The Philosophy of War


Any philosophical examination of war will  center on four general questions: What is war? What causes war? What is the relationship between human nature and war? Can war ever be morally justifiable?

Defining what war is requires determining the entities that are allowed to begin and engage in war. And a person’s definition of war often expresses the person’s broader political philosophy, such as limiting war to a conflict between nations or state.   Alternative definitions of war can include conflict not just between nations but between schools of thought or ideologies.

Answers to the question “What causes war?” largely depend on the philosopher’s views on determinism and free will.  If a human’s actions are beyond his or her control, then the cause of war is irrelevant and inescapable.  On the other hand, if war is a product of human choice, then three general groupings of causation can be identified: biological, cultural, and reason.  While exploring the root cause of conflict, this article investigates the relationship between human nature and war.

Finally, the question remains as to whether war is ever morally justified.  Just war theory is a useful structure within which the discourse of war may be ethically examined.  In the evolving context of modern warfare, a moral calculus of war will require the philosopher of war to account not only for military personnel and civilians, but also for justifiable targets, strategies, and use of weapons.

The answers to all these questions lead on to more specific and applied ethical and political questions.  Overall, the philosophy of war is complex and requires one to articulate consistent thought across the fields of metaphysics, epistemology, philosophy of mind, political philosophy, and ethics.

Table of Contents

  1. What is War?
  2. What causes war?
  3. Human Nature and War
  4. War and Political and Moral Philosophy
  5. Summary

1. What is War?

The first issue to be considered is what is war and what is its definition. The student of war needs to be careful in examining definitions of war, for like any social phenomena, definitions are varied, and often the proposed definition masks a particular political or philosophical stance paraded by the author. This is as true of dictionary definitions as well as of articles on military or political history.

Cicero defines war broadly as “a contention by force”; Hugo Grotius adds that “war is the state of contending parties, considered as such”; Thomas Hobbes notes that war is also an attitude: “By war is meant a state of affairs, which may exist even while its operations are not continued;” Denis Diderot comments that war is “a convulsive and violent disease of the body politic;” for Karl von Clausewitz, “war is the continuation of politics by other means”, and so on. Each definition has its strengths and weaknesses, but often is the culmination of the writer’s broader philosophical positions.

For example, the notion that wars only involve states-as Clausewitz implies-belies a strong political theory that assumes politics can only involve states and that war is in some manner or form a reflection of political activity. ‘War’ defined by Webster’s Dictionary is a state of open and declared, hostile armed conflict between states or nations, or a period of such conflict. This captures a particularly political-rationalistic account of war and warfare, i.e., that war needs to be explicitly declared and to be between states to be a war. We find Rousseau arguing this position: “War is constituted by a relation between things, and not between persons…War then is a relation, not between man and man, but between State and State…” (The Social Contract).

The military historian, John Keegan offers a useful characterization of the political-rationalist theory of war in his A History of War. It is assumed to be an orderly affair in which states are involved, in which there are declared beginnings and expected ends, easily identifiable combatants, and high levels of obedience by subordinates. The form of rational war is narrowly defined, as distinguished by the expectation of sieges, pitched battles, skirmishes, raids, reconnaissance, patrol and outpost duties, with each possessing their own conventions. As such, Keegan notes the rationalist theory does not deal well with pre-state or non-state peoples and their warfare.

There are other schools of thought on war’s nature other than the political-rationalist account, and the student of war must be careful, as noted above, not to incorporate a too narrow or normative account of war. If war is defined as something that occurs only between states, then wars between nomadic groups should not be mentioned, nor would hostilities on the part of a displaced, non-state group against a state be considered war.

An alternative definition of war is that it is an all-pervasive phenomenon of the universe. Accordingly, battles are mere symptoms of the underlying belligerent nature of the universe; such a description corresponds with a Heraclitean or Hegelian philosophy in which change (physical, social, political, economical, etc) can only arise out of war or violent conflict. Heraclitus decries that “war is the father of all things,” and Hegel echoes his sentiments. Interestingly, even Voltaire, the embodiment of the Enlightenment, followed this line: “Famine, plague, and war are the three most famous ingredients of this wretched world…All animals are perpetually at war with each other…Air, earth and water are arenas of destruction.” (From Pocket Philosophical Dictionary).

Alternatively, the Oxford Dictionary expands the definition to include “any active hostility or struggle between living beings; a conflict between opposing forces or principles.” This avoids the narrowness of a political-rationalist conception by admitting the possibility of metaphorical, non-violent clashes between systems of thought, such as of religious doctrines or of trading companies. This perhaps indicates a too broad definition, for trade is certainly a different kind of activity than war, although trade occurs in war, and trade often motivates wars. The OED definition also seems to echo a Heraclitean metaphysics, in which opposing forces act on each other to generate change and in which war is the product of such a metaphysics. So from two popular and influential dictionaries, we have definitions that connote particular philosophical positions.

The plasticity and history of the English language also mean that commonly used definitions of war may incorporate and subsume meanings borrowed and derived from other, older languages: the relevant root systems being Germanic, Latin, Greek, and Sanskrit. Such descriptions may linger in oral and literary depictions of war, for we read of war in poems, stories, anecdotes and histories that may encompass older conceptions of war. Nonetheless, war’s descriptions residing in the literature left by various writers and orators often possess similarities to modern conceptions. The differences arise from the writer’s, poet’s, or orator’s judgement of war, which would suggest that an Ancient Greek conception of war is not so different from our own. Both could recognize the presence or absence of war. However, etymologically war’s definition does refer to conceptions of war that have either been discarded or been imputed to the present definition, and a cursory review of the roots of the word war provides the philosopher with a glimpse into its conceptual status within communities and over time.

For example, the root of the English word ‘war’, werra, is Frankish-German, meaning confusion, discord, or strife, and the verb werran meaning to confuse or perplex. War certainly generates confusion, as Clausewitz noted calling it the “fog of war”, but that does not discredit the notion that war is organized to begin with. The Latin root of bellum gives us the word belligerent, and duel, an archaic form of bellum; the Greek root of war is polemos, which gives us polemical, implying an aggressive controversy. The Frankish-Germanic definition hints at a vague enterprise, a confusion or strife, which could equally apply to many social problems besetting a group; arguably it is of a lower order sociological concept than the Greek, which draws the mind’s attention to suggestions of violence and conflict, or the Latin, which captures the possibility of two sides doing the fighting.

The present employment of ‘war’ may imply the clash and confusion embedded in early definitions and roots, but it may also, as we have noted, unwittingly incorporate conceptions derived from particular political schools. An alternative definition that the author has worked on is that war is a state of organized, open-ended collective conflict or hostility. This is derived from contextual common denominators, that is elements that are common to all wars, and which provide a useful and robust definition of the concept. This working definition has the benefit of permitting more flexibility than the OED version, a flexibility that is crucial if we are to examine war not just as a conflict between states (that is, the rationalist position), but also a conflict between non-state peoples, non-declared actions, and highly organized, politically controlled wars as well as culturally evolved, ritualistic wars and guerrilla uprisings, that appear to have no centrally controlling body and may perhaps be described as emerging spontaneously.

The political issue of defining war poses the first philosophical problem, but once that is acknowledged, a definition that captures the clash of arms, the state of mutual tension and threat of violence between groups, the authorized declaration by a sovereign body, and so on can be drawn upon to distinguish wars from riots and rebellions, collective violence from personal violence, metaphorical clashes of values from actual or threatened clashes of arms.

2. What causes war?

Various sub-disciplines have grappled with war’s etiology, but each in turn, as with definitions of war, often reflects a tacit or explicit acceptance of broader philosophical issues on the nature of determinism and freedom.

For example, if it is claimed that man is not free to choose his actions (strong determinism) then war becomes a fated fact of the universe, one that humanity has no power to challenge. Again, the range of opinions under this banner is broad, from those who claim war to be a necessary and ineluctable event, one that man can never shirk from, to those who, while accepting war’s inevitability, claim that man has the power to minimize its ravages, just as prescriptive medicines may minimize the risk of disease or lightning rods the risk of storm damage. The implication is that man is not responsible for his actions and hence not responsible for war. Wherein lies its cause then becomes the intellectual quest: in the medieval understanding of the universe, the stars, planets and combinations of the four substances (earth, air, water, fire) were understood as providing the key to examining human acts and dispositions. While the modern mind has increased the complexity of the nature of the university, many still refer to the universe’s material nature or its laws for examining why war arises. Some seek more complicated versions of the astrological vision of the medieval mind (e.g., Kondratieff cycle theories), whereas others delve into the newer sciences of molecular and genetic biology for explanations.

In a weaker form of determinism, theorists claim that man is a product of his environment-however that is defined-but he also possesses the power to change that environment. Arguments from this perspective become quite intricate, for they often presume that ‘mankind’ as a whole is subject to inexorable forces that prompt him to wage war, but that some people’s acts-those of the observers, philosophers, scientists-are not as determined, for they possess the intellectual ability to perceive what changes are required to alter man’s martial predispositions. Again, the paradoxes and intricacies of opinions here are curiously intriguing, for it may be asked what permits some to stand outside the laws that everybody else is subject to?

Others, who emphasize man’s freedom to choose, claim that war is a product of his choice and hence is completely his responsibility. But thinkers here spread out into various schools of thought on the nature of choice and responsibility. By its very collective nature, considerations of war’s causation must encroach into political philosophy and into discussions on a citizen’s and a government’s responsibility for a war. Such concerns obviously trip into moral issues (to what extent is the citizen morally responsible for war?), but with regards war’s causation, if man is responsible for the actual initiation of war it must be asked on whose authority is war enacted? Descriptive and normative problems arise here, for one may inquire who is the legal authority to declare war, then move to issues of whether that authority has or should have legitimacy. For example, one may consider whether that authority reflects what ‘the people’ want (or should want), or whether the authority informs them of what they want (or should want). Are the masses easily swayed by the ideas of the élite, or do the élite ultimately pursue what the majority seeks? Here, some blame aristocracies for war (e.g., Nietzsche, who actually extols their virtues in this regard) and others blame the masses for inciting a reluctant aristocracy to fight (cf. Vico, New Science, sect. 87).

Those who thus emphasize war as a product of man’s choices bring to the fore his political and ethical nature, but once the broad philosophical territory of metaphysics has been addressed other particular causes of war can be noted. These may be divided into three main groupings: those who seek war’s causation in man’s biology, those that seek it in his culture, and those who seek it in his faculty of reason.

Some claim war to be a product of man’s inherited biology, with disagreements raging on the ensuing determinist implications. Example theories include those that claim man to be naturally aggressive or naturally territorial, more complex analyses incorporate game theory and genetic evolution to explain the occurrence of violence and war (cf. Richard Dawkins for interesting comments on this area). Within this broad school of thought, some accept that man’s belligerent drives can be channeled into more peaceful pursuits (William James), some worry about man’s lack of inherited inhibitions to fight with increasingly dangerous weapons (Konrad Lorenz), and others claim the natural process of evolution will sustain peaceful modes of behavior over violent (Richard Dawkins).

Rejecting biological determinism, culturalists seek to explain war’s causation in terms of particular cultural institutions. Again determinism is implied when proponents claim that war is solely a product of man’s culture or society, with different opinions arising as to the nature or possibility of cultural change. For example, can the ‘soft morality’ of trade that engages increasing numbers in peaceful intercourse counteract and even abolish bellicose cultural tendencies (as Kant believes), or are cultures subject to an inertia, in which the imposition of external penalties or a supra-national state may be the only means to peace? The problem leads to questions of an empirical and a normative nature on the manner in which some societies have foregone war and on the extent to which similar programs may be deployed in other communities. For example, what generated peace between the warring tribes of England and what denies the people of Northern Ireland or Yugoslavia that same peace?

Rationalists are those who emphasize the efficacy of man’s reason in human affairs, and accordingly proclaim war to be a product of reason (or lack of). To some this is a lament-if man did not possess reason, he might not seek the advantages he does in war and he would be a more peaceful beast. To others reason is the means to transcend culturally relative differences and concomitant sources of friction, and its abandonment is the primary cause of war (cf. John Locke, Second Treatise, sect. 172). Proponents of the mutual benefits of universal reason have a long and distinguished lineage reaching back to the Stoics and echoing throughout the Natural Law philosophies of the medieval and later scholars and jurists. It finds its best advocate in Immanuel Kant and his famous pamphlet on Perpetual Peace.

Many who explain war’s origins in man’s abandonment of reason also derive their thoughts from Plato, who argues that “wars and revolutions and battles are due simply and solely to the body and its desires.” That is, man’s appetite sometimes or perpetually overwhelms his reasoning capacity, which results in moral and political degeneration. Echoes of Plato’s theories abound in Western thought, resurfacing for example, in Freud’s cogitation on war (“Why War”) in which he sees war’s origins in the death instinct, or in Dostoyevsky’s comments on man’s inherent barbarity: “It’s just their defenselessness that tempts the tormentor, just the angelic confidence of the child who has no refuge and no appeal, that sets his vile blood on fire. In every man, of course, a beast lies hidden-the beast of rage, the beast of lustful heat at the screams of the tortured victim, the beast of lawlessness let off the chain, the beast of diseases that follow on vice, gout, kidney disease, and so on.” (Brothers Karamazov, ii.V.4, “Rebellion”)

The problem with focusing on one single aspect of man’s nature is that while the explanation of war’s causation may be simplified, the simplification ignores cogent explanations put forward by competing theories. For example, an emphasis on man’s reason as the cause of war is apt to ignore deep cultural structures that may perpetuate war in the face of the universal appeal to peace, and similarly may ignore inherited pugnacity in some individuals or even in some groups. Similarly, an emphasis on the biological etiology of war can ignore man’s intellectual capacity to control, or his will to go against, his predispositions. In other words, human biology can affect thinking (what is thought, how, for what duration and intensity), and can accordingly affect cultural developments, and in turn cultural institutions can affect biological and rational developments (e.g., how strangers are welcomed affects a group’s isolation or integration and hence its reproductive gene pool).

The examination of war’s causation triggers the need for elaboration on many sub-topics, regardless of the internal logical validity of a proposed explanation. Students of war thus need to explore beyond proffered definitions and explanations to consider the broader philosophical problems that they often conceal.

3. Human Nature and War

A setting to explore the relationship between human nature and war is provided by Thomas Hobbes, who presents a state of nature in which the ‘true’ or ‘underlying’ nature of man is likely to come to the fore of our attention. Hobbes is adamant that without an external power to impose laws, the state of nature would be one of immanent warfare. That is, “during the time men live without a common Power to keep them all in awe, they are in that condition which is called Warre; and such a warre, as is of every man, against every man.” (Leviathan, 1.13) Hobbes’s construction is a useful starting point for discussions on man’s natural inclinations and many of the great philosophers who followed him, including Locke, Rousseau, and Kant, agree to some extent or other with his description. Locke rejects Hobbes’s complete anarchic and total warlike state but accepts that there will always be people who will take advantage of the lack of legislation and enforcement. Rousseau inverts Hobbes’s image to argue that in the state of nature man is naturally peaceful and not belligerent, however when Rousseau elaborates on international politics he is of a similar mind, arguing that states must be active (aggressive) otherwise they decline and founder; war is inevitable and any attempts at peaceful federations are futile. (From Rousseau’s notes on L’état de guerre criticizing the earlier pamphlet of the Abbé Saint-Pierre entitled Perpetual Peace, a title Kant later usurps).

Kant’s position is that the innate conflict between men and later between states prompts humanity to seek peace and federation. It is not that man’s reason alone teaches him the benefits of a pacifistic concord, but that war, which is inevitable when overarching structures are absent, induces men to consider and realize more peaceful arrangements of their affairs, yet even Kant retained a pessimistic conception of mankind: “War…seems to be ingrained in human nature, and even to be regarded as something noble to which man is inspired by his love of honor, without selfish motives.” (Perpetual Peace)

Hobbes presents an atomistic conception of humanity, which many disagree with. Communitarians of various hues reject the notion of an isolated individual pitted against others and prompted to seek a contract between themselves for peace. Some critics prefer an organic conception of the community in which the individual’s ability to negotiate for peace (through a social contract) or to wage war is embedded in the social structures that form him. Reverting to John Donne’s “no man is an island” and to Aristotle’s “man is a political animal”, proponents seek to emphasize the social connections that are endemic to human affairs, and hence any theoretical construction of human nature, and thus of war, requires an examination of the relevant society man lives in. Since the governing elements of man’s nature are thereby relative to time and place, so too is war’s nature and ethic, although proponents of this viewpoint can accept the persistence of cultural forms over time. For instance, the communitarian view of war implies that Homeric war is different from war in the Sixteenth Century, but historians might draw upon evidence that the study of Greek warfare in the Iliad may influence later generations in how they conceive themselves and warfare.

Others reject any theorizing on human nature. Kenneth Waltz, for example argues: “While human nature no doubt plays a role in bringing about war, it cannot by itself explain both war and peace, except by the simple statement that sometimes he fights and sometimes he does not.” (Man, War, and State), and existentialists deny such an entity is compatible with complete freedom of will (cf. Sartre). This danger here is that this absolves any need to search for commonalties in warriors of different periods and areas, which could be of great benefit both to military historians and peace activists.

4. War and Political and Moral Philosophy

The first port of call for investigating war’s morality is the just war theory, which is well discussed and explained in many text books and dictionaries and can also be viewed on the IEP.

However, once the student has considered, or is at least aware of the broader philosophical theories that may relate to war, an analysis of its ethics begins with the question: is war morally justifiable? Again, due notice must be given to conceptions of justice and morality that involve both individuals and groups. War as a collective endeavor engages a co-ordinated activity in which not only the ethical questions of agent responsibility, obedience and delegation are ever present but so too are questions concerning the nature of agency. Can nations be morally responsible for the war’s they are involved in, or should only those with the power to declare war be held responsible? Similarly, should individual Field Marshalls be considered the appropriate moral agent or the army as a corporate body? What guilt, if any, should the Private bear for his army’s aggression, and likewise what guilt, if any, should a citizen, or even a descendant, bear for his country’s war crimes? (And is there such a thing as a ‘war crime’?)

Just war theory begins with an assessment of the moral and political criteria for justifying the initiation of war (defensive or aggressive), but critics note that the justice of warfare is already presumed in just war theory: all that is being outlined are the legal, political, and moral criteria for its justice. Thus the initial justice of war requires reflection. Pacifists deny that war, or even any kind of violence, can be morally permissible, but, as with the other positions noted above, a variety of opinions exists here, some admitting the use of war only in defense and as a last resort (defencists) whereas others absolutely do not admit violence or war of any sort (absolutist pacifists). Moving from the pacifist position, other moralists admit the use of war as a means to support, defend, or secure peace, but such positions may permit wars of defense, deterrence, aggression, and intervention for that goal.

Beyond what has been called the pacificistic morality (in which peace is the end goal as distinct from pacifism and its rejection of war as a means), are those theories that establish an ethical value in war. Few consider war should be fought for war’s sake, but many writers have supported war as a means to various ends other than peace. For example, as a vehicle to forge national identity, to pursue territorial aggrandizement, or to uphold and strive for a variety of virtues such as glory and honor. In this vein of thought, those who are now characterized as social darwinists and their intellectual kin may be heard extolling the evolutionary benefits of warfare, either for invigorating individuals or groups to pursue the best of their abilities, or to remove weaker members or groups from political ascendancy.

The morality of war traipses into the related area of political philosophy in which conceptions of political responsibility and sovereignty, as well as notions of collective identity and individuality, should be acknowledged and investigated. Connections back to war’s causation can also be noted. For example, if the moral code of war concerns the corporate entity of the state, then it is to the existence or behavior of the state that we turn to explain how war’s originate. This raises problems concerning the examination of the moral and political responsibility for war’s initiation and procedure: if states are war’s harbingers, then does it follow that only the state’s leaders are morally and politically responsible, or if we accept some element of Humean democracy (namely that governments are always subject to the sanction of the people they rule or represent) then moral and political responsibility extends to the citizenry.

Once war commences, whatever its merits, philosophers disagree on the role, if any, of morality within war. Many have claimed morality is necessarily discarded by the very nature of war including Christian thinkers such as Augustine, whereas others have sought to remind warriors both of the existence of moral relations in war and of various strictures to remain sensitive to moral ends. Sociologically, those going to and coming back from war often go through rites and rituals that symbolize their stepping out of, or back into, civil society, as if their transition is to a different level of morality and agency. War typically involves killing and the threat of being killed, which existentialist writers have drawn on in their examination of war’s phenomenology.

For the ethicist, questions begin with identifying morally permissible or justifiable targets, strategies, and weapons-that is, of the principles of discrimination and proportionality. Writers disagree on whether all is fair in war, or whether certain modes of conflict ought to be avoided. The reasons for maintaining some moral dimensions include: the preponderance or expectation of peaceful intercourse on other levels; the mutual benefits of refraining from certain acts and the fear of retaliation in kind; and the existence of treatises and covenants that nations may seek to abide by to maintain international status.

A useful distinction here is between absolute war and total war. Absolute war describes the deployment of all of a society’s resources and citizens into working for the war machine. Total war, on the other hand, describes the absence of any restraint in warfare. Moral and political responsibility becomes problematic for proponents of both absolute and total war, for they have to justify the incorporation of civilians who do not work for the war effort as well as the infirm, children, and the handicapped and wounded who cannot fight. Supporters of absolute warfare may argue that membership of a society involves responsibilities for its protection, and if some members are literally unable to assist then all other able-bodied civilians have an absolute duty to do their part. The literature of war propaganda relates well here, as does the penal morality for those who refuse and the definitional politics of the wide range of people who may not wish to fight from conscientious objectors to traitors.

Similar issues dog those who support total warfare in which the military target traditionally sacrosanct people and entities: from non-combatants, women and children, to works of art and heritage buildings. Supporters may evoke the sliding scale that Michael Walzer describes in Just and Unjust Wars, in which graver threats to the body politic may permit the gradual weakening of moral constraints. Curiously, considering his strong emphasis on social virtues, David Hume accepts the abandonment of all notions of justice in war or when the agent’s plight is so dire that recourse to any action becomes permissible (cf. Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals, sect.3). Others merely state that war and morality do not mix.

5. Summary

The nature of the philosophy of war is complex and this article has sought to establish a broad vision of its landscape and the connections that are endemic to any philosophical analysis of the topic. The subject matter lends itself to metaphysical and epistemological considerations, to the philosophy of mind and of human nature, as well as to the more traditional areas of moral and political philosophy. In many respects the philosophy of war demands a thorough investigation of all aspects of a thinker’s beliefs, as well as presenting an indication of a philosopher’s position on connected topics. To begin a philosophical discussion of war draws one onto a long and complex intellectual path of study and continual analysis; whereas a cursory announcement of what one thinks on war can be, or points to, the culmination of thoughts on related topics and a deduction from one to the other can and should always be made.

Author Information

Alexander Moseley
United Kingdom