Immanuel Kant: Aesthetics
Immanuel Kant is an 18th century German philosopher whose work initated dramatic changes in the fields of epistemology, metaphysics, ethics, aesthetics, and teleology. Like many Enlightenment thinkers, he holds our mental faculty of reason in high esteem; he believes that it is our reason that invests the world we experience with structure. In his works on aesthetics and teleology, he argues that it is our faculty of judgment that enables us to have experience of beauty and grasp those experiences as part of an ordered, natural world with purpose. After the Introduction, each of the above sections commences with a summary. These will give the reader an idea of what topics are discussed in more detail in each section. They can also be read together to form a brief bird’s-eye-view of Kant’s theory of aesthetics and teleology.
Kant believes he can show that aesthetic judgment is not fundamentally different from ordinary theoretical cognition of nature, and he believes he can show that aesthetic judgment has a deep similarity to moral judgment. For these two reasons, Kant claims he can demonstrate that the physical and moral universes – and the philosophies and forms of thought that present them – are not only compatible, but unified.
Table of Contents
- Kant’s Aesthetics
- Kant’s Teleology
- The Problem of the Unity of Philosophy and its Supersensible Objects
- References and Further Reading
a. Kant’s Life and Works
Immanuel Kant is often said to have been the greatest philosopher since the Greeks. Certainly, he dominates the last two hundred years in the sense that – although few philosophers today are strictly speaking Kantians – his influence is everywhere. Moreover, that influence extends over a number of different philosophical regions: epistemology, metaphysics, aesthetics, ethics, politics, religion. Because of Kant’s huge importance, and the variety of his contributions and influences, this encyclopedia entry is divided into a number of subsections. What follows here will be a brief account of Kant’s life and works, followed by an overview of those themes that Kant felt bridged his philosophical works, and made them into one ‘critical philosophy’.
Kant was born in Königsberg, Prussia (now Kalingrad in Russia) in 1724 to Pietist Lutheran parents. His early education first at a Pietist school and then at the University of Königsberg was in theology, but he soon became attracted by problems in physics, and especially the work of Isaac Newton. In 1746 financial difficulties forced him to withdraw from the University. After nine years supporting himself as a tutor to the children of several wealthy families in outlying districts, he returned to the University, finishing his degree and entering academic life, though at first (and for many years) in the modest capacity of a lecturer. (Only in 1770 was he given a University chair in logic and metaphysics at Königsberg.) He continued to work and lecture on, and publish widely, on a great variety of issues, but especially on physics and on the metaphysical issues behind physics and mathematics. He rarely left his home city, and gradually became a celebrity there for his brilliant, witty but eccentric character.
Kant’s early work was in the tradition (although not dogmatically even then) of the great German rationalist philosopher Leibniz, and especially his follower Wolff. But by the 1760s, he was increasingly admiring Leibniz’s great rival Newton, and was coming under the additional influences of the empiricist skepticism of Hume and the ethical and political thought of Rousseau. In this period he produced a series of works attacking Leibnizian thought. In particular, he now argued that the traditional tools of philosophy – logic and metaphysics – had to be understood to be severely limited with respect to obtaining knowledge of reality. (Similar, apparently skeptical, claims were relatively common in the Enlightenment.)
It was only in the late 1760s, and especially in his Inaugural Dissertation of 1770 that Kant began to move towards the ideas that would make him famous and change the face of philosophy. In the Dissertation, he argued for three key new ideas: first, that sensible and conceptual presentations of the world (for example, my seeing three horses, and my concept of three) must be understood to be two quite distinct sources of possible knowledge. Second, it follows that knowledge of sensible reality is only possible if the necessary concepts (such as substance) are already available to the intellect. This fact, Kant argued, also limits the legitimate range of application of these concepts. Finally, Kant claimed that sensible presentations were of only appearances’, and not things as they are in themselves. This was because space and time, which describe the basic structure of all sensible appearances, are not existent in things in themselves, but are only a product of our organs of sense. Perceiving things in space and time is a function of the mind of the perceiver. The hypothesis that both key concepts, and the basic structure of space and time, are a priori in the mind, is a basic theme of Kant’s idealism (see the entry on ‘Kant’s Metaphysics’). It is important to recognize that this last claim about space and time also exacerbates the limitation imposed above by proposing a whole realm of ‘noumena’ or ‘things in themselves’ which necessarily lies beyond knowledge in any ordinary sense. These new and often startling ideas, with a few important modifications, would form the basis of his philosophical project for the rest of his life.
After publishing quite often in the preceding 15 years, the Dissertation ushered in an apparently quiet phase in Kant’s work. Kant realized that he had discovered a new way of thinking. He now needed rigorous demonstrations of his new ideas, and had to pursue their furthest implications. He even needed to find a new philosophical language to properly express such original thoughts! This took more than a decade of his life. Except for a remarkable set of correspondence during this period, Kant published nothing until the massive first edition of the Critique of Pure Reason, in 1781 (revised second edition, 1787).
Over the next two decades, however, he furiously pursued his new philosophy into different territories, producing books or shorter publications on virtually every philosophical topic under the sun. This new philosophy came to be known as ‘critical’ or ‘transcendental’ philosophy. Of particular importance were the so called three Critiques: The Critique of Pure Reason (1781/1787), Critique of Practical Reason (1788), and the Critique of Judgment (1790). Kant quickly became famous in the German speaking world, and soon thereafter elsewhere. This fame did not mean universal praise, however. Kant’s work was feverishly debated in all circles – his work on religion and politics was even censored. And by the time of his death in 1804, philosophers such as Fichte, Schelling and the Hegel were already striking out in new philosophical directions. Directions, however, that would have been unthinkable without Kant.
b. The Central Problems of the Critique of Judgment
Kant’s Critique of Judgment (the third Critique) was and continues to be a surprise – even to Kant, for it emerged out of Kant’s philosophical activity having not been a part of the original plan. (For an account of Kant’s first two Critiques, please see the entry on ‘Kant’s Metaphysics’.) Some philosophers have even claimed that it is the product of the onset of senility in Kant. After initial enthusiasm during the romantic period, the book was relatively ignored until work such as Cassirer’s in the early 20th Century. Especially in the last few decades, however, the Critique of Judgment is being increasingly seen as a major and profound work in Kant’s output.
Part of the surprise lies in the diversity of topics Kant deals with. For much of the previous two centuries the book was read – and it still is largely read in this way – as a book about aesthetics (the philosophy of the beautiful and the sublime). In fact this type of reading by no means adequately reflects Kant’s explicit themes, and is forced to ignore much of the text. Here, we shall try to sketch out the range of topics and purposes (including aesthetics) Kant gives to his third Critique.
There are several commonly available translations of the Critique of Judgment. Here, we will use Werner S. Pluhar’s (Hackett, 1987), but will make reference alternative translations of key terms, especially as found in the widely used James Creed Meredith translation. To facilitate the use of the variety of available editions, passages in Kant’s text will be indicated by section number, rather than page number.
The basic, explicit purpose of Kant’s Critique of Judgment is to investigate whether the ‘power’ (also translated as ‘faculty’ – and we will use the latter here) of judgment provides itself with an priori principle. In earlier work, Kant had pretty much assumed that judgment was simply a name for the combined operation of other, more fundamental, mental faculties. Now, Kant has been led to speculate that the operation of judgment might be organized and directed by a fundamental a priori principle that is unique to it. The third Critique sets out to explore the validity and implications of such a hypothesis.
In the third Critique, Kant’s account of judgment begins with the definition of judgment as the subsumption of a particular under a universal (Introduction IV). If, in general, the faculty of understanding is that which supplies concepts (universals), and reason is that which draws inferences (constructs syllogisms, for example), then judgment ‘mediates’ between the understanding and reason by allowing individual acts of subsumption to occur (cf. e.g. Introduction III). This leads Kant to a further distinction between determinate and reflective judgments (Introduction IV). In the former, the concept is sufficient to determine the particular – meaning that the concept contains sufficient information for the identification of any particular instance of it. In such a case, judgment’s work is fairly straightforward (and Kant felt he had dealt adequately with such judgments in the Critique of Pure Reason). Thus the latter (where the judgment has to proceed without a concept, sometimes in order to form a new concept) forms the greater philosophical problem here. How could a judgment take place without a prior concept? How are new concepts formed? And are there judgments that neither begin nor end with determinate concepts? This explains why a book about judgment should have so much to say about aesthetics: Kant takes aesthetic judgments to be a particularly interesting form of reflective judgments.
As we shall see, the second half of Kant’s book deals with teleological judgments. Broadly speaking, a teleological judgment concerns an object the possibility of which can only be understood from the point of view of its purpose. Kant will claim that teleological judgments are also reflective, but in a different way – that is, having a different indeterminacy with respect to the concepts typical of natural science.
Reflective judgments are important for Kant because they involve the judgment doing a job for itself, rather than being a mere co-ordinator of concepts and intuitions; thus, reflective judgments might be the best place to search for judgment’s a priori legislating principle. The principle in question (if it exists), Kant claims, would assert the suitability of all nature for our faculty of judgment in general. (In the narrower case of determinate judgments, Kant believes he has demonstrated the necessity of this ‘suitability’ – please see the entry on ‘Kant’s Metaphysics’.) This general suitability Kant calls the finality or purposiveness/ purposefulness of nature for the purposes of our judgment. Kant offers a number of arguments to prove the existence and validity of this principle. First, he suggests that without such a principle, science (as a systematic, orderly and unified conception of nature) would not be possible. All science must assume the availability of its object for our ability to judge it. (A similar argument is used by Kant in the Critique of Pure Reason in discussing the regulative role of rational ideas (see A642-668=B670-696)). Second, without such a principle our judgments about beauty would not exhibit the communicability, or tendency to universality even in the absence of a concept, that they do. It is this second argument that dominates the first half of the Critique of Judgment.
As we shall see, Kant uses the particular investigation into judgments about art, beauty and the sublime partly as a way of illuminating judgment in general. Aesthetic judgments exhibit in an exemplary fashion precisely those features of judgment in general which allow one to explore the transcendental principles of judgment. But Kant has still higher concerns. The whole problem of judgment is important because judgment, Kant believes, forms the mediating link between the two great branches of philosophical inquiry (the theoretical and the practical). It had been noted before (for example, by Hume) that there seems to be a vast difference between what is, and what ought to be. Kant notes that these two philosophical branches have completely different topics, but these topics, paradoxically, have as their object the very same sensible nature. Theoretical philosophy has as its topic the cognition of sensible nature; practical philosophy has as its topic the possibility of moral action in and on sensible nature.
This problem had arisen before in Kant’s work, in the famous Antinomies in both the first and second Critiques. A key version of the problem Kant poses in the Antinomies concerns freedom: how can nature be both determined according to the laws of science, and yet have ‘room’ for the freedom necessary in order for morality to have any meaning? Ultimately, for Kant this would be a conflict of our faculty of reason against itself. For, in its theoretical employment, reason absolutely demands the subjection of all objects to law; but in its practical (moral) employment, reason equally demands the possibility of freedom. The problem is solved by returning to the idealism we discussed in previous section of the introduction. Every object has to be conceived in a two-fold manner: first as an appearance, subject to the necessary jurisdiction of certain basic concepts (the Categories) and to the forms of space and time; second, as a thing in itself, about which nothing more can be said. Even if appearances are rigorously law-governed, it is still possible that things in themselves can act freely. Nevertheless, although this solution eliminates the conflict, it does not actually unify the two sides of reason, nor the two objects (what is and what ought) of reason.
Judgment seems to relate to both sides, however, and thus (Kant speculates) can form the third thing that allows philosophy to be a single, unified discipline. Kant thus believes that judgment may be the mediating link that can unify the whole of philosophy, and correlatively, also the link that discovers the unity among the objects and activities of philosophy. Unfortunately, Kant never makes explicit exactly how the bulk of his third Critique is supposed to solve this problem; understandably, it is thus often ignored by readers of Kant’s text. Thus, the central problem of the Critique of Judgment is a broad one: the unity of philosophy in general. This problem is investigated by that mental faculty which Kant believes is the key to this unity, namely judgment. And judgment is investigated by the critical inquiry into those types of judgment in which the a priori principle of judgment is apparent: on the beautiful, on the sublime, and on teleology. We shall return to the grand issue of the unity of philosophy at the end of this article.
The various themes of the Critique of Judgment have been enormously influential in the two centuries since its publication. The accounts of genius, and of the significance of imagination in aesthetics, for example, became basic pillars of Romanticism in the early 19th Century. The formalism of Kant’s aesthetics in general inspired two generations of formalist aesthetics, in the first half of the 20th Century; the connection between judgment and political or moral communities has been similarly influential from Schiller onwards, and was the main subject of Hanna Arendt’s last, uncompleted, project; and Kant’s treatment of the sublime has been a principle object of study by several recent philosophers, such as J.-F. Lyotard. Kant’s discussion, in the second half of the book, of the distinction between the intellectus ectypus and the intellectus archetypus was an extremely important in the decades immediately after Kant in the development of German Idealism. And his moral proof for the existence of God is often ranked alongside the great arguments of Anselm and Aquinas.
The following entry is divided into two sections, which correspond for the most part to the major division of Kant’s book between the ‘Critique of Aesthetic Judgment’ and the ‘Critique of Teleological Judgment’. Part A deals with Kant’s account of beauty, the sublime, and fine art. In the first two of these subjects, Kant’s concern is with what features an aesthetic judgment exhibits, how such a judgment is possible, and is there any transcendental guarantee of the validity of such a judgment. The treatment of fine art shifts the focus onto the conditions of possibility of the production of works of art. Part B deals with Kant’s account of teleological judgment, and its relation to the natural science of biology. However, if the discussion above of the ‘Central Problems’ of the Critique of Judgment is correct, a major part of Kant’s interest is less in these particular analyses, than in their broader implications for e.g. morality, the nature of human thought, our belief in the existence of God, and ultimately for the unity of philosophy itself. We will be dealing with these implications throughout, but especially in sections A5, B2, B3 and B4.
2. Kant’s Aesthetics
a. The Judgment of the Beautiful
Overview: The Critique of Judgment begins with an account of beauty. The initial issue is: what kind of judgment is it that results in our saying, for example, ‘That is a beautiful sunset’. Kant argues that such aesthetic judgments (or ‘judgments of taste’) must have four key distinguishing features. First, they are disinterested, meaning that we take pleasure in something because we judge it beautiful, rather than judging it beautiful because we find it pleasurable. The latter type of judgment would be more like a judgment of the ‘agreeable’, as when I say ‘I like doughnuts’.
Second and third, such judgments are both universal and necessary. This means roughly that it is an intrinsic part of the activity of such a judgment to expect others to agree with us. Although we may say ‘beauty is in the eye of the beholder’, that is not how we act. Instead, we debate and argue about our aesthetic judgments – and especially about works of art -and we tend to believe that such debates and arguments can actually achieve something. Indeed, for many purposes, ‘beauty’ behaves as if it were a real property of an object, like its weight or chemical composition. But Kant insists that universality and necessity are in fact a product of features of the human mind (Kant calls these features ‘common sense’), and that there is no objective property of a thing that makes it beautiful.
Fourth, through aesthetic judgments, beautiful objects appear to be ‘purposive without purpose’ (sometimes translated as ‘final without end’). An object’s purpose is the concept according to which it was made (the concept of a vegetable soup in the mind of the cook, for example); an object is purposive if it appears to have such a purpose; if, in other words, it appears to have been made or designed. But it is part of the experience of beautiful objects, Kant argues, that they should affect us as if they had a purpose, although no particular purpose can be found.
Having identified the major features of aesthetic judgments, Kant then needs to ask the question of how such judgments are possible, and are such judgments in any way valid (that is, are they really universal and necessary).
It is useful to see the aesthetics here, as with Kant’s epistemology and to a certain extent his ethics also, as being a leap over the terms of the debate between British (and largely empiricist) philosophy of art and beauty (Shaftesbury, Hutcheson, Hume and Burke) and Continental rationalist aesthetics (especially Baumgarten, who invented the modern use of the term aesthetics’ in the mid-18th century). The key ideas of the former group were (i) the idea of a definite human nature, such that studies of beauty could, within limits, be universal in scope; (ii) the assertion that beautiful objects and our responses to them were essentially involved in sense or feeling, and were not cognitive; (iii) that any ‘natural’ responses to beauty were generally overlaid by individual and communal experiences, habits and customs. The main disagreement with rationalist thought on the matter was in the second of these ideas. Baumgarten, following Leibniz, argued that all sense perception was merely ‘confused’ cognition, or cognition by way of sensible images. Thus, although beauty certainly appears to our senses, this by no means demonstrates that beauty is non-cognitive! Beauty, for Baumgarten, has more to do with rational ideas such as harmony, rather than with the physiological.
Kant asserted the basic distinction between intuitive or sensible presentations on the one hand, and the conceptual or rational on the other. (See ‘Kant’s Transcendental Idealism’ in the article on ‘Kant’s Metaphysics’.) Therefore, despite his great admiration for Baumgarten, it is impossible for Kant to agree with Baumgarten’s account of aesthetic experience. (By ‘aesthetic’ here we mean in Baumgarten’s sense of a philosophy of the beautiful and related notions, and not in Kant’s original usage of the term in the Critique of Pure Reason to mean the domain of sensibility.) In addition, Kant holds that aesthetic experience, like natural experience leading to determinate judgments, is inexplicable without both an intuitive and a conceptual dimension. Thus, for example, beauty is also by no means non-cognitive, as the British tradition had held.
Thus, Kant begins to analyze the experience of beauty, in order to ask as precisely as possible the question ‘how are judgments about beauty possible’. Kant’s initial focus is on judgments about beauty in nature, as when we call a flower, a sunset, or an animal ‘beautiful’. What, at bottom, does such a judgment mean, and how does it take place as a mental act? In order to begin to answer these questions, Kant needs to clarify the basic features of such judgments. On Kant’s analysis, aesthetic judgments are still more strange even than ordinary reflective judgments, and must have a number of peculiar features which at first sight look like nothing other than paradoxes. We will now describe those features using Kant’s conceptual language.
Taking up roughly the first fifth of the Critique of Judgment, Kant discusses four particular unique features of aesthetic judgments on the beautiful (he subsequently deals with the sublime). These he calls ‘moments’, and they are structured in often obscure ways according to the main divisions of Kant’s table of categories (See article on Kant’s Metaphysics).
The First Moment. Aesthetic judgments are disinterested. There are two types of interest: by way of sensations in the agreeable, and by way of concepts in the good. Only aesthetic judgment is free or pure of any such interests. Interest is defined as a link to real desire and action, and thus also to a determining connection to the real existence of the object. In the aesthetic judgment per se, the real existence of the beautiful object is quite irrelevant. Certainly, I may wish to own the beautiful painting, or at least a copy of it, because I derive pleasure from it – but that pleasure, and thus that desire, is distinct from and parasitic upon the aesthetic judgment (see sect;9). The judgment results in pleasure, rather than pleasure resulting in judgment. Kant accordingly and famously claims that the aesthetic judgment must concern itself only with form (shape, arrangement, rhythm, etc.) in the object presented, not sensible content (color, tone, etc.), since the latter has a deep connection to the agreeable, and thus to interest. Kant is thus the founder of all formalism in aesthetics in modern philosophy. This claim of the disinterestedness of all aesthetic judgments is perhaps the most often attacked by subsequent philosophy, especially as it is extended to include fine art as well as nature. To pick three examples, Kant’s argument is rejected by those (Nietzsche, Freud) for whom all art must always be understood as related to will; by those for whom all art (as a cultural production) must be political in some sense (Marxism); by those for whom all art is a question of affective response expressionists).
The Second Moment. Aesthetic judgments behave universally, that is, involve an expectation or claim on the agreement of others – just ‘as if’ beauty were a real property of the object judged. If I judge a certain landscape to be beautiful then, although I may be perfectly aware that all kinds of other factors might enter in to make particular people in fact disagree with me, never-the-less I at least implicitly demand universality in the name of taste. The way that my aesthetic judgments ‘behave’ is key evidence here: that is, I tend to see disagreement as involving error somewhere, rather than agreement as involving mere coincidence. This universality is distinguished first from the mere subjectivity of judgments such as ‘I like honey’ (because that is not at all universal, nor do we expect it to be); and second from the strict objectivity of judgments such as ‘honey contains sugar and is sweet’, because the aesthetic judgment must, somehow, be universal ‘apart from a concept’ (sect;9). Being reflective judgments, aesthetic judgments of taste have no adequate concept (at least to begin with), and therefore can only behave as if they were objective. Kant is quite aware that he is flying in the face of contemporary (then and now!) truisms such as ‘beauty is in the eye of the beholder’. Such a belief, he argues, first of all can not account for our experience of beauty itself, insofar as the tendency is always to see ‘beauty’ as if it were somehow in the object or the immediate experience of the object. Second, Kant argues that such a relativist view can not account for the social ‘behavior’ of our claims about what we find beautiful. In order to explore the implications of ‘apart from a concept’, Kant introduces the idea of the ‘free play’ of the cognitive faculties (here: understanding and imagination), and the related idea of communicability. In the case of the judgment of the beautiful, these faculties no longer simply work together (as they do in ordinary sensible cognition) but rather each ‘furthers’ or ‘quickens’ the other in a kind of self-contained and self-perpetuating cascade of thought and feeling. We will return to these notions below.
The Third Moment. The third introduces the problem of purpose and purposiveness (also translated ‘end’ and ‘finality’). An object’s purpose is the concept according to which it was manufactured; purposiveness, then, is the property of at least appearing to have been manufactured or designed. Kant claims that the beautiful has to be understood as purposive, but without any definite purpose. A ‘definite purpose’ would be either the set of external purposes (what the thing was meant to do or accomplish), or the internal purpose (what the thing was simply meant to be like). In the former case, the success of the process of making is judged according to utility; in the latter, according to perfection. Kant argues that beauty is equivalent neither to utility nor perfection, but is still purposive. Beauty in nature, then, will appear as purposive with respect to our faculty of judgment, but its beauty will have no ascertainable purpose – that is, it is not purposive with respect to determinate cognition. Indeed, this is why beauty is pleasurable since, Kant argues, pleasure is defined as a feeling that arises on the achievement of a purpose, or at least the recognition of a purposiveness (Introduction, VI).
The purposiveness of art is more complicated. Although such works may have had purposes behind their production (the artist wished to express a certain mood, or communicate a certain idea), nevertheless, these can not be sufficient for the object to be beautiful. As judges of art, any such knowledge we do have about these real purposes can inform the judgment as background, but must be abstracted from to form the aesthetic judgment properly. It is not just that the purpose for the beauty of the beautiful happens to be unknown, but that it cannot be known. Still, we are left with the problem of understanding how a thing can be purposive, without having a definite purpose.
The Fourth Moment. Here, Kant is attempting to show that aesthetic judgments must pass the test of being ‘necessary’, which effectively means, ‘according to principle’. Everyone must assent to my judgment, because it follows from this principle. But this necessity is of a peculiar sort: it is ‘exemplary’ and ‘conditioned’. By exemplary, Kant means that the judgment does not either follow or produce a determining concept of beauty, but exhausts itself in being exemplary precisely of an aesthetic judgment. With the notion of condition, Kant reaches the core of the matter. He is asking: what is it that the necessity of the judgment is grounded upon; that is, what does it say about those who judge?
Kant calls the ground ‘common sense’, by which he means the a priori principle of our taste, that is of our feeling for the beautiful. (Note: by ‘common sense’ is not meant being intelligent about everyday things, as in: ‘For a busy restaurant, it’s just common sense to reserve a table in advance.’) In theoretical cognition of nature, the universal communicability of a representation, its objectivity, and its basis in a priori principles are all related. Similarly, Kant wants to claim that the universal communicability, the exemplary necessity and the basis in an a priori principle are all different ways of understanding the same subjective condition of possibility of aesthetic judgment that he calls common sense. (As we shall see, on the side of the beautiful object, this subjective principle corresponds to the principle of the purposiveness of nature.) Thus Kant can even claim that all four Moments of the Beautiful are summed up in the idea of ‘common sense’ (CJ sect.22). Kant also suggests that common sense in turn depends upon or is perhaps identical with the same faculties as ordinary cognition, that is, those features of humans which (as Kant showed in the Critique of Pure Reason) make possible natural, determinative experience. Here, however, the faculties are merely in a harmony rather than forming determinate cognition.
b. The Deduction of Taste
Overview: There are two aspects to Kant’s basic answer to the question of how aesthetic judgments happen. First, some of Kant’s earlier work seemed to suggest that our faculty or ability to judge consisted of being a mere processor of other, much more fundamental mental presentations. These were concepts and intuitions (‘intuition’ being Kant’s word for our immediate sensible experiences – see entry on ‘Kant’s Metaphysics’). Everything interesting and fundamental happened in the formation of concepts, or in the receiving of intuitions. But now Kant argues that judgment itself, as a faculty, has an fundamental principle that governs it. This principle asserts the purposiveness of all phenomena with respect to our judgment. In other words, it assumes in advance that everything we experience can be tackled by our powers of judgment. Normally, we don’t even notice that this assumption is being made, we just apply concepts, and be done with it. But in the case of the beautiful, we do notice. This is because the beautiful draws particular attention to its purposiveness; but also because the beautiful has no concept of a purpose available, so that we cannot just apply a concept and be done with it. Instead, the beautiful forces us to grope for concepts that we can never find. And yet, nevertheless, the beautiful is not an alien and disturbing experience – on the contrary, it is pleasurable. The principle of purposiveness is satisfied, but in a new and unique way.
Asking what this new and unique way is takes us to the second aspect. Kant argues that the kinds of ‘cognition’ (i.e. thinking) characteristic of the contemplation of the beautiful are not, in fact, all that different from ordinary cognition about things in the world. The faculties of the mind are the same: the ‘understanding’ which is responsible for concepts, and the ‘sensibility’ (including our imagination) which is responsible for intuitions. The difference between ordinary and aesthetic cognition is that in the latter case, there is no one ‘determinate’ concept that pins down an intuition. Instead, intuition is allowed some ‘free play’, and rather than being subject to one concept, it instead acts in ‘harmony’ with the lawfulness in general of the understanding. It is this ability of judgment to bring sensibility and understanding to a mutually reinforcing harmony that Kant calls ‘common sense’. This account of common sense explains how the beautiful can be purposive with respect to our ability to judge, and yet have no definite purpose. Kant believes common sense also answers the question of why aesthetic judgments are valid: since aesthetic judgments are a perfectly normal function of the same faculties of cognition involved in ordinary cognition, they will have the same universal validity as such ordinary acts of cognition.
The idea of a harmony between or among the faculties of cognition is turning out to be the key idea. For such a harmony, Kant claims, will be purposive, but without purpose. Moreover, it will be both universal and necessary, because based upon universal common sense, or again, because related to the same cognitive faculties which enable any and all knowledge and experience. Lastly, because of the self-contained nature of this harmony, it must be disinterested. So, what does Kant think is going on in such ‘harmony’, or in common sense for that matter, and does he have any arguments which make of these idea more than mere metaphors for beauty?
Up to now, we have had no decent argument for the existence of common sense as a principle of taste. At best, common sense was plausible as a possible explanation of, for example, the tendency to universality observed in aesthetic judgments. (As Kant admits in sect.17). Such a demand for universality could be accounted for nicely if we assumed an a priori principle for taste, which might also explain the idea of universal communicability. This argument, however, is rather weak. Kant believes he has an ingenious route to proving the case with much greater certainty.
Throughout the Four Moments of the Beautiful, Kant has dropped many important clues as to the transcendental account of the possibility of aesthetic judgment: in particular, we have talked about communicability, common sense and the harmony of the cognitive sub-faculties. Kant then cuts off to turn to the sublime, representing a different problem within aesthetic judgment. He returns to beauty in sect.30, which forms the transition to the passages tantalizingly called the Deduction. These transitional passages feel much like a continuation of the Four Moments; we will treat them as such here, since also Kant claims that the sublime does not need a Deduction.
The Deduction in fact appears in two versions in Kant’s texts (sect.9 and 21 being the first; sect.30-40 the second, with further important clarification in the ‘Dialectic’ sect.55-58). Here, we will discuss only the second. Both explicitly are attempting to demonstrate the universal communicability and thus intersubjective validity of judgments of taste. Which for Kant is the same as saying that there is a ‘common sense’ – by which he means that humans all must have a kind of sensing ability which operates the same way.
Briefly, the argument begins by asserting that aesthetic judgments must be judgments in some sense; that is, they are mental acts which bring a sensible particular under some universal (Kant’s Introduction, IV). The four moments of the beautiful are then explicitly seen as being limitations on the conditions under which this judgment can take place (no interest, purposive without determining purpose, etc.); all these Kant summarizes by saying that the judgments are formal only, lacking all ‘matter’. By this, he means that although the judgment is a judgment of the presentation of a particular (singular) object, no particular determination of either sensible intuition, or understanding forms a necessary part of the judgment. (In ordinary cognition of the world, this lack of restriction would be entirely out of place. It would be nonsense to judge whether a particular thing was a sofa without restricting my judgment to that particular thing, and to the concept of a sofa.) However, considered in general (that is, in their essence as sub-faculties) the faculties of imagination and understanding are likewise not restricted to any presentation or kind of sense, or any concept. This means that Kant is describing the ‘proportion’ between understanding and intuition as something like the always present possibility of the faculties being freed to mutually enact their essence.
Because such faculties in general are required for all theoretical cognition whatsoever, regardless of its object (as Kant claims to have proven in the first Critique), they can be assumed present a priori, in the same form and in the same way, in all human beings. The presence of the cognitive sub-faculties in their various relations is equivalent with the principle of the universal communicability and validity (i.e. common sense) of any mental states in which these faculties are involved a priori. Therefore, an aesthetic judgment must be seen to be an expression of this principle. The key move is obviously to claim that the aesthetic judgment rests upon the same unique conditions as ordinary cognition, and thus that the former must have the same universal communicability and validity as the latter. It is just that, presented with the beautiful, our cognitive faculties are released from the limitations that characterize ordinary thought, and produce what above we called a cascade of thoughts and feelings.
It is difficult to know what to make of this argument (with the various other versions of it scattered throughout the text) and the hypothesis it purports to prove. For one thing, Kant’s work here is so heavily reliant upon the results of the first Critique as to not really be able to stand on its own, while at the same time it is not clear at several points whether the first and third Critiques are fully compatible. For another, does not all this talk about the faculties ‘in general’ seem as if Kant is hypostatising these faculties, as really existent things in the mind that act, rather than simply as an expression for certain capacities? However, there is no doubting the fascinating and profound implications of what Kant is proposing. For example, the notions of common sense and communicability are closely akin to key political ideas, leading several commentators to propose that what Kant is really writing about are the foundations of any just politics (see e.g. sect.60). Or again, the ‘freedom’ of the imagination is explicitly linked by Kant to the freedom characteristic of the moral will, allowing Kant to construct a deeply rooted link between beauty and the moral (sect.59). Finally, of course, there is K
c. The Sublime
Overview: For Kant, the other basic type of aesthetic experience is the sublime. The sublime names experiences like violent storms or huge buildings which seem to overwhelm us; that is, we feel we ‘cannot get our head around them’. This is either mainly ‘mathematical’ – if our ability to intuit is overwhelmed by size (the huge building) – or ‘dynamical’ – if our ability to will or resist is overwhelmed by force (e.g. the storm). The problem for Kant here is that this experience seems to directly contradict the principle of the purposiveness of nature for our judgment. And yet, Kant notes, one would expect the feeling of being overwhelmed to also be accompanied by a feeling of fear or at least discomfort. Whereas, the sublime can be a pleasurable experience. All this raises the question of what is going on in the sublime
Kant’s solution is that, in fact, the storm or the building is not the real object of the sublime at all. Instead, what is properly sublime are ideas of reason: namely, the ideas of absolute totality or absolute freedom. However huge the building, we know it is puny compared to absolute totality; however powerful the storm, it is nothing compared to absolute freedom. The sublime feeling is therefore a kind of ‘rapid alternation’ between the fear of the overwhelming and the peculiar pleasure of seeing that overwhelming overwhelmed. Thus, it turns out that the sublime experience is purposive after all – that we can, in some way, ‘get our head around it’.
Since the ideas of reason (particularly freedom) are also important for Kant’s moral theory, there seems to be an interesting connection between the sublime and morality. This Kant discusses under the heading of ‘moral culture’, arguing for example that the whole sublime experience would not be possible if humans had not received a moral training that taught them to recognize the importance of their own faculty of reason.
Traditionally, the sublime has been the name for objects inspiring awe, because of the magnitude of their size/height/depth (e.g. the ocean, the pyramids of Cheops), force (a storm), or transcendence (our idea of God). Vis-à-vis the beautiful, the sublime presents some unique puzzles to Kant. Three in particular are of note. First, that while the beautiful is concerned with form, the sublime may even be (or even especially be) formless. Second, that while the beautiful indicates (at least for judgment) a purposiveness of nature that may have profound implications, the sublime appears to be ‘counter-purposive’. That is, the object appears ill-matched to, does ‘violence’ to, our faculties of sense and cognition. Finally, although from the above one might expect the sublime experience to be painful in some way, in fact the sublime does still involve pleasure – the question is ‘how?’.
Kant divides the sublime into the ‘mathematical’ (concerned with things that have a great magnitude in and of themselves) and the ‘dynamically’ (things that have a magnitude of force in relation to us, particularly our will). The mathematical sublime is defined as something ‘absolutely large‘ that is, ‘large beyond all comparison‘ (sect.25). Usually, we apply some kind of standard of comparison, although this need not be explicit (e.g. ‘Mt. Blanc is large’ usually means ‘compared with other mountains (or perhaps, with more familiar objects), Mt. Blanc is large’). The absolutely large, however, is not the result of a comparison
Now, of course, any object is measurable – even the size of the universe, no less a mountain on Earth. But Kant then argues that measurement not merely mathematical in nature (the counting of units), but fundamentally relies upon the ‘aesthetic’ (in the sense of ‘intuitive’ as used in the first Critique) grasp of a unit of measure. Dealing with a unit of measure, whether it be a millimeter or a kilometer, requires a number (how many units) but also a sense of what the unit is. This means that there will be absolute limits on properly aesthetic measurement because of the limitations of the finite, human faculties of sensibility. In the first place, there must be an absolute unit of measure, such that nothing larger could be ‘apprehended’; in the second place, there must be a limit to the number of such units that can be held together in the imagination and thus ‘comprehended’ (sect.26). An object that exceeds these limits (regardless of its mathematical size) will be presented as absolutely large – although of course it is still so with respect to our faculties of sense.
However, we must return to the second and third peculiar puzzles of the sublime. As we saw above with respect to the beautiful, pleasure lies in the achievement of a purpose, or at least in the recognition of a purposiveness. So, if the sublime presents itself as counter-purposive, why and how is pleasure associated with it? In other words, where is the purposiveness of the sublime experience? Kant writes,
[W]e express ourselves entirely incorrectly when we call this or that object of nature sublime … for how can we call something by a term of approval if we apprehend it as in itself contrapurposive? (sect.23)
This problem constitutes Kant’s principle argument that something else must be going on in the sublime experience other than the mere overwhelmingness of some object. As Kant will later claim, objects of sense (oceans, pyramids, etc.) are called ‘sublime’ only by a kind of covert sleight-of-hand, what he calls a ‘subreption’ (sect.27). In fact, what is actually sublime, Kant argues, are ideas of our own reason. The overwhelmingness of sensible objects leads the minds to these ideas.
Now, such presentations of reason are necessarily unexhibitable by sense. Moreover, the faculty of reason is not merely an inert source of such ideas, but characteristically demands that its ideas be presented. (This same demand is what creates all the dialectical problems that Kant analyses in, for example, the Antinomies.) Kant claims that the relation of the overwhelming sensible object to our sense is in a kind of ‘harmony’ (sect.27) or analogy to the relation of the rational idea of absolute totality to any sensible object or faculty. The sublime experience, then, is a two-layer process. First, a contrapurposive layer in which our faculties of sense fail to complete their task of presentation. Second, a strangely purposive layer in which this very failure constitutes a ‘negative exhibition’ (‘General Comment’ following sect.29) of the ideas of reason (which could not otherwise be presented). This ‘exhibition’ thus also provides a purposiveness of the natural object for the fulfillment of the demands of reason. Moreover, and importantly, it also provides a new and ‘higher’ purposiveness to the faculties of sense themselves which are now understood to be properly positioned with respect to our ‘supersensible vocation’ (sect.27) – i.e. in the ultimately moral hierarchy of the faculties. Beyond simply comprehending individual sensible things, our faculty of sensibility, we might say, now knows what it is for. We will return to this point shortly. The consequence of this purposiveness is exactly that ‘negative pleasure’ (sect.23) for which we had be searching. The initial displeasure of the ‘violence’ against our apparent sensible interests is now matched by a ‘higher’ pleasure arising from the strange purposiveness Kant has discovered. Interestingly, on Kant’s description, neither of these feelings wins out – instead, the sublime feeling consists of a unique ‘vibration’ or ‘rapid alternation’ of these feelings (sect.27).
The dynamically sublime is similar. In this case, a ‘might’ or power is observed in nature that is irresistible with respect to our bodily or sensible selves. Such an object is ‘fearful’ to be sure, but (because we remain disinterested) is not an object of fear. (Importantly, one of Kant’s examples here is religion: God is fearful but the righteous man is not afraid. This is the difference, he says, between a rational religion and mere superstition.) Again, the sublime is a two-layered experience. Kant writes that such objects ‘raise the soul’s fortitude above its usual middle range and allow us to discover in ourselves an ability to resist which is of a quite different kind…’ (sect.28). In particular, nature is called ‘sublime merely because it elevates the imagination to the exhibition of those cases wherein the mind can be made to feel [sich fühlbar machen] the sublimity, even above nature, that is proper to its vocation’ (sect.28, translation modified). In particular, the sublimity belongs to human freedom which is (by definition) unassailable to the forces of nature. Such a conception of freedom as being outside the order of nature, but demanding action upon that order, is the core of Kant’s moral theory. Thus we can begin to see the intimate connection between the sublime (especially here the dynamically sublime) and morality
This connection (for the sublime in general) becomes even more explicit in Kant’s discussion of what he calls ‘moral culture’. (sect.29) The context is to ask about the modality of judgments on the sublime – that is, to they have the same implicit demand on the necessary assent of others that judgments on the beautiful have? Kant’s answer is complicated. There is an empirical factor which is required for the sublime: the mind of the experiencer must be ‘receptive’ to rational ideas, and this can only happen in a culture that already understands morality as being a function of freedom or, more generally, conceives of human beings as having a dimension which in some way transcends nature. The sublime, properly speaking, is possible only for members of such a moral culture (and, Kant sometimes suggests, may reciprocally contribute to the strengthening of that culture). So, the sublime is subjected to an empirical contingency. However, Kant claims, we are justified in demanding from everyone that they necessarily have the transcendental conditions for such moral culture, and thus for the sublime, because these conditions are (as in the case of the beautiful) the same as for theoretical and practical thought in general. The claims about moral culture show that, for Kant, aesthetics in general is not an isolated problem for philosophy but intimately linked to metaphysical and moral questions. This is one more reason why it is important not to assume that the Critique of Aesthetic Judgment is a book merely about beauty and sublimity. Moreover, this ‘link’ has an even greater significance for Kant: it shows reflective judgment in action as it were relating together both theoretical and practical reason, for this was the grand problem he raised in his Introduction.
Kant’s treatment of the sublime raises many difficulties. For example, only the dynamically sublime has any strict relationship to the moral idea of freedom. This raises the question of whether the mathematical and dynamically sublime are in fact radically different, both in themselves as experiences, and in their relation to ‘moral culture’. Again, Kant gives an interesting account of how magnitude is estimated in discussing the mathematical sublime, but skips the parallel problem in the dynamically sublime (how does one estimate force?). Finally, many readers have found the premise of the whole discussion implausible: that in the sublime experience, what is properly sublime and the object of respect should be the idea of reason, rather than nature.
d. Fine Art and Genius
Overview: Thus far, Kant’s main focus for the discussion of beauty and the sublime has been nature. He now turns to fine art. Kant assumes that the cognition involved in judging fine art is similar to the cognition involved in judging natural beauty. Accordingly, the problem that is new to fine art is not how it is judged by a viewer, but how it is created. The solution revolves around two new concepts: the ‘genius’ and ‘aesthetic ideas’.
Kant argues that art can be tasteful (that is, agree with aesthetic judgment) and yet be ‘soulless’ – lacking that certain something that would make it more than just an artificial version of a beautiful natural object. What provides soul in fine art is an aesthetic idea. An aesthetic idea is a counterpart to a rational idea: where the latter is a concept that could never adequately be exhibited sensibly, the former is a set of sensible presentations to which no concept is adequate. An aesthetic idea, then, is as successful an attempt as possible to ‘exhibit’ the rational idea. It is the talent of genius to generate aesthetic ideas, but that is not all. First, the mode of expression must also be tasteful – for the understanding’s ‘lawfulness’ is the condition of the expression being in any sense universal and capable of being shared. The genius must also find a mode of expression which allows a viewer not just to ‘understand’ the work conceptually, but to reach something like the same excited yet harmonious state of mind that the genius had in creating
Starting in sect.43, Kant addresses himself particularly to fine art for the first time. The notion of aesthetic judgment already developed remains central. But unlike the investigation of beauty in nature, the focus shifts from the transcendental conditions for judgment of the beautiful object to the transcendental conditions of the making of fine art. In other words: how is it possible to make art? To solve this, Kant will introduce the notion of genius.
But that is not the only shift. Kant stands right in the middle of a complete historical change in the central focus of aesthetics. While formerly, philosophical aesthetics was largely content to take its primary examples of beauty and sublimity from nature, after Kant the focus is placed squarely on works of art. Now, in Kant, fine art seems to ‘borrow’ its beauty or sublimity from nature. Fine art is therefore a secondary concept. On the other hand, of course, in being judged aesthetically, nature is seen ‘as if’ purposeful, designed, or a product of an intelligence. So, in this case at least, the notion of ‘nature’ itself can be seen as secondary with respect to the notions of design or production, borrowed directly from art. Thus, the relation between nature and art is much more complex than it seems at first. Kant’s work thus forms an important part of the historical change mentioned above. Moreover, it is clear from a number of comments that Kant makes about ‘genius’ that he is an aesthetic conservative reacting against, for example, the emphasis on the individual, impassioned artist characteristic of the ‘Sturm und Drang‘ movement. But, historically, his discussion of the concept contributed to the escalation of the concept in the early 19th Century.
So, in order to understand how art is possible, we have to first understand what art is, and what art production is, vis-á-vis natural objects and natural ‘production’. First, then, what does Kant mean by ‘nature’? (1) On the one hand, in expressions like ‘the nature of X’ (e.g. ‘the nature of human cognition’), it means those properties which belong essentially to X. This can either be an empirical claim or, more commonly in Kant, a priori. On the other hand, nature as itself an object has several meanings for Kant. Especially: (2) If I say ‘nature as opposed to art’ I mean that realm of objects not presented as the objects of sensible will – that is, which are quite simply not made or influenced by human hands. (3) If I say ‘nature as an object of cognition’ I mean any object capable of being dealt with ‘objectively’ or ‘scientifically’. This includes things in space outside of us, but also aspects of sensible human nature that are the objects of sciences such as psychology. (4) Nature is also the object of reflective judgments and is that which is presupposed to be purposive or pre-adapted with respect to judgment.
Kant begins by giving a long clarification of art. As a general term, again, art refers to the activity of making according to a preceding notion. If I make a chair, I must know, in advance, what a chair is. We distinguish art from nature because (though we may judge nature purposive) we know in fact there is no prior notion behind the activity of a flower opening. The flower doesn’t have an idea of opening prior to opening – the flower doesn’t have a mind or a will to have or execute ideas with.
Art also means something different from science – as Kant says, it is a skill distinguished from a type of knowledge. Art involves some kind of practical ability, irreducible to determinate concepts, which is distinct from a mere comprehension of something. The latter can be fully taught; the former, although subject to training to be sure, relies upon native talent. (Thus, Kant will later claim, there can be no such thing as a scientific genius, because a scientific mind can never be radically original. See sect.46.) Further, art is distinguished from labor or craft – the latter being something satisfying only for the payoff which results and not for the mere activity of making itself. Art (not surprisingly, like beauty) is free from any interest in the existence of the product itself.
Arts are subdivided into mechanical and aesthetic. The former are those which, although not handicrafts, never-the-less are controlled by some definite concept of a purpose to be produced. The latter are those wherein the immediate object is merely pleasure itself. Finally, Kant distinguishes between agreeable and fine art. The former produces pleasure through sensation alone, the latter through various types of cognitions
This taxonomy of fine art defines more precisely the issue for Kant. What, then, ‘goes on’ in the mind of the artist? It is clearly not just a matter of applying good taste, otherwise all art critics would be artists, all musicians composers, and so forth. Equally, it is not a question of simply expressing oneself using whatever means come to hand, since such productions might well lack taste. We feel reasonably secure that we know how it is possible for, for example, clockmakers to make clocks, or glass-blowers to blow glass (which doesn’t mean that we can make clocks or blow glass, but that as a kind of activity, we understand it). We have also investigated how it is for someone looking at a work of beauty to judge it. But it is not yet clear how, on the side of production, fine art gets made.
Kant sums up the problem in two apparent paradoxes. The first of these is easy to state. Fine art is a type of purposeful production, because it is made; art in general is production according to a concept of an object. But fine art can have no concept adequate to its production, else any judgment on it will fail one of the key features of all aesthetic judgments: namely purposiveness without a purpose. Fine art therefore must both be, and not be, an art in general.
To introduce the second paradox, Kant notices that we have a problem with the overwrought – that which draws attention to itself as precisely an artificial object or event. ‘Over-the-top’ acting is a good example. Kant expresses this point by saying that, in viewing a work of art we must be aware of it as art, but it must never-the-less appear natural. Where ‘natural’ here stands for the appearance of freedom from conventional rules of artifice; this concept is derived from the second sense of ‘nature’ given above. The paradox is that art (the non-natural) must appear to be natural.
Kant must overcome these paradoxes and explain how fine art can be produced at all. In sect.46, the first step is taken when Kant, in initially defining ‘genius’, conflates ‘nature’ in the first sense above with nature in the third sense. He writes,
Genius is the talent (natural endowment) that gives the rule to art. Since talent is an innate productive ability of the artist and as such belongs itself to nature, we could also put it this way: Genius is the innate mental predisposition (ingenium) through which nature gives the rule to art. (sect.46)
In other words, that which makes it possible to produce (fine art) is not itself produced – not by the individual genius, nor (we should add) through his or her culture, history, education, etc. From the definition of genius as that talent through which nature gives the rule to art follows (arguably!) the following key propositions. First, fine art is produced by individual humans, but not as contingent individuals. That is, not by human nature in the empirically known sense. Second, fine art as aesthetic (just like nature as aesthetic) can have no definite rules or concepts for producing or judging it. But genius supplies a rule, fully applicable only in the one, concrete instance, precisely by way of the universal structures of the genius’ mental abilities (which again, is ‘natural’ in sense one).
Third, the rule supplied by genius is more a rule governing what to produce, rather than how. Thus, while all fine art is a beautiful ‘presentation’ of an object (sect.48), this partly obscures the fact that genius is involved in the original creation of the object to be presented. The ‘how’ is usually heavily informed by training and technique, and is governed by taste. Taste, Kant claims, is an evaluative faculty, not a productive one (sect.48). Thus, the end of sect.47, he will distinguish between supplying ‘material’ and elaborating the ‘form’. Fourth, because of this, originality is a characteristic of genius. This means also that fine art properly is never an imitation of previous art, though it may ‘follow’ or be ‘inspired by’ previous art (sect.47). Fifth, as we mentioned above, fine art must have the ‘look of nature’ (sect.45). This is because the rule of its production (that concept or set of concepts of an object and of the ‘how’ of its production which allows the genius to actually make some specific something) is radically original. Thus, fine art is ‘natural’ in sense two, in that it lies outside the cycle of production and re-production within which all other arts in general are caught up (and thus, again, cannot be imitated). This leads Kant to make some suggestive, but never fully worked out, comments about artistic influences and schools, the role of culture, of technique and education, etc. (See e.g. sect.49-50)
Having made the various distinctions between the matter and the form of expression in genius’ work, or again between the object and its presentation, Kant applies these to a brief if eccentric comparative study of the varieties of fine art (sect.51-53). According to the manner of presentation, he divides all fine arts into the arts of speech (especially poetry, which Kant ranks the highest of the arts), the arts of visual form (sculpture, architecture and painting), and the arts involving a play of sensible tones (music). The last pages of this part of Kant’s book are taken up with a curious collection of comments on the ‘gratifying’ (non-aesthetic but still relatively free activities), especially humor.
However, we have not yet clarified what kind of thing the ‘rule’ supplied by genius is; therefore we have not yet reached an understanding of the nature of the ‘talent’ for the production of fine art that is genius.
Genius provides the matter for fine art, taste provides the form. The beautiful is always formal, as we have already discovered. So, what distinguishes one ‘matter’ from another, such that genius might be required? What genius does, Kant says, is to provide ‘soul’ or ‘spirit’ (‘Seele‘, sect.49) to what would otherwise be uninspired. This peculiar idea seems to be used in a sense analogous to saying that someone ‘has soul’, meaning to have nobility or a deep and exemplary moral character, as opposed to being shallow or even in a sense animal-like; but Kant also, following the Aristotelian tradition, means that which makes something alive rather than mere material. There can be an uninspired fine art, but it is not very interesting (pure beauty, mentioned above, may be an example). There can also, Kant warns, be inspired nonsense, which is also not very interesting. Genius inspires art works – gives them spirit – and does so by linking the work of art to what Kant will call aesthetic ideas.
This is defined in the third paragraph of sect.49. The aesthetic idea is a presentation of the imagination to which no thought is adequate. This is a ‘counterpart’ to rational ideas (which we encountered above in talking of the sublime), which are thoughts to which nothing sensible or imagined can be adequate. Each is excessive, we might say, but on different sides of our cognitive apparatus. Aesthetic ideas are seen to be ‘straining’ after the presentation of rational ideas – this is what gives them their excess over any set of ordinary determinate concepts.
In the judgment of the beautiful, we had a harmony between the imagination and the understanding, such that each furthered the extension of the other. Kant is now saying: certainly that is true for all judgments of taste, whether of natural or artificial objects. And yet we can distinguish between such a harmony which happens on the experiencing of a beautiful form simply, or a harmony which happens on the experiencing of a beautiful form that itself is the expression of something yet higher but that cannot in any other way be expressed. (The notion of ‘expression’ is important: what Kant is describing is an aesthetic process, rather than a process of understanding something with concepts, and then communicating that understanding.) Inspired fine art is beautiful, but in addition is an expression of the state of mind which is generated by an aesthetic idea.
The relevant passages in sect.49 are both confused and compressed. Kant seems to have two different manners in which aesthetic ideas can be the spirit of fine art. First, the aesthetic idea is a presentation of a rational idea (one of Kant’s examples is the moral idea of cosmopolitan benevolence). Of course, we know that there is no such adequate presentation. An obvious example might be a novelist or playwright’s attempt to portray a morally upright character: because, for Kant, an important part of our moral being transcends the world of phenomena, there must always be a mis-match between the idea and the portrayal of the character. Here the aesthetic idea seems to function by prompting an associated or coordinated surplus of thought that is directly analogous to the associated surplus of imaginative presentations demanded by rational ideas. (We saw a similar relation between the demand of rational ideas and imaginative activity in Kant’s analysis of the sublime. Indeed, arguably there is an analogy here to the concept of ‘negative exhibition’.) In practice, this will often involve what Kant calls ‘aesthetic attributes’: more ordinary, intermediate images: ‘Thus Jupiter’s eagle with the lightning in its claws is an attribute of the mighty king of heaven’.
Second, the aesthetic idea can be an impossibly perfect or complete presentation of a possible empirical experience and its concept (death, envy, love, fame are Kant’s examples). Here the aesthetic idea is not presenting a particular rational idea so much as a general function of reason: the striving for a maximum, a totality or the end of a series (as in Kant’s account of the mathematical sublime). And again, the effect is an associated ‘expansion’ of the concept beyond its determinate bounds. In either case, the aesthetic idea is not merely a presentation, but one which will set the imagination and understanding into a harmony, creating the same kind of self-sustaining and self-contained feeling of pleasure as the beautiful.
Kant’s theory of genius – for all its vagueness and lack of philosophical rigor – has been enormously influential. In particular, the radical separation of the aesthetic genius from the scientific mind; the emphasis on the near-miraculous expression (through aesthetic ideas and attributes) of the ineffable, excited state of mind; the link of fine art to a ‘metaphysical’ content; the requirement of radical originality; the raising of poetry to the head of all arts – all these claims (though not all of them entirely unique to Kant) were commonplaces and wide-spread for well over a century after Kant. Indeed, when modernists protested (often paradoxically) against the concept of the artist by using ‘automatic writing’ or ‘found objects’ it is, for the most part, this concept of the artist-genius that they are reacting against.
e. Idealism, Morality and the Supersensible
Overview: Let us return to the notion of beauty as tackled in sections A1 and A2. Viewed from the position of our knowledge of nature, the supposed purposiveness of nature looks like nonsense. Not only does our scientific knowledge seem to have no room for the concept of a purpose, but many and perhaps all beautiful natural objects can be accounted for on purely scientific terms. Thus, any principle of purposiveness can only be understood as ideal. That is, such a principle says more about the particular nature of our cognitive faculties than it says about what nature really is.
But the principle of purposiveness is still valid from the point of view of the activities of judgment. This in turn means that, for judgment, the question is valid as to how this natural purposiveness is to be explained. The only possible account is that the appearance of purposiveness in nature is conditioned by the supersensible realm underlying nature. But this means that beauty is a kind of revelation of the hidden substrate of the world, and that this substrate has a necessary sympathy with our highest human projects. To this, Kant adds a series of important analogies between the activity of aesthetic judgment and the activity of moral judgment. These analyses lead Kant to claim that beauty is the ‘symbol of morality’.
Above, at the end of section A1, we saw Kant claim that his whole account of the transcendental possibility of judgments on the beautiful could be summed up in the notion of common sense. This principle of common sense is the form that the general a priori principle of the purposiveness of nature for judgment takes when we are trying to understand the subjective conditions of aesthetic judgments of beauty. That is, where the principle is taken as a rule governing the conditions of aesthetic judgments in the subject, then it is properly called ‘common sense’. But where the principle is taken to be functioning like a concept of an object (the beautiful thing), then it is to be seen as the principle of the purposiveness of all nature for our judgment (see sect.55-58). But nature, understood scientifically, is not purposive. This strange situation gives rise to what Kant calls a ‘dialectic’ – merely apparent knowledge claims or paradoxes that arise from the misuse of a faculty. Just as in the ‘dialectic’ sections in the first two Critiques (see the entry on ‘Kant’s Metaphysics’), he Kant solves the problem by way of an appeal to the rational idea of the supersensible. Dialectical problems, for Kant, always involves a confusion between the rational ideas of the supersensible (which have at best a merely regulative validity) and natural concepts (which have a validity guaranteed but restricted to appearances). This particular form of dialectical problem involves two contradictory, but apparently necessary, truth claims – Kant calls such a situation an ‘antinomy’. (See Introduction 2 above, and the entry on ‘Kant’s Metaphysics’.) A similar dialectical problem will arise in the ‘Critique of Teleological Judgment’ where we will resume our discussion of these issues. For the moment it is enough to observe that the Antinomy of Taste seems to involve two contradictory claims about the origin of beautiful objects.
However, it could be the case that nature as the object of scientific laws (‘nature’, as Kant is fond of saying, according to the ‘immanent’ principles of the understanding), is itself responsible for the beautiful forms in nature (Kant’s example is the formation of beautiful crystals, understood perfectly through the science of chemistry). This possibility demonstrates the idealism of the principle of purposiveness. Kant thus writes, ‘we … receive nature with favor, [it is] not nature that favors us’ (sect.58).
Just as we must assume that objects of sense as appearances are ideal if we are to explain how we can determine their forms a priori, so we must presuppose an idealistic interpretation of purposiveness in judging the beautiful in nature and in art… (sect.58)
But at the same time, this idealism also necessarily raises the question of what conditions beautiful appearances: if we are asking for a concept that accounts (on the side of the ideal object) for this purposiveness, it must be what Kant calls the realm of the ‘supersensible’ that is ‘underlying’ all nature and all humanity. As we know, no other concept (e.g. a natural concept) is adequate to grasping the beautiful object as beautiful. So, in forming an aesthetic judgment, which judges a beautiful object as purposive without purpose, we must assume the legitimacy of the rational concept of an underlying supersensible realm in order to account for that purposiveness. This assumption is valid only within and only for that judgment, and thus is certainly not a matter of knowledge. Thus, Kant can borrow the notion of aesthetic idea from his account of fine art and, speaking from the point of view of reflective judgment, say that beauty in general is always the expression of aesthetic ideas (sect.51). From the point of view of judgment, everything happens as if the unfolding beauty of the natural world is like the product of a genius. This piques the interest of reason – for judgment has, as it were, found phenomenal evidence of the reality of reason’s more far-reaching claims about the supersensible (see B3 below). The profundity of beauty, for Kant, consists of precisely this assumption by judgment; it allows him to make further connections between beauty and morality, and (as we shall see) ultimately to suggest the unity of all the disciplines of philosophy.
The last major section of the Critique of Aesthetic Judgment famously considers the relation between beauty and morality, which recalls the earlier treatment of the sublime and moral culture. Here, Kant claims that beauty is the ‘symbol’ of morality (sect.59). A symbol, he argues, is to be defined as a kind of presentation of a rational idea in an intuition. The ‘presentation’ in question is an analogy between how judgment deals with or reflects upon the idea and upon the symbolic intuition. Thus, if ‘justice’ is symbolized by a blind goddess with a scale, it is not because all judges are blind! Rather, ‘blindness’ and ‘weighing’ function as concepts in judgments in a way analogous to how the concept of ‘justice’ functions. In showing how beauty in general is the symbol of morality, Kant lists four points: (1) Both please directly and not through consequences; (2) Both are disinterested; (3) Both involve the idea of a free conformity to law (free conformity of the imagination in the case of beauty, of the will in the case of morality); (4) Both are understood to be founded upon a universal principle. The importance of this section is two-fold: first, historically, Kant is giving a philosophical underpinning to the notion that taste should be related to and, through cultivation, also promotes morality. This is a claim that is often rolled out even today. Second, the link to morality is a detailing out of the basic link between aesthetics in general and the pure concepts of reason (ideas). First aesthetic judgments (both the sublime and the beautiful), and then teleological judgments will form the bridge between theoretical and practical reason, and (Kant hopes) bring unity to philosophy. We shall return to this in section B4.
3. Kant’s Teleology
a. Objective Purposiveness and Science
Overview: The second part of Kant’s book deals with a special form of judgment called ‘teleological judgment’. The word ‘teleology’ comes from the Greek word ‘telos’ meaning end or purpose. A teleological judgment, on Kant’s account, is a judgment concerning an object the possibility of which can only be grasped from the point of view of its purpose. The purpose in question Kant calls an ‘intrinsic purpose’. In such a case, we have to say that, strictly speaking, the object was not made according to a purpose that is different from the object (as the idea of vegetable soup in the mind of the cook is different from the soup itself), but that the object itself embodies its purpose. Kant is talking mainly about living organisms (which he calls ‘natural purposes’), which are both cause and effect, both blueprint and product, of themselves. The problem here is that such a notion is paradoxical for human thought in general, and certainly incompatible with scientific thought.
This raises two issues. First, the paradoxical nature of any concept of a natural purpose means that our minds necessarily supplement judgment with the concept of causation through purposes – i.e. the concept of art, broadly speaking. In other words, for lack of any more adequate resources, we think natural purposes on an analogy with the production of man-made objects according to their purpose. Second, just as with aesthetic judgments, Kant does not claim that such judgments ever achieve knowledge. Kant argues that teleological judgments are required, even in science – but not to explain organisms, rather simply to recognize their existence, such that biological science can then set about trying to understanding them on its own terms.
The word ‘teleology’ comes from the Greek word ‘telos’ meaning end or purpose. A teleological judgment, on Kant’s account, is a judgment concerning an object the possibility of which can only be grasped from the point of view of its purpose.
The second half of Kant’s book (the ‘Critique of Teleological Judgment’) is much less often studied and referred to. This is of course related to the fact that Kant’s aesthetics has been hugely influential, while his teleology has sparked less contemporary interest; and also the fact that, in the Introduction to the whole text, Kant writes that ‘In a critique of judgment, [only] the part that deals with aesthetic judgment belongs to it essentially.’ (Introduction VIII). This is because, as we saw above, in aesthetic judgment the faculty of judgment is, as it were, on its own – although certainly the action of judgment there has implications for our faculty of reason. In teleological judgment, on the other hand, the action of judgment – although still reflective – is much more closely linked to ordinary theoretical cognition of nature. Judgment in its teleological function is not, let us say, laid bare in its purity. However, it would be wrong to ignore the ‘Critique of Teleological Judgment’ either on the grounds of its lesser influence, or especially on the assumption that its content is intrinsically less interesting.
The main difference between aesthetic and teleological judgments is the ‘reality’ of the purpose for the object. Whereas the object of aesthetic judgment was purposive without a purpose, the objects of teleological judgment do have purposes for which a concept or idea is to hand. There are, Kant claims, two types of real purposes: first, an ‘extrinsic purpose’ which is the role a thing may play in being a means to some end. An example would be an object of art in the general sense: a shoe for example, or a landscaped garden – something that was made for a purpose, and where the purpose is the reason behind it being made.
However, just as in the critique of aesthetic judgment, such ordinary examples are not (apparently) troubling and are thus not what Kant has in mind. So, Kant notes that there is a second type of real purpose, an ‘intrinsic purpose’. In this case, rather than the purpose being primarily understood as ‘behind’ the production of a thing, a thing embodies its own purpose. These are what Kant calls ‘natural purposes’ (also translated as ‘physical ends’), and the key examples are living organisms (sect.65).
Such an organism is made up of parts – individual organs, and below that, individual cells. These parts, however, are ‘organized’ – they are determined to be the parts that they are – according to the form or ‘purpose’ which is the whole creature. The parts reciprocally produce and are produced by the form of the whole. Nor is the idea of the whole separate to the organism and its cause (for then the creature would be an art product.) A mechanical clock may be made up or organized parts, but this organization is not the clock itself, but rather the concept of the clock in the mind of the craftsperson who made it. The organism is such insofar as it intrinsically and continually produces itself; the clock is not an organism because it has to be made according to a concept of it.
But how does this principle relate to the sciences of nature? Such an account of organisms as teleological is not original to Kant. It extends back to Aristotle, and, despite increasing hostility to Aristotle’s physics since the Renaissance, remained a commonplace in European biology through the 18th century and beyond. Kant is very careful to distinguish himself from the rationalist position which, he claims, takes teleology as a constitutive principle – that is, as a principle of scientific knowledge. Importantly, Kant claims that such a teleological causation is utterly alien to natural causation as our understanding is able to conceive it. However, since natural mechanical causal connections are necessary, this means that a physical end has to be understood to be contingent with respect to such ‘mechanical’ natural laws. Reason, however, always demands necessity in its objects (the principle of reason here is akin to Leibniz’s notion of the principle of sufficient reason; see entry on Leibniz’s Metaphysics). Accordingly, reason provides the idea of causation according to ends (on the analogy of art being the product of a will). As we know, however, a purely rational concept has no constitutive validity with respect to objects of experience. Instead, Kant claims, teleological judgment is merely reflective, and its principle merely regulative. The teleological judgment gives no knowledge, in other words, but simply allows the cognitive faculty to recognize a certain class of empirical objects (living organisms) that then might be subjected (so far as that is possible) to further, empirical, study. In effect, Kant is saying that, were it not for the reflective judgment and the principle of its functioning here (the rational idea of an ‘intrinsic’ end or purpose), the ability to experience something as alive (and thus subsequently to study it as the science of biology) would be impossible. Ordinary scientific judgments will be unable to fully explore and explain certain biological phenomena, and thus teleological judgments have a limited scientific role.
Such judgments only apply (with the above mentioned constraints) to individual things on the basis of their inner structure, and are not an attempt to account for their existence per se. Nevertheless, even this suggests to reason by analogy the idea of the whole of nature as a purposive system, which could only be explained if based upon some supersensible foundation – although it is hardly necessary in every instance to take the investigation so far (sect.85). In fact, the whole of nature is not given to us in this way, Kant admits, and therefore this extended idea is not as essential to science as the narrower one of natural purposes (sect.75). Nevertheless, the idea may be useful in discovering phenomena and laws in nature that might not have been recognized on a mechanical understanding alone. (Recent ecological thought, for example, has often tended to think of whole eco-systems as if they were in themselves organisms, and whole species of plants and animals (as well as the physical environment they inhabit) are their ‘organs’. Such an approach may be fruitful for understanding the inter-connectedness of the system, but also may be dangerous if taken too far – when it begins to see as necessary what in fact has to be considered as contingent.)
Thus Kant believes he has discovered a role, albeit a limited one, for teleological judgments within natural science. In fact, of course, the whole conception of biological science was moving away from such notions, first with the theory of evolution, and subsequently with the idea of genetics. Nevertheless, there is something fascinating about Kant’s conception of a natural purpose, which seems to capture something of the continuing scientific and philosophical difficulties in understanding what ‘life’ in general is.
b. ‘The Peculiarity of the Human Understanding’
Overview: Why is it the case that a proper concept of a natural purpose is impossible for us, and has to be supplemented with the concept of production according to a separate purpose? It is because of a fundamental ‘peculiarity’ of the human understanding, according to Kant. Our minds he describes as ‘intellectus ectypus’, cognition only by way of ‘images’. That is why it is impossible for us to understand something that is at the same time object and purpose. Kant then claims that this characterization of the human intellect raises the possibility of another form of intellect, the ‘intellectus archetypus‘, or cognition directly through the original. In such a case, there would be no distinction between perceiving a thing, understanding a thing, and the thing existing. This is as close as our finite minds can get to understanding the mind of God.
However, in dealing with the limited role discussed above, there is an implicit danger. If reason does not pay sufficient critical attention to the reflection involved the result is an antinomy (sect.70) between the basic scientific principle of the understanding – to seek to treat everything as necessary in being subject to natural laws – and the teleological principle – that there are some objects that are cannot be treated according to these laws, and are thus radically contingent with respect to them. Kant’s basic solution to this antinomy is given immediately (sect.71): the problem is simply that reason has forgotten that the second of these principles is not constitutive of its object – that is, does not account of the object’s existence. There could only be an antinomy if both principles were understood to be so constitutive. Kant, however, continues for several sections the discussion of the antinomy and its solution, in the end proposing a remarkable new solution.
In sect.77, Kant is at pains to point out that the teleological, reflective judgment is a necessity for human minds because of a peculiarity of such minds. (This discussion recalls the treatment of idealism in the ‘Critique of Aesthetic Judgment’ above.) In our understanding of the world (and for any other understanding we could imagine the workings of), the universal principle (law of nature) never fully determines any particular thing in all its real detail. Thus these details, although necessary in themselves as part of the order of nature, must be contingent with respect to our universal concept. It is simply beyond our understanding that there should be a concept that, in itself, determines as necessary all the features of any particular thing. (At this point, Kant is clearly influenced by Leibniz’s idea of the ‘complete concept’ – please see the entry on Leibniz’s Metaphysics.) As Kant explains it, an object so understood would be a whole that conditions all its parts.
But a living organism would be just such a whole. As we have seen, to understand its possibility we have to apply (through reflective judgment) the rational idea of an intrinsic purpose. Here, as we have just seen, the problem of the contingency with respect to natural law is exacerbated. But this idea is of a presentation of such a whole, and the presentation is conceived of as a purpose which conditions or leads to the production of the parts. Ours, in other words, is an understanding which always ‘requires images (it is an intellectus ectypus)’ (sect.77).
This peculiarity of our understanding poses the possibility of another form of intelligence, the intellectus archetypus, an intelligence which is not limited to this detour of presentations in its thinking and acting. Such an understanding would not function in a world of appearances, but directly in the world of things-in-themselves. Its power of giving the universal (concepts and ideas) would not be a separate power from its power of forming intuitions of particular things; concept and thing, thought and reality would be one. From the point of view of such an understanding, what we humans must conceive as the contingency of natural purposes with respect to the universal concept, is only an appearance. For the intellectus archetypus, such natural purposes would indeed be necessary, in the same sense as events subject to mechanical natural law. Thus, the notion of an intellectus archetypus – and the corresponding distinction for us between appearances and things-in-themselves – gives Kant a more complete way of solving the above antinomy. Because of the limitation of our understanding, we are incapable of knowing the details of the necessity of all natural processes. The idea of a natural purpose is an essential additional principle which partly corrects for this limitation, but also produces the antinomy. But the contingency introduced by the new principle is (or, rather, may be) only a contingency for us (as intellectus ectypus), and therefore the principle of natural purposes does not contradict the demand of reason for necessity.
Such an idea clearly takes us in the direction of theology – the study of the divine being, and that being’s relation to creation. But it is above all important to remember that, at this point, Kant is not claiming that there is, or must be, or that he can prove there to be, such a being. Thus, for example, given Kant’s concern with purposiveness and design, one might think he would make a case for the so-called ‘argument from design’ (the argument to the existence of a creator from the apparently designed quality of creation). But, in fact, Kant believes this to be an extraordinarily weak argument (see for example sect.sect.85, 90 and ‘General Comment on Teleology’), though interesting. Kant, however, thinks he has an argument which is related to it, and which (within certain limits) works much better. It is this argument which occupies most of the second half of the ‘Critique of Teleological Judgment’.
c. The Final Purpose and Kant’s Moral Argument for the Existence of God
Overview: The notion of the intellectus archetypus is clearly heading in the direction of philosophical theology. Kant’s book culminates with his most sustained presentation and discussion of his Moral Proof for the Existence of God.
Kant’s work already included some very famous critiques of other such proofs. In the Critique of Pure Reason, he provides some of the standard attacks on the cosmological and especially the ontological arguments. And in the Critique of Judgment, he argues that the argument from design, at least as normally stated, is very weak. Kant’s own proof, he thinks, avoids the problems typical of other arguments, precisely because it does not conclude by stating that we know the existence of God. This is because Kant is quite happy with the idea that God’s existence could never be necessary for theoretical reason. But he then asks whether practical reason – i.e. the moral side of our intellect – has the same limitation.
In Kant’s account of practical reason, the moral law is conceived of as duty. Acting from the mere pure and universal form of the moral law is everything, the consequences of action do not enter into the equation (see entry on ‘Kant’s Metaphysics’). However, Kant claims that the moral law obligates us to consider the final purpose or aim of all moral action. This final purpose of moral action Kant calls the ‘highest good’ (summum bonum). This means the greatest possible happiness for all moral beings. Importantly, this goal is not the ground of morality – unlike ordinary instances of desire or action, wherein I act precisely because I want to reach the goal. Moral action is grounded in duty – but, subsequently, so to speak, we must be assured that the final purpose is actually possible.
Just as moral action must be possible through freedom, so the summum bonum must be possible through moral action. But the possibility of the summum bonum as the final purpose in nature appears to be questionable. Therefore, if our moral action is to make sense, there must be someone working behind the scenes. This could only be activity of a ‘moral author of the world’ which would make it at least possible for the summum bonum to be reached. Moral action, therefore, assumes the existence of a God. But that the postulation of God lies ‘within’ moral action in this way automatically discounts the ‘moral proof’ from any theoretical validity.
After an extended discussion of the ins and outs of the role of teleological judgments in science, from sect.78 to around sect.82, Kant’s discussion begins to shift to a quite different topic. In sect.82 he argues in this way: it might seem, he says, that certain features of nature have as an extrinsic purpose their relations to other features: the nectar for the honey, the river for the irrigation of land near its bank, etc. (Ultimately, again, these might be seen as part of the intention or design of the intelligent cause of creation.) This, Kant says, is a perfectly understandable way of speaking sometimes, and even helps us to cognize certain natural processes, but has no objective foundation in science. There is always another way of looking at things for which what we thought was a purpose is in fact only a means to something else entirely (e.g. the nectar is simply a way of attracting bees for the purposes of pollination).
It is sometimes even claimed (often on a religious basis) that human beings are the real, ‘ultimate’ purpose of nature, and all other things have, in the end, the benefit and use of humans as an extrinsic end. But ‘in the chain of purposes man is never more than a link’ (sect.83). Nature per se does not, then, contain or pursue any such purposes, not even for man. But Kant is not quite yet finished with these kinds of problems, and introduces in sect.84 the idea of a ‘final purpose’.
Kant defines a ‘final purpose’ as ‘a purpose that requires no other purpose as a condition of its possibility’ (sect.84). This is no longer an extrinsic purpose that nature might have. Still, it is clear that, again, there can be no intrinsic final purpose in nature -all natural products and events are conditioned, including the world around us, our own bodies and even our mental life. (And living beings, qua natural purposes, are conditioned by themselves.) So, what kind of thing would such a final purpose be? Kant writes, ‘… the final purpose of an intelligent cause must be of such a kind that in the order of purposes it depends upon no condition other than just the idea of it’ (sect.84).
As we have discovered on several previous occasions, for Kant human beings are not merely natural beings. The human capacity for freedom is both a cause which acts according to purposes (the moral law) represented as necessary, and yet which has to be thought as independent of the chain of natural causation/purposes. Kant then writes, carefully, ‘… if things in the world … require a supreme cause that acts in terms of purposes, then man [qua free] is the final purpose of creation’ (sect.84). (As Kant emphasizes on several occasions – e.g. in the last part of sect.91 – it is the fact of freedom that forms the incontrovertible first premise of the argument he is about to put forward.) Put more grandly, ‘without man [as a moral being] all of creation would be a mere wasteland, gratuitous and without a final purpose’ (sect.86). Thus, the question that really ‘matters’, Kant writes, ‘is whether we do have a basis, sufficient for reason (whether speculative or practical), for attributing a final purpose to the supreme cause [in its] acting in terms of purposes’ (sect.86). Certainly, the argument will not involve a ‘speculatively’ (i.e. theoretically) sufficient basis.
Kant’s ‘moral proof for the existence of God’ is given beginning in sect.87. Actually, this proof first appeared in the Critique of Practical Reason a few years previously (see entry on Kant’s Metaphysics), and is in fact assumed through the Critique of Pure Reason. But Kant’s most detailed discussion is in the third Critique.
The rational idea of purposiveness, although never constitutive, seems to be relevant everywhere so far: in Kant’s account of the possibility of science in his Introduction, in the account of beauty (and in a different way in the sublime), and in the treatment of teleological judgments. Because these are one and all reflective judgments, they entail neither a theoretical nor a practical conclusion as to what might be behind these purposes. Even where teleological judgments about purposes in nature leads us to consider the possibility of a world author, this approach leaves quite indeterminate (and thus useless for the purposes of religion or theology) our idea of that world author (thus Kant’s ultimate criticism of what he calls ‘physicotheology’ in sect.85). But, Kant asks, is there any reason requiring us to assume nature is purposive with respect to practical reason?
In Kant’s account of practical reason, the moral law is conceived of as duty. Acting from the mere pure and universal form of the moral law is everything, the consequences of action do not enter into the equation. However, as Kant makes clear in the Introduction to the Critique of Judgment, the practical faculties in general have to do with desire – i.e. purposes motivating action – and the free will is termed the ‘higher’ faculty of desire. Kant claims that the moral law necessarily obligates us to consider the final purpose of moral action. However, it is not to be considered as the ground of morality, as would normally be the case in desire, when the presentation of the result (my aim) causes the action (action leading to that aim). This final purpose linked to the higher, moral, faculty of desire Kant calls the ‘highest good’ (summum bonum). Conceived of as a state of natural beings, this means the greatest possible happiness for all moral beings.
Kant is using this inter-implication of moral law and final purpose of moral action as a premise of his argument. The obvious question that arises is why, given the stress Kant always makes on the absolutely unconditioned nature of moral freedom, he should feel able to make this claim. It would seem as if precisely the purity of the free will would make any connection to purposes immoral. Kant writes that, even speaking practically, we must consider ourselves
… as beings of the world and hence as beings connected with other things in the world; and those same moral laws enjoin us to direct our judging to those other things [regarded] either as purposes or as objects for which we ourselves are the final purpose (sect.87).
In other words, practical reason is a human faculty – where, as always for Kant, being human is defined in terms of a unity of a lower, sensible nature together with a higher, supersensible dimension. Our sensibly conditioned will is not a different thing from our free will, but is the same faculty considered now as phenomenal psychology, now as noumenal activity. This must be the case if our actions in the phenomenal world are to be considered moral in any sense of the word. But this sensibly conditioned will does require attention to be paid to consequences – to the object of our action. Free will may determine itself unconditionally through the mere form of the moral law, but it remains the faculty of will, that is the higher faculty of desire, and thus retains the essential link to purposes.
Just as moral action must be possible through freedom, so the summum bonum must be possible through moral action. The impossibility of achieving this end would make a nonsense of moral action, because it would in effect mean that free will was no longer will, that practical reason was no longer practical (because it could not be said to act). Kant is claiming that it is just part of the meaning of an action – even a purely and formally determined action, i.e. one not conditioned by its purpose – to also posit the possibility of achieving its purpose.
But the possibility of the summum bonum as the final purpose in nature is not at all obvious. Indeed, a cynic might claim that moral action makes no difference at all – that the good man is no more happy for it, and that ‘nice guys finish last’. Kant writes,
.. the concept of the practical necessity of [achieving] such a purpose by applying our forces does not harmonize with the theoretical concept of the physical possibility its being achieved, if the causality of nature is the only causality (of a means [for achieving it]) that we connect with our freedom. (sect.87)
The obvious inference then is that the ‘causality of nature’ cannot be the ‘only causality’ – and there must also be the moral causality of a moral author of the world which would make it at least possible for the summum bonum to be reached. Without the postulate of such a moral author – who, as we saw above, must have our free morality in mind as a final purpose, if anything – our free moral action could not be represented as possible. Moral action, precisely as both moral and as action, within itself assumes the existence of a God. Of course, in acting morally we may not be conscious either of the summum bonum as final purpose, nor of the necessary postulation of God as moral author of the world – we are just doing what is right. Nevertheless, when that duty is fully understood, these necessary implications will be found within it.
But that the postulation of God is ‘within’ moral action in this way automatically discounts the ‘moral proof’ from any theoretical validity. Theoretical philosophy must continue to operate within its legitimate grounds, treating so far as possible all of nature as intelligible in terms of mechanical cause and effect and requiring neither purpose nor creator. This distinction is extremely important for Kant, as despite the link to morality and the ‘fact’ of our freedom, the ‘moral proof’ does not make of religion anything but a matter of faith (e.g. sect.91). This involves noting that the conception of God involved in the moral proof is and must be bound up with how things are cognizable by us. (This of course continues the treatment of the intellectus ectypus begun in sect.77 and of the idealism of reflective judgment in sect.58.) Kant writes, As for objects that we have to think a priori (either as consequences or as grounds) in reference to our practical use of reason in conformity with duty, but that are transcendent for the theoretical use of reason: they are mere matters of faith. […] To have faith … is to have confidence that we shall reach an aim that we have a duty to further, without our having insight into whether achieving it is possible. (sect.91)
The summum bonum, God as moral author (and the immortality of the soul, treated in the Critique of Practical Reason) are all such objects of faith. For Kant, this stress on faith keeps religion pure of the misunderstandings involved in, for example, fanaticism, demonology or idolatry (sect.89). Kant spends the last fifth of the ‘Critique of Teleological Judgment’ dealing with how his proof is to be understood, the nature and limitations of its validity, and various metaphysical and religious implications, including those for his own conception of critical philosophy.
Kant’s argument and later variations are generally considered to be one of the great arguments for the existence of a God. Obviously, questions can be raised about its validity. For example, whether the possibility of the final purpose is somehow necessarily linked to any moral action. However, the typical objection – that the argument is insufficient to give any knowledge – is just irrelevant, since Kant is not interested in knowledge at this point.
4. The Problem of the Unity of Philosophy and its Supersensible Objects
Overview: Let us conclude by looking at Kant’s grand conception for his Critique of Judgment.
The problem of the unity of philosophy is the problem of how thought oriented towards knowledge (theoretical reason) can be a product of the same faculty as thought oriented towards moral duty (practical reason). The problem of the unity of the objects of philosophy is the problem of how the ground of that which we know (the supersensible ground of nature) is the same as the ground of moral action (the supersensible ground of that nature in which the summum bonum is possible – together with freedom within the subject). Kant only makes some rather vague suggestions about how proof of these unities is to be established – but it is clear that he believes the faculty of judgment is the key
We will briefly look at the second of these problems. The central move is the a priori principle of nature’s purposiveness for judgment. This amounts to the assumption that judgment will always be possible, even in cases like aesthetic judgment where no concept can be found. As we discussed in A5, this principle makes a claim (though only from the ‘point of view’ of judgment) about the supersensible ground of nature. This claim leads to two assertions. First, that the supersensible ground of beauty in nature is the same as the undetermined ground of nature as an object of science. Second, it is also capable of moral determination and thus also the same as the supersensible ground of moral nature. Together, these two prove the unity of the supersensible objects of philosophy.
Let us very briefly look at the grand problem Kant poses for himself in the Critique of Judgment. The problem comes down to the implications of the ‘abyss’ that Kant opened up between theoretical and practical philosophy; or, as we may as well put it, between the side of our being that knows or tries to know the world, and the side that wills (or fails to will) according to moral law. Although this issue dominates Kant’s two introductions to his book, the book itself contains only occasional references to it, and certainly no clear statement of a solution. But arguably there is sufficient material to suggest what Kant’s solution might have been.
The following quotation contains the kernel.” The understanding, inasmuch as it can give laws to nature a priori, proves that we cognize nature only as appearance, and hence at the same time points to a supersensible substrate of nature; but it leaves this substrate entirely undetermined” (Introduction IX, translation modified). Kant is referring to the first Critique and especially to his solution to the Antinomies therein. The solution there merely required that we recognize the distinction between appearances and things-in-themselves. But this solution required nothing further of the latter other than its mere negative definition: that it not be subject to the conditions of appearance.
Kant continues, ‘Judgment, through its a priori principle of judging nature [purposively; in other words judging nature] in terms of possible particular laws of nature, provides nature’s supersensible substrate (within as well as outside us) with determinability by the intellectual faculty [i.e. reason].’ He is referring here particularly to the principle of reflective judgment (and especially aesthetic judgments on the beautiful) that nature will exhibit a purposiveness with respect to our faculty of judgment, that ‘particular’ laws of nature will always be ‘possible’. This purposiveness can only be accounted for if judgment assumes a supersensible that determines this purposiveness. This supersensible is the ‘same’ supersensible substrate underlying nature as the object of theoretical reason. It is no longer merely indeterminate. But because the particular laws are as yet only ‘possible’ – and this is exacerbated in aesthetic judgment with the notion of purposiveness ‘without purpose’ – the substrate remains left open, it is ‘determinable’ but not ‘determined’. That is to say, judgment conceives of the supersensible as capable of receiving a determinate purpose, should there be good reasons for assuming there to be such a purpose.
Kant continues, ‘But reason, through its a priori practical law, gives this same substrate determination.’ The determination in question is the one Kant introduced in the moral proof for the existence of God: that is, from the point of view of our moral selves, the ‘same’ supersensible is the ground of phenomenal nature’s co-operation in our moral projects. It carries the summum bonum as its final purpose.
Kant accordingly concludes: ‘Thus judgment makes the transition from the domain of the concept of nature to that of the concept of freedom.’ Judgment has also made the transition such that the supersensible objects of reason have to been seen as ‘the same’. Moreover, Judgment has, on the side of the subjective mind, made it conceivable to reason that its theoretical and practical employments are not only compatible (that was proved already in the Antinomy concerning freedom) but also capable of co-ordination towards moral purposes. Because, on the one hand, aesthetic judgment were found to be not fundamentally different from ordinary theoretical cognition of nature (see A2 above), and on the other hand, aesthetic judgment has a deep similarity to moral judgment (A5). Thus, Kant has demonstrated that the physical and moral universes – and the philosophies and forms of thought that present them – are not only compatible, but unified.
5. References and Further Reading
a. Works by Kant
The standard edition of the collected works in German is Kant’s gesammelte Schriften, Edited by the Deutsche Akademie der Wissenshaften, Berlin: Walter de Gruyter. Equally widely available is the Werkausgabe in zwölf Bänden, edited by Wilhelm Weischedel, Frankfurt am Mein: Suhrkamp. There are alternative, perfectly acceptable, translations of most of the following. Cambridge University Press, at the time of writing, is about half-way through publishing the complete works in English.
- Aesthetics and Teleology. Ed., Eric Matthews and Eva Schaper. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, forthcoming)
- Critique of Judgment. Trans., Werner Pluhar. (Indianapolis: Hackett, 1987)
- Critique of Judgment. Trans., James Creed Meredith. (Oxford: Clarendon, 1988)
- Critique of Practical Reason. Trans., Ed., Lewis White Beck. (Oxford: Maxwell Macmillan International, 1993)
- Critique of Pure Reason. Trans., Werner Pluhar. (Indianapolis: Hackett, 1996)
b. Other Primary and Secondary Works
For a treatment of various themes in Kant, please also see the introductions to the above editions.
- Burnham, Douglas. An Introduction to Kant’s Critique of Judgment. (Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press [in the US, Columbia University Press], 2000)
- Caygill, Howard. The Art of Judgement.(Oxford: Blackwell, 1989)
- Cohen, Ted and Guyer, Paul. Essays in Kant’s Aesthetics. (Chicago: Chicago University Press, 1982)
- Crawford, Donald. Kant’s Aesthetic Theory. (Madison: Wisconsin University Press, 1974)
- Crawford, Paul. The Kantian Sublime. (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1991)
- Gibbons, Sarah L. Kant’s Theory of Imagination.(Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1994)
- Guyer, Paul, ed. The Cambridge Companion to Kant.(Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1992)
- Guyer, Paul. Kant and the Claims of Taste. (Cambridge, Mass: Harvard University Press, 1979)
- Guyer, Paul. Kant and the Experience of Freedom.(Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996)
- Henrich, Dieter. Aesthetic Judgment and the Moral Image of the World. (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1992)
- Kemal, Salim. Kant and Fine Art. (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1986)
- Kemal, Salim. Kant’s Aesthetic Theory. (London: St Martin’s Press, 1992)
- Makkreel, Rudi. Imagination and Understanding in Kant. (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1994)
- McCloskey, Mary. Kant’s Aesthetic. (London: Macmillan, 1987) Schaper, Eva. Studies in Kant’s Aesthetics.(Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press, 1979)
- Zammito, John H. The Genesis of Kant’s Critique of Judgement.(Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1992)