Animism is a religious and ontological perspective common to many indigenous cultures across the globe. According to an oft-quoted definition from the Victorian anthropologist E. B. Tylor, animists believe in the “animation of all nature”, and are characterized as having “a sense of spiritual beings…inhabiting trees and rocks and waterfalls”. More recently, ethnographers and anthropologists have moved beyond Tylor’s initial definition, and have sought to understand the ways in which indigenous communities, in particular, enact social relations between humans and non-human others in a way which apparently challenges secular, Western views of what is thought to constitute the social world. (This new approach in anthropology is sometimes called the “new animism”.) At a minimum, animists accept that some features of the natural environment such as trees, lakes, mountains, thunderstorms, and animals are non-human persons with whom we may maintain and develop social relationships. Additionally, many animist traditions regard features of the environment to be non-human relatives or ancestors from whom members of the community are descended.

Animism, in some form or other, has been the dominant religious tradition across all human societies since our ancestors first left Africa. Despite the near ubiquity of animistic beliefs and practices among indigenous peoples of every continent, and despite the crucial role of animism in the early emergence and development of human religious thought, contemporary academic philosophy of religion is virtually silent on the subject. This article outlines some key ideas and positions in the current philosophical and social scientific discourse on animism.

Table of Contents

  1. Concepts of Animism
    1. Hylozoism, Panpsychism, and Vitalism
    2. Modernist Animism
    3. Enactivist Animism
    4. Animism as Ontology
    5. Social-Relational Animism
  2. The Neglect of Animism
  3. Public Arguments for Animism
    1. Argument from Innateness
    2. Argument from Common Consent
  4. Private Arguments for Animism
  5. Pragmatic Arguments for Animism
    1. Environmentalism
    2. Feminism
    3. Nationalism and Sovereignty
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Concepts of Animism

Animist religious traditions have been particularly prevalent among hunter-gatherer societies worldwide. A variety of different and conflicting religious traditions across the globe have been labeled “animist”. So, animism is not a single religious tradition, but is instead a category to which various differing traditions appear to belong. Just as “theism” is a term that extends to cover any belief system committed to the existence of a god, “animism” is a term that extends to cover any belief system satisfying the appropriate definition (such as the classical Tylorian definition given in the introduction to this article). Note that the terms “theism” and “animism” are not mutually exclusive: an animist may or may not also be a theist. There is some dispute, particularly among anthropologists, as to whether there is a single definition that works to draw the wide variety of traditions typically considered as animist under a single umbrella.

Contemporary social scientific discussion of animism has witnessed a renaissance beginning in the late twentieth century, and this has led different authors to consider a range of alternative ways in which we might conceive of the characteristic qualities of animist thought. Some noteworthy recent contributors to this debate are Nurit Bird-David, Philippe Descola, Tim Ingold, Graham Harvey, and Stewart Guthrie. Before surveying a few of the conceptions currently discussed in this literature, it is worthwhile to be clear on what is not meant by the term “animism”.

a. Hylozoism, Panpsychism, and Vitalism

When attempting to define “animism”, it is important to first disentangle the concept from three closely related philosophical doctrines: Hylozoism, Panpsychism, and Vitalism. Animism is often conflated with these three doctrines as scholarly concepts of animism have traditionally drawn from the work of Tylor, and particularly from his conception of animism as a belief in the “animation of all nature,” a doctrine which he also labels “universal vitality”. Phrases such as these, with their allusions to a “world consciousness”, have given rise to the mistaken impression that animism is a doctrine about the entire universe being fundamentally alive or sentient or filled with soul.

Hylozoism is the view that the universe is itself a living organism. It is a doctrine often attributed (although erroneously, [see Fortenbaugh 2011, 63]) to the third director of Aristotle’s Lyceum, Strato of Lampsacus, who argued that motion in the universe was explicable by internal, unconscious, naturalistic mechanisms, without any need for an Aristotelian prime mover (ibid, 61). This characterization of the universe’s motion as sustained by internal, unconscious mechanisms is seen as analogous to the biological mechanisms and processes sustaining life. However, religious animists typically reject the claim that all things are living, and they also reject that the universe as a whole is a living being. Typically, the animist takes particular features of the natural world as endowed with personhood or some form of interiority, often having their own cultural lives and communities akin to those of human beings.

Panpsychism is the view that “mentality is fundamental and ubiquitous in the natural world” (Goff and others 2017, §2.1). Mind is, on this view, a building block of the universe. Unlike the animist, the panpsychist does not take features of the natural world to have a fully-fledged interior or cultural life akin to that of human beings. Additionally, it is not characteristic of animism to take mental properties to be fundamental to the universe or to be distributed in all systems or objects of a given type. For example, the animist need not accept that all rocks have an interior life, but only that some particular rocks do (perhaps a rock with unusual features, or one which moves spontaneously or unpredictably).

Vitalism is the out-of-favour scientific view that biological phenomena cannot be explained in purely mechanical terms and that a complete explanation of such phenomena will require an appeal to spiritual substances or forces. Proponents of the view included Francis Glisson (1597-1677), Xavier Bichat (1771-1802), and Alessandro Volta (1745-1827). Vitalists hold that all living things share in common a spiritual quality or fluid (famously dubbed by Henri Bergson as the “élan vital”). With this élan vital in hand, it was thought that phenomena that appeared recalcitrant to purely mechanical explanation (for example, the blossoming of flowers, the reproduction of worms, the musings of humans, the growth of algae, and so forth) could be explained in other, more spiritual terms. Animists, unlike vitalists, need not be committed to the existence of any sort of metaphysically special spirit or soul phenomena. Additionally, animists very often take non-biological phenomena (rivers, winds, and the like) to be animate.

b. Modernist Animism

In his Natural History of Religion, David Hume speaks of a tendency for primitive human beings “to conceive all beings like themselves.” Natural phenomena are attributed to “invisible powers, possessed of sentiment and intelligence” and this can be “corrected by experience and reflection”. For Tylor, “mythic personification” drives the primitive animist to posit souls inhabiting inanimate bodies. In a similar vein, Sigmund Freud writes that the animist views animals, plants, and objects as having souls “constructed on the analogy of human souls” (1950, 76). James Frazer’s Golden Bough is a particularly good example, with animism being referred to as “savage dogma” (1900, 171). Rites and rituals relating to animism are described as “mistaken applications” of basic principles of analogy between the human world and the natural world (62). For these writers, animism is understood as a kind of promiscuous dualism and stray anthropomorphism. The animist is committed to a superstitious belief in anthropomorphic spirits, which reside within non-human animals or altogether inanimate objects. It is considered an erroneous view.

Although this position has faced criticism for presenting the animist’s worldview as a kind of mistake (see, for example, Bird-David 1999), similar modernist conceptions of animism persist, particularly in the evolutionary psychology of religion. A notable modern proponent is Stewart Guthrie, who takes animist belief as a problem requiring an explanation. The problem needing explained is why people are so disposed to ascribe agency and personhood to non-agents and non-persons. Setting the problem in this light, Guthrie rejects post-modern and relativist tendencies in the contemporary anthropological literature, which seek to investigate animism as an ontology that differs from, but is not inferior to, naturalistic scientific understandings of the world. This post-modernist approach, Guthrie argues, makes “local imagination the arbiter of what exists,” and thereby abandons many important realist commitments inherent in the scientific project (2000, 107).

Guthrie’s own view is that animistic thinking is the result of an evolutionarily adaptive survival strategy. Animistic interpretations of nature are “failures of a generally good strategy” to perceive agents in non-agentive phenomena. The strategy is generally good since, as he puts it, “it is better for a hiker [for example] to perceive a boulder as a bear than to mistake a bear for a boulder” (2015, 6). If we are mistaken in seeing agents everywhere, the price to pay is small. Whereas if we are not mistaken, the payoff is high. This idea has been developed further by other cognitive scientists of religion, such as Justin Barrett, who accounts for this propensity as resulting from what he calls a hyperactive agency detection device (usually abbreviated to HADD): an innate and adaptive module of human cognition.

This modernist or positivist view of animism can be contrasted with several post-modernist views, which are surveyed below.

c. Enactivist Animism

Another approach to animism takes it as a kind of non-propositional, experiential state. Tim Ingold characterizes animism as a lived practice of active listening. Animism, he says, is “a condition of being alive to the world, characterized by a heightened sensitivity and responsiveness, in perception and action, to an environment that is always in flux, never the same from one moment to the next” (2006, 10). Borrowing a phrase from Merleau-Ponty, Ingold characterizes the lived experience of animism as “the sense of wonder that comes from riding the crest of the world’s continued birth”. The animist does not so much believe of the world that it contains spooky “nature spirits”; rather, she participates in a natural world, which is responsive and communicative. Animism is not a system to which animists relate, but rather it is immanent in their ways of relating.

On this enactivist account, the crucial thread of animist thinking is not characterized by a belief in spirits or a belief in the intentionality of non-intentional objects. Animist thinking is instead construed as a kind of experience—the living of a particular form of life, one which is responsive and communicative with the local environment, and one which engages with the natural environment as subject, not object. Thus, there is a distinctive and characteristically interpersonal quality of animist phenomenology. The animist’s claim—say, that whales are persons—is not a belief to which she assents, nor is it a hypothesis which she might aim to demonstrate or falsify. On the contrary, the animist does not know that whales are persons, but rather knows how to get along with whales.

This understanding of animism echoes the philosophy of religion of Ludwig Wittgenstein, who famously rejected the notion that the substantive empirical claims of religion should be understood as attempts at objective description or explanation. Instead, religion should be understood as a frame of experience or “world picture”. A similarly permissive approach to animism and indigenous religion has recently been championed by Mikel Burley, who stresses the importance of evaluating competing religious world-pictures according to their own internal criteria and the effects that such world pictures have on the lived experience of their adherents (see Burley [2018] and [2019]).

A similar view can also be found in work outside of the analytic philosophical tradition. Continental philosophers such as Max Horkheimer and Theodor Adorno, for example, argue that the modern scientistic worldview alienates us from our environment and is the cause of widespread disenchantment by way of the “extirpation of animism” (2002, 2). Thus, it is our experience of the world around us which is diminished on the scientistic frame, and this disenchantment can be cured by taking up an animistic frame of experience. Martin Buber is another philosopher who stresses the fundamentally spiritual nature of what he calls the “I-Thou” aspect of experience (a subject-subject relation), which can be contrasted with the “I-It” aspect (a subject-object relation). The pragmatist philosopher William James uses the very same terms in his expression of what is characteristic of a religious perception of the universe: “The universe is no longer a mere It to us, but a Thou” (2000 [1896], 240).

It is through the animist’s experience of the world as fundamentally grounded in interpersonal relations that her experience is characterized as distinct from the Western, naturalistic world picture, in which interpersonal encounters are austerely restricted to encounters between human beings.

d. Animism as Ontology

For many post-modern anthropologists, the purpose of research is understood to be a mediation between different but equally valid constructions of reality or “ontologies”. This modern shift of emphasis is sometimes labeled the “ontological turn” in anthropology. According to theorists in this school, animism should be understood as consisting in a distinct ontology with distinct commitments. Philippe Descola is one writer who characterizes animism as just one competing way among several in which the culturally universal notions of “interiority” (subjective or private states of experience) and “exteriority” (physical states) can be carved up. For Descola, the animist views elements of the external world as sharing a common interiority while differing in external features. This can be contrasted with the naturalist’s worldview, which holds that the world contains beings which are similar in their physicality (being made of the same or similar substances), yet which differ in their interiority. Thus, for the animist, while humans and trees, for example, differ in exteriority, they nevertheless share in common the possession of similar interior states. In ‘animic’ systems, humans and non-humans possess the same type of interiority. Since this interiority is understood to be common to both humans and non-humans alike, it follows that non-humans are understood as having social characteristics, such as respecting kinship rules and ethical codes.

On such an account, the animist takes the interiority of any given creature to differ from human interiority only to the extent that it is grounded in different cognitive and perceptual instruments. A tree, for example, cannot change location at will, and so has an interior life very different from that of a human being or a raven. Nevertheless, trees, humans, and ravens share in common the quality of interiority.

A more radical view in the same vein, dubbed “perspectivism”, is described by Viveiros de Castro, who notes that among various Amerindian indigenous religions, a common interiority is understood to consist in a common cultural life, and it is this common culture which is cloaked in diverse exterior appearances. This view turns the traditional, Western, naturalistic notion of the unity of nature and the plurality of culture on its head. Instead, the unity of culture is a fundamental feature of the animists’ world. Whereas in normal conditions, humans see humans as humans, and animals as animals, it is not the case that animals see themselves as animals. On the contrary, animals may see humans as possessing the exteriority of animals, while viewing themselves as humans. Jaguars, for example, see the blood they drink as beer, while vultures see maggots as grilled fish. They see their fur, feathers, claws, beaks, and so forth as cloaks and jewellery. In addition, they have their own social system organized in the same way as human institutions are (Viveiros de Castro, 1998, 470).

Although a particularly interesting position in its own right, perspectivism seems to apply to only a limited number of Amerindian cultures which are the objects of Viveiros de Castro’s studies, and so perspectivism may not serve as a broad and inclusive account of animism that could act as an umbrella for the broad range of traditions which are, on their face, animistic.

Both Descola’s and Viveiros de Castro’s accounts assume that the animist ascribes interiority to non-humans as well as to non-living creatures. However, it is unclear whether all or even most putatively animist communities share in this view. At least some communities regarded as animist appear to enact social relationships with non-human persons, yet do not appear to be committed to any dualist ontological view according to which non-human persons are actually sentient or have their own unique interior states or souls (for a discussion with reference to indigenous Australian animism, see Peterson 2011, 177).

e. Social-Relational Animism

An increasingly popular view understands animism, not as depending upon some abstract notion of interiority or soul, but rather as being fundamentally to do with relationships between human and other-than-human persons. Irving Hallowell, for example, emphasizes an ontology of social relations that holds between the world’s persons, only some of whom are human (1960, 22). Thus, what is fundamental to the animist’s worldview is a commitment to the existence of a broad set of non-human persons. This approach has been championed by Graham Harvey, who summarizes the animist’s belief as the position that “the world is full of persons, only some of whom are human, and that life is always lived in relationship with others” (2005, xi). That is not to say that animists have no concept of objecthood as divorced from personhood, but rather that animist traditions seriously challenge traditional Western views of what sorts of things can count as persons.

A version of this view has been championed by Nurit Bird-David (1999) who takes animism to be a “relational epistemology”, in which social relations between humans and non-humans are fundamental to animist ontology. What is fundamental to the animist’s worldview is the subject-subject relation, in contrast to the subject-object relation taken up in a naturalist’s understanding of the world. This in no way hinges on a metaphysical dualism that makes any distinction between spirits/souls and bodies/objects. Rather, this account hinges on a particular conception of the world as coming to be known principally via socialization. The animist does not hypothesize that some particular tree is a person, and socialize accordingly. Instead, one personifies some particular tree as, when and because one socializes with it. Thus, the commitment to the idea of non-human personhood is a commitment that develops across time and through social interaction.

The animist’s common adoption of kinship terms (such as “grandfather”) for animals and other natural phenomena may also be elucidated on this picture. In earlier writing, Hallowell (1926) describes the extent to which “bear cults” of the circumpolar region carefully avoid general terms, such as “bear” or “animal”, when addressing bears both pre- and post-mortem. Instead, kinship terms are regularly adopted. This can be explained on the assumption that the social role of the kinship term is being invoked (“grandfather”, for example, refers to one who is wise, who deserves to be listened to, who has authority within the social life of the community, and so on). Indeed, in more recent writing, Bird-David speculates whether an understanding of animist belief as fundamentally built on the notion of relatives rather than persons may more accurately account for the sense in which the animist relates with non-human others (2017). For the animist, on this revised account, the world does not so much consist in a variety of human and non-human persons, who differ in their species-specific and special forms of community life; rather, the world is composed of a network of human and non-human relatives, and what is fundamental to the animist’s worldview is this network as well as the maintenance of good relations within it.

2. The Neglect of Animism

Unlike theism, animism has seldom been the focus of any sustained critical or philosophical discourse. Perhaps unsurprisingly, where such traditions of critical discourse have flourished, a realist interpretation of animist belief has been received negatively. 17th century Japanese commentaries on Shinto provide a rare example of such a critical tradition. Writers such as Fukansai Habian, Arai Hakuseki, and Ando Shoeki critically engaged with the mythological and animistic aspects of Shinto, while also illuminating their historical and political subtexts. Interestingly, in his philosophical discourse On Shinto, Habian produces several naturalistic debunking arguments against animism, among which is the argument that the Japanese have developed their peculiar ontology in the same way as other island peoples, who all developed similar mythologies pertaining to a familial relationship with the unique piece of land on which they find themselves. He goes on to argue that the Japanese cannot truly be descendants of the Sun, since in the ordinary course of events, humans beget humans, dogs beget dogs, and so on. Thus, human beings could not actually be born of the Sun. It follows that the Japanese race could not be the descendants of Ameratsu, the Sun kami. Another critical argument from Habian runs that the heavenly bodies cannot be animate beings, since their movements are too linear and predictable. Were the moon truly animate, he argues, we should witness it zig-zagging as does an ant (Baskind and Bowring 2015, 147). Such debates, naturally, had little impact in the West where they were largely inaccessible (and anyways considered irrelevant). After the voyages of discovery and during the age of empire, the steady conversion of colonized peoples to the proselytizing theistic traditions of colonial powers added credence to the notion that primitive animist religions had indeed been discarded for more sophisticated religious rivals (particularly, Christianity and Islam).

The modernist view (championed by the likes of Hume, Tylor, and Frazer) according to which animism is an unsophisticated, primitive, and superstitious belief was carried over wholesale into contemporary 20th century analytic philosophy of religion. One might expect that as religious exclusivism waned in popularity in philosophy and popular culture, animism would come to be appreciated as one valid religious perspective among many other contenders. Yet even permissive religious pluralists, such as the philosopher John Hick, denied that primitive animistic traditions count as genuine transformative encounters with transcendental ultimacy or “the Real” (1989, 278). One recent attempt to reconcile religious pluralism and indigenous religious traditions can be found in the work of Mikel Burley, although it remains to be seen what impact this approach will have on the field.

Other philosophers of religion (such as Kevin Schilbrack [2014] and Graham Oppy [2014]) argue that the philosophy of religion needs to critically engage with a greater diversity of viewpoints and traditions, which would include animism, as well as ancestor worship, shamanism and the like. Of course, it is not incumbent on these philosophers to celebrate animism. But it is important that that the field dubbed “philosophy of religion” engage with religion as a broad and varied human phenomenon. The cursory dismissal that animism receives within the discipline is, apparently, little more than a hangover of colonial biases.

The view that animist traditions fail to compete with the “great world religions” remains surprisingly pervasive in mainstream philosophy of religion. A reason for this may have to do with a prevailing conception of animist traditions as having no transformative or transcendental aspects. They are immanentist religions, which seldom speak of any notions of salvation or liberation as a central religious aim. Instead, there is a focus on the immediate needs of the community and on good working relationships which stand between human persons and the environment. Because animists are immanentists, their traditions are seen as failing to lead believers to the ultimate religious goal: salvation. However, it is clear enough that there are no non-circular grounds on which to base this appraisal. Why would we judge transcendentalist religions superior, or more efficacious, compared to immanentist ones, unless we were already committed to the view that the ultimate goal of religion is salvation?

3. Public Arguments for Animism

Some philosophical arguments can be mounted in support of animism. Some of these arguments hinge on evidence which is publicly available (call them “public arguments”). Others may hinge on what is ultimately private or person-relative evidence (call them “private arguments”). Two closely related public arguments may be proffered in support of animism:

a. Argument from Innateness

Within the field of psychology, it has been observed that children have a “tendency to regard objects as living and endowed with will” (Piaget 1929, 170). Young children are more inclined to ascribe agency to what most adults regard as inanimate objects. Evidence suggests that this tendency to attribute agency decreases markedly between three and five years of age (Bullock 1985, 222). This tendency to attribute agency is not the result of training by caregivers. Implicit in much of the psychological research is the idea that the child’s perception of widespread agency is naive, and corrected by the path of development to adulthood. This was an argument already stated by the Scottish enlightenment philosopher Thomas Reid in the 18th century. Yet it is unclear on what grounds, apart from our pre-existing naturalistic commitments, we might base this appraisal.

Against the view that childhood animism is corrected by experience, David Kennedy writes that the shift towards naturalist modernism has left the child’s animist commitments in a state of abandonment. Kennedy asks somewhat rhetorically: “Do young children, because of their different situation, have some insight into nature that adults do not? Does their “folly” actually represent a form of wisdom, or at least a philosophical openness lost to adults, who have learned, before they knew it, to read soul out of nature?” (Kennedy 1989). The idea that childhood animism is corrected by experience is the natural consequence of a commitment to a modernist conception of animism, but it would be a harder position to maintain according to the alternative conceptions surveyed above.

b. Argument from Common Consent

The traditional argument from common consent runs that because the majority of religious believers are theists, theism is probably true. A revised common consent argument may be launched, however, which runs that since separate and isolated religious communities independently agree to the proposition that features of the natural world (such as rocks, rivers and whales) are persons, it follows, therefore, that animism is probably true (Smith 2019). This argument relies on the social epistemic claim that independent agreement is prima facie evidence for the truth of some proposition. A similar argument supporting ancestor worship can be found in a recent article by Thomas Reuter (2014). Moreover, it is argued that since the widespread distribution of theists has been brought about by the relatively recent proselytization of politically disempowered peoples, such widespread agreement is not compelling evidence for the truth of theism. Indeed, even contemporary defenders of the common consent argument for the existence of God accept that independent agreement is stronger evidence for the truth of some proposition than agreement generated by some other means, such as “word of mouth” or indoctrination (see, for example, Zagzebski [2012, 343]). It would seem, then, that even on their own terms, contemporary proponents of the common consent argument for the existence of God ought to consider animism as a serious rival to theism.

4. Private Arguments for Animism

Recently, it has been popular to move beyond public defenses of religious belief and toward private or person-relative defenses. Such defenses typically charge that believers are warranted to accept their religious beliefs, even if they lack compelling discursive arguments or public evidence that their views are reasonable to believe or probably true. Alvin Plantinga’s Warranted Christian Belief is the best-known work in this vein.

If such defenses are not inherently epistemologically suspicious, then it remains open for the animist to argue that while there may be no overwhelmingly convincing arguments for animism, animist beliefs are nevertheless internally vindicated according to the standards that animists themselves hold, whatever those standards might be. It could be argued that animist belief is properly basic in the same way that Plantinga takes theistic belief to be (Plantinga 1981). In addition, it may be argued that animist beliefs are not defeated by any external challenges (Smith [2019], for example, gives rebuttals to evolutionary debunking arguments of animism). Thus, it might be argued that animism is vindicated not by external or discursive arguments according to which animism can be shown to be probably true, but by epistemic features internal to the relevant animistic belief system. The animist may argue that although animist belief is thereby justified in a circular manner, this is in no way inferior to the justification afforded to other fundamental beliefs (beliefs about perception, for example), since epistemic circularity is a feature of many of our most fundamental beliefs (William Alston [1986] defends Christian mystical practices by appeal to this kind of tu quoque argument).

5. Pragmatic Arguments for Animism

It is the nature of pragmatic arguments to present some aim as worthwhile, and to recommend some policy conducive to the achievement of that aim. Animist belief has been recommended by some writers as conducive to achieving the following three aims.

a. Environmentalism

An understanding of the environment as rich with persons clearly has implications for conservation, resource management, and sustainability. The scope of human moral decision-making, which may affect the well-being of other persons, is broadened beyond a concern only for human persons. It is on these grounds that philosophers and environmental theorists have argued that a shift towards animism is conducive to the success of worldwide conservation and sustainability efforts. Val Plumwood, for example, argues that an appreciation of non-human others is nothing short of a “basic survival project”. She writes that “reversing our drive towards destroying our planetary habitat,” may require “a thorough and open rethink which has the courage to question our most basic cultural narratives” (2010, 47). The argument runs that within a positivist, scientistic paradigm, reverence and appreciation for the natural world is replaced by a disregard or even an antipathy, according to which the natural world is understood as a mere resource for human consumption.

Much of the appeal of this view appears to hinge on the popular belief that many indigenous societies lived in harmony with nature and that this harmony is a direct result of their understanding of the outside world as an extension of their own society and culture. Against this ecological “noble savage” view, some scholars have charged that this romanticized picture of the animist is unrealistic, as there seems to be at best a tenuous causal connection between traditional animist belief systems and enhanced conservation practices (Tiedje 2008, 97). Any link between animism and environmentalism will also hinge importantly on precisely which natural phenomena are understood to be persons, and whether such persons require much or any respect at all.  A tradition that views a fire as a subject and a grassland as a mere object is unlikely to be concerned when the former consumes the latter.

b. Feminism

It has been argued that the liberation of women is a project which cannot be disentangled from the liberation of (and political recognition of) the environment. The objectification of nature is seen as an aspect of patriarchy, which may be undone by the acceptance of an ethics of care which acknowledges the existence of non-human persons. The frame of thinking in which patriarchy flourishes depends upon a system of binary opposition, according to which “nature” is contrasted with “reason”, and according to which anything considered to fall within the sphere of the former (women, indigenous peoples, animals, and so forth) is devalued and systematically disempowered (Mathews 2008, 319). Thus, animism, in so far as it rejects the traditional binary, is perceived as an ally of (a thoroughly intersectional) feminism.

Moreover, the argument is made that animism, as an epistemological world picture, itself constitutes a feminist challenge to patriarchal epistemologies and the conclusions drawn from them. So, whereas monotheistic religious traditions are taken to be grounded in abstract reasoning about ultimate causes and ultimate justice (supposedly “masculine” reasoning), animism is taken to be grounded in intuition and a concern for the maintenance of interpersonal relationships. Likewise, while an austere philosophical naturalism views the external world as fundamentally composed of unconscious, mechanistic, and deterministic causal objects whose real natures are grasped by sense perception and abstract reasoning, an animist epistemology is sensitive to the fundamentality of knowing others, and so shares common cause with feminist epistemological approaches (such as Stuckey [2010, 190]).

c. Nationalism and Sovereignty

Given the intimate connection that the animist draws between communities and their local environment, animism has been endorsed in promoting nationalistic political agendas as well as in reasserting indigenous sovereignty over contested ancestral lands. In New Zealand, for example, legal personhood has been granted to both a mountain range (Te Urewera Act 2014) and a river (Te Awa Tupua (Whanganui River Claims Settlement) Act 2017). In both cases, legal personhood was granted in accordance with the traditional animist commitments of local Māori, and the acts were thereby seen as reasserting indigenous sovereignty over these lands.

Nationalist political movements have also made appeal to animism and neo-paganism, particularly in hostile quests of expansion. Since animist traditions draw strong connections between environment and culture, land and relatedness, there is fertile ground for such traditions to invoke exclusive rights to the use and habitation of the environment. The promotion of Volkisch neo-paganism, for example, was used to motivate Nazi arguments for German Lebensraum, or living space—the expansion into “ancestral” German lands (Kurlander 2017, 3-32). Similarly, Shinto was instituted as the state religion in Japan in 1868 to consolidate the nation after the Meiji restoration. It was further invoked to defend notions of racial superiority up to the Second World War. As direct descendants of Amaterasu (the sun kami), the Japanese race had a claim to racial superiority, particularly over other Asian races. This claim to Japanese racial supremacy, itself a consequence of animist aspects of Shinto mythology, was often used in defense of the expansion of the Japanese empire throughout the Asia-Pacific region (Holtom 1947, 16).

6. References and Further Reading

  • Alston, W. (1986) ‘Epistemic Circularity’ Philosophy and Phenomenological Research. 47 (1): pp. 1—30.
  • Baskind, J. and Bowring, R. (2015) The Myotei Dialogues: A Japanese Christian Critique of Native Traditions. Boston: Brill.
  • Bird-David, N. (1999) ““Animism” Revisited: Personhood, Environment, and Relational Epistemology” Current Anthropology. 40: (S1). pp. S67-S91.
  • Bird-David, N. (2017) Us, Relatives: Scaling and Plural Life in a Forager World. Oakland: University of California Press.
  • Buber, M. (1970) in Kaufman, W. (trans.). I and Thou. New York: Charles Scribner’s and Sons.
  • Bullock, M. (1985) “Animism in Childhood Thinking: a New Look at an Old question” Developmental Psychology. 21: (2) pp. 217-225.
  • Burley, Mikel (2019) A Radical Pluralist Philosophy of Religion. New York: Bloomsbury Academic.
  • Descola, P. (2013) in Lloyd, J. (trans.) Beyond Nature and Culture. Chicago. Chicago University Press.
  • Fortenbaugh, W. (2011) Strato of Lampsacus: Text, Translation and Discussion. New York: Routledge.
  • Frazer, J. (1900) The Golden Bough: A Study in Magic and Religion. New York: Macmillan and Co.
  • Freud, S. (1950) Totem and Taboo. London: Routledge and Kegan Paul Ltd.
  • Guthrie, S. (2015) Faces in the Clouds: A New Theory of Religion. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
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Author Information

Tiddy Smith
Otago University
New Zealand