Taste is the most common trope when talking about the intellectual judgment of an object’s aesthetic merit. This popularity rose to an unprecedented degree in the eighteenth century, which is the main focus of this article. Taste became a major concept in aesthetics. This prominence was so pronounced that it might seem that taste as an aesthetic idea developed from nothing during this time. However, the roots for theories of taste stretch back, as many things do, to Plato and Aristotle. In talking about the human soul, for example, Aristotle emphasized the role the senses play in obtaining knowledge and making judgments. As a condition for sentient beings, touch is the main component of taste, since the tongue must touch what it tastes. So, the idea that taste can be used to make judgments was present early on, as the embryonic idea for the more robust theories of taste.
Though it is no secret that theories of taste thrived in the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries, it might still be surprising because of the new intellectual focus. Science and the higher faculties of reason received a greater emphasis, while Alexander Baumgarten began using the word aesthetics to refer to the lower faculties of judgment. Why these lower faculties came to be so popular is unusual in the wake of the scientific developments and ideas of the day. But these philosophers realized there was something in common experience when confronted with beauty that they didn’t understand. Perhaps, people began to believe that humans really are the measure, since they were making these new intellectual advancements. And the ability to judge beauty would become more important, as they believed their judgments were more accurate or substantial. However, they still did not agree about the specifics of the judgments. For David Hume, taste is a subjective feeling with a standard found within the beholders. For Alexander Gerard, taste is an act of the imagination. For Immanuel Kant, taste is subjective, but beautiful objects present themselves as having universal appeal. And this is just a smattering of the different ideas.
Despite this strong beginning, the importance of taste dropped out of most theories of aesthetics by the twentieth century. Yet on a popular level, people continue to refer to good and bad taste in what are meaningful exchanges. Many subsequent philosophers have tried to develop a more involved theory of gustatory taste as a branch of aesthetics. Though this might have its own value, taste in the more traditional sense has not completely faded away, even though people do not any longer devote as much time to theories of taste.
Table of Contents
- Early Foundations for Taste: Ancient to Medieval Philosophers
- Why Taste Became the Metaphor for Aesthetic Judgment
- Eighteenth Century Philosophers: The Century of Taste
- Nineteenth and Twentieth Century Philosophers: The Step Away from Taste
- Contemporary Philosophy and Beyond
- References and Further Reading
1. Early Foundations for Taste: Ancient to Medieval Philosophers
Theories of taste did not explicitly come to the forefront until the eighteenth century; however, most of the foundational ideas were in place many years prior. The focus was more on beauty and truth rather than on what the beholder felt about a given work. These ideas came to influence the theories of later thinkers as they revitalized, revised, and responded to the writings of these early Greek and medieval philosophers. Here, just a cursory glance of these preliminary thoughts will be reviewed.
a. Plato and Aristotle
Plato, Aristotle, and the other ancient Greeks did not have any specific notion of taste as a means of aesthetic judgment. However, many of their ideas inspired the later developments of theories of taste. Plato’s metaphysical beliefs, especially his view of the perfect forms, had an acute influence on the later Neoplatonists, even on those who did not specifically believe in a realm of the Forms. The traditional understanding of Plato holds that there is a heavenly realm where the perfect Forms of reality exist. Whether or not Plato believed in a literal realm of Forms is open for discussion, but it seems clear that he believed in perfect versions of everything we experience on earth. These Forms are like the templates of reality, and reality is therefore less perfect than these Forms. For instance, the Form of Beauty is the standard by which all other beautiful things are measured. Necessarily, all of the particular things are less beautiful than this perfect Beauty. To reach this higher Beauty, one must rise up to it through a dialectical method, as Socrates learned from Diotima in Symposium. Almost like ascending stairs, one uses the lower beauties of the world to climb up to the higher realms. To explain, we start with physical beauty, move to intellectual beauty, and then arrive at spiritual (or perfect) beauty. More could be said about Plato’s overall view of aesthetics and beauty, but it is important to note here simply that the apprehension of the beautiful is connected with knowledge. As one obtains knowledge, one continues to learn more of beauty. So, knowledge is the key component to developing a better appreciation of beauty and, for Plato, arriving at Beauty itself.
Aristotle, like Plato, did not have a concept of taste per se. The quest was to uncover the principles of beauty. Rather than believing real beauty existed in another world, Aristotle wrote that beauty was a property of objects; it was related to their size and proportion. Though Aristotle did not develop a system of aesthetics as such, he is the first on record to have developed an extended treatment about one of the arts, namely poetry. Since this is the main art that Plato criticized in the Republic, one might wonder whether this was Aristotle’s attempt to further distinguish his own system of philosophy.
While Plato’s view is that Beauty has the same nature but with different degrees in different objects, Aristotle seems to hold the idea that beauty’s nature varies with the different objects (or types of art) in which it is found. Therefore, the beauty of an object might relate to that object’s purpose, though he never directly says so. More important to Aristotle’s view are the concepts of form and unity. As form and unity are necessary for knowledge in the strict sense, so they also provide a kind of knowledge in art as an object imitates something else. While Plato believed that art diminishes the knowledge of something to an almost unrecognizable degree, Aristotle holds that the imitation helps the idea become simpler and therefore more easily understood. The imitation can actually be a useful, sometimes necessary, step in obtaining knowledge. And the imitation, though not always complete, is correct. Rather than rising to some higher forms of beauty beyond this physical world, Aristotle seems to have a more experiential approach to discovering and judging beauty. Each kind of thing has its own form and therefore its own beauty. To develop what we might call aesthetic judgment, though Aristotle does not use that expression, one would have to observe enough samples of different objects of the same kind to discover the order and arrangement proper to those things. Both Aristotle and Plato have beauty located outside of human experience, so taste would have been the search for beauty in things.
Plotinus, the most recognized Neoplatonist, developed his metaphysical philosophy around three principles: The One, Intellect, and Soul. Following earlier philosophers’ attempts to derive the more complex things from the simple, Plotinus posits the One as the simplest first principle of everything else, and everything is derived (or emanates) from this first principle. The One is even more foundational for reality than Plato’s Forms, without which the Forms would have no unifying principle. The second principle, Intellect, is where the other Forms reside, so to speak. These Forms, like in Plato’s view, are what give everything else their respective properties. The third principle, Soul, is the principle of desire for those things that are external to the individual. Plotinus, like Plato, posits degrees of beauty, with the lowest being physical beauty, leading up to the Beauty present in the Intellect.
Likely influenced by the ideas in Diotima’s speech in Plato’s Symposium, we begin our ascent from physical beauties until we climb up to the highest Beauty. Where he might differ from Plato is in the hierarchy of beautiful things. Presumably, Plato thought natural things were more beautiful than artifacts because they were closer to the Forms of those things. However, Plotinus claims that the manipulation of a natural object through art made it more beautiful. To demonstrate, Plotinus uses an example of two stones: one is naturally occurring and the other has been wrought by an artist into the image of a god. Which one is more beautiful? Plotinus thinks it is clear that the one that has been imbued with the soul of a human artist has achieved a higher degree of beauty. The soul of the spectator can enjoy this object more than the natural stone because he recognizes the work of a like soul. As one ascends toward Beauty, the goal is to rely less on the senses, though they are the necessary condition for beginning the ascent. It seems for Plotinus that taste is not necessarily developed or reasoned about. Rather, it is almost like a reaction in the soul, based on the knowledge that the soul possesses.
c. Augustine and Aquinas
Medieval philosophers were concerned with metaphysical properties like beauty more than any notion of individual preference or taste. This was partly because beauty, for most of the philosophers of this time, was an objective property. There wasn’t any room for disagreement about whether something was actually beautiful, though they presumably debated about whether one’s particular knowledge about the beauty of an object was correct. It was widely believed that the true, the good, and the beautiful were linked to each other. Talking about any one of these concepts involved overlapping discussions of the other two. For instance, theories of beauty consisted of some discussion about its relation to the true and good. For present purposes, the main two representatives of the early and later middle ages will be discussed: Augustine and Aquinas (See also the article on Medieval Theories of Aesthetics).
Continuing the basic ideas of Plato, Augustine thought perfect beauty existed in God rather than the impersonal realm of the Forms. In fact, God is the highest beauty, and everything participates in beauty because everything is created by God. In physical objects, Augustine believed two primary attributes made those things beautiful: equality and unity. Unity is found in everything that exists, but equality (proportion or symmetry) is not necessarily found in everything, especially those things made by people. Augustine provides an example that shows we at least aim for equality in our work: If you want to put two windows on the side of a house, you do not want one to be gigantic and the other tiny. You want them to be the same size, assuming the wall is an even rectangle. For Augustine, the judgment of beauty is founded upon a person’s apprehension of the unity and equality of an object. And this involves reason, which isn’t that different from previous thinkers who thought knowledge was a necessary aspect of grasping beauty. The standard of beauty is in God’s mind, so the beholder must come to understand this standard through some divine illumination. Without God’s help, a person might see vaguely the beauty of an object, but it is God alone who can help the beholder grasp the fullness of beauty. Though Augustine does not have a theory of taste, we might say that one’s taste is perfected the closer one is aligned with God.
Unlike Augustine, Aquinas adheres more carefully to the overall philosophical views of Aristotle rather than Plato, though Plato’s influence is not absent. Finding beauty present in physical objects, Aquinas famously asserts that beauty is that which pleases when seen. It might appear that Aquinas’s definition asserts a subjective understanding of beauty; namely, whatever pleases the onlooker becomes beautiful. However, the word seen implies contemplation of the object. Once again, knowledge comes into the apprehension of the beautiful. Aquinas’ view of beauty differs from the platonic view in that beauty is really present in the object, though similar to Augustine’s view, beauty is still God, who is the ultimate cause of all beauty.
Recall that Augustine offered two main traits of beautiful things: equality and unity. Similarly, Aquinas presents us with three conditions of beauty: proportion, wholeness, and radiance. Proportion involves symmetry but is not limited to this one aspect. It involves whether there is an overall balance achieved in the object. Wholeness (or integrity) is the condition that involves the degree to which something attains its proper form. For example, a dancer sitting down is less beautiful—as a dancer—than when he or she is actually dancing. The last condition, radiance, is the most evasive. It might just be, for Aquinas, the most important condition because objects might have proportion and be whole yet still not be radiant. Generally speaking, it is that quality of an object that makes us want to perceive it again. It involves the way an object “shines” before the beholder. For Aquinas, perceiving the beauty in an object is not passive; it is an activity of the intellect. Like judging the truth of a proposition, a judgment of beauty begins with cognition. Then, the beholder makes a judgment based on these three conditions. Taste, if Aquinas had a theory, might be the ability to recognize these three universal conditions in their specific instantiations.
2. Why Taste Became the Metaphor for Aesthetic Judgment
We have mentioned briefly the basic ideas that created the foundation for theories of taste, but we still need an explanation as to why taste became the metaphor for aesthetic judgment. The sense of taste, in ancient times, was connected with the appetite, not with rational judgments. Seeing and hearing provide the most information and thus were considered the best senses for gaining knowledge. The other three senses simply help round out that knowledge. Therefore, it would have been natural to assume that seeing and hearing are also the best senses for pronouncing a judgment of beauty or sublimity. After all, these two senses were thought to be necessary for making intelligent judgments. But it was taste that became the main faculty for making aesthetic judgments, especially for the 18th century philosophers. Of course, it was not literal tasting, but metaphorical, that was at work here. Because of this, some posited a sixth, internal sense that they referred to as taste. Still, one might wonder why taste suddenly emerged as the metaphor for making judgments about beauty. Though there is no exact reason why taste rose to this prominent role, there are a couple of ideas about it worth mentioning here.
In the Aristotelian tradition, taste is connected strongly with the sense of touch. Though he maintained five senses as we do today, Aristotle considered whether there might only be four. It is necessary for the tongue to touch food, for example, for the food to be tasted. In the middle ages, this became more significant as different tastes were believed to elicit healing and nutrition on the body. It was believed that different flavors held different properties for the body, and a mixture of flavors was necessary in order to maintain healthy balance. Flavor was not accidental in different foods. Thus, good taste, in the sense of diet, was necessary for one’s physical well-being.
In the later middle ages, taste was occasionally related to the term honest by referring to objects as, for example, an honest painting. This description might seem unusual since honesty is often connected with truth. And we consider honesty describing only a being with a will to choose, because one has to decide to be honest in a given situation. An inanimate object cannot make such a choice. Calling an object honest, however, was a reflection on the viewer or, more specifically, ideal type of viewer. Basically, an honest object is one that an honorable person would consider to be beautiful. It would be an object that is well suited for its purpose. This idea is connected with the belief that the good and beautiful are related, so of course, the good person is better suited to apprehend the beauty of an object. Taste was recognized as the sense associated with the ability to discriminate, namely flavors. But taste also became the metaphor for discriminating or judging the beauty of an object.
3. Eighteenth Century Philosophers: The Century of Taste
Theories of taste sprung up in the eighteenth century, which is why George Dickie refers to it as “the century of taste,” which is also the name of his book. Everyone had to contribute something to the discussion, and then it seemed to die down as quickly as it had arisen. Prior to this century, most of the discussion centered on theories about beauty, which was deemed objective, but now philosophers began to look more toward themselves to understand their reactions and preferences to such things in both art and nature. This shift began their theorizing about taste, which turned the discussion toward the subjective. And then, a century later, this discussion transformed into theories about the aesthetic attitude.
a. Joseph Addison
Joseph Addison (1672-1719) did not present a systematic treatment of aesthetics, but he did promise and deliver original ideas spread throughout his essays for the Spectator in 1712. Specifically, Addison set out to investigate the pleasures of the imagination. The first essay in this series of eleven is devoted to taste. He writes that most languages employ the metaphor of taste to indicate the faculty of the mind that distinguishes between faults and perfections in writing. This faculty of mental taste (which involves the perception of beauty), like that of sensitive (or physical) taste, has degrees of refinement. So Addison was trying to help those in the middle-class utilize their brief moments of leisure for these kinds of pleasures of imagination. The pleasures of cognition, which involve intellectual thought, might not be possible for some people who have lesser intelligence or lack access to education. But the pleasures of the imagination—eyesight furnishes the ideas here—are just as good and are more easily obtained. After all, every image, says Addison, enters our minds through sight.
Addison asserts that taste is a person’s psychological response to literature. Though his remarks are mostly framed in the context of literature, Addison’s basic ideas became the foundation for people’s thoughts about other kinds of art and nature. Even though the faculty of taste is present in people at birth, it must still be cultivated to be brought to its fullest ability to judge. This should not be surprising, because the same is true for the sensitive taste. Putting something in one’s mouth enables the sensation of taste to work quite automatically. But it can take years of experience and practice to develop a sensitive taste refined enough to detect the subtle differences between two glasses of whisky.
The pleasures of the imagination are found in two types. Following Locke, Addison maintains that no images enter one’s mind without going through the sense of sight. The primary pleasures come directly from the visual objects, which are present to the observer. The secondary pleasures arrive from those objects that are remembered or fictitious, being only in the mind (at least at the present moment). A person, through imagination, can manipulate or alter the images that are in the mind. The aesthetic pleasure arises solely through the contemplation of these ideas or those images in the mind. These pleasures of the imagination are greater than sensual pleasure and are as great as the cognitive pleasures. They have at least one advantage over the cognitive pleasures—the pleasures of the imagination are much easier to obtain because one has to simply open one’s eyes.
b. Anthony Cooper, Third Earl of Shaftesbury
Anthony Cooper (1671-1713), the Third Earl of Shaftesbury (usually just called Shaftesbury), started his thoughts on aesthetics from Neoplatonic metaphysics. Shaftesbury developed his belief that taste was inborn in human beings, an idea perhaps similar to recollection in Plato. For anyone reading Shaftesbury, it becomes clear early on that he is not interested in developing a “system” of aesthetics. His thoughts cycle through his narrative, especially in his work “The Moralists.” Woven throughout these works are many important ideas that Shaftesbury does not always fully develop but were still highly influential to those writing after him.
Shaftesbury maintains that people grasp beauty and goodness in exactly the same way, which involves the moral sense. The beautiful is closely related to virtue in his thinking; hence, moral theory permeates most aspects of Shaftesbury’s understanding of aesthetics. One’s sensibility in the realm of morality is intertwined with one’s apprehension of beauty. Not only does he borrow from Neoplatonism, but Shaftesbury also emphasizes experience, showing elements of empiricism in the development of his ideas. He holds that forms of the beautiful and good are embedded in people’s minds, but each person has an internal (moral) sense to which he or she can appeal. These two attitudes provide tension among the characters—Theocles and Philocles—in his prose as they seek to sort out opinions concerning taste. It was likely this interplay of contrary ideas that led Shaftesbury to utilize the prose style where he told a story of a group of people having discussions about taste and beauty. This style invites the reader into the discussion, similar to Plato’s use of dialogue.
The key aesthetic property is harmony, which is found in nature as created by God. Seeing God as the ultimate artist, Shaftesbury extends aesthetic appreciation to the natural world as the ultimate aesthetic object. An important part of Shaftesbury’s belief is that the moral sense allows a person to comprehend an object’s beauty immediately, without the need to use reason. Intuition is at work here more than sensation. Obviously, the object is initially perceived by the senses, but then it is immediately judged by the internal (or moral) sense.
Though it seems possible for variation among different people’s internal senses, Shaftesbury did not think that aesthetic judgments were relative. He believed in a universal standard of judgment for beauty. Philocles claims that an inward eye immediately differentiates the fair and admirable from the deformed and foul. This ability must be natural, since it differentiates as soon as objects are perceived by the senses. If the ability to discriminate (through one’s taste) between beauty and ugliness is immediate, then taste cannot have its ultimate grounding in the process of reason, which takes time. Experience affirms the immediacy of one’s judgments concerning objects of perception. For example, being captivated by a sunset usually does not require more than a glance to draw the viewer in. Therefore Shaftesbury, through Theocles, maintains that taste cannot have its ultimate source in discursive reasoning.
Some things can block people or cloud their minds from being able to make sound judgments. Even though taste resides innately in human beings, passions and ignorance prevent one’s internal sense from successfully comprehending beauty in sensible things. Shaftesbury acknowledges that one cannot escape these obstacles; however, one can learn to control them in order to avoid being tossed around by one’s whimsical feelings. The internal sense connects goodness and beauty for Shaftesbury; therefore, one can allow beauty to affect oneself more fully by cultivating a virtuous or harmonious life. Someone deprived of virtue will be less able to perceive beauty than one who lives a virtuous life.
Theocles declares several times that beauty and good are the same thing, which the inward eye enables people to immediately perceive. Then, the beauty and goodness of these objects are compared to the innate concept of harmony. It seems that the closer they are to this notion of harmony, the more beauty they are judged to possess, remembering that this happens without reasoning about the object. The same would also apply to one’s judgment about the actions of others, whether they are noble or evil. When one builds good foundations of “order, peace, and concord,” then one is able to immediately connect with beauty. The reverse is also true: if one is unable to experience the beautiful, then it is indicative that one’s life is disharmonious. Philocles raises an interesting objection to Theocles’ schema. He wonders why there are so many different people believed to be virtuous, yet their actions are often conflicting. Theocles agrees that seemingly virtuous people differ in their opinions about heroes and whether gardens or paintings are better. These differences create tension when seeking which opinions should have authority. Shaftesbury is vague on this point: It seems he is trying to claim that happiness is the measure of a successful life. And virtue, which leads to success and happiness, is the prerequisite for developing taste to comprehend beauty. In the end, it seems that the individual is responsible for his or her own happiness and has to make decisions accordingly. If there are different, even contrary, examples of a virtuous life, then it seems difficult to know whether one is actually living the virtuous life and able to apprehend beauty to a fuller degree. But he still maintains that a developed sensibility allowing one’s innate taste to have full play is the result of guiding oneself toward a moral life with happiness as the standard of measure.
c. Francis Hutcheson
Francis Hutcheson (1694-1746) started from a Lockean view of sensation, which is divided into simple and complex ideas and primary and secondary qualities. With that foundation and his belief in a moral sense, Hutcheson also posits an innate and internal sense that was necessary for perceiving beauty. One reason for this view is exemplified by the fact that some people’s external senses are fully functioning, yet they find no enjoyment in the arts. If their five senses are working properly, then the hindrance must come from another sense. Moreover, there are things like mathematical or logical theorems that are deemed beautiful, but they are perceived by the mind and not the five senses. Finally, as further proof, Hutcheson notes that beauty is perceived immediately and does not require any knowledge; people make aesthetic judgments quite instantly. So, for Hutcheson the ability to grasp beauty must be another, internal “sense.
The internal sense—Hutcheson does not clearly define it—is a mental faculty that functions much like one of the five senses. However, it recognizes beauty in both sensuous and mental experiences, which makes it sufficiently distinct. Hutcheson holds a complementary place to Shaftesbury in the development of the idea of innate taste. Hutcheson also blends his aesthetic theories with his moral theories, and both contexts allow for innate elements in human beings. Like an external sense, this internal sense is natural and is not governed by one’s will. Hutcheson points out that the will does not determine whether an object causes pain or pleasure. It is a natural instinct to pull one’s hand away upon touching something hot. Experiencing some objects causes pleasure, while other objects inevitably cause pain. As an analogy, Hutcheson demonstrates that pleasure in artistic objects—architecture, painting, musical composition, and so on—is also innate and necessary. Though he finds the faculty of taste to be an internal sense, Hutcheson explains that the pleasure arises out of the harmony, order, and design of the object. But he does not think that simple ideas, like color, sound, or mode of extension, can provide the same pleasure.
Concerning taste, Hutcheson believed that beauty represents the idea, while the sense of beauty represents our ability to grasp this idea. The combination—one’s ability to perceive beauty internally—is what he refers to as taste. When perceiving beauty, we should note that Hutcheson proposes a distinction between absolute (or original) beauty and comparative (or relative) beauty. Objects have absolute beauty when they are beautiful in themselves without a comparison with any other object. Comparative beauty, on the other hand, is grounded in the comparison between the object of the perception and the object that it imitates.
Beauty, for Hutcheson, is mostly comparative, which means it would not exist without relating to the mind of a perceiver. Objects play their part by exciting in people feelings of beauty when there is “uniformity amidst variety,” which is the primary property of beauty. When the uniformity is multiplied, then the beauty increases. For example, an equilateral triangle has less beauty than a square, while a perfect hexagon has more beauty than both of them. On the other side, more uniformity enhances the beauty when variety is multiplied. For example, a square is more beautiful than a rhombus. This uniformity with variety triggers the internal (and innate) sense of taste in human beings, causing them to apprehend the beauty of the object. External things only contribute by relating to this internal sense, causing it to activate feelings of pleasure. This activation of pleasure notifies observers that they are experiencing something that is beautiful.
d. Moses Mendelssohn
As a committed rationalist, Moses Mendelssohn (1729-1786) did not want to rely on emotional responses for aesthetic experiences. He was dedicated to the principles of Leibnizian metaphysics. Mendelssohn’s goal of understanding the world could only come from rational principles applied to reality. The rationalists advanced the notion that clear and distinct ideas are present when one understands the interconnectedness of things. Taste also falls under the rationalist scheme and is something acquired and developed rather than an internal sense that is natural. Since clear and distinct ideas are not easily realized, Leibniz suggests that most of our knowledge consists of clear and confused ideas. Clear ideas arise from an object that is distinguishable in a sense perception, but they can be confused (that is, not distinct) because their contents are not distinguishable. Clear and confused ideas usually result when one knows the whole and not the parts, that is, the interconnectedness of the parts is not known.
In “On Sentiments,” Mendelssohn presents a series of letters, written by Theocles, that was a reaction to Shaftesbury who had a character with the same name. Mendelssohn believed that views like Shaftesbury’s, though freethinking, lacked the rigor necessary for precision. Mendelssohn’s Theocles admits that when someone does not have the requisite experience of beauty, it was likely from lack of preparation. Theocles claims that he prepares himself to experience beauty, and this preparation is necessary for the experience. It might be similar to a runner stretching before running a race. People ready themselves in many different contexts, so it should not seem odd to prepare for an aesthetic experience. Mendelssohn’s Theocles explains that he actually prepares to experience something pleasurable by initially striving to perceive it distinctly. Making a transfer from parts to whole, the distinct ideas fade out into the background and become confused. Since it is necessary for the whole to be present to the senses at once, the universe can only be a beautiful object for the mind of God. Hence, the finitude of mankind prevents objects too massive or too miniscule from being perceived as beautiful.
Mendelssohn describes some criteria for explaining why an object is effective at presenting a perfection or an imperfection, which aids in apprehending beauty. He describes three proportions that act on our impulses: (1) the proportion to the magnitude of the good, (2) the proportion to the magnitude of our insight, and (3) the proportion to the time required to consider this good. The first proportion relates to perfection, implying that things which possess a higher degree of perfection are more pleasing to the mind. The second one relates to knowledge: the more distinct one’s knowledge is of something, then the more impact that thing has on the individual. The last proportion requires more explanation. It relates to the speed of the perception. The less time it takes to perceive a perfection, then the more pleasant is the knowledge of that object. Something that can be perceived quickly might produce greater desire in the perceiver than something that is more perfect. By learning to see things clear and confused, that is, the whole but not the parts, one can learn to perceive more quickly. One learns to train the soul through habit and practice; the goal is to become so trained that an action no longer requires thought (or at least requires less thought). Practice and intuitive knowledge are the two main ways to increase the speed of one’s thoughts. Practice involves constantly reviewing things, such as inferences in practical philosophy until it becomes ingrained in one’s mind. Intuitive knowledge entails continually learning to apply the practiced inferences to concrete situations. In terms of aesthetic experience, one learns through reason things that are supremely beautiful by being often exposed to beauty. Eventually, one practices and applies taste through the instrument of reason until it becomes embedded, and it will eventually function without thought.
Mixed sentiments—those combining pleasure and displeasure—are another indicator of Mendelssohn’s belief that taste is acquired. Sympathy is the primary example Mendelssohn employs to illustrate the notion of mixed sentiments. Sympathy expresses love for an object, while also being discontent at the object’s or person’s misfortune. He demonstrates this idea using examples from drama. When a tragedy is about to occur, the audience can appreciate the ability of the actors, directors, and writers to make them feel terror; however, the audience is not afraid for themselves but the characters who are about to suffer. The interesting thing about mixed sentiments is that they penetrate more deeply and vividly into one’s mind than any type of pure pleasure. Like learning to recognize the three proportions, habit is also required to develop an understanding of the mixed sentiments. One must practice utilizing mixed sentiments to discover and experience beauty and sublimity.
Mixed sentiments lead Mendelssohn into thoughts on perceptions and one’s reaction. An extremely large object that we could think about as a whole but could not comprehend in person causes a mixed sentiment of gratification and trembling if we continue to think about it. As examples, he suggests the depths of the ocean, a desert stretching out to the horizon, or the seemingly endless stream of stars in the sky. One feels euphoric, a pleasing nausea. Pure pleasure will eventually breed boredom induced from monotony, but mixed sentiments will overpower one’s senses, making one want to perceive it again and again. Mixed sentiments and training the mind are two important facets of Mendelssohn’s understanding for how people develop or acquire taste.
e. Johann Gottfried Herder
Johann GottfriedHerder (1744-1803) shared the notion of reasoned or developed taste with Mendelssohn. He deviated from Mendelssohn by grounding everything in nature, while Mendelssohn was a staunch advocate of Leibnizian metaphysics, grounding everything in reason. It might seem that a belief in the supremacy of nature would lead one to the view of innate taste, like the view held by Shaftesbury. However, Herder does not begin with innate ideas like those in the Platonist school; he places more emphasis on discovering and developing an ability to perceive beauty. Herder adds a step to Mendelssohn’s view, rather than opting for innate taste. Mendelssohn basically believed that reason develops taste, while Herder believed that nature leads to reason, which then leads to taste. In commenting on the natural aspect of taste, Herder explicitly claims that truth and beauty are disclosed through the use of reasons. When one is induced by reasons, then one will naturally expect everyone to accept the same reasons as evidence of truth or beauty. He was well aware that not everyone would actually agree with the same type of reasoning concerning the beauty of a given object. He merely asserts that it is natural to expect (or want) others to be in agreement.
People tend to have differing views about what counts as beautiful or ugly, and it is important for Herder’s view that this occurrence be explained. Dealing with people’s differences of opinion is one of Herder’s distinguishing characteristics. He was very interested in the way that diverse people develop and come to think and act in distinct ways from other people, and he points out the fact that taste changes throughout time and from place to place. He links this change, as well as others, with culture and upbringing. Everyone, according to Herder, possesses an aesthetic nature, which is one’s capacity to apprehend beauty through the senses. This aesthetic nature is the starting point for each person, but it develops in different ways depending on one’s culture, background, and experience. For example, if someone immerses oneself completely in the art of music, then one will be exceptionally trained to hear the melody of music. At the same time, this person might be ill-equipped to perceive visual beauty because one’s eyes might not be as well trained as one’s ears. Nature has equipped everyone with similar capacities to perceive beauty, but each person is responsible for developing these capacities. On the other hand, people are restricted by how much their society and environment have contributed to developing their tastes as a whole. Beauty is not always obvious in every culture, but Herder claims that it is always present, at least in a foundational way. Utilizing one’s reason and overcoming one’s background are necessary for developing good or refined taste.
f. Alexander Gerard and Archibald Alison
Much like Hutcheson, Alexander Gerard (1728-1795) and Archibald Alison (1757-1839) built their theories of taste upon a foundation of Locke’s notion of ideas. They each developed from this foundation views of taste called associationism—a view that the mind (or imagination) relates ideas that are similar to each other or conjoined by custom or experience. Even though their theories differed in degree, there is enough overlap to list them together.
Gerard believed that taste was a kind of internal sense similar to the external senses. Like those five senses, experiences for this one were also simple and immediate. As soon as something comes into your field of vision, the sense of sight perceives it immediately. Likewise, as soon as beauty—or another aesthetic property—enters into your perception, you can immediately experience its beauty. Gerard divided up his study into seven principles of the internal sense (or powers of the imagination), not only a sense of beauty like Hutcheson. The seven principles are novelty, sublimity, beauty, imitation, harmony, oddity (humorousness), and virtue. This may seem like a curious list for contemporary theories of aesthetic taste, but Gerard’s association theory makes sense of these principles.
Taste, for Gerard, is a kind of critical perception, which he calls relishing. It went beyond simply perceiving an object. Anyone who ingests food can taste it in the most primal sense of the term. But to discern differences and subtleties requires a whole other set of abilities. The pleasure is derived from the seven categories because they require moderate difficulty to formulate or comprehend this new idea. Basically, the new object is associated to previous ideas in the mind of the perceiver, and this is an act of the imagination. Rather than being a mere feeling, the imagination follows rules to make these associations. Strong passions conjure up these associations, in a sense, but then the mind continues the process of associating these feelings with the appropriate concepts.
People improve their taste when judgment and imagination are combined through the following factors: sensibility, refinement, correctness, and proportion (or comparative adjustment). All but the last refer to a single property among various objects. Sensibility is basically a person’s range of feeling pleasure and pain, which, Gerard notes, differs from person to person. Refinement involves making comparisons, especially between lower and higher degrees of a particular quality. Correctness, for Gerard, means alleviating the confusion between what are merits and what are blemishes. Proportion, on the other hand, compares whole objects with each other, rather than mere properties. One’s taste improves as one develops a refined ability to utilize these four factors to unite the seven principles when apprehending an object of beauty.
Alison provides an overly detailed association theory of taste, but here only the basic ideas of his view will be presented. To begin with, beauty is found in the mind of the perceiver; he does not consider it a property of the object. He maintains this opinion because, when describing an experience of beauty, one always resorts to talking about how it made him or her feel. Imagine someone claiming that a given object is extremely beautiful, and yet it is an object of indifference. That seems impossible, which is why Alison believed feeling is necessary for beauty. And this feeling of beauty arises through what he calls a train of taste. This is similar to someone having a train of thought, where one thought is associated with or leads to another thought and so on. A train of taste begins with a simple emotion—such as cheerfulness—that arises when perceiving an object. This simple emotion becomes the starting point for a train that associates the ideas of emotions. While this is the necessary starting point for an aesthetic experience, this train must also produce emotions.
Alison’s association view claims that an affective quality of an object becomes associated with ideas of emotions as a train of taste. The constant conjunction between the material quality and the abstract or emotional quality become correlated through experience. To illustrate, thunder might produce fear in a child because the child associates the noise and lightning with the emotion of fear; on the other hand, a farmer might feel joy upon hearing thunder if this season has been particularly dry. Unlike these examples, differences in people’s tastes result from an absence of the right associations. People, for different reasons, may fail to produce the requisite trains of taste that lead to the right emotion. This can be caused by different concerns interfering with one’s ability to allow the trains of taste to develop. Worrying about paying next month’s rent, for example, could hinder one’s ability to follow the train of taste where it will naturally lead. Thus Alison, like many others, posits a notion of disinterestedness as a necessary condition—one must not be distracted by cares in order to allow one’s taste to apprehend and appreciate beauty.
g. David Hume
Even though David Hume (1711-1776) wrote little on aesthetics, his condensed essay “Of the Standard of Taste” was highly regarded by those who came after him. One cannot successfully treat the subject of taste thoroughly without some reference to this essay. Hume is generally labeled an empiricist, but in terms of taste, we could classify him as an ideal observer theorist who allows for some individual and cultural preferences. Empiricism, however, seems an apt label when considering certain elements of his essay on taste, namely that its foundation is experience. Art as a social practice is contained, for Hume, under the general theory of human action that he presents elsewhere but does not develop explicitly for his aesthetic views.
Hume draws a distinction between sentiments and determinations. Sentiments are always right because they do not reference anything beyond themselves. However, determinations are not all correct because they make reference to something beyond themselves, something that could be verified or falsified. Beauty is not a quality of objects; therefore, judgments of beauty and taste are sentiments, not determinations. If beauty was a quality of objects, then we would have a standard of beauty contained within those beautiful objects. Despite this result, Hume still wants to allow for certain kinds of opinions that seem correct from experience. While there are some objects that might be close in beauty to each other, there are others that clearly seem to be more beautiful than other objects.
As a prime example, Hume claims quite famously that no one—with a right mind—would think that Ogilby and Milton have no difference in excellence. But this difference is not something in the object itself, for beauty is not a property of objects but is in the mind only. So the objects that affect the higher sentiments of the person are the ones that we deem more beautiful. These affects are the result of cultural convention and therefore are subject to change. But within a culture, there is a standard of taste that isn’t explicit, like the law, but is based on experience (comprising practice and comparison), especially experience of the right kind of person. Hume appeals to a true judge that would be able to perfectly assess the beauty of an object because this person would possess “strong sense, united to delicate sentiment, improved by practice, perfected by comparison, and cleared of all prejudice.” The combined opinion of these very rare individuals would compose the standard of taste. The standard of taste lives within these true judges. By recognizing the better judgments certain people have displayed, the standard of taste they represent becomes public.
It is important, however, not to confuse Hume’s true judge with someone like a contemporary art critic. The judge is not applying a standard of taste to the different objects of perception. If so, then beauty would be found in the objects or in some other realm. To better understand what Hume means, we can explain it this way: Many people have experienced looking at something and not understanding what they are seeing. And then someone else comes along and shows them what to look for (or how to see it properly). All of a sudden, they are able to perceive the object properly. For another example, take seeing someone in the distance. You might think the person is your friend. But as the distance becomes smaller and the perception clearer, it is now obvious that the person is a stranger. These analogies are what Hume has in mind. The true judge does not apply a standard, but the true judge has more perfect perception. And ideal perception is the key to having good taste. It follows that becoming better at perceiving objects will make one’s taste better.
h. Edmund Burke
Like Hume and others, Edmund Burke (1729-1797) recognized that nothing seems more indeterminate than taste. Hume tried to show that since we believe there are expert opinions on matters of taste, then taste cannot be simply a personal whim. He even asserted it is likely that the standard of reason and taste are the same in human beings. The explanation, Burke claims, for thinking that reason and taste seem so different is because more people cultivate reason to a higher level. An error in reasoning could have far more negative consequences than an error in taste. For example, a heart surgeon considering which kind of operation is necessary will have greater direct consequences than someone trying to reason about whether Pablo Picasso is a better painter than Marc Chagall. The urge to cultivate taste is not present, so most people do not devote much time to it.
Though Burke recognized the ambiguities surrounding taste, he set his goal to try to uncover principles of taste. One of his starting points was the uniformity of people’s organs of perception. Many people emphasize the differences between people’s perception of the same event, which leads to the belief that people perceive things differently. Burke, however, maintains that if people’s sense organs functioned completely differently, then every kind of reasoning would be impossible. If two people were looking at a tree, for example, then there would be nothing on which to ground their separate claims that it is a tree. They might choose to describe what they see in contradictory terms, but as Burke claims, their sense organs must actually perceive the same object. Part of his method was to catalogue the different kinds of objects and how they affect the senses and which senses they affect. Specifically, Burke chose to categorize objects according to their giving pleasure or pain. Through this catalog, Burke believed he demonstrated that people have the same physical responses of pain and pleasure to various objects. This catalog further gives foundation for a more precise theory of taste by showing the similar responses people have toward different sense stimuli.
For Burke, pleasure and pain compose the two, main aesthetic starting points for a judgment of taste, first going through the senses and the imagination. Since one rarely moves from pain to pleasure or the reverse, Burke introduces indifference as the neutral starting point for experience. In other words, one moves from a state of indifference to either pleasure or pain. If one is in an indifferent (or neutral) state, then music, for example, compels one to move to a state of pleasure. The power of the imagination utilizes the pleasure or pain to recognize the property of the object that led to that particular feeling. Depending on which one, the object is judged to be beautiful or ugly in accordance with the degree of pleasure or pain. So, Burke’s notion of taste consists of three things: primary pleasures of sense, secondary pleasures of the imagination, and conclusions of the reasoning faculty.
I. Immanuel Kant
Owing to his third major critique about aesthetic judgment, Immanuel Kant (1724-1804) remains an overwhelming influence in aesthetics. Much has been written about different aspects of Kant’s aesthetic theory, so this section will focus solely on his ideas surrounding taste. Though Kant fully believed that taste is subjective, he nevertheless referred to judgments of taste rather than something like feelings of taste. This choice was not a denial that feelings are relevant, since taste has to do with pleasure, but he wanted to uncover whether there were any a priori principles for taste.
As someone who liked theoretical systems, it is no surprise that Kant divides judgments of taste into moments. There are four moments that correspond with the four judgments (quality, quantity, relation, and modality) found in the Critique of Pure Reason. The first moment, disinterested pleasure, corresponds with quality. It means that in order for a judgment to be one of taste, it must not involve any interest beyond itself. Disinterested is not the same as uninterested. Disinterested is closer to a kind of detachment. The object has nothing to give other than the pleasure of itself; there is not an interest beyond itself. If one found an expensive object, one might declare that it is beautiful. However, this would not, strictly speaking, be a judgment of taste, if one were also thinking about the amount of money to be gained from its sale.
The second moment, universal pleasure, corresponds with quantity. It preserves the common belief (or feeling) that judgments about beauty are not completely subjective. We often expect others to share this belief. For example, we would find it highly unusual, if not disturbing, that someone literally believed that a sunset did not possess at least some beauty. Since Kant does not assert a specific standard of beauty, he doesn’t claim everyone will actually agree about which objects are beautiful. Judgments of beauty are singular; they are about one object at a time, and each judgment presents itself as having universal appeal.
The third moment, the form of purposiveness, corresponds with relation. Specifically, he is focusing on the relation of an end or purpose, a final cause. The purpose for which an object is made governs the way it is made. A hammer has a purpose as it was made to put nails into wood; so, the idea of its purpose existed before the actual hammer. However, judgments of taste (or beauty) do not depend on concepts, so it seems that they could not have purpose. But Kant believes that a judgment of beauty cannot be solely a feeling: it must be based on formal properties. To overcome this problem, Kant employs the expression “purposiveness without a purpose.” This is subjective; we must imagine that the object has a purpose even though, for an aesthetic judgment, it does not.
The fourth and last moment, necessary pleasure, corresponds with modality. Unsurprisingly, Kant does not think people find something beautiful because they must necessarily find it so. Kant explains that this necessity implies that the beautiful object is exemplary. When we see a beautiful work of art, we want to imitate it as if there were rules to follow to produce an equally beautiful object. Artists employ techniques that can be learned, but Kant believes that it is not possible to teach someone how to make a beautiful work of art even if that person masters all the techniques of a given art. Taken together, these four moments compose the basic aspects involved in making a judgment of taste.
4. Nineteenth and Twentieth Century Philosophers: The Step Away from Taste
Theories of taste rose up in the 18th century and diminished almost as quickly. As demonstrated by sheer numbers, 19th century philosophers were less concerned with taste than 18th century thinkers. They didn’t abandon aesthetic taste; rather, they moved from talk of aesthetic taste to talk of an aesthetic attitude. On some level, this change might seem like a mere semantic difference, but though it overlaps with taste, talk of an aesthetic attitude offers certain differences. (See also the article on Aesthetic Attitude for a fuller treatment.)
Taste is very outward looking, especially as it relates to aesthetic judgment. The object possesses concrete properties that the perceiver ought to judge as beautiful or not. Failure to make the correct judgment was considered as something deficient with the beholder. For some previous philosophers, it could be a flaw with a person’s virtue that hinders the ability to perceive the beauty of the object. For others, it might be more connected to a lack of knowledge or at least the right kind of knowledge. The key idea for most traditional theories of taste was that the object has properties that the beholder must discover, though the views of people like Hume start to show a shift.
In contrast, aesthetic attitude brings the individual onlooker more to the forefront. The beholder’s state of mind becomes more important as his or her attitude helps or hinders the possibility of aesthetic experience. Whether or not the original aesthetic attitude theorists believed so, these theories allow for a wider range of objects to be considered aesthetic objects. Just by adopting an aesthetic attitude, it seems like any object could be viewed as an aesthetic object. With the taste theorists, the object, apart from the spectator, must be worthy of the aesthetic appreciation it receives. Another difference lies in the fact that the aesthetic attitude can seemingly be turned on and off. Someone could adopt the aesthetic attitude in a given instance, but ignore it in a very similar situation the next day. There seems to be some truth to this because you could walk into an art museum wanting and expecting to experience wonderful things, but you could also enter with a refusal to see anything in an aesthetic light. Taste, according to the respective theories, is not something that is turned on and off. A person either has a developed or attuned sense of taste or not. In other words, the aesthetic attitude is a point of view one adopts, while aesthetic taste seems to be more connected with one’s development and nature.
Two main versions of aesthetic attitude theories occur in the writings of Arthur Schopenhauer and Edward Bullough. Schopenhauer’s (1788-1860) thoughts on aesthetics, we might say, mark the transition from theories of aesthetic taste to aesthetic attitude. Schopenhauer often uses the term aesthetic contemplation rather than attitude. But it seems clear that the later use of attitude can be applied retroactively to his use of contemplation. In order to have an aesthetic experience, the perceiver must have a different kind of perception about the object. No longer focused on the particulars, the perceiver experiences the ideas that are embedded in the object. We might postulate that this shift from particulars to ideas occurs when the perceiver has adopted the aesthetic attitude, though Schopenhauer never clearly spells this out. This attitude and experience are only temporary; it’s an impermanent rest from the suffering of life. The attitude is very important for Schopenhauer. Most things, when viewed with the right aesthetic attitude, will become beautiful in the mind (or perception) of that specific person.
Edward Bullough (1880-1934) is not a common name in the larger history of philosophy, but he made a small but significant contribution in the field of aesthetics. Working as a psychologist, he developed a notion of psychical distance (a continuation of disinterestedness) that was to ground his idea of aesthetic attitude. He often uses the expression aesthetic consciousness instead of aesthetic attitude.
Bullough wanted to develop a notion of the experience of art without appealing to any single characteristic found in all art, since he did not believe there was such a characteristic. This belief helps to illustrate the shift that had taken place since the 18th century, when many still believed beauty was the main characteristic of art. Bullough was more concerned with focusing on the experience that the work of art causes for the beholder. Two people looking at the same object, for instance, might have very different experiences. His solution to this dilemma is what he calls psychical distance. Bullough believed that the beholder must have the correct amount of distance between herself and the work of art. Too much or too little distance will prevent the complete aesthetic experience. It might be similar to having a conversation: Imagine trying to talk to someone in a normal conversation, and he moves his face one inch away from yours. It would be much too distracting to continue. Likewise, if someone were standing one hundred feet away from you, it would not be possible to have the intimacy that a good conversation requires. While there isn’t an exact distance one must have when experiencing art (or having a conversation), there is a range of distances, and the beholder must be in that range in order for the possibility of the aesthetic experience. For Bullough, this distance is what directly affects one’s taste in works of art. It is important for the beholder to learn to gauge the right distance, which can vary from person to person. People create the distance by removing practical interest from the object.
5. Contemporary Philosophy and Beyond
Theories of taste reached their peak in the 18th century. They diminished and then changed in the 19th century. They were left without much significance in the 20th century. Now, in the 21st century, few people really speak about a theory of taste. Are these theories merely relics of the past that we should find interesting only as historical artifacts? How can we account for the fact that people speak commonly and meaningfully about aesthetic taste while it seems to have diminished in academic discourse? It is not obvious how we should answer such questions. However, even though taste is no longer a prominent idea, there have been some notable contributions in the contemporary world.
a. Pierre Bourdieu
A French sociologist, Pierre Bourdieu (1930-2002) attempted to apply the methods of the social sciences to an understanding of aesthetics. In this way, he is unique because he did not work in the traditional philosophical framework that surround questions of beauty, taste, and aesthetic experience. He studied how people come to develop their tastes in various areas, but especially music. While money and time are important for developing cultural knowledge, Bourdieu claims that a crucial component comes from how someone is raised in the home and other institutions, like school. He uses the term cultural capital to refer to someone’s social assets, such as education. While money may help someone gain some social assets, the salient idea is that cultural capital helps one achieve a higher class beyond their purely financial assets.
To the embedded responses a particular individual has to cultural objects, Bourdieu gives the name habitus. People belong to different aesthetic spheres, and their preferences are very similar within the sphere. He concludes that there is no value that guides one’s aesthetic taste; it is developed within a person’s class. This differs from views in traditional philosophy that tend to favor notions of beauty and taste from beyond one’s vantage point in the realm of ideas, or even God, without reference to a person’s class or context. Since people approach things from a particular situation, Bourdieu maintains that people’s social context contributed significantly to their approach to aesthetic taste. In order to demonstrate this idea, Bourdieu surveyed many people belonging to different social classes. He discovered, for instance, that people from the working class believe that objects should serve a function, even aesthetic objects. However, those from the upper classes believe an object could be valuable for its own sake. One class, thought Bourdieu, would almost be disgusted by the dominant art in another class. Thus, for Bourdieu, taste is developed within one’s social context, but one could move to a different class by acquiring cultural capital.
b. Gustatory Taste
Aesthetic taste began as a convenient metaphor for the judgment of the beautiful. Some recent philosophers have begun to examine whether taste must be considered only a metaphor disconnected from its natural setting. In other words, might real gustatory taste have a substantial connection with the traditional and more metaphorical notion of taste? It is a contentious topic with very few middle ground positions.
Gustatory taste can be altered—positively and negatively—with experience or education. People have different methods of preparing foods all over the world that produce different flavors. Knowing how to blend flavors and how to properly consume certain items will refine one’s taste and enjoyment of certain foods and drinks. Scotch, for example, is a complex drink that can contain sweet, smoky, spicy, citrus, and other flavors. Knowing how to drink scotch to taste all of these flavors is not automatic. While there might not be an absolutely correct way to drink it, there are ways to drink it so that you taste all it has to offer. Similarly, in the context of art, one could learn how to appreciate certain kinds of art by learning how to appropriately perceive and experience them. This has nothing to do with whether the person will actually like certain art. The point is merely that one can alter or improve one’s taste by learning more about the object or type of object. This education and refinement will usually increase the pleasure received in both contexts.
Whether gustatory taste is on par with traditional aesthetic taste seems to hinge on the status of food as art. This is where the larger questions loom for connecting the two kinds of taste. There are some more generally agreed upon characteristics of art that could help negotiate this question. Art is generally considered a kind of expression of emotions or ideas. While someone cooking might have positive emotions about the food or those who will consume it, the food itself does not seem to express emotion. Now there might be a situation where one person claims that the cook must love her because the cook prepared her favorite meal. There is some communication here, but the question is whether the communication was through the food as art, because something similar could be communicated with store-bought chocolate or even a bottle of wine. These things might not carry meaning (or the same meaning) for anyone else. Insofar as meaning or expression is necessary for art, gustatory taste seems to fall short of the traditional (and metaphorical) theories of taste, as suggested by Elizabeth Telfer, though she believes food to be a minor art.
c. Some Developments in Analytic Philosophy
Even though the zenith for theories of taste has passed, it has found some interest among contemporary analytic philosophers. Talk of aesthetic judgment and interpretation are more prevalent, but there are some important themes that have received attention in recent discussion. With the rise in connecting gustatory taste with aesthetic taste, some philosophers have given more weight to the personal interaction one has with an aesthetic object. Carolyn Korsmeyer and others have pointed out that taste in both the literal and metaphorical senses require a personal experience with the object. It would be suspect for people to claim that they dislike bananas, for example, if they had never eaten one or even seen one. Similarly, people cannot reasonably claim to dislike an opera or painting that they have never observed or experienced. This lack of personal familiarity becomes even more acute were they to try making a specific claim, such as stating that the colors of a painting are not well balanced throughout the composition. This claim seems impossible without actually seeing the painting. While we might trust our friend’s negative review and decide not to see a work of art, we cannot reasonably make the stronger claim that something is wrong with the work without actually experiencing it. Furthermore, there is a difference between claims of taste and other kinds of factual claims. From second-hand testimony, we could learn that a sculpture is made of bronze, but we could not learn how beautiful it is unless we see it for ourselves. It seems reasonable that some kind of personal experience of an object itself or similar object (including audio or visual representations) is important for an evaluative judgment of taste. Even if it was possible to make a judgment of taste without direct experience, it would at least be necessary for someone to have a little knowledge of the kind of object under discussion.
Some questions arise about which objects are appropriate for one’s judgment of taste and which people’s opinions matter. Imagine a person who claimed that a toaster was the most beautiful object he had ever seen. While it seems likely that most people would not agree, is this person wrong? Frank Sibley claims that anyone can notice the non-aesthetic qualities of an object, but only some people notice its aesthetic qualities. These qualities help an observer recognize an object that is admirable. But they are not easily recognizable because of the experiences and training that each observer possesses. An issue with this view is that there can be a wide variety of legitimate opinions. One person claims an object is mildly beautiful, while another claims the same object is supremely beautiful. Both views are based on their perceptions of the same object’s aesthetic qualities. Some might say that one person’s taste is more refined. However, there are two residual questions. Which person’s taste is refined? Plus, Jerrold Levinson raises the question about what might motivate someone to cultivate her taste to be able to perceive the finer aspects of an aesthetic object. Answers to questions about the right observer and the right object never seem to lead to a concrete answer, which creates problems for theories of taste.
In the 18th century, many connected taste with a robust account of moral goodness. With that connection dismissed by many over the last century, theories of taste, along with theories of beauty and sublimity, suffered as well. The early 21st century, however, has brought a renewed interest in several related areas: ideas of beauty with people like Roger Scruton and Nick Zangwill, the sublime with Emily Brady, and aesthetic experience with Richard Shusterman. This reappearance suggests that these traditional aesthetic concepts were perhaps ignored for too long. Thus, taste might also have the possibility of new life in the 21st century.
6. References and Further Reading
a. Primary Sources
- Bullough, Edward. “‘Psychical Distance’ as a Factor in Art and an Aesthetic Principle.” The British Journal of Psychology, vol. 5, no. 2, 1912, pp. 87–118.
- This article presents his most famous idea: psychical distance.
- Burke, Edmund. A Philosophical Enquiry into the Origin of Our Ideas of the Sublime and Beautiful. London, 1757.
- The earlier version has his essay “On Taste,” which presents his main ideas concerning taste.
- Cooper, Anthony. Third Earl of Shaftesbury. Characteristics of Men, Manners, Opinions, Times. London, 1711.
- The section called “The Moralists” is where Shaftesbury spells much of his view of taste.
- Herder, Johann Gottfried. Selected Writings on Aesthetics. Edited and translated by Gregory Moore, Princeton University Press, 2006.
- This is a compilation of Herder’s works on aesthetics, and a main discussion of taste is found in the chapters called “Critical Forests: Fourth Grove” and “The Causes of Sunken Taste.”
- Hume, David. “Of the Standard of Taste.” In Four Dissertations, Edinburgh, 1757.
- Hume introduces his notion of the ideal judge in this essay.
- Hutcheson, Francis. An Inquiry into the Original of Our Ideas of Beauty and Virtue. London, 1725.
- Section VI develops his belief that people have a universal sense of beauty.
- Kant, Immanuel. Critique of Judgment. Berlin, 1790.
- His section discussion of the four moments are of particular importance to this topic.
- Mendelssohn, Moses. Philosophical Writings. Berlin, 1761.
- In the section “On Sentiments,” Mendelssohn (or his Theocles) talks about how he prepares himself to experience art and beauty.
- Plotinus, The Enneads.
- In the first Ennead, tractate 1, section 1, Plotinus discusses beauty, especially his belief that symmetry cannot be the only requirement of beauty.
- Schopenhauer, Arthur. The World as Will and Idea. Leipzig, 1819.
- His major work dealing with the major branches of philosophy, but Book 3 (Volume 1) is where he focuses on aesthetics.
b. Secondary Sources
- Beardsley, Monroe. Aesthetics from Classical Greece to the Present: A Short History. The University of Alabama Press, 1966.
- A very accessible history of the development of aesthetic ideas.
- Cahn, Steven M. and Aaron Meskin. Aesthetics: A Comprehensive Anthology. Blackwell Publishing, 2008.
- This is one of the best anthologies for the history of aesthetics, incorporating selections from most of the main philosophers throughout history.
- Carruthers, Mary. The Experience of Beauty in the Middle Ages. Oxford University Press, 2013.
- Chapter 4 offers an insightful analysis of how taste rose to prominence during the medieval period.
- Dickie, George. The Century of Taste: The Philosophical Odyssey of Taste in the Eighteenth Century. Oxford University Press, 1996.
- An excellent resource on five of the major philosophers on taste: Hutcheson, Gerard, Alison, Hume, and Kant.
- Gaut, Berys and Dominic McIver Lopes, editors. The Routledge Companion to Aesthetics. 3rd ed., Routledge, 2013.
- This is a great resource for an introduction to a wide array of issues in aesthetics, but Carolyn Kormeyer’s entry on “Taste” is most relevant for this article.
- Neill, Alex and Aaron Ridley, editors. Arguing about Art: Contemporary Philosophical Debates. 2nd ed., Routledge, 2002.
- This book features some competing arguments on a variety of issues, but offers a helpful exchange about whether food is art in Part 1.
- Wenzel, Christian Helmut. An Introduction to Kant’s Aesthetics: Core Concepts and Problems. Blackwell Publishing, 2005.
- A very accessible explanation of the main ideas of Kant’s aesthetic theory.
Michael R. Spicher
Massachusetts College of Art and Design
U. S. A.