Anti-natalism is the extremely provocative view that it is either always or usually impermissible to procreate. Some find the view so offensive that they do not think it should be discussed. Others think their strongly intuitive disagreement with it is enough in itself to reject all arguments for anti-natalism. In the first twenty years of the twenty-first century, however, a distinct literature emerged that addressed anti-natalism. Sophisticated arguments both in favour of and against anti-natalism have been developed and defended. Philanthropic arguments for anti-natalism, that is, arguments that emphasize liking and trusting human beings (as opposed to misanthropic arguments), focus on the harm done to individuals who are brought into existence. For example, David Benatar’s Asymmetry Argument says that it is wrong to procreate because of an asymmetry between pleasure and pain. The absence of pain is good even if no one experiences that good whereas the absence of pleasure is not bad unless someone is deprived of it. Since everyone who comes into existence will inevitably experience nontrivial harm, it is better that they are not brought into existence since no one would be harmed by their non-existence. Other philanthropic arguments include the idea that individuals cannot consent to their creation, that procreating necessarily involves creating victims, and that procreation involves exploiting babies in order to get fully formed adults. Misanthropic arguments for anti-natalism, on the other hand, appeal to the harm that individuals who are brought into existence will cause. These include the harms that humans inflict upon each other, other animals, and the environment. Finally, it has also been recognized that if we have a duty to relieve extreme poverty when possible, there may be a corresponding duty for both the rich and poor to cease from procreating.
There are numerous ways to expand the debate about anti-natalism. For instance, scholars of religion have had little to say about anti-natalism, but it is unclear that they can completely dismiss certain of these arguments out of hand. Additionally, the debate about anti-natalism has primarily been conducted within the context of Western philosophy. It is an open question how the arguments for anti-natalism would be evaluated by various non-Western ethical theories. Finally, environmental ethics and population ethics have had little to say about anti-natalism, and as such there are many avenues for further exploration.
Table of Contents
- Philanthropic Arguments for Anti-Natalism
- Benatar’s Asymmetry Argument
- Challenges to the Asymmetry Argument
- The Deluded Gladness Argument
- Challenges to Deluded Gladness
- Overall’s Sexism Challenge to Benatar
- The Hypothetical Consent Argument
- Challenges to Hypothetical Consent
- The No Victim Argument
- The Exploitation Argument
- Negative Utilitarianism
- Broader Implications
- Additional Objections to Philanthropic Arguments
- The Misanthropic Argument
- Anti-Natalism and Duties to the Poor
- Future Directions
- References and Further Reading
1. Philanthropic Arguments for Anti-Natalism
This section outlines important philanthropic arguments for anti-natalism, which focus on the harm done to individuals who are created. Philanthropic arguments are particularly controversial because they tend to conclude that it is always all-things-considered impermissible to procreate. The specific arguments outlined in this article include the Asymmetry Argument, the Deluded Gladness Argument, the Hypothetical Consent Argument, the No Victim Argument, and the Exploitation Argument. This section concludes by briefly examining the broader implications of philanthropic arguments.
a. Benatar’s Asymmetry Argument
The South African philosopher David Benatar is probably the most influential contemporary proponent of anti-natalism, although later we will see that he has offered a misanthropic argument for anti-natalism, he is best known for defending a strong philanthropic argument which says that it is always impermissible to procreate.
Benatar’s main defense of philanthropic arguments is to be found in his book, Better Never to Have Been: The Harm of Coming into Existence (2006). Since its publication, he has defended the main lines of argument in this book from various critiques and appears not to have wavered from his initial conclusions. Benatar explains that “[t]he central idea of [his] book is that coming into existence is always a serious harm” (2006, 1; emphasis added). He is well aware that the strong evolutionary tendency towards optimism means that many will find such a conclusion repulsive. Finally, while Benatar focuses most of his discussion on human procreation, he is clear from the beginning that his argument applies to all sentient beings because they are capable of experiencing harm (2006, 2).
How does Benatar arrive at such a controversial conclusion? Consider that many people hold that procreation is often permissible because most individuals who come into existence believe that their lives are worth living. In other words, many of us think our lives are worth living despite facing a certain number of obstacles and difficulties throughout our lives. Moreover, a problem about personal identity raised by twentieth-century moral philosopher Derek Parfit complicates matters further. This problem is called the non-identity problem and raises questions about whether it is even possible for an individual with an extremely low quality of life to coherently wish that their life had gone differently (1996). For example, if Sally was born to different parents or in different circumstances, it is doubtful that Sally would really be the same person at all, and not some other different person, Sally*. Benatar argues that all of this is the result of a simple mistake. He suggests that the non-identity problem only arises because people frequently conflate a life worth continuing with a life worth starting. According to Benatar, these are hardly the same. This is because the former judgment is one that a person who already exists makes about themselves, while the latter judgment is one about a potential though non-existent being (Benatar 2006, 19-23). Benatar’s thesis is that no lives are worth starting, even though many lives are worth continuing once they have been started.
One of the main ways that Benatar defends this view is by appealing to important asymmetries between non-existence and existence. For Benatar, “there is a crucial difference between harms (such as pains) and benefits (such as pleasures) which entails that existence has no advantage over, but does have disadvantages relative to, non-existence” (Benatar 2006, 30). Here is a key distinction that Benatar needs to establish the Asymmetry Argument: the absence of pain is good even if no one experiences that good while the absence of pleasure is not bad unless someone is deprived of it. Consider:
(1) the presence of pain is bad,
(2) the presence of pleasure is good (Benatar 2006, 30).
However, Benatar claims that this sort of symmetry does not exist when applied to the absence of pain:
(3) the absence of pain is good, even if that good is not enjoyed by anyone,
(4) the absence of pleasure is not bad unless there is somebody for whom this absence is a deprivation (Benatar 2006, 30).
One reason for holding the asymmetry between (3) and (4) is that it enjoys great explanatory power. According to Benatar, it explains four different asymmetries better than competing alternatives. The first asymmetry it explains is also probably the most obvious one. This is the asymmetry between the claim that we have a strong duty not to intentionally bring someone into existence who will suffer, but we do not have a corresponding duty to bring happy persons into existence (Benatar 2006, 32). The second asymmetry is between the strangeness of citing the benefit to a potential child as the reason for bringing them into existence versus the coherence of citing the harms to a potential child as the reason for not bringing them into existence (Benatar 2006, 34). The third asymmetry involves our retrospective judgments. While we can regret both bringing an individual into existence and not bringing an individual into existence, it is only possible to regret bringing an individual into existence for the sake of that individual. If that individual had not been brought into existence, they would not exist and hence nothing could be regretted for their sake (Benatar 2006, 34). The fourth asymmetry is between our judgments about distant suffering versus uninhabited regions. We should rightly be sad and regret the former, but we should not be sad or regret that some far away planet (or island in our own world), is uninhabited (Benatar 2006, 35).
Here is a chart Benatar uses to further explain his view (Benatar 2006, 38):
|If X exists||If X never exists|
|Presence of pain (Bad)||Absence of pain (Good)|
|Presence of pleasure (Good)||Absence of pleasure (Not bad)|
Thus, the absence of pain is good even if the best or perhaps only way to achieve it is by the very absence of the person who would otherwise experience it. This asymmetry between harm and pleasure explains why it is wrong to have a child because they will not benefit from that existence, while “it is not strange to cite a potential child’s interests as a basis for avoiding bringing a child into existence” (Benatar 2005, 34). With this asymmetry established, Benatar concludes that coming into existence in our world is always a harm. In sum, “[t]he fact that one enjoys one’s life does not make one’s existence better than non-existence, because if one had not come into existence there would have been nobody to have missed the joy of leading that life and thus the absence of joy would not be bad” (Benatar 2005, 58).
b. Challenges to the Asymmetry Argument
Benatar’s Asymmetry Argument has been challenged in a number of places. Some have suggested that the distinction between a life worth starting and a life worth continuing does not hold up to scrutiny (DeGrazia 2012; Metz 2011, 241). Why think these are two distinct standards? For example, why not hold that a life worth starting just is a life that will be worth continuing? Some have argued that Benatar does not do enough to defend this distinction, which is an important one for the success of his argument. Another objection has been to challenge directly the asymmetries defended by Benatar. While Benatar suggests that an absence of pleasure is not bad unless there is an individual who is deprived of it, perhaps it is better understood as not good (Metz 2011, 242). Likewise, maybe an absence of pain is better understood as not bad (Metz 2011, 242-243). This would modify Benatar’s chart to the following:
|If X exists||If X never exists|
|Presence of pain (Bad)||Absence of pain (Not Bad)|
|Presence of pleasure (Good)||Absence of pleasure (Not Good)|
There are at least two reasons to favour this symmetry to the asymmetry posited by Benatar. First “is the fact of symmetry itself. As many physicists, mathematicians and philosophers of science have pointed out, symmetrical principles and explanations are to be preferred, ceteris paribus, to asymmetrical ones” (Metz 2011, 245). Second, the symmetry may better explain “uncontroversial judgments about the relationship between experiences such as pleasure and pain and their degree of dis/value” (Metz 2011, 245).
Another alternative understanding of the four procreative asymmetries Benatar claims are best explained by the basic asymmetry between pain and pleasure is the idea that the four asymmetries themselves are fundamental. As such they need not rely on a further asymmetry for their explanation (2002, 354-355). For those who disagree, DeGrazia writes that another alternative explanation is that “we have much stronger duties not to harm than to benefit and that this difference makes all the difference when we add the value of reproductive liberty. If so, the asymmetry about procreative duties does not favor the fundamental asymmetry between benefit and harm championed by Benatar” (DeGrazia 2010 322).
Ben Bradley argues that Benatar’s asymmetry fails because “there is a conceptual link between goodness and betterness; but if pleasure were intrinsically good but not better than its absence, there would be no such link” (Bradley 2013, 39; see also Bradley 2010).
Elizabeth Harman claims that Benatar’s Asymmetry Argument “equivocates between impersonal goodness and goodness for a person” (2009, 780). It is true that the presence of pain is bad. It is both personally and impersonally bad. However, the absence of pain is only impersonally good since there is no person who exists to experience its absence (Harman 2009, 780). But for the asymmetry to hold Benatar would have to show that absence of pain is also personally good. All of the various rejoinders to these claims cannot be discussed, but it is noteworthy that Benatar has directly responded to many criticisms of his arguments (for example, Benatar 2013).
c. The Deluded Gladness Argument
Benatar also offers a second argument in support of his anti-natalist conclusion, which can be called the Deluded Gladness Argument. The main thrust of this argument is to show that while typical life assessments are often quite positive, they are almost always mistaken. This serves as a standalone argument for the claim that we should refrain from procreating since all (or almost all) lives are quite bad. It also offers support for the Asymmetry Argument which says that if an individual’s life will contain even the slightest harm, it is impermissible to bring them into existence. This argument aims to show that in the vast majority of cases, the harms contained in human lives are far from slight. Benatar argues that “even the best lives are very bad, and therefore that being brought into existence is always a considerable harm” (2006, 61).
Most people’s own self-assessments of their lives are positive. In other words, most people are glad to have been brought into existence and do not think they were seriously harmed by being brought into existence. The ‘Deluded Gladness Argument’ is Benatar’s reasons for thinking that such self-assessments are almost always the result of delusion. Benatar explains that “[t]here are a number of well-known features of human psychology that can account for the favourable assessment people usually make of their own life’s quality. It is these psychological phenomena rather than the actual quality of a life that explain (the extent of) the positive assessment” (2006, 64). The most important psychological factor is the Pollyanna Principle which says that people are strongly inclined towards optimism in their judgments. People recall positive experiences with greater frequency and reliability than negative experiences. This means that when people look back on the past, they tend to inflate the positive aspects of it while minimizing the negative features. This also affects how people view the future, with a bias towards overestimating how well things will go. Subjective assessments about overall well-being are also consistently over-stated with respect to positive well-being (Benatar 2006, 64-65). Just consider that “most people believe that they are better off than most others or than the average person” (Benatar 2006, 66). People’s own assessments of their health do not correlate with objective assessments of it. The self-assessments of happiness of the poor are (almost) always equivalent to those offered by the rich. Educational and occupational differences tend to make insignificant differences to quality of life assessments too (Benatar 2006, 66-67).
Benatar claims that some of this Pollyannaism can be explained by “adaptation, accommodation, or habituation” (2006, 67). If there is a significant downturn in a person’s life, their well-being will suffer. However, they often readjust their expectations to their worse situation and so eventually their self-assessments do not remain low; they move back towards the original level of well-being (Benatar 66-67). Subjective well-being report changes more accurately than actual levels of well-being. People often also assess their own well-being by making relative comparisons to others. This means that self-assessments are more often comparisons of well-being, instead of assessments of actual well-being (Benatar 2006, 68). Benatar further argues that on three main theories of how well a life is going–hedonistic theories, desire-fulfillment theories, and objective list theories—assessments of how well one’s life is going are almost always too positive. He consistently points out that there is a distinction between the well-being that an individual ascribes to their own life and the actual well-being of that individual’s life. Benatar’s point is that these things do not often align. Once we have a more accurate picture of how bad our lives really are, we should ask whether we would inflict the harms that occur in any ordinary life to a person who already exists. The answer, according to Benatar is clearly ‘no’. (87-88). While it is possible to have a life that avoids most harms, we are not in a good epistemic position to identify whether this will apply to our own offspring. Given that the odds of avoidance are slim to begin with, procreation is akin to a rather nasty game of Russian roulette.
d. Challenges to Deluded Gladness
Regardless of the status of Benatar’s asymmetry thesis, he has also urged that our lives are far worse than the value at which we normally assess them. If it turns out that most lives are actually not worth living, then this is a reason in itself not to procreate. But many have suggested that Benatar is mistaken about this fact. For instance, the fact that so many people are glad for their existence might be evidence in itself that such gladness is not deluded (DeGrazia 2012, 164). Furthermore, any plausible moral theory must be able to account for the fact that most people are glad to be alive and think that their lives are going well (DeGrazia 2012, 158).
Another objection is that it fails to distinguish between higher-order pleasures and minor pains. Being tired or hungry is a harm, but it is outweighed by more valuable goods such as loving relationships. Many of the negative features that Benatar associates with existence can be overridden in this way (Harman 2009, 783).
Alan Gewirth has comprehensively defended the concept of self-fulfillment as key to a meaningful life (1998). Although special relationships like the one between parents and children violate egalitarian norms, having a family does not violate anyone else’s human rights. This forms part of the basis for Gewirth claiming that while “children have not themselves voluntarily participated in setting up the family, their special concern for their parents and siblings is appropriately viewed as derivative, both morally and psychologically, from the parents’ special concern both for one another and for each of their children and, in this way, for the family as a whole” (1998, 143). At least for some people, procreating and the family unit are an important part of self-fulfillment. If Gewirth is right about the value of self-fulfillment, and procreating contributes to self-fulfillment (at least for certain individuals), then these ideas constitute a reason to reject Deluded Gladness. At the very least, Gewirth’s theory of self-fulfilment needs to be considered by Benatar in addition to the hedonistic theories, desire-fulfillment theories, and objective list theories he criticizes for encouraging inaccurate self assessments about quality of life.
There are also important questions about whether the type of self-deception that seems to be required by the Undeluded Gladness Argument is even possible. For example, some theories of deception say that the deceiver knowingly and intentionally deceives another agent. But this makes it difficult to see how self-deception is even possible. The deceiver would know they are deceiving themselves since deceit is intentional. A problem arises because the notion that many people have simply deluded themselves into thinking their lives are better than they really are could plausibly be thought to be a form of self-deception. And yet on the theory of self-deception just described, we might wonder whether such self-deception is even possible. Connections between arguments for anti-natalism and self-deception are surely worthy of more consideration. As it stands, the literature on anti-natalism in general has not taken into account how different theories of self-deception might affect various arguments.
e. Overall’s Sexism Challenge to Benatar
Christine Overall suggests that Benatar’s arguments, even if true, could have harmful consequences for women. This is thus a moral rather than an epistemic challenge to anti-natalism. First, Overall holds that we do not have a duty to procreate because women have procreative control over their own bodies (Overall 2012, 114). Second, she objects to the idea that there are no costs associated with procreation, especially when one considers the nine-month pregnancy and delivery. Third, she worries that adopting Benatar’s views could actually lead to more female infanticide and violence towards pregnant women. One question here, then, is whether Benatar is sufficiently sensitive to the plight of women and the potential consequences his arguments might have for them. Is anti-natalism ultimately a sexist position?
Benatar responds to Overall by claiming that a right to not reproduce only exists if there is no moral duty to reproduce. This reply closely links rights with duties. He also observes that the costs women incur in procreating are not what is under dispute. The question at stake here is whether it is permissible to procreate, not whether there are costs involved in procreating. Finally, Benatar again reiterates that his arguments have to do with morality, which in this case is distinct from the law. This is why he holds that “contraception and abortion should not be legally mandatory even though contraception and early abortion are morally required” (Benatar 2019, 366). Finally, Benatar suggests that Overall has not provided specific evidence that anti-natalism would harm women. In turning this objection on its head, he claims that anti-natalism might actually be good for women. For if widely adopted, then there might be less of a tendency to view women primarily as child birthers and rearers (Benatar 2019, 366-367). Which of Benatar or Overall is correct about the consequences of anti-natalism for women appears to be an empirical question.
f. The Hypothetical Consent Argument
After Benatar’s work, the Hypothetical Consent Argument is probably the most discussed argument for anti-natalism in the literature. The basic idea of the argument is that procreation imposes unjustified harm on an individual to which they did not consent (Shiffrin 1999; Singh 2012; Harrison 2012). But what makes procreation an unjustified harm? For there are clearly certain cases where harming an unconsenting individual is justified. Consider the following oft-discussed case:
Rescue. A man is trapped in a mangled car that apparently will explode within minutes. You alone can help. It appears that the only way of getting him out of the car will break his arm, but there is no time to discuss the matter. You pull him free, breaking his arm, and get him to safety before the car explodes (DeGrazia 2012, 151).
It is permissible in this case to harm the man in a nontrivial way without his consent because doing so clearly prevents the greater harm of his death. We can say that in such a case you have the man’s hypothetical consent because he would (or rationally ought to) consent to the harm if he could. But now consider a different case that is also frequently discussed:
Gold manna. An eccentric millionaire who lives on an island wants to give some money to inhabitants of a nearby island who are comfortably off but not rich. For various reasons, he cannot communicate with these islanders and has only one way of giving them money: by flying in his jet and dropping heavy gold cubes, each worth $1 million, near passers-by. He knows that doing so imposes a risk of injuring one or more of the islanders, a harm he would prefer to avoid. But the only place where he can drop the cubes is very crowded, making significant (but nonlethal and impermanent) injury highly likely. Figuring that anyone who is injured is nevertheless better off for having gained $1 million, he proceeds. An inhabitant of the island suffers a broken arm in receiving her gold manna (DeGrazia 2012, 151-152).
What makes this eccentric millionaire’s actions impermissible in this case is that the benefit imposed does not involve avoiding a greater harm. This is what ethicists refer to as a pure benefit. So, the idea is that it is impermissible to confer a pure benefit on someone who has not consented to it, while it is permissible to confer a benefit on someone to prevent a nontrivial harm to them. In the Rescue case there is hypothetical consent to the harm, whereas in the Gold manna case there is no such consent.
The anti-natalist urges that procreation is analogous to the Gold manna case, not the Rescue case. Procreation imposes a nontrivial and unconsented harm on the individual who is created for the purposes of bestowing a pure benefit. Those who would procreate, then, do not have the hypothetical consent of the individuals they procreate. Why is this the case? If an individual does not exist, she cannot be harmed nor benefitted. Language is misleading here because when procreation does not occur there is no ‘individual’ who does not exist. There is simply nothing. There is no person in a burning car, no people on the island, and no free-floating soul waiting to be created. Procreation always involves bestowing a pure benefit, something this argument says is impermissible.
g. Challenges to Hypothetical Consent
Connected to the counterclaim that our lives usually go well is the idea that it is actually permissible to sometimes bestow a pure benefit on someone. There are cases where parents are better understood as exposing their child to certain harms rather than imposing such harms on them. Even if the act of procreation is ultimately best understood as imposing harms, it may be justified in light of bestowing a pure benefit on the created individual. Parents often make their children participate in activities where the gain is only a pure benefit; the activity has nothing to do with avoiding a greater harm. Consider parents who encourage excellence in scholarship, music, or athletics (DeGrazia 2012, 156-157). If this is right, then there is also reason to reject the Hypothetical Consent Argument for anti-natalism.
h. The No Victim Argument
Gerald Harrison argues that to coherently posit the existence of moral duties means there must be a possible victim (that can be hurt by the breaking of a duty). In light of this, he suggests that “we have a duty not to create the suffering contained in any prospective life, but we do not have a duty to create the pleasures contained in any prospective life” (2012, 94). It is intuitive to think that we have the following two duties: (1) There is a duty to prevent suffering; and (2) There is a duty to promote pleasure (Harrison 2012, 96). Since there would be no victim if one failed to create happy people, this nicely explains why we do not have a duty to procreate even if we are sure our offspring will have very happy lives. However, this also explains why we have a duty not to create suffering people since if we do so there are clearly victims (that is, the suffering people who were created).
Since all lives contain suffering, there is a duty to never procreate. For in procreating, we always fail to do our duty to prevent suffering because there is an actual victim of suffering. That an individual has an on balance or overall happy life cannot outweigh the duty to not procreate because in failing to procreate there is no victim (Harrison 2012, 97-99).
According to Harrison, the duty not to procreate is therefore underpinned by two prima facie duties. First, we have a duty to prevent harm. Second, we have a “duty not to seriously affect someone else with [their] prior consent” (2012, 100). However, Harrison acknowledges that “[f]ulfilling this duty will mean that no more lives are created and this […] is a bad state of affairs, even if it is not bad for anyone” (2012, 100). The reason we do not have a duty from ensuring that this state of affairs does not obtain is that doing so would involve bringing people into existence who will in fact be harmed by their existence. On the other hand, that no more lives are created does not harm anyone. Harrison further notes that though his position entails the strange claim that a person can be happy for being brought into existence, even though they are harmed by it, there is nothing incoherent in it. For example, someone could place a large bet in our name without our consent. Doing so is wrong even if the bet is won and we ultimately benefit from it (Harrison 2012, 100).
i. The Exploitation Argument
The Exploitation Argument for anti-natalism, offered by Christopher Belshaw, involves the idea that procreation fundamentally involves exploitation (Belshaw 2012). Consider that we have the intuition that we should end the lives of animals who are suffering even if there is some chance that they could be happy in the future (Belshaw 2012, 120). Suppose that there are categorical desires, which involve reasons to ensure our future existence. Further suppose that there are also conditional desires, which, assuming a future, offer reason to think that one state of affairs will obtain over some other one (Belshaw 2012, 121). Belshaw continues to suggest that while a baby is a human animal, it is necessarily not a person in a more robust sense. This is because babies are not psychologically knit together, nor do they have categorical or conditional desires (Belshaw 2012, 124). Likewise, there is no continuity between a baby and the adult it becomes; it is implausible to think these are the same person. For a baby:
[H]as no developed notion of itself, or of time, no desire to live on into the future, no ability to think about the pain and decide to endure it. Further, if we think seriously about a baby’s life we’ll probably agree it experiences pain in more than trivial amounts. Even perfectly healthy babies come into the world screaming, cry a lot, suffer colic and teething pains, keep people awake at night. None of us can remember anything about it (Belshaw 2012, 124).
An important claim of the Exploitation Argument is that such a life is not worth living. Even if only through a baby can a person be brought into existence, this does not compensate the baby for the harm it experiences (Belshaw 2012, 124). This means that we must exploit babies in order for there to be humans. I might be glad that there was a baby who was exploited in order for me to come to exist, but it would still be better for that baby had it never been born. In procreating “we are inevitably free-riding on the several misfortunes of small, helpless and shortlived creatures.” (Belshaw 2012, 126).
j. Negative Utilitarianism
Two well-known consequentialist ethical theories are act-utilitarianism and rule-utilitarianism. The former focuses on evaluating the permissibility of individual actions based on their effects while the latter instead seeks to discover a set of rules which if followed will maximize positive effects. This strategy involves categorizing different types of action. It has been observed that a different type of utilitarianism, negative utilitarianism, entails anti-natalism (for example, Belshaw 2012; Metz 2011). On this moral theory, the only salient aspect of morality is avoiding pain. When assessing whether a particular action is permissible (or what set of rules to follow) we should only ask whether the effects of that action will be painful. Obtaining pleasure (in any sense) simply does not factor into moral reasoning on this view.
Since every life contains at least some pain, it is best to avoid it by simply not starting that life in the first place. According to negative utilitarianism, no amount of pleasure could outweigh even the smallest degree of pain, since pleasure does not count for anything morally. While the connection between negative utilitarianism and anti-natalism has been identified, anti-natalists have hardly been eager to adopt this as an argumentative strategy. Not only is negative utilitarianism a highly controversial moral theory in itself, but it seems to entail pro-mortalism, the view that people should end their lives. This is, after all, seemingly the best way to avoid any future pains. Since many anti-natalists have gone to great lengths to show that the view does not in fact entail pro-mortalism, appealing to negative utilitarianism is largely avoided by proponents of anti-natalism.
k. Broader Implications
It is important to note that there is a difference between offering theoretical arguments for a particular conclusion and enforcing policies which ensure that conclusion is enacted. The philosophical debate about anti-natalism is almost entirely theoretical. Many authors defending anti-natalism seem well aware that there are strong prudential and moral reasons not to force anti-natalist policies on people. Likewise, though they think anti-natalism is true there is a general recognition that it will not be widely adopted in practice.
2. Additional Objections to Philanthropic Arguments
a. Procreative Autonomy
One reason that has been offered to reject anti-natalist conclusions in general is that procreative autonomy is more important (for example, Robertson 1994). Procreative autonomy is important because procreation is often central to an individual’s identity, dignity, and life’s meaning. In other words:
Whether or not to have children, when and by what means to have them, how many to have, and similar choices are extremely important to us. These decisions greatly affect our narrative identity—for example, whether or not we become parents, what sort of family we have—and much of the shape of our lives. Few decisions seem as personal and far-reaching as reproductive decisions. That procreative freedom is very important seems too obvious to require further defense (DeGrazia 2012, 155).
Those who are attracted to this type of response could admit that anti-natalists get at important truths about procreation, but simply maintain that procreative autonomy is more important.
Another objection that sometimes gets levelled against anti-natalism is that it entails pro-mortalism, the view that individuals ought to end their lives. As noted above, this is probably one reason why anti-natalists have avoided tying their views to negative utilitarianism. However, it seems doubtful that any of the main arguments for anti-natalism entail pro-mortalism. With respect to Benatar’s work, he consistently states that even though lives are not worth creating, most are worth continuing. The same can be said of the Hypothetical Consent Argument. Once an individual has received the pure benefit of existence, realizing this fact does not imply they should commit suicide, just as the islander whose arm is broken by the gold manna ought not to end his life. The No Victim Argument neatly avoids this worry because one has a duty to promote one’s own pleasure. Once one comes into existence there is an actual victim if one fails to promote their own pleasures, so there is a duty to promote one’s pleasure. Presumably, for most people and throughout most of their lives, suicide would not fulfill this duty. Finally, the Exploitation Argument also avoids this objection. For on this argument most adult human lives are indeed worth continuing, the problem is rather the exploitation of the babies to get such lives in the first place. Benatar says that even though he holds most lives are going poorly, it does not entail that we should commit suicide. This is because we typically each have interests in continuing to live. Our lives would have to be worse than death, which is extremely bad, in order for suicide to be justified. This will only rarely be the case (Benatar 2013, 148).
3. The Misanthropic Argument
The philanthropic arguments which were discussed in the previous section conclude that because of the harm done to the created individual, it is always all things considered wrong to procreate. This section explains what is known as the misanthropic argument for anti-natalism. Unlike the philanthropic arguments, this argument focuses on the harm caused by the individuals who are created. The conclusion of this argument is slightly weaker, claiming that procreation is almost always impermissible, or only impermissible given the current situation in which procreation occurs.
Though Benatar is best known for offering a philanthropic argument for anti-natalism, he has also developed a distinct misanthropic argument. He also speculates that misanthropic arguments are even more likely to be met with scorn than philanthropic arguments. This is because while the latter are in some sense about protecting individuals, the former focuses on the bad aspects of humanity (Benatar 2015, 35). Whether Benatar is right about this remains an open question as most of the anti-natalist literature tends to focus on the philanthropic arguments.
Here’s Benatar’s basic misanthropic argument for anti-natalism:
(1) We have a (presumptive) duty to desist from bringing into existence new members of species that cause (and will likely continue to cause) vast amounts of pain, suffering and death.
(2) Humans cause vast amounts of pain, suffering and death.
(3) We have a (presumptive) duty to desist from bringing new humans into existence. (Benatar 2012, 35).
a. Premise 2 of the Misanthropic Argument
Premise 2 is the one in most need of defense. To defend it Benatar appeals to humanity’s generally poor impulses, their destructiveness towards one another, the suffering they cause other animals, and the damage that they do to the environment.
i. Harm to Humans
Regarding humanity’s poor impulse control in general, Benatar is quick to observe that the vast majority of human achievements are not possible for most humans. We therefore should not judge the human species in general based on the performance of exceptional people. In fact, it is now well-document that humans exhibit numerous cognitive biases which cause us to both think and act irrationally (Benatar 2015, 36). Consider that:
For all the thinking that we do we are actually an amazingly stupid species. There is much evidence of this stupidity. It is to be found in those who start smoking cigarettes (despite all that is known about their dangers and their addictive content) and in the excessive consumption of alcohol—especially in those who drive while under its influence. It is to be found in the achievements of the advertising industry, which bear ample testament to the credulity of humanity (Benatar 2015, 36).
These cognitive failings often cause humans to harm each other. We exhibit an extreme tendency toward conformity and following authority, even when doing so leads us to hurt each other (Benatar 2015, 37).
Even if one contends that our intelligence compensates for these moral deficiencies, it is difficult to defend this claim in light of human destructiveness:
Many hundreds of millions have been murdered in mass killings. In the twentieth century, the genocides include those against the Herero in German South-West Africa; the Armenians in Turkey; the Jews, Roma, and Sinti in Germany and Nazi-occupied Europe; the Tutsis in Rwanda; and Bosnian Muslims in the former Yugoslavia. Other twentieth-century mass killings were those perpetrated by Mao Zedong, Joseph Stalin, and Pol Pot and his Khmer Rouge. But these mass killings were by no means the first. Genghis Khan, for example, was responsible for killing 11.1% of all human inhabitants of earth during his reign in the thirteenth century […] The gargantuan numbers should not obscure the gruesome details of the how these deaths inflicted and the sorts of suffering the victims endure on their way to death. Humans kill other humans by hacking, knifing, hanging, bludgeoning, decapitating, shooting, starving, freezing, suffocating, drowning, crushing, gassing, poisoning, and bombing them (Benatar 2015, 39).
Humans also do not just murder each other. They also “rape, assault, flog, maim, brand, kidnap, enslave, torture, and torment other humans” (Benatar 2015, 40). Though these are the worst harms, humans also frequently “lie, steal, cheat, speak hurtfully, break confidences and promises, violate privacy, and act ungratefully, inconsiderately, duplicitously, impatiently, and unfaithfully” (Benatar 2015, 43). Even if justice is sought, it is hardly ever achieved. Many of the most evil leaders in human history ruled for the course of their natural lives, while others had peaceful retirements or were only exiled (Benatar 2015, 43). In sum, “‘Bad guys’ regularly ‘finish first’. They lack the scruples that provide an inner restraint, and the external restraints are either absent or inadequate” (Benatar 2015, 43).
ii. Harm to Animals
The amount of suffering that humans inflict on animals each year is hard to fathom. Given that the vast majority of humans are not vegetarians or vegans, most of them are complicit in this suffering. Consider that “[o]ver 63 billion sheep, pigs, cattle, horses, goats, camels, buffalo, rabbits, chickens, ducks, geese, turkeys, and other such animals are slaughtered every year for human consumption. In addition, approximately 103.6 billion aquatic animals are killed for human consumption and non-food uses” (Benatar 2015, 44). These numbers exclude the hundreds of millions of male chicks killed every year because they cannot produce eggs. It also excludes the millions of dogs and cats that are eaten in Asia every year (Benatar 2015, 44). Each year there are also 5 billion bycatch sea animals, which are those caught in nets, but not wanted. Finally, at least 115 million animals are experimented on each year (Benatar 2015, 45). Furthermore, “[t]he deaths of the overwhelming majority of these animals are painful and stressful” (Benatar 2015, 44). The average meat eater will consume at least 1690 animals in their lifetime (a rather low estimate) which is an extremely large amount of harm (Benatar 2015, 54-55).
iii. Harm to the Environment
Humans are also incredibly destructive to the environment. The human population is growing exponentially and the negative environment effects per person continue to increase too. This is partly due to industrialization and a steady growth in per capita consumption (Benatar 2015, 48). As a result:
The consequences include unprecedented levels of pollution. Filth is spewed in massive quantities into the air, rivers, lakes, and oceans, with obvious effects on those humans and animals who breath the air, live in or near the water, or who get their water from those sources. The carbon dioxide emissions are having a ‘greenhouse effect,’ leading to global warming. As a result, the icecaps are melting, water levels are rising, and climate patterns are changing. The melting icecaps are depriving some animals of their natural habitat. The rising sea levels endanger coastal communities and threaten to engulf small, low-lying island states, such as Nauru, Tuvalu, and the Maldives. Such an outcome would be an obvious harm to its citizens and other inhabitants. The depletion of the ozone layer is exposing earth’s inhabitants to greater levels of ultraviolet light. Humans are encroaching on the wild, leading to animal (and plant) extinctions. The destruction of the rain forests exacerbates the global warming problem by removing the trees that would help counter the increasing levels of carbon dioxide (Benatar 2015, 48).
CO2 emissions per year per person are massive. While they are lower in developing countries, they tend to have much higher birthrates than their wealthier counterparts. As the population increases, adding more humans will invariably harm the environment.
b. Premise 1 of the Misanthropic Argument
Notice that premise 1 of this argument does not claim that we should kill members of a dangerous species or stop that dangerous species from procreating. Instead, it merely says “that one should oneself desist from bringing such beings into existence” (Benatar 2015, 49). For this premise to be true it also does not have to be the case that every single member of the species is dangerous. The likelihood that a new member of the species will cause significant harm is enough to make procreation too dangerous to be justified. Also notice that this premise is silent on the species in question. It would be easily accepted if it were about some non-human species: “Imagine, for example, that some people bred a species of non-human animal that was as destructive (to humans and other animals) as humans actually are. There would be widespread condemnation of those who bred these animals” (Benatar 2015, 49).
c. The Presumptive Duty Not to Procreate
Presumptive duties are defeasible. The duty only holds if there are no good reasons to do otherwise (Benatar 2015, 51). One possible way of avoiding the misanthropic argument is to counter that the good that humans do is pervasive enough to often defeat this presumptive duty. If this is right, then procreation will often be permissible (Benatar 2015, 51). However, in light of the vast harms that humans do, meeting the burden of proof regarding the amount of counteracting good that humans do, is going to be extremely difficult. Remember that the benefits here do not just have to counter the harms to other humans, but the harm done to billions of animals every year, in addition to the environment more generally (Benatar 2015, 52). We would also need a clear understanding of what constitutes good outweighing bad. Does saving two lives outweigh the bad of one violent murder? Benatar is doubtful, claiming the number of lives needing to be saved to outweigh the bad is much higher than two (2015, 52). Likewise, offering benefits to future generations cannot count as part of the good that outweighs the bad because such humans would not exist if the presumptive duty were followed in the first place. Under the current conditions of the world, more new humans add more additional harms than they do any offsetting benefits (Benatar 2015, 54). Finally, a more modest response is the assertion that the presumptive duty not to procreate can occasionally be defeated. Perhaps the children of a particular individual would do enough offsetting good that it would justify creating them (Benatar 2015, 54). While this scenario is certainly possible, it is doubtful that those considering procreating will be in a good position to know this about their future offspring.
4. Anti-Natalism and Duties to the Poor
Thus far, very little has been said about how our duties to the poor are impacted by anti-natalism. However, there are important connections between duties to the poor and procreative ethics. Consider the following scenario: Suppose that you are walking on your way to work in the morning. You find yourself walking by a pond and observe a drowning child. If you stop to help the child, you will probably ruin your nice new clothes and also be late for work. There is no tangible risk of you drowning since the pond is not very deep for an adult. There is also no one else around. If you do not help the child now, then they will almost certainly drown. What should you do? This example is modified from Peter Singer, a famous utilitarian who is well-known for defending the idea that we have rather strong obligations to help the poor, particularly those in developing countries. Singer thinks it is obvious what you should do in this case. You should stop to help the drowning child. The value of the child’s life is worth much more than what it costs for you to help them, namely, your new clothes and having to explain to your boss why you were late. The next step is to draw an analogy between the children in the pond and the less-well off developing nations. In fact, Singer suggests that people in wealthier countries are in the very position of walking past ponds with drowning children everyday. The people we could help are just a bit farther away and we do not see them directly in front of us. But this is not a morally significant difference. So, those of us in wealthier countries need to devote a lot more of our resources to help those in developing countries who are suffering.
Benatar is so far the only one to make connections between Singer’s argument and anti-natalism. Here is his interpretation of Singer’s argument:
Singer’s Poverty Relief argument on our duty to the poor
(1) If we can prevent something bad from happening, without sacrificing anything of comparable moral importance, we ought to do it.
(2) Extreme poverty is bad.
(3) There is some extreme poverty we can prevent without sacrificing anything of comparable moral importance.
(4) We ought to prevent some extreme poverty (Benatar 2020, 416).
This argument nicely avoids disagreement between utilitarians and non-utilitarians because both sides will agree that we should prevent bad things from happening even if there is some disagreement about how to measure bad or just what constitutes a comparable moral sacrifice. Benatar observes that Singer’s argument has clear implications for procreative ethics. We must either accept those implications or give up Singer’s conclusion.
What does Singer’s argument imply about procreative ethics? The first implication has to do with the opportunity costs of having children. His argument “implies that, at least for now, the relatively affluent ought to desist from having children because they could use the resources that would be needed to raise resulting children to prevent extreme poverty” (Benatar 2020, 417). In wealthy countries it costs anywhere from two hundred thousand to three hundred thousand dollars to raise a child from birth to the age of eighteen years old. Having children should be forgone by the wealthy so that they can spend this money on alleviating extreme poverty. It also implies that even adoption may be impermissible for the wealthy if their resources are still more effectively spent elsewhere (Benatar 2020, 418).
Another implication of Singer’s argument has to do with natality costs. It implies that many people should refrain from procreating, especially the poor, because of the bad things that will inevitably happen to those they bring into existence (Benatar 2020, 420). Sacrificing procreation is not of comparable moral importance since no one is harmed by not being brought into existence. So, it is more important that the poor refrain from procreating to prevent their children from experiencing extreme poverty. Benatar suggests that if Singer is right, we might even have a duty to prevent the poor from procreating, though this would be the prevention of a bad thing, not relief from it. Of course, Benatar is well aware that this conclusion is unlikely to be met by many with approval. According to Benatar at least, no one would be harmed if people refrained from procreating for these reasons, and much suffering would be prevented. While these ideas are far from uncontroversial, and likely to even cause offense to some, it is clear that more work needs to be done exploring how our duties to the poor are connected to anti-natalism.
5. Future Directions
This section identifies three potential areas for future research into anti-natalism. The first regards a lack of direct interaction between religious perspectives and arguments for anti-natalism. The second involves the need for more interaction between anti-natalism and non-Western approaches to ethics. The third is about the surprising dearth of engagement with anti-natalism in the philosophical literature on population ethics.
a. Religious Perspectives on Anti-Natalism
Perhaps more than any other group, religious believers cringe when they hear defenses of anti-natalism. In the classical monotheistic tradition, for example, existence is held to be intrinsically good. This has played out in the prizing of the nuclear family. It might seem rather unsurprising, then, that religious thinkers have had little to say about the anti-natalist debate. However, the rejection of anti-natalism out of hand by the religious believer might turn out to be short-lived. First, theists who are committed to the claim that existence is intrinsically good are committed to the further claim that there are literally no lives not worth continuing. Some might find this conclusion difficult to accept. For even if it were to apply to all actual lives, it is easy to think of possible lives that are so awful they are not worth continuing. Second, in holding that existence is intrinsically good, theists are under pressure to explain why they are not obligated to procreate as much as possible. They need to explain this because an obligation to procreate as much as possible is absurd.
If theists can coherently explain why existence is intrinsically good while avoiding the problematic results just mentioned, they may well have an answer to philanthropic arguments for anti-natalism. They can acknowledge that procreation is a weighty moral decision that ought to be taken more seriously than prospective couples often take it. They can even concede that certain cases of procreation probably are impermissible. However, if procreating really is to bring about an individual whose existence is intrinsically valuable, then many instances of procreation will indeed be permissible. Yet this does not necessarily let the theist off the hook when it comes to the misanthropic arguments for anti-natalism. The harm that most human lives will do seems hard to deny. One possibility for the theist is to say that this type of concern reduces to the problem of evil. Therefore, solutions to the problem of evil can be used as resources to show why procreation is permissible even in light of the harm humans do. But there are many questions for such a strategy. It is one thing to say that once humans are brought into existence God allows them to commit a great deal of evil because of the value of morally significant freedom, to name just one theistic response to evil. However, it is another to say that such solutions justify the act of bringing humans into existence who do not already exist.
Another underexplored connection between a theistic perspective and misanthropic arguments for anti-natalism regards humanity’s treatment of the environment. In the Judeo-Christian tradition, for example, the planet is a gift from God to humans. We are supposed to cherish, protect, and look after the environment and the non-human animals that it contains. Clearly, just the opposite has happened. In light of the fact that population increase is directly tied to the climate crises, might those in religious traditions who hold that the planet is a gift be obligated to cease procreating? These and related ideas are at least worthy of exploration by scholars of religion.
b. Anti-Natalism and Non-Western Ethics
The philosophical literature on anti-natalism is dominated by those working in Western philosophy. It is important to briefly consider ways in which debates about procreative ethics could be forwarded by including non-Western ethical perspectives, African philosophy, for example. This literature emerged (professionally) in the 1960s, with the demise of colonization and the rise of literacy rates on the African continent. There are three main branches of African ethics. First, African thinkers distinguish the normative conception of personhood from the metaphysical or biological conceptions of the person (Menkiti 1984). On this understanding of ethics, the most central feature of morality is for individuals to develop their personhood. This is typically done by exercising other-regarding virtues and hence can only be accomplished within the context of community. On this view personhood is a success term such that one could fail to be a person (in the normative sense) (Ikuenobe 2006; Molefe 2019). Second, harmony has been postulated as the most important aspect of morality in indigenous African societies. Harmony is about establishing a balance or equilibrium amongst humans with each other and all else, including the natural world. Disrupting the harmony of the community is one of the worst things an individual can do. That personhood and harmony are both understood within the context of relating to others shows why, in part, community is of supreme importance in the African tradition (Metz forthcoming; Paris 1995; Ramose 1999). Third, vitalist approaches to morality say that everything, both animate and inanimate, are imbued with life force, a kind of imperceptible energy. On this approach, the goal of morality is to increase life force in oneself and others. Procreation is valuable because it creates a being with life force (Magesa 1997).
On African personhood accounts of morality, an individual can only develop and exercise moral virtue in the context of the community, traditionally including not merely present generations but also future ones, often called the ‘not-yet-born’. To deny the importance of the continuance of the community through procreation seems to fly in the face of such an ethic. Likewise, in African relational ethics, harmony amongst individuals is of the upmost important. Again, the continuance of the community through procreation appears vital to the existence of and promotion of harmony in the community. In other words, there can be no personhood or harmony without a community of persons. Given its importance, the community ought to continue via procreation. Finally, on vitality accounts, anti-natalism appears to deny the importance of creating beings with life force. There is thus a rather apparent tension between anti-natalism and African communitarian ethics.
However, consider that, despite initial appearances, it could be argued that misanthropic arguments for anti-natalism are in conflict with African ethics. Furthermore, it is plausible that philanthropic arguments are consistent with at least some line of thought in African ethics. While tensions may remain between the two views, much more exploration of a possible synthesis between anti-natalism, and African ethics is needed. There are least five possible reasons why these two views might be consistent with each other (and in some cases mutually supportive). First, African ethics emphasizes doing no harm to the community. Procreation right now harms many communities, given that creating more people means making valuable resources even more scarce, for example. Second, procreation harms the global community and environment. An important line in African thought is that humans should strive to be in harmony with the natural environment, not just with each other. Until we find ways to greatly reduce our carbon footprints, procreating harms the environment and thereby produces disharmony. Third, even if strong philanthropic versions of anti-natalism which do not rely on better resource distribution or environmental considerations are followed, consider that even if everyone refrained from procreating there would still be a human community for many years (the next 80 or so), right up until the very last person existed. The opportunity to develop one’s personhood and seek harmonious relationships would remain. Fourth, not procreating arguably allows one to better contribute to the common good because one has more available time, energy, money, among other resources available that are not spent on one’s children. Again, this remains so in the African understanding because developing personhood and harmonious relationships are viewed as essential parts of the common good. Fifth, adoption is a viable alternative to satisfying the interests of the community. This raises interesting questions about whether it is creating the child itself, instead of merely rearing one, that is meaningful, morally significant, or otherwise of importance to the African tradition.
c. Anti-Natalism and Population Ethics
Anti-natalism appears to have relatively underappreciated connections to topics in environmental ethics. This is surprising particularly regarding the misanthropic arguments which focus, in part, on the harm that humans do to the environment. Trevor Hedberg (2020) explains that after a long silence beginning the 1980s and 1990s only very recently have theorists begun to explicitly discuss the population problem in connection with the environment. The continued growth of the planet’s population is a fact. It took all of human history until 1804 to reach one billion people. A century ago, the world had approximately 1.8 billion people. However, the current population sits at approximately 7.8 billion people (Hedberg 2020, 3). Hedberg contends that “population is a serious contributor to our environmental problems, we are morally obligated to pursue the swift deceleration of population growth, and there are morally permissible means of achieving this outcome—means that avoid the coercive measures employed in the past” (Hedberg 2020, 3). Indeed, such coercive measures in the past are probably part of the reason that many environmental organizations and governments which claim to care deeply about the climate crisis virtually never mention the population. Yet it does not matter if humans become more efficient and individually have a less bad impact on the environment if such improvements are outpaced by population growth. So far, any improvements in individual impact have been greatly outpaced by population growth. On the very plausible (if not obvious) assumptions that (1) climate change poses a significant and existential threat to the human species; and (2) that population growth contributes to climate change, environmental ethicists need to start contending with misanthropic arguments for anti-natalism. Remember that these arguments leave open the possibility (however small) that humans may not cause so much damage in the future and as such it might not be impermissible to bring more into existence.
d. Human Extinction as the Goal of Anti-Natalism
At the beginning of Better Never to Have Been: The Harm of Coming into Existence, Benatar acknowledges that his work will likely have no (or almost no) impact on people’s procreative choices. He writes:
Given the deep resistance to the views I shall be defending, I have no expectation that this book or its arguments will have any impact on baby-making. Procreation will continue undeterred, causing a vast amount of harm. I have written this book, then, not under the illusion that it will make (much) difference to the number of people there will be but rather from the opinion that what I have to say needs to be said whether or not it is accepted (2006, vii).
But what would happen if everyone accepted Benatar’s arguments and put them into practice? The current generation of humans (that is, everyone alive right now), would be the last generation of humans. Benatar’s recommendation is that the human species should voluntarily opt to go extinct. Yet if this course of action were followed, life would very likely be quite difficult for the last few remaining humans. An anti-natalist policy, then, would actually increase the harm experienced by at least some humans. Deciding if this is worth it may well come down to whether we agree that the suffering that will inevitably occur by continuing to propagate the human species outweighs the harm done to those whose lives would be made quite difficult by being part of the last few remaining humans. Benatar and those who agree with him appear to believe that the harm of continuing to bring more persons into existence drastically outweighs the harm done to the last remaining humans. Anti-natalists are well aware that they are recommending human extinction.
6. References and Further Reading
- Belshaw, Christopher. 2012. “A New Argument for Anti-Natalism.” South African Journal of Philosophy 31(1): 117-127.
- Defends the exploitation argument.
- Benatar, David. 2006. Better Never to Have Been: The Harm of Coming into Existence. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Seminal work containing an extensive defense of the Asymmetry and Deluded Gladness Arguments for anti-natalism.
- Benatar, David. 2013. “Still Better Never to Have Been: A Reply to (More of) My Critics. Journal of Ethics 17: 121-151.
- Replies to Bradley, Grazia, Harman, among others.
- Benatar, David. 2015. “The Misanthropic Argument for Anti-natalism.” In Permissible Progeny?: The Morality of Procreation and Parenting. Sarah Hannon, Samantha Brennan, and Richard Vernon (eds). Oxford: Oxford University Press. pp. 34-59.
- Defends anti-natalism on the basis of the harm that those who are created will cause.
- Benatar, David. 2020. “Famine, Affluence, and Procreation: Peter Singer and Anti-Natalism Lite.” Ethical Theory and Moral Practice 23: 415-431.
- Connects anti-natalism to Peter Singer’s claims about duties to the poor.
- Bradley, Ben. 2010. “Benatar and the Logic of Betterness.” Journal of ethics & social philosophy.
- Critical notice on Benatar 2006
- Bradley, Ben. 2013. “Asymmetries in Benefiting, Harming and Creating.” Journal of Ethics 17:37-49.
- Discussion of the asymmetries between pain and pleasure.
- DeGrazia, David. 2010. “Is it wrong to impose the harms of human life? A reply to Benatar. Theoretical Medicine and Bioethics 31: 317-331.
- Reply to Benatar 2006.
- DeGrazia, David. 2012. Creation Ethics: Reproduction, Genetics, and Quality of Life. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Chapter 5 critically discusses Benatar 2006.
- Gewirth, Alan. 1998. Self-Fulfillment. Princeton University Press.
- Defends a theory of self-fulfillment that includes the goods of family and children.
- Harman, Elizabeth. 2009. “Critical Study of David Benatar. Better Never To Have Been: The Harm of Coming into Existence (Oxford: Oxford Univeristy Press, 2006).” Nous 43 (4): 776-785.
- Critical notice on Benatar 2006.
- Harrison, Gerald. 2012. “Antinatalism, Asymmetry, and an Ethic of Prima Facie Duties.” South African Journal of Philosophy 31 (1): 94-103.
- Statement of the No Victim Argument.
- Hedberg, Trevor. 2020. The Environmental Impact of Overpopulation. New York: Routledge.
- One of the few places to discuss the impact of population on the environment, while also making explicit connections to anti-natalism.
- Ikuenobe, Polycarp. 2006. Philosophical Perspectives on Communitarianism and Morality in African Traditions. Lexington Books.
- An in-depth analysis of the African conception of personhood.
- Magesa, Laruenti. 1997. African Religion: The Moral Traditions of Abundant Life.
- Claims that life force is the most important feature of African ethics.
- Menkiti, Ifeanyi. 1984. “Person and Community in African Traditional Thought.” In African Philosophy: An Introduction. 3d ed. Richard A. Wright (eds). Lanham, MD: University Press of America. pp. 171-181.
- The most influential statement of the African conception of personhood.
- Metz, Thaddeus. 2011. “Are Lives Worth Creating?” Philosophical Papers 40 (2): 233-255.
- Critical notice on Benatar 2006.
- Metz, Thaddeus. forthcoming. A Relational Moral Theory: African Ethics in and beyond the Continent. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Offers a new ethical theory heavily influenced by African conceptions of morality focused on promoting harmony.
- Molefe, Motsamai. 2019. An African Philosophy of Personhood, Morality, and Politics. Palgrave Macmillan.
- Applies the African conception of personhood to various issues in political philosophy.
- Overall, Christine. 2012. Why Have Children? The Ethical Debate. MIT Press.
- Chapter 6 criticizes Benatar 2006.
- Parfit, Derek. 1994. Reasons and Persons. Clarendon Press, Oxford.
- Contains the most influential discussion of the non-identity problem.
- Paris, Peter J. 1995. The Spirituality of African Peoples: The Search for a Common Moral Discourse. Fortress Press.
- Emphasizes promoting life force as salient to African ethics
- Ramose, Mogobe. 1999. African Philosophy through Ubuntu. Mond.
- An African-based ethic focused on harmony.
- Robertson, John. 1994. Children of Choice. Princeton University Press.
- An early defense of procreative freedom.
- Shiffrin, Seana. 1999. “Wrongful Life, Procreative responsibility, and the Significance of Harm.” Legal Theory 5: 117-148.
- An influential account focusing on issues of consent and harm in procreation.
- Singh, Asheel. 2012. “Furthering the Case for Anti-Natalism: Seana Shiffrin and the Limits of Permissible Harm.” South African Journal of Philosophy 31 (1): 104-116.
- Develops considerations from Shiffrin 1999 into an explicit argument for anti-natalism.
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