This article gives an overview of the moral and legal aspects of abortion and evaluates the most important arguments. The central moral aspect concerns whether there is any morally relevant point during the biological process of the development of the fetus from its beginning as a unicellular zygote to birth itself that may justify not having an abortion after that point. Leading candidates for the morally relevant point are: the onset of movement, consciousness, the ability to feel pain, and viability. The central legal aspect of the abortion conflict is whether fetuses have a basic legal right to live, or, at least, a claim to live. The most important argument with regard to this conflict is the potentiality argument, which turns on whether the fetus is potentially a human person and thus should be protected. The question of personhood depends on both empirical findings and moral claims.

The article ends with an evaluation of a pragmatic account. According to this account, one has to examine the different kinds of reasons for abortion in a particular case to decide about the reasonableness of the justification given. Take the example of a young, raped woman. The account suggests that it would seem cruel and callous to force her to give birth to “her” child. So, if  this pragmatic account is correct, some abortions may be morally justifiable whereas other abortions may be morally reprehensible.

Table of Contents

  1. Preliminary Distinctions
    1. Three Views on Abortion
    2. The Standard Argument
    3. The Modified Standard Argument
  2. Personhood
  3. Moral Aspects of the Abortion Conflict
    1. Moral Rights
    2. At Birth
    3. Viability
    4. First Movement
    5. Consciousness and the Ability to Feel Pain
    6. Unicellular Zygote
    7. Thomson and the Argument of The Sickly Violinist
  4. Legal Aspects of the Abortion Conflict
    1. The Account of Quasi-Rights
    2. The Argument of Potentiality
  5. A Pragmatic Account
    1. First Order Reasons
      1. Rape
      2. Endangerment of the Woman’s Life
      3. Serious Mentally or Physically Disabled Fetuses
    2. Second Order Reasons
      1. A Journey to Europe
      2. Financial and Social Reasons
    3. First Order Reasons vs. Second Order Reasons
  6. Public Policy and Abortion
  7. Clinical Ethics Consultation and Abortion
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Preliminary Distinctions

One of the most important issues in biomedical ethics is the controversy surrounding abortion. This controversy has a long history and is still heavily discussed among researchers and the public—both in terms of morality and in terms of legality. The following basic questions may characterize the subject in more detail: Is abortion morally justifiable? Does the fetus (embryo, conceptus, and zygote) have any moral and/or legal rights? Is the fetus a human person and, thus, should be protected? What are the criteria for being a person? Is there any morally relevant break along the biological process of development from the unicellular zygote to birth? This list of questions is not meant to be exhaustive, but it describes the issues of the following analysis.

a. Three Views on Abortion

There are three main views: first, the extreme conservative view (held by the Catholic Church); second, the extreme liberal view (held by Singer); and third, moderate views which lie between both extremes. Some opponents (anti-abortionists, pro-life activists) holding the extreme view, argue that human personhood begins from the unicellular zygote and thus – according to the religious stance – one should not have an abortion by virtue of the imago dei of the human being (for example, Schwarz 1990). To have an abortion would be, by definition, homicide. The extreme liberal view is held by proponents (abortionists). They claim that human personhood begins immediately after birth or a bit later (Singer). Thus, they consider the relevant date is at birth or a short time later (say, one month). The proponents of the moderate views argue that there is a morally relevant break in the biological process of development – from the unicellular zygote to birth – which determines the justifiability and non-justifiability of having an abortion. According to them, there is a gradual process from being a fetus to being an infant where the fetus is not a human being but a human offspring with a different moral status.

The advantage of the extreme conservative view is the fact that it defines human personhood from the beginning of life (the unicellular zygote); there is no slippery slope. However, it seems implausible to say that the zygote is a human person. The advantage of the extreme liberal view is that its main claim is supported by a common philosophical usage of the notion “personhood” and thus seems more sound than the extreme conservative view because the offspring is far more developed; as the unicellular zygote. This view also faces severe problems; for example, it is not at all clear where the morally relevant difference is between the fetus five minutes before birth and a just born offspring. Some moderate views have commonsense plausibility especially when it is argued that there are significant differences between the developmental stages. The fact that they also claim for a break in the biological process, which is morally relevant, seems to be a relapse into old and unjustified habits. As Gillespie stresses in his article “Abortion and Human Rights” (1984, 94-102) there is no morally relevant break in the biological process of development. But, in fact, there are differences, which make a comparative basis possible without having to solve the problem of drawing a line. How should one decide?

b. The Standard Argument

The standard argument is the following practical syllogism:

  1. The killing of human beings is prohibited.
  2. A fetus is a human being.
  3. The killing of fetuses is prohibited.

Hence, abortion is not allowed since homicide is prohibited. It seems obvious to question the result of the practical syllogism since one is able to argue against both premises. First, there are possible situations where the first premise could be questioned by noting, for example that killing in self-defense is not prohibited. Second, the second premise could also be questioned since it is not at all clear whether fetuses are human beings in the sense of being persons, although they are of course human beings in the sense of being members of the species of homo sapiens. Consecutively, one would deny that fetuses are persons but admit that a young two year old child may be a person. Although, in the end, it may be difficult to claim that every human being is a person. For example, people with severe mental handicaps or disorder seem not to have personhood. That is, if personhood is defined with regard to specific criteria like the capacity to reason, or to have consciousness, self-consciousness, or rationality, some people might be excluded. But, in fact, this does not mean that people with severe mental handicaps who lack personhood can be killed. Even when rights are tied to the notion of personhood, it is clearly prohibited to kill disabled people. Norbert Hoerster, a well-known German philosopher, claims that fetuses with severe handicaps can be – like all other fetuses – aborted, as born human beings with severe handicaps they have to be protected and respected like all other human beings, too (1995, 159).

c. The Modified Standard Argument

However, it seems appropriate to modify the standard argument and to use a more sophisticated version. Replace the notion “human being” with “human life form.” The new practical syllogism is:

  1. The killing of human life forms is prohibited.
  2. A fetus is a human life form.
  3. The killing of fetuses is prohibited.

The objection against the first premise of the standard argument still holds for the new more sophisticated version. But, the second modified premise is much stronger than the previous one because one has to determine what a human life form really is. Is a fetus a human life form? But, even if the fetus is a human life form, it does not necessarily follow that it should be protected by that fact, simpliciter. The fetus may be a human life form but it hardly seems to be a person (in the ordinary sense of the notion) and thus has no corresponding basic right to live. However, as already stated, this kind of talk seems to go astray because the criteria for personhood may be suitable for just-borns but not appropriate for fetuses, embryos, or unicellular zygotes, like some biological (human being), psychological (self-consciousness), rational (ability to reasoning), social (sympathy/love), or legal (being a human life form with rights) criteria may indicate (for example, Jane English 1984). Jane English persuasively argues in “Abortion and the Concept of a Person” that even if the fetus is a person, abortion may be justifiable in many cases, and if the fetus is no person, the killing of fetuses may be wrong in many cases.

2. Personhood

What does it mean to claim that a human life form is a person? This is an important issue since the ascription of rights is at stake. I previously stated that it is unsound to say that a fetus is a person or has personhood since it lacks, at least, rationality and self-consciousness. It follows that not every human being is also a person according to the legal sense, and, thus, also lacks moral rights (extreme case). The fetus is by virtue of his genetic code a human life form but this does not mean that this would be sufficient to grant it legal and moral rights. Nothing follows from being a human life form by virtue of one’s genes, especially not that one is able to derive legal or moral rights from this very fact (for example, speciesism). Is a human person exclusively defined by her membership of the species Homo sapiens sapiens and thus should be protected? To accept this line of argumentation would entail the commitment of the existence of normative empirical features. It seems premature to derive the prohibition to kill a life form from the bare fact of its genetic feature – including the human life form – unless one argues that human beings do have the basic interest of protecting their offspring. Is a human life form a moral entity? This seems to be a good approach. The argument runs as follows: It seems plausible to claim that human beings create values and, if they have the basic interest of protecting their offspring, human beings may establish a certain morality by which they can argue, for example, for the prohibition of abortions. The moral judgment can be enforced through legal norms (see below).

To be more precise about the assumption of the existence or non-existence of normative, empirical features: Critics of the view to tie the right to live and the biological category of being a human being claim that the protagonists effect the is-ought fallacy. Why is it unsound to take the bare fact of being a member of the biological species Homo sapiens as a solid basis for granting the right to live? The linkage seems only justified when there are sound factual reasons. If there are none, the whole line of reasoning would “hang in the air” so that one could also easily argue for the right to live for cats and dogs. Only factual relevant features may be important for the linkage. What could these relevant features look like?

Jane English presents in her article “Abortion and the Concept of a Person” several features of personhood which characterize the human person. Her notion of personhood can be grouped into five sectors (English 1984, pp. 152): (i) the biological sector (being a human being, having extremities, eating and sleeping); (ii) the psychological sector (perception, emotions, wishes and interests, ability to communicate, ability to make use of tools, self-consciousness); (iii) the rational sector (reasoning, ability to make generalizations, to make plans, learning from experience); (iv) the social sector (to belong to different groups, other people, sympathy and love); and (v) the legal sector (to be a legal addressee, ability to make contracts, to be a citizen). According to English, it is not necessary for a human life form to comply with all five sectors and different aspects to count as a person. A fetus lies right in the penumbra where the concept of personhood is hard to apply. There is no core of necessary and sufficient features that could be ascribed to a human life form in order to be sure that these features constitute a person (English 1984, 153).

Mary Anne Warren claims that a human life form should qualify as a person when, at least, some of the following aspects (especially i-iii) are at stake: (i) consciousness and the ability to feel pain; (ii) reasoning; (iii) a self-motivated activity; (iv) ability to communicate; and (v) the existence of a self-concept (for example, individual, racial) and self-consciousness (Warren 1984, 110-113). Warren argues that the fetus is no person since it lacks the criteria of personhood and, thus, an abortion is justified.

The aim is not to give an airtight definition of the concept of personhood. The main question is whether a fetus could qualify as a person. The following can be stated: The fetus is a human offspring but is not a legal, social, and rational person in the ordinary sense of the notions. Some aspects of the psychological sector for example, the ability to feel and perceive can be ascribed to the fetus but not to the embryo, conceptus, or the (unicellular) zygote. It seems implausible to say that a fetus (or embryo, conceptus, zygote) is a person, unless one additionally claims that the genetic code of the fetus is a sufficient condition. However, this does not mean, in the end, that one could always justify an abortion. It only shows that the fetus could hardly be seen as a human person.

It is hard to keep the legal and moral aspects of the conflict of abortion apart. There are overlaps which are due to the nature of things since legal considerations are based on the ethical realm. This can also be seen according to the notion person. What a person is is not a legal question but a question which is to be decided within a specific ethics. If one characterizes the notion of a person along some criteria, then the question of which criteria are suitable or not will be discussed with regard to a specific moral approach (for example, Kantianism, utilitarianism, virtue ethics). The relevant criteria, in turn, may come from different areas like the psychological, rational, or social sphere. If the criteria are settled, this influences the legal sector because the ascription of legal rights – especially the right to live in the abortion debate – is tied to persons and respectively to the concept of personhood.

3. Moral Aspects of the Abortion Conflict

The main question with regard to the moral sphere concerns identification of the right developmental point of the fetus (or the embryo, conceptus, zygote) to decide which break may morally justify an abortion or not (proponents of the moderate view and the extreme liberal view claim that there is such a break). The main arguments in the debate will be evaluated in the following. Before we analyze the arguments, it is necessary to say something about moral rights.

a. Moral Rights

Some authors claim that the talk of moral rights and moral obligations is an old never-ending tale. There are no “moral rights” or “moral obligations” per se; at least, in the sense that there are also moral rights and moral obligations apart from legal rights and legal obligations. There is no higher ethical authority which may enforce a specific moral demand. Rights and obligations rest on law. According to ethics, one should better say “moral agreements” (for example, Gauthier). The proponents claim that moral agreements do have a similar status to legal rights and legal obligations but stress that no person has an enforceable demand to have her moral rights prevail over others. The suitability is the essential aspect of the metaphysics of rights and obligations. Only the formal constraint establishes rights and obligations within a given society (for example, Hobbes); the informal constraint within a given society – though it may be stronger – is not able to do so. Without a court of first instance there are no rights and obligations. Only by using the legal system is one able to establish specific moral rights and specific moral obligations. Those authors claim that there are no absolute moral rights and moral obligations which are universally valid; moral agreements are always subjective and relative. Hence, there are also no (absolute) moral rights which the fetus (embryo, conceptus, or zygote) may call for. The only solution may be that the survival of the fetus rests on the will of the human beings in a given moral society. According to their view, it is only plausible to argue that an abortion is morally reprehensible if the people in a given society do have a common interest not to abort and make a moral agreement which is enforced by law.

b. At Birth

Proponents of the liberal view contend that the morally significant break in the biological development of the fetus is at birth. This means that it is morally permitted to have an abortion before birth and morally prohibited to kill the offspring after birth. The objection against this view is simple because there seems to be no morally relevant difference between a short time (say five minutes) before birth and after it. Factually, the only biological difference is the physical separation of the fetus from the mother. However it seems unsound to interpret this as the morally significant difference; the bare evidence with regard to the visibility of the offspring and the physical separation (that is, the offspring is no longer dependent on the woman’s body) seems insufficient.

c. Viability

Proponents of the moderate view often claim that the viability criterion is a hot candidate for a morally significant break because the dependence of the nonviable fetus on the pregnant woman gives her the right to make a decision about having an abortion. The aspect of dependence is insufficient in order to determine the viability as a possible break. Take the following counter-example: A son and his aged mother who is nonviable without the intensive care of her son; the son has no right to let his mother die by virtue of her given dependence. However, one may object that there is a difference between “needing someone to care for you” and “needing to live off a particular person’s body.” Furthermore, one may stress that the nonviable and the viable fetus both are potential human adults. But as we will see below the argument of potentiality is flawed since it is unclear how actual rights could be derived from the bare potentiality of having such rights at a later time. Hence, both types of fetuses cannot make claim for a right. There is also another objection that cannot be rebutted: the viability of the fetus regarding the particular level of medical technology. On the one hand, there is a temporal relativity according to medical technology. The understanding of what constitutes the viability of the fetus has developed over time according to the technical level of embryology in the last centuries and decades. Today, artificial viability allows physicians to rescue many premature infants who would have previously died. On the other hand, there exists a local relativity according to the availability of medical supplies in and within countries which determines whether the life of a premature infant will be saved. The medical supply may vary greatly. Consequently, it seems inappropriate to claim that viability as such should be regarded as a significant break by being a general moral justification against abortions.

d. First Movement

The first movement of the fetus is sometimes regarded as a significant break because proponents stress its deeper meaning which usually rests on religious or non-religious considerations. Formerly the Catholic Church maintained that the first movement of the fetus shows that it is the breathing of life into the human body (animation) which separates the human fetus from animals. This line of thinking is out-of-date and the Catholic Church no longer uses it. Another point is that the first movement of the fetus that women experience is irrelevant since the real first movement of the fetus is much earlier. Ultrasonic testing shows that the real first movement of the fetus is somewhere between the 6th and 9th week. But even if one considers the real first movement problems may arise. The physical ability to move is morally irrelevant. One counter-example: What about an adult human being who is quadriplegic and is unable to move? It seems out of the question to kill such people and to justify the killing by claiming that people who are disabled and simply lack the ability to move are, therewith, at other people’s disposal.

e. Consciousness and the Ability to Feel Pain

In general, proponents of moderate views believe that consciousness and the ability to feel pain will develop after about six months. However the first brain activities are discernable after the seventh week so that it is possible to conclude that the fetus may feel pain after this date. In this respect, the ability to suffer is decisive for acknowledging a morally significant break. One may object to this claim, that the proponents of this view redefine the empirical feature of “the ability to suffer” as a normative feature (is-ought fallacy). It is logically unsound to conclude from the bare fact that the fetus feels pain that it is morally reprehensible or morally prohibited per se to abort the fetus.

f. Unicellular Zygote

Proponents of the extreme conservative view claim that the morally significant break in the biological development of the fetus is given with the unicellular human zygote. They argue that the unicellular zygote is a human person, and thus, it is prohibited to have an abortion because one kills a human being (for example, Schwarz).

The extreme conservative proponents argue that biological development from the fetus to a human being is an incremental process which leaves no room for a morally significant break (liberals deny this line of thinking). If there is no morally significant break, then the fetus has the same high status of a newborn, or the newborn has the same low status of the fetus.

To many opponents of the “extreme” conservative position, it seems questionable to claim that a unicellular zygote is a person. At best, one may maintain that the zygote will potentially develop into a human being. Except the potentiality argument is flawed since it is impossible to derive current rights from the potential ability of having rights at a later time. Opponents (for example, Gert) also object to any attempt to base conclusions on religious considerations that they believe cannot stand up to rational criticism. For these reasons, they argue that the conservative view should be rejected.

g. Thomson and the Argument of The Sickly Violinist

Judith Jarvis Thomson presents an interesting case in her landmark article “A Defense of Abortion” (1971) in order to show that, even if the fetus has a right to live, one is still able to justify an abortion for reasons of a woman’s right to live/integrity/privacy. Thomson’s famous example is that of the sickly violinist: You awake one morning to find that you have been kidnapped by a society of music lovers in order to help a violinist who is unable to live on his own by virtue of his ill-health. He has been attached to your kidneys because you alone have the only blood type to keep him alive. You are faced with a moral dilemma because the violinist has a right to live by being a member of the human race; there seems to be no possibility to unplug him without violating this right and thus killing him. However, if you leave him attached to you, you are unable to move for months, although you did not give him the right to use your body in such a way (Thomson 1984, 174-175).

First, Thomson claims that the right to live does not include the right to be given the means necessary for survival. If the right to live entails the right to those means, one is not justified in preventing the violinist from the on-going use of one’s kidneys. The right to the on-going use of the kidneys necessarily implies that the violinist’s right to his means for survival always trumps the right to another person’s body. Thomson refuses this and claims that “the fact that for continued life that violinist needs the continued use of your kidneys does not establish that he has a right to be given the continued use of your kidneys” (Thomson 1984, 179). She argues that everybody has a right of how his own body is used. That is, the violinist has no right to use another person’s body without her permission. Therefore, one is morally justified in not giving the violinist the use of one’s own kidneys.

Second, Thomson contends that the right to live does not include the right not to be killed. If the violinist has the right not to be killed, then another person is not justified in removing the plug from her kidneys although the violinist has no right to their use. According to Thomson, the violinist has no right to another person’s body and hence one cannot be unjust in unplugging him: “You surely are not being unjust to him, for you gave him no right to use your kidneys, and no one else can have given him any such right” (Thomson 1984, 180). If one is not unjust in unplugging oneself from him, and he has no right to the use of another person’s body, then it cannot be wrong, although the result of the action is that the violinist will be killed.

4. Legal Aspects of the Abortion Conflict

What is the legal status of the fetus (embryo, conceptus, and zygote)? Before the question is answered, one should pay some attention to the issue of the genesis of a legal system. Which ontological status do legal rights have? Where do they come from? Usually we accept the idea that legal rights do not “fall from the blue sky” but are made by human beings. Other conceptions which had been provided in the history of human kind are:

  1. rights rest on God’s will;
  2. rights rest on the strongest person; or
  3. rights rest on a specific human feature like a person’s wisdom or age.

However, let us take the following description for granted: There is a legal community in which the members are legal entities with (legal) claims and legal addressees with (legal) obligations. If someone refuses the addressee’s legal obligation within such a system, the legal entity has the right to call the legal instance in order to let his right be enforced. The main question is whether the fetus (or the embryo, conceptus, zygote) is a legal person with a basic right to live or not and, furthermore, whether there will be a conflict of legal norms, that is a conflict between the fetus’ right to live and the right of self-determination of the pregnant woman (principle of autonomy). Is the fetus a legal entity or not?

a. The Account of Quasi-Rights

It was previously stated that the fetus as such is no person and that it seems unsound to claim that fetuses are persons in the ordinary sense of the notion. If rights are tied to the notion of personhood, then it seems appropriate to say that fetuses do not have any legal rights. One can object that animals of higher consciousness (or even plants, see Korsgaard 1996, 156) have some “rights” or quasi-rights because it is prohibited to kill them without good reason (killing great apes and dolphins for fun is prohibited in most countries). Their “right” not to be killed is based on the people’s will and their basic interest not to kill higher developed animals for fun. But, it would be wrong to assume that those animals are legal entities with “full” rights, or that they have only “half” rights. Thus, it seems reasonable to say that animals have “quasi-rights.” There is a parallel between the so-called right of the fetus and the quasi-rights of some animals: both are not persons in the normal sense of the notion but it would cause us great discomfort to offer them no protection and to deliver them to the vagaries of the people. According to this line of argument, it seems sound to claim that fetuses also have quasi-rights. It does not follow that the quasi-rights of the fetuses and the quasi-rights of the animals are identical; people would normally stress that the quasi-rights of fetuses are of more importance than that of animals.

However, there are some basic rights of the pregnant woman, for example, the right of self-determination, the right of privacy, the right of physical integrity, and the right to live. On the other hand, there is the existential quasi-right of the fetus, that is, the quasi-right to live. If the presumption is right that legal rights are tied to the notion of personhood and that there is a difference between rights and quasi-rights, then it seems right that the fetus has no legal right but “just” a quasi-right to live. If this is the case, what about the relation between the existential quasi-right of the fetus and the basic legal rights of the pregnant woman? The answer seems obvious: quasi-rights cannot trump full legal rights. The fetus has a different legal status that is based on a different moral status (see above). On this view there is no legal conflict of rights.

b. The Argument of Potentiality

Another important point in the debate about the ascription of legal rights to the fetus is the topic of potential rights. Joel Feinberg discusses this point in his famous article “Potentiality, Development, and Rights” (1984, 145-151) and claims that the thesis that actual rights can be derived from the potential ability of having such rights is logically flawed because one is only able to derive potential rights from a potential ability of having rights. Feinberg maintains that there may be cases where it is illegal or wrong to have an abortion even when the fetus does not have any rights or is not yet a moral person. To illustrate his main argument – that rights do not rest on the potential ability of having them – Feinberg considers Stanley Benn’s argument which I slightly modified:

If person X is President of the USA and thus is Commander in Chief of the army, then person X had the potential ability to become the President of the USA and Commander in Chief of the army in the years before his rule.

But, it does not follow that:

The person X has the authority to command the army as potential President of the USA.

Thus, it seems incorrect to derive actual rights from the bare potential ability to have legal rights at a later time. It should be added that Benn – despite his criticism on the argument of potential rights – also claims that there are valid considerations which do not refer to the talk of rights and may provide plausible reasons against infanticide and late abortions even when fetuses and newborns are lawless beings with no personhood.

5. A Pragmatic Account

There is always a chance that women get pregnant when they have sex with their (heterosexual) partners. There is not a 100% certainty of not getting pregnant under “normal circumstances”; there is always a very small chance even by using contraception to get pregnant. However, what does the sphere of decisions look like? A pregnancy is either deliberate or not. If the woman gets deliberately pregnant, then both partners (respectively the pregnant woman) may decide to have a baby or to have an abortion. In the case of having an abortion there may be good reasons for having an abortion with regard to serious health problems, for example, a (seriously) disabled fetus or the endangerment of the woman’s life. Less good reasons seem to be: vacation, career prospects, or financial and social grievances. If the pregnancy is not deliberate, it is either self-caused in the sense that the partners knew about the consequences of sexual intercourses and the contraception malfunctioned or it is not self-caused in the sense of being forced to have sex (rape). In both cases the fetus may be aborted or not. The interesting question concerns the reasons given for the justification of having an abortion.

There are at least two different kinds of reasons or justifications: The first group will be called “first order reasons”; the second “second order reasons.” First order reasons are reasons of justifications which may plausibly justify an abortion, for example, (i) rape, (ii) endangerment of the woman’s life, and (iii) a serious mentally or physically disabled fetus. Second order reasons are reasons of justifications which are, in comparison to first order reasons, less suitable in providing a strong justification for abortion, for example, (i) a journey, (ii) career prospects, (iii) by virtue of financial or social grievances.

a. First Order Reasons

i. Rape

It would be cruel and callous to force the pregnant woman who had been raped to give birth to a child. Judith Jarvis Thomson maintains in her article “A Defense of Abortion” that the right to live does not include the right to make use of a foreign body even if this means having the fetus aborted (Thomson 1984, pp. 174 and pp. 177). Both the fetus and the raped woman are “innocent,” but this does not change “the fact” that the fetus has any rights. It seems obvious in this case that the raped woman has a right to abort. Forcing her not to abort is to remind her of the rape day-by-day which would be a serious mental strain and should not be enforced by law or morally condemned.

However, this assumption would be premature from John Noonan’s viewpoint according to his article “An Almost Absolute Value in History” (Noonan 1970, 51-59). He claims that

the fetus as human [is] a neighbor; his life [has] parity with one’s own […] [which] could be put in humanistic as well as theological terms: do not injure your fellow man without reasons. In these terms, once the humanity of the fetus is perceived, abortion is never right except in self-defense. When life must be taken to save life, reason alone cannot say that a mother must prefer a child’s life to her own. With this exception, now of great rarity, abortion violates the rational humanist tenet of the equality of human lives.

Hence, the woman has no right to abort the fetus even if she had been raped and got pregnant against her will. This is the consequence of Noonan’s claim since he only permits having an abortion in self-defense while Thomson argues that women, in general, have a right to abort the fetus when the fetus is conceived as an intruder (for example, due to rape). But, it remains unclear what Noonan means by “self-defense.” At the end of his article he states that “self-sacrifice carried to the point of death seemed in extreme situations not without meaning. In the less extreme cases, preference for one’s own interests to the life of another seemed to express cruelty or selfishness irreconcilable with the demands of love” (Noonan 1970). On this view, even in the standard case of self-defense — for example, either the woman’s life or the life of the fetus — the pregnant woman’s death would not be inappropriate and in less extreme cases the raped woman would express cruelty or selfishness when she aborts the fetus — a judgment not all people would agree with.

ii. Endangerment of the Woman’s Life

Furthermore, there is no good reason to proceed with a pregnancy when the woman’s life is in serious danger. Potential life should not be more valued then actual life. Of course, it is desirable to do everything possible to rescue both but it should be clear that the woman’s life “counts more” in this situation. To force her at the risk of her life means to force her to give up her right of self-defense and her right to live. There seems to be no good reason to suspend her basic right of self-defense.

iii. Serious Mentally or Physically Disabled Fetuses

It is hard to say when exactly a fetus is seriously mentally or physically disabled because this hot issue raises the vital question of whether the future life of the disabled fetus is regarded as worth living (problem of relativity). Hence, there are simple cases and, of course, borderline cases which lie in the penumbra and are hard to evaluate. Among the simple cases take the following example: Imagine a human torso lacking arms and legs that will never develop mental abilities like self-consciousness, the ability to communicate, or the ability to reason. It seems quite obvious to some people that such a life is not worth living. But what about the high number of borderline cases? Either parents are not entitled to have a healthy and strong offspring, nor are the offspring entitled to become healthy and strong. Society should not force people to give birth to seriously disabled fetuses or morally worse to force mothers who are willing to give birth to a disabled fetus to have an abortion (for example, Nazi Germany). It seems clear that a rather small handicap of the fetus is not a good reason to abort it.

Often radical groups of disabled persons claim that, if other people hold the view that it is all right to abort fetuses with (serious) genetic handicaps, the same people therewith deny the basic right to live of disabled adults with serious handicaps (see Singer debate). This objection is unreasonable since fetuses in contrast to adult human beings have no basic interest in continuing to live their lives. Disabled fetuses may be aborted like other fetuses, disabled (adult) human persons have to be respected like other people.

b. Second Order Reasons

i. A Journey to Europe

With regard to the reasons of justification according to the second group, there is a specific view which is based on the argument that it is the decision of the woman to have an abortion or not.

There is a related view that rests on the assumption of the pregnant woman who claims that the fetus is a part of her body like a limb so that she has the right to do what ever she wants to do with the fetus. The argument is wrong. The fetus is certainly not a simple part of the pregnant woman but, rather, a dependent organism that relies on the woman.

The following example, the journey to Europe from North America, is based on the feminist argument but it is somewhat different in stressing another point in the line of argumentation: A young woman is pregnant in the seventh month and decides to make a journey to Europe for a sight-seeing tour. Her pregnancy is an obstacle to this and she decides to have an abortion. She justifies her decision by claiming that it will be possible for her to get pregnant whenever she wants but she is only able to make the journey now by virtue of her present career prospects. What can be said of her decision? Most authors may feel a deep discomfort not to morally condemn the action of the woman or not to reproach her for her decision for different reasons. But, there seems only two possible answers which may count as a valid basis for morally blaming the woman for her decision: First, if the young woman lives in a moral community where all members hold the view that it is immoral to have an abortion with regard to the reason given, then her action may be morally reprehensible. Furthermore, if the (moral) agreement is enforced by law, the woman also violated the particular law for which she has to take charge of. Second, one could also blame her for not showing compassion for her potential child. People may think that she is a callous person since she prefers to make the journey to Europe instead of giving birth to her almost born child (seventh month). If the appeal to her mercy fails, one will certainly be touched by her “strange” and “inappropriate” action. However, the community would likely put some informal pressure on the pregnant woman to influence her decision not to have an abortion. But some people may still contend that this social pressure will not change anything about the fact that the fetus has no basic right to live while claiming that the woman’s decision is elusive.

ii. Financial and Social Reasons

A woman got pregnant (not deliberately) and wants to have an abortion by virtue of her bad financial and social background because she fears that she will be unable to offer the child an appropriate life perspective. In this case, the community should do everything possible to assist the woman if she wants to give birth to her child. Or, some may argue, that society should offer to take care of her child in special homes with other children or to look for other families who are willing to house another child. According to this line of thinking, people may claim that the financial or social background should not be decisive for having an abortion if there is a true chance for help.

c. First Order Reasons vs. Second Order Reasons

There is a difference between the first order reasons and the second order reasons. We already saw that the first order reasons are able to justify an abortion while the second order reasons are less able to do so. That is because people think that the second order reasons are weaker than the reasons of the first group. It seems that the human ability to show compassion for the fetus is responsible for our willingness to limit the woman’s basic right of autonomy where her reasons are too elusive. However, one may state that there are no strong compulsive reasons which could morally condemn the whole practice of abortion. Some people may not unconvincingly argue that moral agreements and legal rights are due to human beings so that reasons for or against abortion are always subjective and relative. According to this view, one is only able to contend the “trueness” or “wrongness” of a particular action in a limited way. Of course, there are other people who argue for the opposite (for example, Kantians, Catholic Church). One reason why people have strong feelings about the conflict of abortion is that human beings do have strong intuitive feelings, for example, to feel compassion for fetuses as helpless and most vulnerable human entities. But moral intuitionism falls short by being a valid and objective basis for moral rights.

In the end, it is a question of a particular moral approach whether one regards an abortion as morally justifiable or not. But not every approach is justified. There is no anything goes.

6. Public Policy and Abortion

One of the most difficult issues is how to make a sound policy that meets the needs of most people in a given society without focusing on the extreme conservative view, or the extreme liberal view, or the many moderate views on the conflict of abortion. The point is simple, one cannot wait until the philosophical debate is settled, for maybe there is no one solution available. But, in fact, people in a society must know what the policy is; that is, they have to know when and under what circumstances abortion is permitted or altogether prohibited. What are the reasons for a given policy? Do they rest on religious beliefs or do they depend on cultural claims? Whose religious beliefs and whose cultural claims? Those beliefs and claims of most people or of the dominant group in a given society ? What about the problem of minority rights? Should they be respected or be refused? These are hard questions; no one is able to yet give a definite response.

But, of course, the problem of abortion has to be “solved,” at least, with regard to practical matters. This means that a good policy does not rest on extreme views but tries to cover as many points of views, although being aware of the fact that one is not able to please every person in society. This would be an impossible task. It seems that one should adopt a moderate view rather than the proposed extreme views. This is not because the moderate view is “correct” but because one needs a broad consensus for a sound policy. The hardliners in the public debate on the conflict of abortion, be they proponents or opponents, may not be aware of the fact that neither view is sustainable for most people.

A sound way for governments with regard to a reasonable policy could be the acceptance of a more or less neutral stance that may function as a proper guide for law. But, in fact, the decisive claim of a “neutral stance” is, in turn, questionable. All ethical theories try to present a proper account of a so-called neutral stance but there is hardly any theory that could claim to be sustainable with regard to other approaches. However, the key seems to be, again, to accept a middle way to cover most points of views. In the end, a formation of a policy seeks a sound compromise people could live with. But this is not the end of the story. One should always try to find better ways to cope with hard ethical problems. The conflict of abortion is of that kind and there is no evidence to assume otherwise.

7. Clinical Ethics Consultation and Abortion

The vital issue of how one chooses whether or not to have an abortion is of utmost importance since people, in particular women, want to have a proper “guideline” that can support them in their process of ethical decision-making. According to pregnant women, the most crucial point seems not to be whether abortion is morally legitimate or not but, rather, how one should deliberate in the particular case. In fact, observations regularly show that women will nearly have the same number of abortions in contexts in which it is legal or not.

Gert is right in claiming that “the law can allow behavior that some people regard as morally unacceptable, such as early abortion, and it can prohibit behavior that some people regard as morally acceptable, such as late abortion. No one thinks that what the law decides about abortion settles the moral issue” (Gert 2004, 138). But what follows from that? What aspects should one consider and how should one decide in a particular case?

It would be best to consult a neutral person who has special knowledge and experiences in medicine and medical ethics (for example, clinical ethics consultation). Most people are usually not faced with hard conflicts of abortion in their daily lives and get simply swamped by it; they are unable to determine and evaluate all moral aspects of the given case and to foresee the relevant consequences of the possible actions (for example, especially with regard to very young women who get pregnant by mistake). They need professional help without being dominated by the person in order to clarify their own (ethical) stance.

However, the conflict of abortion as such may not be solvable, in the end, but the experienced professional is able to provide persons with feasible solutions for the particular case.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Boonin, David (2002), A Defense of Abortion Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Boylan, Michael (2002), “The Abortion Debate in the 21st Century” in Medical Ethics, ed. Michael Boylan. Upper Saddle River, NJ: Prentice Hall.
  • Chadwick, Ruth, Kuhse, Helga, Landman, Willem et al. (2007), The Bioethics Reader. Editor’s Choice Oxford: Blackwell Publishers.
  • English, Jane (1984), “Abortion and the Concept of a Person,” in: The Problem of Abortion, 151-161.
  • Feinberg, Joel (1984), “Potentiality, Development, and Right,” in: The Problem of Abortion, 145-150.
  • Feinberg, Joel (1984), The Problem of Abortion, Belmont: Wadsworth.
  • Gauthier, David (1986), Morals by Agreement, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Gert, Bernard (2004), Common Morality. Deciding What to Do, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Gillespie, Norman (1984), “Abortion and Human Rights,” in: The Problem of Abortion, 94-102.
  • Gordon, John-S. (2005), “Die moralischen und rechtlichen Dimensionen der Abtreibungsproblematik,” in: Conjectura, 43-62.
  • Hoerster, Norbert (1995), Abtreibung im säkularen Staat, Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp.
  • Hobbes, Thomas (1996), Leviathan, Ed. Richard Tuck Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Korsgaard, Christine (1996), The Sources of Normativity, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Noonan, John T. (1970), “An Almost Absolute Value in History,” in: The Morality of Abortion: Legal and Historical Perspectives, Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 51-59.
  • Noonan, John T. (1970), The Morality of Abortion: Legal and Historical Perspectives, Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Schwarz, Stephen (1990), Moral Questions of Abortion, Chicago: Loyola University Press.
  • Singer, Peter (1993), Practical Ethics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Sumner, Wayne (1980), Abortion and Moral Theory, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Thomson, Judith J. (1984), “A Defense of Abortion,” in: The Problem of Abortion, 173-188.
  • Tooley, Michael (1983), Abortion and Infanticide, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Warren, Mary A. (1984), “On the Moral and Legal Status of Abortion,” in: The Problem of Abortion, 102-119.
  • Warren, Mary A. (1997), “Abortion,” in: A Companion to Ethics, Oxford: Blackwell Publishers, 303-314.

Author Information

John-Stewart Gordon
Email: john-stewart.gordon@rub.de
Ruhr-University Bochum