American Transcendentalism

American transcendentalism is essentially a kind of practice by which the world of facts and the categories of common sense are temporarily exchanged for the world of ideas and the categories of imagination. The point of this exchange is to make life better by lifting us above the conflicts and struggles that weigh on our souls. As these chains fall away, our souls rise to heightened experiences of freedom and union with the good. Emerson and Thoreau are the two most significant nineteenth century proponents of American transcendentalism.

Looking at the world through common sense categories, such as time, space, and causation, yields hard and fast limits that can hurt us. Causation seems to make certain outcomes unavoidable whether we like them or not. Space separates us from the ones we love and the places we would rather be. Not to be outdone, time brings all good things to an end and converts the living into the dead. The categories of imagination free us from these detestable limits. We can imagine a world in which physical space is no more than an idea, enabling us to move from place to place at the speed of our thoughts. Emanation and fulguration make congenial substitutes for causation, because they generate only what is true, beautiful, and good. Not even time presents a problem for imagination, since we can readily view all things from the standpoint of eternity.

Most philosophers start with theories, searching for ways in which to practice what they preach only if they are serious about their philosophies. The transcendentalists reversed this procedure. They began with practices and then attempted to establish them on solid theoretical foundations. Yet these practices all involved spurning certain facts in favor of ideas, leading them invariably to theories that are inconsistent and vague. Their honesty would not allow them to spurn all facts, so they were ever at work reshaping intractable facts to fit their theories or stretching the fabric of their views to cover uncooperative facts. Unwitting victims of their own scruples, they found themselves hating facts that did not fit the mold and being frustrated with theories they knew failed to capture all the facts.

The final victim was transcendentalism itself. Critics, eager to wield the sword of criticism, overlooked the life-enhancing practices at the core of transcendentalism, concentrating their efforts on the many chinks and thin plates in its theoretical armor. Their blades penetrated easily, and they quickly pronounced their victim hopelessly baffling. Even friendly critics felt obliged to begin their articles with the proviso that transcendentalism is not easily articulated.

The transcendentalists were suspended between imagination and common sense. If they had been consistent empiricists or materialists, their theories might have been securely founded on facts. Had they been fully fledged idealists or rationalists, their theories might have been firmly fixed on logical relations. In reality, they were neither consistent nor fully fledged theorists. Emerson complained of a see-saw in his voice. Yet what is most valuable in the legacy of transcendentalism is not theoretical and is not in need of theoretical backing. It is the practices by which the transcendentalists managed, at least occasionally, to re-make the world in the image of what they loved.

Table of Contents

  1. Emerson and His Practices
  2. German Influence
  3. British Influence
  4. Idealism
  5. Morality
  6. Beauty
  7. Contemporary Relevance
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Emerson and His Practices

Although he denied he was a transcendentalist, Ralph Waldo Emerson (1803-1882) was rightly viewed by his peers and is rightly viewed by contemporary scholars as the primary philosophical exponent of American transcendentalism, followed by Henry David Thoreau (1817-1862). Emerson distinguished at least three practices by which facts may be exchanged for ideas. The first enacts a form of idealism. Instead of seeing the world as an independent power that may lay waste to our purposes and plans, we can view it as a display of images or pictures created by us, rendering it harmless and even benevolent. Secondly, we can focus on moral actions and rejoice in their goodness. The third practice distinguished by Emerson is perhaps the one for which transcendentalism is best known. It is that of contemplating beauty.

These practices come naturally to many of us. We many not connect them to Emerson, his contemporaries, or the period in American intellectual history─roughly between the publication of Emerson’s “Nature” in 1836 and Thoreau’s death in 1862─when transcendentalism flourished as a movement; but inasmuch as we seek to improve our lives by turning away from facts and embracing ideas, we are transcendentalists.

2. German Influence

Word of Kant’s transcendental idealism may have reached Emerson through Frederick Henry Hedge (1805-1890), a Unitarian minister who had studied in Germany and knew German philosophy in its native tongue. In 1836, Hedge, Emerson, and George Ripley (1802-1880) founded an informal group they called Hedge’s Club for the purpose of stimulating discussion of current topics in philosophy and theology. The group convened irregularly for about seven years and grew to include at least a dozen members. It became known as the Transcendental Club. These meetings provided ample opportunity for Hedge to share his knowledge of Kant’s transcendental philosophy with Emerson.

The heart of Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason is the distinction he draws between the transcendental and the transcendent. The transcendental refers to the necessary conditions of the possibility of experience. Input from perception is grasped through twelve categories, space, time, and what he calls the transcendental unity of apperception. These are structures of mind, so without them experience would be impossible. In contrast, the transcendent is that which lies beyond the scope of experience and is therefore inaccessible to conceptual knowledge. In his Critique of Pure Reason, Kant rejects the classic arguments for the existence of God on the grounds that knowledge of the transcendent is impossible. Ironically, the transcendental structure of mind is necessarily incapable of providing knowledge of the transcendent.

But Kant followed the Critique of Pure Reason with the Critique of Practical Reason, in which he adds an important qualification to his original view that God is unknowable. The transcendent, he argues, is the very foundation of morality. If not for God, the wicked might go unpunished and the righteous unrewarded. We may not be able to have conceptual knowledge of the transcendent, but we are morally obligated to act as the transcendent in the form of the free and rational moral will.

Kant’s view of our relation to the transcendent underwent a second transformation in his third major work, the Critique of Judgment. There he reconsiders some of the classic arguments for God’s existence and opts for the teleological. Organic beings are purposive, he tells us, though we cannot glean what their purposes are. Their purposiveness consists in the fact that they and their parts are mutually supporting. The parts are means to the wholes, and the wholes are means to the parts. Two important conclusions fall out of this analysis. The first is that everything can be seen as beautiful, because all objects have form, which hints at a kind of purposiveness based on the internal complexity of objects. This purposiveness of form creates a universal disinterested satisfaction that is experienced as beauty. The second conclusion is that conceptual understanding of beauty is impossible for human beings.

Although they are very different philosophies, the influence of Kant’s transcendental idealism on American transcendentalism is easy to see. The philosophies are markedly different because the Americans did not preserve Kant’s distinction between the transcendent and the transcendental. This distinction provides the framework for Kant’s entire system as presented in the Critique of Pure Reason, but the transcendentalists were not interested in systems or the frameworks of systems. What attracted them to Kant’s philosophy was the sentiment behind his words. One look at the prevailing sentiment of American transcendentalism and Kant’s influence is unmistakable. The Americans eagerly joined him in celebrating the rightness of moral action, the beauty of the world, and the majesty of God. Kant’s influence also shows itself in the view of the nature of beauty embraced by the transcendentalists, namely that it surpasses all understanding.

3. British Influence

The word “transcendental” brings to mind Kant and the German philosophers he influenced, but German thinkers were not the only ones to leave their mark on American transcendentalism. Emerson was a great admirer of William Wordsworth and Samuel Taylor Coleridge, both of whom he met when he traveled to Europe in 1832. Their romanticism was intoxicating to him, and he seems to have passed some of that intoxication to his friend Thoreau. The British romantics shared the same love of beauty, morality, and God that animated both Kant and the American transcendentalists, but the romantics had developed a unique perspective on our relation to those realities. This perspective provided one of the central features of American transcendentalism.

The British romantics saw tremendous beauty and goodness in the world. At the same time, they saw that all of that goodness and beauty is flawed. Human beings often embody great virtues, but this is not always so. Sometimes their behavior is monstrous in its selfishness and cruelty. The sky, the meadow, and the rose are breathtakingly beautiful, but as time passes their beauty fades. This double vision of the romantics, although it did not betray any facts, nevertheless placed them in the uncomfortable position of both hating and loving the world.

To get out of their predicament, the romantics made a bold move. They set their sights on the perfect, which for them could exist only beyond the awful limits of the world. Yet they could not forget that they were, as flesh and blood, inextricably tied to those very limits. Nor could they forget that it was those very limits that provided the precious glimpses of beauty and goodness, however degraded, that they cherished. This was a great tragedy, they decided, and it was made even greater by the fact that it was inevitable. If you live in this world and you have enough humanity to love the good and the beautiful, you will be constantly assailed by the pain of falling short of those ideals. Yet, they suggested, the more the tragedy of life appeared to us in all of its inevitability and pain, the more beautiful life would be in our eyes.

Had they embraced this perspective at face value, the transcendentalists might have been cheered. As a sequence of random events, some good and others bad, life is arguably meaningless and not worth living. But view it as a tragedy and life takes on a marvelous aesthetic unity. Anguish and tears become literary realities, beautiful in their significance and in the timeless moral lessons they convey. But the transcendentalists were too pragmatic to embrace such an intellectual view of life. The world was too much with them, and although they never tired of translating facts into ideas, they could not shake the sense that facts were somehow more real. Instead of cheering them up, their contact with romanticism ultimately saddened them. They fell in love with the perfect like good romantics, but they could find little beauty in the countless misfortunes that befell them. They felt betrayed by life. In Emerson, this feeling expressed itself in the form of sheer disbelief at the terrible things that happened to him. In Thoreau, it created a thin layer of bitterness and resentment that never dissipated.

The influence of the British romantics shaped American transcendentalism at least as much and probably more than that of Kant’s transcendental philosophy. Their influence contributed a longing for the perfect, one of the central features of transcendentalism in America. The other side of this contribution, equally central, was a treacherous undercurrent of disappointment and sadness.

4. Idealism

The idealism of the American transcendentalists, like their morality and their love of beauty, took the form of practices before it became, as an afterthought, a sort of theory. Emerson stood with his head between his legs and took note of the fact that this opened a very different reality. His long country rambles produced in him a profound feeling of the lawfulness and rationality of nature. The passions that stirred in his breast often burst forth in the form of an essay or a poem. Looking at the world from different angles, delighting in the patterns nature manifests, and writing poetry or prose are idealistic practices in the sense that they give consciousness a kind of priority. In creating new experiences or ideas, we seem to create new worlds, and mind takes on a status close to that of a divinity. The old familiar facts, when filtered through the categories of imagination, are given an almost miraculous appearance. We are free from their tedious and often sorrowful limits to roam at liberty in thought.

For the transcendentalists, this freedom was almost always short-lived. This is because they felt they should ground their idealistic practices in a consistent theory. The freedom and satisfaction their practices provided, they reasoned, would be more secure if given an adequate theoretical backing. Their reasoning may have been sound, but their attempt to ground their practices in an adequate theory had the opposite effect. They became tangled in theoretical problems that proved intractable, and this made engaging with ideas for the sake of the activity itself more difficult. An ulterior motive for this engagement was always pressing on them. The ideas could not be fully trusted unless somehow it could be shown that they captured the inner nature of things.

But the main idea implied by the transcendentalists’ practices, that all existence must conform to consciousness, was verified by their experience only occasionally. There were flashes of verification, as when Emerson dreamed he ate the world, but all too often it was consciousness that had to give way to the cold facts of existence. The loss of his beloved wife Ellen Tucker, his cherished son Waldo, and his dear friend Thoreau signaled to Emerson that something alien to mind was at work in the world.

What this alien something might be, the transcendentalists had no clear idea. Their idealism gave consciousness, rational principles, and human values the status of omnipotent governing powers. Evil was that for which there would be compensation, or it was an instrument necessary for the creation of a good far greater than any that would have been possible without its use. It was, in short, thoroughly intelligible, just, and even benevolent: a low mood or a contradictory thought passing through the Oversoul for the sake of its ultimate enrichment. Evil is good, or rather it has to be good if one takes the idealism of the transcendentalists at face value. Not even they were capable of doing this all the time, yet they had no means of understanding evil except through the lens of their idealism, nor would they have been comfortable viewing it through a different lens as a brute fact or an irrational power.

The only option for the transcendentalists was to live with one more evil, namely the fact that evil positively confounded their attempts to explain it. This made the evils they suffered that much worse, adding avoidable surprise and puzzlement to unavoidable pain. Had they been content to practice their idealism without attempting to expound it, they might have saved themselves considerable grief. Their idealistic practices alone do not give mind the kind of priority proper to a power, but they do give it a sort of valuational priority. In lavishly applying the categories of imagination to the world and marveling at the results, we affirm the priority of consciousness and its products in the sense of loving them the most. As long as this does not lead us to the tenuous theory that all existence must submit to mind, we are free to understand evil through the categories of common sense, as a rogue power that goes against our purposes and often overwhelms them. This does not translate evil into good, but it at least removes the sting of surprise and confusion when evil strikes.

5. Morality

Emerson was often accused of being a reluctant reformer, and behind those accusations there was a kernel of truth. His contemporaries in the United States and Europe were hungry for moral progress, and they wasted no time putting shoulder to wheel for their favorite causes. Emerson was different in that his temperament inclined him to be first a scholar. The purpose of scholars, he said, is to nurture the good in others; but what makes a scholar is the ability to see the larger picture of things, and for this a certain distance from the heat of action is required. Emerson was by nature a visionary and a poet, not a man of action. No matter how much he sympathized with the ideals to which reformers aspired, he could not engage in actual reform without some initial discomfort. It was not what he was born to do.

Yet Emerson’s accusers failed to see the full reality of the accused. He may have hesitated before throwing his weight behind a cause for fear of losing the reflective distance he naturally valued; but if the cause was just he almost always ended up fighting for it. When the government of the United States announced plans to force Cherokees from their native lands, Emerson wrote President Van Buren in protest. The reflective but deeply moral Emerson opposed slavery openly both in writing and in public lectures. Inspired by his friend Margaret Fuller, Emerson supported the burgeoning women’s rights movement, becoming Vice President of the New England Women’s Suffrage Association in 1869. It is ironic that for all the accusations of reluctance made against him by his peers, today’s scholars tend to view Emerson as one of the nineteenth century’s most important reformers.

Emerson’s reflective temperament made him skeptical of reform movements, which seemed to him to be driven by narrow and hasty views. At the same time, he was convinced that it is not the group but the individual that is the ultimate agent of moral progress. He admired and celebrated the moral actions of principled individuals and was often spurred by them to act in spite of his temperament. This is transcendentalism at its moral best. Moral action is not governed or called forth by a theory; it is a spontaneous response to the feeling of one’s individual potentiality combined with one’s natural love of the good. Assuming the good is not conceived narrowly, as it almost never was by Emerson, this kind of morality is less problematic than many others. Emerson was lead by it to some of his most important contributions to the reform movements of his day.

Again, the problem came when the transcendentalists attempted to ground their spontaneous practices in a theory that lodged their values in the nature of things. Emerson said many times that nature itself is the supreme model and ultimate ground of morality, since it is a manifestation of timeless moral laws. All evil is a form of instruction, pointing the way to better lives and a better world. No doubt Emerson embraced this view wholeheartedly, but its implications for specific evils that visited him created turmoil in his soul. He could not hide from himself the fact that some evils seemed to lack pedagogical value. It was hardly possible for him to view the death of his five year old son as instruction for the improvement of life. Nor was he easily able to see the fire that consumed his home as a lesson in how to make the world a better place. Their view of the world as inherently moral, like the idealism they attempted to develop, created for the transcendentalists a painful rift between the theory they thought they should live by and the actual events, actions, and emotions that filled their lives.

This was less so, at least as regards morality, for Thoreau. Emerson’s greatest student was less committed than his mentor to the view that nature is intrinsically moral. Thoreau, moreover, was more practical than Emerson in moral matters. He perceived with greater clarity the fact that institutions exist because of the free actions of individuals. If individual slaveholders decided to stop holding slaves, slavery would gradually be destroyed. Nor did Thoreau confuse this practical insight with Emerson’s more theoretical position that individuals are the ultimate moral agents because they have access, through reason and contemplation, to the moral laws inherent in nature.

While Emerson’s love of reflection often slowed his response time, Thoreau tended to react to moral problems quickly and decisively. He immediately urged those around him to examine their consciences and change their behaviors accordingly. Thoreau’s letter in support of John Brown, a controversial abolitionist convicted of treason, captures this pragmatic approach to morality. The letter is full of motivational rhetoric. Advancing the cause of abolition, Thoreau seems to have reasoned, was simply a matter of convincing enough individuals to oppose Brown’s conviction.

In their morality, the transcendentalists did not abandon their practice of exchanging facts and the categories of common sense for ideas and the categories of imagination. Nor did they lose all awareness of common sense or all contact with facts. This combination of circumstances might have propelled them to dizzying heights of theorizing in an attempt to reconcile the two poles of their vision, as it often did in relation to their idealism. But on the whole, not counting the theoretical flights in which Emerson argued for a moral structure of the world, the transcendentalists were more down to earth about morality than they were about metaphysics. Not only did they tend to avoid too much theorizing, they took their practice a step further. Having seen and appreciated a vision of how things ought to be, they went to work to improve the relevant facts in light of their ideas. In a word, the transcendentalists were meliorists.

6. Beauty

If there is a single practice with which American transcendentalism can be identified, it is contemplation of beauty. Emerson responded to Plato’s theory that beauty, truth, and goodness are one by saying that even so beauty is the best of the three. Children seem to see it radiating from the most ordinary objects to their exquisite delight. Adults sometimes find themselves feeling like children again in its presence. The transcendentalists thought of beauty as eternal, because a mere glimpse of it was enough to make them drop everything and simply take in what they heard or saw with neither motive nor intention. This activity satisfied them so deeply that while they were thus engaged it was as if time stood still.

Perhaps the most famous experience of beauty described by Emerson is the one in which he became a “transparent eyeball.”  Alone in the woods, “head bathed by the blithe air, and uplifted into infinite space”, he found that he had vanished from his own experience. It was as if he consisted of nothing but impersonal vision, the object of which was “unconstrained and immortal beauty.”  Thoreau was equally susceptible to such enthralling experiences of beauty.  Snow drifts, the shapes and colors of leaves, and the way light falls revealed to him so much beauty that he thought of them as imprints of the divine.

Of the three practices distinguished by Emerson, contemplation of beauty is perhaps the one that came most naturally to the transcendentalists. They were ready, like Socrates, for beauty to give them wings on which they could ascend to heaven and see reality from the standpoint of the gods. Facts, with all of their hard edges, quickly melted into images or ideas under beauty’s divine influence. The contemplative absorptions this created were immensely satisfying, but they were also deceptive. Had the facts actually melted or did it merely seem as if they had?

Motivated by the tremendous appeal of the former hypothesis, Emerson attempted to extend the influence of beauty far beyond momentary absorptions. He reached the conclusion that everything is beautiful by arguing that beauty derives from purposiveness. Emerson thought of nature as a single, all-embracing system governed by immutable moral laws. In such a system, everything has a purpose in relation to the whole and is rendered beautiful by that relation. Marcus Aurelius proposed something similar in his Meditations. He said that even the foam at the mouths of ravening beasts takes on a certain beauty once its purpose is known.

The argument that purposiveness confers beauty is plausible when purposes are present and when they are at least arguably benevolent. A towering concrete dam may spoil the beauty of a river, until we understand that it was built to provide water to surrounding communities. Yet even though we see a benevolent purpose behind it, the ugliness of the dam may not be diminished. The argument is much weaker when applied to objects or events the purposes of which are evil, and it fails altogether in the case of realities that are non-purposive. Weapons of mass destruction are not rendered beautiful in light of their purpose. Earthquakes that strike major cities may occur for the sake of maintaining the structural equilibrium of the planet, but this adds little beauty to them. Moreover, nothing prevents us from understanding natural disasters as mechanical rather than purposive processes.

The transcendentalists were eminently capable of stretching their imaginations. When they exercised this capacity to the fullest, they saw around them an abstract world of interrelated ideas. The beauty of that world was so captivating that it tended to blind them to all external realities. Emerson went as far as to say there is a certain beauty in a corpse. We can hardly fault the transcendentalists for wishing to live always in the presence of the beautiful; yet the feats of imagination by which they conjured an ideal world could not be sustained forever. The transcendentalists were drawn to the beauty of ideas, but they knew they had to make their way in a world that also included stubborn facts. Once more we can see that it was not their practices, but their efforts to ground them in theories that created problems for the transcendentalists. Emerson’s attempt to demonstrate that all things are beautiful made ugliness a little uglier and a little sadder. Even worse, it made it confounding. When a homely or a grotesque fact intruded into the beautiful world of his ideas, he loathed it all the more because he could not make sense of the intrusion.

7. Contemporary Relevance

Theories that attempt to establish the inner nature of the world will always be interesting and instructive. They capture the imagination and, if we care to see, show us the limits of what we know. The transcendentalists never produced a complete theory. Producing one that placed their values at the core of reality would have required them to set aside their interest in action and their instinctive loyalty to facts. Instead, they theorized spontaneously in an attempt to shore up the practices that brought them closer to the good. The bits and pieces of theory they devised are of continuing relevance not because they capture corresponding portions of ultimate reality but because they show us the extent to which human beings are capable of loving all that is good in the world.

Although the transcendentalists did not succeed in grounding their practices in a fully developed theory of absolute reality, they did not need to succeed in this. Appreciating the marvelous creativity of consciousness, affirming moral action, and contemplating beauty are self-standing practices. One might explain them and the values they uphold equally well through a variety of theories, and many philosophers have developed complete systems that assign to beauty, morality, or consciousness the status of the real. The transcendentalists sought to secure their practices to theoretical foundations, but their practices are independent of all attempts to develop a satisfactory account of them. They do not need the support of theories as an airplane does not need wires to hold it in the air. Not only that, but the effort to ground practices in theories is fraught with frustration, since there are many plausible theories, and those that one dislikes must constantly be defended against. The life-long devotion of the transcendentalists to their practices, even as their theories changed and vexed them anew, suggests they sensed their practices would and perhaps should stand on their own.

It is hard to overstate the value of the practices that form the heart of transcendentalism. We tend to lose sight of the sheer improbability of awareness and the wonder of its products. The rightness of moral action does not always impress us, and we often fail to see beauty in ordinary objects and events. The focus on improvement instilled in many of us from childhood bogs us down in facts that demand accounting and predicting. We grow increasingly blind to the realm of imagination and possibilities. Consider what the world would be like if we practiced transcendentalism all the time. We would view consciousness as a wonder that is without equal in the universe. A single moral action either performed or witnessed would be cause for feeling good. Perhaps best of all, we would not miss even the smallest particle of beauty. A pattern, a color, a sparkle seen out of the corner of the eye would lift us above all dreary facts to the heights of contemplative joy. None of this would establish the good or the beautiful or even the true in the inner sanctum of reality, but it would enrich the reality that is our experience, and that is what the transcendentalists sought above all.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Emerson, R. W. Emerson’s Complete Works. 12 Vols. Boston: Houghton, Mifflin, and Company, 1883-93.
  • Emerson, R. W. Emerson in His Journals. Joel Porte, Ed. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1982.
  • Gougeon, L. Virtue’s Hero: Emerson, Antislavery, and Reform. Athens, GA: University of Georgia Press, 1990.
  • Gray, H. D. Emerson: A Statement of New England Transcendentalism as Expressed in the Philosophy of its Chief Exponent. New York: Frederick Ungar, 1970.
  • McAleer, J. J. Ralph Waldo Emerson: Days of Encounter. Boston: Little, Brown, and Company, 1984.
  • Packer, B. L. The Transcendentalists. Athens, GA: University of Georgia Press, 2007.
  • Richardson, R. D. Henry Thoreau: A Life of the Mind. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1986.
  • Thoreau, H. D. The Best of Thoreau’s Journals. Carl Bode, Ed. Carbondale, IL: Southern Illinois University Press, 1971.
  • Thoreau, H. D. Walden. Michael Meyer, Ed. London: Macmillan, 1995.
  • Thoreau, H. D. A Week on the Concord and Merrimack Rivers. Carl Hovde, Ed. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1980.
  • Myerson, Joel, Ed. Transcendentalism: A Reader. New York: Oxford University Press, 2000.


Author Information

Michael Brodrick
Indiana University Purdue University Indianapolis
U. S. A.