Aristotle: Epistemology

For Aristotle, human life is marked by special varieties of knowledge and understanding. Where other animals can only know that things are so, humans are able to understand why they are so. Furthermore, humans are the only animals capable of deliberating in a way that is guided by a conception of a flourishing life. The highest types of human knowledge also differ in having an exceptional degree of reliability and stability over time. These special types of knowledge constitute excellences of the soul, and they allow us to engage in characteristic activities that are integral to a good human life, including the study of scientific theories and the construction of political communities.

Aristotle’s central interest in epistemology lies in these higher types of knowledge. Among them, Aristotle draws a sharp division between knowledge that aims at action and knowledge that aims at contemplation, valuing both immensely. He gives a theory of the former, that is, of practically oriented epistemic virtues, in the context of ethics (primarily in the sixth book of the Nicomachean Ethics [Nic. Eth.], which is shared with the Eudemian Ethics [Eud. Eth.]), and he gives a theory of the latter both there and in the Posterior Analytics [Post. An.], where the topic of epistemology is not sharply distinguished from the philosophy of science. Lower types of knowledge and other epistemically valuable states are treated piecemeal, as topics like perception, memory and experience arise in these texts as well as in psychological, biological, and other contexts.

Although Aristotle is interested in various forms of error and epistemic mistakes, his theory of knowledge is not primarily a response to the possibility that we are grossly deceived, or that the nature of reality is radically different from the way we apprehend it in our practical dealings and scientific theories. Instead, Aristotle takes it for granted that we, like other animals, enjoy various forms of knowledge, and sets out to enumerate their diverse standards, objects, purposes and relative value. He emphasizes the differences among mundane forms of knowledge such as perception and higher forms such as scientific theorizing, but he also presents an account on which the latter grows organically out of the former. His pluralism about knowledge and his sensitivity to the different roles various forms of knowledge play in our lives give his theory enduring relevance and interest.

Table of Contents

  1. Knowledge in General
  2. Perception
  3. Memory
  4. Experience
  5. Knowledge as an Intellectual Virtue
    1. The Division of the Soul
    2. Scientific Virtues
      1. Theoretical Wisdom
      2. Demonstrative Knowledge
      3. Non-Demonstrative Scientific Knowledge
    3. Practical Knowledge and the Calculative Virtues
      1. Craft
      2. Practical Wisdom
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Bibliography

1. Knowledge in General

Knowledge in a broad sense (gnōsis, from whose root the word “knowledge” derives; sometimes also eidenai) is enjoyed by all animals from an early stage in their individual development (Generation of Animals [Gen. An.] I 23, 731a30–4). In Aristotle’s usage, it includes everything from a worm’s capacity to discriminate hot and cold to the human ability to explain a lunar eclipse or contemplate the divine (for representative usages, see Post. An. I 1, 71a1–2; II 8, 93a22; II 19, 99b38–9). However, Aristotle shows comparatively little interest in knowledge in this broad sense. The Aristotelian corpus has no surviving treatise devoted to knowledge in all generality, and there is no evidence that Aristotle ever authored such a text. His main interest is in more specific kinds of knowledge. Nevertheless, a few features of Aristotle’s view regarding knowledge in general deserve comment.

First, it is relatively clear that he takes gnōsis to be at least factive (although this is disputed by Gail Fine). That is, if someone (or some animal) has gnōsis that something is the case, then that thing is true. Plausibly, Aristotle takes gnōsis to be not only true cognition, but cognition that is produced by a faculty like perception which reliably yields truths. This makes it tempting to compare Aristotle’s general view of knowledge with contemporary forms of reliabilism such as Ernest Sosa’s or John Greco’s, though the reliability of gnōsis is not a point Aristotle stresses.

Second, Aristotle also treats most kinds of knowledge as relatives (Physics [Phys.] VII 3, 247b1–3). A relative, in Aristotle’s metaphysical scheme, is an entity which is essentially of something else (Cat. 7, 6a37). One example is that of a double, since a double is essentially the double of something else (Cat. 7, 6a39–b1). Likewise, knowledge is essentially knowledge of something-or-other (Cat. 7, 6b5), be it an external particular (De Anima [De An.] II 5, 417b25–7), a universal within the soul (De An. II 5, 417b22–3; compare Phys. VII 3, 247b4–5, 17–18), or the human good (Nic. Eth. VI 5, 1140a25–8). It is fundamental to Aristotle’s way of thinking about knowledge that it is in this way object directed, where the notion of object is a broad one that includes facts, particulars, theories and ethical norms. Aristotle frequently characterizes different types of knowledge by the types of objects they are directed at.

Third, for Aristotle, knowledge generally builds upon itself. In many cases, learning amounts to reconceiving the knowledge we already have, or coming to understand it in a new way (Post. An. I 1, 71b5–8). Further, Aristotle notes that the knowledge we gain when we learn something is often closely connected to the knowledge that we need to already have in order to learn this. For instance, in order to gain a proper geometrical understanding of why a given triangle has internal angles that sum to 180 degrees, we must already know that triangles in general have this angle sum and know that this particular figure is a triangle, whereupon it may be asked: what is this if not already to know that the particular triangle has this angle sum (Post. An. I 1, 71a19–27; cf. Pr. An. II 21, 67a12–22)? Likewise, in order to arrive at knowledge of what something is, that is, of its definition, we must perform an inquiry that involves identifying and scrutinizing things of the relevant kind. That requires knowing that the relevant things exist; however, how can we identify these things if we do not know what defines instances of that kind (Post. An. II 7, 92b4–11; II 8, 93a19–22)?

Aristotle identifies such questions with a famous puzzle raised in Plato’s Meno: how can we search for anything that we do not already know (Post. An. I 1, 71a29, compare Pr. An. II 21, 67a21–2)? Either we already know it, in which case we do not need to look for it, or we do not know it, in which case we do not know what we are seeking to learn and we will therefore not recognize it when we have found it (Meno 80e).

As David Bronstein and Gail Fine have shown, much of Aristotle’s epistemology is structured around this challenge. Aristotle is confident that we can distinguish the prior knowledge required for various types of learning from what we seek to learn; hence, for Aristotle, the puzzle in the Meno amounts to a challenge to articulate what prior knowledge various kinds of learning depend upon. The picture of learning and inquiry we get from Aristotle is, consequently, a thoroughly cumulative one. Typically, we learn by building on and combining what we already know rather than going from a state of complete ignorance to a state of knowledge. Aristotle is concerned to detail the various gradations in intellectual achievement that exist between mundane knowledge and full scientific or practical expertise.

This approach, however, raises a different worry. If we can only gain knowledge by building on knowledge we already have, then the question arises: where does our learning begin? Plato’s answer, at least as Aristotle understands it, is that we have innate latent beliefs in our souls which we can recollect and hence come to know (Post. An. II 19, 99b25–6). Aristotle rejects this view, taking it to require, implausibly, that we have more precise cognitive states in us than we are aware of (Post. An. II 19, 99b26–7). Instead, he adverts to perception as the type of knowledge from which higher cognitive states originate (Post. An. II 19, 99b34–5; cf. Met. I 1, 980a26–7). At least the most rudimentary types of perception allow us to gain knowledge without drawing on any prior knowledge. Thus, for Aristotle, everything learned (both for us and for other animals) starts with perception, such that any lack in perception must necessarily result in a corresponding lack in knowledge (Post. An. I 18, 81a38–9). Depending on the intellectual capabilities of a given animal, perception may be the highest type of knowledge available, or the animal may naturally learn from it, ascending to higher types of knowledge from which the animal can learn in turn (Post. An. II 19, 99a34–100a3; Met. I 1, 980a27–981b6).

2. Perception

For Aristotle, perception is a capacity to discriminate that is possessed by all human and non-human animals (Post. An. II 19, 99b36–7; De An. II 2, 413b2; Gen. An. I 23, 731a30–4), including insects and grubs (Met. I 1, 980a27–b24; De An. II 2, 413b19–22). Every animal possesses at least the sense of touch, even though some may lack other sensory modalities (De An. II 2, 413b8–10, 414a2–3). Each sense has a proper object which only that perceptual modality can detect as such (De An. II 6, 418a9–12): color for sight, sound for hearing, flavor for taste, odor for smell and various unspecified objects for touch (De An. II 6 418a12–14). For Aristotle, perception is not, however, limited to the proper objects of the sensory faculties. He allows that we and other animals also perceive a range of other things: various common properties which can be registered by multiple senses, such as shape, size, motion and amount (De An. II 6, 418a17–18), incidental objects such as a pale thing or even the fact that the pale thing is the son of Diares (De An. II 6, 418a21), and possibly even general facts such as that fire is hot (Met. I 1, 981b13; but see below).

Aristotle holds that we are never, or at least most infrequently, in error about the proper objects of perception, like color, sound, flavor, and so on (De An. II 6, 418a12; De An. III 3, 428b18–19). We are, however, regularly mistaken about other types of perceptual objects (De An. III 3, 428b19–25). While I can be mistaken, for instance, about the identity of the red thing I am perceiving (Is it an ember? Is it a glowing insect? Is it just artifact of the lighting?), I usually am not mistaken that I am seeing red. In Aristotle’s language, this is to say that I am more often in error regarding the incidental objects of perception (De An. III 3, 428b19–22). The common objects of perception are, in his view, even more prone to error (De An. III 3, 428b22–5); for example, I can easily misperceive the size of the red thing or the number of red things there are.

Aristotle gives an account of the way perception works which spans physiology, epistemology and philosophy of mind. In order for perception to occur, there must be an external object with some quality to be perceived and a perceptual organ capable of being affected in an appropriate way (De An. II 5, 417b20–1, 418a3–5). Aristotle posits that each sense organ is specialized and can only be affected in specific ways without being harmed. This explains both why different sensory modalities have different proper objects and why overwhelming stimuli can disable or damage these senses (De An. II 12, 424a28–34; III 2, 426a30–b3; III 13, 435b4–19). Perception takes place when the sensory organ is altered within its natural bounds, in such a way as to take on the sensible quality of the object perceived. In this way, the perceptual organ takes on the sensible form of the object without its matter (De An. III 12, 424a17–19). Much debate has revolved around whether Aristotle means that the organ literally takes on the sensible property (whether, for instance, the eye literally becomes red upon seeing red), or whether Aristotle means that it does so rather in some metaphorical or otherwise attenuated sense.

Some animals, Aristotle holds, have no other form of knowledge except perception. Such animals, in his view, only have knowledge when they are actually perceiving (Post. An. II 19, 99b38–9); they know only what is present to them when their perceptual capacities are in play. The same holds for human perceptual knowledge. If we can be said to have knowledge on account of our merely perceiving something, then this is knowledge we have only at the time when this perception is occurring (Pr. An. II 21, 67a39–67b1; compare Met. Ζ 15, 1039b27–30). A person has, for instance, perceptual knowledge that Socrates is sitting only when actually perceiving Socrates in a seated position. It follows that we cease to have this knowledge as soon as we cease to perceive the thing that we know by perception (Nic. Eth. VI 3, 1139b21–22; Topics [Top.] V 3, 131b21–22).

For Aristotle, this represents a shortcoming of perceptual knowledge. Perceptual knowledge is transitory or unstable in a way that knowledge ideally is not, since knowledge is supposed to be a cognitive state which we can rely upon (Categories [Cat.] 8, 8b27–30; Posterior Analytics [Post. An.] I 33, 89a5–10). Perception is also lacking as a form of knowledge in other ways. Higher types of knowledge confer a grasp of the reasons why something is so, but perception at best allows us to know that something is so (Metaphysics [Met.] I 1, 981b12–13; Post. An. I 31, 88a1–2). The content of perception is also tied to a particular location and time: what I perceive is that this thing here has this property now (Post. An. I 31, 87b28–30). Even if the content of my perception is a fact like the fact that fire is hot (rather than that this fire is hot), a perceptual experience cannot, according to Aristotle, tell me that fire is in general hot, since that would require me to understand why fire is hot (Met. I 1, 981b13).

Hence, while knowledge begins with perception, the types of knowledge which are most distinctively human are the exercise of cognitive abilities that far surpass perception (Gen. An. I 23, 731a34–731b5). In creatures like us, perception ignites a curiosity that prompts repeated observation of connected phenomena and leads us through a series of more demanding cognitive states that ideally culminate in scientific knowledge or craft (Met. I 1, 980a21–27; Post. An. I 31, 88a2–5; Post. An. II 19, 100a3–b5). The two most important of these intermediate states are memory and experience. Let us turn to these, before considering the types of knowledge that Aristotle considers to be virtues of the soul.

3. Memory

For Aristotle, perception provides the prior knowledge needed to form memories. The capacity to form memories allows us to continue to be aware of what we perceived in the past once the perceived object is no longer present, and thus to enjoy forms of knowledge that do not depend on the continued presence of their objects. Learning from our perceptions in order to form memories thus constitutes an important step in the ascent from perception to higher types of knowledge. With the formation of a memory, we gain epistemic access to the contents of our perceptions that transcends the present moment and place.

Aristotle distinguishes memory from recollection. Whereas recollection denotes an active, typically conscious “search” (On Memory and Recollection [De Mem.] 453a12), memory is a cognitive state that results passively from perception (De Mem. 453a15). In order to form a memory, the perceived object must leave an impression in the soul, like a stamp on a tablet (De Mem. 450a31–2). This requires the soul to be in an appropriate receptive condition, a condition which Aristotle holds to be absent or impaired in both the elderly and the very young (De Mem. 450a32–b7). Aristotle however denies that a memory is formed simultaneously with the impression of the perceived object, since we do not remember what we are currently perceiving; we have memories only of things in the past (De Mem. 449b24–26). He infers that there must be a lapse of time between the perceptual impression and the formation of a memory (De Mem. 449b28, 451a24–5, 29–30).

The fact that memory requires an impression raises a puzzle, as Aristotle notices: if perception is necessarily of a present object, but only an impression left by the object is present in our memory, do we really remember the same things that we perceive (De Mem. 450a25–37, 450b11–13)? His solution is to introduce a representational model of memory. The impression formed in us by a sensory object is a type of picture (De Mem. 450a29–30). Like any picture, it can be considered either as a present artifact or as a representation of something else (De Mem. 450b20–5). When we remember something, we access the representational content of this impression-picture. Memory thus requires a sensory impression, but it is not of the sensory impression; it is of the object this impression depicts (De Mem. 450b27–451a8).

While the capacity to form memories represents a cognitive advance over perception thanks to its cross-temporal character, memory is still a rudimentary form of knowledge, which Aristotle takes not to belong to the intellect strictly speaking (De An. I 4, 408b25–9; De Mem. 450a13–14). Memories need not possess any generality (although Aristotle does not seem to rule out the possibility of remembering generalizations), nor does memory as such tell us the reasons why things are so. A more venerable cognitive achievement than memory which, however, still falls short of full scientific knowledge or craft, is what Aristotle calls “experience” (empeiria).

4. Experience

Memories constitute the prior knowledge required to gain experience, which we gain by means of consciously or unconsciously grouping memories of the same thing (Post. An. II 19, 100a4–6; Met. I 1, 980b28–981a1). The type of knowledge we gain in experience confers practical success; in some cases, the practical efficacy (which is not to say the overall value) of this type of knowledge surpasses that of scientific knowledge (Met. I 1, 981a12–15). Aristotle emphasizes the pivotal role of experience in the acquisition of knowledge of scientific principles (Pr. An. I 30, 46a17–20; II 19, 100a6), but he considers the proper grasp of scientific principles to be a strictly different (and more valuable) kind of knowledge.

Experience thus sits mid-way between the awareness of the past we enjoy by way of memory and the explanatory capacity we have in scientific knowledge. His characterization of the content of the knowledge we have in experience has given rise to divergent interpretations. He contrasts experience with the “art” that a scientifically informed doctor has as follows:

[T]o have a judgment that when Callias was ill of this disease this did him good, and similarly in the case of Socrates and in many individual cases, is a matter of experience; but to judge that it has done good to all persons of a certain constitution, marked off in one class, when they were ill of this disease, e.g. to phlegmatic or bilious people when burning with fever–this is a matter of art. (Met. I 1, 981a7–12, trans. Ross)

On one traditional reading, the contrast Aristotle wishes to draw here concerns the generality of what one knows in experience and in scientific knowledge respectively. A person with scientific knowledge knows a universal generalization (for example, “all phlegmatic people are helped by such-and-such a drug when burning with a fever”), whereas a person with experience knows only a string of particular cases which fall under this generalization (“Socrates was helped by such-and-such a drug when burning with a fever”, “Callias was helped by such-and-such a drug when burning with a fever”, and so on).

What distinguishes the experienced person from someone who merely remembers these things, however, is that the memories of the experienced person are grouped or connected (Post. An. II 19, 100a4–6; Met. I 1, 980b28–981a1). Precisely what this grouping or connection comes to is not made clear by the text, but one point suggested by the passage above is that it allows one to competently treat new cases by comparison with old ones. An experienced person would thus, in this example, be able to prescribe the correct drug if, for instance, Polus should arrive with a fever and be of the relevant constitution to benefit from it. The experienced person will do this, however, by comparing Polus with Socrates and Callias, not by means of an explicit grasp of the universal generalization that all phlegmatic people benefit from this drug when suffering from a fever (or even that most of them do). The person with experience thus has a capacity to generalize, but not yet any explicit grasp of the underlying generalization.

One problem for this reading is that outside of this passage Aristotle describes generalizations, even scientifically accurate ones, as things known by experience. In particular, Aristotle describes scientific explananda as things known by experience, where these are taken to be general facts like the fact that round wounds heal more slowly (Post. An. I 13, 79a14–16 with Met. I 1, 981a28–30; Historia Animalium [Hist. An.] VIII 24, 604b25–7; Pr. An. I 30, 46a17–27; and, possibly, Post. An. II 19, 100a3–8). According to Pieter Sjoerd Hasper and Joel Yurdin, the content of experience does not differ from that of scientific knowledge in being any less general or less accurate than scientific knowledge. Instead, what one has experience of is fully precise scientific facts, but what one lacks is a grasp of their causes. On this view, Aristotle’s point in the passage quoted is that someone with experience knows that a certain treatment is effective for all feverish patients who are phlegmatic, but the person does not know why. Experience thus gives one knowledge of scientific explananda; further inquiry or reflection is however needed to have properly scientific knowledge, which requires a grasp of the causes of what one knows by experience.

On either of these interpretations, experience can be seen to contribute a further dimension to the temporal reach of our knowledge. Where memory allows us to retain perceptual knowledge, and thus extends our knowledge into the past, experience extends our knowledge into the future. A person with experience has not only a retrospective grasp of what has cured certain patients; this person has learned from this knowledge what will cure (or is likely to cure) the next patient with the relevant malady, either by direct comparison with previous cases or by grasping the relevant generalization. Since experience presupposes memory, an experienced person has knowledge whose reach extends both backward and forward in time.

5. Knowledge as an Intellectual Virtue

A virtue, for Aristotle, is a particular respect in which a thing is excellent at being what it is or doing what it is meant to do. If, with Aristotle, we suppose that not only our characters but also our intellects can be in better or worse conditions, it makes sense to talk about virtues of intellect as well as virtues of character.

Unlike contemporary virtue epistemologists, who tend to identify knowledge as a type of success issuing from intellectual virtues, Aristotle directly identifies the most desirable types of knowledge with certain intellectual virtues. This has an important effect on his epistemology. A virtue is a kind of stable condition, something a person is qualified with over a period of time rather than (primarily) a thing a person may be said to have or lack on a given occasion. The identification of the highest types of knowledge with virtues thus leads Aristotle to think of these kinds of knowledge as abilities. The relevant abilities include not just practical ones (like building a house) but also purely intellectual abilities, most importantly the ability to contemplate.

Since intellectual virtues must be stable states of the intellect, the best types of knowledge are also those that are difficult to acquire and, conversely, cannot be easily lost or forgotten (Cat. 8, 8b26–9a10). This does not hold of memories (which are easily formed and routinely forgotten) and even less so of perceptual knowledge (which, as we have seen, is for Aristotle a type of knowledge we have just when we are actually perceiving). Only the type of knowledge that is the outcome of protracted instruction or research counts as knowledge in the sense of a virtue (Nic. Eth. VII 3, 1141a18–22). Further, Aristotle thinks we only have this type of knowledge of necessary generalizations which belong to an axiomatizable theory, on the one hand, and of practically pertinent generalizations together with particular facts about their implementation, on the other. His reasons for this view are connected with his division of the human soul.

a. The Division of the Soul

Aristotle takes the human soul to have distinct parts corresponding to our various capacities. He divides the soul first into a rational and a non-rational part. The non-rational part of the soul accounts for the capacities we share with other animals. This part of the soul is divided into a vegetative part, which represents capacities for growth and nutrition, and a part representing the capacities we share with other animals but not with plants.

The rational part of our soul accounts for those capacities by which we seek to grasp truth, capacities which Aristotle takes to be limited to humans and the divine. By “truth”, Aristotle means both the theoretical truth of things that hold independently of us and the practical “truth” of an action or intention that accords with our rational desires (Nic. Eth. VI 2, 1139a26–31). Accordingly, Aristotle divides the rational soul into a calculative and a scientific part corresponding to the different types of truth we seek to grasp (Nic. Eth. VI 1, 1139a6–15; compare. Pol. VII 14, 1333a24–5). The calculative part of the rational soul is responsible for the cognitive component of our practical deliberation, while the scientific part of the soul is responsible for our grasp of what we seek to know for its own sake.

Each part of the soul can, for Aristotle, be in a better or a worse condition. Aristotle notes that this also holds of the nutritive part and the capacities for perception, but he shows little interest in the perfection of these capacities in normative contexts, since they are not distinctively human (Nic. Eth. I 7, 1097b33–5; I 13, 1102a32–b3). Perfecting the non-rational part of the soul is, for humans, to acquire virtues of character, such as courage, temperance and magnanimity. These are acquired, if at all, through a process of habituation beginning in childhood (Nic. Eth. II 1, 1103a25–6, b23–5). To perfect the rational part of the soul, on the other hand, is to acquire what Aristotle calls the “intellectual virtues” (Nic. Eth. I 13, 1103a3–5; VI 1, 1138b35–39a1). Such virtues are also acquired only gradually and over a long period of time, but “mostly as a result of instruction” (didaskalia, Nic. Eth. II 1, 1103a15) rather than habituation.

In addition to taking the calculative and the scientific parts of the soul to be concerned with practical and theoretical truth respectively, Aristotle also distinguishes them according to the modal statuses of the truths that they grasp. The virtues of the calculative part of the soul are excellences for grasping truth concerning what is contingent or can be otherwise (Nic. Eth. VI 1, 1139a8), whereas the virtues of the scientific part of the soul concern “things whose principles cannot be otherwise” (Nic. Eth. VI 1, 1139a7–8). This careful formulation leaves open the possibility that the scientific soul may grasp contingencies so long as the things about which it grasps these contingencies have principles which are necessary. There are, for instance, necessary principles which govern the eclipse of the moon, so that one can have scientific knowledge of the eclipse of the moon even though the moon is not always or necessarily eclipsed (Post. An. I 8, 75b33–6; compare I 31, 87b39–88a5; II 8, 93a35–93b3). Aristotle, however, tends to treat such cases as secondary, taking the primary objects of the scientific part of the soul to be strict and exceptionless necessities.

Aristotle takes there to be different intellectual capacities devoted to the grasp of truths of differing modal statuses for a variety of reasons. On the one hand, he thinks of action as the manipulation of truth. If I fashion some planks of wood into a table, I am making it true that these planks are a table (which, before I begin, is false). It follows that intellectual capacities that are directed towards action must have contingent truths as their objects, since if something cannot be otherwise, then a fortiori it cannot come to be otherwise by someone’s agency (Nic. Eth. VI 2, 1139a36–b11).

Conversely, Aristotle takes only necessary truths to be appropriate objects for the form of knowledge that pertains to the scientific part of the soul. The best condition for this part of the soul is one that allows someone to contemplate the truth freely and at will (De An. II 5, 417b23–5). This means that it ought not to need to monitor, intervene in or otherwise “check on” how things stand in the world with respect to what we know. Aristotle thinks that if one could have this sort of knowledge of a contingent state of affairs, then this state of affairs might change without our awareness, pulling the rug, as it were, out from under our knowledge (Nic. Eth. VI 3, 1139b21–2). For instance, if I could have scientific knowledge that Socrates is sitting, and Socrates gets up without me noticing, then I would suddenly no longer know that Socrates is sitting (since it would no longer be true that Socrates is sitting). Hence, if my knowledge is guaranteed to remain knowledge just by me having learned it in the appropriate way, then what I know must be a state of affairs that does not change, and this will be so if scientific knowledge is of necessities.

b. Scientific Virtues

i. Theoretical Wisdom

Wisdom (sophia) is Aristotle’s name for the best condition of the scientific part of the soul (Nic. Eth. VI 1, 1139a16; compare Met. I 2, 983a9–10) and the “most precise of the kinds of knowledge” (Nic. Eth. VI 7, 1141a17–8). This is the state that we are in when our soul grasps the best objects in the universe in the most intellectually admirable way, enabling us to contemplate these objects with total comprehension (Nic. Eth. VI 7, 1141a20–1, 1141b2–8; X 7, 1177a32–b24; Met. I 1, 981b25–982a3). In the best objects, Aristotle surely intends to include God (Met. 983a4–5) and possibly also the celestial bodies or other things studied in the books of the Metaphysics. He makes clear that humans and their polities are not among these most venerable things: we are in his view plainly not “the best thing there is in the universe” (Nic. Eth VI 7, 1141a21). Humans and their goals may be the most fitting objects of practical knowledge (Nic. Eth. VI 7, 1141b4–15), but there are better things to contemplate.

To this extent, theoretical wisdom is a distinctively disinterested type of knowledge. It is the limiting case of the type of knowledge we seek when we want to understand something for its own sake rather than because it benefits us or has practical utility, and Aristotle associates it strongly with leisure (scholē) (Met. I 1, 982a14–16; Nic. Eth. VI 12; Politics [Pol.] VII.14, 1333a16–b5). This does not mean, however, that it is neutral with respect to its ethical value. On the contrary, Aristotle takes the person with superlative wisdom to be “superlatively happy” (Nic. Eth. X 8, 1179a31), and the pursuit of theoretical wisdom is undoubtedly a central component of the good life in his view.

Aristotle also holds that wisdom can be practically advantageous in more mundane ways. He recounts a story about Thales putting his philosophical knowledge to work so as to predict an excellent olive crop and amassing a fortune by buying up all of the oil presses and then loaning them out at a profit (Pol. I 11, 1259a5–23). Yet he stresses that sophia is neither for the sake of such practical advantages (Nic. Eth. VI 7, 1141b2–8) nor does it require its possessor to be practically wise (Nic. Eth. VI 7, 1141b20–1). He depicts Thales as amassing this wealth to show that “philosophers could easily become wealthy if they wished, but this is not their concern” (Pol. I 11, 1259a15–18).

The best kind of theoretical knowledge has, for Aristotle, the structure of an axiomatic science. One has the best theoretical orientation towards the world when one grasps how each fact of a science concerning the highest things follows from the principles of the highest things (Met. I 2, 982a14–16). Wisdom thus divides into two components, scientific knowledge of certain principles (nous) and the type of scientific knowledge that consists in grasping a scientific proof or “demonstration” issuing from these principles (Nic. Eth. VI 7, 1141a17–20). Someone with the virtue of wisdom understands why the basic principles of theology (or whatever science deals with the best things) are the basic principles of that science, and is also able to prove, in axiomatic fashion, every other theorem in that science on the basis of these principles.

While wisdom is for Aristotle the best kind of theoretical knowledge, he does not hold that this sort of knowledge ought to form a foundation for all other kinds of knowledge or even all other scientific knowledge. This is because he holds that each kind of thing is only properly understood when we understand it according to its own, specific principles (Post. An. I 2, 71b23–25, 72a6; I 6, 74b24–26; I 7; Met. I 3, 983a23–25; Phys. I 1, 184a1–15). Knowledge of the first principles of the highest science might give someone a general understanding of a range of other things (Met. I 2, 982a7–10, 23–24; Nic. Eth. VI 7, 1141a12–15)—it might explain, for instance, why animals move at all by saying that they move in imitation of divine motion—but this sort of general understanding is, for Aristotle, no substitute for the specific kind of understanding we have when we grasp, for example, the mechanics of a particular animal’s motion or the function of this motion in its peculiar form of life.

For this reason, Aristotle takes each scientifically explicable domain to be associated with its own dual virtues of demonstrative and non-demonstrative scientific knowledge. The virtues of demonstrative and non-demonstrative knowledge are, therefore, not characteristics which a person can be said to simply have or to lack in general. Instead, someone might possess the virtues of scientific knowledge with respect to, say, geometry and lack them with respect to, say, human physiology. While one type of scientific knowledge might assist in the acquisition of another, and perhaps even provide some of its principles (Post. An. I 7, 75b14–17; compare I 9, 76a16–25), Aristotle insists that there is a different virtuous state associated with each distinct scientific domain (Nic. Eth. VI 10, 1143a3–4). He does, however, take all such virtues to share a common axiomatic structure, which he lays out in the Posterior Analytics in the course of giving a theory of demonstration.

ii. Demonstrative Knowledge

A demonstration (apodeixis), for Aristotle, is a deductive argument whose grasp imparts scientific knowledge of its conclusion (Post. An. I 2, 71b18–19). Aristotle takes it for granted that we possess a distinctive kind of knowledge by way of deductive reasoning and asks what conditions a deductive argument must satisfy in order to confer scientific knowledge. His primary model for this type of knowledge is mathematics, which, alongside geometrical construction, included the practice of providing a deductive argument from basic principles to prove that the construction satisfies the stated problem. Aristotle however seeks to generalize and extend this model to broadly “mathematical” sciences like astronomy and optics, and, with some qualifications, to non-mathematical sciences like botany and meteorology. His theory of knowledge in the Posterior Analytics (especially the first book) investigates this ideal knowledge state by asking what conditions an argument must satisfy in order to be a demonstration.

Aristotle observes, to begin, that not all deductive arguments are demonstrations (Post. An. I 2, 71b24–26). In particular, an argument from false premises does not confer knowledge of its conclusion (Post. An. I 2, 71b26–27). The notion of demonstration is not, however, simply the notion of a sound deductive argument, since even sound arguments do not provide knowledge of their conclusions unless the premises are already known. Moreover, even sound arguments from known premises may not provide the best kind of knowledge of the conclusion. Aristotle holds that in order to impart the best kind of knowledge of a necessary truth, an argument must establish this truth on the basis of principles that properly pertain to the type of thing the demonstration concerns. A demonstration of some astronomical fact must, for instance, proceed from properly astronomical principles (Pr. An. I 30, 46a19–20). What this rules out is, on the one hand, arguments from accidental and “chance” features of an object (Post. An. I 6, especially 74b5–12, 75a28–37; I 30), and arguments from the principles of a different science, on the other (Post. An. I 7, 75b37–40).

Two requirements for demonstration, then, are that the premises be true and that they be non-accidental facts belonging to the relevant science. Assuming that all principles of a science are true and non-accidental, this reduces to the condition that a demonstration be from principles belonging to the relevant science. This, however, is still not a sufficient condition for an argument to be a demonstration. Aristotle famously contrasts the following two arguments (Post. An. I 13, 78a30–7):

Argument One

Things that do not twinkle are near;
the planets do not twinkle;
therefore, the planets are near.

Argument Two

What is near does not twinkle;
the planets are near;
therefore, the planets do not twinkle.

Here by “twinkle” we should understand the specific astronomical phenomenon whereby a celestial body’s visual intensity modulates in the way that a distant star’s does on a clear night, and we should understand both of these arguments to quantify over visible celestial bodies. If we do, then both of these arguments are sound. The planets are near the earth (relative to most astronomical bodies), and they do not display the astronomical property of twinkling. It is also true that bodies which are relatively close to us, as compared to the stars, fail to display this effect, so the first premise of Argument Two is true. Further, only visible celestial bodies which are near to us fail to twinkle, so the first premise of Argument One is also true. All of the premises in these two arguments are also, in Aristotle’s view, properly astronomical facts. To this extent they both establish that their respective conclusions hold as a matter of astronomical science.

The latter argument is in Aristotle’s view superior, however, in that it establishes not only that the conclusion holds but also why it does. In a completed theory of astronomy, the non-twinkling of the planets might be explained by recourse to their nearness to us, for example by adding that other celestial bodies obstruct the light issuing from more distant ones. Argument Two conveys this explanation by presenting the immediate cause of the conclusion, nearness, as a middle term shared between the two premises. The two premises in the argument thus not only prove the conclusion; they jointly explain what makes the conclusion true.

On the other hand, while the facts that non-twinkling celestial bodies are near and that all planets are non-twinkling celestial bodie do provide perfectly legitimate grounds to infer that the planets are near, an argument from these premises provides little insight into why the planets are near. The fact that the planets are near might take significant work to establish (it might even be established using a chain of reasoning such as that in Argument One), but it would be a confusion, in Aristotle’s view, to think that the soundness of Argument One and the scientific character of its premises shows that the non-twinkling of the planets explains their nearness. The order of explanation runs rather in the opposite direction: they do not twinkle because they are near. In a completed science of astronomy as Aristotle conceives it, where it is assumed that the gross distance of all celestial bodies from the earth is eternally fixed, the nearness of the planets would presumably be treated as a fundamental given from which other things may be explained, not as a fact requiring explanation.

Someone is in a better cognitive condition with respect to a given fact, Aristotle evidently holds, if that person not only knows that it is true but also grasps why it is true. Aristotle does not argue for this position, but it is not difficult to imagine what reasons he might give. We naturally desire not just to know but to understand; curiosity is sated by explanation rather than sheer fact. Further, understanding confers stability on what we know, and Aristotle takes stability to be a desirable quality of knowledge (Cat. 8, 8b28–30; Post. An. I 33, 89a5–10). If I understand why the planets must not twinkle (rather than knowing that this is so but having no idea why), then I will be less likely to give up this belief in light of an apparent observation to the contrary, since to do so would require me to also revise my beliefs about what I take to be the explanation. This is especially so if I understand how this fact is grounded, as Aristotle requires of demonstrative knowledge, in the first principles of a science, since renouncing that piece of knowledge would then require me to renounce the very principles of my scientific theory.

Hence, the type of deduction which places one in the best cognitive condition with respect to an object must be explanatory of its conclusion in addition to being a sound argument with premises drawn from the correct science. The notion of explanation Aristotle works with in laying down this condition is a resolutely objective one. Scientific explanations are not just arguments that someone, or some select class of people, find illuminating. They are the best or most appropriate kinds of explanations available for the fact stated in the conclusion because they argue from what is prior to the conclusion in the order of nature (Phys. I.1, 184a10–23). Further, the fact that a given set of premises explains their conclusion need not be obvious or immediately clear. Aristotle leaves open the possibility that it might be a significant cognitive achievement to see that the premises of a given demonstration explain its conclusion (Post. An. I 7, 76a25–30).

When someone does grasp demonstrative premises as explanatory of a given demonstrative conclusion, the argument is edifying because it tracks some objective fact about how things stand with the relevant kind (celestial bodies, triangles, and so on). Aristotle describes the way that scientific knowledge correctly tracks the order of things in terms of “priority” (Post. An. I 2, 71b35–72a6). Borrowing the terminology of contemporary metaphysics, we might gloss this by saying that demonstrations reveal facts about grounding in a way that not all deductive arguments do. The second syllogism is better than the first one because the fact that the planets are near together with relevant universal generalization about the optical behavior of nearness ground the fact that the planets do not twinkle. They are in an objective sense responsible for the fact that the planets do not twinkle. Given the assumption that grounding is antisymmetric, the premises of the first syllogism cannot also ground its conclusion.

Aristotle’s account of the specific content and logical form of scientific principles is notoriously obscure. Key texts, which do not obviously stand in agreement, are Post. An. I 2, I 4, I 10, II 19 and Pr. An. I 30. Nevertheless, there are a few key ideas which Aristotle remains consistently committed to. First, a particularly important type of principle is one that states what something is, or its definition (Post. An. I 2, 72a22). The centrality accorded to this type of principle suggests a project of grounding all truths of a given science in facts about the essences of the kind or kinds that this science concerns. Aristotle however seems aware of problems with such a rigid view, and admits non-specific or “common” axioms into demonstrative sciences (Post. An. I 2, 72a17–19; I 10, 76b10–12). These include axioms like the principle of non-contradiction, which are in some sense assumed in every science (Post. An. I 2, 72a15–17; I 11, 77a30), as well as those like the axiom that equals taken from equals leave equals, which can be given both an arithmetical and a geometrical interpretation (Post. An. I 10, 76a41—b1; I 11, 77a30).

Aristotle also briefly discusses the profile of conviction (pistis) that someone with scientific knowledge ought to display. At least some of the principles of a demonstration, Aristotle holds, should be “better known” to the expert scientist than their conclusions, and the scientist should be “more convinced” of them (Post. An. I 2, 72a25–32). This is motivated in part by the idea that the principles of demonstrations are supposed to be the source or grounds for our knowledge of whatever we demonstrate in science. Aristotle also connects it with the requirement that someone who grasps a demonstration should be “incapable of being persuaded otherwise” (Post. An. I 2, 72b3). Someone with demonstrative knowledge in the fullest sense will never renounce their beliefs under dialectical pressure, and Aristotle thinks this requires someone to be supremely confident in the principles that found her demonstrations.

iii. Non-Demonstrative Scientific Knowledge

The claim that the principles of demonstrations must be better known than their conclusions generates a problem. If the best way to know something theoretically is by demonstration, and the premises of demonstrations must be at least as well known as their conclusions, then the premises of demonstrations will themselves need to be demonstrated. However, these demonstrations in turn will also have premises requiring demonstration, and so on. A regress looms.

Aristotle canvases three possible responses to this problem. First, demonstrations might extend back infinitely: there might be an infinite number of intermediate demonstrations between a conclusion and its first principles (Post. An. I 3, 72b8–10). Aristotle dismisses this solution on the grounds that we can indeed have demonstrative knowledge (Post. An. I 1, 71a34–72b1), and that we could not have it if having it required surveying an infinite series of arguments (Post. An. I 3, 72b10–11).

Two other views, which Aristotle attributes to two unnamed groups of philosophers, are treated more seriously. Both assume that chains of demonstrations terminate. One group says that they terminate in principles which cannot be demonstrated and consequently cannot be known (or at least, not in the demanding way required by scientific knowledge (Post. An. I 3, 72b11–13)). The other holds that demonstrations “proceed in a circle or reciprocally” (Post. An. I 3, 72b17–18): the principles are demonstrated, but from premises which are in turn demonstrated (directly or indirectly) from them.

Aristotle rejects both of these views, since both possibilities run afoul of the requirement that the principles of demonstrations be better known than their conclusion. The first alternative maintains that the principles are not known, or at least not in any scientifically demanding way, while the second requires that the principles in turn be demonstrated from (and hence not better known than) other demonstrable facts.

Aristotle’s solution is to embrace the claim that the principles are indemonstrable but to deny that this implies they are not known or understood in a rigorous and demanding way. There is no good reason, Aristotle maintains, to hold that demonstrative knowledge is the only or even the best type of scientific knowledge (Post. An. I 3, 72b23–5); it is only the best kind of scientific knowledge regarding what can be demonstrated. There is a different kind of knowledge regarding scientific principles. Aristotle sometimes refers to this as “non-demonstrative scientific knowledge” (Post. An. I 3, 72b20; I 33, 88b36) and identifies or associates it strongly with nous (Post. An. I 33, 88b35; II 19, 100b12), which is translated variously as comprehension, intellection and insight.

Aristotle is therefore a foundationalist insofar as he takes all demonstrative knowledge to depend on a special sort of knowledge of indemonstrable truths. It should be stressed, however, that Aristotle’s form of foundationalism differs from the types that are now more common in epistemology.

First, Aristotle professes foundationalism only regarding demonstrative knowledge in particular: he does not make any similar claim about perceptual knowledge as having a foundation in, for instance, the perception of sense data, nor for practical knowledge nor for our knowledge of scientific principles.

Second, as we have seen, Aristotle’s view is that scientific knowledge is domain-specific. Expert knowledge in one science does not automatically confer expert knowledge in any other, and Aristotle explicitly rejects the idea of a ”super-science” containing the principles for all other sciences (Post. An. I 32). Hence, Aristotle defends what we might term a “local” foundationalism about scientific knowledge. Our knowledge of geometry will have one set of foundations, our knowledge of physics another, and so on. (compare Post. An. I 7; I 9, 75b37–40; 76a13–16; Nic. Eth. VI 10, 1143a3–4).

Third, the faculty which provides our knowledge of the ultimate principles of demonstrative knowledge is, as we have seen, itself a rational faculty, albeit one which does not owe its knowledge to demonstration. Hence, Aristotle does not take the foundation of our demonstrative knowledge to be “brute” or “given”; his claim, more modestly, is that our knowledge of scientific principles must be of a different kind than demonstrative knowledge.

Finally, Aristotle’s foundationalism should not be taken to imply that we need to have knowledge of principles prior to discovering any other scientific facts. In at least some cases, Aristotle takes knowledge of scientific explananda to be acquired first (Post. An. II 2, 90a8–9), by perception or induction (Post. An. I 13, 78a34–5). Only later do we discover the principles which allow us to demonstrate them, and thus enjoy scientific knowledge of them.

Aristotle does not say much about the specific character of our knowledge of principles, and its nature has been the subject of much debate. As we have seen, Aristotle requires the principles to be “better known” (at least in part) than their demonstrative consequences, and he also refers to this type of knowledge as “more precise” (Post. An. II 19, 99b27) than demonstrative knowledge. Some scholars take Aristotle’s view to be that the principles are self-explanatory, while others take the principles to be inexplicable.

His views about the way we acquire knowledge of first principles have also been subject to varying interpretations. Traditionally, Aristotle’s view was taken to be that we learn the first principles by means of exercising nous, understood as a capacity for abstracting intelligible forms from the impressions left by perception. Subsequent scholars have pointed to the dearth of textual evidence for ascribing such a view to Aristotle in the Posterior Analytics, however. Aristotle calls the state we are in when we know first principles nous (Post. An. II 19, 100b12), but he does not claim that we learn first principles by means of exercising a capacity called nous.

A second possibility is that Aristotle thinks we obtain knowledge of scientific principles through some form of dialectic—a competitive argumentative practice outlined in the Topics that operates with different standards and procedures than scientific demonstration. Another view, defended by Marc Gasser-Wingate, is that our knowledge of the first principles is both justified and acquired by what Aristotle calls “induction” (epagōgē)—a non-deductive form of scientific argument in which we generalize from a string of observed cases or instances.

Some scholars also divide the question about how we first come to know the first principles from questions about what justifies this knowledge in the context of a science. One suggestion is that Aristotle takes the justification for nous to consist in a recognition of the principles as the best explanations for other scientific truths. On one version of this view, forcefully defended by David Charles, knowledge of first principles is not acquired prior to our knowledge of demonstrable truths; rather, we gain the two in lockstep as we engage in the process of scientific explanation. On other versions of this view, we come to know the first principles in some less demanding way before we come to appreciate their explanatory significance and thus have proper scientific knowledge of them. David Bronstein, who defends a version of the latter view, argues that Aristotle recommends a range of special methods for determining first principles, including, importantly, a rehabilitation of Plato’s method of division.

c. Practical Knowledge and the Calculative Virtues

Wisdom and scientific knowledge (demonstrative and non-demonstrative) are the excellences of the scientific part of our soul, that part of us devoted to the contemplation of unchanging realities. Aristotle takes the type of knowledge that we employ in our dealings with other people and our manipulation of our environment to be different in kind from these types of knowledge, and gives a separate account of their respective justification, acquisition, and purpose.

The goal of practical knowledge is to enable us to bring about changes in the world. Where attaining theoretical knowledge is a matter of bringing one’s intellect into conformity with unchanging structures in reality, practical knowledge involves a bidirectional relationship between one’s intellect and desires, on the one hand, and the world, on the other. As practical knowers we seek not only to conform our desires and intellects to facts about what is effective, ethical and practically pertinent; we also seek to conform these situations to what we judge to be such. Hence, practical knowledge can have as its objects neither necessities (since no one can coherently decide to, for example, change the angle sum of a triangle (Nic. Eth. III 2, 1112a21–31)) nor what is in the past (someone might make a decision to sack Troy, but “no one decides to have sacked Troy” (Nic. Eth. VI 2, 1139b7)). Only present and future contingencies are, in Aristotle’s view, possible objects of practical knowledge.

Aristotle distinguishes two activities that are enabled by practical thinking: action (praxis) and production (poiēsis) (Nic. Eth. VI 2, 1139a31–b5). Production refers to those doings whose end lies outside of the action itself (Nic. Eth. VI 5, 1140b6–7), the paradigm of which is the fashioning of a craft object like a shoe or a house. Aristotle recognizes that not all of our doings fit this mold, however: making a friend, doing a courageous act, or other activities laden with ethical significance cannot be thought of only with strain on the model of manufacturing a product. Such activities do aim to bring about changes in reality, but their end is not separate from the action itself. In performing a courageous act, say, I am, in Aristotle’s view, simply aiming to exercise the virtue of courage appropriately. Praxis is Aristotle’s name for doings such as these. It refers to a distinctively human kind of action, one not shared by other animals (Nic. Eth. VI 2, 1139a20; III 3, 1112b32; III 5, 1113b18), involving deliberation and judgment that an action is the best way of fulfilling one’s goals (Nic. Eth. VI 2, 1139a31).

Both action and production require more than just knowledge in order to be performed well. In particular, the best kind of action also requires the doer to be virtuous, and this, for Aristotle, has a desiderative as well as an epistemic component. Someone is only virtuous if that person desires the right things, in the right way, to the right extent (Nic. Eth. II 3, 1104b3–13; II 9 1109b1–5; III 4 1113a31–3; IV 1 1120a26–7; X I, 1172a20–3). Further, Aristotle does not take the starting points of our practical knowledge to be themselves objects of practical knowledge. It is not part of someone’s technical expertise to know that, for example, a sword is to be made or a patient to be healed; rather, a blacksmith or a doctor in her capacity as such takes for granted that these ends are to be pursued, and it is the job of her practical knowledge to determine actions which bring them about (Nic. Eth. III 3, 1112b11–16). The proper ends of actions, meanwhile, are given by virtue (Nic. Eth. VI 12, 1144a8, 20), and the virtues are habituated into us from childhood (Nic. Eth. II 2, 1103a17–18, 23–26, 1103b23–25). Nevertheless, Aristotle takes certain types of knowledge to be indispensable for engaging in action and production in the best possible ways. He identifies these types of knowledge with the intellectual virtues of practical wisdom (phronēsis) and craft (technē).

i. Craft

Craft (technē) is Aristotle’s name for the type of knowledge that perfects production (Nic. Eth. IV 4, 1140a1–10; Met. IX 2, 1046a36–b4). Aristotle mentions a treatise on craft which seems to have given a treatment of it roughly parallel to the treatment of scientific knowledge he gives in the Posterior Analytics (Nic. Eth. VI 4, 1140a2–3; compare VI 3, 1139b32), but this treatise is lost. Aristotle’s views on technē must be pieced together from scattered remarks and an outline of this treatise’s contents in the Nicomachean Ethics (VI 4).

As with scientific knowledge, Aristotle does not take craft to be a monolithic body of knowledge. He holds, sensibly enough, that a different type of technical knowledge is required for bringing into being a different kind of object. Aristotle’s stock example of a technē is the construction of houses (Nic. Eth. VI 4, 1140a4). In constructing a house, a craftsperson begins with the form of the house in mind together with a desire to bring one about, and practical knowledge is what enables this to lead to the actual presence of a house (Met. VII 7, 1032a32–1032b23; Phys. II 2, 194a24–27; II 3, 195b16–25).

In order for this to occur, a person with craft must know the “true prescription” pertaining to that practice (Nic. Eth. VI 4, 1140a21), that is, the general truths concerning how the relevant product is to be brought about. In the case of housebuilding, these might include the order in which various housebuilding activities need to be carried out, the right materials to use for various parts, and the correct methods for joining different types of materials. While a merely “experienced” housebuilder might manage to bring about a house without such prescriptions, they would not, in Aristotle’s view, bring about a house in the best or most felicitous way, and hence could not be said to operate according to the craft of housebuilding.

Aristotle indicates that these prescriptions fit together in a causal or explanatory way (Met. A 1, 981a1–3, 28–981b6; Post. An. II 19, 100a9). This view is plausible. Someone with the best kind of knowledge about how to bring about some product will presumably not only know what should be done but also understand why that is the correct thing to do. Such understanding, after all, has not only theoretical interest but also practical benefit. Suppose, for instance, that the craft of housebuilding prescribes that one should bind bricks using straw. Someone who understands why this is prescribed will be in a better position to know what else can be substituted should straw be unavailable, or even when it may be permissible to omit the binding agent. None of this is to say that a practitioner of a craft requires the same depth of understanding as someone with scientific knowledge, however. A technician of housebuilding does not need to know, for example, the chemical or physical principles which explain why and how binding agents work at a microscopic scale.

Given that it involves a kind of understanding, knowing the craft’s correct prescriptions in the way required by craft is a significant intellectual accomplishment. Nevertheless, this is not sufficient for having craft knowledge, according to Aristotle. Someone with craft knowledge must also have a “productive disposition” (Nic. Eth. VI 3, 1140a20–1), that is, a tendency to actually produce the goods according to these prescriptions when they have the desire to do so. Aristotle makes this disposition a part of craft knowledge itself, and not merely an extra condition required for practicing the craft, for at least three reasons.

First, someone does not count as having craft knowledge if that person has only a theoretical grasp of how houses are to be made, for example. Having craft knowledge requires knowledge of how to build houses, and Aristotle thinks that this sort of knowledge is only available to someone with a disposition to actually build them. Second, unlike mathematical generalizations, the prescriptions grasped in technē are not exceptionless necessities (Nic. Eth. VI 4, 1140a1–2; compare Nic. Eth. VI 2, 1139a6–8). Hence, simply knowing these prescriptions (even if one has every intention of fulfilling them) is not in itself sufficient for an ability to actually bring about the relevant product. One must have an ability to recognize when a rule of thumb about, say, the correct materials to use in building a house fails to apply. Aristotle thinks of this type of knowledge as existing in a disposition to apply the prescriptions correctly rather than as an auxiliary theoretical prescription.

A third, related reason is that the process of production requires one to make particular decisions that go beyond what is specified in the prescriptions given by that craft. Thus, even where the craft prescription instructs the builder to, for instance, separate cooking and sleeping quarters or to have a separate top floor for this kind of house, it may not specify the specific arrangement of these quarters or the precise elevation of the second floor. The ability to make such decisions in the context of practicing a craft is, for Aristotle, conferred by the productive disposition involved in craft knowledge rather than by the grasp of additional prescriptions.

ii. Practical Wisdom

Practical wisdom is the central virtue of the calculative part of the soul. This type of knowledge makes one excellent at deliberation (Nic. Eth. VI 9, 1142b31–3; VI 5, 1140b25). Since deliberation is Aristotle’s general term for reasoning well in practical circumstances, practical wisdom is also the type of knowledge that perfects action (praxis). More generally, practical wisdom is the intellectual virtue “concerned with things just and fine and good for a human being” (Nic. Eth. VI 12, 1143b21–22). It includes, or is closely allied with, a number of related types of practical knowledge that inform ethical behavior: good judgment (gnōmē), which Aristotle characterizes as a sensitivity to what is reasonable in a given situation (, Nic. Eth. VI 12, 1143a19–24); comprehension (sunesis), an ability to discern whether a given action or statement accords with practical wisdom (Nic. Eth. VI 10, 1143a9–10); and practical intelligence (nous, related to, but distinct from the theoretical virtue discussed above), which allows one to spot or recognize practically pertinent particulars (Nic. Eth. VI 11, 1143b4–5).

Practical wisdom thus serves to render action rather than production excellent. One important difference between practical wisdom and craft immediately follows. Whereas in craft someone performs an action for the purpose of creating something “other” than the production itself, the end of practical wisdom is the perfection of the action itself (Nic. Eth. VI 5, 1140b6–7). Nevertheless, in many respects, Aristotle’s view of practical wisdom is modeled on his view of craft knowledge. Like craft knowledge, the goal of practical wisdom is to effect some good change rather than simply to register the facts as they stand. In addition, like craft, this type of knowledge involves both a grasp of general prescriptions governing the relevant domain and an ability to translate these generalities into concrete actions. In the case of practical wisdom, the domain is the good human life generally (Nic. Eth. VI 8, 1141b15; Nic. Eth. VI 12, 1143b21–2), and the actions which it enables are ethically good actions. Hence, the general prescriptions associated with practical wisdom concern the living of a flourishing human life, rather than any more particular sphere of action. Practical wisdom also, like craft, involves an ability to grasp the connections between facts, but in a way that is specifically oriented towards action (Nic. Eth. VI 2 1139a33–1139b5; Nic. Eth. VI 7, 1141b16–20).

Some of the complications involved in moving from general ethical prescriptions to concrete actions also mirror those regarding the movement from a craft prescription to the production of a craft object. For one, Aristotle holds that many or all general truths in ethics likewise hold only for the most part (Nic. Eth. I 3, 1094b12–27; 1098a25-34). The ethical prescription, for instance, to reciprocate generosity is a true ethical generalization, even if not an exceptionless one (Nic. Eth. IX 2, 1164b31). If ethical norms permit of exceptions, then knowing these norms will not always be sufficient for working out the ethical thing to do. A further epistemic capacity will be required in order to judge whether general ethical prescriptions apply in the concrete case at hand, and this is plausibly one function of phronēsis.

Aristotle also describes phronēsis as a capacity to work out what furthers good ends (Nic. Eth. VI 5, 1140a25–9; VI 9, 1142b31–3). He distinguishes it from the trait of cleverness, a form of means-end reasoning that is indifferent to the ethical quality of the ends in question (Nic. Eth. VI 12, 1144a23–5). Phronēsis is an ability to further good ends in particular, and to further them in the most appropriate ways. It has also been argued that phronēsis has the function of recognizing, not only the means to one’s virtuous ends, but also what would constitute the realization of those ends in the first place. For instance, I might have the intention to be generous, but it is another thing to work out what it means to be generous to this friend at this time under these circumstances. This is parallel to the way that one needs, in, say,. seeking to construct a house to decide which particular type of house to construct given the constraints of location and resources.

One crucial difference between craft knowledge and practical wisdom is, however, the following. Whereas it suffices for craft knowledge to find a means to an end which is in accord with the goals of that craft, a practically wise person must find a way of realizing an ethical prescription which is in accord with all of the ethical virtues (Nic. Eth. VI 12, 1144a29–1144b1). This is a considerable practical ability in its own right, especially when the demands of different virtues come into conflict, as they might, for instance, when the just thing to do is not (or not obviously) the same as the kind or the generous thing to do. Practical wisdom thus requires, first, that one has all of the virtues so as to be sensitive to their various demands (Nic. Eth. VI 13, 1145a1–2). Over and above the possession of the virtues, practical wisdom calls for an ability to navigate their various requirements and arbitrate between them in concrete cases. In this way, it constitutes a far higher achievement than craft knowledge, since a person with practical wisdom grasps and succeeds in coordinating all of the goods constitutive of a human life rather than merely those directed towards the production of some particular kind of thing or the attainment of some specific goal.

6. References and Further Reading

Two good overviews of Aristotle’s views about knowledge, with complementary points of emphasis, are Taylor (1990) and Hetherington (2012). Bolton (2012) emphasizes Aristotle’s debt to Plato in epistemology. Fine (2021) is one of the few to treat Aristotle’s theory of knowledge in all generality at significant length, but readers should be aware that some of her central theses are not widely supported by other scholars. More advanced but nevertheless accessible pieces on Aristotle’s epistemology and philosophy of science may be found in Smith (2019), Anagnostopoulos (2009) and Barnes (1995).

The most in-depth study of Aristotle’s theory of scientific knowledge in the Posterior Analytics is Bronstein (2016), which focuses on the prior knowledge requirement and reads Aristotle’s views as a response to Meno’s paradox. See also Angioni (2016) on Aristotle’s definition of scientific knowledge in the Posterior Analytics. McKirahan (1992) and Barnes (1993) both provide useful commentary on the Posterior Analytics. See Barnes (1969), Burnyeat (1981), Lesher (2001) and Pasnau (2013) for views concerning whether Aristotle’s theory in the Posterior Analytics is best viewed as an epistemology, a philosophy of science, or something else. Sorabji (1980) also contains penetrating discussions of many specific issues in Aristotle’s epistemology and philosophy of science. For scholarly issues, Berti (1981) is still an excellent resource.

On Aristotle’s scientific method more generally, see Lennox (2021), Bolton (1987) and Charles (2002). For how we acquire knowledge of first principles, important contributions include Kahn (1981) and Bayer (1997) (who defend a view close to the traditional one), Irwin (1988) (who argues for the importance of a form of dialectic in coming to know first principles), and Gasser-Wingate (2016) (who argues for the role of induction and perception). Morison (2019) as well as Bronstein (2016) discuss at length the nature of knowledge of first principles and its relationship to nous in Aristotle.

Shields (2016) provides an excellent translation and up-to-date commentary on the De Anima. Kelsey (2022) gives a novel reading of De Anima as a response to Protagorean relativism. For Aristotle’s views on perception, see Modrak (1987) and Marmodoro (2014). Gasser-Wingate (2021) argues for an empiricist reading of Aristotle, against the rationalist reading of Frede (1996). On the more specific issue of whether Aristotle takes perception to involve a literal change in the sense organ, one can start with Caston (2004), Sorabji (1992) and Burnyeat (2002).

For the Nicomachean Ethics, Broadie and Rowe (2002) provide useful, if partisan, philosophical introduction and commentary, while Reeve (2014) provides extensive cross-references to other texts. For Aristotle’s views about practical wisdom, Russell (2014) and Reeve (2013) are useful starting points. Walker (2018) gives a prolonged treatment of Aristotle’s views about contemplation and its alleged “uselessness”, and Ward (2022) provides interesting background on the religious context of Aristotle’s views.

a. Bibliography

  • Anagnostopoulos, Georgios (ed.). 2009. A Companion to Aristotle. Sussex: Wiley-Blackwell.
  • Angioni, Lucas. 2016. Aristotle’s Definition of Scientific Knowledge. Logical Analysis and History of Philosophy 19: 140–66.
  • Barnes, Jonathan. 1969. Aristotle’s Theory of Demonstration. Phronesis 14: 123–52.
  • Barnes, Jonathan. 1993. Aristotle: Posterior Analytics. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Barnes, Jonathan (ed.). 1995. The Cambridge Companion to Aristotle. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Bayer, Greg. 1997. Coming to Know Principles in Posterior Analytics II.19. Apeiron 30: 109–42.
  • Berti, Enrico (ed.). 1981. Aristotle on Science: The Posterior Analytics. Proceedings of the Eighth Symposium in Aristotelicum Held in Padua from September 7 to 15, 1978. Padua: Editrice Antenore.
  • Bolton, Robert. 1987. Definition and Scientific Method in Aristotle’s Posterior Analytics and Generation of Animals. In Philosophical Issues in Aristotle’s Biology. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Bolton, Robert. 1997. Aristotle on Essence and Necessity. Proceedings of the Boston Area Colloquium in Ancient Philosophy (edited by John J. Cleary) 13:113–38. Leiden: Brill.
  • Bolton, Robert. 2012. Science and Scientific Inquiry in Aristotle: A Platonic Provenance. In The Oxford Handbook of Aristotle (edited by Christopher Shields), 46–59. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Bolton, Robert. 2014. Intuition in Aristotle. In Rational Intuition: Philosophical Roots, Scientific Investigations, 39–54. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Bolton, Robert. 2018. The Search for Principles in Aristotle. In Aristotle’s Generation of Animals: A Critical Guide (edited by Andrea Falcon and David Lefebvre), 227–48. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Broadie, Sarah, and Christopher Rowe. 2002. Nicomachean Ethics. Philosophical Introduction and Commentary by Sarah Broadie (translated by Christopher Rowe). New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Bronstein, David. 2010. Meno’s Paradox in Posterior Analytics 1.1. Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 38: 115–41.
  • Bronstein, David. 2012. The Origin and Aim of Posterior Analytics II.19. Phronesis 57(1): 29–62.
  • Bronstein, David. 2016. Aristotle on Knowledge and Learning: The Posterior Analytics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Bronstein, David. 2020. Aristotle’s Virtue Epistemology. In What the Ancients Offer to Contemporary Epistemology (edited by Stephen Hetherington and Nicholas Smith), 157–77. New York: Routledge.
  • Burnyeat, Myles. 1981. Aristotle on Understanding Knowledge. In Aristotle on Science: The Posterior Analytics (edited by Enrico Berti). Padua: Editrice Antenore.
  • Burnyeat, Myles. 2011. Episteme. In Episteme, Etc. Essays in Honour of Jonathan Barnes (edited by Benjamin Morison and Katerina Ierodiakonou), 3–29. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Burnyeat, Myles. 2002. De Anima II 5. Phronesis 47(1): 28–90.
  • Byrne, Patrick. 1997. Analysis and Science in Aristotle. Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Caston, Victor. 2004. The Spirit and the Letter: Aristotle on Perception. In Metaphysics, Soul and Ethics: Themes from the Work of Richard Sorabji (edited by Ricardo Salles), 245–320. Oxford University Press.
  • Charles, David. 2002. Aristotle on Meaning and Essence. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Fine, Gail. 2021. Aristotle on Knowledge. In Essays in Ancient Epistemology, 221–32. Oxford University Press.
  • Frede, Michael. 1996. Aristotle’s Rationalism. In Rationality in Greek Thought (edited by Michael Frede and Gisela Striker), 157–73. Oxford University Press.
  • Gasser-Wingate, Marc. 2016. Aristotle on Induction and First Principles. Philosopher’s Imprint 16(4): 1–20.
  • Gasser-Wingate, Marc. 2019. Aristotle on the Perception of Universals. British Journal for the History of Philosophy 27(3): 446–67.
  • Gasser-Wingate, Marc. 2021. Aristotle’s Empiricism. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Goldin, Owen. 1996. Explaining an Eclipse: Aristotle’s Posterior Analytics 2.1–10. Ann Arbor: The University of Michigan Press.
  • Greco, John. 2010. Achieving Knowledge. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Hasper, Pieter Sjoerd, and Joel Yurdin. 2014. Between Perception and Scientific Knowledge: Aristotle’s Account of Experience. In Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy (edited by Brad Inwood), 47:119–50.
  • Hetherington, Stephen (ed.). 2012. Aristotle on Knowledge. In Epistemology: The Key Thinkers, 50–71. London: Continuum.
  • Hintikka, Jaakko. 1967. Time, Truth and Knowledge in Ancient Greek Philosophy. American Philosophical Quarterly 4(1): 1–14.
  • Irwin, Terence. 1988. Aristotle’s First Principles. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Kahn, Charles. 1981. The Role of Nous in the Cognition of First Principles in Posterior Analytics II 19. In Aristotle on Science: The Posterior Analytics. Proceedings of the Eighth Symposium in Aristotelicum Held in Padua from September 7 to 15, 1978 (edited by Enrico Berti). Padua: Editrice Antenore.
  • Kelsey, Sean. 2022. Mind and World in Aristotle’s de Anima. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press.
  • Kiefer, Thomas. 2007. Aristotle’s Theory of Knowledge. London: Continuum.
  • Kosman, Aryeh. 2013. Understanding, Explanation, and Insight in Aristotle’s Posterior Analytics. In Virtues of Thought, 7–26. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Lennox, James G. 2021. Aristotle on Inquiry. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Lesher, James H. 2001. On Aristotelian Ἐπιστήμη as ‘Understanding’. Ancient Philosophy 21(1): 45–55.
  • Lorenz, Hendrik. 2014. Understanding, Knowledge and Inquiry in Aristotle. In The Routledge Companion to Ancient Philosophy, 290–303. New York: Routledge.
  • Malink, Marko. 2013. Aristotle on Circular Proof. Phronesis 58(3): 215–48.
  • Marmodoro, Anna. 2014. Aristotle on Perceiving Objects. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • McKirahan, Richard. 1992. Principles and Proofs. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Modrak, Deborah K. W. 1987. Aristotle: The Power of Perception. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Morison, Benjamim. 2019. Theoretical Nous in the Posterior Analytics. Manuscrito 42(4): 1–43.
  • Morison, Benjamin. 2012. Colloquium 2: An Aristotelian Distinction Between Two Types of Knowledge. In Proceedings of the Boston Area Colloquium of Ancient Philosophy (edited by Gary Gurtler and William Wians), 27:29–63.
  • Pasnau, Robert. 2013. Epistemology Idealized. Mind 122: 987–1021.
  • Reeve, C. D. C. 2013. Aristotle on Practical Wisdom: Nicomachean Ethics VI. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Reeve, C. D. C. 2014. Aristotle: Nicomachean Ethics. Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • Russell, Daniel C. 2014. Phronesis and the Virtues (NE Vi 12-13). In The Cambridge Companion to Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics (edited by Ronald Polansky), 203–20. New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Shields, Christopher. 2016. Aristotle. De Anima. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Smith, Nicholas D. (ed.). 2019. The Philosophy of Knowledge: A History (Vol. I: Knowledge in Ancient Philosophy). London: Bloomsbury Academic.
  • Sorabji, Richard. 1980. Necessity, Cause and Blame. Perspectives on Aristotle’s Theory. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Sorabji, Richard. 1992. Intentionality and Physiological Processes: Aristotle’s Theory of Sense-Perception. In Essays on Aristotle’s De Anima (edited by Martha C. Nussbaum and Amelie Oksenberg Rorty), 195–225. Clarendon Press.
  • Sosa, Ernst. 2010. Knowing Full Well. Cambridge: Princeton University Press.
  • Taylor, C. C. W. 1990. Aristotle’s Epistemology. In Epistemology (edited by Stephen Everson), 116–42. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Walker, Matthew D. 2018. Aristotle on the Uses of Contemplation. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Ward, Julie K. 2022. Searching for the Divine in Plato and Aristotle: Philosophical Theoria and Traditional Practice. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.


Author Information

Joshua Mendelsohn
Loyola University Chicago
U. S. A.