Alexander Polyhistor (1st cn. B.C.E.)

Known in his own time as a prolific writer, historian and philosopher, Alexander Polyhistor’s existing writings are fragmentary and are often cited from secondary or paraphrased sources.  In addition to having recorded the geographies of ancient Greek and Roman empires and transcribing the writings of Hellenistic Jewish scholars that would otherwise be lost, Alexander Polyhistor is recognized for his interpretation of Pythagorean doctrines, all the while not being officially recognized as a Pythagorean in written histories. Alexander’s writings on Pythagorean ideas address central doctrines: the harmony of numbers as Unity and the ideal that the mathematical world has primacy over, or can account for the existence of, the physical world.  Yet the often conflicting accounts of Pythagorean concepts of numbers and Unity, the order giving rise to each, and their relation to the concept of matter and the origin of the universe make it difficult to determine with certainty how Alexander’s interpretation complements or embodies the varied lineages of the Pythagorean thinkers. Nonetheless, Alexander Polyhistor’s attempt at reconciling these ideas is considered a concise and valuable remnant of ancient Pythagorean thought, the importance of which still occupies scholars.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Work
  3. Thought
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Life

Lucius Cornelius Alexander Polyhistor was a Greek scholar, imprisoned by the Romans in the war of Sulla against Mithridates of Pontus and brought as a slave to Rome for employment as a tutor. After Alexander’s release he lived in Italy as a Roman citizen. He had written so many books on philosophy, geography, and history, that he received the name Polyhistor. The writings of Alexander are now lost; only fragments exist, providing valuable information on antiquarian and eastern Mediterranean subjects. Alexander’s most important treatise consisted of 42 books of historical and geographical accounts of nearly all the countries of the ancient world. His other notable work is about the Jews; it reproduces in paraphrase relevant excerpts from Jewish writers, of whom otherwise nothing would be known. One of Alexander’s students was Gaius Julius Hyginus, Latin author, scholar and friend of Ovid, who was appointed by Augustus to be superintendent of the Palatine library.

2. Work

As a philosopher, Alexander Polyhistor had written Philosophers’ Successions, mentioned several times by Diogenes Laertius in his Lives and Opinions of Eminent Philosophers [hereafter ‘DL’]. Usually Diogenes used bio-bibliographical information from Alexander — on Socrates, Plato, Carneades of Cyrene, Chrysippus of Soli, Pyrrho of Elea, and others. There is also one passage about the Pythagoreans [DL, VIII, 25-36], containing several thoughts (on contradictions, fate, life, soul and its parts, perfect figures), and different curiosities (do not eat beans, do not touch a white cock, and similar). All these are of less importance.

3. Thought

Diogenes has preserved one extraordinarily interesting paraphrase of Alexander Polyhistor, concerning the Pythagorean idea of numbers as the elements of the universe:

The beginning of all is unity (monas); unity is a cause of indefinite duality as a matter; both unity and indefinite duality are sources of the numbers; the points are proceeding from numbers; the lines – from the points; from the lines are plane figures; from plane are volumetric figures; from them – sensibly acceptable solids, in which four elements are – fire, water, earth, and air; moving and changing totally, they give rise to the universe – inspired, intelligent, spherical, in the middle of which is the earth; and the earth is also spherical and inhabited from all sides. [DL, VIII, 25]

Here and elsewhere Alexander expounds Pythagorean doctrines. (It is interesting to mention that Alexander states that he found all his information in some Pythagorean notes, and an addition to these notes made by Aristotle [DL, VIII, 36]). However, straight evaluation of Alexander himself as a Pythagorean does not follow from the quote. Also, the “catalogue of the Pythagoreans” by the Neo-Platonist Iamblichus [On Pythagorean Life 267] includes 218 persons, but Alexander’s name is absent. Most likely, he was an erudite scholar, well-informed of different philosophical schools. It is proved by his nickname and his use of the genre of “successions of philosophers,” as well as references in other of Diogenes’ books, unrelated to Pythagoreanism.

The passage quoted above explains in its own way a harmonious conception of some mathematical idealism. The physical world is secondary with regard to the mathematical one. F.M. Cornford considered this information to be related to the Old Pythagoreans. He approved that the “original Pythagoreanism was monistic.” He thought that the Pythagoreans, from the very beginning, had taken unity as the first principle of all. [Classical Quarterly, XXVII, 1933, p.104] This seems to be in correspondence with the beginning of the fifth chapter of the first book (A) of Aristotle’s Metaphysics:

Contemporaneously with these philosophers, and even earlier, the so-called Pythagoreans, who were the first to take up mathematics, not only advanced this study, but also having been brought up in it, they thought its principles were the principles of everything. Since of these principles numbers are by nature the first, and in numbers they seemed to see many resemblances to the things that exist and come into being – more than in fire and earth and water … since, again, they saw that the properties and the ratios of the musical scales were expressible in numbers; – since, then, all other things seemed in their whole nature to be modeled on numbers, and numbers seemed to be the ultimate things in the whole of nature, they supposed the elements of numbers to be the elements of everything, and the whole universe to be a harmony (or proportion) and a number. [985b-986a]

Aristotle’s explanation seems to contain some difficult inconsistency. It is not one and the same to say that individual things “are numbers,” or the whole cosmos to be a number — because of difference between the singularities and the universals. Further, different sources sometimes ascribe to Pythagoreans the idea that things “are numbers,” or sometimes that they are “like numbers.” Furthermore, it is not so difficult to admit geometric figures or musical scales depending on numbers; more difficult is to imagine, for example, a fire made of numbers; and it is almost incomprehensible, how justice (say) “was four.” Indeed, the very Pythagorean doctrine of numbers was full of contradictions. Were really “all things” (everything) numbers — or only some of them? Were the things really numbers, or “like numbers?” Were the numbers elements of the things, or “the elements of numbers to be the elements of everything?” Were the things “made of numbers,” or “to be modeled on numbers,” i.e. they were made “according to numbers?” It is not so easy to reconcile such discrepancy of ill-assorted opinions.

We have still to consider a view, also attributed to Pythagoreans, that the First Principle (arkhe) is Unity (monas): “The beginning of all is unity…” [DL, VIII, 25]. Late Pythagoreans erected altars and temples for the Unity (i.e. One), and worshipped it as God. They deified Unity, rather than numbers. A reason is that the numbers themselves consist of, or originated from the units. But in what sense did the Pythagoreans speak of the Unity as the First Principle — as a unity of singular things? or hidden unity, being the basis of everything? or the unity of opposites? and if so, then either opposite philosophical categories (finite and infinite, one and many, rest and motion, etc.), or opposing characteristics and qualities of singular things (as, for example, white-black, sweet-bitter, and similar)? As we can see, the Pythagorean concept of the Unity is no clearer than their doctrine of numbers.

So, what was the First Principle? Was it the Number, or the Unity? It is hard to see how the Pythagoreans could reconcile the two. If the Number was the beginning of all, then we must regard the numbers as resulting from the units; and, then, the Universe originated from the Unity, rather than numbers. Even we could exclude numbers at all, because any thing is some entire wholeness and a unit (not “two”, or “three”, or “number”). Then, we have to consider the numbers as secondary qualities or external characteristics of things, proceeding from the Unity.

However, Pythagorean teaching of the Unity also maintains a contradiction — between really existing things and some underlying, invisible and ‘mystical’ Unity. So, singular things, gathered together, become not a unity, but a plurality. If we want to dig anything out of the depth of things, why was it unity, rather than duality (say), or plurality again? Consequently, we accept a unity of singular, finite, separate things in themselves (as “units”) — but we couldn’t realize their unity as One (monas). Thus, the Pythagorean principle of the Unity is inconsistent with the doctrine that things are numbers.

There is no doubt, however, that the Pythagoreans asserted that “things were like numbers”, and this was the original doctrine, going back to Pythagoras himself. Valuable comments are to be found in W.K.C. Guthrie:

The earlier of them (i.e. the Pythagoreans) maintained, that the “things were numbers.” To demonstrate it they said: “Look! 1 is a point, 2 a line, 3 a surface, and 4 a solid. Thus you have solid bodies generated from numbers.” We may call this an unwarrantable and indeed incomprehensible leap from the abstract intellectual conceptions of mathematics to the solid realities of nature. The pyramid, which they have made of the number 4, is not a pyramid of stone or wood, but non-material, a mere concept of the mind. Aristotle was already too far removed from their mentality to understand it, and complained that they “made weightless entities the elements of entities which had weight.” [Guthrie 1960, pp.14-15. Cf. Aristotle, Metaphysics 1090a32-34]

Consequently, the above question — whether Pythagoreans acknowledged as the First Principle the Number, or the Unity — we also have to reconcile with matter. To understand the origin of the Universe, it is necessary to explain how material things proceeded either from (non-material) Number, or from (non-material) Unity, or how “entities which had weight” originated from “weightless entities.” It was an irresolvable yet important problem for the whole Ancient philosophy. The outstanding importance and exclusive difficulties of this problem were stressed in Aristotle’s criticism of theory of ideas and numbers as independent entities and first principles of the things (in books 13 and 14 of Metaphysics). The final conclusion is that that to explain the origin of numbers is tortuous, and it is impossible here to make ends meet; thus, it gives evidence of impossibility — in spite of Pythagorean statements — to separate mathematical objects from sensibly acceptable things, and that they are not the First Principles of these things. [Metaphysics 1093b25f.]

Perhaps a suitable historical approach to the question is the one proposed by the famous Russian philosopher Alexey Losev, in his Ancient Cosmos and Contemporary Science:

As it is known, the Neo-Pythagoreanism developed into two different directions: the first didn’t put forward the concept of the number (Timaeus Locrus, Ocellos, Pseudo-Architos); the second proceeded from the philosophy of number — here are the Pythagoreans Alexander Polyhistor, and also Moderatus, Nichomachos, Numenius and some others. The study of this second direction in the Neo-Pythagoreanism is especially important for understanding of Plotinus’ (say, Neo-Platonic) teaching of matter. [Losev 1993, p. 464]

Thus, the main doctrine of Old Pythagoreanism was that of numbers as the First Principles. The main difficulty of this doctrine was the impossibility of explaining how material things originated from non-material beginnings. Neo-Pythagoreanism divided into two streams; and some Pythagoreans simply didn’t put forward the concept of the number; others strived to retain original doctrine of numbers, arranging it with some teachings about matter, and thus moving toward Neo-Platonism.

At last, we could consider the fragment of Polyhistor (quoted above) as a quite successful attempt to reconcile Pythagorean concepts of the unity, their doctrine of numbers as the beginning of all things, and simultaneously to include matter in the Pythagorean explanation of the origin of the sensibly acceptable world. It was a great deed, even more amazing with regard to the fact that we haven’t sufficient grounds to consider Alexander Polyhistor himself exactly as Pythagorean. In the same time, by his felicitous reconciliation of main Pythagorean ideas — just in one paraphrase — Polyhistor provided us with some integrated philosophical account of  Pythagoreanism from a doctrinal perspective, and perhaps he is, for this reason, a better Pythagorean than Pythagoras himself. Generally speaking, from what we know of Polyhistor’s ideas, we could gather that this “unknown philosopher” was an outstanding historian of philosophy, and an important thinker of his era, somewhat along the lines of Posidonius. Indeed, the almost absolute loss of his writings is one of the irrecoverable and unbearable tragedies of the history of philosophy!

4. References and Further Reading

  • Guthrie, W.K.C. The Greek Philosophers: From Thales to Aristotle (New York: Evanston 1960)
  • Losev, A.F. Ancient Cosmos and Contemporary Science in Being – Name – Cosmos (Moscow: Thought 1993 – published in Russian)

Author Information

Oleg Romanov