Giorgio Agamben (1942– )

Giorgio Agamben is one of the leading figures in Italian philosophy and radical political theory, and in recent years, his work has had a deep impact on contemporary scholarship in a number of disciplines in the Anglo-American intellectual world. Born in Rome in 1942, Agamben completed studies in Law and Philosophy with a doctoral thesis on the political thought of Simone Weil, and participated in Martin Heidegger’s seminars on Hegel and Heraclitus as a postdoctoral scholar. He has taught at various universities, including the Universities of Macerata and Verona and was Director of Programmes at the Collège Internationale de Paris. He has been a Visiting Professor at various universities in the United States of America, and was a Distinguished Professor at the New School, University in New York. He caused a controversy when he refused to submit to the “biopolitical tattooing” requested by the United States Immigration Department for entry to the USA in the wake of the September 11, 2001 attacks.

Agamben’s work does not follow a straightforward chronological path of development either conceptually or thematically. Instead, his work constitutes an elaborate and multifaceted recursive engagement with the problems introduced into Western philosophy by the highly original and often enigmatic works of Walter Benjamin, most notably in his book on German trauerspielThe Origins of German Tragic Drama, but also in associated essays and fragments, such as his “Critique of Violence.” This is not to say that Agamben is not influenced by, nor engaged with, a number of other canonical or contemporary figures in Western philosophy and political, aesthetic and linguistic theory. He certainly is, most notably Heidegger and Hegel, as well as the scholarship that follows from them, but also Aby Warburg’s iconography (Agamben worked at the Warburg Institute Library in 1974-5), Italian Autonomism and Situationism (especially Guy Debord’s influential Society of the Spectacle), Aristotle, Emile Benveniste, Carl Schmitt and Hannah Arendt amongst others. Beyond this philosophical heritage, Agamben also engages in multilayered discussions of the Jewish Torah and Christian biblical texts, Greek and Roman law, Midrashic literature, as well as of a number of Western literary figures and poets, including Dante, Holderlin, Kafka, Pessoa, and Caproni to name but a few. This breadth of reference and the critical stylistics it gives rise to no doubt contribute to the appearance of intimidating density characteristic of Agamben’s work. Even so, Agamben’s engagement with these figures is often mediated by his deep conceptual and thematic debt to Benjamin (he served as editor of the Italian edition of Benjamin’s collected works from 1979 to 1994) evident in his central focus on questions of language and representation, history and temporality, the force of law, politics of the spectacle, and the ethos of humanity.

Table of Contents

  1. Language and Metaphysics
  2. Aesthetics
  3. Politics
  4. Ethics
  5. Messianism
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Language and Metaphysics

As Agamben indicates in the 1989 preface to the English translation of Infancy and History, the key question that unites his disparate explorations is that of what it means for language to exist, what it means that “I speak.” In taking up this question throughout his work, and most explicitly in texts such as Infancy and HistoryLanguage and Death, and most recently, The Open, Agamben reinvigorates consideration of philosophical anthropology through a critical questioning of the metaphysical presuppositions that inform it, and in particular, the claim that the defining essence of man is that of having language. In taking up this question, Agamben proposes the necessity of an“experimentum linguae” in which what is experienced is language itself, and the limits of language become apparent not in the relation of language to a referent outside of it, but in the experience of language as pure self-reference.

Published in Italian in 1978, Infancy and History constitutes one of Agamben’s earliest attempts to grasp and articulate the implications of such an as experience of language as such. Consisting of a series on interconnected essays on concepts such as history, temporality, play, and gesture, Infancy and History provides an importance entrance to Agamben’s later work on politics and ethics, particularly in the eponymous essay of the edition on the concept of infancy understood as an experiment of language as such. In this, Agamben argues that the contemporary age is marked by the destruction or loss of experience, in which the banality of everyday life cannot be experienced per se but only undergone, a condition which is in part brought about by the rise of modern science and the split between the subject of experience and of knowledge that it entails. Against this destruction of experience, which is also extended in modern philosophies of the subject such as Kant and Husserl, Agamben argues that the recuperation of experience entails a radical rethinking of experience as a question of language rather than of consciousness, since it is only in language that the subject has its site and origin. Infancy, then, conceptualizes an experience of being without language, not in a temporal or developmental sense of preceding the acquisition of language in childhood, but rather, as a condition of experience that precedes and continues to reside in any appropriation of language.

Agamben continues this reflection on the self-referentiality of language as a means of transforming the link between language and metaphysics that underpins Western philosophical anthropology inLanguage and Death, originally published in 1982. Beginning from Heidegger’s suggestion of an essential relation between language and death, Agamben argues that Western metaphysics have been fundamentally tied to a negativity that is increasingly evident at the heart of the ethos of humanity. While this collapse of metaphysics into ethics is increasingly evident as nihilism, contemporary thought has yet to escape from this condition. Agamben seeks to understand and ultimately escape this collapse through a rigorous philosophy of the experience of language suggested in Infancy and History. In his analysis of Heidegger and Hegel, Agamben isolates their reliance upon and indeed radicalization of negativity, by casting Da and Diese as grammatical shifters that refer to the pure taking place of language. Here, Agamben draws upon the linguistic notion of deixis to isolate the self-referentiality of language in pronouns or grammatical shifters, which he argues do not refer to anything beyond themselves but only to their own utterance (LD, 16-26). The problem for Agamben, though, is that both Hegel and Heidegger ultimately maintain a split within language – which he sees as a consistent element of Western thought from Aristotle to Wittgenstein – in their identification of an ineffability or unspeakability that cannot be brought into human discourse but which is nevertheless its condition. Agamben calls this mute condition of language “Voice,” and concludes that a philosophy that thinks only from the foundation of Voice cannot deliver the resolution of metaphysics that the nihilism toward which we are moving demands. Instead, he suggests, this is only possible in an experience of infancy that has never yet been: it is only in existing “in language without being called there by any Voice” and dying “without being called by death” (LD 96) that humanity can return to its proper dwelling place or ethos, to which it has never been and from which it has never left.

One further dimension of Agamben’s engagement with Western metaphysics and attempt to develop an alternative ontology is worth mentioning here, since it is one of the most consistent threads throughout his work. This is the problem of potentiality, the rethinking of which Agamben takes to be central to the task of overcoming contemporary nihilism. Citing Aristotle’s proposal in Book Theta of his Metaphysics, that “a thing is said to be potential if, when the act of which it is said to be potential is realized, there will be nothing im-potential (“that is, there will be nothing able not to be,” (in HS, 45) Agamben argues that this ought not be taken to mean simply that “what is not impossible is possible” but rather, highlights the suspension or setting aside of im-potentiality in the passage to actuality. This suspension, though, does not amount to a destruction of im-potentiality, but rather to its fulfilment; that is, through the turning back of potentiality upon itself, which amounts to its “giving of itself to itself,” im-potentiality, or the potentiality to not be, is fully realized in its own suspension such that actuality appears as nothing other than the potentiality to not not-be. While this relation is central to the passage of voice to speech or signification and to attaining toward the experience of language as such, Agamben also claims that in this formulation Aristotle bequeaths to Western philosophy the paradigm of sovereignty, since it reveals the undetermined or sovereign founding of being. As Agamben concludes, ‘“an act is sovereign when it realizes itself by simply taking away its own potentiality not to be, letting itself be, giving itself to itself’” (HS 46). In this way then, the relation of potentiality to actuality described by Aristotle accords perfectly with the logic of the ban that Agamben argues is characteristic of sovereign power, thereby revealing the fundamental integration of metaphysics and politics.

These reflections on metaphysics and language thus yield two inter-related problems for Agamben, which he addresses in his subsequent work; the first of these lies in the broad domain of aesthetics, in which Agamben considers the stakes of the appropriation of language in prose and poetry in order to further critically interrogate the distinction between philosophy and poetry. The second lies in the domains of politics and ethics, for Agamben’s conception of the destruction of experience and of potentiality directly feed into an analysis of the political spectacle and of sovereignty. These also necessitate, according to Agamben, a reformulation of ethics as ethos, which in turn requires rethinking community.

2. Aesthetics

In Language and Death, Agamben raises the question of the relation of philosophy and poetry by asking whether poetry allows a different experience of language than that of the “unspeakable experience of Voice” that grounds philosophy. From a brief reflection on Plato’s identification of poetry as the “invention of the Muses,” Agamben argues that both philosophy and poetry attain toward the unspeakable as the condition of language, though both also “demonstrate this asunattainable.” Thus rejecting a straightforward prioritization of poetry over philosophy, or verse over prose, Agamben concludes that “perhaps only a language in which the pure prose of philosophy would intervene at a certain point to break apart the verse of the poetic word, and in which the verse of poetry would intervene to bend the prose of philosophy into a ring, would be the true human language” (LD, 78). This thematic subsequently drives Agamben’s contributions to aesthetics, and in doing so, the distinction between philosophy and poetry grounds a complex exercise of language and representation, experience and ethos, developed throughout his works in this area and designed to surpass the distinction itself as well as those that attend it.

Agamben’s first major contribution to contemporary philosophy of aesthetics was his acclaimed book Stanzas, in which he develops a dense and multifaceted analysis of language and phantasm, entailing engagement with modern linguistic and philosophy, as well as psychoanalysis and philology. While dedicated to the memory of Martin Heidegger, whom Agamben here names as the last of Western philosophers within this book, also most evidently bears the influence of Aby Warburg. Agamben argues in Stanzas that to the extent that Western culture accepts the distinction between philosophy and poetry, knowledge founders on a division in which “philosophy has failed to elaborate a proper language… and poetry has developed neither a method nor self-consciousness” (S, xvii). The urgent task of thought, and particularly that which Agamben names “criticism,” is to rediscover “the unity of our own fragmented word.” Criticism is situated at the point at which language is split from itself—in for instance, the distinction of signified and signifier and its task is to point toward a “unitary status for the utterance,” in which criticism “neither represents nor knows, but knows the representation” (S, xvii). Thus, against both philosophy and poetry, criticism “opposes the enjoyment of what cannot be possessed and the possession of what cannot be enjoyed” (S, xvii).

In order to pursue this task, Agamben develops a model of knowledge evident in the relations of desire and appropriation of an object that Freud identifies as melancholia and fetishism. In this, he also questions the “primordial situation” of the distinction between the signifier and the signified, to which Western reflections on the sign are beholden. He concludes this study—which encompasses discussion of fetishism and commodity fetishism, dandyism, the psychoanalysis of toys, and the myths of Narcissus, Eros and Oedipus amongst other things—with a brief discussion of Saussurian linguistics, claiming that Saussure’s triumph lay in recognizing the impossibility of a science of language based on the distinction of signified and signifier. However, to isolate the sign as a positive unity from Saussure’s problematic position is to “push the science of the sign back into metaphysics.” (S 155) This idea of a link between the notion of the unity of the sign and Western metaphysics, is in Agamben’s view, confirmed by Jacques Derrida’s formulation of grammatology as an attempt to overcome the metaphysics of presence that Derrida diagnoses as predominant within western philosophy from Plato onwards. Yet, Agamben argues that Derrida does not achieve the overcoming he hopes for, since he has in fact misdiagnosed the problem: metaphysics. Metaphysics is not simply the interpretation of presence in the fractures of essence and appearance, sensibility and intelligibility and so on. Rather; rather, the origin of Western metaphysics lies in the conception that “original experience be always already caught in a fold… that presence be always already caught in a signification” (S 156). Hence, logos is the fold that “gathers and divides all things in the ‘putting together’ of presence” (S, 156). Ultimately, then, an attempt to truly overcome metaphysics requires that the semiological algorithm must reduce to solely the barrier itself rather than one side or the other of the distinction, understood as the “topological game of putting things together and articulating” (S 156).

It is in the framework established here then that Agamben’s next work in aesthetics, The Idea of Prose, might be said to achieve its real importance…. Published in Italian in 1985, The Idea of Prose takes up the question of the distinction between philosophy and poetry through a series of fragments on poetry, prose, language, politics, justice, love and shame amongst other topics. This enigmatic text is perhaps especially difficult to understand, because these fragments do not constitute a consistent argument throughout the book. In the light of the foregoing though, it is possible to say that what Agamben is doing is performing and indeed undermining a difference between poetry and philosophy by breaking apart the strictures of logos. In bringing into play various literary techniques such as the fable, the riddle, the aphorism and the short story, Agamben is practically demonstrating an exercise of criticism, in which thought is returned to a prosaic experience or awakening, in which what is known is representation itself.

3. Politics

The most influential dimension of Agamben’s work in recent years has been his contributions to political theory, a contribution that springs directly from his engagements in metaphysics and the philosophy of language. Undoubtedly, Homo Sacer: Sovereign Power and Bare Life is Agamben’s best-known work, and probably also the most controversial. It is in this book that Agamben develops his analysis of the condition of biopolitics, first identified by Michel Foucault in the first volume of his History of Sexuality series and associated texts. In this volume, Foucault argued that modern power was characterized by a fundamentally different rationality than that of sovereign power. Whereas sovereign power was characterized by a right over life and death, summarized by Foucault in the dictum of “killing or letting live,” modern power is characterized by a productive relation to life, encapsulated in the dictum of “fostering life or disallowing it.” For Foucault, the “threshold of modernity” was reached with the transition from sovereign power to biopower, in which the “new political subject” of the population became the target of a regime of power that operates through governance of the vicissitudes of biological life itself. Thus, in his critical revision of Aristotle, Foucault writes that “for millennia, man remained… a living animal with the additional capacity for a political existence; modern man is an animal whose politics places his existence as a living being in question” (HS1 143).

Agamben is explicitly engaged with Foucault’s thesis on biopower in Homo Sacer, claiming that he aims to “correct or at least complete” it, though in fact he rejects a number of Foucault’s historico-philosophical commitments and claims. Suggesting that Foucault has failed to elucidate the points at which sovereign power and modern techniques of power coincide, Agamben rejects the thesis that the historical rise of biopower marked the threshold of modernity. Instead, he claims that biopower and sovereignty are fundamentally integrated, to the extent that “it can even be said that the production of a biopolitical body is the original activity of sovereign power.” (HS 6) What distinguishes modern democracy from the Ancient polis then, is not so much the integration of biological life into the sphere of politics, but rather, the fact that modern State power brings the nexus between sovereignty and the biopolitical body to light in an unprecedented way. This is because in modern democracies, that which was originally excluded from politics as the exception that stands outside but nevertheless founds the law has now become the norm: As Agamben writes, “In Western politics, bare life has the peculiar privilege of being that whose exclusions found the city of men.” (HS 7)

Several theoretical innovations inform this thesis, two of which are especially important. The first is a re-conception of political power, developed through a complex reflection upon Aristotelian metaphysics and especially the concept of potentiality, alongside a critical engagement with the theory of sovereignty posited by Carl Schmitt, which is developed through Walter Benjamin’s own engagement with Schmitt. The second innovation introduced by Agamben is his provocative theorization of “bare life” as the central protagonist of contemporary politics.

Of the first of these, it might be argued that the key motivation within Homo Sacer is not so much an attempt to correct or complete Foucault’s account of biopolitics, as an attempt to complete Benjamin’s critique of Schmitt. In Political Theology, Carl Schmitt—the German jurist infamous for joining the Nazi party and becoming one of its strongest intellectual supporters—summarizes his strongly decisionistic account of sovereignty by claiming that the sovereign is the one that decides on the exception. For Schmitt, it is precisely in the capacity to decide on whether a situation is normal or exceptional, and thus whether the law applies or not—since the law requires a normal situation for its application—that sovereignty is manifest. Against this formulation of sovereignty, Benjamin posits in his “Theses on the Philosophy of History” that the state of emergency has in fact become the rule. Further, what is required is the inauguration of a real state of exception in order to combat the rise of Fascism, here understood as a nihilistic emergency that suspends the law while leaving it in force.

In addressing this conflict between Schmitt and Benjamin, Agamben argues that in contemporary politics, the state of exception identified by Schmitt in which the law is suspended by the sovereign, has in fact become the rule. This is a condition that he identifies as one of abandonment, in which the law is in force but has no content or substantive meaning—it is “in force without significance.” The structure of the exception, he suggests, is directly analogous to the structure of the ban identified by Jean-Luc Nancy in his essay “Abandoned Being, in which Nancy claims that in the ban the law only applies in no longer applying. The subject of the law is simultaneously turned over to the law and left bereft by it. The figure that Agamben draws on to elaborate this condition is that of homo sacer, which is taken from Roman law and indicates one who ‘“can be killed but not sacrificed.” According to Agamben, the sacredness of homo sacer does not so much indicate a conceptual ambiguity internal to the sacred, as many have argued, as the abandoned status of sacred man in relation to the law. The sacred man is “taken outside” both divine and profane law as the exception and is thus abandoned by them. Importantly, for Agamben, the fact that the exception has become the norm or rule of contemporary politics means that it is not the case that only some subjects are abandoned by the law; rather, he states that in our age, “we are all virtually homines sacri.” (HS 115).

As provocative as it is, understanding this claim also requires an appreciation of the notion of “bare life” that Agamben develops from the Ancient Greek distinction between natural life—zoe—and a particular form of life—bios, especially as it is articulated in Aristotle’s account of the origins of the polis. The importance of this distinction in Aristotle is that it allows for the relegation of natural life to the domain of the household (oikos), while also allowing for the specificity of the good life characteristic of participation in the polis—bios politikos. More importantly though, for Agamben, this indicates the fact that Western politics is founded upon that which it excludes from politics—the natural life that is simultaneously set outside the domain of the political but nevertheless implicated inbios politicos. The question arises, then, of how life itself or natural life is politicized. The answer to this question is through abandonment to an unconditional power of death, that is, the power of sovereignty. It is in this abandonment of natural life to sovereign violence—and Agamben sees the relation of abandonment that obtains between life and the law as “originary”—that “bare life” makes its appearance. For bare life is not natural life per se—though it is often confused with it in critical readings of Agamben, partly as a consequence of Agamben’s own inconsistency—but rather, it is the politicized form of natural life. Being neither bios nor zoe, then, bare life emerges from within this distinction and can be defined as “life exposed to death,” especially in the form of sovereign violence. (compare HS 88)

The empirical point of conjuncture of these two theses on the exception and on the production of bare life is the historical rise of the concentration camp, which, Agamben argues, constitutes the state of exception par excellence. As such though, it is not an extraordinary situation in the sense of entailing a fundamental break with the political rationality of modernity, but in fact reveals the ‘“nomos of the modern’” and the increasing convergence of democracy and totalitarianism. According to Agamben, the camp is the space opened when the exception becomes the rule or the normal situation, as was the case in Germany in the period immediately before and throughout World War 2. Further, what is characteristic of the camp is the indistinguishability of law and life, in which bare life becomes the “threshold in which law constantly passes over into fact and fact into law” (HS 171). This indiscernability of life and law effectively contributes to a normative crisis, for here it is no longer the case that the rule of law bears upon or applies to the living body, but rather, the living body has become “the rule and criterion of its own application” (HS 173) thereby undercutting recourse to the transcendence or independence of the law as its source of legitimacy. What is especially controversial about this claim is that if the camps are in fact the “nomos” or “hidden matrix” of modern politics, then the normative crisis evident in them is not specifically limited to them, but is actually characteristic of our present condition, a condition that Agamben describes as one of “imperfect nihilism.”

Importantly, in addition to this, Agamben argues that the logic of the “inclusive exclusion” that structures the relation of natural life to the polis, the implications of which are made most evident in the camps, is perfectly analogous to the relation of the transition from voice to speech that constitutes the political nature of “man” in Aristotle’s account. For Aristotle, the transition from voice to language is a founding condition of political community, since speech makes possible a distinction between the just and the unjust. Agamben writes that the question of how natural bare life dwells in the polis corresponds exactly with the question of how a living being has language, since in the latter question “the living being has logos by taking away and conserving its own voice in it, even as it dwells in the polis by letting its own bare life be excluded, as an exception, within it” (HS 8). Hence, for Agamben, the rift or caesura introduced into the human by the definition of man as the living animal who has language and therefore politics is foundational for biopolitics; it is this disjuncture that allows the human to be reduced to bare life in biopolitical capture. In this way then, metaphysics and politics are fundamentally entwined, and it is only by overcoming the central dogmas of Western metaphysics that a new form of politics will be possible.

This damning diagnosis of contemporary politics does not, however, lead Agamben to a position of political despair. Rather, it is exactly in the crisis of contemporary politics that the means for overcoming the present dangers also appear. Agamben’s theorization of the “coming politics”—which in its present formulation is under-developed in a number of significant ways—relies upon a logic of “euporic” resolution to the aporias that characterise modern democracy, including the aporia of bare life (P 217). In Means without End, he argues for a politics of pure means that is not altogether dissimilar to that projected by Walter Benjamin, writing that “politics is the sphere neither of an end in itself nor of means subordinated to an end; rather, it is the sphere of a pure mediality without end intended as the field of human action and of human thought” (ME 117). In developing this claim, Agamben claims that the coming politics must reckon with the dual problem of the post-Hegelian theme of the end of history and with the Heideggerian theme of Ereignis, in order to formulate a new life and politics in which both history and the state come to an end simultaneously. This “experiment” of a new politics without reference to sovereignty and associated concepts such as nation, the people and democracy, requires the formulation of a new “happy life,” in which bare life is never separable as a political subject and in which what is at stake is the experience of communicability itself.

4. Ethics

Given this critique of the camps and the status of the law that is revealed in, but by no means limited to, the exceptional space of them, it is no surprise that Agamben takes the most extreme manifestation of the condition of the camps as a starting point for an elaboration of an ethics without reference to the law, a term that is taken to encompass normative discourse in its entirety. InRemnants of Auschwitz, published as the third instalment of the Homo Sacer series, Agamben develops an account of an ethics of testimony as an ethos of bearing witness to that for which one cannot bear witness. Taking up the problem of skepticism in relation to the Nazi concentration camps of World War II—also discussed by Jean-Francois Lyotard and others—Agamben castsRemnants as an attempt to listen to a lacuna in survivor testimony, in which the factual condition of the camps cannot be made to coincide with that which is said about them. However, Agamben is not concerned with the epistemological issues that this non-coincidence of “fact and truth” raises, but rather, with the ethical implications, which, he suggests, our age has as yet failed to reckon with.

The key figure in his account of an ethics of testimony is that of the Muselmann, or those in the camps who had reached such a state of physical decrepitude and existential disregard that “one hesitates to call them living: one hesitates to call their death death” (Levi cited in RA 44). But rather than seeing the Muselmann as the limit-figure between life and death, Agamben argues that theMuselmann is more correctly understood as the limit-figure of the human and inhuman. As the threshold between the human and the inhuman, however, the Muselmann does not simply mark the limit beyond which the human is no longer human. Agamben argues that such a stance would merely repeat the experiment of Auschwitz, in which the Muselmann is put outside the limits of human and the moral status that attends that categorization. Instead then, the Muselmann indicates a more fundamental indistinction between the human and the inhuman, in which it is impossible to definitively separate one from the other, and in that calls into question the moral distinctions that rest on this designation. The key question that arises for Agamben then, is whether there is in fact a “humanity to the human” over and above biologically belonging to the species, and it is in reflection upon this question that Agamben develops his own account of ethics. In this, he rejects recourse to standard moral concepts such as dignity and respect, claiming that “Auschwitz marks the end and the ruin of every ethics of dignity and conformity to a norm…. The Muselmann… is the guard on the threshold of a new ethics, an ethics of a form of life that begins where dignity ends” (RA 69).

In order to elaborate on or at least provide “signposts” for this new ethical terrain, Agamben returns to the definition of the human as the being who has language, as well as his earlier analyses of deixis, to bring out a double movement in the human being’s appropriation of language. In an analysis of pronouns such as “I” that allow a speaker to put language to use, he argues that the subjectification effected in this appropriation is conditioned by a simultaneous and inevitable de-subjectification. Because pronouns are nothing other than grammatical shifters or “indicators of enunciation,” such that they refer to nothing other than the taking place of language itself, the appropriation of language in the identification of oneself as a speaking subject requires that the psychosomatic individual simultaneously erase or desubjectify itself. Consequently, it is not strictly the “I” that speaks, and nor is it the living individual: rather, as Agamben writes, “in the absolute present of the event of discourse, subjectification and desubjectification coincide at every point and both the flesh and blood individual and the subject of enunciation are perfectly silent.” (RA 117)

Importantly, Agamben argues that it is precisely this non-coincidence of the speaking being and living being and the impossibility of speech revealed in it that provides the condition of possibility of testimony. Testimony, he claims, is possible only “if there is no articulation between the living being and language, if the “I” stands suspended in this disjunction” (RA, 130). The question that arises here then is what Agamben means by testimony, since it is clear that he does not use the term in the standard sense of giving an account of an event that one has witnessed. Instead, he argues that what is at stake in testimony is bearing witness to what is unsayable, that is, bearing witness to the impossibility of speech and making it appear within speech. In this way, he suggests, the human is able to endure the inhuman. More generally then, testimony is no longer understood as a practice of speaking, but as an ethos, understood as the only proper “dwelling place” of the subject. The additional twist that Agamben adds here to avoid a notion of returning to authenticity in testimony, is to highlight the point that while testimony is the proper dwelling place or “only possible consistency” of the subject, it is not something that the subject can simply assume as its own. As the account of subjectification and desubjectification indicates, there can be no simple appropriation of language that would allow the subject to posit itself as the ground of testimony, and nor can it simply realise itself in speaking. Instead, testimony remains forever unassumable.

This also gives rise, then, to Agamben’s account of ethical responsibility. Against juridical accounts of responsibility that would understand it in terms of sponsorship, debt and culpabililty, Agamben argues that responsibility must be thought as fundamentally unassumable, as something which the subject is consigned to, but which it can never fully appropriate as its own. Responsibility, he suggests, must be thought without reference to the law, as a domain of “irresponsibility” or “non-responsibility” that necessarily precedes the designations of good and evil and entails a “confrontation with a responsibility that is infinitely greater than any we could ever assume…” While it may seem as if Agamben is leaning toward a conception of ethical responsibility akin to Emmanuel Levinas’ conception of infinite responsibility toward the absolute Other, this is not wholly the case, since Agamben sees Levinas as simply radicalising the juridical relation of sponsorship in unexpiatable guilt. In distinction from this, Agamben argues that “ethics is the sphere that recognizes neither guilt nor responsibility; it is… the doctrine of happy life” (RA 24).

5. Messianism

Clearly then, the conception of politics and of ethics that Agamben develops converge in the notion of “happy life,” or what he calls “form-of-life” at other points. What Agamben means by this is particularly unclear, not least because he sees elaboration of these concepts as requiring a fundamental overturning of the metaphysical grounds of western philosophy, but also because they gesture toward a new politics and ethics that remain largely to be thought. What is clear within this though is that Agamben is drawing upon Benjamin’s formulation of the necessity of a politics of pure means and, correlative to that, his conception of temporality and history, which taps a deep vein of messianism that runs through Judeo-Christian thought. This vein of messianism emerges in Agamben’s thought in a number of formulations, particularly those of “infancy,” “happy life” and “form-of-life,” and the notion of “whatever singularities.” What is also common to all these concepts is a concern with the figuration of humanity at the end of history, a concern that Agamben develops in discussion of the debates between Bataille and Kojeve over the Hegelian thesis of the end of history.

In the concept of “happy life” or “form of life,” Agamben points toward a new conception of life in which it is never possible to isolate bare life as the biopolitical subject, which, he argues ought to provide the foundation of political philosophy. As he states,

The “happy life”on which political philosophy should be founded thus cannot be either the naked life that sovereignty posits as a presupposition so as to turn it into its own subject or the impenetrable extraneity of science and of modern biopolitics that everybody tries in vain to sacralize. This “happy life” should be rather, an absolutely profane “sufficient life.” that has reached the perfection of its own power and its own communicability – a life over which sovereignty and right no longer have any hold (ME 114-115).

Happy life will be such that no separation between bios and zoe is possible, and life will find its unity in a pure immanence to itself, in “the perfection of its own power.” In this then, he seeks a politico-philosophical redefinition of life no longer founded upon the bloody separation of the natural life of the species and political life, but which is beyond every form of relation insofar as happy life is life lived in pure immanence, grounded on itself alone. This conception of a “form of life” or happy life that exceeds the biopolitical caesurae that cross the human being is developed in reference to Benjamin’s conception of happiness as he articulates it in “Theologico-Political Fragment,” a short text in which he paints a picture of two arrows pointing in different directions but nevertheless reinforcing each other, one of which indicates the force of historical time and the other that of Messianic time. For Benjamin, while happiness is not and cannot bring about the redemption of Messianic time on its own, it is nevertheless the profane path to its realization – happiness allows for the fulfilment of historical time, since the Messianic kingdom is “not the goal of history but the end (TPF 312). Drawing on this figuration, Agamben appears to construe happiness as that which allows for the overturning of contemporary nihilism in the form of the metaphysico-political nexus of biopower.

This debt also brings into focus Agamben’s reliance on the Benjaminian formulation of communicability as such, or communicability without communication, a thematic which emerges more strongly in Agamben’s somewhat anomalous essay published as The Coming Community, in which he develops the notion of “whatever singularities.” It is here that Agamben most explicitly addresses the rethinking of community that his early analyses of language and metaphysics suggested was required. In taking up the problem of community, Agamben enters into a broader engagement with this concept by others such as Maurice Blanchot and Jean-Luc Nancy, and in the Anglo-American scene, Alphonso Lingis. The broad aim of the engagement is to develop a conception of community that does not presuppose commonality or identity as a condition of belonging. Within this, Agamben’s conception of “whatever singularity” indicates a form of being that rejects any manifestation of identity or belonging and wholly appropriates being to itself, that is, in its own “being-in-language.” Whatever singularity allows for the formation of community without the affirmation of identity or “representable condition of belonging,” in nothing other than the “co-belonging” of singularities itself. Importantly though, this entails neither a mystical communion nor a nostalgic return to a Gemeinschaft that has been lost; instead, the coming community has never yet been. Interestingly, Agamben argues in this elliptical text that the community and politics of whatever singularity are heralded in the event of Tianenmen square, which he. He takes this event to indicate that the coming politics will not be a struggle between states, but, instead, a struggle between the state and humanity as such, insofar as it exists in itself without expropriation in identity. Correlatively, the coming politics do not entail a sacralization of humanity, for the existence of whatever singularity is always irreparably abandoned to itself; as Agamben writes, ‘“The Irreparable is that things are just as they are, in this or that mode, consigned without remedy to their way of being. States of things are irreparable, whatever they may be: sad or happy, atrocious or blessed. How you are, how the world is—this is the irreparable….”(CC 90)

Agamben returns to this thematic within a critical analysis of the definition of man as the being that has language in his recent book, The Open. Agamben begins this text with reflection on an image of the messianic banquet of the righteous on the last day, preserved in a thirteenth- century Hebrew Bible, in which the righteous are presented not with human heads, but with those of animals. In taking up the rabbinic tradition of interpretation of this image, Agamben suggests that the righteous or “concluded humanity” are effectively the “remnant” or remainder of Israel, who are still alive at the coming of the Messiah. The enigma presented by the image of the righteous with animal heads appears to be that of the transformation of the relation of animal and human and the ultimate reconciliation of man with his own animal nature on the last day. But for Agamben, reflection on the enigma of the posthistorical condition of man thus presented necessitates a fundamental overturning of the metaphysico-political operations by which something like man is produced as distinct from the animal in order for its significance to be fully grasped. Agamben concludes this text—which is pragmatically an extended reflection on the Bataille-Kojeve debate—with the warning that what is required to stop the “anthropological machine” is not tracing the “no longer human or animal contours of a new creation,” but rather risking ourselves in the hiatus and central emptiness that separates the human and animal within man. Thus, for Agamben, “the righteous with animal heads… do not represent a new declension of the man-animal relation,” but instead indicates a zone of non-knowledge that allows them to be outside of being, “saved precisely in their being unsavable” (TO, 92). This articulation of the unsavable reiterates a number of Agamben’s previous comments on redemption and beatitude and provides some clearer articulation of his resolution of the dilemma of the post-historical condition of humanity as distinct from those of his precursors. But how Agamben will develop this resolution and the ethico-political implications of it in large part remains to be seen.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Agamben, Giorgio. The Coming Community, tr. Michael Hardt, University of Minnesota Press, Minneapolis, 1993; La communità che viene, Einaudi, 1990. (CC)
  • Agamben, Giorgio. Language and Death: The Place of Negativity, tr. Karen E. Pinkus and Michael Hardt, University of Minnesota Press, Minneapolis, 1991; Il linguaggio e la morte: Un seminario sul luogo della negatività, Giulio. Einuadi , 1982. (LD)
  • Agamben, Giorgio. Stanzas: Word and Phantasm in Western Culture, tr. Ronald L. Martinez, University of Minnesota Press, Minneapolis, 1993; Stanze: La Parola e il fantasma nella cultura occidentale, Giulio Einuadi, Turin, 1977. (S)
  • Agamben, Giorgio. The Idea of Prose, tr. Michael Sullivan and Sam Whitsitt, SUNY Press, Albany, 1995; Idea della prosa, Giangiacomo Feltrinelli, Milano, 1985.
  • Agamben, Giorgio. Infancy and History, Verso, London, 1993; Infanzia et storia, Giulio Einuadi, 1978 (IH)
  • Agamben, Giorgio. Language and Death: The Place of Negativity, tr. Karen E. Pinkus, University of Minnesota, Minneapolis, 1991; Il linguaggio e la morte: Un Seminario sul luogo, Giulio Einuadi, 1982.
  • Agamben, Giorgio. Homo Sacer: Sovereign Power and Bare Life. tr. Daniel Heller-Roazen, Stanford University Press, Stanford, 1998; Homo sacer: Il potere sovrano e la nuda vita, Giulio Einuadi, 1995. (HS)
  • Agamben, Giorgio. The Man without Content, tr. Georgia Albert, Stanford University Press, Stanford, 1999; L’”uomo senza contenuto, Quodlibet, 1994.
  • Agamben, Giorgio. The End of the Poem: Studies in Poetics, tr. Daniel Heller-Roazen, Stanford University Press, Stanford, 1999. Categorie Italiane: Studi di poetica, Marsilio Editori, 1996. (EP)
  • Agamben, Giorgio. Potentialities: Collected Essays in Philosophy, ed. and tr. Daniel Heller-Roazen, Stanford University Press, Stanford, 1999. (P)
  • Agamben, Giorgio. Remnants of Auschwitz, tr. Daniel Heller-Roazen, Zone Books, New York, 1999; Quel che resta di Auschwitz, (RA)
  • Agamben, Giorgio. Means without End: Notes on Politics, tr. Vincenzo Binetti and Cesare Casarino, University of Minnesota Press, Minneapolis, 2000; Mezzi sensa fine, Bollati Boringhieri, 1996. (ME)
  • Agamben, Giorgio. The Open: Man and Animal, tr. Kevin Attell, Stanford University Press, Stanford, 2004; L’aperto: L’uomo e l’animale, Bollati Boringhieri, 2002 (TO)
  • Agamben, Giorgio. State of Exception, tr. Kevin Attell, The University of Chicago Press, Chicago; 2005; Il Stato eccezione, Bollati Boringhieri, 2003. (SE)
  • Benjamin, Walter. “Critique of Violence,” Reflections: Essays, Aphorisms, Autobiographical Writings, ed. Peter Demetz, tr. Edmund Jephcott, Schocken Books, New York: 1978, 277-300. (TPF)
  • Agamben, Giorgio. “Theologico-Political Fragment,” Reflections: Essays, Aphorisms, Autobiographical Writings, ed. Peter Demetz, tr. Edmund Jephcott, Schocken Books, New York: 1978, 312.
  • Benjamin, Walter. “Theses on the Philosophy of History” Illuminations, ed. Hannah Arendt, tr. Harry Zohn, Fontana, 1973.
  • Foucault, M. History of Sexuality, Volume 1: An Introduction, tr. R Hurley, Penguin, London: 1981.

Author Information:

Catherine Mills
University of New South Wales
U. S. A.