entire range of modes of human cognition.

Blaga analyzes cognition into seven possible modes:

  1. Positive-adequate cognition
  2. Quasi-cognition
  3. Negative cognition
  4. Cognition that is part positive-adequate and part quasi-cognition
  5. Cognition that is part positive-adequate and part negative cognition
  6. Cognition that is part positive-adequate and part quasi-cognition and part negative cognition
  7. Cognition that is part quasi-cognition and part negative cognition

He discusses each of these modes of cognition, but only the second and the seventh are actually realized by humans. The second, quasi-cognition, can be further analyzed into concrete cognition, paradisaic cognition, mythic cognition, and occult cognition. The seventh, which Blaga names “luciferic cognition,” can be analyzed into three subdivisions: plus-cognition, zero-cognition, and minus-cognition. His discussion of the subdivisions of luciferic cognition, which is the subject of his book by that name, is perhaps the most original and most interesting part of his epistemology.

Blaga remarks that the possible forms of cognition can be analyzed into three types: (1) cognition that is positive-adequate and unlimited, (2) cognition that is censured but in principle unlimited, and (3) cognition that is positive-adequate but strictly limited. The first type would pertain only to a deity. The third type pertains to simple organisms and enables them to perform functions such as the replication of lost appendages. Human cognition falls within the second type, since human cognition is potentially unlimited in extent but strictly limited qualitatively, because it never completely captures its object and never perfectly corresponds to reality.

Mystery, and the cognitive limits that produce mystery, are central to Blaga’s epistemology (and perhaps to his whole philosophy). The reason for these limits is explained in his metaphysics, and the means are explained in his philosophy of culture.

There are at least five important features of Blaga’s epistemology that are innovative, to a greater or lesser degree, and that are significant epistemological contributions. The first of these is the placing of his epistemology within a complementary and explicatory metaphysical system, which will be discussed presently. This metaphysical speculation provides answers to such epistemologically relevant questions as: what are the material, efficient, and final causes of the human epistemological situation; why this situation pertains; how it was implemented; and how it is preserved. A second important feature is Blaga’s emphasis on the important role played in human cognition by culture. According to Blaga, even categories of understanding are culturally affected. He argues that there are both subjective and beautifully creative aspects of human cognition, and also that human cognition is not thwarted by its historicity but is rather empowered by it.

The third and fourth important contributions of Blaga’s epistemology are his analysis of the two types of cognition that he calls “luciferic cognition” and “minus-cognition.” Minus-cognition is a subset of luciferic cognition. Blaga devoted an entire book of his epistemological trilogy to minus-cognition, and another is largely devoted to luciferic cognition. In his elucidation of these two types of cognition, Blaga uncovers methods of problem solving that have heretofore been largely overlooked in Western epistemology.

A fifth important aspect of Blaga’s epistemology is its constructivism. Constructivism, the view that knowledge is a human construct, is a ubiquitous element of Blaga’s philosophy. It was seen in the previous elaboration of Blaga’s philosophy of philosophy, it is reflected in his epistemology, it will be seen in his freely creative metaphysics, and it can also be seen in his philosophy of culture and philosophy of religion.

There have been numerous other constructivist philosophers, ranging from Kant through Nietzsche to 20th century figures such as Jean Piaget and Ernst van Glasersfeld. Nonetheless, there are several important things about Blaga’s constructivism that make it particularly noteworthy. The first of these is how neatly and consistently constructivism fits within the larger philosophical picture that Blaga paints. His philosophical system gives constructivism a context, an explanation and a purpose that are sometimes lacking in other constructivist philosophies. A second noteworthy aspect of his constructivism is that it is argued for in a wide variety of cognitive contexts: Blaga shows that human thought is constructivist whether it occurs in math, the natural sciences, philosophy, theology, the arts, or in any other cognitive context. A third important aspect is how his constructivism is argued: he does not cease being a constructivist when he argues for his own philosophical system. He views his own system as merely a possible thesis supported (but not proved) by evidence and pragmatic utility.

More should be said about luciferic cognition, since this is one of the key insights of Blaga’s epistemology. Paradisaic cognition (what could be considered “ordinary cognition”) attempts to quantitatively reduce the mysteries of existence. Its progress is linear, adding new facts to the existent body of knowledge. Luciferic cognition, on the other hand, seeks to qualitatively reduce mystery through attenuation or, if that is not possible, through permanentization or intensification of the mysterious. Its progress is inward, deepening and intensifying knowledge of the hidden essence of the cognitive object. Every step of progress leads to another step, ad infinitum, and thus luciferic cognition is never totally successful in grasping its object, but it is successful in providing new understanding of the layers and aspects of the mystery of its being. Luciferic cognition does not exceed the inherent limits of human cognition, but it does explore those limits and press cognition to its fullest extent.

Luciferic cognition is dependent on paradisaic cognition for its starting point, the empirical, conceptual, or imaginary data that Blaga calls “phanic material.” It then “provokes a crisis” in the phanic material through bringing out the mysteries inherent in the object. Whereas paradisaic cognition views objects of cognition as “given,” luciferic cognition views them as partly given, but also partly hidden. Whereas paradisaic cognition is subject to the “illusion of adequacy”—the mistaken belief that the object is as it is perceived to be or, more precisely, the mistaken belief that paradisaic cognition is able to grasp the object as it really is—luciferic cognition begins with the removal of this illusion. An investigation that stops at the mere defining of an object as it is “given” overlooks potentially multitudinous other facets of knowledge about the object.

The distinction between the object of paradisaic cognition and the object of luciferic cognition bears a resemblance to Kant’s phenomena-noumena distinction, but has several important differences. One significant difference is that the Kantian noumenon is an object that is one single mystery; the luciferic object is a long series of latent mysteries. An even more important difference is that whereas the Kantian noumenon is not available to human cognition, Blaga’s luciferic objects are available to luciferic cognition (but are not cognized in the same way as objects are cognized in paradisaic cognition).

Blaga’s analysis of the process of luciferic cognition is fairly detailed and very interesting. It includes ideas that mirror more recent developments in the philosophy of science, such as his concepts of “theory idea,” “directed observation,” “categorical dislocation,” and “Copernican inversion of the object.” His concept of “theory capacity” resembles ideas suggested by American Pragmatists.

Blaga weighs in on the issues of truth and verification, which have largely dominated discussions in recent analytic epistemology. He accepts coherence as a necessary but not sufficient condition of truthfulness, and demonstration of correspondence as a sufficient but not necessary condition. He suggests that the best way to verify the truthfulness of a theory is pragmatic: put it into practice. His own philosophy is consistent with these views: it is a cohesive system, but he does not appeal to this cohesiveness as the grounds for believing it true. Rather he appeals to its ability to facilitate the resolution of philosophical problems.

4. Metaphysics

Blaga’s metaphysic is contained in the three books that form his “Cosmological Trilogy”: Diferentialele divine, (Divine Differentials), Aspecte anthropologice (Anthropological Aspects), and Fiinta istorica (The Historical Being). It is centered on a cosmology that is specifically intended to complement his epistemology. It is sometimes characterized as a “speculative” metaphysic rather than an empirical one. Blaga is firmly persuaded that metaphysical theories are not (and cannot be) proven empirically, although he accords a significant role to experience in the testing of such theories. His method resembles the hypothetico-deductive method wherein a theoretically possible solution to a problem is granted as a working hypothesis, and then the consequences of this hypothesis are deduced in order to determine if they are compatible with generally accepted theory. If they are, then the hypothesis stands as provisionally vindicated, despite the fact that the hypothesis itself has not been directly verified empirically.

Blaga states that metaphysical starting points are presupposed at the outset of the metaphysical investigation and are only subsequently justified by their ability to organize data and to “construct a world.” In elucidating his metaphysical vision, Blaga proposes a cluster of premises that are essential to the system he intends to promulgate. He then elaborates how these form the basis of a system that provides, or enables, the resolution of certain important problems heretofore not satisfactorily resolved by other metaphysical systems.

It is widely acknowledged that Blaga accepts and works within a sort of neo-Kantian Idealism, wherein the actual existence of an external world is accepted as a necessary metaphysical corollary even though an external world is not directly knowable epistemologically. If doing metaphysics would be defined along realist lines, as an accurate description of “noumenal” reality, then Blaga would not be able to do metaphysics, since according to his epistemology humanity cannot have perfect knowledge of objects of cognition. However, because Blaga views metaphysics as a creative and pragmatically justified endeavor that attempts to reach beyond the empirical and provide a theoretical explanation for all of existence, metaphysics is possible.

One of the first issues addressed in Blaga’s metaphysical writings is the question of the origin of the cosmos. It is conceivable that the cosmos has no origin, and that it has always existed. Alternatively, it is possible that the cosmos has a specific origin. Blaga opts for the latter view because it “enormously facilitates approaching cosmological problems” and is therefore to be preferred. Based on this pragmatic justification, he proceeds to construct his metaphysics around a postulated beginning and source of the world.

That both the origin and the source of the cosmos are unknown is admitted by Blaga. Therefore one of the ways that he refers to the source is “The Anonymous Fund.” Theoretically, the cosmos could be a result of one or more creative acts of this Fund acting upon external preexistent sources; it could be an emanation from the Fund; or it could even be a reproduction of the Fund. Blaga rejects the possibility of creation using sources outside of the Fund, presumably because this would entail the existence of a cosmos that precedes the creation of the present cosmos, introducing a regress that thwarts the solving of the problems that Blaga is addressing. He also rejects the possibility of creation ex nihilo. Blaga opts for a theory of emanation similar to that proposed by Plotinus, an emanation wherein the Fund reproduces itself endlessly without diminishing itself in any way.

Blaga proposes that the Fund be viewed as possessing, due to its own “fullness,” the capacity of infinite self-replication. It controls its reproduction so that it will not destabilize existence. (Blaga grants that this sort of talk is necessarily metaphorical.) But it is the nature of the Fund to create/reproduce (this is inherent in the meaning of “fund”); therefore it allows itself to reproduce, but only in a specific mode that assures the longevity and greatest success of its reproductive acts. This controlled reproduction is the best compromise between the Fund’s capacity for replication and the necessity of safeguarding the centrality of existence. Had such precautions not been taken, the result of the Fund’s creative capacity would be a series of competing funds rather than the present world. What is remarkable, according to Blaga, is not so much that the present world exists, but that a series of competing funds does not exist. The present world is a result of the Fund’s own self-limitation, of the partial thwarting of the Fund’s natural creativity.

The form that the controlled reproduction of the Anonymous Fund takes is that of creation through “differentials”. Differentials are minute particles emanated from the Fund that exactly replicate minute aspects of the Fund and are emanated in endless numbers. The differentials have a natural propensity to combine with each other, forming new subcreations. The most central differentials are withheld from emanation in order to prevent the recombination of differentials into a copy of the Anonymous Fund. The recombination of emitted differentials has created the present world in its ever-changing forms.

This schema depicts the origin of the world as taking place in three phases: (1) the operation of limiting the generative possibilities of the Anonymous Fund, (2) the emission of differentials, and (3) the combination of differentials, creating more complex beings through integration. The schema also depicts the creation of the world as being based upon two fundamental factors, the Anonymous Fund’s reproductive potential and its success in directing this potential into creating in a manner that preserves its own hegemony as metaphysical center of the universe.

Integration of the differentials is a natural result of the fact that the differentials are, in their structure, particles of one integrated whole. But integration does not occur on the basis of a perfect match between differentials. If it did, there would only be one line of integration that would result in only one type of created being. Integration takes place on the basis of a merely sufficient match between differentials. This allows for a vast number of different integrations, which explains such empirical phenomena as the existence of sometimes similar, sometimes identical or parallel features in entities that belong to different kingdoms, classes, phyla, and species.

Blaga offers the following empirical analysis in support of his theory that the world is composed of differentials. Upon close inspection, it can be observed that all empirical existents display at least three types of discontinuity: (1) Structural discontinuity: some existents are very simple structurally, others are very complex. (2) Intrinsic discontinuity: existents are at the same time independent and interdependent. (3) Discontinuity of repetition: groups of existents of the same type are composed of individuals. These phenomena are explained by the existence of discontinuity in the very heart of the empirical world. This fundamental discontinuity is a result of the empirical world being composed of a multitude of diverse differentials, variously integrated and organized. Furthermore, Blaga argues that two lines of empirical proof show that creation takes place through something akin to differentials: (1) The widespread consistency of certain structures and the equally widespread variability of others indicates that at the base of existence there is a discontinuity of elements that are capable of a variety of different combinations. (2) The presence of similar or identical features in entities that are otherwise very different from each other likewise indicates that existence is composed of a variety of elements capable of forming a variety of combinations.

Blaga discusses how the Anonymous Fund concept differs from and is similar to the theistic conception of God. Both are conceived as being the source of all else, the most central of all existents, and the greatest existent, to the extent that their own existence surpasses all others in both extent and in quality. However, Blaga states that he hesitates to use the term God to refer to his conception of the central metaphysical entity both because there are significant differences between his own conception and that of traditional theology, and because he believes it impossible to know whether the attributes usually ascribed to God apply to the Anonymous Fund. He grants that the term “God” could be used as a synonym for the Anonymous Fund, since according to his metaphysics there is nothing in existence that is more central than the Anonymous Fund. But Blaga will not even affirm that the Fund is a being in the usual sense, saying rather that conceiving it thus is merely a “crutch” used by the understanding.

Blaga sees the product of self-reproduction of the Anonymous Fund as necessarily differentiated from the Fund itself in order to preserve the order of the cosmos. This differentiation is accomplished by the Fund in order to achieve a specific goal. The goal and benefits of differentiated creation include: (1) facilitation of the fulfillment of the Fund’s generative nature, (2) the avoidance of genesis of innumerable identical “hypostases,” and (3) the avoidance of genesis of complex, indivisible, and indestructible existents that would have too great an autarchic potential, (4) the generation of complex existents that do not infringe upon numbers 2 and 3 above, (5) the genesis of an immense variety of existents and beings, (6) a proportioning of existents between those that are simple and those that are more complex, and (7) the generation of beings with cognitive capacity while at the same time censoring that capacity so as to protect both the beings and the order of the universe. Blaga believes that his proposal shows that the Anonymous Fund has employed a means of genesis that achieves a maximum number of advantages through the employment of a minimum number of measures.

He states that the existence of dis-analogy between Creator and creation is paradoxical. It is paradoxical because the expected result of an Anonymous Fund as postulated by Blaga would be the production of other entities like itself, the production of identical self-replications. Blaga finds it surprising but empirically evident that this self-replication does not take place. The explanation for this surprising nonoccurrence is the necessity of thwarting “theo-geneses” in order to preserve the necessary order of existence. Thus the apparent paradox is only an initial paradox, which is seen to be resolvable through the means of minus-cognition (as discussed in Blaga’s epistemology).

In Blaga’s metaphysics there are two important measures employed by the Anonymous Fund in preservation of cosmic equilibrium. One of these has already been discussed: differentiated creation. The other is transcendent censorship. While many metaphysicians have struggled with the question “What is the nature of existence?” and many epistemologists have struggled with “What are the methods of knowledge?” relatively few have sought to answer the question “What is it that impedes our answering of these fundamental questions?” Blaga insightfully observes that this “prohibitive factor” is one of the factors of existence that philosophy has yet to reckon with.

Blaga proposes that ultimate questions are difficult to answer, and in some sense unanswerable, because in addition to the ontological limit that the Anonymous Fund has imposed upon creation (through the means of differentiated creation), the Fund has also imposed a cognitive limit on creation. This was done at the time of the creation of the cosmos, and is now an inherent aspect, affecting all modes of cognition. Blaga refers to this limit as “transcendent censorship.” This censorship is accomplished via a network of factors, including obligatory epistemic reliance on the concrete, the intervention of cognitive structures, the resulting “dissimulation of the transcendent,” and “the illusion of adequacy.” Transcendent censorship not only prevents humans from having positive-adequate knowledge of the mysteries of existence, it prevents them from having “positive-adequate” knowledge of any object of cognition whatsoever. Blaga points out that this view has an interesting difference from the Kantian/neo-Kantian view. In Kant’s epistemology, existence is passive in the cognitive event; according to Blaga’s theory, existence is active in preventing itself from being known.

According to Blaga, the result of transcendent censorship is that all human knowledge is either dissimulation (in which objects of cognition are represented as being other than they really are), or negative cognition (in which antinomian elements of a cognitive problem are reconciled through the employment of a heuristic “theory idea,” which leads to a deepened understanding of the problem without resulting in its complete elimination), or a combination of these. This does not indicate that Blaga is a skeptic, however. Even the “mysteries” of existence are approachable through the strategy that Blaga names “luciferic cognition,” although they are not actually reachable.

The reasons that the Anonymous Fund would impose censorship upon its creation are similar to the reasons for its dissimulation of creation. Blaga lists the following four reasons for transcendent censorship: (1) Human possession of perfect knowledge would upset the equilibrium of existence by bestowing perfection on limited beings. (2) Human possession of perfect knowledge might threaten the benign governance of the universe by introducing the possibility of a human cognitive rival to the Anonymous Fund. (3) Possession of absolute knowledge would ossify the human spirit, quenching human creativity. (4) Censorship spurs human creativity and exertion, giving humanity its raison d’etre. To this list could be added the explanation that human creativity is one indirect outlet of the creativity of the Anonymous Fund, and anything that lessens human creativity is an attack on the creative intentions of the Fund.

The responsibility for the human inability to arrive at an absolute understanding of existence therefore rests squarely upon the Anonymous Fund, for benevolent reasons. This is in striking contrast to the philosophical system of Descartes, wherein God’s righteousness and benevolence are made the foundation of all sure knowledge. In Blaga’s system, the benevolence and wisdom of the Anonymous Fund result in the prevention of sure knowledge.

It is clear that Blaga’s metaphysical system can say relatively little about the actual structure of the universe, because according to this system such knowledge is structurally excluded from human cognition. Blaga’s system does allow for metaphysical postulation, however, and these postulates can be supported or substantiated by experience and by pragmatic arguments. Thus Blaga justifies himself in asserting that the cosmos has a center, and that this center is the Anonymous Fund.

Blaga does take stands on several of the standard issues of cosmology. He rejects both naive realism and subjective idealism (a la Berkeley), opting for a neo-Kantian critical realism. With regards to the monism-pluralism controversy, Blaga is clearly a pluralist. While the cosmos is a result of one single entity, and is composed of pieces emitted from that one entity, these pieces (the differentials) are separate, distinct entities in their own right. They are permanent and unchanging, and are the building blocks of all else that exists. Although Blaga is a realist, he is not a materialist. Differentials are not material, but rather are submaterial. They underlie all material existents, but underlie nonmaterial realities as well.

According to Blaga, humanity is, in a sense, the very pinnacle of the Anonymous Fund’s creation, because the human consciousness is the most complex organization of differentials it has permitted. There is also another sense in which humanity is the pinnacle of creation: more than any other complex created existent, humanity has the ability to further the Fund’s own creative activity. Humans are naturally creative, and their creations can be viewed as secondary creations of the Anonymous Fund.

Human existence is characterized by two modes of existence, the “paradisaic” mode, which is the normal state of life in the world, and the “luciferic” mode, which is life lived in the presence of mystery and for the purpose of “revealing” it (grappling with it; trying to make it understandable). The latter mode results in an “ontological mutation” that is unique in the universe and essential to full humanness. “Mystery” is a result of the protective limits imposed on creation by the Anonymous Fund (transcendent censorship and the discontinuity between creator and creation). Through these means the Fund bestows upon humanity a destiny and a purpose in life: humanity’s purpose is to create; its destiny is to strive (through creating) to reveal the mysteries of existence.

Since the mysteries of existence are not ultimately fathomable by humans, humanity is doomed to a continual striving to reveal them, sometimes experiencing partial successes, but never reaching the ultimate goal. In Blaga’s vision, human history becomes an endless, permanent creative state, never reaching its goal, but never exhausting its source of motivation and meaningfulness either. Through this artifice the Anonymous Fund gives to humanity a goal, a purpose, and gives it the unique historicity that makes it so culturally rich. Thus historicity is one of the greatest dimensions of human existence. It is seen to be a vital aspect of “luciferic” humanness. Likewise, the “principle of conservation of mystery,” which was made part of the very fiber of existence in order to preserve the centrality of the Anonymous Fund from the ambitions of created beings, is seen to be one of the chief metaphysical conditions of the historicity of humanity.

This description highlights the two opposing components that shape human history: the inner human desire to creatively reveal mystery, and the necessity of the Anonymous Fund to thwart this desire. This desire and its lack of fulfillment are here seen as essential both to the historicity of humanity and to full humanness, since they provide the peaks and valleys of failed attempts and renewed aspirations toward the absolute of which human history is composed.

The human inability to have absolute knowledge is often viewed as a failure, shortcoming, or handicap. Blaga reverses this evaluation, making human subjectivity and relativity essential to humanness and the glory of the human situation: according to Blaga, these factors give humanity its role and place in a great ontological scheme. Humans are not the deplorable victims of their own limits that they are sometimes supposed to be; rather, they are the servants of a system that is so great it surpasses them.

The final question of cosmology might be, “Is there anything beyond this cosmos?” Transcendent censorship does not prevent Blaga from having an answer to this question. All that exists is either one of two things: a structure of differentials emitted by the Anonymous Fund, or the Anonymous Fund itself. The cosmos is composed of differentials, as discussed above. The Fund, on the other hand, is not composed of differentials. Therefore the Anonymous Fund is not part of the cosmos. The answer to this question, then, is that there is something “beyond” the cosmos, but only one thing: the Anonymous Fund.

5. Other Philosophical Issues

From this sketch of Blaga’s epistemology and metaphysics one can infer the major themes and directions of the rest of his philosophy. His philosophy of culture elevates culture to the pinnacle of human existence. Culture is a product of the human drive to creatively “reveal” the mysteries of reality and the thwarting of this drive by the Anonymous Fund. Its creativity is an extension of the creativity of the Fund itself, and lends beauty and meaning to human existence. In his philosophy of history he describes humans as historical beings who derive their meaningfulness through living in the face of the unknown, wrestling with it, and conquering it, only to find that it rises up again, providing ever new mountains to climb. Human history is a record of a long series of only partially successful attempts to master our world. (It can be seen that history and culture are closely related, both as subjects and as themes in Blaga’s oeuvre.)

Blaga’s attitude towards science is fairly remarkable considering the positivistic philosophical currents of the early 20th century. He has a great appreciation for science as a cognitive approach that combines both paradisaic and luciferic cognition. As can be anticipated, his application of his epistemology to science leads to insights similar to those of Michael Polanyi and Thomas Kuhn. His is not a critique of science, per se, but rather an explanation of how science operates, locating it within the range of human creative endeavors that aim at revealing the mysteries of existence. As such, science, like art, religion, and all other human cognitive enterprises can be successful, but only within the boundaries postulated by Blaga’s metaphysics.

Blaga views religion as yet another attempt to penetrate the mysteries of existence. Religion is perhaps the grandest of all such attempts, since it aims the highest, but it is also the most doomed, since its reach far outstretches its grasp. He argues that religion is a cultural production, which is a position that caused great animosity toward him on the part of some contemporary Romanian theologians. However, an implication of his metaphysic is that religion is a response to the transcendent Anonymous Fund, a position that is fairly harmonious with Romanian Orthodox theology. And Blaga admits that his “Anonymous Fund” could also be termed “God,” though he explains that he avoids using this term because it carries with it so much baggage.

Blaga’s primary books on philosophy of culture are the three that comprise his “Trilogy of Culture”: Orizont si stil (Horizon and Style), Spatiul mioritic (The Ewe-Space), and Geneza metaforei si sensul culturii (The Genesis of Metaphor and the Meaning of Culture). His philosophy of history is exposited together with his philosophical anthropology in Aspecte antropologice (Anthropological Aspects) and Fiinta istorica (The Historical Being), two of the books making up his “Cosmological Trilogy.” He addresses issues in the philosophy of science in Experimentul si spiritual mathematic (Experiment and the Mathematical Spirit) and Stiinta si creatie (Science and Creation). His theory of aesthetics is outlined in Arta si valoare (Art and Value), and his philosophy of religion is explained in Gandire magica si religiei (Magical Thinking and Religion) and in a set of lecture notes that were posthumously published as Curs de filosofia religiei (Curse on the Philosophy of Religion). 

6. References and Further Reading

Blaga authored many books and articles. Unfortunately, while all of his poetry and some of his theater is available in English, his philosophy remains to be translated. An anthology of fragments, which have been translated into English, with some secondary sources in English as well, is available on CD from Richard T. Allen.

a. Primary Sources

i. English

  • Blaga, Lucian, and Andrei Codrescu (trans.). At the Court of Yearning. Columbus, OH: Ohio State University Press, 1989.
  • Blaga, Lucian, and Brenda Walker (trans.). Complete Poetical Works of Lucian Blaga. Iasi, RO, Oxford, GB, and Portland, USA: Center for Romanian Studies, 2001.
  • Blaga, Lucian, and Doris Planus-Runey (trans.). Zalmoxis: Obscure Pagan. Iasi, RO, Oxford, GB, and Portland, USA: Center for Romanian Studies, 2000.
  • Interestingly, some of Blaga’s poetry, accompanied by music and visuals, is also available on YouTube.

ii. Romanian

  • Eonul dogmatic (The Dogmatic Age). Bucharest: Cartea Romaneasca, 1931.
  • Cunoasterea luciferica (Luciferic Knowledge). Sibiu: Tiparul Institutului de arte grafice “Dacia Traiana,” 1933.
  • Cenzura transcendenta: Incercare metafizica. (Transcendent Censorship: A Metaphysical Attempt). Bucharest: Cartea Româneasca, 1934.
  • Orizont si stil (Horizon and Style). Bucharest: Fundatia pentru literatura si arta “Regele Carol II,” 1935.
  • Spatiul mioritic (The Ewe-Space). Bucharest: Cartea Româneasca, 1936.
  • Geneza metaforei si sensul culturii (The Genesis of Metaphor and the Meaning of Culture). Bucharest: Fundatia pentru literatura si arta “Regele Carol II,” 1937.
  • Arta Si valoare (Art and Value). Bucharest: Fundatia pentru literatura si arta “Regele Carol II,” 1939.
  • Diferentialele divine (The Divine Differentials). Bucharest: Fundatia pentru literatura si arta “Regele Carol II,” 1940.
  • Despre gandirea magica (Concerning Magical Thinking). Bucharest: Fundatia regala pentru literatura si arta, 1941.
  • Religie si spirit (Religion and Spirit). Sibiu: Editura “Dacia Traiana,” 1942.
  • Stiinta si creatie (Science and Creation). Sibiu: Editura “Dacia Traiana,” 1942.
  • Despre constiinta filosofica (Concerning Philosophical Consciousness). Cluj-Napoca: Lito-Schildkraut, 1947.
  • Aspecte antropologice (Anthropological Aspects). Cluj-Napoca: Uniunea nationala a studentilor din Romania, Centrul studentesc Cluj, 1948.
  • Experimentul si spiritul matematic (Experiment and the Mathematical Spirit). Bucharest: Editura Stiintifica, 1969.
  • Fiinta istorica (The Historical Being). Cluj-Napoca: Editura Dacia, 1977.

iii. Other Languages

  • Orizzonte e stile, ed. Antonio Banfi. Milano: Minuziano Editore, 1946.
  • Zum Wesen der rumanischen Volkseele, ed. Mircea Flonta. Bucharest: Editura Minerva, 1982.
  • L’Eon dogmatique, L’Age d’Homme, trans. Jessie Marin, Raoul Marin, Mariana Danesco, and Georges Danesco. Lausanne: Editions l’Age d’Home, 1988.
  • L’Eloge du village roumain, ed. Jessie Marin and Raoul Marin. Paris: Librairie du Savoir, 1989.
  • L’Etre historique, trans. Mariana Danesco. Paris: Librairie du Savoir, 1990.
  • Les Differentielles divines, trans. Thomas Bazin, Raoul Marin, and Georges Danesco. Paris: Librairie du Savoir, 1990.
  • La trilogie de la connaissance, trans. Raul Marin and Georges Piscoci-Danescu. Paris: Librairie du Savoir, 1992.
  • Trilogia della cultura: Lo spazio mioritico, trans. Ricardo Busetto and Marco Cugno. Alessandria, IT: Editionni dell’Orso, 1994.

b. Secondary Sources in English

  • Bejan, Cristina. “The Paradox of the Young Generation in Inter-war Romania,” Slovo, 18:2 (Autumn 2006): 115-128.
  • Botez, Angela. “Comparativist and Valuational Reflections on Blaga’s Philosophy,” Revue Roumaine de Philosophie et Logique 40 (1996): 153–62.
  • Botez, Angela. “Lucian Blaga and the Complementary Spiritual Paradigm of the 20th Century,” Revue Roumaine de Philosophie et Logique 37 (1993): 51–55.
  • Botez, Angela. “The Postmodern Antirepresentationalism (Polanyi, Blaga, Rorty),” Revue Roumaine de Philosophie et Logique 41 (1997): 59–70.
  • Eliade, Mircea. “Rumanian Philosophy,” in Encyclopedia of Philosophy, ed. Paul Edwards (New York: Macmillan and the Free Press, 1967).
  • Flonta, Mircea. “Blaga, Lucian.” In Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy Online, edited by E. Craig. London: Routledge, 2004, (accessed January 3, 2006).
  • Hitchins, Keith. “Introduction to Complete Poetical Works of Lucian Blaga, translated by Brenda Walker, 23–48. Iasi, RO, Oxford, Portland, USA: Center for Romanian Studies, 2001.
  • Isac, Ionut. “Considerations on some Historical and Contemporary Issues in Lucian Blagas Metaphysics,” Journal for the Study of Religions and Ideologies 7:19, spring 2008, 184-202.
  • Jones, Michael S. “Culture and Interreligious Understanding according to the Romanian Philosopher Lucian Blaga,” Journal of Ecumenical Studies 45: 1, winter 2010, 97-112.
  • Jones, Michael S. “Culture as Religion and Religion as Culture in the Philosophy of Lucian Blaga,” Journal for the Study of Religions and Ideologies no. 15, winter 2006, 66-87.
  • Jones, Michael S. “The Metaphysics of Religion: Lucian Blaga and contemporary philosophy.” Teaneck and Madison, NJ: Fairleigh Dickenson University Press, 2006.
  • Munteanu, Bazil. “Lucian Blaga, Metaphysician of Mystery and Philosopher of Culture,” Revue Roumaine de Philosophie et Logique 39 (1995): 43–46.
  • Nemoianu, Virgil. “Mihai Sora and the Traditions of Romanian Philosophy,” Review of Metaphysics 43 (March 1990): 591–605.
  • Nemoianu, Virgil. “A Theory of the Secondary: Literature, Progress, and Reaction.” Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1989, 153 –170.

Author Information

Michael S. Jones
Liberty University
U. S. A.

Manbendra Nath Roy (1887—1954)

M. N. RoyM. N. Roy was a twentieth century Indian philosopher. He began his career as a militant political activist and left India in 1915 in search of arms for organizing an insurrection against British rule in India. However, Roy’s attempts to secure arms ended in a failure, and finally in June 1916, he landed in San Francisco, California. It was there that Roy, who was then known as Narendra Nath Bhattacharya, changed his name to Manbendra Nath Roy. Roy developed friendships with several American radicals, and frequented the New York Public Library. He began a systematic study of socialism, originally with the intention of combating it, but he soon discovered that he had himself become a socialist! Roy met Lenin in Moscow in 1920, and went on to become an international ranking communist leader. Nevertheless, in September 1929 he was expelled from the Communist International for various reasons. He returned to India in December 1930 and was sentenced to six years imprisonment for his role in the Kanpur Communist Conspiracy Case.

Roy’s real philosophical quest began during his prison years which he decided to use for writing a systematic study of ‘the philosophical consequences of modern science’, which would be a re-examination and re-formulation of Marxism to which he subscribed since 1919. The reflections, which Roy wrote in jail over a period of five years, grew into nine rigorous volumes. The ‘Prison Manuscripts’ have not yet been published in their totality, and are currently preserved in the Nehru Memorial Museum and Library Archives in New Delhi. However, selected portions from the manuscript were published as separate books in the 1930s and the 1940s.

In his philosophical works, Roy has made a clear distinction between philosophy and religion. According to Roy, no philosophical advancement is possible unless we get rid of orthodox religious ideas and theological dogmas. On the other hand, Roy has envisaged a very close relationship between philosophy and science. Moreover, Roy has given a central place to intellectual and philosophical revolution in his philosophy. Roy maintained that a philosophical revolution must precede a social revolution. Besides, Roy has, in the tradition of eighteenth century French materialist Holbach, revised and restated materialism in the light of twentieth century scientific developments. In the context of Indian philosophy, Roy could be placed in the tradition of ancient Indian materialism—both Lokayata and Carvaka.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
    1. Militant Nationalist Phase: In Search of Arms
    2. Towards Communism
    3. Return to India: Prison Years
    4. Beyond Communism: Towards New Humanism
    5. Final years
  2. Writings
    1. Autobiographical
    2. Philosophical
  3. Roy’s Concept of Philosophy
    1. Philosophy and Metaphysics
    2. Philosophy and Religion
    3. Philosophy and Science
  4. Roy’s New Humanism: Twenty-Two Theses on Radical Democracy
    1. Basic Tenets of New Humanism
    2. Humanist Interpretation of History
    3. Inadequacies of Communism
    4. Shortcomings of Formal Parliamentary Democracy
    5. Radical Democracy
  5. Philosophical Revolution or Renaissance
  6. Roy’s Materialism or Physical Realism
    1. Roy’s Materialism
    2. Roy’s Materialism and Traditional Materialism
      1. Change in the Concept of “Matter”
      2. Revision of Physical Determinism
      3. Objective Reality of Ideas and the Autonomy of the Mental World
      4. Emphasis on Ethics
    3. Roy’s Materialism and Marxian Materialism
      1. Delinking of Dialectics and Materialism
      2. Rejection of Historical Materialism
      3. Emphasis on Ethics
    4. Roy and Lokayata
  7. Roy’s Intellectual Legacy
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life


M. N. Roy’s original name was Narendra Nath Bhattacharya. He was born on 21 March 1887, at Arbalia, a village in 24 Parganas district in Bengal. His father, Dinabandhu Bhattacharya, was head pandit of a local school. His mother’s name was Basanta Kumari.

a. Militant Nationalist Phase: In Search of Arms


Roy began his political career as a militant nationalist at the age of 14, when he was still a student. He joined an underground organization called Anushilan Samiti, and when it was banned, he helped in organizing Jugantar Group under the leadership of Jatin Mukherji. In 1915, after the beginning of the First World War, Roy left India for Java in search of arms for organizing an insurrection to overthrow the British rule in India. From then on, he moved from country to country, using fake passports and different names in his attempt to secure German arms. Finally, after wandering through Malay, Indonesia, Indo-China, Philippines, Japan, Korea and China, in June 1916, he landed at San Francisco in United States of America.

Roy’s attempts to secure arms ended in a failure. The Police repression had shattered the underground organization that Roy had left behind. He had also come to know about the death of his leader, Jatin Mukherji, in an encounter with police.

b. Towards Communism


The news of Roy’s arrival at San Francisco was somehow published in a local daily, forcing Roy to flee south to Palo Alto, California near Stanford University. It was here that Roy, until then known as Narendra Nath Bhattacharya or Naren, changed his name to Manbendra Nath Roy. This change of name on the campus of Stanford University enabled Roy to turn his back on a futile past and look forward to a new life of adventures and achievements.

Roy’s host at Palo Alto introduced him to Evelyn Trent, a graduate student at Stanford University. Evelyn Trent, who later married Roy, became his political collaborator. She accompanied him to Mexico and Russia and was of great help to him in his political and literary work. The collaboration continued until they separated in 1929.

At New York, where he went from Palo Alto, Roy met Lala Lajpat Rai, the well-known nationalist leader of India. He developed friendships with several American radicals, and frequented the New York Public Library. Roy also went to public meetings with Lajpat Rai. Questions asked by the working class audience in these meetings made Roy wonder whether exploitation and poverty would cease in India with the attainment of independence. Roy began a systematic study of socialism, originally with the intention of combating it, but he soon discovered that he had himself become a socialist! In the beginning, nurtured as he was on Bankimchandra, Vivekanand and orthodox Hindu philosophy, Roy accepted socialism except its materialist philosophy.

Later in Mexico in 1919, Roy met Michael Borodin, an emissary of the Communist International. Roy and Borodin quickly became friends, and it was because of long discussions with Borodin that Roy accepted the materialist philosophy and became a full-fledged communist.

In 1920, Roy was invited to Moscow to attend the second conference of the Communist International. Roy had several meetings with Lenin before the Conference. He differed with Lenin on the role of the local bourgeoisie in nationalist movements. On Lenin’s recommendation, the supplementary thesis on the subject prepared by Roy was adopted along with Lenin’s thesis by the second conference of the Communist International. The following years witnessed Roy’s rapid rise in the international communist hierarchy. By the end of 1926, Roy was elected as a member of all the four official policy making bodies of the Comintern – the presidium, the political secretariat, the executive committee and the world congress.

In 1927, Roy was sent to China as a representative of the Communist International. However, Roy’s mission in China ended in a failure. On his return to Moscow from China, Roy found himself in official disfavor. In September 1929, he was expelled from the Communist International for “contributing to the Brandler press and supporting the Brandler organizations.” Roy felt that he was expelled from the Comintern mainly because of his “claim to the right of independent thinking.” (Ray 1987)

c. Return to India: Prison Years



Roy returned to India in December 1930. He was arrested in July 1931 and tried for his role in the Kanpur Communist Conspiracy Case. He was sentenced to six years imprisonment.

When Roy returned to India, he was still a full-fledged communist, though he had broken from the Comintern. The forced confinement in jail gave him more time than before for systematic study and reflection. His friends in Germany, especially his future wife, Ellen Gottschalk, kept providing him books, which he wanted to read. Roy had planned to use his prison years for writing a systematic study of ‘the philosophical consequences of modern science’, which would be in a way a re-examination and re-formulation of Marxism to which he had been committed since 1919. The reflections, which Roy wrote down in jail, grew over a period of five years into nine thick volumes (approximately over 3000 lined foolscap-size pages). The ‘Prison Manuscripts’ have not so far been published in their totality, and are currently preserved in the Nehru Memorial Museum and Library Archives in New Delhi. However, selected portions from the manuscript were published as separate books in the 1930s and the 1940s. These writings show that Roy was not satisfied with a primarily economic explanation of historical processes. He studied and tried to assess the role of cultural and ideational factors in traditional and contemporary India, in the rise and expansion of Islam, and in the phenomenon of fascism. He was particularly severe on the obscurantist professions and practices of neo-Hindu nationalism. Roy tried to reformulate materialism in the light of latest developments in the physical and biological sciences. He was convinced that without the growth and development of a materialist and rationalist outlook in India, neither a renaissance nor a democratic revolution would be possible. In a way, seeds of the philosophy of new humanism, which was later developed fully by Roy, were already evident in his jail writings.

d. Beyond Communism: Towards New Humanism



Immediately after his release from jail on 20 November 1936, Roy joined Indian National Congress along with his followers. He organized his followers into a body called League of Radical Congressmen. However, in December 1940, Roy and his followers left Congress owing to differences with the Congress leadership on the role of India in the Second World War. Thereafter, Roy formed the Radical Democratic Party of his own. This signaled the beginning of the last phase of Roy’s life in which he developed his philosophy of new humanism.

After Roy’s release from jail in 1936, Ellen Gottschalk joined Roy in Bombay in March 1937. They were married in the same month. Subsequently, Ellen Roy played an important role in Roy’s life, and cooperated in all of his endeavors.

Roy prepared a draft of basic principles of “radical democracy” before the India conference of the Radical Democratic Party held in Bombay in December 1946. The draft, in which his basic ideas were put in the form of theses, was circulated among a small number of selected friends and associates of Roy. The “22 Theses” or “Principles of Radical Democracy”, which emerged as a result of intense discussions between Roy and his circle of friends, were adopted at the Bombay Conference of the Radical Democratic Party. Roy’s speeches at the conference in connection with the 22 Theses were published later under the title Beyond Communism.

In 1947, Roy published New Humanism A Manifesto, which offered an elaboration of the 22 Theses. The ideas expressed in the manifesto were, according to Roy, “developed over a period of number of years by a group of critical Marxists and former Communists.”

Further discussions on the 22 Theses and the manifesto led Roy to the conclusion that party-politics was inconsistent with his ideal of organized democracy. This resulted in the dissolution of the Radical Democratic Party in December 1948 and launching of a movement called the Radical Humanist Movement. At the Calcutta Conference, itself where the party was dissolved, theses 19 and 20 were amended to delete all references to party. The last three paragraphs of the manifesto were also modified accordingly. Thus, the revised versions of the 22 Theses and the manifesto constitute the essence of Roy’s New Humanism.

e. Final years


In 1946, Roy established the Indian Renaissance Institute at Dehradun. Roy was the founder-director of the Institute. Its main aim was to develop and organize a movement to be called the Indian Renaissance Movement.

In 1948, Roy started working on his last major intellectual project. Roy’s magnum opus Reason, Romanticism and Revolution is a monumental work (638 pages). The fully written, revised and typed press copy of the book was ready in April 1952. It attempted to combine a historical survey of western thought with an elaboration of his own system of ideas. While working on Reason, Romanticism and Revolution, Roy had established contacts with several humanist groups in Europe and America, which had views similar to his own. The idea gradually evolved of these groups coming together and constituting an international association with commonly shared aims and principles. The inaugural congress of the International Humanist and Ethical Union (IHEU) was planned to be organized in Amsterdam in 1952, and Roy was expected to play an influential role in the congress and in the development of the IHEU.

However, before going abroad, Roy needed some rest. He and Ellen Roy went up for a few days from Dehradun to the hill station of Mussoorie. On June 11 1952, Roy met a serious accident. He fell fifty feet down while walking along a hill track. He was moved to Dehradun for treatment. On the 25th of August, he had an attack of cerebral thrombosis resulting in a partial paralysis of the right side. The accident prevented the Roys from attending the inaugural congress of the IHEU, which was held in August 1952 at Amsterdam. The congress, however, elected M.N. Roy, in absentia, as one of its vice-presidents and made the Indian Radical Humanist Movement one of the founder members of the IHEU. On August 15 1953, Roy had the second attack of cerebral thrombosis, which paralyzed the left side of his body. Roy’s last article dictated to Ellen Roy for the periodical Radical Humanist was about the nature and organization of the Radical Humanist Movement. This article was published in the Radical Humanist on 24 January 1954. On January 25 1954, ten minutes before midnight, M.N. Roy died of a heart attack. He was nearly 67 at that time.

2. Writings

a. Autobiographical


Roy was a prolific writer. He wrote many books edited, and contributed to several journals. However, he was reluctant to write about himself.  M. N. Roy’ Memoirs (627 pages), which he wrote after initial reluctance, only covers a short period of six years from 1915. When Roy was in an Indian prison, his friends in Germany, especially his future wife, Ellen Gottschalk, kept providing him books, which he wanted to read. Roy’s letters to her from jail, published subsequently as Letters from Jail (1943), contains pointers to his reading and thinking during those years.

b. Philosophical


Four volumes of Selected Works of M. N. Roy, edited by Sibnarayan Ray, have been published by the Oxford University Press.  Many of the writings of M. N. Roy such as Revolution and Counter-Revolution in China belong to the period when he was a communist. We have already mentioned some of his works related to the final humanist phase of his life, such as, Beyond Communism, New Humanism – A Manifesto and Reason, Romanticism and Revolution. According to M. N. Roy, his books Scientific Politics (1942) along with New Orientation (1946) and Beyond Communism (1947) constitute the history of the development of radical humanism. The final ideas are, of course, contained in New Humanism.

As mentioned earlier, Roy’s real philosophical quest began during his prison years after returning to India in 1930.  He decided to use his prison years for writing a systematic study of ‘the philosophical consequences of modern science’, which was to be in a way a re-examination and re-formulation of Marxism to which he subscribed since 1919. The reflections, which Roy wrote down in jail, grew over a period of five years into nine thick volumes (approximately over 3000 lined foolscap-size pages). The ‘Prison Manuscripts’ have not so far been published in their totality, and are currently preserved in the Nehru Memorial Museum and Library Archives in New Delhi. However, selected portions from the manuscript were published as separate books in the 1930s and the 1940s. Materialism (1940), Science and Superstition (1940), Heresies of the 20th Century (1939), Fascism (1938), The Historical Role of Islam (1939), Ideal Of Indian Womanhood (1941), Science and Philosophy (1947) and India’s Message (1950) are among the books that were made from these handwritten note books. Of these Materialism and Science and Philosophy, are of special interest from the point of view of studying Roy’s concept of philosophy and his formulations on materialism.

Since 1937, Roy was editing a new weekly named Independent India. In 1949, Independent India weekly changed to The Radical Humanist weekly. The name of another quarterly journal The Marxian Way, which Roy had been publishing since 1945 in collaboration with Sudhindranath Datta, was changed to The Humanist Way in the same year. The Humanist Way has ceased publication, but The Radical Humanist is still being published by the Indian Renaissance Institute as a monthly.

3. Roy’s Concept of Philosophy

Philosophy, according to Roy, is contemplation, study and knowledge of nature. Its function is “to know things as they are, and to find the common origin of the diverse phenomena of nature, in nature itself”.

Philosophy, says Roy, begins when “spiritual needs” of human beings are no longer satisfied by primitive natural religion, which imagines and worships a variety of gods as personification of the diverse phenomena of nature. The grown-up human is no longer satisfied with the nursery-tales, with which “he was impressed in his spiritual childhood”. Intellectual growth emboldens him to seek the causes of all natural phenomena in nature itself and to “find in nature a unity behind its diversity.” (Roy 1951)

In his book Science and Philosophy, Roy defines philosophy as “the theory of life”. The function of philosophy, in words of Roy, “is to solve the riddle of the Universe”. According to Roy, philosophy is born out of the efforts of man to explain nature and to understand his own relationship with it. (5-6)

a. Philosophy and Metaphysics

Roy has made a distinction between philosophy and metaphysics. According to him, metaphysics also begins with the desire to discover the unity behind the diversity. However, it leaves the ground of philosophy in its quest for a “noumenon” beyond nature, something that is distinct from “phenomena”. Thus, it abandons the inquiry into what really exists, and “plunges into the wilderness of speculation”. It takes up the absurd task of knowing the intangible, as the condition for the knowing the tangible.

It is obvious that Roy was opposed to speculative philosophy, which set for itself the impossible task of prying into the transcendental being “above and behind” the physical universe – of acquiring the knowledge of the reality behind the appearance. According to Roy, an inquiry, which denies the very existence of the object to be enquired, is bound to end in idle dreams and hopeless confusion.

b. Philosophy and Religion

Roy was opposed not only to speculative philosophy but also to the identification of philosophy with poetic fancy or theology and religion. According to him, for the average educated human, the term philosophy has a very vague meaning. It stands not only for speculative thought, but also for poetic fancy. Not only that, in India, philosophy is often not distinguished from religion and theology. “Indeed,” according to Roy, “what is generally believed to be the distinctive feature of Indian philosophy is that it has not broken away from the medieval tradition, as modern Western philosophy did in the seventeenth century.”

According to Roy, faith in the supernatural does not allow the search for the causes of natural phenomena in nature itself. Therefore, rejection of orthodox religious ideas and theological dogmas is the precondition for philosophy.  Roy was of the view that, religion will certainly be liquidated by the rise of science, because scientific knowledge enables humankind to answer questions, confronted by which in its childhood, it was forced to assume super-natural forces or agencies. Therefore, according to Roy, in order to perform its function, “philosophy must break away from religion” and start from the reality of the physical universe.

c. Philosophy and Science

On the one hand, Roy regards rejection of orthodox religious ideas and theological dogmas as the essential precondition of philosophy, and on the other, he envisages a very intimate relationship between philosophy and science. In fact, according to Roy, the philosophical significance of modern scientific theory is to render untenable the old division of labor between science and philosophy. Science is, says Roy, stepping over the old boundary line, “Digging deeper and deeper into the secrets of nature, science has come up against problems, the solution of which was previously left to philosophy. Scientific inquiry has pushed into what is traditionally regarded as the ‘metaphysical’ realm.”

The problems of philosophy – cosmology, ontology and epistemology – can all be progressively solved, according to Roy, in the light of scientific knowledge. The function of philosophy is, points out Roy, to explain existence as a whole. An explanation of existence requires knowledge of existence. Knowledge about the different phases of existence is being gathered by the various branches of science. Therefore, says Roy, the function of philosophy is to coordinate an entire body of scientific knowledge into a comprehensive theory of nature and life.  Philosophy can now exist only as the science of sciences – a systematic coordination, a synthesis of all positive knowledge, continuously readjusting itself to progressive enlargement of the store of human knowledge. A mystic metaphysical conception of the world is no longer to be accorded the distinction of philosophy. Thus, according to Roy, philosophy is a logical coordination of all the branches of positive knowledge in a system of thought to explain the world rationally and to serve as a reliable guide for life.

4. Roy’s New Humanism: Twenty-Two Theses on Radical Democracy


“New Humanism” is the name given by Roy to the “new philosophy of revolution” which he developed in the later part of his life. This philosophy has been summarized by Roy in the “Twenty-Two Theses” and elaborated in his New Humanism A Manifesto.

New Humanism, as presented in the Twenty-Two Theses, has both a critical and a constructive aspect. The critical aspect consists of describing the inadequacies of communism (including the economic interpretation of history), and of formal parliamentary democracy. The constructive aspect, on the other hand, consists of giving highest value to the freedom of individual, presenting a humanist interpretation of history, and outlining a picture of radical or organized democracy along with the way for achieving the ideal of radical democracy.

a. Basic Tenets of New Humanism


Apart from Roy’s effort to trace the quest for freedom and search for truth to the biological struggle for existence. The basic idea of the first three theses of Roy is individualism. According to Roy, the central idea of the Twenty-Two Theses is that political philosophy must start from the basic idea that the individual is prior to society, and freedom can be enjoyed only by individuals.

Quest for freedom and search for truth, according to Roy, constitute the basic urge of human progress. The purpose of all-rational human endeavor, individual as well as collective, is attainment of freedom in ever-increasing measure. The amount of freedom available to the individuals is the measure of social progress. Roy refers back the quest for freedom to human being’s struggle for existence, and he regards search for truth as a corollary to this quest. Reason, according to Roy, is a biological property, and it is not opposed to human will. Morality, which originates from the rational desire for harmonious and mutually beneficial social relations, is rooted in the innate rationality of man.

b. Humanist Interpretation of History


In his humanist interpretation of history, presented in theses four, five and six, Roy gives an important place to human will as a determining factor in history, and emphasizes the role of ideas in the process of social evolution. Formation of ideas is, according to Roy, a physiological process but once formed, ideas exist by themselves and are governed by their own laws. The dynamics of ideas runs parallel to the process of social evolution and both of them influence each other. Cultural patterns and ethical values are not mere super structures of established economic relations. They have a history and logic of their own.

c. Inadequacies of Communism

Roy’s criticism of communism, contained in theses seven to eleven is based mainly on the experience of the former Soviet Union, particularly the “discrepancy between the ideal and the reality of the socialist order.”  According to Roy, freedom does not necessarily follow from the capture of political power in the name of the oppressed and the exploited classes and abolition of private property in the means of production. For creating a new world of freedom, revolution must go beyond an economic reorganization of society. A political system and an economic experiment which subordinate the man of flesh and blood to an imaginary collective ego, be it the nation or class, cannot possibly be, in Roy’s view, the suitable means for the attainment of the goal of freedom.

The Marxian doctrine of state, according to which the state is an instrument of exploitation of one class by another, is clearly rejected by Roy. According to Roy, the state is “the political organization of society” and “its withering away under communism is a utopia which has been exploded by experience”.

Similarly, Roy rejects the communist doctrine of the dictatorship of the proletariat. “Dictatorship of any form, however plausible may be the pretext for it, is,” asserts Roy, “excluded by the Radical-Humanist perspective of social revolution”.

d. Shortcomings of Formal Parliamentary Democracy


Roy has discussed the shortcomings of formal parliamentary democracy in his twelfth and thirteenth theses. These flaws, according to Roy, are outcome of the delegation of power. Atomized individual citizens are, in Roy’s view, powerless for all practical purposes, and for most of the time. They have no means to exercise their sovereignty and to wield a standing control of the state machinery.

“To make democracy effective,” says Roy, “power must always remain vested in the people and there must be ways and means for the people to wield sovereign power effectively, not periodically, but from day to day.”

e. Radical Democracy


Thus, Roy’s ideal of radical democracy, as outlined in theses fourteen to twenty-two consists of a highly decentralized democracy based on a network of people’s committee’s through which citizens wield a standing democratic control over the state.

Roy has not ignored the economic aspect of his ideal of radical democracy. He argued that progressive satisfaction of the material necessities is the pre-condition for the individual members of society unfolding their intellectual and other finer human potentialities. According to him, an economic reorganization, which will guarantee a progressively rising standard of living, is the foundation of the Radical Democratic State. “Economic liberation of the masses”, says Roy, “is an essential condition for their advancing towards the goal of freedom.”

The ideal of radical democracy will be attained, according to Roy, through the collective efforts of mentally free men united and determined for creating a world of freedom. They will function as the guides, friends and philosophers of the people rather than as their would-be rulers. Consistent with the goal of freedom, their political practice will be rational and, therefore, ethical.

Roy categorically asserts that a social renaissance can come only through determined and widespread endeavor to educate the people as regards the principles of freedom and rational co-operative living.  Social revolution, according to Roy, requires a rapidly increasing number of men of the new renaissance, and a rapidly expanding system of people’s committees and an organic combination of both. The program of revolution will similarly be based on the principles of freedom, reason and social harmony.

As pointed out by Roy himself in his preface to the second edition of the New Humanism: A Manifesto, though new humanism has been presented in the twenty-two theses and the Manifesto as a political philosophy, it is meant to be a complete system. Because of being based on the ever-expanding totality of scientific knowledge, new humanism cannot be a closed system. “It will not be”, says Roy, “a dogmatic system claiming finality and infallibility.”

f. Philosophical Revolution or Renaissance

It is obvious from the foregoing that Roy was a great supporter of philosophical revolution or renaissance, and he has given a central place to it in his radical humanism. Roy was an admirer of European renaissance and drew inspiration from it. For him, “the renaissance was the revolt of man against God and his agents on this earth”. According to Roy, the renaissance “heralded the modern civilization and the philosophy of freedom”. He strongly believed that India, too, needed a renaissance on rationalist and humanist lines. According to him, this was a necessary condition for democracy to function in a proper manner. He believed that “a new Renaissance based on rationalism and cosmopolitan humanism” was essential for democracy to be realized. (Roy has used the word “rationalist” not in the Cartesian sense but in the popular sense. In this sense, a “rationalist” regards reason including both perception and inference as a source of knowledge.)

According to Roy, a philosophical revolution must precede a social revolution. He was opposed to blind faith and superstitions of all kinds and supported rationalism. As a physical realist, he rejected all allegedly supernatural entities like god and soul. Similarly, he was opposed to fatalism and the doctrine of karma. He unequivocally rejected the religious mode of thinking and advocated a scientific outlook and a secular morality. As noted earlier, he was in favor of delinking philosophy with religion and associating it closely with science.  He believed that science would ultimately liquidate religion.

According to Roy, a revolutionary is one who has got the idea that the world can be remade, made better than it is to-day, that it was not created by a supernatural power, and therefore, could be remade by human efforts.

Further, according to Roy, “the idea of improving upon the creation of God can never occur to God-fearing. We can conceive of the idea only when we know that all gods are our own creation, and we can depose whomsoever we have enthroned.”

Roy’s critical approach towards religion comes out very clearly in the preface of his book, India’s Message, where he asserts that a criticism of religious thought and a searching analysis of traditional beliefs and the time-honored dogmas of religion is essential for the belated Renaissance of India. “The spirit of inquiry should overwhelm the respect for tradition.”

According to Roy, “a critical examination of what is cherished as India’s cultural heritage will enable the Indian people to cast off the chilly grip of a dead past. It will embolden them to face the ugly realities of a living present and look forward to a better, brighter and pleasanter future.” Thus, Roy was opposed to an uncritical and vain glorification of India’s so-called “spiritual” heritage. However, he did not stand for a wholesale rejection of ancient Indian thought either. He favored a rational and critical approach towards ancient traditions and thoughts. Roy believed that the object of European renaissance was to rescue the positive contributions of ancient European civilization, which were lying buried in the Middle Ages owing to the dominance of the Church. Roy had something similar in his mind about India. According to him, one of the tasks of the Renaissance movement should be to rescue the positive outcome and abiding contributions of ancient thought – contributions, which just like the contributions of Greek sages, are lying in ruins under the decayed structure of the Brahmanical Society – the tradition of which is erroneously celebrated as the Indian civilization.

5. Roy’s Materialism or Physical Realism

a. Roy’s Materialism

M .N. Roy was a strong supporter of materialist philosophy. According to Roy, strictly speaking, materialism is “the only philosophy possible”, because  it represents the knowledge of nature as it really exists—knowledge acquired through the contemplation, observation and investigation of nature itself.

Roy points out that materialism is not the “monstrosity” it is generally supposed to be. It is not the cult of “eat, drink and be merry”, as it has been depicted by its ignorant or malicious adversaries. It simply maintains that “the origin of everything that really exists is matter, that there does not exist anything but matter, all other appearances being transformations of matter, and these transformations are governed necessarily by laws inherent in nature.”  (Roy 1951)

Thus, broadly speaking, Roy’s philosophy is in the tradition of materialism. However, there are some important differences between Roy’s materialism and traditional materialism.  In fact, Roy’s “materialism” is a restatement of traditional materialism in the light of contemporary scientific knowledge.  According to Roy, the substratum of the universe is not matter as traditionally conceived, but it is “physical as against mental or spiritual”. It is, in other words, “a measurable entity”. Therefore, says Roy, to prevent prejudice, materialism could be renamed “physical realism”.

b. Roy’s Materialism and Traditional Materialism

Roy was of the view that materialism must be dissociated from certain notions, which have been rendered untenable by the discoveries of science. His revision and restatement of materialism embraces both the basic tenets of materialism: the concept of matter as well as the doctrine of physical determinism.

i. Change in the Concept of “Matter”

According to Roy, the discoveries of quantum physics have “made the classical notion of matter untenable”. Nevertheless, Roy insists that though the substratum of the universe is “not matter as traditionally conceived” it is “physical as against mental or spiritual. It is a measurable entity”.

The so-called “crisis” of materialism, according to Roy, involved the conception of matter, and not its existence.  The “crisis” simply exposed the inadequacy of the old atomist theory. The substance of the “crisis” was, “that it appeared to reduce matter from mass to energy and radiation”. However, there cannot be any doubt about the fact that “atomic physics deals with material realities which exist objectively, outside the mind of the physicist.” Thus, in Roy’s physical realism “matter” is not made up of hard and massy stone-like atoms as in traditional “mechanical materialism”. The whole concept of “matter” has been revised in the light of new physics. In fact, Roy was even ready to discard the term “matter” provided a more appropriate new term could be coined. In Science and Philosophy, Roy describes “matter” as the “sole-existence.” According to Roy, it is not very important what name is attached to the “substratum of existence” – matter, energy, action, vibratory motion or field. However, he insists that it is a physical reality. What Roy means by calling it physical is that it exists objectively and that it is measurable. As we have seen, Roy has even renamed his revised version of materialism as “physical realism”.

ii. Revision of Physical Determinism


Roy disagrees with the view of some thinkers that Heisenberg’s Principle of Uncertainty requires the rejection of the doctrine of determinism. According to Roy, only a modification in the traditional conception of causality is required. Causality, in Roy’s view, is not an a priori form of thought or an axiomatic law; it is physical relation inherent in the constitution of the universe.

Roy, in fact, tries to temper a rigidly mechanical view of determinism by interpreting it in terms of probability. He admits plurality of possibilities and the element of contingency in the world, and tries to show that determinism and probability are not mutually exclusive. However, Roy insists that statistical methods presuppose determinism. The universe is a law-governed system, and the existence of law presupposes causality. He is emphatic that the element of uncertainty in the sub-atomic world is not to be equated with indeterminacy. Rejection of the idea that there are invariant relations in nature, maintains Roy, will blast the very foundation of science.

Roy also tries to reconcile “freedom of will” with determinism. According to him, human beings possess free will and can choose out of various alternatives in front of them. Roy, however, is not unique among materialists in recognizing free will. Epicurus, among ancient Greek materialists, and Hobbes, among modern materialists, tried to accommodate free will in their philosophies. According to Roy, the vast world of biological evolution lies between the world of human beings and the world of inanimate matter, and, therefore, the world of human beings has its own specific laws, though these laws can be referred back to the general laws of the world of dead matter. Nevertheless, human will, says Roy, cannot be directly related to the laws of physical universe. Thus, Roy is not, to use the terminology of William James, a “hard” determinist like Holbach, but a “soft” determinist like Hobbes.

iii. Objective Reality of Ideas and the Autonomy of the Mental World

Though Roy traces the origin of mental activities to the physical background of the living world, yet he also grants them an objective existence of their own. Mind and matter, according to Roy, can be reduced to a common denominator; as such, they are two objective realities. In Roy’s view, once formed, ideas exist by themselves, governed by their own laws. Thus, Roy grants much more objectivity and autonomy to the mental world than has been traditionally granted by materialists. Roy’s materialism is not an “extreme” materialism like that of the eighteenth century French materialist, Julien de la Mettrie, who regarded man to be a self-moving machine. According to Roy, on the other hand, “Man is not a living machine, but a thinking animal”.

iv. Emphasis on Ethics

Roy has given a very important place to ethics in his philosophy. According to Roy, “the greatest defect of classical materialism was that its cosmology did not seem to have any connection with ethics”. Roy strongly asserts that if it is not shown that materialist philosophy can accommodate ethics, then, human spirit, thirsting for freedom, will spurn materialism. In Roy’ view materialist ethics is not only possible but also the noblest form of morality. Roy links morality with human being’s innate rationality. Human beings are moral, according to Roy, because they are rational. In Roy’s ethics freedom, which he links with the struggle of existence is the highest value. Search for truth is a corollary to the quest for freedom.

However, Roy is not unique among materialists in emphasizing the importance of ethics in his philosophy. Contrary to popular impression, ancient materialist Epicurus and modern materialist Holbach, for example, accorded an important place to ethics in their philosophies. However, the details of Roy’s ethics are somewhat different from these philosophers.

c. Roy’s Materialism and Marxian Materialism


Before he formulated and expounded his own philosophy of New Humanism, Roy was an orthodox Marxist. In fact, Roy’s revision of materialism was carried out in the context of Marxism. Thus, Roy’s revision of materialism in general is also applicable to Marxian materialism to the extent Marxian materialism resembles traditional materialism.

Roy’s Physical Realism is, however, different from Marxian materialism in three important ways:

i. Delinking of Dialectics and Materialism

Roy considers the Hegelian heritage a weak spot of Marxism. The simplicity and scientific soundness of materialism are marred by making its validity conditional upon dialectic. According to Roy, materialism pure, and simple, can stand on its own legs, and, therefore, he tries to de-link dialectics from materialism. The validity of materialism, maintains Roy, is in no way conditional on dialectics, as there is no logical connection between the two.

ii. Rejection of Historical Materialism

Roy rejects historical materialism and advocates a humanist interpretation of history in which he gives an important place to human will as a determining factor in history, and he recognizes the autonomy of the mental world. He argues that human will cannot be directly related to the laws of physical universe. Ideas, too, have an objective existence, and are governed by their own laws. The economic interpretation of history is deduced from a wrong interpretation of materialism.

iii. Emphasis on Ethics


Roy’s materialism is sharply different from Marxian materialism in so far it recognizes the importance of ethics and gives a prominent place to it. According to Roy, Marxian materialism wrongly disowns the humanist tradition and thereby divorces materialism from ethics. The contention that “from the scientific point of view this appeal to morality and justice does not help us an inch farther” was based, according to Roy, upon a false notion of science.

d. Roy and Lokayata


His materialism or physical realism could be placed in the tradition of ancient Indian materialism: Lokayata or Carvaka. In fact, in the third chapter of his book Materialism, titled “Materialism in Indian Philosophy”, Roy has approvingly referred to Lokayata. According to him, “the long process of the development of naturalist, rationalist, skeptic, agnostic and materialist thought in ancient India found culmination in the Charvak system of philosophy, which can be compared with Greek Epicureanism, and as such is to be appreciated as the positive outcome of the intellectual culture of India”. (94)

6. Roy’s Intellectual Legacy

Roy was a former Marxist and a hero of Indian communists for having rubbed shoulders with Lenin and Stalin. However, he later gave up Marxism and advocated his own “radical humanism”. Naturally, he has been criticized generally by Marxists and communists for renouncing Marxism as well as for finding fault with communist doctrines like “the dictatorship of the proletariat”. Nonetheless, there was a small group of intellectuals who collaborated closely with him in preparing the “Twenty-two Theses on Radical Democracy” and New Humanism: A Manifesto; namely, V. M. Tarkunde, Phillip Spratt, Laxman Shastri Joshi, Sibnarayan Ray, G. D. Parikh, G. R. Dalvi, Sikander Choudhary and Ellen Roy (Roy’s wife). Some of them like Tarkunde, Sibnarayan Ray and G. D. Parikh remained active in the radical humanist movement launched by Roy and also wrote and edited books on him. (See References and Further Reading)

Among the journals founded by M. N. Roy, The Humanist Way, has ceased publication, but The Radical Humanist is still being published as a monthly by the Indian Renaissance Institute. It was edited for a long time by Tarkunde. Since Tarkunde, it has been edited by R. M. Pal and R. A. Jahagirdar among others.

Outside the select group of Roy’s close friends and associates, A. B. Shah, founder of the Indian Secular Society and The Secularist journal was one of the important intellectuals influenced by Roy’s ideas.

Some of his final ideas are open to criticism even from a humanist perspective. For example, Roy’s use of the word “spiritual” in certain contexts is problematic. Roy talks of “spiritual needs” and “spiritual childhood” of human beings (Section 3), when, in fact, he was a materialist. He was at pains to emphasize that reality is “physical as against mental or spiritual” (Section 5 a ). As a materialist, he was also opposed to the vain glorification of the so-called “spiritual” heritage of India. (Section 4 f ) Apparently, Roy has used the word “spiritual” in phrases like “spiritual needs” and “spiritual childhood” in the sense of “intellectual.” Nonetheless, the use of the term “spiritual” by Roy even in these contexts could be misleading, considering the fact that he did not believe in the existence of soul and spirit. (Ramendra 2001)

Roy’s advocacy of party-less democracy, too, is open to criticism. Freedom of association is a fundamental democratic freedom. In any democracy worth the name, citizens with similar political ideas and programs are bound to come together and cooperate with one another by forming political parties and other non-party organizations. The only possible way to prevent them from doing so will be to deny the fundamental right to association, which will be an undemocratic act in itself. Therefore, the ideal of “party-less democracy” seems to be self-contradictory, impractical and unrealizable.

7. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Parikh, G. D. compiler.  Essence of Royism (Bombay: Nav Jagriti Samaj, 1987).
    • Anthology of  M. N. Roy’s writings by one of his close academician associates.
  • Ray, Sibnarayan. ed., Selected Works of M. N. Roy, vol. I, (Delhi: Oxford University Press, 1987).
    • Altogether four volumes have been published. The first volume contains an illuminating introduction written by the editor, another close academician associate of Roy.
  • Roy, M. N. and Spratt, Phillip.  Beyond Communism (Delhi: Ajanta Publications, 1981).
    • Shows Roy’s transition from Marxism to Humanism.
  • Roy, M. N.  India’s Message (Delhi: Ajanta Publications, 1982).
    • One of the books made out of the ‘Prison Manuscripts’. Published originally as the second volume of Fragments of a Prisoner’s Diary.  First volume was titled Memoirs of a Cat.
  • Roy, M. N.  Letters from Jail ( Calcutta: Renaissance Publishers Private Ltd., 1965).
    • Third volume of Fragments of a Prisoner’s Diary.  Letters written to his future wife and a close associate, Ellen Roy.
  • Roy, M. N.  Materialism (Calcutta: Renaissance Publishers Ltd., 1951).
    • From the ‘Prison Manuscripts’.
  • Roy, M. N.  M. N. Roy’s Memoirs (New Delhi: Ajanta Publications, 1983).
    • Covers a short period of six years from 1915.
  • Roy, M. N. New Humanism – A Manifesto (Delhi: Ajanta Publications, 1981).
    • Roy’s final ideas on humanism
  • Roy, M. N. New Orientation (Delhi: Ajanta Publications, 1982).
    • Transition from Marxism to Humanism.
  • Roy, M. N. Politics, Power and Parties (Delhi: Ajanta Publications, 1981).
    • Roy’s views on party-politics.
  • Roy, M. N. Reason, Romanticism and Revolution (Delhi: Ajanta Publications, 1989).
    • Last major work.
  • Roy, M. N. Science and Philosophy (Delhi: Ajanta Publications, 1984).
    • From the ‘Prison Manuscripts’.
  • Roy, M. N. Scientific Politics (Calcutta: Renaissance Publishers, 1947).
    • Transition from Marxism to Humanism

b. Secondary Sources

  • Karnik, V. B. M. N. Roy (New Delhi: National Book Trust, 1980).
    • A biography of Roy by one of his close associates.
  • Pal, R. M. ed., Selections from the Marxian Way and the Humanist Way (Delhi: Ajanta Publications, 2000).
    • Selections from the journal The Marxian Way and The Humanist Way (changed name), edited by Roy.
  • Ramendra. M. N. Roy’s New Humanism and Materialism (Patna: Buddhiwadi Foundation, 2001).
    • A critical study of Roy’s new humanism and materialism.
  • Ray, Sibnarayan, ed. M.N. Roy Philosopher-Revolutionary (New Delhi: Ajanta Publications, 1995).
    • Contains some writings of  M. N. Roy, but also writings of many others on Roy, including that of V. B. Karnik, Suddhindranath Datta, Ellen Roy, Laxman Shastri Joshi, Phillip Spratt, G. D. Parikh, Stanley Maron and H. J. Blackham.
  • Tarkunde, V. M.    Radical Humanism (New Delhi: Ajanta Publications, 1983).
    • An exposition of radical humanism by an intellectual-activist and a close associate of Roy.

Author Information

Ramendra Nath
Patna University

Angélique Arnauld (1591—1661)

The reforming abbess of the convent of Port-Royal, Mère Angélique Arnauld developed an Augustinian philosophy deeply influenced by the Jansenist movement.  Her philosophy of God follows the via negativa in its stress on God’s incomprehensibility.  Her theory of moral virtue is emphatically theocentric; even such natural virtues as patience are presented as emanations of grace.   The monastic virtues of poverty and humility receive pride of place in this account.  Reflecting her struggle with political and ecclesiastical authorities, Arnauld’s philosophy stresses the rights of women to education, to theological culture, to self-government, and to fidelity to personal conscience.  Although she affirms the existence of free will, Arnauld’s emphasis on the depth of human depravity and the dependence of the moral agent on divine grace for the execution of virtuous action bears the traces of theological determinism.  Long considered a minor voice in the Jansenist strand of Augustinian philosophy developed by Antoine Arnauld and Blaise Pascal, Angélique Arnauld’s original variations on Augustinianism have recently been underscored by feminist commentators.  The abbess’s gendered account of virtue is drawn from the experience of nuns committed to a strict contemplative life. Her defense of the rights of women to theological culture and opinion challenged the patriarchal commands issued by throne and altar that recommended religious silence for nuns.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Works
  3. Philosophical Themes
    1. Apophatic Theology
    2. Virtue Theory
    3. Theological Determinism
    4. Gender and Right
  4. Interpretation and Relevance
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

Born on September 8, 1591, Jacqueline Marie Arnauld belonged to a prominent noblesse de robe family.  Both her father Antoine Arnauld and her mother Catherine Marion Arnauld descended from families renowned for their lawyers, parliamentarians, and diplomats.  Her grandfather Antoine Arnauld the Elder had battled the Jesuits in the parlement of Paris.  The family’s juridical culture and hostility to the Jesuits would durably mark the younger generation during the battle over Jansenism.

From her infancy, Jacqueline Marie Arnauld had been designated by the family as a future nun and superior.  In 1599 her maternal grandfather Simon Marion successfully obtained from King Henri IV the royal appointment of his niece as the abbess of Port-Royal, a Cistercian convent in the southwestern hinterlands of Paris. The family falsified the age of the abbatial nominee in documents sent to the Vatican in order to circumvent the requirements of canon law.  To receive the rudiments of religious education, Jacqueline Marie was sent to the decadent convent of Maubuisson, governed by the sister of the king’s mistress.  Despite the low level of education, the nascent abbess discovered Stoicism through her reading of Plutarch.  Now known by her religious name as Mère Marie-Angélique de Sainte-Magdalene [popularly as Mère Angélique], the young nun was formally installed as coadjutor abbess on April 10, 1602 and upon the death of Abbess Jeanne Boulehart on July 3, 1602, was declared the abbess of Port-Royal.  This childhood experience of forced vocations, trafficking in religious office, and perjury to attain social position would influence the mature Mère Angélique’s campaign to abolish just such abuses in the name of vocational freedom.

The eleven-year old abbess had inherited a lax convent containing scarcely a dozen nuns.  Liturgical offices had languished; sermons were rarely heard; the nuns entertained themselves by leisurely visits with the neighbors, masked balls, and elaborate decoration of their private apartments.  In 1608, Mère Angélique underwent a sudden conversion.  With the reluctant consent of her subjects, she launched the convent’s reform.  Her reforms included the abolition of private property and the institution of strictly communal property; the restoration of the rule of silence; the restoration of the night office; the institution of a vegetarian diet; the strict practice of cloister, with visitors relegated to a parlor divided by a grille.  The Angelican reform campaign reached a dramatic apogee on September 15, 1609, the journée du guichet, when Mère Angélique refused her own family admission to the convent.

Intellectual as well as moral, the Angelican reform also devoted itself to the development of a theological culture by the nuns.  Distinguished theologians, notably Archange de Pembroke, Benot de Canfield, and François de Sales, preached and lectured at the convent.  The philosophical and theological orientation of these preachers was clearly Augustinian rather than Thomistic.  This new Augustinian intellectual culture was reinforced by readings from Saint Augustine and Saint Bernard of Clairvaux at table and by the neo-Augustinian conferences on the spiritual life delivered by Mère Angélique herself.  During the Oratorian ascendancy (1626-33), when Oratorian priests served as the convent’s chaplains, Port-Royal fell under the influence of the mystical école française.  A disciple of the Pseudo-Dionysius, Pierre Bérulle defended apophatic theology, in which the negative attributes of the godhead are underscored; Charles Condren stressed the annihilation of self which is essential for union with God and authentic knowledge of the divine attributes.  The Oratorian themes of divine incomprehensibility and annihilation of the human subject clearly influenced Mère Angélique’s philosophy.

Under Mère Angélique’s direction, Port-Royal flourished as a model of reformed convent life.  In 1626, the convent opened a Parisian branch in the neighborhood adjacent to the Sorbonne.  In 1629, King Louis XIII approved one of the abbess’s most cherished reforms: the election of the abbess by the convent nuns themselves rather than by royal appointment; the term of office would now be fixed (three years) rather than lifetime.  The nuns elected Mère Geneviève Tardiff as Mère Angélique’s successor in 1630.  The new episcopal overseer of the convent, Bishop Sebastien Zamet, opposed Mère Angélique on the nature of conventual reform; the austere Angelican reform was soon replaced by more theatrical liturgies and greater intercourse with the Parisian lay elite.  The effort of Zamet and Mère Angélique to develop a new religious order, the ephemeral Institut du Saint-Sacrement (1633-36), ended in bitter failure.  The election of Mère Angélique’s sister Mère Agnès Arnauld as Port-Royal’s new abbess in 1636 permitted a swift return to the principles of the Angelican reform.  Appointed as novice mistress, Mère Angélique now focused on the spiritual and intellectual formation of younger community members.

The restoration of the Angelican reform also marked the transformation of Port-Royal into a bastion of Jansenism.  Jean de Hauranne, abbé de Saint-Cyran, became the convent chaplain.  A friend and disciple of Cornelius Jansen, Louvain theologian and bishop of Ypres, Saint-Cyran propagated the radical Augustinianism of Jansen through sermons, lectures, and spiritual direction.  Typical Jansenist themes included radical human depravity, the centrality of predestination, the small number of the elect, complete dependence on divine grace for salvation, and moral rigorism.  The imprisonment of Saint-Cyran (1638-43) initiated the French government’s campaign against the convent and its Jansenist theology, perceived as heretical and supportive of political dissidence.

In subsequent decades, the Jansenist orientation of Port-Royal intensified.  Devoted to meditation and scholarship, a community of laymen living in the environs of the convent (the solitaires) published the works of Augustine, Jansen, Saint-Cyran, and other authors favored by the Jansenists.   These works became the staples of the convent school curriculum and of the texts read aloud during convent meals.  The Arnauld family spearheaded the Jansenist movement.  Mère Angélique’s brother Antoine the Younger Arnauld emerged as the school’s leading theologian; her brother Henri Arnauld, bishop of Angers, defended Jansenism in the episcopate; her brother Robert Arnauld d’Andilly became the most prolific of the solitaire translators and editors.  Through correspondence Mère Angélique personally participated in the philosophical and theological disputes occasioned by Antoine Arnauld’s Frequent Communion (1643), Blaise Pascal’s Provincial Letters (1656), and Jean de Brisacier’s anti-Jansenist Jansenism Confounded (1651).

In 1661 Louis XIV intensified the campaign against Port-Royal.  The French government demanded that all clerics, teachers, and members of religious orders sign a statement in which they assented to the papacy’s condemnation of five heretical theses allegedly found in Jansen’s Augustinus.  To guide the perplexed conscience of Jansenists during “the crisis of the signature,” Antoine Arnauld developed the droit/fait distinction.  According to this distinction, the judgment of the church on matters of faith and morals (droit) binds the conscience of the faithful, since such judgments were essential to the church’s divine mission of guiding people to salvation.  On judgments of empirical fact (fait), however, the church’s judgment is fallible, open to subsequent alteration or even reversal.  Using the droit/fait distinction, the Jansenists could assent to the church’s condemnation of the five condemned theses concerning grace and freedom; however, they could not assent to what they considered the church’s erroneous judgment of fact that Jansen had actually defended these heretical theories.

Despite Mère Angélique’s efforts at intervention with civil and ecclesiastic authorities, the campaign of coercion against Port-Royal stiffened.  In April 1661 the throne closed the convent school and novitiate; the convent’s chaplain and confessors were exiled.  In June 1661 the nuns reluctantly signed the controversial statement concerning Jansen but they declared that they only offered a reserved assent, to be interpreted according to the droit/fait distinction.  At the urging of Louis XIV, the Vatican quickly annulled the reserved signature and demanded unconditional submission to all the church’s judgments in the controversy.

In the midst of the crisis Mère Angélique Arnauld died on August 6, 1661.

2. Works

From a philosophical perspective, two works written by Mère Angélique Arnauld merit particular attention.  They are her correspondence and a series of conferences she gave at Port-Royal.

Published in 1742-44 as the three-volume Letters of Reverend Mère Angélique Arnauld, Abbess and Reformer of Port-Royal [L], the massive correspondence of Mère Angélique includes more than thirteen hundred letters and more than one hundred correspondents.  Her letters to her scholarly brothers, Antoine Arnauld and Robert Arnauld d’Andilly, clearly express her philosophical Augustinianism.  She repeatedly declares herself a “disciple of Saint Augustine” and defends neo-Augustinian positions on the nature of virtue, the critique of casuistry, and the relationship between grace and freedom.  Her letters to her nephew Antoine Le Maître and her niece Angélique Arnauld d’Andilly present the abbess’s theories of the rights of the conscience and the limits of civil and ecclesiastical authority.  Numerous letters study the exercise of authority by women.  In her correspondence with fellow women superiors, Mère Angélique emphasizes the right of superiors to act as the convent’s principal spiritual director, including the right to appoint the convent’s chaplain and confessors and to instruct the nuns in theological matters germane to convent life.  Her extensive correspondence with Marie-Louise de Gonzague, queen of Poland, analyzes the virtues necessary for Christian women to govern others in the civic sphere and to endure reversals of fortune.

The correspondence also indicates Mère Angélique’s philosophical and theological culture.  Outside of the Bible, Saint Augustine is the author most cited in the letters; his Confessions are the work most frequently quoted.  The abbess often cites neo-Augustinian authors in the Jansenist circle: Saint-Cyran, Blaise Pascal, Antoine Arnauld, Pierre Nicole, Claude Lancelot, Antoine Singlin, and Antoine Le Maître.   Saint Teresa of Avila, whose works were translated into French by Robert Arnauld d’Andilly, is the most influential of the women authors cited by Mère Angélique, especially in her considerations on the exercise of authority by women.

Published in 1757, Speeches or Conferences of Reverend Mother Marie-Angélique Arnauld, Abbess and Reformer of Port-Royal [C] are transcriptions of the informal talks given by the abbess to the nuns at Port-Royal during the 1650s.  In these conferences the abbess often addresses moral issues pertinent to convent life.  She argues that it is intention rather than the quality of an act that determines the act’s moral worth.  Her severe judgments on minor ethical lapses by nuns and laity reflect the influence of Saint-Cyran’s moral rigorism.

Other major works by Mère Angélique include her autobiographical Report Written by Mère Angélique Arnauld, in which the abbess defends her policy of conventual reform, and her Commentary on the Rule of Saint Benedict, especially her discussion of the monastic virtue of humility.

3. Philosophical Themes

Angélique Arnauld develops philosophical arguments in three major areas: philosophy of God, especially the question of divine attributes; moral philosophy, in particular theory of the virtues; and gender theory, especially as it relates to the education and spiritual rights of women.  Arnauld’s philosophical reflection is subordinated to her larger theological project of Augustinian theology and reflects the distinctive culture of a convent devoted to the Jansenist cause.

a. Apophatic Theology

In her presentation of the divine attributes, Mère Angélique focuses on God’s incomprehensibility.  This apophatic theology stresses that what the human agent cannot grasp about the divine essence far surpasses what the human agent claims to know through positive images and concepts.

This incapacity to penetrate God’s essence stems from the stark alterity between divine and human natures.  “Everything God does is above human ability.  It is incomprehensible to our minds.  If we exist before God as if we were the smallest ants, is it so strange that we can neither know him nor grasp his intentions…. Between human beings and God there is no proportion.  They must acknowledge that God is a being infinitely superior to them.  As a result, it is impossible for them to know his ways” [C, 254].  Analogical affirmations of God’s attributes collapse in such an account of divine/human otherness.  The sinful nature of postlapsarian humanity deepens the chasm between humanity and God.  Only divine self-revelation can disclose a glimmer of God’s authentic nature to a human reason enticed by idols of its own imagination.

Arnauld’s apophatic theology underscores a particular dimension of divine incomprehensibility: inscrutability.  Although the Christian affirms the operation of divine providence in the ordering of the world, the accurate interpretation of God’s intention behind a particular historical act eludes human power.  “The judgments and ways of God are admirable.  Often God seems to want to destroy when he wants to edify.  What appears to be the result of his wrath and justice is actually the result of his mercy.  Blessed are the souls who perceive in every event only God’s holy will in order to submit to it” [L; to the Abbess of Gif; 23 December 1651].  Arnauld’s appeal to God’s inscrutability also expresses the voluntarist cast of her philosophy of God and of human nature.  It is divine sovereignty and self-abandonment to the divine will that are central in the convenant between God and the believer.

b. Virtue Theory

In her correspondence and conferences, Mère Angélique not only exhorts her public to the practice of virtue; she repeatedly defines the virtues in the context of monastic life.  Furthermore, she defends an Augustinian account of the moral virtues.  Authentic moral virtue can only spring from the operation of the theological virtues of faith, hope, and charity.  The theological virtues themselves are the gift of divine grace, not the creation of human endeavor.  Apparently natural virtues, such as the cardinal virtue of courage, are only the masks of pride.

Arnauld’s discussion of the virtues privileges those moral habits typical of conventual life.  Rooted in the monastic vow of poverty, the virtue of poverty not only renounces personal possessions and cultivates sympathy for the materially poor; it refuses all aesthetic pleasures, even those found in liturgical arts and ceremonies.  Contempt for the world inevitably provokes persecution by the world.  “Many graces of God are required in order to disdain the world and tolerate its disdain for us….It is impossible for us to hate the world without the world hating us and considering us fools” [L; To Mademoiselle de Luzanci; September 7, 1650].  The centerpiece of monastic virtue, piety demands complete oblation of oneself.  Authentic piety requires total abolition of human personal desire as one obeys the divine will.  “God has given everything to humanity so it will give everything to him.  By this sacrifice it obtains from God’s goodness the grace to possess him and to reign with him forever” [L; to Marie-Louise de Gonzague, queen of Poland; November 12, 1655].  The moral rigorism typical of the Jansenist movement marks this account of the nature of the prominent virtues in monastic life.  Militant opposition to the world accompanies every authentic expression of moral virtue.

The theocentric framework of Arnauld’s virtue theory also appears in her analysis of more secular virtues.  Patience is rooted in the recognition of our grave sinfulness before God.  Tolerating the imperfections of others prevents us from descending into moral complacency and the illusion of personal perfection.  “To avoid falling, we must humbly tolerate the faults of others and of ourselves.  We are born in sin and we will be totally liberated from it only at the moment of our death” [L; to Madame Allen; May 12, 1665].  Even the Socratic virtue of self-knowledge undergoes theological reconstruction.  The moral self-knowledge granted by divine grace surpasses any self-knowledge acquired by the natural means of reflection.  “If you had spent an entire year making an examination of conscience with the most meticulous care, it would have been inferior to the moment when God touched your heart.  You could not have been as well prepared and you could not have known your faults as well as you do right now without any personal examination of conscience.  It is grace alone that can grant us such knowledge” [L; to Anne de Rohan, Princess de Guéménée; November 15, 1629].  Authentic self-knowledge thus emerges as a product of divine illumination.

Arnauld’s analysis of the moral virtues affirms a traditional tenet of Augustinian virtue theory: that the allegedly natural virtues praised by pagan philosophers are in fact disguised vices and that authentic moral virtue is rooted in the theological virtues grafted into the human will by divine grace.   Following the Augustinian perspective, Mère Angélique dismisses the neoclassical virtues of magnanimity and courage as masks of self-satisfaction.  “There is nothing more pleasant for a generous person than the act of giving.  People so possess courage according to the world’s standard fear nothing so much as asking for something.  It is characteristic of the rich to give and the poor to receive” [C, 71].  It is selfless intention, rather than external act, that is the criterion for the existence of authentic virtue.  Only the presence of the divinely infused virtues of faith, hope, and charity can provide the proper theocentric motivation for the exercise of the moral virtues.  Arnauld’s analysis of these theological virtues expresses her typical rigorism.  Faith plunges the moral agent into combat against the world, the flesh, and the devil.  Authentic hope turns the believer against the sinful hope of domination that poisons the courtier.  Charity demands the annihilation of the self.  “Charity is nothing other than the love of God and the love of God is an ardent desire that God reign in everything and that all creatures annihilate themselves and recognize his supreme grandeur and infinite majesty” [C, 77].

Reflecting the Jansenist combat with the French throne and episcopate, Mère Angélique stresses the virtue of suffering for the truth.  Under persecution, this virtue of sacrificial witness to the truth has become the hallmark of the convent’s moral character.  “I am overwhelmed by the vision I have of the great and singular grace God has granted us to suffer for the truth, trying to serve the souls he has redeemed by his death” [L; to Antoine Arnauld; early 1644].  This suffering for the contested truths of salvation, however, must be animated by the theological virtue of charity.  Mère Angélique censures the sarcasm that has increasingly stained the polemical defenses of the convent by Jansenist sympathizers.  “I only desire that God may deign to fill you deeply, not only with the knowledge of the truth, but with a perfect love that you practice faithfully and that gives you a humble patience toward everything.  The current impassioned applause from so many people disturbs me” [C; to Antoine Arnauld; April 1644].  To be authentic, even the convent’s distinctive willingness to suffer persecution for the sake of doctrinal truth must remain rooted in the infused virtue of charity toward one’s opponents.

c. Theological Determinism

Angélique Arnauld’s heavy emphasis on divine grace as the cause of all virtuous action often appears close to a species of theological determinism.  So central is the initiative and sovereignty of God in all cosmic and moral activity that free will appears to disappear.  Human beings remain voluntaristic beings inasmuch as they can choose one course of action over another after deliberation, but the deliberative and elective activities appear destined by concupiscence to involve the selection of evil unless divine grace intervenes through an inscrutable decree of divine providence.

The abbess reinforces this theological determinism by her insistence on the Augustinian doctrine of predestination.  The salvation of sinners, illustrated through the conversion of the good thief by Jesus on the cross, is due entirely to divine initiative, not to the personal merit of the saved.  “God grants his grace to whomever he pleases.  This is seen in the prayer of the thief he touched and converted in the very act of sinning.  At first he blasphemed just like the other thief; nevertheless, one is taken and the other is left behind.  Jesus Christ gazes at the former with his great mercy and leaves the latter by an effect of justice that condemns him” [C, 108].  Moral conversion and the concomitant status of being saved are caused uniquely by divine election.

Reinforcing the Augustinian framework of predestination, Arnauld rejects the compromise solution of human cooperation with divine grace.  The abbess insists on the comprehensive nature of divine causation in the act of salvation.  “The creature could never cooperate with the grace of God.  It would lose infinitely more than it could keep for its use.  God’s grace always suffered some loss when it came to us….The creature’s incapacity stems from sin, which is infinitely opposed to this grace” [C, 365].  It is in her discussions of grace and salvation that the theological determinism of Mère Angélique becomes the most pronounced.

Arnauld’s emphasis on divine causation is not without paradox.  The abbess repeatedly exhorts her listeners and correspondents to act virtuously and to seek God’s favor, as if they exercised authentic free will and responsibility.  But these appeals to moral reform find scant justification in a metaphysics and a moral philosophy that make divine volition the unique cause of physical and ethical action.

d. Gender and Right

The convent is not simply the site for the elaboration of Mère Angélique’s Augustinian philosophy; her corpus defends the right of women, specifically of nuns, to exercise judgments of conscience on matters of theological dispute, even when this entails conflict with political and religious authorities.  It also defends the correlative rights of women to education, to theological culture, and to limited autonomy through the selection of superiors and of constitutional law.

In many writings, Arnauld analyzes how women should exercise their rightful authority in the religious and civic spheres.  Despite the rigorism of her moral views, Mère Angélique argues that flexibility is central in a religious superior’s exercise of authority.  Women superiors must tailor their judgments to the needs of the individual subject.  “Superiors must be extremely reserved in all their words.  They must  weigh all of them according to the golden measure of holy charity.  Whether they are exhorting, reproving, or consoling, they must proportion themselves to the capacity of each soul” [L; to the Anonciade superior in Boulogne; May 14, 1640].  Authentic conventual governance involves respect of each individual’s experience and of the superior’s personal judgment in a particular case.

Legalism constitutes a particular danger for this exercise of personalized spiritual governance.  Mère Angélique criticizes the tendency of overly detailed constitutions in religious orders to suffocate the right of women superiors to exercise substantial freedom in the governance of their subjects.  “In the area of penances, it seems to me that one should usually grant freedom to a superior to act according to her inclinations.  She must try to take into account the spirit of God and the different circumstances and not try to regulate all the nuns according to the same manner.  The letter kills and the spirit gives life” [L; to Monsieur Macquet; January 4, 1635].  These counsels on the proper exercise of authority religious superiors reinforce the principal provisions of the Angelican reform of the convent.  Nuns are to elect their own superiors and to draw up their constitutions and legislation in chapter.  Superiors are to act as the principal spiritual directors of their subjects with the authority to appoint chaplains and to direct schools and retreat programs for laywomen.

In her extensive correspondence with Marie-Louise de Gonzague, queen of Poland, Arnauld evokes the virtues central for the exercise of civil authority by women.  Like nuns, monarchs must practice the annihilation of self that unites the believer completely to God.  “God will treat you in his judgment just as you have treated him here.  He will honor those who have honored him as their sovereign lord, considering themselves nothing at all before his divine majesty” [L; to Marie-Louis de Gonzague, queen of Poland; January 20, 1655].  In particular, the queen must practice the love of enemies, a theological virtue that proves especially difficult in time of war.  “Your soul should often ponder these words of Our Lord Jesus Christ when he was nailed to the cross in the last extremity and by the most horrible malice and cruelty that could be imagined: ‘Father, forgive them; they did not know what they do.’  It was not only those who crucified the Son of God who did not know that he was the king of glory; it is those who make war on you” [L; to Marie-Louise de Gonzague de Poland; November 5, 1655].

As the persecution of Port-Royal intensified, Mère Angélique insisted on the right and duty of women to follow an informed conscience on the theological disputes of the moment.  Appeals to obedience cannot force a nun to assent to a judgment by a political or ecclesiastical authority she believes to be erroneous.  Citing the precedent of Teresa of Avila, Arnauld urges Queen Anne of Austria, the French queen-mother, to intervene on behalf of the Port-Royal nuns against the errors of the church on the question of Jansenism.  “I believe that God will use the wisdom of Your Majesty and the wisdom of the king, as he used Phillip II, the ancestor of Your Majesty, in the past, to save Saint Teresa from the greatest persecution she had ever known.  We see in her writings that even the pope had been wrongly informed about her and the nuns of her order and that his nuncio had been prejudiced against her, thus pushing this conflict, in her own words, to the last step of violence” [L; to Anne of Austria, queen-mother of France; May 25, 1661].  Against the fallible, prudential judgments of both church and state on matters of fact, both nuns and laywomen enjoyed the right to challenge judgments that appeared to wound truth and charity.

4. Interpretation and Relevance

Several factors have impeded a properly philosophical appreciation of the works of Angélique Arnauld.  First, apologists for Jansenism have long argued that Mère Angélique was simply ignorant of the theological controversies erupting during the crisis of the signature.  Gazier’s defense of the Port-Royal nuns (1929) is typical of such apologetic.  Furthermore, Mère Angélique’s spirituality has often been described as practical, more interested in moral than speculative issues.  Undoubtedly, Mère Angélique never read Jansen’s Augustinus.  But she had certainly read Jansen’s Reformation of the Interior Man, translated by her brother Robert Arnauld d’Andilly from the Latin original, and she had studied Saint-Cyran’s Popular Theology, a summary of Jansenist doctrine that served as the convent school’s major catechetical reference.  The misleading portrait of Mère Angélique as a theological innocent baffled by the intricacies of the ecclesiastical quarrel over grace has long closed her canon to philosophical commentary.

Second, the thought of Mère Angélique has often been simply assimilated to the Augustinianism of the male leaders of the Jansenist movement.  While the abbess was clearly influenced by the constellation of Augustinian thinkers who surrounded her, especially her brother Antoine Arnauld and her mentor Saint-Cyran, she maintains her own distinctive voice in this school of radical Augustinianism.  Her analysis of monastic virtue in a conventual context and her defense of the spiritual rights of women against political and ecclesiastical coercion reflect her own theoretical and gendered priorities.

Finally, the philosophy of Mère Angélique has been obscured by its forbidding theological architecture.  The abbess expresses her theories in monastic genres foreign to the philosophical treatise: letters of spiritual direction, abbatial conferences, and commentaries on patristic texts.  The substantive issues which preoccupied her appear similarly foreign to contemporary philosophy.  Her philosophy of divine attributes, moral virtue, and personal rights are embedded in quarrels over grace and monastic reform that can appear arcane.  Philosophical analysis of her works requires a grasp of the early modern theological controversies which provided the occasion for the abbess’s philosophical speculation.

The current revival of interest in the philosophy of Angélique Arnauld is fueled in large part by the feminist effort to expand the cannon of the humanities in the early modern period.  Mère Angélique’s defense of the rights of women to exercise religious and political authority has emerged as a central interest in contemporary commentary on her own writings.  Kostroun’s study of Port-Royal (2003) focuses on the gendered subversion of authority justified by Mère Angélique and her associates.

5. References and Further Reading

All French to English translations above are by the author of this article.

a. Primary Sources

  • Arnauld, Mère Angélique. Entretiens ou conférences de la Révérende Mère Marie-AngéliqueArnauld, abbesse et réformatrice de Port-Royal (Brussels: A. Boudet, 1757).
    • [Transcribed largely by her niece Soeur Angélique de Saint-Jean Arnauld d’Andilly, this series of conferences delivered in the 1650s at Port-Royal expresses the moral rigorism of the abbess.]
  • Arnauld, Mère Angélique. Lettres de la Révérende Mère Marie-Angélique Arnauld, abbesse et réformatrice de Port-Royal, 3 vols. (Utrechet: Aux dépens de la Compagnie, 1742-44).
    • [The facsimile edition of this collection of Mère Angélique’s letters produced by Phénix Éditions in 2003 contains an excellent introduction by Jean Lesaulnier, who identifies the various networks of correspondents with the abbess.]
  • Arnauld, Mère Angélique. Rélation écrite par la Mère Angélique Arnauld, ed. Louis Cognet (Paris: Grasset, 1949).
    • [This autobiographical text is an apologetic for the Angelican reform of Port-Royal and a description of the burgeoning persecution of the convent and the Jansenist movement.]

b. Secondary Sources

  • Bugnion-Secrétan, Perle. La Mère Angélique Arnauld, 1591-1661, après ses écrits (Paris: Cerf, 1991).
    • [This biography of the abbess focuses on her writings, with particular attention to their polemical context.]
  • Chédeozeau, Bernard. “Idéal intellectuel et vie monastique à Port-Royal,” Chroniques de Port-Royal 37 (1997), 57-74.
    • [This article examines the intellectual culture developed at Port-Royal under the Angelican reform and compares it favorably to the anti-intellectual piety dominating most of the convents of the period.]
  • Conley, John J. Adoration and Annihilation: The Convent Philosophy of Notre Dame (Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press, 2009), 43-112.
    • [This chapter analyzes and critiques the neo-Augustinian philosophy developed by the abbess in her letters and conferences.]
  • Gastellier, Fabian, Angélique Arnauld (Paris: Fayard, 1998).
    • [This biography studies the politics of the abbess’s civil and ecclesiastical context.]
  • Gazier, Cécile. Histoire du monastére de Port-Royal (Paris: Perrin, 1929).
    • [This pro-Janenist apologetic history depicts a theologically uncultured Mère Angélique, baffled by the arcane doctrinal disputes by which the enemies of Port-Royal attempted to destroy the convent through charges of heresy.]
  • Kostroun, Daniella. “A Formula for Disobedience: Jansenism, Gender, and the Feminist Paradox,” Journal of Modern History 75 (2003), 483-522.
    • [This article analyzes the subversive nature of the gendered arguments employed by Mère Angélique and her associates against royal and episcopal demands to submission on matters of conscience.]
  • Rowan, Mary. “Angélique Arnauld’s Web of Feminine Friendships: Letters to Jeanne de Chantal and the Queen of Poland,” in Les femmes au grand siècle; le Baroque; Musique et littérature; Music et liturgie, ed. David Wetsel et al. (Tübingen: Narr, 2003), 53-59.
    • [This study of the abbess’s correspondence focuses on her relationship with two prominent women who exercised authority in the religious and civic spheres respectively.]

Author Information

John J. Conley
Loyola University in Maryland
U. S. A.

Social and Political Recognition

Acts of recognition infuse many aspects of our lives such as receiving a round of applause from a rapt audience, being spotted in a crowded street by a long-forgotten friend, having an application for a job rejected because of your criminal record, enjoying some words of praise by a respected philosophy professor, getting pulled over by the police because you are a black man driving an expensive car, and fighting to have your same-sex marriage officially sanctioned in order to enjoy the same benefits as hetero-sexual marriages. Evidently the various ways we are recognised (and recognise others) play an important role in shaping our quality of life. Recognition theorists go further than this, arguing that recognition can help form, or even determine, our sense of who we are and the value accorded to us as individuals.

Political theories of recognition, which attempt to reconfigure the concept of justice in terms of due or withheld recognition, can be contrasted with (but set alongside) the rise of multiculturalism, which has produced an array of literature focused on recognising, accommodating and respecting difference. Although these two trajectories overlap, there are important differences between them. Multicultural politics is rooted in the identity politics underlying various social movements that gained prominence during the 1960s, such as the civil rights movement and radical/cultural feminism. These movements tend to emphasise the distinctness and value of their cultural identity and demand group-specific rights to protect this uniqueness. Without depreciating identity politics and multiculturalism, this article is primarily concerned with political theories of recognition, particularly those formulated by Charles Taylor (who is also a prominent figure in multicultural politics), Nancy Fraser and Axel Honneth. These focus on the role played by recognition in individual identity formation and the normative foundation this can provide to theories of justice.

Despite its brief history as an explicitly political concept, philosophical interest in the idea of recognition can be traced to the work of Hegel, who first coined the phrase ‘struggle for recognition’ (kampf um anerkennung). This article begins by clarifying the specific political and philosophical meaning of recognition. It will provides an overview of Hegel’s remarks on recognition before proceeding to identify the contemporary advocates of recognition. It presents the main similarities and differences between these authors before examining some important criticisms levelled at concept of recognition. The conclusion is a reflection upon the increasing influence of recognition and how it may develop in the future.

Table of Contents

  1. Defining Recognition
  2. The Hegelian Legacy
  3. Contemporary Theories of Recognition
    1. Charles Taylor
    2. Axel Honneth
    3. Nancy Fraser
  4. Redistribution or Recognition? The Fraser-Honneth Debate
  5. Criticisms of Recognition
    1. The Reification of Identity
    2. The Accusation of Essentialism
    3. The Danger of Subjectivism
    4. The Problem of the Other
    5. The Post-Structural Challenge
  6. The Future of Recognition
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Defining Recognition

The term ‘recognition’ has several distinct meanings: (1) an act of intellectual apprehension, such as when we ‘recognise’ we have made a mistake or we ‘recognise’ the influence of religion on American politics; (2) a form of identification, such as when we ‘recognise’ a friend in the street; and (3) the act of acknowledging or respecting another being, such as when we ‘recognise’ someone’s status, achievements or rights (upon the different meanings of recognition, see Inwood, 1992: 245-47; Margalit, 2001: 128-129). The philosophical and political notion of recognition predominantly refers to (3), and is often taken to mean that not only is recognition an important means of valuing or respecting another person, it is also fundamental to understanding ourselves.

Various attempts have been made to clarify precisely what is, and is not, to count as an act of recognition (perhaps most comprehensively by Ikäheimo and Laitinen, 2007). Ikäheimo (2002: 450) defines recognition as ‘always a case of A taking B as C in the dimension of D, and B taking A as a relevant judge’. Here A and B indicate two individual persons, specifically A is the recogniser and B the recognisee. C designates the attribute recognised in A, and D is the dimension of B’s personhood at stake. For example, I may recognise you as a person possessing certain rights and responsibilities in light of your being an autonomous, rational human being (for more on defining the structure of recognition, see Laitinen, 2002). A key feature of Ikäheimo’s definition is that it requires not only that someone be recognised by another, but that the person being recognised judges that the recogniser is capable of conferring recognition. This means that we must place sufficient value in the recogniser in order for their attitude towards us to count as recognitive. Brandom (2009) approaches this idea through the idea of authority, arguing that a genuine instance of recognition requires that we authorise someone to confer recognition. Similarly, one can gain authority and responsibility by petitioning others for recognition. Consequently, one has authority only insofar as one is recognised as authoritative.

We may not consider being valued by a wilful criminal as any sort of recognition in the sense being defined here. We do not judge them capable of conferring value on us, as we do not accord any value or respect to them. Similarly, someone who is coerced into recognising us may also fail to count as a relevant judge. A king who demands recognition of his superiority from all his subjects, simply in virtue of his being king, and threatens to punish them if they disobey, does not receive any meaningful kind of recognition for the subjects do not genuinely choose to confer value on him. Thus, in recognising another, we must also be recognised as a subject capable of giving recognition. This indicates that reciprocity or mutuality is likely to be a necessary condition of appropriate recognition (for a discussion of this point, see Laden, 2007).

A further issue in defining recognition is whether it is generative or responsive (Laitinen, 2002; Markell, 2007). A generation-model of recognition focuses on the ways in which recognition produces or generates reasons for actions or self-understandings. This is to say that someone ought to act in a certain way in virtue of being recognised as, for example, recognising someone as a rational being will generate certain duties and responsibilities for both the person being recognised and those who interact with him. A response-model of recognition focuses on the ways in which recognition acknowledges pre-existing features of a person. Here, to recognise someone is to acknowledge them as they already really are (Appiah, 1994: 149). This means that there are reasons why one ought to give recognition to someone prior to the act of recognition itself. Thus, for example, we ought to recognise someone’s ability to self-determination because they possess certain features, such as rational autonomy. The demand for recognition in a response-model is produced and justified through pre-existing characteristics of a person, whilst in the generation-model it is the act of recognition itself which confers those characteristics onto a person through their being recognised as such. The former is a case of person ‘knowing’, whilst the latter is a case of person ‘making’ (see Markell, 2002).

A third issue is whether groups or collectives can count as recognisers and recognisees. For example, when speaking of recognising a particular cultural group, do we mean we recognise that group qua a group, or as a collection of individuals? Similarly, does the granting of certain rights or respect apply to the group itself or the individual members belonging to that group? (For a detailed discussion and defence of group-differentiated minority rights, see Kymlicka, 1995). These questions revolve, at least in part, around the ontological status afforded to groups or collectives. Advocates of a politics of recognition are not always clear regarding whether or not groups can be granted recognition. Debates over the legitimacy or sovereignty of a state may depend upon the extent to which we recognise it as legitimate or sovereign. Important discussions of groups as entities include Tuomela (2007), Jones (2009) and List and Pettit (2011). However, as yet there has been little analysis of the connection between recognition and the ontology of groups. Charles Taylor (1994) argues for the importance of collective rights, but gives little consideration to whether collectives are genuine subjects over-and-above the individuals that constitute them. In his more recent work, Axel Honneth (Fraser and Honneth 2003: 159ff.) appears to give consideration to the possibility of groups as the object of recognition, but his general emphasis is on individual rights and recognition.

Common to all social and political notions of recognition is the shift from an atomistic to an intersubjective, dialogical understanding of the individual. Because our identity is shaped precisely through our relations to others, our being recognised by them, feelings of self-worth, self-respect and self-esteem are possible only if we are positively recognised for who we are. To this extent, theories of political recognition, which were first formulated in the 1990s, developed out of political movements centred upon such concepts as gender, sexuality, race, ethnicity and culture. Recognition, according to Taylor (1994), is an indispensible means of understanding and justifying the demands of these identity movements, which have had a major impact on society, particularly from the 1960s onwards. Consequently, for many political theorists, recognition is an integral component of any satisfactory modern theory of justice as well as the means by which both historical and contemporary political struggles can be understood and justified. In order to understand how such theories developed, it is necessary to examine their genesis within Hegel’s philosophy.

2. The Hegelian Legacy

Descartes’ dualistic philosophy of consciousness created an influential legacy in which the mind was characterised as a private theatre and knowledge of the self was achieved through introspection. This atomistic conception of self, encapsulated in Descartes’ cogito, filtered into the transcendental idealism of Kant (despite his objections to Descartes’ philosophy) and the transcendental phenomenology of Husserl, as well as being present in the contract theories of Hobbes and Locke. Against this trend there emerged a strongly intersubjective conception of selfhood that found expression through the concept of recognition, the founder of which is typically identified as Hegel. Although Hegel has undoubtedly influenced the contemporary understanding of recognition more than any other philosopher, Hegel was himself inspired by the work of Johann Fichte (see Williams, 1992). In his Foundations of Natural Right (1796/7), Fichte argues that the ‘I’ (the ego or pure consciousness) must posit itself as an individual to be able to understand itself as a free self. In order for such self-positing to occur, the individual must recognise itself as ‘summoned’ by another individual. This is to say, the individual must acknowledge the claims of other free individuals in order to understand itself as a being capable of action and possessing freedom. Hence, one’s freedom is both rendered possible and yet limited by the demands made on us by others. A key feature of this idea is that the same applies in reverse – the other can only comprehend itself as free by being recognised as such. Hence, mutual recognition is necessary for human beings to understand themselves as free individuals (as beings capable of ‘I-hood’). Through this analysis, Fichte produced a thoroughly intersubjective ontology of humans and demonstrated that freedom and self-understanding are dependent upon mutual recognition.

These ideas were developed in greater detail by Hegel. In his Phenomenology of Spirit Hegel (1807: 229) writes, ‘Self-consciousness exists in itself and for itself, in that, and by the fact that it exists for another self-consciousness; that is to say, it is only by being acknowledged or “recognized”’. Self-knowledge, including one’s sense of freedom and sense of self, is never a matter of simple introspection. Rather, understanding ourselves as an independent self-consciousness requires the recognition of another. One must recognise oneself as mediated through the other. As Sartre, who was heavily influenced by Hegel, wrote, ‘The road of interiority passes through the Other’ (Sartre, 1943: 236-7). The idea of recognition is developed further in Hegel’s mature works, particularly Elements of the Philosophy of Right (1821), where it becomes an essential factor in the development of ethical life (sittlichkeit). According to Hegel, it is through the intersubjective recognition of our freedom that right is actualised. Rights are not instrumental to freedom; rather they are the concrete expression of it. Without recognition we could not come to realise freedom, which in turn gives rise to right. The work of Hegel consciously echoes the Aristotelian conception of humans as essentially social beings. For Hegel, recognition is the mechanism by which our existence as social beings is generated. Therefore, our successful integration as ethical and political subjects within a particular community is dependent upon receiving (and conferring) appropriate forms of recognition.

The part of Hegel’s work to lay bare certain fundamental dynamics involved in recognition is the oft-discussed master-slave dialectic which appears in the Phenomenology (see Pinkard, 1996: 46ff; Stern, 2002: 83ff.). Hegel introduces the idea of a ‘struggle for recognition’, describing an encounter between two self-consciousnesses which both seek to affirm the certainty of their being for themselves (Hegel, 1807: 232ff.). Such a conflict is described as a life-and-death struggle, insofar as each consciousness desires to confirm its self-existence and independence through a negation or objectification of the other. That is, it seeks to incorporate the other within its field of consciousness as an object of negation, as something which this consciousness is not, thus affirming its own unfettered existence. Of course, the other also tries to negate this consciousness, thus generating the struggle which results in affirmation of one self-consciousness at the cost of the negation or annihilation of the other. Only in this way, Hegel observes, only by risking life, can freedom be obtained. However, there is a key moment with this struggle. Namely, consciousness realises that it cannot simply destroy the other through incorporating it within itself, for it requires the other as a definite other in order to gain recognition. Thus, it must resist collapsing the other into itself, for to do so would also be to annihilate itself. It would be starving itself of the recognition it requires in order to be a determinate self-consciousness.

Within Hegel’s radical reworking of how the individual subject is understood, autonomy becomes a contingent, social and practical accomplishment; it is an intersubjectively-mediated achievement which is never simply given or guaranteed but always dependent upon our relations with others. This co-dependency results in mutual relations of recognition which are the condition for understanding oneself as a genuinely free being, albeit a free being which acknowledges, and thus adjusts itself, to the freedom of others. Discussing the process of recognition, Hegel (1807: 230) notes that it ‘is absolutely the double process of both self-consciousnesses… Action from one side only would be useless, because what is to happen can only be brought about by means of both’. As a result, these two self-consciousnesses ‘recognize themselves as mutually recognizing one another’ (ibid: 231). Hegel characterises this mutuality, which cannot be coerced but be freely given and received, as being at home in the other. Such a relation with another is the condition for the phenomenological experience of freedom and right. Consequently, our interactions with others are not a limitation on freedom, but rather the ‘enhancement and concrete actualization of freedom’ (Williams, 1997: 59).

We see now how the master-slave dialectic of recognition is inherently unstable and unsatisfying. The master has dominion over the slave, reducing the latter to the status of a mere ‘thing’ through refusing to recognise it as a free and equal self-consciousness. The slave, realising that life as a slave is better than no life at all, accepts this relation of dominance and subservience. Whilst the slave receives no recognition from the master, the master has ‘earned’ the recognition of a slave which it considers as less-than-human. Such recognition is not ‘real’ recognition at all and yet, within this Hegel’s dialectic of recognition, the master requires the recognition of the slave in order to gain some modicum of self-understanding and freedom. The recognition of the slave is ultimately worthless, for it is not the recognition of a free self-consciousness, which alone can grant the recognition on another required for self-certainty of existence and freedom. Trapped in this fruitless relation, the slave becomes the ‘truth’ of the master, and so the master, paradoxically, becomes enslaved to the slave. For Hegel, relations of domination provide a vicious spiral of recognition. They lead nowhere but to their own destruction. Hence recognition must always take place between equals, mediated through social institutions which can guarantee that equality and thus produce the necessary mutual relations of recognition necessary for the attainment of freedom. It is precisely this last point that recent recognition theorists have seized upon and elaborated into comprehensive discussions of justice.

3. Contemporary Theories of Recognition

a. Charles Taylor

Much contemporary interest in recognition was undoubtedly fuelled by Charles Taylor’s essay ‘Multiculturalism and the Politics of Recognition’ (1994), first published in 1992. Taylor’s lucid and concise article is often treated as the classic expression of a theory of recognition. However, it would be more accurate to say that Taylor awoke a general interest in the idea of recognition. His short essay provides a series of reflections and conjectures which, whilst insightful, do not constitute a full-blown theory of recognition. However, its exploratory nature and non-technical language has helped install it as the common reference point for discussions of recognition.

Taylor begins with the assertion that ‘a number of strands in contemporary politics turn on the need, sometimes the demand, for recognition’ (Taylor, 1994: 25). He identifies such a demand as present in the political activities of feminism, race movements and multiculturalists (for a critical discussion of this point, see Nicholson, 1996). The specific importance of recognition lies in its relationship to identity, which he defines as ‘a person’s understanding of who they are, of their fundamental characteristics as a human being’ (Taylor, 1994: 25). Because identity is ‘partly shaped by recognition or its absence’, then ‘Nonrecognition or misrecognition can inflict harm, can be a form of oppression, imprisoning someone in a false, distorted, and reduced mode of being’ (ibid.). Underlying Taylor’s model is the Hegelian belief that individuals are formed intersubjectively (see Section II). Our individual identity is not constructed from within and generated by each of us alone. Rather, it is through dialogue with others that we negotiate our identity. Taylor refers to these others as ‘significant others’, meaning those people who have an important role in our lives (that is, family, friends, teachers, colleagues, and so forth.). The idea that our sense of who we are is determined through our interaction with others initiates a shift from a monologic to a dialogic model of the self.

Taylor is keen to stress just how important recognition is, referring to it as ‘a vital human need’ (ibid: 26) and stating that misrecognition ‘can inflict a grievous wound, saddling its victims with a crippling self-hatred’ (ibid: 26). Deploying a brief historical narrative, Taylor argues that the collapse of social hierarchies, which had provided the basis for bestowing honour on certain individuals (that is, those high up on the social ladder), led to the modern day notion of dignity, which rests upon universalist and egalitarian principles regarding the equal worth of all human beings. This notion of dignity lies at the core of contemporary democratic ideals, unlike the notion of honour which is, he claims, clearly incompatible with democratic culture. This picture is complicated by the fact that alongside this development of dignity there emerged also a new understanding of ‘individualised identity’, one in which the emphasis was on each person’s uniqueness, which Taylor defines as ‘being true to myself and my own particular way of being’ (ibid: 28). Taylor refers to this idea of uniqueness as the ideal of authenticity, writing ‘Being true to myself means being true to my own originality, which is something only I can articulate and discover. In articulating it, I am also defining myself’ (ibid: 31).

Taylor has been accused of adopting an essentialist view of the self, on the basis that there is some inner ‘me’ waiting to be uncovered and displayed to (recognised by) the world (see section V. b). However, he is quick to point out that the discovery of our authenticity is not simply a matter of introspection. Rather, it is through our interactions with others that we define who we are. Nor is there an end point to this dialogue. It continues throughout our entire lives and does not even depend upon the physical presence of a specific other for that person to influence us. Consider, for example, the way an imaginary conversation with a deceased partner might influence how we act or view ourselves. The importance of recognition lies precisely in the fact that how others see (might) us is a necessary step in forming an understanding of who we are. To be recognised negatively, or misrecognised, is to be thwarted in our desire for authenticity and self-esteem.

Taylor’s uses these insights to construct a politics of equal recognition. He identifies two different ways in which the idea of equal recognition has been understood. The first is a politics of equal dignity, or a politics of universalism, which aims at the equalisation of all rights and entitlements. In this instance, all individuals are to be treated as universally the same through recognition of their common citizenship or humanity. The second formulation is the politics of difference, in which the uniqueness of each individual or group is recognised. Rousseau bitterly noted that man, having shifted from a state of self-sufficiency and simplicity to one of competition and domination that characterises modern society, has come to crave the recognition of their difference (Rousseau, 1754). In this detrimental situation, man is rendered dependent upon the views of others, craving what Rousseau termed ‘amour propre’ through the admiration of those around him, leading to an endless competition for greater achievements and respect and thus robbing man of his independence. For Rousseau, this desire for individual distinction, achievement and recognition conflicts with a principle of equal respect

Returning to Taylor, he notes that there is also a universal basis to this second political model insofar as all people are entitled to have their identity recognised: ‘we give due acknowledgement only to what is universally present – everyone has an identity – through recognizing what is peculiar to each. The universal demand powers an acknowledgement of specificity’ (Taylor, 1994: 39). One consequence of this politics of difference is that certain rights will be assigned to specific groups but not others. The two approaches can be summed as follows. The politics of equal dignity is difference-blind, whereas the politics of difference is, as the name suggests, difference-friendly (this does not mean that a politics of equal dignity is not also ‘friendly’ towards difference, but rather that differences between individuals cannot be the normative foundation for the assignment of certain rights or entitlement to some individuals or groups but not others).

Taylor defends a politics of difference, arguing that the concept of equal dignity often (if not always) derives its idea of what rights and entitlement are worth having from the perspective of the hegemonic culture, thus enforcing minority groups to conform to the expectations of dominant culture and hence relinquish their particularity. Failure to conform will result in the minority culture being derided and ostracised by the dominant culture. As Taylor (ibid: 66) notes, ‘dominant groups tend to entrench their hegemony by inculcating an image of inferiority in the subjugated’. A clear instance of this can be seen in de Beauvoir’s claim that woman is always defined as man’s ‘other’ or ‘shadow’ (de Beauvoir, 1949). Woman exists as a lack; characterised through what she does not possess or exhibit (namely, male and masculine traits). Similarly, civil rights movements have frequently protested that the image of the ‘human’ was inevitably white, Western, educated, middle-class and wealthy. An example of how this plays out in everyday life is the recent, though now generally discarded, practice of labelling pink crayons ‘flesh’ coloured. Both feminist and race theorists have tried to convey the idea that the white male is simply another particular instance of humanity, rather than its ‘default’ image or constitutive, universal norm. This point was strongly made by Fanon (1952), who detailed how racism infiltrates the consciousness of the oppressed, preventing psychological health through the internalisation of subjection and otherness. This in turn alienates the black person from both their society and their own body, owing to the fact that the world is defined in terms of ‘whiteness’ and thus as something essentially irretrievably different (alien) to them.

b. Axel Honneth

Axel Honneth has produced arguably the most extensive discussion of recognition to date. He is in agreement with Taylor that recognition is essential to self-realisation. However, he draws more explicitly on Hegelian intersubjectivity in order to identify the mechanics of how this is achieved, as well as establishing the motivational and normative role recognition can play in understanding and justifying social movements. Following Hegel (1807; 1821) and Mead (1934), Honneth identifies three ‘spheres of interaction’ which are connected to the three ‘patterns of recognition’ necessary for an individual’s development of a positive relation-to-self.  These are love, rights, and solidarity (Honneth, 1995: 92ff; also Honneth 2007, 129-142).

The mode of recognition termed ‘love’ refers to our physical needs and emotions being met by others and takes the form of our primary relationships (that is, close friends, family and lovers). It provides a basic self-confidence, which can be shattered through physical abuse.  The mode of recognition termed ‘rights’ refers to the development of moral responsibility, developed through our moral relations with others. It is a mutual mode of recognition ‘in which the individual learns to see himself from the perspective of his [or her] partner in interaction as a bearer of equal rights’ (Honneth, 1992: 194). The denial of rights through social and legal exclusion can threaten one’s sense of being a fully active, equal and respected member of society. Finally, the mode of recognition termed ‘solidarity’ relates to recognition of our traits and abilities. It is essential for developing our self-esteem and for how we become ‘individualised’, for it is precisely our personal traits and abilities that define our personal difference (Honneth, 1995: 122). Consequently, unlike the relations of love and rights, which express universal features of human subjects, esteem ‘demands a social medium that must be able to express the characteristic differences between human subjects in a universal, and more specifically, intersubjectively obligatory way’ (ibid.). All three spheres of recognition are crucial to developing a positive attitude towards oneself:

For it is only due to the cumulative acquisition of basic self-confidence, of self-respect, and of self-esteem… that a person can come to see himself or herself, unconditionally, as both an autonomous and an individuated being and to identify with his or her goals and desires (ibid: 169).

According to Honneth, the denial of recognition provides the motivational and justificatory basis for social struggles. Specifically, it is through the emotional experiences generated by certain attitudes and actions of others towards us that we can come to feel we are being illegitimately denied social recognition. This argument makes use of Dewey’s theory of emotion as intentionally orientated. Certain emotional states, such as shame, anger and frustration, are generated by the failure of our actions. Conversely, more positive emotional states are generated through successful action. The experience of negative emotional states can, in theory, reveal to us that an injustice is taking place (namely, that we are not being given due and appropriate recognition). However, as Honneth points out, feelings of shame or anger need not (indeed, do not) necessarily disclose relations of disrespect (ibid: 138). What they provide is the potential for identifying the occurrence of an injustice which one is justified in opposing. The experience of disrespect is the raw material from which normatively justified social struggles can be formulated. Furthermore, it is only within certain social contexts, those in which the ‘means of articulation of a social movement are available’ (ibid: 139), that experiences of disrespect provide the motivational basis for political struggles (see Honneth, 2007). Presumably, disrespect in other contexts would lead to individual acts of retaliation or undirected violence, rather than coordinated resistance.

This phenomenological approach to recognition thus locates the source and justification of social struggles in the experiences and expectations of recognition. Of course, as noted, it requires the further steps of (a) locating these experiences within a socially-generated framework of emancipatory discourse; and (b) the establishment of common experiences amongst individuals for these individual frustrations to develop into social struggles. Therefore, it would be naïve to think that Honneth is blind to the importance of, say, ensuring the means and rights to collective political action within societies. But the fundamental component of any attempt to identify injustice and vindicate the necessary remedies must be located in the individual’s experiences of disrespect (Honneth, 2007) (for a potential problem with this position, see Rogers, 2009).

In order to justify these claims, Honneth ascribes an inherent expectation of recognition to humans, referring to demands generated from such an expectation as the ‘“quasi-transcendental interests” of the human race’ (Fraser and Honneth, 2003: 174). It is only through the failure of such expectations that recognition can be a motivational source, arising via negative emotional experiences. This assumption allows Honneth to assess societal change as a developmental process driven by moral claims arising from experiences of disrespect. Honneth (1995: 168) summarises his somewhat teleological account (a product of Honneth’s Hegelian and Aristotelian tendencies) as follows: ‘Every unique, historical struggle or conflict only reveals its position within the development of society once its role in the establishment of moral progress, in terms of recognition, has been grasped’.

The positing of an approximate and ideal end-state, presumably one in which full recognition reigns supreme, allows a distinction between progressive, emancipatory struggles and those which are reactionary and / or oppressive. Therefore, from this general position of enabling the self-realisation of one’s desires, characteristics and abilities, we can assess current socio-political struggles and analyse their future directions so as to ensure their promoting of the conditions for self-realisation. Honneth is careful to specify that he is not advocating a single, substantive set of universal values and social arrangements. Rather, his concept of ‘the good’ is concerned with the ‘structural elements of ethical life’ which enable personal integrity (ibid: 172). Therefore, the posited ‘end-point’ from which normative claims can be made must emanate from structural relations outlined in the three distinct patterns of recognition which foster a positive relation-to-self (for a discussion of Honneth’s conception of the good / ethical life, see Zurn, 2000). Here, Honneth is trying to retain a Kantian notion of respect and autonomy through identifying the necessary conditions for self-realisation and self-determination, akin to a Kantian kingdom of ends in which all individuals receive and confer recognition on one another. Simultaneously, in stressing the minimal or ‘bare’ conditions necessary for this, he aims to avoid committing himself to a singular, substantial conception of the good life and thus resists the dangers of reproducing an exclusivist and exclusionary conception of what constitutes the good life.

c. Nancy Fraser

Whereas there are broad areas of agreement between Honneth and Taylor, Nancy Fraser is keen to differentiate her theory of recognition from both of their respective positions. Fraser’s overarching theme throughout her works on recognition is the dissolving of the assumed antithesis between redistribution and recognition (arguably this assumption is a consequence of critical theory’s Marxist roots, within which framework Fraser’s work undoubtedly emerges from). Thus far, the presentation of recognition and redistribution has been presented (at least implicitly) as an either/or decision. Fraser believes that this binary opposition derives from the fact that, whereas recognition seems to promote differentiation, redistribution supposedly works to eliminate it. The recognition paradigm seems to target cultural injustice, which is rooted in the way people’s identities are positively or negatively valued. Individuals exist as members of a community based upon a shared horizon of meanings, norms and values. Conversely, the distribution paradigm targets economic injustice, which is rooted in one’s relation to the market or the means of production (Fraser and Honneth, 2003: 14). Here, individuals exist in a hierarchically-differentiated collective class system which, from the perspective of the majority class who are constituted by a lack of resources, needs abolishing.

According to Fraser, both these forms of injustice are primary and co-original, meaning that economic inequality cannot be reduced to cultural misrecognition, and vice-versa. Many social movements face this dilemma of having to balance the demand for (economic) equality with the insistence that their (cultural) specificity be met. Fraser (1997: 19) gives the example of the feminist movement by posing the question, ‘How can feminists fight simultaneously to abolish gender differentiation [through economic redistribution] and to valorize gender specificity [through cultural recognition]?’. There is a clear divergence here between the monistic models of Taylor and Honneth, in which recognition is the foundational category of social analysis and distribution is treated as derivative, and Fraser’s dualistic model. Whereas Honneth thinks a sufficiently elaborated concept of recognition can do all the work needed for a critical theory of justice, Fraser argues that recognition is but one dimension of justice, albeit a vitally important one.

The disagreement over whether or not distribution can be made to supervene on recognition arises from the differing interpretations of recognition. According to Fraser (Fraser and Honneth 2003: 29), one can understand recognition as either (a) a matter of justice, connected to with the concept of a universal ‘right’ (Fraser’s position); or (b) a matter of self-realisation, connected with historically-relative cultural conceptions of the ‘good’ (Honneth’s and Taylor’s position). In (b) Fraser draws out the Aristotelian idea of eudaimonia (flourishing), which runs throughout Honneth’s teleological account. Contra Honneth and Taylor, Fraser does not look to situate the injustice of misrecognition in the retardation of personal development. Rather, she identifies it with the fact that ‘some individuals and groups are denied the status of full partners in social interaction simply as a consequence of institutionalized patterns of cultural value in whose construction they have not equally participated and which disparage their distinctive characteristics or the distinctive characteristics assigned to them’ (ibid). Addressing injustices arising from misrecognition therefore means looking at the discursive representations of identities in order to identity how certain individuals are assigned a relatively inferior social standing. Hence, on Fraser’s model, misrecognition should not be construed as an impediment to ethical self-realization (as it is for Taylor and Honneth). Instead, it should be conceived as an institutionalised relation of subordination.

Owing to her identification of recognition with social status, the evaluative element in Fraser’s account is the notion of ‘parity of participation’. According to this principle, ‘justice requires that social arrangements permit all (adult) members of society to interact with one another as peer’ (ibid: 36). In effect, recognition is required in order to guarantee that all members of society have an equal participation in social life. Crucially, participatory parity also requires material / economic redistribution in order to guarantee that people are independent and ‘have a voice’ (ibid). Because Honneth equates recognition with self-realisation, the derivative issues of redistribution are only generated to the extent that they inhibit this personal development. For Fraser, injustice in the form of both misrecognition and maldistribution is detrimental to the extent that it inhibits participatory parity.

Fraser considers two possible remedies for injustice, which transcend the redistribution-recognition divide by being applicable to both. The first is ‘affirmation’, which incorporates any action which corrects ‘inequitable outcomes of social arrangements without disturbing the underlying framework that generates them’ (ibid: 23). The second is ‘transformation’, which refers to ‘remedies aimed at correcting inequitable outcomes precisely by restricting the underlying generative framework’ (ibid). Fraser’s concept of transformation highlights her belief that certain forms of injustice are ingrained within ‘institutionalized patterns of cultural value’ (ibid: 46). Certain forms of inequality, including those of race and gender, derive from the signifying effect of socio-cultural structures. These discursive frameworks, situated within language and social arrangements, reproduce hierarchical binary oppositions such as ‘heterosexual/homosexual’, ‘white/black’ and ‘man/woman’. Thus, the solution is not simply a matter of revaluing heterosexual, female or black identities. Rather, one must attempt to deconstruct the binary logic which situates people as inherently inferior, creating a ‘field of multiple, debinarized, fluid, ever-shifting differences’ (Fraser, 1997: 24). One key aspect of this transformative approach is that, unlike the affirmative approach which aims to alter only one particular group’s sense of worth or material situation, it would change everyone’s sense of self. The proposal made by Fraser, then, is the radical restructuring of society, achieved through transformative redistribution (that is, socialism) and recognition (cultural deconstruction). It should be noted that in her more recent work on recognition (that is, Fraser 2000; 2001), she resists offering any particular remedies, arguing instead that the required response to injustice will be dictated by the specific context. Thus, she appears to distance herself from the more ‘deconstructive’ elements of her earlier work (see Zurn, 2003).

4. Redistribution or Recognition? The Fraser-Honneth Debate

In a very important discussion, Fraser and Honneth (2003) defend their respective theories of recognition (see also Honneth, 2001). Underlying the disagreements between them is their respective positions regarding the distribution / recognition debate. As noted in Section III, Fraser believes that recognition and distribution are two irreducible elements of a satisfactory theory of justice. This is to say, they are of equal foundational importance – the one cannot be collapsed into the other. Honneth, on the other hand, contends that issues of distribution are ultimately explained and justified through issues of recognition. As he writes, ‘questions of distributive justice are better understood in terms of normative categories that come from a sufficiently differentiated theory of recognition’ (ibid: 126). He begins justifying this claim through a historical survey of political movements and unrest amongst the lower classes during the early stages of capitalism. What marked such activities was the commonly held belief that the honour and dignity of the members of the lower classes were not being adequately respected. Summarising these findings, Honneth (ibid: 132) proclaims that ‘subjects perceive institutional procedures as social injustice when they see aspects of their personality being disrespected which they believe they have a right to recognition’.

One important consequence of this view is that it undermines the received wisdom that collective identity movements are a recent ‘modern’ phenomenon. In actual fact, according to Honneth, experiences of disrespect and denigration of an individual’s or group’s identity are the constitutive feature of all instances of social discontent. Portraying ‘recognition’ as the sole preserve of cultural minorities struggling for social respect is therefore highly misleading and obscures the fact that challenges to the existing social order are always driven by the moral experience of failing to receive what is deemed to be sufficient recognition (ibid: 160). Any dispute regarding redistribution of wealth or resources is reducible to a claim over the social valorisation of specific group or individual traits. The feminist struggle over the gendered division of labour is, according to Honneth, primarily a struggle regarding the prevailing assessment of achievement and worth which has had important redistributive effects, such as a trend towards greater access to, and equality within, the workplace and the acknowledgement of ‘female’ housework. The division that Fraser makes between economic distribution and cultural recognition is, Honneth claims, an arbitrary and ultimately misleading one that ignores the fundamental role played by recognition in economic struggles, as well as implying that the cultural sphere of society can be understood as functioning independently of the economic sphere.

Fraser (ibid: 30ff.) offers four advantages of her status model over Honneth’s monistic vision of justice as due recognition (for a discussion of these, see Zurn, 2003). Arguably the most important of these is that, in locating injustice in social relations governed by cultural patterns of representations, she can move beyond both Taylor’s and Honneth’s reliance on psychology as the normative force underlying struggles for recognition. Recalling that Honneth locates the experiences of injustice in the emotional responses to frustrated expectations of due recognition, Fraser argues that she is able to ‘show that a society whose institutionalized norms impede parity of participation is morally indefensible whether or not they distort the subjectivity of the oppressed’ (ibid: 32). The ideal of participatory parity gives Fraser her normative component, for it provides the basis on which different recognition claims can be judged. Namely, a valid recognition claim is one in which subjects can show that ‘institutionalized patterns of cultural value deny them the necessary intersubjective conditions [for participatory parity]’ (ibid: 38). Honneth’s invocation of pre-political suffering, generated by the perceived withholding of recognition, as the motivating force behind social movements is thus rejected by Fraser as seriously problematic. In particular, she says, the idea that all social discontent has the same, single underlying motivation (misrecognition) is simply implausible. Honneth rejects other motivational factors such as ‘resentment of unearned privilege, abhorrence of cruelty, aversion of arbitrary power… antipathy to exploitation, dislike of supervision’ that cannot not simply be reduced down to, or subsumed by, an overarching expectation of appropriate recognition.

Another problem with Honneth’s psychological model of experiences of injustice is that, so Fraser argues, it shifts the focus away from society and onto the self, thus ‘implanting an excessively personalized sense of injury’ (ibid: 204). This can lead to the victim of oppression internalising the injustice or blaming themselves, rather than the discursive and material conditions within which they are situated as oppressed or harmed. Indeed, Fraser proceeds to point out that there can be no ‘pure’ experience of moral indignation caused by withheld or inappropriate recognition. There is no realm of personal experience that is not experienced through a particular linguistic and historical horizon, which actively shapes the experience in question (see section V. d). Thus to introduce a ‘primordial’ sense of moral suffering is, Fraser claims, simply incoherent (similar concerns are raised by McNay, 2008: 138ff.). Honneth cannot invoke psychological experiences of disrespect as the normative foundation for his theory of recognition as they cannot be treated as independent of the discursive conditions within which the subject is constituted. To do so is to rely on an ultimately unjustifiable transcendental account of the subject’s access to their sense of moral worth grounded in the right to recognition.

In his response to Fraser, Honneth points out that she can necessarily focus only on those social movements that have already become visible. By analysing the ways in which individuals and groups are socially-situated by institutionalised patterns of cultural value, Fraser limits herself to only those expressions of social discontent that have already entered the public sphere. The logic of this criticism seems to be that, if (in)justice is a matter of how society signifies subjects’ abilities and characteristics, then it can only address those collective subjectivities which are currently socially recognised. In other words, there could be a plethora of individuals and groups who are struggling for recognition which have not yet achieved public acknowledgement and thus have not been implicated within positive or negative social structures of signification. There appears some weight to this criticism, for a successful critical social theory should be able to not only critique the status quo, but identify future patterns of social resistance. If, on Fraser’s account, justice is a matter of addressing how subjects are socially-situated by existing value structures, then it seems to lack the conceptual apparatus to look beyond the present. The ability to identify social discontent must, Honneth argues, be constructed independently of social recognition, and therefore ‘requires precisely the kind of moral-psychological considerations Fraser seeks to avoid’ (ibid: 125). In ignoring the individual’s experiences of injustice as the disrespect of aspects of their personality, a social theory can only address the present situation, rather than exploring the normative directions of future social struggles. It is out of the frustration of individual expectations of due recognition that new social movements will emanate, rather than the pre-existing patterns of signification which currently hierarchically situate subjects.

5. Criticisms of Recognition

Despite its influence and popularity, there are a number of concerns regarding the concept of recognition as a foundational element in a theory of justice. This article cannot hope to present an exhaustive list, so instead offers a few of the most common critiques.

a. The Reification of Identity

Perhaps the one most frequently voiced criticism is that regarding the reification of group identity. Put simply, the concern is that, in initiating an identity politics in which one demands positive recognition for a group’s specific characteristics, specific characteristics can be seen as necessarily constitutive of this group and thus any group member who does not display these characteristics risks being ostracised. Such claims are often cloaked in a language of ‘authenticity’ which leads to demands for conformity amongst individual members of the group in order to gain acceptance and approval. This risks producing intergroup coercion and enforcing conformity at the expense of individual specificity.

To give an example, discussed by Appiah (1994) in his response to Taylor’s essay on recognition, the construction of a black politics in which black identity is celebrated can provide a sense of self-worth and dignity amongst historically denigrated black communities. However, it can also lead to a ‘proper’ way of being black, one which all members of the black community must demonstrate in order to partake in this positive self-image. Such expectations of behaviour can lead, Appiah notes (ibid: 163), to one form of tyranny being replaced by another. Specifically, individuals who fail to exemplify authentic ‘black’ identity can find themselves once again the victims of intolerance and social exclusion. Similar dynamics of exclusion can be seen in the debate within certain feminist circles about whether lesbians can be properly considered ‘women’. Extrapolating from these concerns, Markell (2003) argues that Taylor conflates individual identity with group identity with the result that agency is rendered a matter of adopting the identity one is assigned through membership of one’s community. Consequently, the critical tension between the individual and community is dissolved, which leaves little (if any) space for critiquing or resisting the dominant norms and values of one’s community (see also Habermas, 1991: 271).

The reification of group identity can also lead to separatism through generating an ‘us-and-them’ group mentality. By valorising a particular identity, those other identities which lack certain characteristics particular to the group in question can be dismissed as inferior. This isolationist policy runs counter to the ideal of social acceptability and respect for difference that a politics of recognition is meant to initiate. Reifying group identity prevents critical dialogue taking place either within or between groups. Internal group members who challenge apparently ‘authentic’ aspects of their culture or group identity can be labelled as traitors, whilst non-group members are dismissed as unqualified to comment on the characteristics of the group on the basis that they are ‘outsiders’. The result is a strong separatism and radical relativism in which intergroup dialogue is eliminated. This can mask over the ways in which various axes of identity overlap and thus ignores the commonalities between groups. For example, the focus of black feminists on ‘black culture’ and the oppression this has suffered can lead to a failure to recognise their commonality with women in other cultures. Conversely, the tendency among feminists to focus on the concept of ‘woman’ can lead them to ignore the potential alliances they might share with other oppressed groups that don’t focus on gender injustice. Underlying this critique is the idea that identity is always multilayered and that each individual is always positioned at the intersection of multiple axes of oppression. Simply reducing one’s sense of oppression to a single feature of identity (such as race or gender) fails to acknowledge the way that each feature of identity is inextricably bound up with other features, so that, for example, race and gender cannot be treated as analytically distinct modes of dominance.

b. The Accusation of Essentialism

Similar to the concerns over reification, there is a concern that recognition theories invoke an essentialist account of identity. This has particularly been the case with regards Taylor’s model of recognition (see McNay, 2008: 64ff). Critics accuse recognition theory of assuming that there is a kernel of selfhood that awaits recognition (see, for example, Heyes, 2003). The struggle for recognition thus becomes a struggle to be recognised as what one truly is. This implies that certain features of a person lie dormant, awaiting discovery by the individual who then presents this authentic self to the world and demands positive recognition for it. Although Taylor is keen to stress that his model is not committed to such an essentialist account of the self, certain remarks he makes do not help his cause. For example, in describing the modern view of how we create a sense of ‘full being’, he notes that, rather than connecting with some source outside of ourselves (such as God or the Platonic Good), ‘the source we have to connect with is deep within us. This fact is part of the massive subjective turn of modern culture, a new form of inwardness, in which we come to think our ourselves as beings with hidden depths’ (Taylor, 1994: 29). Taylor proceeds to note that ‘Being true to myself means being true to my own originality, which is something only I can articulate and discover’ (ibid: 31) and that authenticity ‘calls on me to discover my own original way of being. By definition, this way of being cannot be socially derived, but must be inwardly generated’ (ibid: 32).

A more radical account of intersubjectivity can be found in Arendt (1958). Examining the processes by which the subject reveals who they are, she shifts the focus away from a personal revelation on the part of the agent and into the social realm: ‘it is more than likely that the “who” , which appears so clearly and unmistakably to others, remains hidden from the person itself, like the daimōn in Greek religion which accompanies each man throughout his life, always looking over his shoulder from behind and thus visible only to those he encounters’ (Arendt, 1958: 179-80). One important consequence of this idea is that, in order to address the question of ‘who’ we are, we must be willing to relinquish control of any such answer. In so doing, we place ourselves into the hands of others. As Arendt writes, ‘This unpredictability of outcome [of personal disclosure] is closely related to the revelatory character of action and speech, in which one discloses one’s self without ever either knowing himself or being able to calculate beforehand whom he reveals’ (ibid: 192) (for an Arendt-inspired critique of recognition, see Markell, 2003).

c. The Danger of Subjectivism

Taylor mitigates his position and, arguably, eschews any form of essentialism, by arguing that we always work out our identity through dialogue with others. However, there is a possibility that he slips towards a subjectivist position, for it seems that it is the individual who ultimately decides what their ‘true’ identity is. For example, Taylor (1994: 32-3) states that this dialogue with others requires that we struggle with and sometimes struggle against the things that others want to see in us. However, he does not state to what we appeal to in this potential struggle with others. If it is ultimately our sense of who we are, then this would seem to undermine the very conditions of intersubjectivity that Taylor wants to introduce into the notion of personal identity. For, if one is the ultimate judge and jury on who one is, then those around us will simply be agreeing or disagreeing with our pre-existent or inwardly-generated sense of self, rather than playing an ineliminable role in its constitution.

Again, it is unlikely that Taylor would endorse any form of subjectivism. Indeed, his turn towards intersubjective recognition is precisely meant to resist the idea that one simply decides who one is and demands that others recognise oneself in such a way. Taylor would certainly seem critical of the existential tradition, which emphasised the need for one to define oneself and provide meaning to the world. Although Sartre deployed the language of intersubjectivity (see V. d) and highlighted the importance of the other, his analysis of the in-itself and the for-itself, coupled with describing how we are each born alone and must carry the weight of the world on our shoulders (with no-one able to lighten the burden), suggests an ego which negates (and hence is radically separated from) the world. This split between ‘I’ and ‘you’ renders any notion of dialogical identity construction impotent.

Recognition, contrasted with this existential picture, theories seem well equipped to resist any accusation that they slide into subjectivism. However, they must provide a criterion from which to judge whether individual and collective demands for recognition are legitimate. For example, it cannot be the case that all demands for recognition are accepted, for we are unlikely to want to recognise the claims of a racist or homophobic group for cultural protection. There is a danger that Taylor’s model does not explicitly state the conditions by which acceptable claims for recognition can be separated from unacceptable claims. His politics of difference is premised on ‘a universal respect for the human capacity to form one’s identity (Taylor, 1994: 42). Hence he seems committed to respecting difference qua difference, regardless of the particular form this difference takes. There is a sense that, as long as recourse is made to an ‘authentic’ life, then the demand for recognition should be met. But no matter how strongly the racist group insists upon their authenticity, we would be likely to resist recognising the value and worth of their identity as racists.

d. The Problem of the Other

Certain theorists have tended to cast recognition in a far more negative, conflictual light. Typically, they interpret Hegelian recognition as evolving an inescapable element of domination between, or appropriation of, subjects. Perhaps the most notable of such thinkers is Sartre (1943), whose account of intersubjectivity appears to preclude any possibility of recognition functioning as a means of attaining political solidarity or emancipation. According to Sartre, our relations with other people are always conflictual as each of us attempts to negate the other in an intersubjective dual. The realisation of our own subjectivity is dependent upon our turning the other into an object. In turn, we are made to feel like an object within the gaze of the other. Sartre’s famous example is the shameful, objectifying experience of suddenly feeling the ‘look’ or ‘gaze’ of another person upon us when carrying out a contemptible act. In this moment of shame, I feel myself as an object and am thus denied existence as a subject. My only hope is to make the other into an object. There are no equal or stable relations between people; all interactions are processes of domination.

Whereas Sartre focuses on the problem of being recognised, Levinas (1961) turns to the ethical issues attending how one recognises others. According to Levinas, Hegelian recognition involves an unavoidable appropriation or assimilation of the other into one’s own subjectivity. By this he means that in recognising the other we render them ‘knowable’ according to our own terms, thus depriving him or her of their irreducible ‘alterity’ or difference. Levinas believes that the denying of such difference is the fundamental ethical sin as it fails to respect the other in their absolute exteriority, their absolute difference to us. In effect, to recognise someone is to render them the same as us; to eliminate their inescapable, unapprehendable and absolute alterity (Yar, 2002).

An alternative perspective on the self-other relationship can be found in Merleau-Ponty who argues that the other is always instigated within oneself, and vice-versa, through the potential reversibility of the self-other dichotomy (that is, that the self is also a potential other; seeing someone necessarily involves the possibility of being seen). Merleau-Ponty explicitly rejects the Levinasian perspective that the other is an irreducible alterity. Rather, the self and other are intertwined through their bodily imbrications in the world. He describes our respective perspectives on the world as slipping into one another and thus being brought together: ‘In reality, the other is not shut up inside my perspective of the world, because this perspective itself has no definite limits, because it slips spontaneously into the other’s’ (Merleau-Ponty, 1945: 411). Consequently, there is no ‘problem’ of the other, for the other is already contained within our being, as we are within theirs. This resonates with Heidegger’s characterisation of Being (Dasein) as being-with-others. We are always already alongside others, bound up in relations of mutuality that prevent any strict ontological distinction between self, other and world.

The Levinasian and Sartrean accounts of the self-other relationship can be criticised from a hermeneutic perspective for failing to acknowledge the fact that understanding is essentially a conversation with another, and that a simple reduction of the other to a sameness with oneself, or a pure objectification of the other, would preclude the possibility of a genuine interaction from which mutual understanding could arise (Gadamer, 1960). Levinas presents a monological account of understanding, ignoring the fundamentally dialogical nature of intersubjectivity. As Taylor (1994: 67) approvingly noted, understanding according to Gadamer is always a fusion of horizons, a coming-to-understanding between two individuals who require the perspective of the other in order to make sense of their own (and vice-versa). Neither the total incorporation of the other into the perspective of the recognisee, nor the reduction of the other to pure object, is possible on a hermeneutic account of meaning and understanding.

e. The Post-Structural Challenge

Concurrent with the rise of identity politics, there has been a trend towards ‘deconstructive’ or ‘destabilising’ accounts of the individual subject. Rather than representing a single critical perspective on recognition and identity politics, the post-structural challenge can be understood as a broad term incorporating various attempts at showing how the subject is always constructed through and within networks of power and discourse (e.g. Foucault, 1980; Butler, 1990; Haraway 1991; Lloyd, 2005; McNay, 2008).

Perhaps the most notable theorist in this regard is Foucault, who develops a detailed account of the way in which the subject is constituted through discursive relations of power. Within Foucault’s theory, the individual becomes the ‘site’ where power is enacted (and, importantly, resisted or reworked). Foucault’s genealogical method was employed precisely in order to explore the conditions under which we, as subjects, exist and what causes us to exist in the way that we do. According to Foucault, not only are we controlled by truth and power, we are created by it too. Concerning his genealogical method, Foucault (1980: 117) writes, ‘One has to dispense with the constituent subject, to get rid of the subject itself, that’s to say, to arrive at an analysis which can account for the constitution of the subject within a historical framework’. This leads to a far more problematic view of the subject than is generally found within recognition theories. Specifically, issues of power, coercion and oppression are seen as coeval with identity formation and intersubjective relations.

This suggests that there can be no instances of mutual recognition that do not simultaneously transmit and reproduce relations of power. As Foucault (1988: 39) notes, ‘If I tell the truth about myself… it is in part that I am constituted as a subject across a number of power relations which are exerted over me and which I exert over others’. Critics of recognition theorists argue that they ignore the fundamental relationship between power and identity formation, assuming instead that intersubjective relations can be established which are not mediated through power relations. McNay (2008) develops this critique through a discussion of Bourdieu’s concept of habitus, arguing that Taylor assumes that language is an expressive medium that functions independently of, and antecedent to, power and thus fails to analyse how ‘self-expression is constitutively shaped by power relations’ (ibid: 69).

Another important theorist in this regard is Judith Butler, whose account of gender identity develops certain key themes of Foucauldian theory as well as insights offered up by Derrida on the re-iteration of norms as fundamental to identity formation. Butler (1988: 519) begins outlining this project by arguing that gender is ‘in no way a stable identity or locus of agency from which various acts proceed; rather it is an identity tenuously constituted in time – an identity instituted through a stylized repetition of acts’. Gender is created through acts which are ‘internally discontinuous’. These acts produce the ‘appearance of substance’, but this apparition is no more than ‘a constructed identity, a performative accomplishment which the mundane social audience, including the actors themselves, come to believe and to perform in the mode of belief’ (ibid: 520; see also Butler 1990: 141). Essentially, we internalise a set of discursive practices which enforce conformity to a set of idealised and constructed accounts of gender identity that reinforce heterosexual, patriarchal assumptions about what a man and woman is meant to be like.

Turning the commonsense view of gender on its head, Butler argues that the various acts, thoughts and physical appearances which we take to arise from our gender are actually the very things which produce our sense of gender. Gender is the consequence, rather than the cause, of these individual, isolated, norm-governed acts. Because acts which constitute gender are governed by institutional norms which enforce certain modes of behaviour, thought, speech, and even shape our bodies, all positive constructions of gender categories will be exclusionary. Consequently, not only does Butler deny any ontological justification for a feminist identity politics, but she also rejects the possibility of a political justification. Identity categories ‘are never merely descriptive, but always normative, and as such, exclusionary’ (1992: 16). As a result, ‘Any effort to give universal content or specific content to the category of women… will necessarily produce factionalization’ and so, ‘“identity” as a point of departure can never hold as the solidifying ground of a feminist political movement’ (ibid: 15).

Infusing issues of power into the recognition debate therefore presents problems for existent models of recognition. Taken to its extreme, contemporary feminist accounts of gender and identity may be seen as reason to decisively reject recognition politics. If, as Butler suggests, gender identity is intrinsically connected to power, then to demand recognition for one’s identity could seen as becoming compliant with existing power structures. Such a position would have no possibility of radically critiquing the status quo and would thus potentially forfeit any emancipatory promise. Upon the relationship between the individual and power, Foucault (1980: 98) writes: ‘[Individuals] are not only its [power’s] intent or consenting target; they are always also the elements of its articulation. In other words, individuals are the vehicles of power, not its point of application’. The concern is that there is no form of self-realisation in recognition models that does not, in some way, reproduce patterns of dominance or exclusion.

6. The Future of Recognition

Despite the above reservations regarding the concept of recognition and its political application, there is a growing interest in the value of recognition as a normative socio-political principle. The increasingly multicultural nature of societies throughout the world seems to call for a political theory which places respect for difference at its core. In this regard, recognition theories seem likely to only increase in influence. It should also be noted that they are very much in their infancy. It was only in the 1990s that theorists formulated a comprehensive account of recognition as a foundational concept within theories of justice. To this extent, they are still in the process of being fashioned and re-evaluated in the light of critical assessment from various schools of thought.

For many thinkers, the concept of recognition captures a fundamental feature of human subjectivity. It draws attention to the vital importance of our social interactions in formulating our sense of identity and self-worth as well as revealing the underlying motivations for, and justifications of, political action. It seems particularly useful in making sense of notions of authenticity and the conditions for agency, as well as mapping out the conditions for rational responsibility and authority (see Brandom, 2009). As a result, recognition can be seen as an indispensible means for analysing social movements, assessing claims for justice, thinking through issues of equality and difference, understanding our concrete relations to others, and explicating the nature of personal identity. Although there remain concerns regarding various aspects of recognition as a social and political concept, it is entirely possible that many of these will be addressed and resolved through future research.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Alexander, Jeffrey C. and Lara, Maria P., ‘Honneth’s New Critical Theory of Recognition’. New Left Review. 1/220 (1996): 126-136
  • Appiah, Kwame, A. ‘Identity, Authenticity, Survival: Multicultural Societies and Social Reproduction’. Multiculturalism: Examining the Politics of Recognition. Ed. Amy Gutmann. Princeton: Princeton University Press. 1994: 149-163
  • Arendt, Hannah. The Human Condition. Chicago: Chicago University Press, 1958
  • Brandom, Robert. Reason in Philosophy: Animating Ideas. Cambridge, Ma.: Harvard University Press, 2009
  • Brandom, Robert. ‘The Structure of Desire and Recognition: Self-consciousness and Self-Constitution’. Philosophy & Social Criticism. 33:1 (2007): 127-150
  • Butler, Judith. ‘Performative Acts and Gender Constitution: An Essay in Phenomenology and Feminist Theory’. Theatre Journal, 40:4 (1988): 519-531
  • Butler, Judith.Gender Trouble: Feminism and the Subversion of Identity. New York: Routledge, 1990
  • Butler, Judith. ‘Contingent Foundations: Feminism and the Question of “Postmodernism”’. Feminists Theorize the Political. Ed. Butler, Judith and Joan W. Scott. London: Routledge, 1992. 3-21
  • De Beauvoir, Simone. The Second Sex. Harmondsworth: Penguin, 1972 [1949]
  • Fanon, Frantz. Black Skin, White Masks. London: Pluto, 1986 [1952]
  • Fichte, Johann G. Foundations in Natural Right: According to the Principles of the Wissenschaftslehre. Cambridge: CUP, 2000 [1796/7]
  • Foucault, Michel. Power/Knowledge: Selected Interviews and Other Writings. Brighton: Harvester, 1980
  • Foucault, Michel. Politics, Philosophy, Culture: Interviews and Other Writings 1977-1984. Ed. Kritzman, L. D. London: Routledge, 1988
  • Fraser, Nancy. Justice Interruptus: Critical Reflections on the “Postsocialist” Condition. New York: Routledge, 1997
  • Fraser, Nancy. ‘Rethinking Recognition’. New Left Review. 3 (2000): 107-120
  • Fraser, Nancy. ‘Recognition Without Ethics?’. Theory Culture & Society. 18:2-3 (2001): 21-42
  • Fraser, Nancy and Axel Honneth. Redistribution or Recognition: A Political-Philosophical Exchange. London: Verso, 2003
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg. Truth and Method. London: Sheed and Ward, 1975 [1960]
  • Haraway, Donna. Simians, Cyborgs, and Women: The Reinvention of Nature. London: Free Association Books, 1991
  • Hegel, Georg W. G. Phenomenology of the Spirit. Trans. A. V. Miller. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1977 [1807]
  • Hegel, Georg W. G. Elements of the Philosophy of Right. Trans. H. B. Nisbet. Cambridge: CUP, 1991 [1821]
  • Habermas, Jürgen. ‘A Reply’. Communicative Action. Ed. Honneth, Axel and Hans Joas. Cambridge: Polity, 1991
  • Heyes, Cressida. ‘Can There Be a Queer Politics of Recognition?’. Recognition, Responsibility, and Rights: Feminist Ethics and Social Theory. Ed. Fiore, Robin N. and Hilde L. Nelson. Lanham: Rowman and Littlefield, 2003: 53-66
  • Honneth, Axel. ‘Integrity and Disrespect: Principles of a Conception of Morality Based on the Theory of Recognition’. Political Theory, 20:2 (1992): 187-201
  • Honneth, Axel. The Struggle for Recognition: The Grammar of Social Conflicts. Cambridge: Polity, 1995
  • Honneth, Axel. ‘Recognition or Redistribution? Changing Perspectives on a Moral Order of Society’. Theory, Culture & Society. 18:2-3 (2001): 43-44
  • Honneth, Axel. Disrespect: The Normative Foundations of Critical Theory. Cambridge: Polity, 2007
  • Ikäheimo, Heikki. ‘On the Genus and Species of Recognition.’ Inquiry, 45 (2002): 447-62
  • Ikäheimo, Heikki and Arto Laitinen. ‘Analyzing Recognition: Identification, Acknowledgement, and Recognitive Attitudes Towards Persons.’ Recognition and Power: Axel Honneth and the Tradition of Social Theory. Ed. Bert van den Brink and David Owen. New York: CUP, 2007: 33-56
  • Inwood, Michael. A Hegel Dictionary. Oxford: Blackwell, 1992
  • Jones, Peter. ‘Equality, Recognition and Difference’. Critical Review of International Social and Political Philosophy. 9:1 (2006): 23-46
  • Jones, Peter (ed.). Group Rights. Aldershot: Ashgate, 2009
  • Kymlicka, Will. Multicultural Citizenship: A Liberal Theory of Minority Rights. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1995
  • Laden, Anthony S. ‘Reasonable Deliberation, Constructive Power, and the Struggle for Recognition’. Recognition and Power: Axel Honneth and the Tradition of Social Theory. Ed. Bert van den Brink and David Owen. New York: CUP, 2007: 270-289
  • Laitinen, Arto. ‘Interpersonal Recognition: A Response to Value or a Precondition of Personhood?’ Inquiry, 45 (2002): 463-78
  • Levinas, Emmanuel. Totality and Infinity: An Essay on Exteriority. Pittsburgh: Duquesne University Press, 1969 [1961]
  • List, Christian and Philip Pettit, Group Agency. Oxford: OUP, 2011
  • Lloyd, Moya. Beyond Identity Politics: Feminism, Power & Politics. London: Sage, 2005
  • Margalit, Avishai. ‘Recognizing the Brother and the Other.’ Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society: Supplementary Volumes, vol. 75 (2001): 127-139
  • Markell, Patchen. ‘The Recognition of Politics: A Comment on Emcke and Tully’. Constellations, 7:4 (2002): 496-506
  • Markell, Patchen. Bound By Recognition. New Jersey: Princeton University Press, 2003
  • Markell, Patchen. ‘The Potential and the Actual: Mead, Honneth, and the “I”’. Recognition and Power: Axel Honneth and the Tradition of Social Theory. Ed. Bert van den Brink and David Owen. New York: CUP, 2007: 100-134
  • McBride, Cillian. ‘Demanding Recognition: Equality, Respect, and Esteem’. European Journal of Political Theory 8:1 (2009): 96-108
  • McNay, Lois. Against Recognition. Cambridge: Polity, 2008
  • Mead, George H. Mind, Self and Society: From the Standpoint of a Social Behaviourist. Chicago: Chicago University Press, 1934
  • Nicholson, Linda. ‘To Be or Not To Be: Charles Taylor and the Politics of Recognition’. Constellations, 3:1 (1996): 1-16
  • Merleau-Ponty, Maurice. Phenomenology of Perception. Trans. C. Smith. Oxford: Routledge, 2002 [1945]
  • Pinkard, Terry. Hegel’s Phenomenology: The Sociality of Reason. Cambridge: CUP, 1996
  • Rogers, Melvin L. ‘Rereading Honneth: Exodus Politics and the Paradox of Recognition’. European Journal of Political Theory, 8:2 (2007): 183-206
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  • Sartre, Jean-Paul. Being and Nothingness: An Essay in Phenomenological Ontology. London: Methuen & Co., 1957 [1943]
  • Stern, Robert. Hegel and the Phenomenology of Spirit. London: Routledge, 2002
  • Taylor, Charles. ‘The Politics of Recognition’. Multiculturalism: Examining the Politics of Recognition. Ed. Amy Gutmann. Princeton: Princeton University Press. 1994: 25-73
  • Thompson, Simon. The Political Theory of Recognition: A Critical Introduction. Cambridge: Polity, 2006
  • Tully, James. Strange Multiplicity: Constitutionalism in the Age of Diversity. Cambridge: CUP, 1995
  • Tuomela, Raimo. The Philosophy of Sociality: The Shared Point of View. Oxford: OUP. 2007
  • Williams, Robert R. Recognition: Fichte and Hegel on the Other. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1992
  • Williams, Robert R. Hegel’s Ethics of Recognition. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1992
  • Yar, Majid. ‘Recognition and the Politics of Human(e) Desires’. Recognition and Difference: Politics, Identity, Multiculture. Ed. Featherstone, Mike and Scott Lash. London: Sage, 2002
  • Young, Iris M. Justice and the Politics of Difference. New Jersey: Princeton University Press, 1990
  • Zurn, Christopher F. ‘Anthropology and Normativity: A Critique of Axel Honneth’s “Formal Conception of Ethical Life”’. Philosophy and Social Criticism, 26:1 (2000): 115-214
  • Zurn, Christopher F. ‘Identity or Status? Struggles Over ‘Recognition’ in Fraser, Honneth and Taylor’. Constellations, 10:4 (2003): 519-537

Author Information

Paddy McQueen
Queen’s University
Northern Ireland