Aesop’s Fables

With the possible exception of the New Testament, no works written in Greek are more widespread and better known than Aesop’s Fables. For at least 2500 years they have been teaching people of all ages and every social status lessons how to choose correct actions and the likely consequences of choosing incorrect actions. However, because the fables do not fit the model of philosophy that would be developed later by thinkers like Plato and Aristotle and their successors, they are often disregarded by philosophers; and because they are regarded as having been written for children and slaves, they are often not taken seriously as a source of information about practical ethics in ancient Greece.

In order to provide some context for the fables themselves, after a brief introduction the first part of this article discusses the Life of Aesop, a pseudo-biographical text about the fables’ legendary author. Next, the article considers the form and content of fables, and how these limit what the fables can do while also providing opportunities that other forms of communication do not. Finally, the article looks at some specific fables and the messages that can be taken away from them, in order to demonstrate the kinds of ethical principles that the ancient Greeks conveyed using this kind of philosophizing—and which are still present in the fables that are read and recited around the world today.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. The Life of Aesop
  3. Aesopic Fable as a Kind of Philosophy
  4. Philosophical Values in Aesopic Fable
    1. The Strong and the Weak
    2. Friends and Enemies
    3. Intelligence/Foolishness
    4. Overambition/Failure
    5. Truth/Honesty/Lies/Deceit
    6. Gods
    7. Reciprocity
    8. Women, Family, Love
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

This article talks about the fables under consideration as “Aesopic” fables to show that they are attributed to Aesop while also being clear that Aesop is not necessarily their actual author. The ancient Greeks believed that there had once been a man named Aesop who was the originator of the fable and author of its earliest examples, and it became traditional to attribute all fables to him, just as Americans currently tend to attribute any clever remark to Mark Twain. However, there are at least two problems with this view of Aesop as the creator and author of fables. First, there is very little evidence to suggest that Aesop ever existed. This is not surprising, given that he allegedly lived during the sixth century B.C.E., centuries before the Greeks who were writing down his fables were born; and there is very little surviving evidence from that era about anything. In addition, the ancient Greeks were not scrupulous about historical detail—if something should have been written or said or done by a particular person, then they attributed it to that person. (For example, the Athenians attributed many laws to Solon, which are documented as being enacted well after his death.) There is a surviving pseudo-biography of Aesop that is discussed below, not for its historical accuracy or value, but in order to bring out some of the beliefs that the Greeks had about the kind of person who should have written the fables, because, as was noted above, these beliefs tell us something important about the fables themselves. Second, we know that Aesop could not have been the originator of the fable form because fables predate the Greek civilization of which he was supposed to have been a part by many centuries. Their origins are lost, in part, because they were orally transmitted for an unknown period of time before being written down, but (as has been said) stories that are clearly recognizable as fables have been found in tablets written in ancient Sumeria.

2. The Life of Aesop

Even though Aesop probably never existed, it is helpful in understanding how the ancient Greeks thought about the fables to understand who Aesop was thought to have been, and how he was thought to have lived his life. We can reasonably assume that the “life story” of the inventor of the fables developed along the lines that would have been found most compatible with what the Greeks thought the fables were. Therefore, by learning what the Greeks thought about the author of the fables, we can expect to learn something about what they thought about the fables themselves.

So, who was Aesop to the ancient Greeks? We know that Aesop was widely known in the ancient Greek world. We find references to him and his life in Herodotus, Plato, Aristotle, and Aristophanes, and while those references may not be historically accurate, they do show that the audiences for the works of these four men (a historian, two philosophers, and a comic playwright), which would have included citizens from a wide range of social classes, knew who Aesop was and could be expected to respond to references to him in predictable ways. It also shows that he was well known and important enough for these authors to decide that he was worth including in their writings in the first place, and this can only be because his life and fables were believed to be useful cultural material and worthy of attention.

Setting aside the references mentioned above, an extended account of Aesop’s life can be found in the pseudo-biographical Life of Aesop, which is believed to have been written in roughly the 2nd cn. C.E., although much of it is a compilation of older stories that were part of oral tradition (for example, the Life of Ahiqar). The details of his life, although they may be entirely fictional, are important because while today we tend to draw sharp distinctions between how a philosopher does their job and how they live their life, in ancient Greece and Rome this was much less the case. The philosopher was expected to live their life according to their principles, and accordingly what one did (or was believed to have done) had a real impact on how their philosophy was received. Therefore, Aesop’s life can be seen as an embodiment of the principles he lives by, and vice versa: we can learn about fables through the ”biography” of the person who wrote them, whether or not Aesop ever actually existed. Rather than analyzing the entire text in detail, this article will offer a short summary, and then look in more detail at four especially salient aspects of his life. First, he was said to have begun his life as a slave; second, he is said to have been extremely ugly—as though he were not entirely human; third, he begins his life unable to speak; and, finally, his rise from slavery to greatness also leads to his destruction. As we will see, each of these qualities mark him as being on the boundary between human beings and the other animals that feature so prominently in Aesop’s fables.

Several versions of the Life of Aesop have survived the centuries, and while they have differences, they are the same in broad outline. Aesop, we are told by the unnamed author, was a slave from Samos, a Greek island in the Northern Aegean. He had a number of distinctive traits. He was remarkably ugly, and is frequently compared to animals in terms of his appearance. He was born mute, entirely unable to speak, which is another trait usually associated with animals, who can make sounds but cannot make words or speeches. However, he was also remarkably intelligent and resourceful. This is illustrated by an incident early in the Life in which he is successfully able to defend himself from a false accusation of eating stolen figs by getting the slaves who were the actual culprits to unwillingly reveal their guilt even though he is unable to tell the master what has happened. Aesop does this by drinking warm water and vomiting, which reveals that he had not recently eaten figs. He then gets their master to make the other slaves drink warm water and vomit, which leads to them vomiting up the evidence. He is spared, and they are beaten. He is also pious: One day he helps a priestess of the goddess Isis who has strayed from the road and become lost, and Isis and the Muses repay him for his help by “conferring on him the power to devise stories and the ability to conceive and elaborate tales in Greek.” (The version of the Life used in this article is the one found in Daly’s book referenced below. It is probably the most widely available source of the Life). Shortly after this the slave overseer realizes that if Aesop can speak, he is in a position to convincingly relate the overseer’s abuse of slaves and other wrongdoing to the master. (Since the other slaves, who can speak, have not already reported the overseer, we are already being made aware that there is something exceptional about Aesop’s insistence on being well treated – as though he were a human and not an animal).

The overseer is able to get a slave dealer to pay him a pittance and take Aesop away, but when the dealer takes Aesop to the slave market to sell him, he is at first unable to find a buyer because Aesop is so ugly. The slave dealer is eventually able to sell him, for almost nothing, to the philosopher Xanthus. (There is a connection here, which may be intentional, between Aesop and speaking animals. In Homer’s Iliad at XIX.400, it is a horse named Xanthus who is briefly given the power of speech by Hera in order to reply to Achilles’ demand that his horses do a better job of keeping him from harm than they had done with Patroclus). The next section of the Life describes Aesop’s activities while a slave of Xanthus, and in a number of different episodes Aesop demonstrates that he is in fact wiser than his master—that although he is legally a slave and has no formal education, when it comes to wisdom, cleverness, and proper use of language, the qualities that philosophers like Xanthus claim make them superior to other human beings (and to the animals), Aesop is in fact the master. In all of these episodes, Aesop is not merely showing off his superiority. All of his efforts are turned toward gaining his freedom, but largely due to Xanthus’ arrogance and dishonesty they always fall short. It is not until Xanthus’ fellow citizens call on him to free Aesop so that Aesop may interpret a portent of the future (which Xanthus has promised to interpret before realizing he is not able to do so and being driven to the brink of suicide) before a meeting of the Assembly that Aesop is finally freed (Aesop having helpfully (and ironically) advised them that it is not proper for a slave to address free men in the Assembly). After Aesop correctly interprets the portent, he gains fame and fortune, skillfully solves problems and riddles for famous and powerful figures, and occasionally tells fables along the way. However, in the end it is his very success that leads to his ruin. Although he is successful in his service to the king of Babylon, so much so that the king raises a golden statue in his honor, Aesop decides to travel to Delphi. On the way, he visits many cities and demonstrates his wisdom, receiving payment from cities whose citizens have been impressed by these demonstrations. But when he does the same at Delphi, the people there do not give him any reward for his performance. In return, Aesop mocks the Delphians as being like driftwood, which seems like something worthwhile at a distance but is revealed to be worthless when seen up close. He goes further and tells them that it is not surprising that they are worthless, because their ancestors were slaves (apparently forgetting that he himself was once a slave). The Delphians are outraged by his abuse, hide a golden cup from the temple of Apollo in his luggage, arrest him as he leaves town for allegedly trying to steal it, and sentence him to death. He is unable to persuade them not to kill him, and in the end he is either thrown off of a cliff by the Delphians or, in another tradition, jumps from the cliff himself instead of dying at their hands. The Life ends by noting that the Delphians were afflicted by a famine for killing Aesop and were subsequently punished by the Greeks, Babylonians, and Samians.

What can we take away from this story about what fables are and how they were regarded in ancient Greece? First, it is widely accepted that attributing authorship of the fables to a slave means that the messages of the fables were primarily intended for slaves, or that they were created by slaves, or both. Why would slaves be thought to be particularly appropriate as the creators and audience for animal fables? Two arguments, which are not mutually exclusive, have been put forward. First, many authors have noted that fables allow for the possibility of hidden messages. They allow slaves to tell stories to one another about the cruelty of slavery and how its effects can be mitigated or evaded, without communicating in a way that will get them caught and punished by their masters. The fables can also provide messages about how to successfully survive in a world in which the odds are stacked against you. (Another example of this would be the Uncle Remus stories, which allowed African-Americans to criticize and make fun of whites, as well as share advice about how to survive, without suffering unwanted consequences). Second, it is important to recall that as an ugly slave, unable to speak, Aesop himself is on the boundary between human and animal at the beginning of his life. His slave status would by itself mark him as being on this boundary. Athenians commonly referred to slaves as “boy”—they had no individual identities, like the animals in the fables (and, in fact, slaves were also sometimes called “andropodon,” man-footed animal, related to the word “tetrapodon,” four-footed animal, used to describe cattle). And slaves, like animals, were considered unable to speak in that they had no legal identities—they could not represent themselves in public because speaking in public is a characteristic of human beings (hence Aesop’s insistence that if he is to speak freely to the Samian Assembly in interpreting the portent he must have his freedom). So, fables, which so often feature animals in order to teach lessons to humans, are believed to have been invented by an author who is himself on the border of the animal and the human. It is only once he reaches the pinnacle of fame, wealth, and influence—when he has left his beginnings as almost more animal than human behind and moved from the low end of the human hierarchy to the high end—that he makes the errors in judgment that lead to his death in Delphi. His life story reinforces a significant theme in the fables: that of being unable to change one’s nature and status—although he succeeds for a time, his destruction ultimately comes as a result of these changes. For an example of a fable with a similar message, see Gibbs 327 (Perry 123).

In addition, Aesop’s biography shows us that the fables are related to the animal side of human beings. It is all well and good for Aristotle to suggest that the happiest life is one spent in pure intellectual contemplation or for Plato to tell us that the best life is one spent pursuing knowledge about the Forms of the good and the just and the beautiful, but for most people this kind of philosophy is unavailable, because they do not have the resources to pursue academic philosophy. For some few, linking the human to the divine is an enticing intellectual activity; most of us are closer to the animal than the divine and will benefit more from advice that is framed accordingly. For such people, fables which bring the animal and the human together will be much more valuable than Platonic or Aristotelian philosophy, because fables are focused on practical and embodied philosophy rather than the theoretical and abstract.

3. Aesopic Fable as a Kind of Philosophy

The word “fable” comes from Latin. It ultimately means “story” and is derived from the word fari which simply means “to speak.” Theon famously called it “a false discourse depicting the truth.” Although not all fables are about animals—humans, plants, inanimate objects, and the gods all make appearances—animals certainly predominate, and understanding what fable is requires understanding something about why animals have such a prominent role in them. (Indeed, if we remember that fables were, for a long time, written down on animal skins, it would be fair to say that the ancient fables would not exist if not for animals, either intellectually or physically.)

It’s important to keep in mind that animals were much more important as a part of the life of ancient Greeks than they are for most people in the Western world in the twenty-first century. As they are for many of us today, animals were sources of food and clothing and companionship for the Greeks. However, for the Greeks, they were in addition forms of transportation and conveyance, entertainment, and prestige; they were valued as hunting animals, were used in war, were sources of personal protection, and were an important part of sacrificial rituals linking the human, animal, and divine. Since animals were so deeply involved with their day-to-day physical life, it makes sense that the Greeks would incorporate them into their intellectual life as well. Animals live in a variety of different locations, sometimes in herds and sometimes alone; they engage in a wide range of behaviors and act differently in different settings. Often it would seem to be a simple matter of selecting the right animal in order to evoke a particular understanding of the setting and motivations for the participants in the fable. This allows the author to suggest or imply a lot of backstory in a format which is partially defined by its brevity. So, whereas establishing that a human character is clever might take considerable effort, if the author chooses a fox as one of the characters in the fable, then cleverness is already established as a trait for that character. Similarly, it takes less time to say “this fable is about a mouse” than to establish the timidity of a particular human being.

Of course, stories about animals are only useful lessons for human beings if human beings have traits in common with other animals. For the analogy between human beings and other animals to hold up, human beings must be understood as being a kind of animal themselves. There is a fable that makes this point:

Following Zeus’s orders, Prometheus fashioned humans and animals. When Zeus saw that the animals far outnumbered the humans, he ordered Prometheus to reduce the number of the animals by turning them into people. Prometheus did as he was told, and as a result those people who were originally animals have a human body but the soul of an animal. (Perry 240)

Animals in fable do have one significant difference from animals in the real world as the Greeks saw them: they have the ability to speak, which in the real world is restricted to human beings. (There is disagreement today about whether or not animals can speak, as well as what it means to be able to speak in the first place, but those debates need not concern us here.) Aristotle is perhaps the best-known exponent of this view, as he says in Book 1 of the Politics. Connected to their inability to speak is the inability to reason (the word logos captures both meanings); Aristotle says at Metaphysics 1.1: “The animals other than man live by appearances and memories, and have but little of connected experience; but the human race lives also by art and reasonings.” And at Nicomachean Ethics X.8, he explains that animals do not partake in contemplation and so cannot be said to be happy. Only if someone can make a conscious choice can their actions be in accordance with happiness and virtue (thus Aristotle also indicates that children (and, presumably, slaves) cannot be happy, because they lack the adult ability to make choices). By giving other animals the ability to speak, the fables blur the lines between humans and those other animals, making it easier for humans to learn from the stories fables tell.

With regard to form, fables have a number of distinguishing characteristics: they are usually very short, typically only a few sentences long; they lack any specific setting in time or place; they typically (although not always) involve animals, who are not named or described; the main character acts so as to bring about some outcome, usually through conflict with another character, but often fails to achieve what they intend to do; finally, the character typically makes some kind of a statement acknowledging where they went wrong and accepting the consequences of their error (which can be anything up to and including death). On the one hand, these characteristics limit what the fable can convey. There is no plot, there is no character development, there is typically only one action, and there does not even need to be any dialogue. On the other hand, the characteristics of the form of fable are perfectly suited for widespread oral transmission, which was for centuries the only way in which they were or could be transmitted, and they continued to be transmitted in that way even after the development of widespread literacy, as indeed they still are today. Their simplicity makes them memorable and helps give them their power. Although the fables lack abstraction, they provide a rich stock of philosophical resources for people who are in need of practical philosophical principles to be used in their day-to-day life. The simplicity of the fable is not a sign of the ignorance or limited abilities of the author or the audience; indeed, the opposite is true because creating an effective fable requires stripping the action and language of the story down to the bare minimum needed to convey the truth it seeks to convey.

Lester Hunt says that “though this sort of speech [fable] is not characteristic of philosophy as we know it, that may be because it represents a form of argument that does not seem to be well suited to serve certain purposes that philosophers characteristically pursue, and not because it fails to be an argument” (Hunt 371). In part, it does not serve those purposes because it pre-dates Socrates, who is seen as the first philosopher in the Western tradition, and Plato, who did more than anyone to fix the boundaries of Western philosophy and to define what it was. As presented by Plato, Socrates was deeply interested in the definitions of words. He wanted to know the answers to questions like “What is justice?” and “What is piety?” and these kinds of questions are what many people associate with philosophy to this day. These questions and others like them are indeed not well suited to the form and content of the fables. As has been said, the fables serve to illustrate the consequences of certain kinds of behavior. Their message is practical rather than theoretical, and simple rather than complex. In the Platonic dialogues, Socrates rejects examples of behavior as suitable definitions for words: a list of actions that are just or pious is not the same as a definition of justice or piety, and Plato’s Socrates insists that we cannot reliably come up with examples of a virtue unless we are able to give an accurate definition of what that virtue is. This would seem to exclude fables from the category “philosophy” because they are specific individual examples of behavior and consequences and not concerned with creating systems or defining terms. (It is worth noting here that Socrates himself often uses myths and other stories, such as the Ring of Gyges in Republic, to advance his philosophical arguments.)

But Socrates is only the founder of philosophy if one accepts that philosophy is the thing that Socrates was the first person to do. If one believes, as Socrates apparently did, that one reason to examine one’s life is to be able to be more self-aware, or to live more happily or successfully, then the earlier traditions of wisdom literature such as Aesopic fables which aim at these goals should certainly count. Fables may not be able to tell you about the Form of Justice, but they can suggest some likely consequences of unjust behavior; they may not be able to define Virtue and Vice, but they can give you some examples of what these things look like and suggest for which of the two should be chosen in particular situations and what the outcome of that choice is likely to be. It is true that they are not suitable for complex forms of reasoning or logic, or extended argument—but why should these set boundaries on what we believe philosophy is or does? Hunt adds that: “Because of the limitations of [fable]—that is, that it must be a short, simple narrative making a clear and memorable point that can reach a wide audience—its interest tends to be overwhelmingly practical” (Hunt 379). This does not, however, make fables less philosophical, especially for the Greek audience that they were originally addressed to. Aristotle tells us that the purpose of practical knowledge (by which he means knowledge about ethics and politics) is to enable people to act properly. Leading people to act properly may sometimes require complicated arguments, but it does not mean that only complicated arguments are philosophy.

In addition, fables deliver their messages through analogy, which is a recognized form of philosophical argument. Not every fable does this, but then not every dialogue is a Platonic dialogue—the form allows, but does not compel, philosophical meanings. Perhaps the best starting point for a consideration of how fables worked as analogies can be found in Book II, Chapter 20 of Aristotle’s Rhetoric, where he discusses how they can be used effectively in persuading people to take political action:

Fables are suitable for addresses to popular assemblies; and they have one advantage—they are comparatively easy to invent, whereas it is hard to find parallels among actual past events. You will in fact frame [fables] just as you frame illustrative parallels: all you require is the power of thinking out your analogy, a power developed by intellectual training.

That is, the speaker shows that the situation the assembly currently faces is similar to a situation described by fable, and shows what happens to the characters in the fable, leaving it to the audience to conclude that if they want a different outcome they must act differently than the characters in the story they have just heard (or, if they want the same outcome, they must act in the same way). This requires the audience to actively take part in constructing the argument: they have to analyze the fable, analyze the current situation, determine whether and how they are similar, and come up with a conclusion regarding how they ought to act. The speaker does not tell the listeners how to act; instead, they leave it to the listeners to reach their own conclusions about the right thing to do—which, again, fits with the methods of practical philosophy.

The listeners can then carry the fable with them in their minds—since fables are written to be short and memorable—so that it can be used in other situations. Someone who knows a lot of fables can probably find one to fit any situation—but in order to use the fable effectively, they must be able to choose the appropriate one for the particular situation they are in. For example, is this a situation which calls for determination and persistence, such as that exhibited by the tortoise in the race with the hare? Or is it a situation which calls for someone to recognize that the goal is unattainable and to walk away, as when the fox realizes that the grapes are not within his reach and decides that they must be sour anyway? Again, the fable’s value as an analogy is dependent on the ability of the person using it to properly determine what the appropriate analogy is and what the fable tells that person about the situation they find themselves in. This practice of reflection seems worthy of being described as philosophical activity in this person.

That analogy can be used within other kinds of philosophy and not just fables can be shown with reference to Plato. Socrates also frequently uses analogy as a form of argument, perhaps most famously in the Apology. For example, after he gets his accuser Meletus to say that out of all the Athenians, only Socrates makes the young men worse, and he responds thusly:

I am very unfortunate if that is true. But suppose I ask you a question: Would you say that this also holds true in the case of horses? Does one man do them harm and all the world good? Is not the exact opposite of this true? One man is able to do them good, or at least not many; the trainer of horses, that is to say, does them good, and others who have to do with them rather injure them? Is not that true, Meletus, of horses, or any other animals?

And Meletus agrees. From this Socrates concludes that Meletus is wrong in his accusation of Socrates and is not even taking the trial seriously—anyone who thought things through would easily see that, just as only a few know how to improve horses, only a few would know how to make human beings better. Of course, as many people have noted, this may not be a good analogy. Knowing when an analogy applies and when it does not is an important part of taking it seriously and using it properly. Whether this is a valid analogy or not is not important for our point here, which is that it is a form of argument requiring the listener’s active participation in reaching the correct ethical and political judgment about Socrates’ guilt or innocence. And, of course, in the Republic, Socrates offers his famous cave analogy as a way of explaining the nature of human existence. So Plato is willing to use analogy within the realm of higher philosophy when it seems to be the most effective way to communicate what he is trying to explain.

Perhaps the best statement regarding the content of fables is that of Zafiropoulos, who says that fable offers an “exemplary and popular message on practical ethics and which comments, usually in a cautionary way, on the course of action to be followed or avoided in a particular situation” (Zafiropoulos 1). Practical ethics for the Greeks, as exemplified in the writings of Aristotle, was considered an aspect of politics and political education, so that we can see the fables as not only philosophy but political philosophy, telling people not only how they should live but how they should live together, what to expect from other people if they behave in certain ways, how to have successful social interactions, and so on. In this way the fables can be regarded as similar to Greek plays and epic poetry. Both the plays and the epic poems offer examples of fictional characters conducting themselves in particular ways and the consequences of their conduct so that the audience can learn from their choices (and, most significantly, their mistakes). Raaflaub says with regard to the oral tradition of the epic poems of Homer that “It was important not only to the community but also to the elite to propagate positive patterns of behavior and to illustrate the disastrous consequences of negative ones” (Raaflaub 565). Fables had the same function, while being more accessible to everyone in the community.

4. Philosophical Values in Aesopic Fable

The message (or messages) of a particular fable depend on where it is found. If it is located within a particular story, it will derive its message from the story in which it is found, although even then it may have more than one meaning. If it stands on its own, or is found in a collection of fables, its meaning becomes even more fluid. Nevertheless, if we look at the early fable collections, there do seem to be particular themes that emerge.

Many authors have discussed the themes to be found in the fables; what follows draws on the list found in Morgan, Chapter 3, but similar themes can be found in, for example, Zafiropoulos. Gibbs’ collection of the fables organizes them along thematic lines as well, although her categories differ from the ones given below. Included with each category is an example fable, which will be used to show the way in which the fables generally deal with the topic. Also included is the fable number from Laura Gibbs’ edition of the fables, as well as the Perry number, which is the standard reference number for each fable. The text of each fable is copied from Gibbs’ edition, as found on her website. Taken together, the fables provide a useful set of principles for conducting oneself appropriately according to ancient Greek moral beliefs.

a. The Strong and the Weak

Gibbs 131. The Hawk and the Nightingale
Perry 4 (Hesiod, Works and Days 202 ff.)

This is how the hawk addressed the dapple-throated nightingale as he carried her high into the clouds, holding her tightly in his talons. As the nightingale sobbed pitifully, pierced by the hawk’s crooked talons, the hawk pronounced these words of power, “Wretched creature, what are you prattling about? You are in the grip of one who is far stronger than you, and you will go wherever I may lead you, even if you are a singer. You will be my dinner, if that’s what I want, or I might decide to let you go.”

Perhaps the predominant theme in fable is also the oldest. It can be found in the first recorded fable in the Aesopic fable tradition, from Hesiod’s Works and Days (which significantly pre-dates the supposed dates for Aesop’s life). There is some disagreement about the lesson to be taken from this fable, but it seems clear that the opposition is between the strength of the hawk and the words of the nightingale, who has nothing but words to counter that strength. It is the classic statement of “might makes right,” and those who have little power of their own must necessarily learn this lesson quickly and well. In the poem, Hesiod goes on to claim that the exercise of unjust power is wrong and that Zeus will punish it. Whether or not this is true, it is clear that the thought of future divine punishment will not necessarily deter the strong or protect the weak.

b. Friends and Enemies

Gibbs 70. The Lion and the Mouse
Perry 150 (Ademar 18)

Some field-mice were playing in the woods where a lion was sleeping when one of the mice accidentally ran over the lion. The lion woke up and immediately grabbed the wretched little mouse with his paw. The mouse begged for mercy, since he had not meant to do the lion any harm. The lion decided that to kill such a tiny creature would be a cause for reproach rather than glory, so he forgave the mouse and let him go. A few days later, the lion fell into a pit and was trapped. He started to roar, and when the mouse heard him, he came running. Recognizing the lion in the trap, the mouse said to him, “I have not forgotten the kindness that you showed me!” The mouse then began to gnaw at the cords binding the lion, cutting through the strands and undoing the clever ingenuity of the hunter’s art. The mouse was thus able to restore the lion to the woods, setting him free from his captivity.

The theme here in some ways qualifies the previous example, as sometimes those who seem to be powerless turn out to have more power than one might expect. Although the mouse is weak, the lion’s decision to free the mouse ends up working in his favor in the end, as the mouse repays one kindness with another. There is no way to know in advance who might be able to help you in the future, and so it pays to show kindness and benefit others in the hope of future reciprocity.

c. Intelligence/Foolishness

Gibbs 434. The Man and the Golden Eggs
Perry 87 (Syntipas 27)

A man had a hen that laid a golden egg for him each and every day. The man was not satisfied with this daily profit, and instead he foolishly grasped for more. Expecting to find a treasure inside, the man slaughtered the hen. When he found that the hen did not have a treasure inside her after all, he remarked to himself, “While chasing after hopes of a treasure, I lost the profit I held in my hands!”

Here we have the stereotypical example of foolishness: someone who has a good situation but does not properly appreciate it and, in trying to get still more, loses what they have. Throughout the fables, foolish decisions are punished, often by death. Intelligence, on the contrary, gets a good reputation in the fables. Those who are smart, or at least clever, can turn situations to their advantage—as, for example, in Gibbs 104/Perry 124, “The Fox and the Raven,” in which the fox is able to steal dinner from the raven by the crafty use of flattery. They can also sometimes use their intelligence to find ways to protect themselves from those who have superior power and strength, as in Gibbs 18/Perry 142.

d. Overambition/Failure

Gibbs 342. The Jackdaw and the Eagle
Perry 2 (Syntipas 9)

There was a jackdaw who saw an eagle carry away a lamb from the flock. The jackdaw then wanted to do the very same thing himself. He spied a ram amidst the flock and tried to carry it off, but his talons got tangled in the wool. The shepherd then came and struck him on the head and killed him.

This fable and others like it illustrate the importance of not overreaching. In a society such as the majority of ancient Greek cities, which were extremely hierarchical and which did not allow for social mobility, trying to become more than what one is by nature or birth is a strategy not for climbing to the top but for being destroyed. It is this that arguably destroys Aesop in the Life of Aesop: though a slave by birth, he ends up aspiring to be the adviser of kings, and in the end, his change of status leads him to Delphi and thereby to his death.

e. Truth/Honesty/Lies/Deceit

Gibbs 117. The Wolf and the Sleeping Dog
Perry 134 (Chambry 184)

A dog was sleeping in front of the barn when a wolf noticed him lying there. The wolf was ready to devour the dog, but the dog begged the wolf to let him go for the time being. “At the moment I am thin and scrawny,” said the dog, “but my owners are about to celebrate a wedding, so if you let me go now, I’ll get fattened up and you can make a meal of me later on.” The wolf trusted the dog and let him go. When he came back a few days later, he saw the dog sleeping on the roof. The wolf shouted to the dog, reminding him of their agreement, but the dog simply said, “Wolf, if you ever catch me sleeping in front of the barn again, don’t wait for a wedding!”

This fable provides a nicely Machiavellian lesson about promising one’s enemies whatever is necessary while they have you at a disadvantage and then abandoning those promises when the conditions that made you promise no longer exist. Conversely, the lesson may be that when you are in a position of advantage over an enemy, you should not be too quick to accept their promises about their future behavior.

f. Gods

Gibbs 481. Heracles and the Driver
Perry 291 (Babrius 20)

An ox-driver was bringing his wagon from town and it fell into a steep ditch. The man should have pitched in and helped, but instead he stood there and did nothing, praying to Heracles, who was the only one of the gods whom he really honoured and revered. The god appeared to the man and said, “Grab hold of the wheels and goad the oxen: pray to the gods only when you’re making some effort on your own behalf; otherwise, your prayers are wasted!”

The gods do not appear especially frequently in the extant fables, but when they do appear they are usually there to either reward appropriate conduct (or punish inappropriate conduct), or else to serve to remind people that prayers without effort generally do no good. As the Christian proverb has it, “God helps those who help themselves.” Greek religion provides a wider selection of deities, but reaches a similar conclusion.

g. Reciprocity

Gibbs 167. The Murderer and the Mulberry Tree
Perry 152 (Chambry 214)

A robber had murdered someone along the road. When the bystanders began to chase him, he dropped the bloody corpse and ran away. Some travellers coming from the opposite direction asked the man how he had stained his hands. The man said that he had just climbed down from a mulberry tree, but as he was speaking, his pursuers caught up with him. They seized the murderer and crucified him on a mulberry tree. The tree said to him, “It does not trouble me at all to assist in your execution, since you tried to smear me with the murder that you yourself committed!”

This is an unusual fable in that it features not a talking animal but a talking plant. However, the lesson is not an uncommon one: if you attempt to harm others, they will undoubtedly respond in kind. The fable of the lion and the mouse quoted above would also fit here, as the lion’s kindness is repaid by reciprocity on behalf of the mouse.

h. Women, Family, Love

Gibbs 496. The Thief and His Mother
Perry 200 (Chambry 296)

A boy who was carrying his teacher’s writing tablet stole it and brought it triumphantly home to his mother who received the stolen goods with much delight. Next, the boy stole a piece of clothing, and by degrees he became a habitual criminal. As the boy grew older and became an adult, he stole items of greater and greater value. Time passed and the man was finally caught in the act and taken off to court where he was condemned to death: woe betide the trade of the thief! His mother stood behind him, weeping as she shouted, “My son, what has become of you?” He said to his mother, “Come closer, mother, and I will give you a final kiss.” She went up to him, and all of a sudden he bit her nose, tugging at it with his teeth until he cut it clean off. Then he said to her, “Mother, if only you had beaten me at the very beginning when I brought you the writing tablet, then I would not have been condemned to death!”

Violence and death are commonplace in the fables, but this one is unusual for the graphic depiction of the violence. Nevertheless, it provides a clear example of how mothers ought to behave: they need to provide clear moral guidance to their children (perhaps through the use of instructive fables?), lest the wayward child turn into a criminal as an adult.

5. Conclusion

This article has described what fable is and the characteristics of the man who was allegedly its inventor in order to make the case that the form and content of Aesopic fable as it existed in ancient Greece were philosophical in nature and taught those who learned the fables valuable moral and intellectual lessons for survival. Although fable is not well suited to complicated or abstract arguments, its brevity and use of argument by analogy provides useful food for thought for those who are looking for simple, effective, and memorable moral principles by which to guide their behavior. Fable is therefore well suited to deliver practical life-lessons that can be applied by anyone who is able to think through their situation and draw on the appropriate fable and the lesson that it teaches. In the Greek world, those lessons were oriented toward the day-to-day lives of people who were often in positions of powerlessness and low status, but even for those who were higher on the socioeconomic ladder, fables could provide valuable instruction. In the modern world, as communications become shorter and more immediate (such as Twitter, Facebook, and other social media), we may see a renaissance of the fable form, although of course the lessons it will communicate in today’s world may be very different from those of ancient Greece.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Adrados, Francisco Rodriguez. History of the Graeco-Latin Fable. Vols. 1 and 3. Leiden, NL: Brill, 2003.
  • Arnheim, M. T. W. “The World of the Fable.” Studies in Antiquity 1979–1980, 1–11.
  • Blackham, H. J. The Fable as Literature. London: Athlone Press, 1985.
  • Carnes, Pack. Fable Scholarship: An Annotated Bibliography. New York: Garland Publishing, Inc., 1985.
  • Compton, Todd. Victim of the Muses. Cambridge, MA: Center for Hellenic Studies, 2006.
  • Daly, Lloyd. Aesop Without Morals. New York: Thomas Yoseloff, 1961.
  • Hägg, Tomas. “A Professor and His Slave: Conventions and Values in The Life of Aesop.” In Conventional Values of the Hellenistic Greeks, edited by Per Bilde, Troels Engberg-Pedersen, Lise Hannestad, and Jan Zahle. Aarhus, DKs: Aarhus University Press, 1997.
  • Holzberg, Niklas. The Ancient Fable: An Introduction. Translated by Christine Jackson-Holzberg. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2002.
  • Hunt, Lester. “Literature as Fable, Fable as Argument.” Philosophy and Literature 33:2 (2009): 369–385.
  • Katsadoros, George C. “Aesopic Fables in the European and the Modern Greek Enlightenment,” Review of European Studies 3:2, 2011.
  • Kurke, Leslie. Aesopic Conversations. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2011.
  • Lignell, David. Aesop in a Monkey Suit: Fifty Fables of the Corporate Jungle. New York: iUniverse, 2006.
  • Lissarrague, François. “Aesop, Between Man and Beast: Ancient Portraits and Illustrations.” In Not The Classical Ideal, edited by Beth Cohen, 132–149. Leiden, NL: Brill, 2000.
  • Morgan, Teresa. Popular Morality in the Early Roman Empire. New York: Cambridge University Press, 2007.
  • Nagy, Gregory. The Best of the Achaeans. Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1979.
  • Noonan, David C. Aesop & the CEO: Powerful Business Insights from Aesop’s Ancient Fables. Nashville, TN: Thomas Nelson, 2005.
  • Papademetriou, I. -Th. A. Aesop as an Archetypal Hero. Athens: Hellenistic Society for Humanistic Study, 1997.
  • Patterson, Annabel. Fables of Power: Aesopian Writing and Political History. Durham, NC: Duke University Press, 1991.
  • Perry, B. E. Aesopica. Vol. 1. Urbana: University of Illinois Press, 1952.
  • Perry, B. E. Babrius and Phaedrus. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1965.
  • Perry, B. E. Studies in the Text History of the Life and Fables of Aesop. Chico, CA: Scholars Press, 1981.
  • Pervo, Richard. “A Nihilist Fabula: Introducing the Life of Aesop.” In Ancient Fiction and Early Christian Narrative, edited by Ronald F. Hock, J. Bradley Chance, and Judith Perkins. Atlanta: Scholars Press, 1998.
  • Plato. Phaedo. Translated by C. J. Rowe. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1993.
  • Plato. Apology.
  • Raaflaub, Kurt A. “Intellectual Achievements.” In Raaflaub, Kurt A., and Hans van Wees, A Companion to Archaic Greece. New York: Blackwell Publishing, 2009.
  • Short, Jeremy C., and David J. Ketchen Jr. “Teaching Timeless Truths through Classic Literature: Aesop’s Fables and Strategic Management.” Journal of Management Education 29 (2005): 816–832.
  • Van Dijk, Gert-Jan. Ainoi, Logoi, Mythoi: Fables in Archaic, Classical, and Hellenistic Greek Literature. Leiden, NL: Brill, 1997.
  • Winkler, John J. Auctor and Actor. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1985.
  • Zafiropoulos, Christos A. Ethics in Aesop’s Fables: The Augustana Collection. Leiden, NL: Brill, 2001.


Author Information

Edward W. Clayton
Central Michigan University
U. S. A