All posts by Josh May

Aristotle: Ethics

Standard interpretations of Aristotle’s Nichomachean Ethics usually maintain that Aristotle (384-322 B.C.E.) emphasizes the role of habit in conduct. It is commonly thought that virtues, according to Aristotle, are habits and that the good life is a life of mindless routine.

These interpretations of Aristotle’s ethics are the result of imprecise translations from the ancient Greek text. Aristotle uses the word hexis to denote moral virtue. But the word does not merely mean passive habituation. Rather, hexis is an active condition, a state in which something must actively hold itself.

Virtue, therefore, manifests itself in action. More explicitly, an action counts as virtuous, according to Aristotle, when one holds oneself in a stable equilibrium of the soul, in order to choose the action knowingly and for its own sake. This stable equilibrium of the soul is what constitutes character.

Similarly, Aristotle’s concept of the mean is often misunderstood. In the Nichomachean Ethics, Aristotle repeatedly states that virtue is a mean. The mean is a state of clarification and apprehension in the midst of pleasures and pains that allows one to judge what seems most truly pleasant or painful. This active state of the soul is the condition in which all the powers of the soul are at work in concert. Achieving good character is a process of clearing away the obstacles that stand in the way of the full efficacy of the soul.

For Aristotle, moral virtue is the only practical road to effective action. What the person of good character loves with right desire and thinks of as an end with right reason must first be perceived as beautiful. Hence, the virtuous person sees truly and judges rightly, since beautiful things appear as they truly are only to a person of good character. It is only in the middle ground between habits of acting and principles of action that the soul can allow right desire and right reason to make their appearance, as the direct and natural response of a free human being to the sight of the beautiful.

Table of Contents

  1. Habit
  2. The Mean
  3. Noble
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Habit

In many discussions, the word “habit” is attached to the Ethics as though it were the answer to a multiple-choice question on a philosophy achievement test. Hobbes‘ Leviathan? Self-preservation. Descartes‘ Meditations? Mind-body problem. Aristotle’s Ethics? Habit. A faculty seminar I attended a few years ago was mired in the opinion that Aristotle thinks the good life is one of mindless routine. More recently, I heard a lecture in which some very good things were said about Aristotle’s discussion of choice, yet the speaker still criticized him for praising habit when so much that is important in life depends on openness and spontaneity. Can it really be that Aristotle thought life is lived best when thinking and choosing are eliminated?

On its face this belief makes no sense. It is partly a confusion between an effect and one of its causes. Aristotle says that, for the way our lives turn out, “it makes no small difference to be habituated this way or that way straight from childhood, but an enormous difference, or rather all the difference.” (1103b, 23-5) Is this not the same as saying those lives are nothing but collections of habits? If this is what sticks in your memory, and leads you to that conclusion, then the cure is easy, since habits are not the only effects of habituation, and a thing that makes all the difference is indispensable but not necessarily the only cause of what it produces.

We will work through this thought in a moment, but first we need to notice that another kind of influence may be at work when you recall what Aristotle says about habit, and another kind of medicine may be needed against it. Are you thinking that no matter how we analyze the effects of habituation, we will never get around the fact that Aristotle plainly says that virtues are habits? The reply to that difficulty is that he doesn’t say that at all. He says that moral virtue is a hexis. Hippocrates Apostle, and others, translate hexis as habit, but that is not at all what it means. The trouble, as so often in these matters, is the intrusion of Latin. The Latin habitus is a perfectly good translation of the Greek hexis, but if that detour gets us to habit in English we have lost our way. In fact, a hexisis pretty much the opposite of a habit.

The word hexis becomes an issue in Plato‘s Theaetetus. Socrates makes the point that knowledge can never be a mere passive possession, stored in the memory the way birds can be put in cages. The word for that sort of possession, ktÎsis, is contrasted with hexis, the kind of having-and-holding that is never passive but always at work right now. Socrates thus suggests that, whatever knowledge is, it must have the character of a hexis in requiring the effort of concentrating or paying attention. A hexis is an active condition, a state in which something must actively hold itself, and that is what Aristotle says a moral virtue is.

Some translators make Aristotle say that virtue is a disposition, or a settled disposition. This is much better than calling it a “habit,” but still sounds too passive to capture his meaning. In De Anima, when Aristotle speaks of the effect produced in us by an object of sense perception, he says this is not a disposition (diathesis) but a hexis. (417b, 15-17) His whole account of sensing and knowing depends on this notion that receptivity to what is outside us depends on an active effort to hold ourselves ready. In Book VII of the Physics, Aristotle says much the same thing about the way children start to learn: they are not changed, he says, nor are they trained or even acted upon in any way, but they themselves get straight into an active state when time or adults help them settle down out of their native condition of disorder and distraction. (247b, 17-248a, 6) Curtis Wilson once delivered a lecture at St. John’s College, in which he asked his audience to imagine what it would be like if we had to teach children to speak by deliberately and explicitly imparting everything they had to do. We somehow set them free to speak, and give them a particular language to do it in, but they–Mr. Wilson called them “little geniuses”–they do all the work.

Everyone at St. John’s has thought about the kind of learning that does not depend on the authority of the teacher and the memory of the learner. In the Meno it is called “recollection.” Aristotle says that it is an active knowing that is always already at work in us. In Plato’s image we draw knowledge up out of ourselves; in Aristotle’s metaphor we settle down into knowing. In neither account is it possible for anyone to train us, as Gorgias has habituated Meno into the mannerisms of a knower. Habits can be strong but they never go deep. Authentic knowledge does engage the soul in its depths, and with this sort of knowing Aristotle links virtue. In the passage cited from Book VII of the Physics, he says that, like knowledge, virtues are not imposed on us as alterations of what we are; that would be, he says, like saying we alter a house when we put a roof on it. In the Categories, knowledge and virtue are the two examples he gives of what hexis means (8b, 29); there he says that these active states belong in the general class of dispositions, but are distinguished by being lasting and durable. The word “disposition” by itself he reserves for more passive states, easy to remove and change, such as heat, cold, and sickness.

In the Ethics, Aristotle identifies moral virtue as a hexis in Book II, chapter 4. He confirms this identity by reviewing the kinds of things that are in the soul, and eliminating the feelings and impulses to which we are passive and the capacities we have by nature, but he first discovers what sort of thing a virtue is by observing that the goodness is never in the action but only in the doer. This is an enormous claim that pervades the whole of the Ethics, and one that we need to stay attentive to. No action is good or just or courageous because of any quality in itself. Virtue manifests itself in action, Aristotle says, only when one acts while holding oneself in a certain way. This is where the word hexis comes into the account, from pÙs echÙn, the stance in which one holds oneself when acting. The indefinite adverb is immediately explained: an action counts as virtuous when and only when one holds oneself in a stable equilibrium of the soul, in order to choose the action knowingly and for its own sake. I am translating as “in a stable equilibrium” the words bebaiÙs kai ametakinÍtÙs; the first of these adverbs means stably or after having taken a stand, while the second does not mean rigid or immovable, but in a condition from which one can’t be moved all the way over into a different condition. It is not some inflexible adherence to rules or duty or precedent that is conveyed here, but something like a Newton’s wheel weighted below the center, or one of those toys that pops back upright whenever a child knocks it over.

This stable equilibrium of the soul is what we mean by having character. It is not the result of what we call “conditioning.” There is a story told about B. F. Skinner, the psychologist most associated with the idea of behavior modification, that a class of his once trained him to lecture always from one corner of the room, by smiling and nodding whenever he approached it, but frowning and faintly shaking their heads when he moved away from it. That is the way we acquire habits. We slip into them unawares, or let them be imposed on us, or even impose them on ourselves. A person with ever so many habits may still have no character. Habits make for repetitive and predictable behavior, but character gives moral equilibrium to a life. The difference is between a foolish consistency wholly confined to the level of acting, and a reliability in that part of us from which actions have their source. Different as they are, though, character and habit sound to us like things that are linked, and in Greek they differ only by the change of an epsilon to an eta, making Íthos from ethos

We are finally back to Aristotle’s claim that character, Íthos, is produced by habit, ethos. It should now be clear though, that the habit cannot be any part of that character, and that we must try to understand how an active condition can arise as a consequence of a passive one, and why that active condition can only be attained if the passive one has come first. So far we have arranged three notions in a series, like rungs of a ladder: at the top are actives states, such as knowledge, the moral virtues, and the combination of virtues that makes up a character; the middle rung, the mere dispositions, we have mentioned only in passing to claim that they are too shallow and changeable to capture the meaning of virtue; the bottom rung is the place of the habits, and includes biting your nails, twisting your hair, saying “like” between every two words, and all such passive and mindless conditions. What we need to notice now is that there is yet another rung of the ladder below the habits.

We all start out life governed by desires and impulses. Unlike the habits, which are passive but lasting conditions, desires and impulses are passive and momentary, but they are very strong. Listen to a child who can’t live without some object of appetite or greed, or who makes you think you are a murderer if you try to leave her alone in a dark room. How can such powerful influences be overcome? To expect a child to let go of the desire or fear that grips her may seem as hopeless as Aristotle’s example of training a stone to fall upward, were it not for the fact that we all know that we have somehow, for the most part, broken the power of these tyrannical feelings. We don’t expel them altogether, but we do get the upper hand; an adult who has temper tantrums like those of a two-year old has to live in an institution, and not in the adult world. But the impulses and desires don’t weaken; it is rather the case that we get stronger.

Aristotle doesn’t go into much detail about how this happens, except to say that we get the virtues by working at them: in the give-and-take with other people, some become just, others unjust; by acting in the face of frightening things and being habituated to be fearful or confident, some become brave and others cowardly; and some become moderate and gentle, others spoiled and bad-tempered, by turning around from one thing and toward another in the midst of desires and passions. (1103 b, 1422) He sums this up by saying that when we are at-work in a certain way, an active state results. This innocent sentence seems to me to be one of the lynch-pins that hold together the Ethics, the spot that marks the transition from the language of habit to the language appropriate to character. If you read the sentence in Greek, and have some experience of Aristotle’s other writings, you will see how loaded it is, since it says that a hexis depends upon an energeia. The latter word, that can be translated as being-at-work, cannot mean mere behavior, however repetitive and constant it may be. It is this idea of being-at-work, which is central to all of Aristotle’s thinking, that makes intelligible the transition out of childhood and into the moral stature that comes with character and virtue. (See Aristotle: Motion for as discussion energeia.)

The moral life can be confused with the habits approved by some society and imposed on its young. We at St. John’s College still stand up at the beginning and end of Friday-night lectures because Stringfellow Barr — one of the founders of the current curriculum — always stood when anyone entered or left a room. What he considered good breeding is for us mere habit; that becomes obvious when some student who stood up at the beginning of a lecture occasionally gets bored and leaves in the middle of it. In such a case the politeness was just for show, and the rudeness is the truth. Why isn’t all habituation of the young of this sort? When a parent makes a child repeatedly refrain from some desired thing, or remain in some frightening situation, the child is beginning to act as a moderate or brave person would act, but what is really going on within the child? I used to think that it must be the parent’s approval that was becoming stronger than the child’s own impulse, but I was persuaded by others in a study group that this alone would be of no lasting value, and would contribute nothing to the formation of an active state of character. What seems more likely is that parental training is needed only for its negative effect, as a way of neutralizing the irrational force of impulses and desires.

We all arrive on the scene already habituated, in the habit, that is, of yielding to impulses and desires, of instantly slackening the tension of pain or fear or unfulfilled desire in any way open to us, and all this has become automatic in us before thinking and choosing are available to us at all. This is a description of what is called “human nature,” though in fact it precedes our access to our true natural state, and blocks that access. This is why Aristotle says that “the virtues come about in us neither by nature nor apart from nature” (1103a, 24-5). What we call “human nature,” and some philosophers call the “state of nature,” is both natural and unnatural; it is the passive part of our natures, passively reinforced by habit. Virtue has the aspect of a second nature, because it cannot develop first, nor by a continuous process out of our first condition. But it is only in the moral virtues that we possess our primary nature, that in which all our capacities can have their full development. The sign of what is natural, for Aristotle, is pleasure, but we have to know how to read the signs. Things pleasant by nature have no opposite pain and no excess, because they set us free to act simply as what we are (1154b, 15-21), and it is in this sense that Aristotle calls the life of virtue pleasant in its own right, in itself (1099a, 6-7, 16-17). A mere habit of acting contrary to our inclinations cannot be a virtue, by the infallible sign that we don’t like it.

Our first or childish nature is never eradicated, though, and this is why Aristotle says that our nature is not simple, but also has in it something different that makes our happiness assailable from within, and makes us love change even when it is for the worse. (1154b, 21-32) But our souls are brought nearest to harmony and into the most durable pleasures only by the moral virtues. And the road to these virtues is nothing fancy, but is simply what all parents begin to do who withhold some desired thing from a child, or prevent it from running away from every irrational source of fear. They make the child act, without virtue, as though it had virtue. It is what Hamlet describes to his mother, during a time that is out of joint, when a son must try to train his parent (III, Ìv,181-9):

Assume a virtue if you have it not.
That monster, custom, who all sense doth eat
Of habits evil, is angel yet in this,
That to the use of actions fair and good
He likewise gives a frock or livery,
That aptly is put on. Refrain tonight,
And that shall lend a kind of easiness
To the next abstinence; the next more easy;
For use almost can change the stamp of nature…

Hamlet is talking to a middle-aged woman about lust, but the pattern applies just as well to five-year-olds and candy. We are in a position to see that it is not the stamp of nature that needs to be changed but the earliest stamp of habit. We can drop Hamlet’s “almost” and rid his last quoted line of all paradox by seeing that the reason we need habit is to change the stamp of habit. A habit of yielding to impulse can be counteracted by an equal and opposite habit. This second habit is no virtue, but only a mindless inhibition, an automatic repressing of all impulses. Nor do the two opposite habits together produce virtue, but rather a state of neutrality. Something must step into the role previously played by habit, and Aristotle’s use of the word energeia suggests that this happens on its own, with no need for anything new to be imposed. Habituation thus does not stifle nature, but rather lets nature make its appearance. The description from Book VII of the Physics of the way children begin to learn applies equally well to the way human character begins to be formed: we settle down, out of the turmoil of childishness, into what we are by nature.

We noticed earlier that habituation is not the end but the beginning of the progress toward virtue. The order of states of the soul given by Aristotle went from habit to being-at-work to the hexis or active state that can give the soul moral stature. If the human soul had no being-at-work, no inherent and indelible activity, there could be no such moral stature, but only customs. But early on, when first trying to give content to the idea of happiness, Aristotle asks if it would make sense to think that a carpenter or shoemaker has work to do, but a human being as such is inert. His reply, of course, is that nature has given us work to do, in default of which we are necessarily unhappy, and that work is to put into action the power of reason. (1097b, 24-1098a, 4) Note please that he does not say that everyone must be a philosopher, nor even that human life is constituted by the activity of reason, but that our work is to bring the power of logos forward into action. Later, Aristotle makes explicit that the irrational impulses are no less human than reasoning is. (1111 b, 1-2) His point is that, as human beings, our desires need not be mindless and random, but can be transformed by thinking into choices, that is desires informed by deliberation. (1113a, 11) The characteristic human way of being-at-work is the threefold activity of seeing an end, thinking about means to it, and choosing an action. Responsible human action depends upon the combining of all the powers of the soul: perception, imagination, reasoning, and desiring. These are all things that are at work in us all the time. Good parental training does not produce them, or mold them, or alter them, but sets them free to be effective in action. This is the way in which, according to Aristotle, despite the contributions of parents, society, and nature, we are the co-authors of the active states of our own souls (1114b, 23-4).

2. The Mean

Now this discussion has shown that habit does make all the difference to our lives without being the only thing shaping those lives and without being the final form they take. The same discussion also points to a way to make some sense of one of the things that has always puzzled me most in the Ethics, the insistence that moral virtue is always in its own nature a mean condition. Quantitative relations are so far from any serious human situation that they would seem to be present only incidentally or metaphorically, but Aristotle says that “by its thinghood and by the account that unfolds what it is for it to be, virtue is a mean.” (1107a, 7-8) This invites such hopeless shallowness as in the following sentences from a recent article in the journal Ancient Philosophy (Vol. 8, pp. 101-4): “To illustrate …0 marks the mean (e.g. Courage); …Cowardice is -3 while Rashness is 3…In our number language…’Always try to lower the absolute value of your vice.’ ” This scholar thinks achieving courage is like tuning in a radio station on an analog dial. Those who do not sink this low might think instead that Aristotle is praising a kind of mediocrity, like that found in those who used to go to college to get “gentlemen’s C’s.” But what sort of courage could be found in these timid souls, whose only aim in life is to blend so well into their social surroundings that virtue can never be chosen in preference to a fashionable vice? Aristotle points out twice that every moral virtue is an extreme (1107a, 8-9, 22-4), but he keeps that observation secondary to an over-riding sense in which it is a mean.

Could there be anything at all to the notion that we hone in on a virtue from two sides? There is a wonderful image of this sort of thing in the novel Nop’s Trials by Donald McCaig. The protagonist is not a human being, but a border collie named Nop. The author describes the way the dog has to find the balance point, the exact distance behind a herd of sheep from which he can drive the whole herd forward in a coherent mass. When the dog is too close, the sheep panic and run off in all directions; when he is too far back, the sheep ignore him, and turn in all directions to graze. While in motion, a good working dog keeps adjusting his pace to maintain the exact mean position that keeps the sheep stepping lively in the direction he determines. Now working border collies are brave, tireless, and determined. They have been documented as running more than a hundred miles in a day, and they love their work. There is no question that they display virtue, but it is not human virtue and not even of the same form. Some human activities do require the long sustained tension a sheep dog is always holding on to, an active state stretched to the limit, constantly and anxiously kept in balance. Running on a tightrope might capture the same flavor. But constantly maintained anxiety is not the kind of stable equilibrium Aristotle attributes to the virtuous human soul.

I think we may have stumbled on the way that human virtue is a mean when we found that habits were necessary in order to counteract other habits. This does accord with the things Aristotle says about straightening warped boards, aiming away from the worse extreme, and being on guard against the seductions of pleasure. (1109a, 30- b9) The habit of abstinence from bodily pleasure is at the opposite extreme from the childish habit of yielding to every immediate desire. Alone, either of them is a vice, according to Aristotle. The glutton, the drunkard, the person enslaved to every sexual impulse obviously cannot ever be happy, but the opposite extremes, which Aristotle groups together as a kind of numbness or denial of the senses (1107b, 8), miss the proper relation to bodily pleasure on the other side. It may seem that temperance in relation to food, say, depends merely on determining how many ounces of chocolate mousse to eat. Aristotle’s example of Milo the wrestler, who needs more food than the rest of us do to sustain him, seems to say this, but I think that misses the point. The example is given only to show that there is no single action that can be prescribed as right for every person and every circumstance, and it is not strictly analogous even to temperance with respect to food. What is at stake is not a correct quantity of food but a right relation to the pleasure that comes from eating.

Suppose you have carefully saved a bowl of chocolate mousse all day for your mid-evening snack, and just as you are ready to treat yourself, a friend arrives unexpectedly to visit. If you are a glutton, you might hide the mousse until the friend leaves, or gobble it down before you open the door. If you have the opposite vice, and have puritanically suppressed in yourself all indulgence in the pleasures of food, you probably won’t have chocolate mousse or any other treat to offer your visitor. If the state of your soul is in the mean in these matters, you are neither enslaved to nor shut out from the pleasure of eating treats, and can enhance the visit of a friend by sharing them. What you are sharing is incidentally the 6 ounces of chocolate mousse; the point is that you are sharing the pleasure, which is not found on any scale of measurement. If the pleasures of the body master you, or if you have broken their power only by rooting them out, you have missed out on the natural role that such pleasures can play in life. In the mean between those two states, you are free to notice possibilities that serve good ends, and to act on them.

It is worth repeating that the mean is not the 3 ounces of mousse on which you settled, since if two friends had come to visit you would have been willing to eat 2 ounces. That would not have been a division of the food but a multiplication of the pleasure. What is enlightening about the example is how readily and how nearly universally we all see that sharing the treat is the right thing to do. This is a matter of immediate perception, but it is perception of a special kind, not that of any one of the five senses, Aristotle says, but the sort by which we perceive that a triangle is the last kind of figure into which a polygon can be divided. (1142a, 28-30) This is thoughtful and imaginative perceiving, but it has to be perceived. The childish sort of habit clouds our sight, but the liberating counter-habit clears that sight. This is why Aristotle says that the person of moral stature, the spoudaios, is the one to whom things appear as they truly are. (1113a, 30-1) Once the earliest habits are neutralized, our desires are disentangled from the pressure for immediate gratification, we are calm enough to think, and most important, we can see what is in front of us in all its possibility. The mean state here is not a point on a dial that we need to fiddle up and down; it is a clearing in the midst of pleasures and pains that lets us judge what seems most truly pleasant and painful.

Achieving temperance toward bodily pleasures is, by this account, finding a mean, but it is not a simple question of adjusting a single varying condition toward the more or the less. The person who is always fighting the same battle, always struggling like the sheep dog to maintain the balance point between too much and too little indulgence, does not, according to Aristotle, have the virtue of temperance, but is at best selfrestrained or continent. In that case, the reasoning part of the soul is keeping the impulses reined in. But those impulses can slip the reins and go their own way, as parts of the body do in people with certain disorders of the nerves. (1102b, 14-22) Control in self-restrained people is an anxious, unstable equilibrium that will lapse whenever vigilance is relaxed. It is the old story of the conflict between the head and the emotions, never resolved but subject to truces. A soul with separate, self-contained rational and irrational parts could never become one undivided human being, since the parties would always believe they had divergent interests, and could at best compromise. The virtuous soul, on the contrary, blends all its parts in the act of choice.

This is arguably the best way to understand the active state of the soul that constitutes moral virtue and forms character. It is the condition in which all the powers of the soul are at work together, making it possible for action to engage the whole human being. The work of achieving character is a process of clearing away the obstacles that stand in the way of the full efficacy of the soul. Someone who is partial to food or drink, or to running away from trouble or to looking for trouble, is a partial human being. Let the whole power of the soul have its influence, and the choices that result will have the characteristic look that we call “courage” or “temperance” or simply “virtue.” Now this adjective “characteristic” comes from the Greek word charactÍr, which means the distinctive mark scratched or stamped on anything, and which is apparently never used in the Nicomachean Ethics. In the sense of character of which we are speaking, the word for which is Íthos, we see an outline of the human form itself. A person of character is someone you can count on, because there is a human nature in a deeper sense than that which refers to our early state of weakness. Someone with character has taken a stand in that fully mature nature, and cannot be moved all the way out of it.

But there is also such a thing as bad character, and this is what Aristotle means by vice, as distinct from bad habits or weakness. It is possible for someone with full responsibility and the free use of intellect to choose always to yield to bodily pleasure or to greed. Virtue is a mean, first because it can only emerge out of the stand-off between opposite habits, but second because it chooses to take its stand not in either of those habits but between them. In this middle region, thinking does come into play, but it is not correct to say that virtue takes its stand in principle; Aristotle makes clear that vice is a principled choice that following some extreme path toward or away from pleasure is right. (1146b, 22-3) Principles are wonderful things, but there are too many of them, and exclusive adherence to any one of them is always a vice.

In our earlier example, the true glutton would be someone who does not just have a bad habit of always indulging the desire for food, but someone who has chosen on principle that one ought always to yield to it. In Plato’s Gorgias, Callicles argues just that, about food, drink, and sex. He is serious, even though he is young and still open to argument. But the only principled alternative he can conceive is the denial of the body, and the choice of a life fit only for stones or corpses. (492E) This is the way most attempts to be serious about right action go astray. What, for example, is the virtue of a seminar leader? Is it to ask appropriate questions but never state an opinion? Or is it to offer everything one has learned on the subject of discussion? What principle should rule?–that all learning must come from the learners, or that without prior instruction no useful learning can take place? Is there a hybrid principle? Or should one try to find the mid-way point between the opposite principles? Or is the virtue some third kind of thing altogether?

Just as habits of indulgence always stand opposed to habits of abstinence, so too does every principle of action have its opposite principle. If good habituation ensures that we are not swept away by our strongest impulses, and the exercise of intelligence ensures that we will see two worthy sides to every question about action, what governs the choice of the mean? Aristotle gives this answer: “such things are among particulars, and the judgment is in the act of sense-perception.” (1109b, 23-4) But this is the calmly energetic, thought-laden perception to which we referred earlier. The origin of virtuous action is neither intellect nor appetite, but is variously described as intellect through-and-through infused with appetite, or appetite wholly infused with thinking, or appetite and reason joined for the sake of something; this unitary source is called by Aristotle simply anthropos. (1139a, 34, b, S-7) But our thinking must contribute right reason (ho orthos logos) and our appetites must contribute rightdesire (hÍ orthÍ orexis) if the action is to have moral stature. (1114b, 29, 1139a, 24-6, 31-2) What makes them right can only be the something for the sake of which they unite, and this is what is said to be accessible only to sense perception. This brings us to the third word we need to think about.

3. Noble

Aristotle says plainly and repeatedly what it is that moral virtue is for the sake of, but the translators are afraid to give it to you straight. Most of them say it is the noble. One of them says it is the fine. If these answers went past you without even registering, that is probably because they make so little sense. To us, the word “noble” probably connotes some sort of high-minded naiveté, something hopelessly impractical. But Aristotle considers moral virtue the only practical road to effective action. The word “fine” is of the same sort but worse, suggesting some flimsy artistic soul who couldn’t endure rough treatment, while Aristotle describes moral virtue as the most stable and durable condition in which we can meet all obstacles. The word the translators are afraid of is to kalon, the beautiful. Aristotle singles out as the distinguishing mark of courage, for example, that it is always “for the sake of the beautiful, for this is the end of virtue.” (111 S b, 12-13) Of magnificence, or large-scale philanthropy, he says it is “for the sake of the beautiful, for this is common to the virtues.” (1122 b, 78) What the person of good character loves with right desire and thinks of as an end with right reason must first be perceived as beautiful.

The Loeb translator explains why he does not use the word “beautiful” in the Nicomachean Ethics. He tells us to kalon has two different uses, and refers both to “(1) bodies well shaped and works of art …well made, and (2) actions well done.” (p. 6) But we have already noticed that Aristotle says the judgment of what is morally right belongs to sense-perception. And he explicitly compares the well made work of art to an act that springs from moral virtue. Of the former, people say that it is not possible add anything to it or take anything from it, and Aristotle says that virtue differs from art in that respect only in being more precise and better. (1106b, 10-15) An action is right in the same way a painting might get everything just right. Antigone contemplates in her imagination the act of burying her brother, and says “it would be a beautiful thing to die doing this.” (Antigone, line 72) This is called “courage.” Neoptolemus stops Philoctetes from killing Odysseus with the bow he has just returned, and says “neither for me nor for you is this a beautiful thing.” (Philoctetes, line 1304) This is a recognition that the rightness of returning the bow would be spoiled if it were used for revenge. This is not some special usage of the Greek language, but one that speaks to us directly, if the translators let it. And it is not a kind of language that belongs only to poetic tragedy, since the tragedians find their subjects by recognizing human virtue in circumstances that are most hostile to it.

In the most ordinary circumstances, any mother might say to a misbehaving child, in plain English, “don’t be so ugly.” And any of us, parent, friend, or grudging enemy, might on occasion say to someone else, “that was a beautiful thing you did.” Is it by some wild coincidence that twentieth-century English and fourth-century BC Greek link the same pair of uses under one word? Aristotle is always alert to the natural way that important words have more than one meaning. The inquiry in his Metaphysics is built around the progressive narrowing of the word “being” until its primary meaning is discovered. In the Physics the various senses of motion and change are played on like the keyboard of a piano, and serve to uncover the double source of natural activity. The inquiry into ethics is not built in this fashion; Aristotle asks about the way the various meanings of the good are organized, but he immediately drops the question, as being more at home in another sort of philosophic inquiry. (1096b, 26-32) It is widely claimed that Aristotle says there is no good itself, or any other form at all of the sort spoken of in Plato’s dialogues. This is a misreading of any text of Aristotle to which it is referred. Here in the study of ethics it is a failure to see that the idea of the good is not rejected simply, but only held off as a question that does not arise as first for us. Aristotle praises Plato for understanding that philosophy does not argue from first principles but toward them. (1095a, 31-3)

But while Aristotle does not make the meanings of the good an explicit theme that shapes his inquiry, he nevertheless does plainly lay out its three highest senses, and does narrow down the three into two and indirectly into one. He tells us there are three kinds of good toward which our choices look, the pleasant, the beautiful, and the beneficial or advantageous. (1104b, 31-2) The last of these is clearly subordinate to the other two, and when the same issue comes up next, it has dropped out of the list. The goods sought for their own sake are said to be of only two kinds, the pleasant and the beautiful. (1110b, 9-12) That the beautiful is the primary sense of the good is less obvious, both because the pleasant is itself resolved into a variety of senses, and because a whole side of virtue that we are not considering in this lecture aims at the true, but we can sketch out some ways in which the beautiful emerges as the end of human action.

Aristotle’s first description of moral virtue required that the one acting choose an action knowingly, out of a stable equilibrium of the soul, and for its own sake. The knowing in question turned out to be perceiving things as they are, as a result of the habituation that clears our sight. The stability turned out to come from the active condition of all the powers of the soul, in the mean position opened up by that same habituation, since it neutralized an earlier, opposite, and passive habituation to self-indulgence. In the accounts of the particular moral virtues, an action’s being chosen for its own sake is again and again specified as meaning chosen for no reason other than that it is beautiful. In Book III, chapter 8, Aristotle refuses to give the name courageous to anyone who acts bravely for the sake of honor, out of shame, from experience that the danger is not as great as it seems, out of spiritedness or anger or the desire for revenge, or from optimism or ignorance. Genuinely courageous action is in no obvious way pleasant, and is not chosen for that reason, but there is according to Aristotle a truer pleasure inherent in it. It doesn’t need pleasure dangled in front of it as an extra added attraction. Lasting and satisfying pleasure never comes to those who seek pleasure, but only to the philokalos, who looks past pleasure to the beautiful. (1099a, 15-17, 13)

In our earlier example of temperance, I think most of us would readily agree that the one who had his eye only the chocolate mousse found less pleasure than the one who saw that it would be a better thing to share it. And Aristotle does say explicitly that the target the temperate person looks to is the beautiful. (1119b, 15-17) But since there are three primary moral virtues, courage, temperance, and justice, it is surprising that in the whole of Book V, which discusses justice, Aristotle never mentions the beautiful. It must somehow be applicable, since he says it is common to all the moral virtues, but in that case it would seem that the account of justice could not be complete if it is not connected to the beautiful. I think this does happen, but in an unexpected way.

Justice seems to be not only a moral virtue, but in some pre-eminent way the moral virtue. And Aristotle says that there is a sense of the word in which the one we call “just” is the person who has all moral virtue, insofar as it affects other people. (1129b, 26-7) In spite of all this, I believe that Aristotle treats justice as something inherently inadequate, a condition of the soul that cannot ever achieve the end at which it aims. Justice concerns itself with the right distribution of rewards and punishments within a community. This would seem to be the chief aim of the lawmakers, but Aristotle says that they do not take justice as seriously as friendship. They accord friendship a higher moral stature than justice. (1155a, 23-4) It seems to me now that Aristotle does too, and that the discussion of friendship in Books VIII and IX replaces that of justice.

What is the purpose of reward and punishment? I take Aristotle’s answer to be homonoia, the like-mindedness that allows a community to act in concord. For the sake of this end, he says, it is not good enough that people be just, while if they are friends they have no need to be just: (1155a, 24-9) So far, this sounds as though friendship is merely something advantageous for the social or political good, but Aristotle immediately adds that it is also beautiful. The whole account of friendship, you will recall, is structured around the threefold meaning of the good. Friendships are distinguished as being for use, for pleasure, or for love of the friend’s character.

Repeatedly, after raising questions about the highest kind of friendship, Aristotle resolves them by looking to the beautiful: it is a beautiful thing to do favors for someone freely, without expecting a return (1163a, 1, 1168a, 10-13); even in cases of urgent necessity, when there is a choice about whom to benefit, one should first decide whether the scale tips toward the necessary or the beautiful thing (1165a, 4-5 ); to use money to support our parents is always more beautiful than to use it for ourselves (1165a, 22-4); someone who strives to achieve the beautiful in action would never be accused of being selfish (1168b, 25-8). These observations culminate in the claim that, “if all people competed for the beautiful, and strained to do the most beautiful things, everything people need in common, and the greatest good for each in particular, would be achieved …for the person of moral stature will forego money, honor, and all the good things people fight over to achieve the beautiful for himself.” (1169a, 8-11, 20-22) This does not mean that people can do without such things as money and honor, but that the distribution of such things takes care of itself when people take each other seriously and look to something higher.

The description of the role of the beautiful in moral virtue is most explicit in the discussion of courage, where the emphasis is on the great variety of things that resemble courage but fail to achieve it because they are not solely for the sake of the beautiful. That discussion is therefore mostly negative. We can now see that the discussion of justice was also of a negative character, since justice itself resembles the moral virtue called “friendship” without achieving it, again because it does not govern its action by looking to the beautiful. The discussion of friendship contains the largest collection of positive examples of actions that are beautiful. There is something of a tragic feeling to the account of courage, pointing to the extreme situation of war in which nothing might be left to choose but a beautiful death. But the account of friendship points to the healthy community, in which civil war and other conflicts are driven away by the choice of what is beautiful in life. (1155a, 24-7) By the end of the ninth book, there is no doubt that Aristotle does indeed believe in a primary sense of the good, at least in the human realm, and that the name of this highest good is the beautiful.

And it should be noticed that the beautiful is at work not only in the human realm. In De Anima, Aristotle argues that, while the soul moves itself in the act of choice, the ultimate source of its motion is the practical good toward which it looks, which causes motion while it is itself motionless. (433a, 29-30, b, 11-13) This structure of the motionless first mover is taken up in Book XII of the Metaphysics, where Aristotle argues that the order of the cosmos depends on such a source, which causes motion in the manner of something loved; he calls this source, as one of its names, “the beautiful,” that which is beautiful not in seeming but in being. (1072a, 26-b, 4) Like Diotima in Plato’s Symposium, Aristotle makes the beautiful the good itself.

A final word, on the fact that the beautiful in the Ethics is not an object of contemplation simply, but the source of action: In an article on the Poetics, I discussed the intimate connection of beauty with the experience of wonder. The sense of wonder seems to be the way of seeing which allows things to appear as what they are, since it holds off our tendencies to make things fit into theories or opinions we already hold, or use things for purposes that have nothing to do with them. But this is what Aristotle says repeatedly is the ultimate effect of moral virtue, that the one who has it sees truly and judges rightly, since only to someone of good character do the things that are beautiful appear as they truly are (1113 a, 29-35), that practical wisdom depends on moral virtue to make its aim right (1144a, 7-9), and that the eye of the soul that sees what is beautiful as the end or highest good of action gains its active state only with moral virtue (1144a, 26-33). It is only in the middle ground between habits of acting and between principles of action that the soul can allow right desire and right reason to make their appearance, as the direct and natural response of a free human being to the sight of the beautiful.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Aristotle, Metaphysics, Joe Sachs (trans.), Green Lion Press, 1999.
  • Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics, Joe Sachs (trans.), Focus Philosophical Library, Pullins Press, 2002.
  • Aristotle, On the Soul, Joe Sachs (trans.), Green Lion Press, 2001.
  • Aristotle, Poetics, Joe Sachs (trans.), Focus Philosophical Library, Pullins Press, 2006.
  • Aristotle, Physics, Joe Sachs (trans.), Rutgers U. P., 1995.

Author Information

Joe Sachs
St. John’s College
U. S. A.

Anaximander (c. 610—546 B.C.E.)

anaximander-160x300Anaximander was the author of the first surviving lines of Western philosophy. He speculated and argued about “the Boundless” as the origin of all that is. He also worked on the fields of what we now call geography and biology. Moreover, Anaximander was the first speculative astronomer. He originated the world-picture of the open universe, which replaced the closed universe of the celestial vault.

His work will always remain truncated, like the mutilated and decapitated statue that has been found at the market-place of Miletus and that bears his name. Nevertheless, by what we know of him, we may say that he was one of the greatest minds that ever lived. By speculating and arguing about the “Boundless” he was the first metaphysician. By drawing a map of the world he was the first geographer. But above all, by boldly speculating about the universe he broke with the ancient image of the celestial vault and became the discoverer of the Western world-picture.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Sources
  2. The “Boundless” as Principle
  3. The Arguments Regarding the Boundless
    1. The Boundless has No Origin
    2. The Origin must be Boundless
    3. The “Long Since” Argument
  4. The Fragment
  5. The Origin of the Cosmos
  6. Astronomy
    1. Speculative Astronomy
    2. The Celestial Bodies Make Full Circles
    3. The Earth Floats Unsupported in Space
    4. Why the Earth Does Not Fall
    5. The Celestial Bodies Lie Behind One Another
    6. The Order of the Celestial Bodies
    7. The Celestial Bodies as Wheels
    8. The Distances of the Celestial Bodies
    9. A Representation of Anaximander’s Universe
  7. Map of the World
  8. Biology
  9. Conclusion
  10. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Sources

The history of written Greek philosophy starts with Anaximander of Miletus in Asia Minor, a fellow-citizen of Thales. He was the first who dared to write a treatise in prose, which has been called traditionally On Nature. This book has been lost, although it probably was available in the library of the Lyceum at the times of Aristotle and his successor Theophrastus. It is said that Apollodorus, in the second century BCE, stumbled upon a copy of it, perhaps in the famous library of Alexandria. Recently, evidence has appeared that it was part of the collection of the library of Taormina in Sicily, where a fragment of a catalogue has been found, on which Anaximander’s name can be read. Only one fragment of the book has come down to us, quoted by Simplicius (after Theophrastus), in the sixth century AD. It is perhaps the most famous and most discussed phrase in the history of philosophy.

We also know very little of Anaximander’s life. He is said to have led a mission that founded a colony called Apollonia on the coast of the Black Sea. He also probably introduced the gnomon (a perpendicular sun-dial) into Greece and erected one in Sparta. So he seems to have been a much-traveled man, which is not astonishing, as the Milesians were known to be audacious sailors. It is also reported that he displayed solemn manners and wore pompous garments. Most of the information on Anaximander comes from Aristotle and his pupil Theophrastus, whose book on the history of philosophy was used, excerpted, and quoted by many other authors, the so-called doxographers, before it was lost. Sometimes, in these texts words or expressions appear that can with some certainty be ascribed to Anaximander himself. Relatively many testimonies, approximately one third of them, have to do with astronomical and cosmological questions. Hermann Diels and Walter Kranz have edited the doxography (A) and the existing texts (B) of the Presocratic philosophers in Die Fragmente der Vorsokratiker, Berlin 1951-19526. (A quotation like “DK 12A17” means: “Diels/Kranz, Anaximander, doxographical report no.17”).

2. The “Boundless” as Principle

According to Aristotle and Theophrastus, the first Greek philosophers were looking for the “origin” or “principle” (the Greek word “archê” has both meanings) of all things. Anaximander is said to have identified it with “the Boundless” or “the Unlimited” (Greek: “apeiron,” that is, “that which has no boundaries”). Already in ancient times, it is complained that Anaximander did not explain what he meant by “the Boundless.” More recently, authors have disputed whether the Boundless should be interpreted as spatially or temporarily without limits, or perhaps as that which has no qualifications, or as that which is inexhaustible. Some scholars have even defended the meaning “that which is not experienced,” by relating the Greek word “apeiron” not to “peras” (“boundary,” “limit”), but to “perao” (“to experience,” “to apperceive”). The suggestion, however, is almost irresistible that Greek philosophy, by making the Boundless into the principle of all things, has started on a high level of abstraction. On the other hand, some have pointed out that this use of “apeiron” is atypical for Greek thought, which was occupied with limit, symmetry and harmony. The Pythagoreans placed the boundless (the “apeiron”) on the list of negative things, and for Aristotle, too, perfection became aligned with limit (Greek: “peras”), and thus “apeiron” with imperfection. Therefore, some authors suspect eastern (Iranian) influence on Anaximander’s ideas.

3. The Arguments Regarding the Boundless

It seems that Anaximander not only put forward the thesis that the Boundless is the principle, but also tried to argue for it. We might say that he was the first who made use of philosophical arguments. Anaximander’s arguments have come down to us in the disguise of Aristotelian jargon. Therefore, any reconstruction of the arguments used by the Milesian must remain conjectural. Verbatim reconstruction is of course impossible. Nevertheless, the data, provided they are handled with care, allow us to catch glimpses of what the arguments of Anaximander must have looked like. The important thing is, however, that he did not just utter apodictic statements, but also tried to give arguments. This is what makes him the first philosopher.

a. The Boundless has No Origin

Aristotle reports a curious argument, which probably goes back to Anaximander, in which it is argued that the Boundless has no origin, because it is itself the origin. We would say that it looks more like a string of associations and word-plays than like a formal argument. It runs as follows: “Everything has an origin or is an origin. The Boundless has no origin. For then it would have a limit. Moreover, it is both unborn and immortal, being a kind of origin. For that which has become has also, necessarily, an end, and there is a termination to every process of destruction” (Physics 203b6-10, DK 12A15). The Greeks were familiar with the idea of the immortal Homeric gods. Anaximander added two distinctive features to the concept of divinity: his Boundless is an impersonal something (or “nature,” the Greek word is “phusis”), and it is not only immortal but also unborn. However, perhaps not Anaximander, but Thales should be credited with this new idea. Diogenes Laërtius ascribes to Thales the aphorism: “What is the divine? That which has no origin and no end” (DK 11A1 (36)). Similar arguments, within different contexts, are used by Melissus (DK 30B2[9]) and Plato (Phaedrus 245d1-6).

b. The Origin Must be Boundless

Several sources give another argument which is somehow the other way round and answers the question of why the origin should be boundless. In Aristotle’s version, it runs like this: “(The belief that there is something Boundless stems from) the idea that only then genesis and decay will never stop, when that from which is taken what has been generated, is boundless” (Physics 203b18-20, DK 12A15, other versions in DK12A14 and 12A17). In this argument, the Boundless seems to be associated with an inexhaustible source. Obviously, it is taken for granted that “genesis and decay will never stop,” and the Boundless has to guarantee the ongoing of the process, like an ever-floating fountain.

c. The “Long Since” Argument

A third argument is relatively long and somewhat strange. It turns on one key word (in Greek: “êdê”), which is here translated with “long since.” It is reproduced by Aristotle: “Some make this (namely, that which is additional to the elements) the Boundless, but not air or water, lest the others should be destroyed by one of them, being boundless; for they are opposite to one another (the air, for instance, is cold, the water wet, and the fire hot). If any of them should be boundless, it would long since have destroyed the others; but now there is, they say, something other from which they are all generated” (Physics 204b25-29, DK 12A16).

This is not only virtually the same argument as used by Plato in his Phaedo (72a12-b5), but even more interesting is that it was used almost 2500 years later by Friedrich Nietzsche in his attempts to prove his thesis of the Eternal Recurrence: “If the world had a goal, it would have been reached. If there were for it some unintended final state, this also must have been reached. If it were at all capable of a pausing and becoming fixed, if it were capable of “being,” if in the whole course of its becoming it possessed even for a moment this capability of “being,” then again all becoming would long since have come to an end.” Nietzsche wrote these words in his notebook in 1885, but already in Die Philosophie im tragischen Zeitalter der Griechen (1873), which was not published during his lifetime, he mentioned the argument and credited Anaximander with it.

4. The Fragment

The only existing fragment of Anaximander’s book (DK 12B1) is surrounded by all kinds of questions. The ancient Greeks did not use quotation marks, so that we cannot be sure where Simplicius, who has handed down the text to us, is still paraphrasing Anaximander and where he begins to quote him. The text is cast in indirect speech, even the part which most authors agree is a real quotation. One important word of the text (“allêlois,” here translated by “upon one another”) is missing in some manuscripts. As regards the interpretation of the fragment, it is heavily disputed whether it means to refer to Anaximander’s principle, the Boundless, or not. The Greek original has relative pronouns in the plural (here rendered by “whence” and “thence”), which makes it difficult to relate them to the Boundless. However, Simplicius’ impression that it is written in rather poetic words has been repeated in several ways by many authors. Therefore, we offer a translation, in which some poetic features of the original, such as chiasmus and alliteration have been imitated:

Whence things have their origin,
Thence also their destruction happens,
As is the order of things;
For they execute the sentence upon one another
– The condemnation for the crime –
In conformity with the ordinance of Time.

In the fourth and fifth line a more fluent translation is given for what is usually rendered rather cryptic by something like “giving justice and reparation to one another for their injustice.”

We may distinguish roughly two lines of interpretation, which may be labeled the “horizontal” and the “vertical.” The horizontal interpretation holds that in the fragment nothing is said about the relation of the things to the Boundless, whereas the vertical interpretation maintains that the fragment describes the relationship of the things to the Boundless. The upholders of the horizontal interpretation usually do not deny that Anaximander taught that all things are generated from the Boundless, but they simply hold that this is not what is said in the fragment. They argue that the fragment describes the battle between the elements (or of things in general), which accounts for the origin and destruction of things. The most obvious difficulty, however, for this “horizontal” interpretation is that it implies two cycles of becoming and decay: one from and into the Boundless, and the other caused by the mutual give and take of the elements or things in general. In other words, in the “horizontal” interpretation the Boundless is superfluous. This is the strongest argument in favor of the “vertical” interpretation, which holds that the fragment refers to the Boundless, notwithstanding the plural relative pronouns. According to the “vertical” interpretation, then, the Boundless should be regarded not only as the ever-flowing fountain from which everything ultimately springs, but also as the yawning abyss (as some say, comparable with Hesiod’s “Chaos”) into which everything ultimately perishes.

The suggestion has been raised that Anaximander’s formula in the first two lines of the fragment should have been the model for Aristotle’s definition of the “principle” (Greek: “archê”) of all things in Metaphysics 983b8. There is some sense in this suggestion. For what could be more natural for Aristotle than to borrow his definition of the notion of “archê,” which he uses to indicate the principle of the first presocratic philosophers, from Anaximander, the one who introduced the notion?

It is certainly important that we possess one text from Anaximander’s book. On the other hand, we must recognize that we know hardly anything of its original context, as the rest of the book has been lost. We do not know from which part of his book it is, nor whether it is a text the author himself thought crucial or just a line that caught one reader’s attention as an example of Anaximander’s poetic writing style. The danger exists that we are tempted to use this stray text – beautiful and mysterious as it is – in order to produce all kinds of profound interpretations that are hard to verify. Perhaps a better way of understanding what Anaximander has to say is to study carefully the doxography, which goes back to people like Aristotle and Theophrastus, who probably have had Anaximander’s book before their eyes, and who tried to reformulate what they thought were its central claims.

5. The Origin of the Cosmos

The Boundless seems to have played a role in Anaximander’s account of the origin of the cosmos. Its eternal movement is said to have caused the origin of the heavens. Elsewhere, it is said that “all the heavens and the worlds within them” have sprung from “some boundless nature.” A part of this process is described in rather poetic language, full of images, which seems to be idiosyncratic for Anaximander: “a germ, pregnant with hot and cold, was separated [or: separated itself] off from the eternal, whereupon out of this germ a sphere of fire grew around the vapor that surrounds the earth, like a bark round a tree” (DK 12A10). Subsequently, the sphere of fire is said to have fallen apart into several rings, and this event was the origin of sun, moon, and stars. There are authors who have, quite anachronistically, seen here a kind of foreshadowing of the Kant-Laplace theory of the origin of the solar system. Some sources even mention innumerable worlds (in time and/or in space), which looks like a plausible consequence of the Boundless as principle. But this is presumably a later theory, incorrectly read back into Anaximander.

6. Astronomy

At first sight, the reports on Anaximander’s astronomy look rather bizarre and obscure. Some authors even think that they are so confused that we should give up trying to offer a satisfying and coherent interpretation. The only way of understanding Anaximander’s astronomical ideas, however, is to take them seriously and treat them as such, that is, as astronomical ideas. It will appear that many of the features of his universe that look strange at first sight make perfect sense on closer inspection.

a. Speculative Astronomy

The astronomy of neighboring peoples, such as the Babylonians and the Egyptians, consists mainly of observations of the rising and disappearance of celestial bodies and of their paths across the celestial vault. These observations were made with the naked eye and with the help of some simple instruments as the gnomon. The Babylonians, in particular, were rather advanced observers. Archeologists have found an abundance of cuneiform texts on astronomical observations. In contrast, there exists only one report of an observation made by Anaximander, which concerns the date on which the Pleiades set in the morning. This is no coincidence, for Anaximander’s merits do not lie in the field of observational astronomy, unlike the Babylonians and the Egyptians, but in that of speculative astronomy. We may discern three of his astronomical speculations: (1) that the celestial bodies make full circles and pass also beneath the earth, (2) that the earth floats free and unsupported in space, and (3) that the celestial bodies lie behind one another. Notwithstanding their rather primitive outlook, these three propositions, which make up the core of Anaximander’s astronomy, meant a tremendous jump forward and constitute the origin of our Western concept of the universe.

b. The Celestial Bodies Make Full Circles

The idea that the celestial bodies, in their daily course, make full circles and thus pass also beneath the earth – from Anaximander’s viewpoint – is so self-evident to us that it is hard to understand how daring its introduction was. That the celestial bodies make full circles is not something he could have observed, but a conclusion he must have drawn. We would say that this is a conclusion that lies to hand. We can see – at the northern hemisphere, like Anaximander – the stars around the Polar star making full circles, and we can also observe that the more southerly stars sometimes disappear behind the horizon. We may argue that the stars of which we see only arcs in reality also describe full circles, just like those near the Polar star. As regards the sun and moon, we can observe that the arcs they describe are sometimes bigger and sometimes smaller, and we are able to predict exactly where they will rise the next day. Therefore, it seems not too bold a conjecture to say that these celestial bodies also describe full circles. Nevertheless, it was a daring conclusion, precisely because it necessarily entailed the concept of the earth hanging free and unsupported in space.

c. The Earth Floats Unsupported in Space

Anaximander boldly asserts that the earth floats free in the center of the universe, unsupported by water, pillars, or whatever. This idea means a complete revolution in our understanding of the universe. Obviously, the earth hanging free in space is not something Anaximander could have observed. Apparently, he drew this bold conclusion from his assumption that the celestial bodies make full circles. More than 2500 years later astronauts really saw the unsupported earth floating in space and thus provided the ultimate confirmation of Anaximander’s conception. The shape of the earth, according to Anaximander, is cylindrical, like a column-drum, its diameter being three times its height. We live on top of it. Some scholars have wondered why Anaximander chose this strange shape. The strangeness disappears, however, when we realize that Anaximander thought that the earth was flat and circular, as suggested by the horizon. For one who thinks, as Anaximander did, that the earth floats unsupported in the center of the universe, the cylinder-shape lies at hand.

d. Why the Earth Does Not Fall

We may assume that Anaximander somehow had to defend his bold theory of the free-floating, unsupported earth against the obvious question of why the earth does not fall. Aristotle’s version of Anaximander’s argument runs like this: “But there are some who say that it (namely, the earth) stays where it is because of equality, such as among the ancients Anaximander. For that which is situated in the center and at equal distances from the extremes, has no inclination whatsoever to move up rather than down or sideways; and since it is impossible to move in opposite directions at the same time, it necessarily stays where it is.” (De caelo 295b10ff., DK 12A26) Many authors have pointed to the fact that this is the first known example of an argument that is based on the principle of sufficient reason (the principle that for everything which occurs there is a reason or explanation for why it occurs, and why this way rather than that).

Anaximander’s argument returns in a famous text in the Phaedo (108E4 ff.), where Plato, for the first time in history, tries to express the sphericity of the earth. Even more interesting is that the same argument, within a different context, returns with the great protagonist of the principle of sufficient reason, Leibniz. In his second letter to Clarke, he uses an example, which he ascribes to Archimedes but which reminds us strongly of Anaximander: “And therefore Archimedes (…) in his book De aequilibrio, was obliged to make use of a particular case of the great Principle of a sufficient reason. He takes it for granted that if there be a balance in which everything is alike on both sides, and if equal weights are hung on the two ends of that balance, the whole will stay at rest. This is because there is no reason why one side should weigh down, rather than the other”.

One may doubt, however, whether the argument is not fallacious. Aristotle already thought the argument to be deceiving. He ridicules it by saying that according to the same kind of argument a hair, which was subject to an even pulling power from opposing sides, would not break, and that a man, being just as hungry as thirsty, placed in between food and drink, must necessarily remain where he is and starve. To him it was the wrong argument for the right proposition. Absolute propositions concerning the non-existence of things are always in danger of becoming falsified on closer investigation. They contain a kind of subjective aspect: “as far as I know.” Several authors, however, have said that Anaximander’s argument is clear and ingenious. Already at first sight this qualification sounds strange, for the argument evidently must be wrong, as the earth is not in the center of the universe, although it certainly is not supported by anything but gravity. Nevertheless, we have to wait until Newton for a better answer to the question why the earth does not fall.

e. The Celestial Bodies Lie Behind One Another

When Anaximander looked at the heaven, he imagined, for the first time in history, space. Anaximander’s vision implied depth in the universe, that is, the idea that the celestial bodies lie behind one another. Although it sounds simple, this is a remarkable idea, because it cannot be based on direct observation. We do not see depth in the universe. The more natural and primitive idea is that of the celestial vault, a kind of dome or tent, onto which the celestial bodies are attached, all of them at the same distance, like in a planetarium. One meets this kind of conception in Homer, when he speaks of the brazen or iron heaven, which is apparently conceived of as something solid, being supported by Atlas, or by pillars.

f. The Order of the Celestial Bodies

Anaximander placed the celestial bodies in the wrong order. He thought that the stars were nearest to the earth, then followed the moon, and the sun farthest away. Some authors have wondered why Anaximander made the stars the nearest celestial bodies, for he should have noticed the occurrence of star-occultations by the moon. This is a typical anachronism, which shows that it not easy to look at the phenomena with Anaximander’s eyes. Nowadays, we know that the stars are behind the moon, and thus we speak of star-occultation when we see a star disappear behind the moon. But Anaximander had no reason at all, from his point of view, to speak of a star-occultation when he saw a star disappear when the moon was at the same place. So it is a petitio principii to say that for him occultations of stars were easy to observe. Perhaps he observed stars disappearing and appearing again, but he did not observe – could not see it as – the occultation of the star, for that interpretation did not fit his paradigm. The easiest way to understand his way of looking at it – if he observed the phenomenon at all – is that he must have thought that the brighter light of the moon outshines the much smaller light of the star for a while. Anaximander’s order of the celestial bodies is clearly that of increasing brightness. Unfortunately, the sources do not give further information of his considerations at this point.

g. The Celestial Bodies as Wheels

A peculiar feature of Anaximander’s astronomy is that the celestial bodies are said to be like chariot wheels (the Greek words for this image are presumably his own). The rims of these wheels are of opaque vapor, they are hollow, and filled with fire. This fire shines through at openings in the wheels, and this is what we see as the sun, the moon, or the stars. Sometimes, the opening of the sun wheel closes: then we observe an eclipse. The opening of the moon wheel regularly closes and opens again, which accounts for the phases of the moon. This image of the celestial bodies as huge wheels seems strange at first sight, but there is a good reason for it. There is no doxographic evidence of it, but it is quite certain that the question of why the celestial bodies do not fall upon the earth must have been as serious a problem to Anaximander as the question of why the earth does not fall. The explanation of the celestial bodies as wheels, then, provides an answer to both questions. The celestial bodies have no reason whatsoever to move otherwise than in circles around the earth, as each point on them is always as far from the earth as any other. It is because of reasons like this that for ages to come, when Anaximander’s concept of the universe had been replaced by a spherical one, the celestial bodies were thought of as somehow attached to crystalline or ethereal sphere-shells, and not as free-floating bodies.

Many authors, following Diels, make the image of the celestial wheels more difficult than is necessary. They say that the light of a celestial bodies shines through the openings of its wheel “as through the nozzle of a bellows.” This is an incorrect translation of an expression that probably goes back to Anaximander himself. The image of a bellows, somehow connected to a celestial wheel, tends to complicate rather than elucidate the meaning of the text. If we were to understand that every celestial body had such a bellows, the result would be hundreds of nozzles (or pipes), extending from the celestial wheels towards the earth. Anaximander’s intention, however, can be better understood not as an image, but as a comparison of the light of the celestial bodies with that of lightning. Lightning, according to Anaximander, is a momentary flash of light against a dark cloud. The light of a celestial body is like a permanent beam of lightning fire that originates from the opaque cloudy substance of the celestial wheel.

h. The Distances of the Celestial Bodies

The doxography gives us some figures about the dimensions of Anaximander’s universe: the sun wheel is 27 or 28 times the earth, and the moon wheel is 19 times the earth. More than a century ago, two great scholars, Paul Tannery and Hermann Diels, solved the problem of Anaximander’s numbers. They suggested that the celestial wheels were one unit thick, this unit being the diameter of the earth. The full series, they argued, had to be: 9 and 10 for the stars, 18 and 19 for the moon, and 27 and 28 for the sun. These numbers are best understood as indicating the distances of the celestial bodies to the earth. In others words, they indicate the radii of concentric circles, made by the celestial wheels, with the earth as the center. See Figure 1, a plane view of Anaximander’s universe.


These numbers cannot be based on observation. In order to understand their meaning, we have to look at Hesiod’s Theogony 722-725, where it is said that a brazen anvil would take nine days to fall from heaven to earth before it arrives on the tenth day. It is not a bold guess to suppose that Anaximander knew this text. The agreement with his numbers is too close to neglect, for the numbers 9 and 10 are exactly those extrapolated for Anaximander’s star wheel. Hesiod can be seen as a forerunner to Anaximander, for he tried to imagine the distance to the heaven. In the Greek counting system Hesiod’s numbers should be taken to mean “a very long time.” Thus, Troy was conquered in the tenth year after having stood the siege for nine years; and Odysseus scoured the seas for nine years before reaching his homeland in the tenth year. We may infer that Anaximander, with his number 9 (1 x 3 x 3) for the star ring, simply was trying to say that the stars are very far away. Now the numbers 18 and 27 can easily be interpreted as “farther” (2 x 3 x 3, for the moon ring) and “farthest” (3 x 3 x 3, for the sun ring). And this is exactly what we should expect one to say, who had discovered that the image of the celestial vault was wrong but that the celestial bodies were behind one another, and who wished to share this new knowledge with his fellow citizens in a language they were able to understand.

i. A Representation of Anaximander’s Universe

Although it is not attested in the doxography, we may assume that Anaximander himself drew a map of the universe, like that in figure 1. The numbers, 9, 10, 18, etc., can easily be understood as instructions for making such a map. Although Diogenes Laërtius reports that he made a “sphere,” the drawing or construction of a three-dimensional model must be considered to have been beyond Anaximander’s abilities. On the other hand, it is quite easy to explain the movements of the celestial bodies with the help of a plan view, by making broad gestures, describing circles in the air, and indicating direction, speed, and inclination with your hands, as is said of a quarrel between Anaxagoras and Oenopides (DK 41A2).

Almost nothing of Anaximander’s opinions about the stars has been handed down to us. Probably the best way to imagine them is as a conglomerate of several wheels, each of which has one or more holes, through which the inner fire shines, which we see as stars. The most likely sum-total of these star wheels is a sphere. The only movement of these star wheels is a rotation around the earth from east to west, always at the same speed, and always at the same place relative to one another in the heaven. The sun wheel shows the same rotation from east to west as the stars, but there are two differences. The first is that the speed of the rotation of the sun wheel is not the same as that of the stars. We can see this phenomenon by observing how the sun lags behind by approximately one degree per day. The second difference is that the sun wheel as a whole changes its position in the heaven. In summer it moves towards the north along the axis of the heaven and we see a large part of it above the horizon, whereas in winter we only observe a small part of the sun wheel, as it moves towards the south. This movement of the sun wheel accounts for the seasons. The same holds mutatis mutandis for the moon. Today, we use to describe this movement of the sun (and mutatis mutandis of the moon and the planets) as a retrograde movement, from west to east, which is a counter-movement to the daily rotation from east to west. In terms of Anaximander’s ancient astronomy it is more appropriate and less anachronistic to describe it as a slower movement of the sun wheel from east to west. The result is that we see different stars in different seasons, until the sun, at the end of a year, reaches its old position between the stars.

Due to the inclination of the axis of the heaven, the celestial bodies do not circle around the earth in the same plane as the earth’s – flat – surface, but are tilted. This inclination amounts to about 38.5 degrees when measured at Delphi, the world’s navel. The earth being flat, the inclination must be the same all over its surface. This tilting of the heaven’s axis must have been one of the biggest riddles of the universe. Why is it tilted at all? Who or what is responsible for this phenomenon? And why is it tilted just the way it is? Unfortunately, the doxography on Anaximander has nothing to tell us about this problem. Later, other Presocratics like Empedocles, Diogenes of Apollonia, and Anaxagoras discuss the tilting of the heavens.

Although there exists a report that says the contrary, it is not likely that Anaximander was acquainted with the obliquity of the ecliptic, which is the yearly path of the sun along the stars. The ecliptic is a concept which belongs to the doctrine of a spherical earth within a spherical universe. A three-dimensional representation of Anaximander’s universe is given in Figures 2 and 3.


7. Map of the World

Anaximander is said to have made the first map of the world. Although this map has been lost, we can imagine what it must have looked like, because Herodotus, who has seen such old maps, describes them. Anaximander’s map must have been circular, like the top of his drum-shaped earth. The river Ocean surrounded it. The Mediterranean Sea was in the middle of the map, which was divided into two halves by a line that ran through Delphi, the world’s navel. The northern half was called “Europe,” the southern half “Asia.” The habitable world (Greek: “oikoumenê”) consisted of two relatively small strips of land to the north and south of the Mediterranean Sea (containing Spain, Italy, Greece, and Asia Minor on the one side, and Egypt and Libya on the other side), together with the lands to the east of the Mediterranean Sea: Palestine, Assyria, Persia, and Arabia. The lands to the north of this small “habitable world” were the cold countries where mythical people lived. The lands to the south of it were the hot countries of the black burnt people.

8. Biology

The doxography tells us that according to Anaximander life originated from the moisture that covered the earth before it was dried up by the sun. The first animals were a kind of fish, with a thorny skin (the Greek word is the same that was used for the metaphor “the bark of a tree” in Anaximander’s cosmology). Originally, men were generated from fishes and were fed in the manner of a viviparous shark. The reason for this is said to be that the human child needs long protection in order to survive. Some authors have, rather anachronistically, seen in these scattered statements a proto-evolutionist theory.

9. Conclusion

It is no use trying to unify the information on Anaximander into one all-compassing and consistent whole. His work will always remain truncated, like the mutilated and decapitated statue that has been found at the market-place of Miletus and that bears his name. Nevertheless, by what we know of him, we may say that he was one of the greatest minds that ever lived. By speculating and arguing about the “Boundless” he was the first metaphysician. By drawing a map of the world he was the first geographer. But above all, by boldly speculating about the universe he broke with the ancient image of the celestial vault and became the discoverer of the Western world-picture.

10. References and Further Reading

  • Diels, H. and W. Kranz, Die Fragmente der Vorsokratiker. Zürich/Hildesheim 1964
    • The standard collection of the texts of and the doxography on Anaximander and the other presocratics.
  • Guthrie, W.K.C. A History of Greek Philosophy I, The Earlier Presocratics and the Pythagoreans. London/New York 1985 (Cambridge 1962)
  • Kirk, G.S., J.E. Raven, and M. Schofield, The Presocratic Philosophers, Cambridge 1995 (1957)
    • The above two works each have a good survey of Anaximander’s thoughts in the context of ancient Greek philosophy, with translations of the most important doxography.
  • Kahn, C.H. Anaximander and the Origins of Greek Cosmology. New York 1960 (Indianapolis/Cambridge 1994)
    • A classical study on Anaximander’s cosmology and his fragment, also with many translations.
  • Furley, D.J. and R.E. Allen, eds. Studies in Presocratic Philosophy, Vol. I, The Beginnings of Philosophy. New York/London 1970
    • Contains many interesting articles on Anaximander by different authors.
  • Couprie, D.L., R. Hahn, and G. Naddaf, Anaximander in Context. Albany 2003
    • A volume with three recent studies on Anaximander.
  • Kahn, C.H. “Anaximander and the Arguments Concerning the Apeiron at Physics 203b4-1.” in: Festschrift E. Kapp, Hamburg 1958, pp.19-29.
  • Stokes, M.C. “Anaximander’s Argument.” in: R.A. Shiner & J. King-Farlow, eds., New Essays on Plato and the Presocratics. 1976, pp.1-22.
    • Two articles on some of Anaximander’s arguments.
  • Dicks, D.R. “Solstices, Equinoxes, and the Presocratics,” The Journal of Hellenic Studies 86. 1966, pp.26-40
  • Kahn, C.H. “On Early Greek Astronomy.” The Journal of Hellenic Studies 90. 1970, pp.99-116
    • Two conflicting articles on Anaximander’s astronomy.
  • Furley, D.J. The Greek Cosmologists, Volume I, Cambridge 1987
  • Dicks, D.R. Early Greek Astronomy to Aristotle . Ithaca/New York 1970
    • Two good books on early Greek astronomy.
  • Bodnár, I.M. “Anaximander’s Rings,” Classical Quarterly 38. 1988, pp. 49-51
  • O’Brien, D. “Anaximander’s Measurements,” The Classical Quarterly 17. 1967, pp.423-432
    • Two articles on important details of Anaximander’s astronomy.
  • McKirahan, R. “Anaximander’s Infinite Worlds,” in A. Preus, ed., Essays in Ancient Greek Philosophy VI: Before Plato, Albany 2001, pp. 49-65
    • A recent article on ‘innumerable worlds.’
  • Heidel, W.A. The Frame of the Ancient Greek Maps. With a Discussion of the Discovery of the Sphericity of the Earth. New York 1937
    • An old but still valuable book on Anaximander’s map of the world.
  • Loenen, J.H.M.M. “Was Anaximander an Evolutionist?” Mnemosyme 4. 1954, pp.215-232
    • A discussion of Anaximander’s biology.
  • West, M.L. Early Greek Philosophy and the Orient. Oxford 1971
    • A discussion of possible Iranian influence on Anaximander.
  • Conche, M. Anaximandre. Fragments et Témoignages. Paris 1991
    • The best book in French.
  • Classen, C.J. Ansätze. Beiträge zum Verständnis der frühgriechischen Philosophie. Würzburg/Amsterdam 1986
    • The best book in German.

Author Information

Dirk L. Couprie
The Netherlands

Theodor Adorno (1903—1969)

Photo by Jeremy J. ShapiroTheodor Adorno was one of the foremost continental philosophers of the twentieth century. Although he wrote on a wide range of subjects, his fundamental concern was human suffering—especially modern societies’ effects upon the human condition. He was influenced most notably by Hegel, Marx, and Nietzsche. He was associated with The Institute for Social Research, in the Frankfurt School, which was a social science and cultural intellectual hub for promoting socialism and overthrowing capitalism. It was responsible for the creation of the philosophical form called critical theory, which takes the stand that oppression is created through politics, economics, culture, and materialism, but is maintained most significantly through consciousness. Therefore the focus of action must come from consciousness. The Institute of Social Research deviated from orthodox Marxism in its argument that social and cultural factors played as important a role as economics in oppression.

Adorno made many contributions to critical theory, notably his view that reason had become entangled with domination and suffering. Adorno coined the tern ‘identity thinking’ to describe the process of categorical thought in modern society, by which everything becomes an example of an abstract, and thus nothing individual in its actual specific uniqueness is allowed to exist. He lamented that the human race had gone from understanding the world through myth to understanding it through scientific reasoning, but that this latter ‘enlightenment’ was the same as understanding the world through myth. Both modes create a viewpoint that the subjective must conform to an outside world to which it has no control. Within this argument, Adorno saw morality as being stuck within this powerless subjective: in a world that values only recognizable facts, morality becomes nihilistic, a mere prejudice of individual subjectivity. Adorno is also known for his critique of the ‘the culture industry.’ He felt that the entertainment industry of modern society is just as mechanical, formulaic, and dominating as the workplace. He argued that humans in modern society are programmed at work and in their leisure, and though they seek to escape the monotony of their workplace, they are merely changing to another piece of the machine – from producer to consumer. There is no chance of becoming free individuals who can take part in the creation of society, whether at work or play.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Philosophical Influences and Motivation
  3. Identity Thinking and Instrumental Reason
  4. Morality and Nihilism
  5. The Culture Industry
  6. Conclusion and General Criticisms
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Biography

Theodor Wiesengrund Adorno was born in 1903 to relatively affluent parents in central Germany. His mother was a gifted singer, of Italian descent, and his father was a Jewish wine merchant. Adorno’s partial Jewish status was to have an immeasurable effect upon his life and philosophical works. He was an academically and musically gifted child. Initially, it appeared that Adorno was destined for a musical career. During the early to mid 1920s Adorno studied music composition under Alban Berg in Vienna and his talent was recognized by the likes of Berg and Schoenberg. However, in the late 1920s, Adorno joined the faculty of the University of Frankfurt and devoted the greatest part of his considerable talent and energy to the study and teaching of philosophy. Adorno’s Jewish heritage forced him to eventually seek exile from Nazi Germany, initially registering as a doctoral student at Merton College, Oxford and then, as a member of the University of Frankfurt’s Institute for Social Research, in New York concluding his exile in Southern California. Adorno did not complete his Oxford doctorate and appeared to be persistently unhappy in his exilic condition. Along with other members of the Institute for Social Research, Adorno returned to the University of Frankfurt immediately after the completion of the war, taking up a professorial chair in philosophy and sociology. Adorno remained a professor at the University of Frankfurt until his death in 1969. He was married to Gretel and they had no children.

2. Philosophical Influences and Motivation

Adorno is generally recognized within the Continental tradition of philosophy as being one of the foremost philosophers of the 20th Century. His collected works comprise some twenty-three volumes. He wrote on subjects ranging from musicology  to metaphysics and his writings span to include such things as philosophical analyses of Hegelian metaphysics, a critical study of the astrology column of the Los Angeles Times, and jazz. In terms of both style and content, Adorno’s writings defy convention. In seeking to attain a clear understanding of the works of any philosopher, one should begin by asking oneself what motivated his or her philosophical labors. What was Adorno attempting to achieve through his philosophical writings? Adorno’s philosophy is fundamentally concerned with human suffering. It is founded upon a central moral conviction: that the development of human civilization has been achieved through the systematic repression of nature and the consolidation of insidiously oppressive social and political systems, to which we are all exposed. The shadow of human suffering falls across practically all of Adorno’s writings. Adorno considered his principal task to be that of testifying to the persistence of such conditions and thereby, at best, retaining the possibility that such conditions might be changed for the better. The central tension in Adorno’s diagnosis of what he termed ‘damaged life’ consists in the unrelentingly critical character of his evaluation of the effects of modern societies upon their inhabitants, coupled with a tentative, but absolutely essential, commitment to a belief in the possibility of the elimination of unnecessary suffering. As in the work of all genuine forms of critical philosophy, Adorno’s otherwise very bleak diagnosis of modernity is necessarily grounded within a tentative hope for a better world.

Adorno’s philosophy is typically considered to have been most influenced by the works of three previous German philosophers: Hegel, Marx, and Nietzsche. In addition, his association with the Institute of Social Research profoundly affected the development of Adorno’s thought. I shall begin by discussing this last, before briefly summarizing the influence of the first three.

The Institute for Social Research was established at the University of Frankfurt in 1923. The Institute, or the ‘Frankfurt School’, as it was later to become known, was an inter-disciplinary body comprising specialists in such fields as philosophy, economics, political science, legal theory, psychoanalysis, and the study of cultural phenomena such as music, film, and mass entertainment. The establishment of The Frankfurt School was financed by the son of a wealthy grain merchant who wished to create a western European equivalent to the Marx-Engels Institute in Moscow. The Intellectual labor of the Institute in Frankfurt thus explicitly aimed at contributing to the overthrow of capitalism and the establishment of socialism.

However, from 1930 onwards, under the Directorship of Max Horkheimer, the work of the Frankfurt School began to show subtle but highly significant deviations from orthodox Marxism. Principally, the School began to question, and ultimately reject, the strict economic determinism to which orthodox Marxism was enthralled at the time. This coincided with a firm belief amongst the members of the School that social phenomena, such as culture, mass entertainment, education, and the family played a direct role in maintaining oppression. Marxists had typically dismissed the importance of such phenomena on the grounds that they were mere reflections of the underlying economic basis of the capitalist mode of production. An undue concern for such phenomena was thus generally thought of as, at best, a distraction from the real task of overthrowing capitalism, at worst a veritable hindrance. In contrast, the Frankfurt School argued that such phenomena were fundamentally important, in their own right. The Frankfurt School thus challenged the economically-centric character of Marxism. The Frankfurt School’s rejection of economic determinism and interest in the social and cultural planes of human oppression culminated in a far more circumspect appraisal of the likelihood of capitalism’s demise. The Frankfurt School rejected the Marx’s belief in the economic inevitability of capitalism experiencing cataclysmic economic crises. The Frankfurt School continued to argue that capitalism remained an oppressive system, but increasingly viewed the system as far more adaptable and robust than Marxists had given it credit for. The Frankfurt School came to portray capitalism as potentially capable of averting its own demise indefinitely. The final break with orthodox Marxism occurred with the Frankfurt School’s coming to condemn the Soviet Union as a politically oppressive system. Politically the Frankfurt School sought to position itself equidistant from both Soviet socialism and liberal capitalism. The greater cause of human emancipation appeared to call for the relentless criticism of both systems.

The Frankfurt School’s contribution to the cause of human emancipation consisted in the production of primarily theoretical studies of social and cultural phenomena. This brand of theoretical study is generally referred to as ‘critical theory’. Although originating with the Frankfurt School, critical theory has now achieved the status of a distinct and separate form of philosophical study, taught and practiced in university departments throughout the world. What, then, are the central philosophical characteristics of critical theory and to what extent does Adorno’s philosophy share these characteristics? Critical theory is founded upon an unequivocal normative basis. Taking a cold, hard look at the sheer scale of human misery and suffering experienced during the 20th century in particular, critical theory aims to testify to the extent and ultimate causes of the calamitous state of human affairs. The ultimate causes of such suffering are, of course, to be located in the material, political, economic, and social conditions which human beings simultaneously both produce and are exposed to. However, critical theory refrains from engaging in any direct, political action. Rather, critical theorists argue that suffering and domination are maintained, to a significant degree, at the level of consciousness and the various cultural institutions and phenomena that sustain that consciousness. Critical theory restricts itself to engaging with such phenomena and aims to show the extent to which ‘uncritical theory’ contributes to the perpetuation of human suffering. Critical theory has thus been defined as ‘a tradition of social thought that, in part at least, takes its cue from its opposition to the wrongs and ills of modern societies on the one hand, and the forms of theorizing that simply go along with or seek to legitimate those societies on the other hand.’ (J.M.Bernstein, 1995:11)

Max Horkheimer, the Director of the Frankfurt School, contrasted critical theory with what he referred to as ‘traditional theory’. For Horkheimer the paradigm of traditional theory consisted in those forms of social science that modeled themselves upon the methodologies of natural science. Such ‘positivistic’ forms of social science attempted to address and account for human and social phenomena in terms analogous to the natural scientist’s study of material nature. Thus, legitimate knowledge of social reality was considered to be attainable through the application of objective forms of data gathering, yielding, ultimately, quantifiable data. A strict adherence to such a positivist methodology entailed the exclusion or rejection of any phenomena not amenable to such procedures. Ironically, a strict concern for acquiring purely objective knowledge of human social action ran the very real risk of excluding from view certain aspects or features of the object under study. Horkheimer criticized positivism on two grounds. First, that it falsely represented human social action. Second, that the representation of social reality produced by positivism was politically conservative, helping to support the status quo, rather than challenging it. The first criticism consisted of the argument that positivism systematically failed to appreciate the extent to which the so-called social facts it yielded did not exist ‘out there’, so to speak, but were themselves mediated by socially and historically mediated human consciousness. Positivism ignored the role of the ‘observer’ in the constitution of social reality and thereby failed to consider the historical and social conditions affecting the representation of social facts. Positivism falsely represented the object of study by reifying social reality as existing objectively and independently of those whose action and labor actually produced those conditions. Horkheimer argued, in contrast, that critical theory possessed a reflexive element lacking in the positivistic traditional theory. Critical theory attempted to penetrate the veil of reification so as to accurately determine the extent to which the social reality represented by traditional theory was partial and, in important respects, false. False precisely because of traditional theory’s failure to discern the inherently social and historical character of social reality. Horkheimer expressed this point thus: “the facts which our senses present to us are socially preformed in two ways: through the historical character of the object perceived and through the historical character of the perceiving organ. Both are not simply natural; they are shaped by human activity, and yet the individual perceives himself as receptive and passive in the act of perception.” Horkheimer’s emphasis upon the detrimental consequences of the representational fallacies of positivism for the individual is at the heart of his second fundamental criticism of traditional theory. Horkheimer argues that traditional theory is politically conservative in two respects. First, traditional theory falsely ‘naturalizes’ contingent social reality, thereby obscuring the extent to which social reality emanates not from nature, but from the relationship between human action and nature. This has the effect of circumscribing a general awareness of the possibility of change. Individuals come to see themselves as generally confronted by an immutable and intransigent social world, to which they must adapt and conform if they wish to survive. Second, and following on from this, conceiving of reality in these terms serves to unduly pacify individuals. Individuals come to conceive of themselves as relatively passive recipients of the social reality, falsely imbued with naturalistic characteristics, that confronts them. We come to conceive of the potential exercise of our individual and collective will as decisively limited by existing conditions, as we find them, so to speak. The status quo is falsely perceived as a reflection of some natural, inevitable order.

Adorno was a leading member of the Frankfurt School. His writings are widely considered as having made a highly significant contribution to the development of critical theory. Adorno unequivocally shared the moral commitment of critical theory. He also remained deeply suspicious of positivistic social science and directed a large part of his intellectual interests to a critical analysis of the philosophical basis of this approach. He shared the Frankfurt School’s general stance in respect of orthodox Marxism and economic determinism, in particular. Adorno persistently criticized any and all philosophical perspectives which posited the existence of some ahistorical and immutable basis to social reality. He thus shared Horkheimer’s criticisms of any and all attempts at ‘naturalizing’ social reality. However, Adorno ultimately proceeded to explicate an account of the entwinement of reason and domination that was to have a profound effect upon the future development of critical theory. In stark contrast to the philosophical convention which counter-posed reason and domination, whereby the latter is to be confronted with and dissolved by the application of reason so as to achieve enlightenment, Adorno was to argue that reason itself had become entangled with domination. Reason had become a tool and device for domination and suffering. This led Adorno to reassess the prospects for overcoming domination and suffering. Put simply, Adorno was far more sanguine in respect of the prospects for realizing critical theory’s aims than other members of the Frankfurt School. Adorno was perhaps the most despairing of the Frankfurt School intellectuals.

The Frankfurt School provided Adorno with an intellectual ‘home’ in which to work. The development of Adorno’s thought was to have a profound effect upon the future development of critical theory. Adorno’s philosophy itself owed much to the works of Hegel, Marx, and Nietzsche. The greater part of Adorno’s thought, his account of reason, his understanding of the role of consciousness in the constitution of reality, and his vision of domination and human suffering are all imbued with the thought of these earlier philosophers. Adorno’s philosophy consists, in large part, of a dialogue with these philosophers and their particular, and very different, visions of the formation and deformation of social reality. I shall briefly consider each in turn.

Hegel’s philosophy is notoriously abstruse and difficult to fully understand. There are aspects of Hegel’s thought which Adorno consistently criticized and rejected. However, what Adorno did take from Hegel, amongst other things, was a recognition that philosophy was located within particular socio-historical conditions. The objects of philosophical study and, indeed, the very exercise of philosophy itself, were social and historical phenomena. The object of philosophy was not the discovery of timeless, immutable truths, but rather to provide interpretations of a socially constituted reality. Hegel was also to insist that understanding human behavior was only possible through engaging with the distinct socio-historical conditions, of which human beings were themselves a part. In stark contrast to Immanuel Kant’s conception of the self-constituting character of human consciousness, Hegel argued that human consciousness was mediated by the socio-historical conditions of specific individuals. Further, Hegel argued that the development of each individual’s self-consciousness could only proceed through relations with other individuals: attaining a consciousness of oneself entailed the existence of others. No one single human being was capable of achieving self-consciousness and exercising reason by herself. Finally, Hegel also argued that the constitution of social reality proceeded through subjects’ relationship with the ‘objective’, material realm. In stark contrast to positivism, an Hegelian inspired understanding of social reality accorded a necessary and thoroughly active role to the subject. Hegel draws our attention to our own role in producing the objective reality with which positivists confront us. Adorno was in basic agreement with all of the above aspects of Hegel’s philosophy. A recognition of philosophy as a socio-historical phenomenon and an acceptance of the socio-historical conditions of human consciousness remained central to Adorno’s thought.

However, Adorno differed from Hegel most unequivocally on one particularly fundamental point. Hegel notoriously posited the existence of some ultimately constitutive ground of human reality, in the metaphysical form ‘Geist’, or ‘Spirit’. Hegel ultimately viewed reality as a manifestation of some a priori form of consciousness, analogous to a god. In conceiving of material reality as emanating from consciousness, Hegel was expounding a form of philosophical Idealism. Adorno would never accept this aspect of Hegel’s thought. Adorno consistently argued that any such recourse to some a priori, ultimately ahistorical basis to reality was itself best seen as conditioned by material forces and conditions. For Adorno, the abstractness of such philosophical arguments actually revealed the unduly abstract character of specific social conditions. Adorno could thereby criticize Hegel for not according enough importance to the constitutive character of distinct social and historical conditions.

Such criticisms reveal the influence of Karl Marx’s thought upon the development of Adorno’s thought. Marx has famously been described as standing Hegel on his head. Where Hegel ultimately viewed consciousness as determining the form and content of material conditions, Marx argued that material conditions ultimately determined, or fundamentally conditioned, human consciousness. For Marx, the ultimate grounds of social reality and the forms of human consciousness required for the maintenance of this reality were economic conditions. Marx argued that, within capitalist societies, human suffering and domination originated in the economic relations characteristic of capitalism. Put simply, Marx argued that those who produced economic wealth, the proletariat, were alienated from the fruits of their labor as a result of having to sell their labor to those who controlled the forces of production: those who owned the factories and the like, the bourgeoisie. The disproportionate wealth and power of the bourgeoisie resulted from the extraction of an economic surplus from the product of the proletariat’s labor, in the form of profit. Those who owned the most, thus did the least to attain that wealth, whereas those who had the least, did the most. Capitalism was thus considered to be fundamentally based upon structural inequality and entailed one class of people treating another class as mere instruments of their own will. Under capitalism, Marx argued, human beings could never achieve their full, creative potential as a result of being bound to fundamentally alienating, dehumanizing forms of economic production. Capitalism ultimately reduces everyone, bourgeoisie and proletariat alike, to mere appendages of the machine.

Adorno shared Marx’s view of capitalism as a fundamentally dehumanizing system. Adorno’s commitment to Marxism caused him, for example, to retain a lifelong suspicion of those accounts of liberalism founded upon abstract notions of formal equality and the prioritization of economic and property rights. Adorno’s account of domination was thus deeply indebted to Marx’s account of domination. In addition, in numerous articles and larger works, Adorno was to lay great stress on Marx’s specific understanding of capitalism and the predominance of exchange value as the key determinant of worth in capitalist societies. As will be shown later, the concept of exchange value was central to Adorno’s analysis of culture and entertainment in capitalist societies. Marx’s account of capitalism enabled critical theory and Adorno to go beyond a mere assertion of the social grounds of reality and the constitutive role of the subject in the production of that reality. Adorno was not simply arguing that all human phenomena were socially determined. Rather, he was arguing that an awareness of the extent of domination required both an appreciation of the social basis of human life coupled with the ability to qualitatively distinguish between various social formations in respect of the degree of human suffering prerequisite for their maintenance. To a significant degree, Marx’s account of capitalism provided Adorno with the means for achieving this. However, as I argued above, Adorno shared the Frankfurt School’s suspicions of the more economically determinist aspects of Marx’s thought. Beyond even this, Adorno’s account of reason and domination ultimately drew upon philosophical sources that were distinctly non-Marxian in character.

Foremost amongst these were the writings of Friedrich Nietzsche. Of all the critical theorists, the writings of Nietzsche have exerted the most influence upon Adorno in two principal respects. First, Adorno basically shared the importance which Nietzsche attributed to the autonomous individual. However, Nietzsche’s account of the autonomous individual differs in several highly important respects from that typically associated with the rationalist tradition, within which the concept of the autonomous individual occupied a central place. In contrast to those philosophers, such as Kant, who tended to characterize autonomy in terms of the individual gaining a systematic control over her desires and acting in accordance with formal, potentially universalizable rules and procedures, Nietzsche placed far greater importance upon spontaneous, creative human action as constituting the pinnacle of human possibility. Nietzsche considered the ‘rule-bound’ account of autonomy to be little more than a form of self-imposed heteronomy. For Nietzsche, reason exercised in this fashion amounted to a form of self-domination. One might say that Nietzsche espoused an account of individual autonomy as aesthetic self-creation. Being autonomous entailed treating one’s life as a potential work of art. This account of autonomy exercised an important and consistent influence upon Adorno’s own understanding of autonomy. Furthermore, Adorno’s concern for the autonomous individual was absolutely central to his moral and political philosophy.

Adorno argued that a large part of what was so morally wrong with complex, capitalist societies consisted in the extent to which, despite their professed individualist ideology, these societies actually frustrated and thwarted individuals’ exercise of autonomy. Adorno argued, along with other intellectuals of that period, that capitalist society was a mass, consumer society, within which individuals were categorized, subsumed, and governed by highly restrictive social, economic and, political structures that had little interest in specific individuals. For Adorno, the majority of peoples’ lives were lead within mass, collective entities and structures, from school to the workplace and beyond. Being a true individual, in the broadly Nietzschean sense of that term, was considered to be nigh on impossible under these conditions.

In addition to this aspect of Nietzsche’s influence upon Adorno, the specific understanding which Adorno developed in respect of the relationship between reason and domination owed much to Nietzsche. Nietzsche refused to endorse any account of reason as a thoroughly benign, or even disinterested force. Nietzsche argued that the development and deployment of reason was driven by power. Above all else, Nietzsche conceived of reason as a principal means of domination; a tool for dominating nature and others. Nietzsche vehemently criticized any and all non-adversarial accounts of reason. On this reading, reason is a symptom of, and tool for, domination and hence not a means for overcoming or remedying domination. Adorno came to share some essential features of this basically instrumentalist account of reason. The book he wrote with Max Horkheimer, Dialectic of Enlightenment, which is a foremost text of critical theory, grapples with precisely this account of reason. However, Adorno refrained from simply taking over Nietzsche’s account in its entirety. Most importantly, Adorno basically shared Nietzsche’s account of the instrumentalization of reason. However Adorno insisted against Nietzsche that the transformation of reason was less an expression of human nature and more a consequence of contingent social conditions which might, conceivably, be changed. Where Nietzsche saw domination as an essential feature of human society, Adorno argued that domination was contingent and potentially capable of being overcome. Obviously, letting go of this particular aspiration would be intellectually cataclysmic to the emancipatory aims of critical theory. Adorno uses Nietzsche in an attempt to bolster, not undermine, critical theory.

Adorno considered philosophy to be a social and historical exercise, bound by both the past and existing traditions and conditions. Hence, it would be fair to say that many philosophical streams run into the river of Adorno’s own writings. However, the works of Hegel, Marx, and Nietzsche exercised a profound and lasting influence upon the form and content of Adorno’s work. It is now time to move on and engage with certain key aspects of Adorno’s philosophical writings. I shall focus upon three aspects of Adorno’s writings so as to provide a clear summary of the scope and substance of Adorno’s philosophy: his understanding of reason and what he termed ‘identity thinking’; his moral philosophy and discussion of nihilism; and finally, his analysis of culture and its effects upon capitalist societies.

3. Identity Thinking and Instrumental Reason

Adorno unequivocally rejected the view that philosophy and the exercise of reason afforded access to a realm of pristine thoughts and reality. In stark contrast to those rationalists such as Plato, who posited the existence of an ultimate realm of reality and truth underlying the manifest world, Adorno argued that philosophical concepts actually expressed the social structures within which they were found. Adorno consistently argued that there is no such thing as pure thought: thinking is a socio-historical form of activity. Hence, Adorno argued that there did not exist a single standpoint from which ‘truth’ could be universally discerned. To many this may sound like mere philosophical relativism: the doctrine which claims that all criteria of truth are socially and historically relative and contingent. However, the charge of relativism has rarely been leveled at Adorno’s work. Relativists are typically accused of espousing a largely uncritical form of theorizing. A belief in the social contingency of truth criteria appears to exclude the possibility of criticizing social practices and beliefs by recourse to practices and beliefs alien to that society. Further, their commitment to the notion of contingency has frequently resulted in philosophical relativists being accused of unduly affirming the legitimacy claims of any given social practice or belief without subjecting them to a sufficiently critical scrutiny. No such criticisms have been made of Adorno’s work. Adorno’s analysis of philosophical concepts aims to uncover the extent to which such concepts are predicated upon, and manifestations of, relations of power and domination.

Adorno coined the term ‘identity thinking’ to refer to that form of thinking which is the most expressive philosophical manifestation of power and domination. Drawing a contrast between his own form of dialectical thinking and identity thinking, Adorno wrote that “dialectics seek to say what something is, while ‘identarian’ thinking says what something comes under, what it exemplifies or represents, and what, accordingly, it is not itself.” (1990:149). A perfect example of identity thinking would be those forms of reasoning found within bureaucracies where individual human beings are assembled within different classes or categories. The bureaucracy can thus only be said to ‘know’ any specific individual as an exemplar of the wider category to which that individual has been assigned. The sheer, unique specificity of the individual in question is thereby lost to view. One is liable to being treated as a number, and not as a unique person. Thus, Adorno condemns identity thinking as systematically and necessarily misrepresenting reality by means of the subsumption of specific phenomena under general, more abstract classificatory headings within which the phenomenal world is cognitively assembled. While this mode of representing reality may have the advantage of facilitating the manipulation of the material environment, it does so at the cost of failing to attend to the specificity of any given phenomenal entity; everything becomes a mere exemplar. One consequence of apprehending reality in this way is the elimination of qualities or properties that may inhere within any given object but which are conceptually excluded from view, so to speak, as a result of the imposition of a classificatory framework. In this way, identity thinking misrepresents its object. Adorno’s understanding and use of the concept of identity thinking provides a veritable foundation for his philosophy and ultimately underlies much of his writing. One of the principal examples of Adorno’s analysis of identity thinking is to be found in his and Horkheimer’s critical study of enlightenment, presented within their Dialectic of Enlightenment.

The centerpiece of Adorno and Horkheimer’s highly unusual text is an essay on the concept of enlightenment. The essay presents both a critical analysis of enlightenment and an account of the instrumentalization of reason. The Enlightenment is characteristically thought of as an historical period, spanning the 17th and 18th Centuries, embodying the emancipatory ideals of modernity. Enlightenment intellectuals were united by a common vision in which a genuinely human social and political order was to be achieved through the dissolution of previously oppressive, unenlightened, institutions. The establishment of enlightenment ideals was to be achieved by creating the conditions in which individuals could be free to exercise their own reason, free from the dictates of rationally indefensible doctrine and dogma. The means for establishing this new order was the exercise of reason. Freeing reason from the societal bonds which had constrained it was identified as the means for achieving human sovereignty over a world which was typically conceived of as the manifestation of some higher, divine authority. Enlightenment embodies the promise of human beings finally taking individual and collective control over the destiny of the species. Adorno and Horkheimer refused to endorse such a wholly optimistic reading of the effects of the rationalization of society. They stated, “in the most general sense of progressive thought, the Enlightenment has always aimed at liberating men from fear and establishing their sovereignty. Yet the fully enlightened earth radiates disaster triumphant.” (1979:3)

How do Adorno and Horkheimer conceive of the ‘fully enlightened earth’ and what is the nature of the ‘disaster’ that ensues from this? Adorno and Horkheimer’s understanding of enlightenment differs in several highly significant respects from the conventional understanding of the concept. They do not conceive of enlightenment as confined to a distinct historical period. As a recent commentator on Adorno has written, “Adorno and Horkheimer do not use the term ‘enlightenment’ primarily to designate a historical period ranging from Descartes to Kant. Instead they use it to refer to a series of related intellectual and practical operations which are presented as demythologizing, secularizing or disenchanting some mythical, religious or magical representation of the world.” (Jarvis, 1998:24). Adorno and Horkheimer extend their understanding of enlightenment to refer to a mode of apprehending reality found in the writings of classical Greek philosophers, such as Parmenides, to 20th century positivists such as Bertrand Russell. At the core of Adorno and Horkheimer’s understanding of enlightenment are two related theses: “myth is already enlightenment, and enlightenment reverts to mythology.” (1979: xvi). An analysis of the second of these two theses will suffice to explicate the concept of enlightenment Adorno and Horkheimer present. Adorno and Horkheimer’s understanding of enlightenment differs fundamentally from those accounts of the development of human thought and civilization that posit a developmental schema according to which human history is considered as progressively proceeding through separate stages of cognitively classifying and apprehending reality. These accounts typically describe the cognitive ascent of humanity as originating in myth, proceeding to religion, and culminating in secular, scientific reasoning. On this view, the scientific worldview ushered in by the enlightenment is seen as effecting a radical intellectual break and transition from that which went before.

Adorno and Horkheimer fundamentally challenge this assumption. Their thesis that ‘myth is already enlightenment’ is based on the claim that the development of human thought possesses a basic continuity. Both myth and enlightenment are modes of representing reality, both attempt to explain and account for reality. Adorno and Horkheimer’s second thesis, that enlightenment reverts to mythology requires a far more detailed explanation since it entails engaging with their entire understanding of reason and its relationship with heteronomy. They aim to demonstrate that and how enlightenment’s rationalization of society comes to revert to the character of a mythical order. Adorno and Horkheimer argue that enlightenment’s reversion to mythology amounts to the betrayal of the emancipatory ideals of enlightenment. However, they view the betrayal of enlightenment as being inherently entwined with enlightenment itself. For them, the reversion to mythology primarily means reverting to an unreflexive, uncritical mode of configuring and understanding reality. Reverting to mythology means the institution of social conditions, over which individuals come to have little perceived control. Reverting to mythology means a reversion to a heteronomous condition.

Adorno and Horkheimer conceive of enlightenment as principally a demythologizing mode of apprehending reality. For them, the fundamental aim of enlightenment is the establishment of human sovereignty over material reality, over nature: enlightenment is founded upon the drive to master and control nature. The realization of this aim requires the ability to cognitively and practically manipulate the material environment in accordance with our will. In order to be said to dominate nature, nature must become an object of our will. Within highly technologically developed societies, the constraints upon our ability to manipulate nature are typically thought of in terms of the development of technological, scientific knowledge: the limits of possibility are determined not by a mythical belief in god, say, but in the development of the technological forces available to us. This way of conceiving of the tangible limits to human action and cognition had first to overcome a belief that the natural order contained, and was the product of, mythical beings and entities whose presumed existence constituted the ultimate form of authority for those societies enthralled by them. The realization of human sovereignty required the dissolution of such beliefs and the disenchantment of nature. Adorno and Horkheimer write, “the program of the Enlightenment was the disenchantment of the world; the dissolution of myths and the substitution of knowledge for fancy. From now on, matter would at last be mastered without any illusion of ruling or inherent powers, of hidden qualities.” (1979:3-6) Overcoming myth was effected by conceiving of myth as a form of anthropomorphism, as already a manifestation of human cognition so that a realm which had served to constrain the development of technological forces was itself a creation of mankind, falsely projected onto the material realm. On this reading, enlightenment is conceived of as superseding and replacing mythical and religious belief systems, the falsity of which consist, in large part, of their inability to discern the subjective character and origins of these beliefs.

Few would dispute a view of enlightenment as antithetical to myth. However, Adorno and Horkheimer’s claim that enlightenment reverts to mythology is considerably more contentious. While many anthropologists and social theorists, for example have come to accept Adorno and Horkheimer’s claim that myth and enlightenment have the same functional purpose of representing and understanding reality, most political theorists would take great issue with the claim that enlightenment has regressed, or relapsed into some mythical state since this latter claim clearly implies that the general state of social and political freedom assumed to exist in ‘enlightened’ societies is largely bogus. This is, however, precisely what Adorno and Horkheimer argue. They argue that human beings’ attempt to gain sovereignty over nature has been pursued through, in large part, the accumulation of objective, verifiable knowledge of the material realm and its constitutive processes: we take control over nature by understanding how it can be made to work for us. Viewed in this way, the value of nature is necessarily conceived of in primarily instrumental terms: nature is thought of as an object for, and instrument of, human will. This conception of nature necessitates drawing a distinction between this realm and those beings for whom it is an object. Thus, the instrumentalist conception of nature entails a conception of human beings as categorically distinct entities, capable of becoming subjects through the exercise of reason upon nature. The very category of subject thus has inscribed within it a particular conception of nature as that which is to be subordinated to one’s will: subject and object are hierarchically juxtaposed, just as they are in the works of, for example, Descartes and Kant. For nature to be considered amenable to such subordination requires that it be conceived of as synonymous with the objectified models through which human subjects represent nature to themselves. To be wholly conceivable in these terms requires the exclusion of any properties that cannot be subsumed within this representational understanding of nature, this particular form of identity thinking. Adorno and Horkheimer state, “the concordance between the mind of man and the nature of things that he had in mind is patriarchal: the human mind, which overcomes superstition, is to hold sway over a disenchanted nature.” (1979:4) Nature is thereby configured as the object of human will and representation. In this way, our criteria governing the identification and pursuit of valid knowledge are grounded within a hierarchical relationship between human beings and nature: reason is instrumentalized. For Adorno and Horkheimer then, “myth turns into enlightenment, and nature into mere objectivity. Men pay for the increase of their power with alienation from that over which they exercise their power. Enlightenment behaves towards things as a dictator toward men. He knows them in so far as he can manipulate them. The man of science knows things in so far as he can make them. In this way, their potentiality is turned to his own ends.” (1979:9) Adorno and Horkheimer insist that this process results in the establishment of a generally heteronomous social order; a condition over which human beings have little control. Ultimately, the drive to dominate nature results in the establishment of a form of reasoning and a general world-view which appears to exist independently of human beings and, more to the point, is principally characterized by a systematic indifference to human beings and their sufferings: we ultimately become mere objects of the form of reason that we have created. Adorno and Horkheimer insist that individual self-preservation in ‘enlightened’ societies requires that each of us conform to the dictates of instrumental reason.

How do Adorno and Horkheimer attempt to defend such a fundamentally controversial claim? Throughout his philosophical lifetime Adorno argued that authoritative forms of knowledge have become largely conceived of as synonymous with instrumental reasoning; that the world has come to be conceived of as identical with its representation within instrumental reasoning. Reality is thus deemed discernible only in the form of objectively verifiable facts and alternative modes of representing reality are thereby fundamentally undermined. A successful appeal to the ‘facts’ of a cause has become the principal means for resolving disputes and settling disputes in societies such as ours. However, Adorno argued that human beings are increasingly incapable of legitimately excluding themselves from those determinative processes thought to prevail within the disenchanted material realm: human beings become objects of the form of reasoning through which their status as subjects is first formulated. Thus, Adorno discerns a particular irony in the totalizing representation of reality which enlightenment prioritizes. Human sovereignty over nature is pursued by the accumulation of hard, objective data which purport to accurately describe and catalogue this reality. The designation of ‘legitimate knowledge’ is thereby restricted to that thought of as ‘factual’: legitimate knowledge of the world is that which purports to accurately reflect how the world is. As it stands, of course, the mere act of describing any particular aspect of the material realm does not, by itself, promote the cause of human freedom. It may directly facilitate the exercise of freedom by providing sufficient knowledge upon which an agent may exercise discretionary judgment concerning, say, the viability of any particular desire, but, by itself, accurate descriptions of the world are not a sufficient condition for freedom. Adorno, however, argues that the very constituents of this way of thinking are inextricably entwined with heteronomy. In commenting upon Adorno and Horkheimer’s claim that enlightenment restricts legitimate knowledge to the category of objectively verifiable facts, Simon Jarvis writes: “thought is to confine itself to the facts, which are thus the point at which thought comes to a halt. The question as to whether these facts might change is ruled out by enlightened thought as a pseudo-problem. Everything which is, is thus represented as a kind of fate, no less unalterable and uninterogable than mythical fate itself.” (1998:24). Conceived of in this way, material reality appears as an immutable and fixed order of things which necessarily pre-structures and pre-determines our consciousness of it. As Adorno and Horkheimer themselves state, “factuality wins the day; cognition is restricted to its repetition; and thought becomes mere tautology. The more the machinery of thought subjects existence to itself, the more blind its resignation in reproducing existence. Hence enlightenment reverts to mythology, which it never really knew how to elude. For in its figures mythology had the essence of the status quo: cycle, fate, and domination of the world reflected as the truth and deprived of hope.” (1979:27) Facts have come to take on the same functional properties of a belief in the existence of some mythical forces or beings: representing an external order to which we must conform. The ostensible difference between them is that the realm of facts appears to be utterly objective and devoid of any subjective, or anthropomorphic forces. Indeed, the identification of a truly objective order was explicitly pursued through the exclusion of any such subjective prejudices and fallacies. Subjective reasoning is fallacious reasoning, on this view.

Adorno’s attempt to account for this objective order as constituted through identity thinking poses a fundamental challenge to the epistemological conceit of such views. Adorno and Horkheimer argued that the instrumentalization of reason and the epistemological supremacy of ‘facts’ served to establish a single order, a single mode of representing and relating to reality. For them, “enlightenment is totalitarian” (1979:24). The pursuit of human sovereignty over nature is predicated upon a mode of reasoning whose functioning necessitates subsuming all of nature within a single, representational framework. We possess knowledge of the world as a result of the accumulation of facts, ‘facts’ that are themselves necessarily abstractions from that to which they refer. Assembled within a classificatory scheme these facts are not, cannot ever be, a direct expression of that to which they refer; no aspect of its thought, by its very nature, can ever legitimately be said to possess that quality. However, while facts constitute the principal constituents of this classificatory scheme, the scheme itself, this mode of configuring reality, is founded upon a common, single cognitive currency, which necessarily holds that the essence of all that can be known is reducible to a single, inherently quantifiable property: matter. They insist that this mode of configuring reality originates within a desire to dominate nature and that this domination is effected by reducing the manifold diversity of nature to, ultimately, a single, manipulable form. For them the realization of the single totality that proceeds from the domination of nature necessitates that reason itself be shorn of any ostensibly partial or particularistic elements. They conceive of enlightenment as aspiring towards the institution of a form of reasoning which is fundamentally universal and abstract in character: a form of reasoning which posits the existence of a unified order, a priori. They argue, “in advance, the Enlightenment recognizes as being and occurrence only what can be apprehended in unity: its ideal is the system from which all and everything follows. Its rationalist and empiricist versions do not part company on this point.” (1979:7) Thus, the identarian character of enlightenment, on this reading, consists of the representation of material reality as ultimately reducible to a single scale of evaluation or measurement. Reality is henceforth to be known in so far as it is quantifiable. Material reality is presented as having become an object of calculation. The form of reasoning which is adequate to the task of representing reality in this way must be necessarily abstract and formal in character. Its evaluative procedures must, similarly, avoid the inclusion of any unduly restrictive and partial affiliations to any specific component property of the system as a whole if they are to be considered capable of being applicable to the system as a whole. Adorno and Horkheimer present the aspiration towards achieving human sovereignty over nature as culminating in the institution of a mode of reasoning which is bound to the identification and accumulation of facts; which restricts the perceived value of the exercise of reason to one which is instrumental for the domination of nature; and which, finally, aims at the assimilation of all of nature under a single, universalizing representational order. Adorno and Horkheimer present enlightenment as fundamentally driven by the desire to master nature, of bringing all of material reality under a single representational system, within which reason is transformed into a tool for achieving this end. For Adorno and Horkheimer then, nature has been fully mastered within the ‘fully enlightened earth’ and human affairs are regulated and evaluated in accordance with the demands of instrumental reasoning: the means by which nature has been mastered have rebounded upon us. The attempt to fully dominate nature culminates in the institution of a social and political order over which we have lost control. If one wishes to survive, either as an individual or even as a nation, one must conform to, and learn to utilize, instrumental reason. Thought and philosophy aids and abets this order where it seeks merely to mirror or ‘objectively’ reflect that reality.

Adorno aims to avoid providing any such support by, at root, providing a prototypical means of deconstructing that ‘reality’. The radical character of his concept of ‘identity thinking’ consists in its insistence that such ‘objective’ forms of representing reality are not ‘objective’ enough, so to speak. The facts upon which instrumental reasoning goes to work are themselves conceptual abstractions and not direct manifestations of phenomena, as they claim to be. Adorno’s philosophical writings fundamentally aim to demonstrate the two-fold falsity of ‘identity thinking’: first, in respect of debunking the claims of identity thinking to representing reality objectively; second, in respect of the effects of instrumental reasoning as a form of identity thinking upon the potential for the exercise of human freedom. Adorno posits identity thinking as fundamentally concerned not to understand phenomena but to control and manipulate it. A genuinely critical form of philosophy aims to both undercut the dominance of identity thinking and to create an awareness of the potential of apprehending and relating to phenomena in a non-coercive manner. Both how he aims to do this, and how Adorno’s philosophical project can itself be criticized will be considered in the final section. However, having summarized the substance of Adorno’s understanding of philosophy and reason, what must now be considered is the next most important theme addressed in Adorno’s philosophical writings: his vision of the status of morality and moral theory within this fully enlightened earth.

4. Morality and Nihilism

Adorno’s moral philosophy is similarly concerned with the effects of ‘enlightenment’ upon both the prospects of individuals leading a ‘morally good life’ and philosophers’ ability to identify what such a life may consist of. Adorno argues that the instrumentalization of reason has fundamentally undermined both. He argues that social life in modern societies no longer coheres around a set of widely espoused moral truths and that modern societies lack a moral basis. What has replaced morality as the integrating ‘cement’ of social life are instrumental reasoning and the exposure of everyone to the capitalist market. According to Adorno, modern, capitalist societies are fundamentally nihilistic, in character; opportunities for leading a morally good life and even philosophically identifying and defending the requisite conditions of a morally good life have been abandoned to instrumental reasoning and capitalism. Within a nihilistic world, moral beliefs and moral reasoning are held to have no ultimately rational authority: moral claims are conceived of as, at best, inherently subjective statements, expressing not an objective property of the world, but the individual’s own prejudices. Morality is presented as thereby lacking any objective, public basis. The espousal of specific moral beliefs is thus understood as an instrument for the assertion of one’s own, partial interests: morality has been subsumed by instrumental reasoning. Adorno attempts to critically analyse this condition. He is not a nihilist, but a critic of nihilism.

Adorno’s account of nihilism rests, in large part, on his understanding of reason and of how modern societies have come to conceive of legitimate knowledge. He argues that morality has fallen victim to the distinction drawn between objective and subjective knowledge. Objective knowledge consists of empirically verifiable ‘facts’ about material phenomena, whereas subjective knowledge consists of all that remains, including such things as evaluative and normative statements about the world. On this view, a statement such as ‘I am sitting at a desk as I write this essay’ is of a different category to the statement ‘abortion is morally wrong’. The first statement is amenable to empirical verification, whereas the latter is an expression of a personal, subjective belief. Adorno argues that moral beliefs and moral reasoning have been confined to the sphere of subjective knowledge. He argues that, under the force of the instrumentalization of reason and positivism, we have come to conceive of the only meaningfully existing entities as empirically verifiable facts: statements on the structure and content of reality. Moral values and beliefs, in contrast, are denied such a status. Morality is thereby conceived of as inherently prejudicial in character so that, for example, there appears to be no way in which one can objectively and rationally resolve disputes between conflicting substantive moral beliefs and values. Under the condition of nihilism one cannot distinguish between more or less valid moral beliefs and values since the criteria allowing for such evaluative distinctions have been excluded from the domain of subjective knowledge.

Adorno argues that, under nihilistic conditions, morality has become a function or tool of power. The measure of the influence of any particular moral vision is an expression of the material interests that underlie it. Interestingly, Adorno identifies the effects of nihilism as extending to philosophical attempts to rationally defend morality and moral reasoning. Thus, in support of his argument he does not rely upon merely pointing to the extent of moral diversity and conflict in modern societies. Nor does he rest his case upon those who, in the name of some radical account of individual freedom, positively espouse nihilism.

Indeed, he identifies the effects of nihilism within moral philosophy itself, paying particular attention to the moral theory of Immanuel Kant. Adorno argues that Kant’s account of the moral law demonstrates the extent to which morality has been reduced to the status of subjective knowledge. Kant certainly attempts to establish a basis for morality by the exclusion of all substantive moral claims, claims concerning the moral goodness of this or that practice or way of life. Kant ultimately seeks to establish valid moral reasoning upon a series of utterly formal, procedural rules, or maxims which exclude even the pursuit of human happiness as a legitimate component of moral reasoning. Adorno criticizes Kant for emptying the moral law of any and all reference to substantive conceptions of human well-being, or the ‘good life’. Ultimately, Kant is condemned for espousing an account of moral reasoning that is every bit as formal and devoid of any substantively moral constituents as instrumental reasoning. The thrust of Adorno’s criticism of Kant is not so much that Kant developed such an account of morality, since this was, according to Adorno, to a large extent prefigured by the material conditions of Kant’s time and place, but that he both precisely failed to identify the effects of these conditions and, in so doing, thereby failed to discern the extent to which his moral philosophy provides an affirmation, rather than a criticism, of such conditions. Kant, of all people, is condemned for not being sufficiently reflexive.

Unlike some other thinkers and philosophers of the time, Adorno does not think that nihilism can be overcome by a mere act of will or by simply affirming some substantive moral vision of the good life. He does not seek to philosophically circumnavigate the extent to which moral questions concerning the possible nature of the ‘good life’ have become so profoundly problematic for us. Nor does he attempt to provide a philosophical validation of this condition. Recall that Adorno argues that reason has become entwined with domination and has developed as a manifestation of the attempt to control nature. Adorno thus considers nihilism to be a consequence of domination and a testament, albeit in a negative sense, to the extent to which human societies are no longer enthralled by, for example, moral visions grounded in some naturalistic conception of human well-being. For Adorno, this process has been so thorough and complete that we can no longer authoritatively identify the necessary constituents of the good life since the philosophical means for doing so have been vitiated by the domination of nature and the instrumentalization of reason. The role of the critical theorist is, therefore, not to positively promote some alternative, purportedly more just, vision of a morally grounded social and political order. This would too far exceed the current bounds of the potential of reason. Rather, the critical theorist must fundamentally aim to retain and promote an awareness of the contingency of such conditions and the extent to which such conditions are capable of being changed. Adorno’s, somewhat dystopian, account of morality in modern societies follows from his argument that such societies are enthralled by instrumental reasoning and the prioritization of ‘objective facts’. Nihilism serves to fundamentally frustrate the ability of morality to impose authoritative limits upon the application of instrumental reason.

5. The Culture Industry

I stated at the beginning of this piece that Adorno was a highly unconventional philosopher. While he wrote volumes on such stock philosophical themes as reason and morality, he also extended his writings and critical focus to include mass entertainment. Adorno analyzed social phenomena as manifestations of domination. For him both the most abstract philosophical text and the most easily consumable film, record, or television show shared this basic similarity. Adorno was a philosopher who took mass entertainment seriously. He was among the first philosophers and intellectuals to recognize the potential social, political, and economic power of the entertainment industry. Adorno saw what he referred to as ‘the culture industry’ as constituting a principal source of domination within complex, capitalist societies. He aims to show that the very areas of life within which many people believe they are genuinely free – free from the demands of work for example – actually perpetuates domination by denying freedom and obstructing the development of a critical consciousness. Adorno’s discussion of the culture industry is unequivocal in its depiction of mass consumer societies as being based upon the systematic denial of genuine freedom. What is the culture industry, and how does Adorno defend his vision of it?

Adorno described the culture industry as a key integrative mechanism for binding individuals, as both consumers and producers, to modern, capitalist societies. Where many sociologists have argued that complex, capitalist societies are fragmented and heterogeneous in character, Adorno insists that the culture industry, despite the manifest diversity of cultural commodities, functions to maintain a uniform system, to which all must conform. David Held, a commentator on critical theory, describes the culture industry thus: “the culture industry produces for mass consumption and significantly contributes to the determination of that consumption. For people are now being treated as objects, machines, outside as well as inside the workshop. The consumer, as the producer, has no sovereignty. The culture industry, integrated into capitalism, in turn integrates consumers from above. Its goal is the production of goods that are profitable and consumable. It operates to ensure its own reproduction.” (1981:91) Few can deny the accuracy of the description of the dominant sectors of cultural production as capitalist, commercial enterprises. The culture industry is a global, multibillion dollar enterprise, driven, primarily, by the pursuit of profit. What the culture industry produces is a means to the generation of profit, like any commercial enterprise.

To this point, few could dispute Adorno’s description of the mass entertainment industry. However, Adorno’s specific notion of the ‘culture industry’ goes much further. Adorno argues that individuals’ integration within the culture industry has the fundamental effect of restricting the development of a critical awareness of the social conditions that confront us all. The culture industry promotes domination by subverting the psychological development of the mass of people in complex, capitalist societies. This is the truly controversial aspect of Adorno’s view of the culture industry. How does he defend it? Adorno argues that cultural commodities are subject to the same instrumentally rationalized mechanical forces which serve to dominate individuals’ working lives. Through our domination of nature and the development of technologically sophisticated forms of productive machinery, we have becomes objects of a system of our own making. Any one who has worked on a production line or in a telephone call centre should have some appreciation of the claim being made. Through the veritably exponential increase in volume and scope of the commodities produced under the auspices of the culture industry, individuals are increasingly subjected to the same underlying conditions through which the complex capitalist is maintained and reproduced. The qualitative distinction between work and leisure, production and consumption is thereby obliterated. As Adorno and Horkheimer assert, “amusement under late capitalism is the prolongation of work. It is sought after as an escape from the mechanized work process, and to recruit strength in order to be able to cope with it again. But at the same time mechanization has such a power over man’s leisure and happiness, and so profoundly determines the manufacture of amusement goods, that his experiences are inevitably after-images of the work process itself.” (1979:137). According to Adorno, systematic exposure to the culture industry (and who can escape from it for long in this media age?) has the fundamental effect of pacifying its consumers. Consumers are presented as being denied any genuine opportunities to actively contribute to the production of the goods to which they are exposed. Similarly, Adorno insists that the form and content of the specific commodities themselves, be it a record, film, or TV show, require no active interpretative role on the part of the consumer: all that is being asked of consumers is that they buy the goods. Adorno locates the origins of the pacifying effects of cultural commodities in what he views as the underlying uniformity of such goods, a uniformity that belies their ostensible differences. Adorno conceives of the culture industry as a manifestation of identity-thinking and as being effected through the implementation of instrumentally rationalized productive techniques. He presents the culture industry as comprising an endless repetition of the same commodified form. He argues that the ostensibly diverse range of commodities produced and consumed under the auspices of the culture industry actually derive from a limited, fundamentally standardized ‘menu’ of interchangeable features and constructs. Thus, he presents the structural properties of the commodities produced and exchanged within the culture industry as being increasingly standardized, formulaic, and repetitive in character. He argues that the standardized character of cultural commodities results from the increasingly mechanized nature of the production, distribution, and consumption of these goods. It is, for example, more economically rational to produce as many products as possible from the same identical ‘mould’. Similarly, the increasing control of distribution centers by large, multinational entertainment conglomerates tends towards a high degree of uniformity.

Adorno’s analyses of specific sectors of the culture industry is extensive in scope. However, his principal area of expertise and interest was music. Adorno analyzed the production and consumption of music as a medium within which one could discern the principal features and effects of the culture industry and the commodification of culture. The central claim underlying Adorno’s analysis of music is that the extension of industrialized production techniques has changed both the structure of musical commodities and the manner in which they are received. Adorno argued that the production of industrialized music is characterized by a highly standardized and uniform menu of musical styles and themes, in accordance with which the commodities are produced. Consistently confronted by familiar and compositionally simplistic musical phenomena requires that the audience need make little interpretative effort in its reception of the product. Adorno presents such musical commodities as consisting of set pieces which elicit set, largely unreflected upon, responses. He states, ‘the counterpart to the fetishism of music is a regression of listening. It is contemporary listening which has regressed, arrested at the infantile stage. Not only do the listening subjects lose, along with freedom of choice and responsibility, the capacity for conscious perception of music, but they stubbornly reject the possibility of such perception. They are not childlike, as might be expected on the basis of an interpretation of the new type of listener in terms of the introduction to musical life of groups previously unacquainted with music. But they are childish; their primitivism is not that of the undeveloped, but that of the forcibly retarded.’ (1978:286). Here Adorno drew upon a distinction previously made by Kant in his formulation of personal autonomy. Distinguishing between maturity and immaturity, Adorno repeats the Kantian claim that to be autonomous is to be mature, capable of exercising one’s own discretionary judgment, of making up one’s own mind for oneself. Adorno argued that the principal effect of the standardization of music is the promotion of a general condition of immaturity, frustrating and prohibiting the exercise of any critical or reflexive faculties in one’s interpretation of the phenomena in question.

Adorno viewed the production and consumption of musical commodities as exemplary of the culture industry in general. However, he also extended his analysis to include other areas of the culture industry, such as television and, even, astrology columns. A brief discussion of this latter will suffice to complete the general contours of Adorno’s account of the culture industry. Adorno conducted a critical textual analysis of the astrology column of the Los Angeles Times. His aim was to identify the ‘rational’ function of the cultural institution itself. He thus took astrology seriously. He considered astrology to be a symptom of complex, capitalist societies and discerned in the widespread appeal of astrology an albeit uncritical and unreflexive awareness of the extent to which individuals’ lives remain fundamentally conditioned by impersonal, external forces, over which individuals have little control. Society is projected, unwittingly, on to the stars. He stated that, “astrology is truly in harmony with a ubiquitous trend. In as much as the social system is the ‘fate’ of most individuals independent of their will and interest, it is projected onto the stars in order thus to obtain a higher degree of dignity and justification in which individuals hope to participate themselves.” (1994:42). According to Adorno, astrology contributes to, and simultaneously reflects, a pervasive fetishistic attitude towards the conditions that actually confront individuals’ lives through the promotion of a vision of human life as being determined by forces beyond our ultimate control. Rather than describing astrology as being irrational in character, Adorno argued that the instrumentally rational character of complex, capitalist societies actually served to lend astrology a degree of rationality in respect of providing individuals with a means for learning to live with conditions beyond their apparent control. He describes astrology as “an ideology for dependence, as an attempt to strengthen and somehow justify painful conditions which seem to be more tolerable if an affirmative attitude is taken towards them.” (1994:115)

For Adorno no single domain of the culture industry is sufficient to ensure the effects he identified as generally exerting upon individuals’ consciousness and lives. However, when taken altogether, the assorted media of the culture industry constitute a veritable web within which the conditions, for example, of leading an autonomous life, for developing the capacity for critical reflection upon oneself and one’s social conditions, are systematically obstructed. According to Adorno, the culture industry fundamentally prohibits the development of autonomy by means of the mediatory role its various sectors play in the formation of individuals’ consciousness of social reality. The form and content of the culture industry is increasingly misidentified as a veritable expression of reality: individuals come to perceive and conceive of reality through the pre-determining form of the culture industry. The culture industry is understood by Adorno to be an essential component of a reified form of second nature, which individuals come to accept as a pre-structured social order, with which they must conform and adapt. The commodities produced by the culture industry may be ‘rubbish’, but their effects upon individuals is deadly serious.

6. Conclusion and General Criticisms

Adorno is widely recognized as one of the leading, but also one of the most controversial continental philosophers of the 20th century. Though largely unappreciated within the analytical tradition of philosophy, Adorno’s philosophical writings have had a significant and lasting effect upon the development of subsequent generations of critical theorists and other philosophers concerned with the general issue of nihilism and domination. Publications on and by Adorno continue to proliferate. Adorno has not been forgotten. His own, uncompromising diagnosis of modern societies and the entwinement of reason and domination continue to resonate and even inspire many working within the continental tradition. However, he has attracted some considerable criticism. I shall briefly consider some of the most pertinent criticisms that have been levelled at Adorno within each of the three areas of his writings I have considered above. I want to begin, though, with some brief comments on Adorno’s writing style.

Adorno can be very difficult to read. He writes in a manner which does not lend itself to ready comprehension. This is intentional. Adorno views language itself as having become an object of, and vehicle for, the perpetuation of domination. He is acutely aware of the extent to which this claim complicates his own work. In attempting to encourage a critical awareness of suffering and domination, Adorno is forced to use the very means by which these conditions are, to a certain extent, sustained. His answer to this problem, although not intended to be ultimately satisfying, is to write in a way that requires hard and concentrated efforts on the part of the reader, to write in a way that explicitly defies convention and the familiar. Adorno aims to encourage his readers to attempt to view the world and the concepts that represent the world in a way that defies identity thinking. He aims, through his writing, to express precisely the unacknowledged, non-identical aspects of any given phenomenon. He aims to show, in a manner very similar to contemporary deconstructionists, the extent to which our linguistic conventions simultaneously both represent and misrepresent reality. In contrast to many deconstructionists, however, Adorno does so in the name of an explicit moral aim and not as a mere literary method. For Adorno, reality is grounded in suffering and the domination of nature. This is a profoundly important distinction. Adorno’s complaint against identity-thinking is a moral and not a methodological one. However, it must be admitted that understanding and evaluating the strengths and weaknesses of Adorno’s philosophical vision is a difficult task. He does not wish to be easily understood in a world in which easy understanding, so he claims, is dependent upon identity-thinking’s falsification of the world.

Adorno’s writing style follows, in large part, from his account of reason. Adorno’s understanding of reason has been subject to consistent criticism. One of the most significant forms of criticism is associated with Jurgen Habermas, arguably the leading contemporary exponent of critical theory. In essence, Habermas (1987) argues that Adorno overestimates the extent to which reason has been instrumentalized within modern, complex societies. For Habermas, instrumental reasoning is only one of a number of forms of reasoning identifiable within such societies. Instrumental reasoning, therefore, is nowhere near as extensive and all-encompassing as Adorno and Horkheimer presented it as being in the Dialectic of Enlightenment. For Habermas, the undue importance attributed to instrumental reasoning has profound moral and philosophical consequences for Adorno’s general vision. Habermas insists that Adorno’s understanding of reason amounts to a renunciation of the moral aims of the Enlightenment, from which critical theory itself appears to take its bearings. There is not doubt that the deployment of technology has had the most horrendous and catastrophic effects upon humanity. However, Habermas argues that these effects are less the consequence of the extension of reason grounded in the domination of nature, as Adorno argues, and more an aberration of enlightenment reason. Adorno is accused of defending an account of instrumental reasoning that is so encompassing and extensive as to exclude the possibility of rationally overcoming these conditions and thereby realizing the aims of critical theory. Adorno is accused of leading critical theory down a moral cul-de-sac. Habermas proceeds to criticize Adorno’s account of reason on philosophical grounds also. He argues, in effect, that Adorno’s account of the instrumentalization of reason is so all encompassing as to exclude the possibility of someone like Adorno presenting a rational and critical analysis of these conditions. Adorno’s critical account of reason seems to logically exclude the possibility of its own existence. Habermas accuses Adorno of having lapsed into a form of performative contradiction. For Habermas, the very fact that a given political or social system is the object of criticism reveals the extent to which the form of domination that Adorno posits has not been fully realized. The fact that Adorno and Horkheimer could proclaim that ‘enlightenment is totalitarian’ amounts to a simultaneous self-refutation. The performance of the claim contradicts its substance. Habermas takes issue with Adorno, finally, on the grounds that Adorno’s account of reason and his advocacy of ‘non-identity thinking’ appear to prohibit critical theory from positively or constructively engaging with social and political injustice. Adorno is accused of adopting the stance of an inveterate ‘nay-sayer’. Being critical can appear as an end in itself, since the very radicalness of Adorno’s diagnosis of reason and modernity appears to exclude the possibility of overcoming domination and heteronomy. Similar criticisms have been leveled at Adorno’s account of morality and his claims in respect of the extent of nihilism. Adorno is consistently accused of failing to appreciate the moral gains achieved as a direct consequence of the formalization of reason and the subsequent demise of the authority of tradition. On this view, attempting to categorize the Marquis de Sade, Kant, and Nietzsche as all similarly expressing and testifying to the ultimate demise of morality, as Adorno and Horkheimer do, is simply false and an example of an apparent tendency to over-generalize in the application of particular concepts.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Adorno, T.W. & Horkheimer, M. Dialectic of Enlightenment. tr. Cumming, J. London: Verso, 1979.
  • Adorno, T.W. Minima Moralia: Reflections from Damaged Life. tr. Jephcott, E.F.N. London: Verso, 1978.
  • Adorno, T.W. Negative Dialectics. tr. E.B.Ashton. London, Routledge, 1990.
  • Habermas, J. The Philosophical Discourse of Modernity: Twelve Lectures. tr. F.G.Lawrence. Cambridge: Polity Press, 1987
  • Held, D. Introduction to Critical Theory: Horkheimer to Habermas. Cambridge: Polity Press, 1980.
  • Jarvis, S. Adorno: A Critical Introduction. Cambridge: Polity Press, 1998.
  • Rasmussen, D. (ed.) The Handbook of Critical Theory. Oxford: Blackwell, 1996.

Author information

Andrew Fagan
University of Essex
United Kingdom


A gymnasium near Athens and the site where Cynic philosophers taught.

Table of Contents

  1. Location, Structures, and Layout of Cynosarges
  2. Bridge
  3. Heracleion
  4. Other Sanctuaries
  5. Gymnasium
  6. Palaistra
  7. Peripatos
  8. Groves
  9. History of the Use of Cynosarges
  10. References and Further Reading

1. Location, Structures, and Layout of Cynosarges

Cynosarges was located along the southern bank of the Ilissos river, not far from the ancient city wall (Diogenes Laertius 6.13 and [Plato] Axiochus 364d) in the deme of Diomeia (Hegesander of Delphi, FHG 4.413, Harpocration, Lexicon s.v. en Diomeois Heracleion; Telephanes, FHG 4.507; Herodian,Correct Pronunciation, s.v. Cynosarges; and Steph. Byz. s.v. Cynosarges). Scholarly debate over the precise location and boundaries of Cynosarges continues, but evidence for specific structures is discussed below.

The literary and epigraphic evidence attests many cult sanctuaries, a gymnasial area for exercise, apalaistra (wrestling school), parcels of land leased to private individuals for cultivation, and open space for equestrian activities.

2. Bridge

The philosopher Diogenes of Sinope is said to have asked to be thrown from a bridge near the Cynosarges gymnasium when he was near the point of death (Aelian, Varia Historia 8.14.3). The bridge presumably spanned the Ilissos river.

3. Heracleion

The Cynosarges area belonged to Heracles (Pausanias 1.19.3, Hesychius s.v. Cynosarges and Suda, s.v.Cynosarges). A temple and altar dedicated to Heracles is attested (Pausanias 1.19.3, Suda, s.v. Es Cynosarges and s.v. Cynosarges; Apostolios, CPG 10.22; old scholia on [Plato] Axiochus 364a). Nearby there were altars for Alcmene and Iolaus, Heracles’ mother and companion respectively, and for Hebe, his consort in Olympus (Pausanias 1.19.3).

4. Other Sanctuaries

All the other deities associated with Cynosarges are closely connected with Heracles himself. There is attested a sanctuary to Antiochus, Heracles’ son and the eponymous hero of the Antiochid tribe (SEG III 115, 116, and 117), and a sanctuary of Diomos, the eponymous hero of the deme Diomeia and founder of the festival for Heracles (IG II2 1247). A statue and cult to Philip II of Macedon, whose family was allegedly founded by Heracles, was set up in Cynosarges during the 330s BCE (Clement of Alexandria,Protrepticus 4.54.5). A sanctuary of Hermes may have also existed (Palatine Anthology 6.143), but the evidence is slim.

5. Gymnasium

During the Classical and Hellenistic periods, the gymnasium in Cynosarges was probably a large, open space dedicated to athletic and military training. None of the literary or epigraphic sources attest a built gymnasium in Cynosarges during this period. Excavations carried out in 1896-1897 by the British School at Athens uncovered a building of the Archaic period and a much larger building of the 2nd century CE on the southern bank of the Ilissos. The results of the excavation were never fully published, but J. Travlos has associated these buildings with Cynosarges and a gymnasium built by the Roman emperor Hadrian (Pausanias 1.18.9). Scholarly opinion remains divided on this identification with some preferring a location further downstream.

6. Palaistra

A wrestling school is attested for Cynosarges (Aelian, Varia Historia 8.14.3 and Diogenes Laertius 6.30.8). The palaistra may have been a building or simply an open area marked off for training in combat sports such as boxing and wrestling.

7. Peripatos

An area for walking is mentioned briefly in the pseudo-Platonic dialogue Axiochus (372a).

8. Groves

Leases for properties belonging to Heracles (Agora XIX L6) make it clear that a number of plots of arable land in the Cynosarges area were leased to private individuals for the benefit of Heracles’ cult during the fourth century BCE. The size of the plots themselves is unclear, buy the total value of the land described in the surviving leases has been estimated at approximately 2 talents.

9. History of the Use of Cynosarges

The origin of the name “Cynosarges” appears to have been a mystery even in antiquity. According to a often re-told story, a “white” or “swift” dog snatched the sacrificial meats from the altar of Heracles (e.g., Hesychius, s.v. Cynosarges Suda, s.v. Es Cynosarges and Cynosarges, and Eustathius, Commentary on Homer’s Odyssey 2.11 p. 1430.54-59). The athletic facilities, cults, educational, and military uses of the area continued from the Archaic period to the siege of Athens in 200 BCE by Philip V of Macedon, whose army encamped in Cynosarges.

By the sixth century BCE, Cynosarges functioned as a cult center for Heracles and as a gymnasium used by the nothoi or offspring of mixed Athenian/non-Athenian parentage (Demosthenes, Against Aristagoras II 214, Harpocration, Lexicon s.v. notheia and cf. Suda, s.v. Antisthenes). The most famous of these nothoi was Themistocles (Plutarch, Themistocles 1.3), who allegedly encouraged his young friends who were not nothoi to use the grounds at Cynosarges themselves in order that there would be a blurring of the distinction.

There was also a connection between the nothoi and the cult of Heracles. The parasitoi who made offerings monthly along with the priest of Heracles were chosen from the nothoi (Athenaeus, The Wise Dinner Companions 6.234d-e). Heracles himself is said to have been considered a nothos as his mother was the mortal, Alcmene, and his father the god Zeus (Plutarch, Themistocles 1.3).

Cynosarges was also the site of the Heracleia, in which Heracles received sacrifices as an Olympian god (Aristophanes Frogs 650, SEG XLII 50, Demosthenes On the False Embassy 125, IG II2 1247, Harpocration, Lexicon s.v. Heracleia, and Suda, s.v. Heracleia). A priest of Diomos, the eponymous hero of the deme Diomeia and the founder of the these rites for Heracles, also took part in the superintendence of the festival (IG II2 1247.16-24. Polemon, fr. 78).

Cynosarges never seems to have attracted the level of organized philosophical discussion and study as the Lyceum and Academy, but it was commonly associated with Cynic philosophy. Socrates appears on his way out to Cynosarges in the pseudo-Platonic dialogue Axiochus (364a1-b1), but it is Socrates’ student Antisthenes whose association with Cynosarges would have a more lasting legacy. Antisthenes was reportedly himself a nothos –his mother was a Thracian–and thus had frequented the gymnasium since his youth (Suda, s.v. Antisthenes). After Socrates’ death in 399 BCE, Antisthenes taught a philosophy in Cynosarges that emphasized simplicity and austerity in life. It is debatable whether Antisthenes taught Diogenes of Sinope or not, but Diogenes is said to have taught and lived in the area of Cynosarges (Diogenes Laertius, 6.13, 6.30.8; Aelian, Varia Historia 8.14.3). Because Cynicism was more a way of life than a formal study of philosophy, no organized school seems to have developed in Cynosarges, which is absent in the lists of philosophical schools that were a part of the regular curriculum of young men during the Hellenistic and Roman periods.

Another group associated with Cynosarges was called The Sixty, who appear to have been a loosely organized comedy club that met in the sanctuary of Heracles (Athenaeus, The Wise Dinner Companions6.260b). Their fame in telling jokes had spread as far north as Macedon during the reign of Philip II (360-336 BCE), who reportedly sent them an enormous sum of money in exchange for a written account of their jokes (Athenaeus, The Wise Dinner Companions 14.614).

Cynosarges was also a critical strategic point in the Persian invasion of Attica in 480 BCE. After their defeat at Marathon, the Persian fleet reportedly sailed into the Saronic gulf and attempted a landing in the bay of Phaleron to the West of Athens. Herodotus (6.116) tells us that the victorious Athenians quickly marched from the sanctuary of Heracles at Marathon to another sanctuary of Heracles at Cynosarges (around 26.5 miles). The sight of the Athenian troops arrayed for battle only a few miles away caused the Persians to retreat.

Cynosarges also was used for military training (Diogenes Laertius 6.30.8 and SEG III 115, 116, 117) and equestrian exercises, as is attested by the orator Andocides (On the Mysteries 61), who said he broke his collarbone in a riding accident there.

The area was used as a camp by Philip V during his unsuccessful, but destructive siege of Athens in 200 BCE (Diodorus Siculus 28.7.1 and Livy 31.24.17-18). Since the sources mention no further activity in Cynosarges after 200 BCE, many believe that the area did not recover from this disaster.

10. References and Further Reading

  • Billot, M.-F. “Le Cynosarges. Histoire, mythes et archéologie,” in Dictionnaire des Philosophes Antiques, R. Goulet, ed. (Paris 1994).
  • Billot, M.-F. “Antisthène et le Cynosarges dans l’Athènes des Ve et IVe siècles,” in Le Cynisme ancien et ses prolongments: Actes du Colloque International du CNRS (Paris 22-25 juillet 1991). M.-O. Goulet-Cazé and R. Goulet, eds. (Paris 1993) 69-116.
  • Walbank, M. “Leases of Public Lands. The Leasing of Public Lands in Attica and in Territories controlled by Athens,” in The Athenian Agora vol. XIX Inscriptions (Princeton 1991)
  • Wycherley, R.E. The Stones of Athens. Princeton 1978.
  • Travlos, J. Pictorial Dictionary of Ancient Athens (New York 1971).
  • Judeich, J. Topographie von Athen2 (Berlin 1931). (Berlin 1931).
  • Stuart, J. and N. Revett, The Antiquities of Athens. (London 1762 [repr. New York 1968])

Author Information

William Morison
Grand Valley State University

The Garden of Epicurus

A garden near the city of Athens, owned and used by the philosopher Epicurus and his followers. It became a symbol of Epicurean philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Location and Use
  2. References and Further Reading

1. Location and Use

In 307/306 BCE the Athenian philosopher Epicurus bought a house with a garden just outside Athens along the road from the Dipylon gate to the Academy (CiceroDe Finibus 5.1.3). Other great founders of philosophical schools had chosen public areas for their teaching: Plato established his school near the Academy, Isocrates and Aristotle taught in the Lyceum, Zeno often met his students in the Stoa Poecile. In contrast, Epicurus’ hedonistic and materialistic philosophy flourished and grew amidst the privately owned groves of his Garden. The Garden itself – apart from the city, a private space, and pleasurable – became a symbol for the detachment and hedonism of the Epicurean school. Nothing of the Garden’s layout is known, but its closeness to the canalized Eridanus River must have provided plentiful water for irrigation of its trees and plants. After Epicurus’ death the Garden was passed down to his followers (Diogenes Laertius, 10.10 and 10.17). We may imagine that Epicureans seeking relief from the disturbances of the city gathered in the Garden’s groves for many centuries.

2. References and Further Reading

  • Furley, David John. “Epicurus” in the Oxford Classical Dictionary. Third Edition. Oxford 1996.
  • Wycherley, R.E. The Stones of Athens. Princeton 197

Author Information

William Morison
Grand Valley State University

The Lyceum

The Lyceum was a gymnasium near Athens and the site of a philosophical school founded by Aristotle.

Table of Contents

  1. Location, Structures, and Layout of the Lyceum
    1. Apodyterion
    2. Dromoi and Peripatoi
    3. Gymnasium Building
    4. Palaistra
    5. Sanctuaries
    6. Seats
    7. Stoas
    8. Trees and Streams
  2. History of the Use of the Lyceum
  3. References and Further Reading

1. Location, Structures, and Layout of the Lyceum

Archaeological exploration of the topography of the Lyceum has been hampered by the sprawl of buildings in modern Athens. The general location of the Lyceum outside and East of the ancient city wall is well-attested (Strabo 9.1.24, Cleidemus, FGrH 323F18, and Pausanias 1.19.3). Ancient literary and epigraphic sources and modern archaeological investigation provide an occasional glimpse into the layout and use of the Lyceum area in antiquity. While most often connected with philosophical teaching and discourse, the Lyceum was used for military exercises, meetings of the Athenian assembly, and cult practice as well as athletic training.

This multiplicity of use had a direct impact on the types of structures in the area and on the general development of the Lyceum. From the earliest times, the area was characterized by large open spaces and shady groves of trees, bounded roughly by the Ilissos river to the south and the Eridanus river and Mt. Lykabettos to the north. A series of roads led to the Lyceum from in and around the city. From the sixth century BC to the sixth century AD the area saw ever increasing numbers of buildings constructed to serve its multiple functions.

Some literary references to the Lyceum give a fuller picture. For example, in the first lines of Plato’sLysis, Socrates is walking along a road from the Academy to the Lyceum that ran under the city wall when he meets his friends Hippothales and Ktesippos near the Panops springhouse (Lysis203a-204a). This springhouse may be the one mentioned by Strabo (9.1.19), who adds that these springs were “near the Lyceum.” Strabo also tells us that the Ilissus river flowed down “from above Agrai and the Lyceum” (9.1.24). In addition, Xenophon records that during a raid by the Spartans against the city from their encampment at Dekeleia to the East of the city, the Athenians came out and drew up their troops “immediately near the Lyceum gymnasium” (Hellenica 1.1.33).

Recent excavations by the Greek Archaeological Service in the area of modern Syntagma have revealed that the area immediately to the East of the ancient city wall was filled with ancient cemeteries and factories, and an immense bathing complex of the Roman period. In addition, sections of a broad, ancient road running East -West through this area have been uncovered. These finds merely add to the list of similar buildings, baths, and graves previously found in the Syntagma area.

In 1996 excavations in the area of modern Rigillis Street uncovered a structure that has been identified by the excavator as a palaistra in the Lyceum. The site continues to be excavated and studied and has not yet been fully published.

In sum, the ancient literary, epigraphic, and archaeological evidence indicates that the area known as the “Lyceum” probably covered a large area to the East of the ancient city wall, but was not immediately adjacent to the wall. It may have begun just to the West of the modern Amalias Blvd. and continued East through the modern National Gardens with the Olympieion and Ilissos river forming its southern boundaries; it may have extended northward as far as modern Kolonaki plateia. If further excavation at the site near Rigillis St. confirms the excavator’s assertions that the ancient buildings there were located in the Lyceum, then we may at least have an indication of the eastern extent of the gymnasium area.

A number of different types of construction are mentioned in the literary and epigraphic sources as being in the Lyceum: an apodyterion (dressing room), dromoi (roads or running tracks) andperipatoi (walks), a gymnasium building, and a palaistra (wrestling school), cult sanctuaries, seating areas, and stoas. Irrigation channels were constructed to keep the area green and wooded.

a. Apodyterion

Literally an “an undressing room.” The building in which the scene of Plato’s Euthydemus (272e-273b) begins. This structure may be either a part of the gymnasium building or the palaistra, or it may have stood independently to serve the covered dromos (racetrack) mentioned in the passage.

b. Dromoi and Peripatoi

Dromoi and Peripatoi: The sources refer to two different types of dromoi: 1) the main East-West road leading up to the city wall through the Lyceum (Xenophon, Hellenica 2.4.27, Xenophon, The Cavalry Commander 3.6, Callimachus, fr. 261 Pfeiffer), and 2) the running tracks (Plato,Euthydemus 272e-273b). Stretches of the main road, which ran through modern Syntagma square and past the modern Parliament building parallel to the present Vasilis Sophias Blvd. have been uncovered and should be the main dromos to which our sources refer. Excavation has not produced any evidence for the location of the dromoi for foot or horse races.

c. Gymnasium Building

An honorary decree for the Athenian statesman Lycurgus (IG II2 457) states that this building was repaired in the 330s BC. The original structure may have been built either by Pericles (Philochoros,FGrH 328F37) in the fifth century BC or Pisistratus (Theopompus, FGrH 115F136) in the sixth century BC. It is the only gymnasium building that is attested in Athens during the Classical period.

d. Palaistra

The scene of Plato’s Euthydemus, which was also perhaps repaired in the 330s BC by Lycurgus ([Plutarch], Lives of the Orators 841d).

e. Sanctuaries

The Lyceum itself was a sanctuary to Apollo, but it also contained a shrine to the Muses that housed many dedications and a portrait bust of Aristotle (Diogenes Laertius 5.51, also cf. IG II2 2613). There was also a cult of Hermes on the Lyceum grounds (IG II2 1357b4).

f. Seats

There were seats for the athlothetai (judges in an athletic contest) somewhere in the Lyceum grounds (Aischin. Soc. fr. 2.2 Dittmar=Demetr. Elocut. 205).

g. Stoas

A small stoa stood near the sanctuary to the Muses, and another stoa had maps of the earth displayed on tablets on the walls (Diogenes Laertius 5.51-52; Lucian, Anachar. 33).

h. Trees and Streams

Parts of the Lyceum were apparently wooded, and channels were dug from the Ilissus and Eridanus rivers to keep the area green. Theophrastus notes one enormous plane tree in particular that “sent out roots a distance of 33 cubits” (Theophrastus, On Plants 1.7.1). The woods were said to have been chopped down during the siege by Sulla in 86 BC (Plutarch, Sulla 12.3).

2. History of the Use of the Lyceum

The Lyceum, like the other famous Athenian gymnasia (the Academy and Cynosarges) was more than a space for physical exercise and philosophical discussion, reflection, and study. It contained cults of Hermes, the Muses, and Apollo, to whom the area was dedicated and belonged. It was also used for military exercises, the marshaling of troops, and for military displays. The Lyceum thus encompassed a fairly large area, including large open spaces, buildings, and cult sites.

The Lyceum was named after Apollo Lyceus, Apollo “the wolf-god.” From at least the sixth-century BC the Lyceum is said to have been the place where the polemarch (head of the army) had his office (Hesychius, “Epilykeion” and Suda, “ArchÙn”). The area was also used for military exercises (Suda, “Lykeion”) and for the marshaling of troops before departing on campaign (Aristophanes, Peace 351-357); it was also the site of cavalry displays (Xenophon, The Cavalry Commander 3.1). The Lyceum was also the place for meetings of the Athenian assembly before the establishment of a permanent meeting area on the Pnyx hill during the fifth century BC (IG I3 105).

The Lyceum was a place of philosophical discussion and debate well before Aristotle founded his school there in 335 BC. Socrates (Euthydemus 271a, Euthyphro 2a, Symposium 223d), Prodicus of Chios ([Plato], Eryxias 397c-d), and Protagoras (Diogenes Laertius 9.54) all apparently frequented the Lyceum to debate, discuss, and teach during the last third of the fifth-century BC. Plato’s great rival Isocrates taught rhetoric in the Lyceum during the first half of the fourth century BC, as did other sophists and philosophers. Rhapsodes were said to teach there as well (Alexis, PCG fr. 25, Antiphanes, PCG fr. 120, and Isocrates, Panathenaecus 33.5).

Upon his return to Athens in 335 BC, Aristotle rented some buildings in the Lyceum and established a school there. For nearly the remainder of his life, it was here that Aristotle lectured, wrote most of his philosophical treatises and dialogues, and systematically collected books for the first library in European history. After Aristotle’s death in 322 BC the headship of the school passed to Theophrastus, who continued his master’s program of research and teaching in the Lyceum. Theophrastus also purchased buildings and land that he bequeathed to the school in his will. However, the quality of the school’s library may have declined after Theophrastus’ death in 287 BC with the apparent loss of many of Aristotle’s works to Neleus of Scepsis (Strabo 13.1.54).

From the time of Aristotle until 86 BC there was a continuous succession of philosophers in charge of the school in the Lyceum. The common name for the school, Peripatetic, was derived either from the peripatos in the Lyceum grounds or from Aristotle’s habit of lecturing while walking. The school was a part of the military/educational institution for the city’s elite, the ephebeia. This program of study and military service provided eighteen- to twenty-year-old Athenian males with a curriculum of philosophy, knowledge of the ancestral cults, and instruction in the art of war. The Lyceum’s fame-and the fame of other schools in Athens-attracted increasing numbers of philosophers and students from all over the Mediterranean world.

The brutal sack of Athens by the Roman general Sulla in 86 BC destroyed much of the Lyceum and disrupted the life of the school considerably. The school may have been refounded later in the first century BC by Andronicus of Rhodes, but this is uncertain. By the second century AD, the Lyceum was again a flourishing center of philosophical activity. The Roman emperor Marcus Aurelius appointed teachers to all the main philosophical schools in Athens, including the Lyceum. The utter destruction of Athens in AD 267 probably ended this renaissance of scholarly activity. The work of Peripatetic philosophers continued elsewhere, but it is unclear whether they returned to the Lyceum. Nothing certain is known about the Lyceum during the remainder of the third through early sixth centuries AD. Any remaining philosophical activity would certainly have ended in AD 529, when the emperor Justinian closed all the philosophical schools in Athens.

3. References and Further Reading

  • J.P. Lynch, Aristotle’s School: A Study of a Greek Educational Institution. Berkeley 1972.
  • C.E. Ritchie, “The Lyceum, the Garden of Theophrastos and the Garden of the Muses. A Topographical Reevaluation”
  • J. Travlos, Pictorial Dictionary of Ancient Athens. Athens 1971.
  • Wycherley, R.E. The Stones of Athens. Princeton 1978.

Author Information

William Morison
Department of History


As a species of naturalized epistemology, ethnoepistemology treats all human epistemological activities as fully natural phenomena to be described, understood, and evaluated from a broadly anthropological and fully a posteriori perspective. In this spirit it examines the entire gamut of human epistemological activities ranging from those of ordinary folk and cognitive specialists (for example, diviners, shamans, priests, magicians, and scientists) to those of epistemologists themselves. Ethnoepistemology includes both domestic and non-domestic epistemological practices, and accordingly regards Western epistemological practices as simply one among many alternative, contingent epistemological projects advanced by and hence available to human beings. In this manner it aims to decenter and provincialize the definitions, aims, assumptions, methods, problems, and claims of Western epistemology.

Ethnoepistemology rejects what it considers to be the double standard embraced by most Western epistemology that exempts itself from the same kind of anthropological scrutiny that the epistemologies of non-Western cultures receive at the hands of Western ethnographers. And it also rejects the double standard that characterizes the epistemological activities of non-Western thinkers as mere ethnoepistemologies while characterizing the epistemological activities of Western thinkers as epistemology proper. Ethnoepistemologists argue that there is a dualism that is commonly expressed by the assertion that thinkers in other cultures practice mere “ethnoepistemology” or “ethnophilosophy.” What others do is thereby marginalized as mere anthropological curiosity, and those practicing it are deemed unqualified to participate in the West’s “genuinely” philosophical conversation. Indeed, the customary use of the terms “ethnophilosophy” and “ethnoepistemology” by Western philosophers is objectionable to ethnoepistemologists because it assumes that Western philosophy is the benchmark by which all other cultures’ philosophies and reflective activities are to be understood and measured, and that Western philosophy is philosophy simpliciter rather than one among many ethnophilosophies. The more broadly ecumenical and non-ethnocentric use of the term “ethnoepistemology” avoids this shortcoming since it includes all epistemological activities, be they African, East Asian, European, Native American, and so forth. And that is how the term will be used in this article. All epistemological activities are instances of ethnoepistemology in this broad sense; and all ethnoepistemologies are instances of epistemology. Finally, ethnoepistemology reflects critically upon the nature, method(s), aim(s), province and very definition of epistemology itself from the broadly anthropological, fully a posteriori perspective.

Table of Contents

  1. General Characterization
  2. Some Questions Addressed by Ethnoepistemology
    1. How Shall We Define Epistemology?
      1. A “Thin” Conception of Epistemology
      2. A “Thick” Conception of Epistemology
      3. Some Considerations Favoring a “Thin” Conception
      4. Two Further Issues
    2. What is the Nature of the Object of Epistemological Evaluation?
    3. How Important is Belief to Epistemology?
  3. Three Areas of Ethnoepistemological Inquiry
    1. The Ethnoepistemology of Ordinary Folk
    2. The Ethnoepistemology of Cognitive Specialists
    3. The Ethnoepistemology of Epistemologists
  4. References and Further Reading

1. General Characterization

Ethnoepistemology is a species of naturalized epistemology devoted to the a posteriori, anthropological style of investigation of all human epistemological activities, both domestic and non-domestic. (For an overview of naturalized epistemology, see Maffie (1990); Kitcher (1992); and Kornblith (1997.). Ethnoepistemology regards human epistemological activities as wholly natural phenomena susceptible to description, understanding, and evaluation from a broadly anthropological and fully a posteriori perspective. It examines the entire gamut of human epistemological activities ranging from those of ordinary folk and cognitive specialists to those of epistemologists themselves. What’s more, it examines not only non-domestic epistemological practices but also domestic Western epistemological practices, and regards the latter as constituting merely one among many alternative and contingent epistemological projects pursued by and available to human beings. In this manner, ethnoepistemology serves to de-center and provincialize the aims, assumptions, problems, methods, and conclusions of Western epistemology. The conception of ethnoepistemology sketched here thus differs from the dominant conception in contemporary Western academic discourse, which conceives ethnoepistemology as the study of non-Western epistemologies only. Lastly, ethnoepistemology reflects critically upon the nature, aims, and province of epistemology, from the selfsame broadly anthropological and fully a posteriori perspective.

As a species of naturalized epistemology, ethnoepistemology rejects epistemology as First Philosophy, i.e. epistemology conceived as an autonomous, a priori enterprise prior to and normative for all other inquiry. It rejects, for example, such mainstay principles of traditional Western epistemologyies, which assert that epistemology employs sui generis, a priori methods and evidence; epistemology employs evidential norms and standards epistemologically firmer or higher than those of the sciences; epistemology proceeds from a vantage point making no use of the substantive findings of the sciences; epistemology yields results epistemologically firmer or higher than those of the sciences; and epistemology is epistemologically prior to the sciences.

Ethnoepistemology conceives its own activities as continuous with the sciences. It endeavors to create such continuity by extending the epistemology of the sciences — e.g. their a posteriori evidential practices, styles of reasoning, and modes of explanation — as well as the substantive findings of the sciences into the ethnoepistemological study of epistemology. In short, ethnoepistemology is conducted within the sciences and as part of the sciences.

Ethnoepistemology thus construes inquiry into human epistemological activities as consisting of “scientific questions about a species of primates” (Quine 1975:68). It seeks an account of these activities that is compatible with creatures possessing the biology, history, cultures, and psychology of Homo Sapiens. Ethnoepistemology thus adopts a broadly interdisciplinary perspective that incorporates the findings of anthropology of knowledge, cultural anthropology, cognitive anthropology, cognitive psychology, indigenized psychology, the sociology of belief and knowledge, linguistics, history, evolutionary biology, etc., and unifies these under a single umbrella: one aptly characterized as “anthropology.” In this manner, its approach to human epistemological activities parallels anthropological approaches to other cultural practices such as morality, magic, shamanism, religion, and law. It regards all epistemological activities — ranging from the less reflective and less critical activities of ordinary folk to the more self-conscious, abstract, and reflective activities of epistemologists — as no different in principle from the aforementioned cultural activities. Epistemological activities are simply one among many natural phenomena, simply one among many human endeavors, and as such properly studied by anthropology. Ethnoepistemology thus considers epistemological activities — e.g. epistemological intuitions, judgments, concepts, norms, and goals — as amenable to the same methods of inquiry as employed by the sciences.

Ethnoepistemology approaches human epistemological activities as historically and contingently constituted natural phenomena conducted by reflective human beings. The nature, aims, norms, theories, concepts, and province of human epistemological activities are to be understood in terms of the life context in which these activities are organically rooted and sustained, rather than in terms of divine imperative, rationality per se, or pre-existing epistemological facts or principles. Epistemological goals, notions, principles, and theories are human postulates and fabrications. Epistemology is fashioned by humans and for humans. However, humans do not fashion their epistemologies in circumstances of their own choosing, and therefore do not fashion their epistemologies entirely as they please. External reality plays a role in the process. Humans fashion their ends and norms as a particular organism with a specific objective make-up, environment, and relationship to that environment which are not of its choosing and which transcend its wishes, language games, culturally-adopted evidential practices, and so forth. Consequently, that which instrumentally promotes the epistemic ends of human beings need not be necessarily socially constructed. In other words, ethnoepistemology (and naturalized epistemology generally) remains neutral between un-realist (constructivist) vs. realist theories regarding the ontological status of epistemological properties. (For supporting argument, see Maffie 1990, 1993, 1995, 1999.)

Ethnoepistemology embraces several methodological principles. The first is Reflexivity, which states that its own manner of description, explanation, and evaluation must be in principle applicable to itself. The practice of ethnoepistemology as proposed herein is itself an instance of ethnoepistemological activity and as such amenable to ethnoepistemological investigation. The second is Symmetry, according to which ethnoepistemology is symmetrical in style of explanation and evaluation. The same kinds of explanations and criteria of evaluation are employed regarding both true and false belief, justified and unjustified belief, and knowledge and ignorance. The third is Impartiality, that is to say, ethnoepistemology is impartial with respect to true and false belief, justified and unjustified belief, and knowledge and ignorance. Both sides of these dichotomies require explanation. Ethnoepistemology thus rejects the various dualisms commonly assumed by traditional epistemology that contradict these three methodological principles. (For related discussion, see Bloor 1991, and Maffie 1999.)

Ethnoepistemology examines all levels of epistemological activity conducted by all epistemological agents in all places. Therefore, ethnoepistemology is universal in scope in this threefold sense. First, it studies the epistemic practices of ordinary people, cognitive specialists such as shamans, priests, jurists and scientists, and of philosophers themselves. Philosophical activity does not transcend naturalistic (e.g., sociological, anthropological, etc.) investigation. It is one species of natural activity alongside cooking, childrearing, and counting. Professional academic philosophy, in particular, is no exception and is thus subject to anthropological scrutiny as well. Academic philosophers are simply one among many groups or subcultures alongside Roman Catholic priests, Yakut shamans, Mesoamerican curanderas, and Yoruba onisegun.

Second, ethnoepistemology studies the epistemological activities of both alien and domestic cultures, and thus incorporates non-domestic and domestic Western anthropology as well as non-domestic and domestic non-Western anthropology. Members of the American Philosophical Association along with the editors and referees of professional journals such as Philosophical Review and Mind are simply one group among many other cultural groups, and as such, are not exempt from anthropological scrutiny. Phenomena for domestic ethnoepistemological research include: (a) professional boundary-work, such as constructing the dominant epistemological canon and tradition, which includes questions such as, who is included in official histories and textbooks of epistemology, who is considered a “serious” epistemologist, and what is a “genuine” epistemological problem; and (b) professional gate-keeping activities such as editorial and investigative, and hiring and promotion decisions.

Ethnoepistemology thus rejects the tacit dualism and double standard of Western epistemology that exempts domestic (i.e. Western) epistemological practices from the same kind of anthropological scrutiny that the epistemological practices of non-Western cultures are subject to. Both are to be studied in the same manner, using the same kinds of methods, norms, and evidence. In addition, ethnoepistemology rejects the kindred dualism and double standard that characterizes the epistemological activities of non-Western cultures as ethnoepistemologies while characterizing the epistemological activities of Western culture as epistemology proper. This view is commonly expressed by the assertion that thinkers in other cultures practice mere “ethnoepistemology” or “ethnophilosophy,” whereas Western academic philosophers practice real epistemology or real philosophy. (This attitude is widespread in Western academia. Ethnoastronomy, for example, is commonly conceived as the study of non-Western astronomies, but not Western astronomy! Western astronomy is immune to anthropological examination because it is “real” astronomy, astronomy simpliciter. The same holds for ethnobotany, ethnomusicology, etc.) What non-Western thinkers do is thereby marginalized as mere anthropological curiosity (e.g. as mythologizing, poetizing, or storytelling), and they are deemed unqualified to participate in the “genuinely” philosophical discourse of the West. What thinkers in other cultures do is endemic and of local interest only. What they think is not universally relevant since it does not apply to humankind in general or reflect the human condition as such. It is simply assumed that this is not the case with Western philosophers.

Indeed, the customary use of the terms “ethnophilosophy” and “ethnoepistemology” by Western philosophers is objectionable, since it assumes that Western philosophy is the standard by which all other cultures’ philosophies and reflective activities are to be understood and measured, and that Western philosophy is philosophy simpliciter rather than one among many ethnophilosophies. (For a recent expression of this view, see Rorty 1991, 1992, 1993.) The more broadly ecumenical and non-ethnocentric use of the term “ethnoepistemology” employed here, however, avoids this shortcoming since it includes all epistemological activities, whether they African, East Asian, European or Latin American. All epistemological activities are instances of ethnoepistemology (in this broad sense); and all ethnoepistemologies are instances of epistemology.

Finally, the scope of ethnoepistemology is universal in the third sense that it subjects to anthropological scrutiny what Anglo-American analytic epistemologists call normative (or basic) level as well as meta-level epistemological activities. Normative level epistemology determines the correct theory of knowledge as well as the scope and sources of human knowledge. It also evaluates and prescribes cognitive behavior. Meta-epistemology investigates the semantics, metaphysics, and epistemology of knowledge claims. It determines the cognitive and epistemic status of epistemic judgments, the reference of epistemic expressions, the ontological status of epistemic properties, and so on. Meta-epistemology also inquires into the nature and content of epistemic ends. Ethnoepistemology examines epistemic agents’ normative level epistemological concepts, judgments, norms, and theories as well as their meta-level theories about the epistemology of epistemology, the ends of epistemology, etc.

2. Some Questions Addressed by Ethnoepistemology

Some of the questions that ethnoepistemology addresses include the following: How shall we define epistemology? What is the nature and province of epistemology? What is it about the biological constitution as well as social, cultural, and physical circumstances of humans that engender epistemic judgment, reflection, and theorizing? Why do humans practice epistemological inquiry? How do humans actually practice epistemological inquiry? What explains the importance of knowledge claims and knowledge holders (e.g. sages, scientists, priests) in the lives of humans?

What do humans actually care about when inquiring into epistemological questions? Do human epistemological activities vary across history, culture, class, race, gender, etc.? What is the ontological status of epistemic properties? Are there any nontrivial and cross-cultural generalizations regarding the epistemological landscape of humankind? Is humankind characterized by epistemological unity or relativity? Is epistemology unique to Western culture? Should humans continue to ask epistemological questions?

The foregoing questions are to be resolved a posteriori rather than by appeal to a priori intuitions, transcendental arguments, divine imperatives, rationality per se, or pre-existing epistemological facts or principles (as is customary with non-naturalist epistemologies). Ethnoepistemology regards these strategies as clever ways of begging the question with all the advantages of theft over hard empirical toil. Ethnoepistemology considers its answers to the above questions as scientific hypotheses, that is to say, fallible and corrigible.

Ethnoepistemology addresses these questions within the context of the fallible and corrigible, a posteriori, and social scientific finding that critical reflection and “the unusually stubborn attempt to think clearly” (as William James characterized philosophy) are indeed global endeavors (e.g., see Deloria et al. 1999; Deutsche and Bontekoe (eds.) 1997; Hester, Jr. and McPherson 1997; Oruka 1990; Leon-Portilla 1963; Radin 1957; and Scharfstein 1993). Let’s briefly consider two pressing questions facing ethnoepistemology.

a. How Shall We Define Epistemology?

Perhaps the most daunting issue facing ethnoepistemology is: How shall we define epistemology itself? When an intuition, concept, judgment, norm, theory or goal is epistemological, and what makes it so? When are critical reflection and “the unusual attempt to think clearly” epistemological? What definition or criterion shall ethnoepistemologists bring into the field when attempting to identify epistemological activities — as opposed to prima facie non-epistemological activities such as moral, aesthetic, prudential, parental or agricultural activities? Can we assume at the outset that epistemological activities are in principle distinct from moral, aesthetic, and other activities? Are we justified in assuming that there is even a distinctly epistemological — as opposed to moral, aesthetic or prudential — point of view?

How we answer these questions bears crucially upon our answers to other key questions such as: How do we avoid ethnocentrically begging the question in favor of our own domestic, meta-epistemological conception of epistemology and against alternative, nonequivalent conceptions advanced by other cultures? How do we avoid arbitrarily rejecting ex hypothesi alternative conceptions of the epistemological on the grounds that they are not genuinely epistemological? Bluntly put, how do we avoid the dismissive ethnocentrism — and the arrogant provincialism that typically underlies it — expressed by such prominent Western philosophers as: Edmund Husserl, who claimed that the expression “Western philosophy” is tautalogous, and the expression “non-western philosophy,”is oxymoronic (Gupta and Mohanty (eds.), 2000:xi); Emmanuel Levinas, who is quoted as having remarked, “I always say — but in private — that the Greeks and the Bible are all that is serious in humanity. Everything else is dancing” (Bernasconi, 1997:185); and Richard Rorty, (1991, 1992, 1993), who claims that looking for philosophy outside of the West is “pointless” since philosophy is unique to Western culture (quoted in Hallen, 1995:17).

i. A “Thin” Conception of Epistemology

As a start, let’s approach this issue by adopting a rather “thin” conception of epistemology. Although this conception is rooted in our own practices, it may nevertheless serve us well. After all, as contextualism has long urged, we cannot begin from scratch; we have no access to a presuppositionless, Archimedean standpoint from which to conduct inquiry. We can begin only from where we presently are.

According to this conception, epistemology consists of reflection upon the nature, source(s), and limits of knowledge. Epistemological intuitions, judgments, norms, theories, and ends are those concerned with the nature, source, and limits of knowledge. Ethnoepistemology regards this definition as a contingent, fallible, a posteriori anthropological hypothesis about the nature of our own practices — not a deliverance of a priori, rational insight into Platonic concepts or preexisting necessary truths, for example. This conception has the virtue of being sufficiently “thin” so as to enable us to capture a wide range of activities as being epistemological. When we encounter individuals, groups, or cultures and find they reflect, wonder, puzzle, or theorize about — in one degree or another, in one manner or another — the nature, source, and limits of knowledge — then we may claim that they practice epistemology. We may find them using, for example, epistemological notions such as knowledge, wisdom, and evidence or what we regard as their interpretive-translational equivalents. On the other hand, however, this conception appears sufficiently “thick” to warrant our excluding a wide range of activities from counting as epistemological such as farming, cooking, and playing chess. Hence, if we encounter individuals, groups, or cultures who do not reflect upon the nature, limits, and source of knowledge, we may claim they do not practice epistemology.

But is this definition too permissive? Does it allow us to distinguish epistemology from other human endeavors, such as morality and aesthetics, for example? Doesn’t it raise the concern that everything now qualifies as epistemology? If a culture defines right belief, evidence, or knowledge in terms of moral or aesthetic notions such as living a morally upright, genuinely human, or beautiful life, is it doing epistemology? Does it have an epistemology as opposed to an ethics or aesthetics of belief?

ii. A “Thick” Conception of Epistemology

By way of answering this question, let’s consider a “thicker” conception of epistemology. According to “thick” views, doing epistemology, having a genuinely epistemological conception of knowledge, making genuinely epistemological judgments, etc., requires that one embraces a specific definition (theory) of justification or knowledge, a specific conception of the end(s) of cognition from the epistemological point of view. “Thick” views certainly enable us to better uphold our familiar domestic distinctions between epistemology, on the one hand, and aesthetics, prudence and morality, on the other. But what is the cost?

One leading “thick” view places decisive weight on the role of truth. Many Western philosophers view correspondence truth as occupying the center stage of Western epistemology’s theories of knowledge and justification since Plato and Aristotle. The most prominent contemporary defender of this view is the North American philosopher Alvin Goldman. Goldman (1999) defends what he calls “veritism,” i.e., the thesis that humans across culture and history uniformly seek truth, epistemic notions such as justification and knowledge are properly defined in terms of truth, the aim of cognition from the epistemological point of view is truth, and a single concept of truth is cross-culturally present (namely, correspondence truth). Goldman is not alone in defending veritism, as it represents an enduring view upheld by the majority of twentieth-century Anglo-American epistemologists from William Alston and Roderick Chisholm to Bertrand Russell and Barry Stroud.

According to veritism, those who conceive of knowledge non-veritistically, as well as those who dismiss the importance or even relevance of correspondence truth to epistemological concepts, are simply not doing epistemology. They are doing something else instead, perhaps morality, aesthetics, pragmatics, etc. Therefore, even if we encounter terms in a target culture’s language that prima facie translate into English terms such as “knowledge” and “evidence,” they may not be properly translated in strictly epistemological terms. Such cultures are using “knowledge,” etc. in some alien, non-epistemological sense. For instance, they may be using the terms in a prudential or practical sense, where “to know” really means “know how,” not “know that.” Such cultures thus have a notion of practical knowledge or “knowledge how” but lack a notion of theoretical knowledge or “knowledge that.” It is the latter that is the proper focus of epistemology as such.

Goldman and others defend veritism in the face of a daunting pantheon of Western philosophers including David Hume, Friedrich Nietzsche, Martin Heidegger, William James, John Dewey, W.V.O. Quine, Nelson Goodman, and Richard Rorty, who reject the relevance of correspondence truth to epistemology, reject veritistic epistemologies, and propose alternative, non-veritistic epistemologies. What do veritists say about these philosophers? Presumably that they have abandoned epistemology per se in favor of some other activity such as reflecting upon the rightness of belief from the moral or pragmatic point of view (e.g., see Goldman, 1999).

Let’s consider this question from the broader perspective of comparative world philosophy. From this perspective, truth clearly appears to be merely one among many ends governing the regulation of belief (or cognition) and merely one among many ends in terms of which knowledge (or wisdom) is conceived. Non-veritistic cognitive ends include: living a life of balance and beauty; becoming a genuinely human; moral rectitude and purity; promoting social harmony; coexisting in harmony with nature; respect for nature; and conformity with sacred text (to name only a few). Let’s briefly review several studies.

Ben-Ami Scharfstein (2001) surveys Bhartriharian, Confucian, European Existentialist, Gangeshan, Neoplatonic, Inuit, !Kung, Navajo, and Taoist (among others) reflections upon the nature of truth and on this basis argues that no single conception of truth is shared universally by all the world’s philosophies. Humans define truth as: correspondence between verbal assertion (or language) and reality; practical utility; the sum-total of ideas that accords with reality; the way things really are (independently of verbal assertion and language); and accurate verbal articulation of what cannot be reasonably doubted because it ought not to be morally doubted.

David Hall (2001), David Hall and Roger Ames (1987, 1998), and Chad Hansen (1992), argue that classical, pre-Han Dynasty Taoist and Confucian epistemologies are not concerned with truth, true belief or truthful representation. Rather, they are concerned with identifying the proper path or appropriate model of conduct that enables humans to live the kind of life suitable for human beings. According to Confucianism, for example, the proper life consists of living harmoniously with one’s social surroundings. Correspondence truth plays no role in attaining or maintaining this life. One aims at living a life characterized by authenticity, genuineness, rectitude and wholeness — not knowledge defined as justified true belief. Confucian epistemology seeks to identify the kind of knowledge that is needed for following this path, i.e., knowledge that is performative and participatory rather than representational. Classical Chinese epistemologies seek right or appropriate belief — not true belief. If truth is relevant, it is defined in terms of genuineness or authenticity — not correspondence.

Indigenous North American philosophers Vine Deloria, Jr. (DeLoria, Jr. (1994) and DeLoria, et al (eds.), 1999) and Lee Hester (Hester and Cheney 2001), contend that indigenous North American philosophies treat cognitive states as maps rather than as beliefs. Hester claims Native American philosophy does not focus upon belief and as a consequence does not worry about the correspondence-truth of belief. Native Americans focus upon actions and practices, and adopt an attitude of non-belief (that is, neither belief nor disbelief) towards actions and practices. This attitude is rooted in the idea that one is defined by one’s actions, not one’s beliefs. Adopting the metaphor of “the map and the territory,” Hester maintains Native Americans adopt an agnostic attitude of epistemological humility regarding the correspondence-truth of their map. They are concerned with the utility of their map as a practical action-guide. Knowledge has a practical not theoretical focus; it concerns concrete experiences and narratives of actual lives in the world. Knowledge is not a species of belief.

Jim Cheney (Cheney 1998, Hester and Cheney 2001) argues that Indigenous North American philosophies conceive truth in moral terms such as responsibility, goodness and human well-being. This view of truth is a component of an ethical-epistemological orientation Cheney calls an “epistemology of respect” rather than an “epistemology of control.” Truth must responsibly guide action in the sense of promoting the well-being of everyone. It must be rooted in the world of concrete everyday practices and experiences in a way that makes possible human flourishing.

Willard Gingerich (1987), Miguel Leon-Portilla (1963), and James Maffie (2000b, 2002, 2003) maintain that pre-Hispanic indigenous Nahuatl-speaking philosophers of the High Central Plateau of Mexico conceived knowledge in non-veritistic terms such as balance, well-groundednness, moral uprightness, authenticity, and disclosingness. Correspondence truth played no role in their notions of wisdom, knowledge, proper belief, etc. Gordon Brotherston (2001) likewise argues that indigenous Amazonian philosophy conceives knowledge pragmatically in terms of the trustworthy, responsible, and careful ordering and arranging of things. It eschews broad, overarching, abstract conceptions of truth such as correspondence between propositions and world.

But what, exactly, does this survey of world philosophies show? Veritists will argue it shows very little. Regardless of what the preceding philosophers may think they are doing, they are simply not doing epistemology proper. They are doing something else: morality, aesthetics, pragmatics, or perhaps some aboriginal activity, that fails to make the necessary conceptual distinctions between the epistemological point of view, on the one hand, and the moral, aesthetic, etc., points of view, on the other.

Non-veritists, however, contend that the preceding shows veritism is a posteriori false. Goldman’s “thick” veritistic conceptions of knowledge, epistemology, and the epistemological point of view do not, as a matter of contingent fact, enjoy global acceptance. This fact demonstrates that Goldman’s veritism is simply too “thick” as a definition of the epistemological. Veritism excludes too many human activities across history and culture that are plausibly translated/interpreted as epistemological, and is therefore too restrictive to serve as an acceptable criterion for the epistemological when doing ethnoepistemology.

Furthermore, rather than simply assuming that non-veritist epistemologies mistakenly fail to draw a conceptually necessary or intrinsically rational distinction between the epistemological and the moral or aesthetic points of view, ethnoepistemology’s status as fallible, hypothetical, and a posteriori enterprise commits us to remain open to the possibilities that non-veritistic epistemologies have simply pursued an alternative path of epistemological development (one that may at some level even be incommensurable with the veritistic path), or that non-veritistic epistemologies have simply not committed the mistake of balkanizing the epistemological from the moral or aesthetic — i.e. the mistake of falsely drawing a distinction where there is no distinction to be made. After all, by naturalist lights, whether there is a distinction to be made is a contingent and a posteriori matter. The veritist’s putative distinction between these various points of view is not rooted in rationality per se, pre-existing non-natural epistemological reality, or a priori conceptual reality. In this regard, therefore, ethnoepistemologists need to be wary of a yet another version of ethnocentrism, namely, philosophical whiggism or the tendency to treat the claims and distinctions of the Western philosophical present not only as correct but as the inevitable, developmental destiny of all philosophical reflection. Comparative world philosophy clearly supports the idea that there is more than one philosophical (and epistemological) trajectory taken by humankind (see Deutsche and Bontekoe (eds.), 1997; Eze (ed.), 1996; Nuccetelli and Seay (eds.), 2004; Scharfstein, 1998; and Waters (ed.), 2004).

iii. Some Considerations Favoring a “Thin” Conception

How shall ethnoepistemology resolve this question? The “thin” conception of epistemology seems more attractive on several grounds. First, it leaves as open a posteriori question the nature and aims of knowledge and epistemology. Second, it is more inclusive. It recognizes a wider variety of possible answers to our questions concerning the nature and aims of knowledge and epistemology. Third, it achieves this inclusiveness in a manner that simultaneously respects the differences between world epistemologies. That is, it creates a common ground for world philosophers (and philosophies) without making all philosophers (and philosophies) the image of Western philosophers (philosophies). Alternatively put, it does not affirm that the non-Western “other” is doing epistemology by demanding that the non-Western “other” do precisely what Western epistemologists do and thus be indistinguishable from Western epistemologists.

Fourth, it avoids the subtle yet significant error committed by “thick” accounts such as Goldman’s. Goldman confounds normative and meta-levels of epistemology by construing his normative level definition of knowledge as a meta-epistemological constraint upon the nature of epistemology per se. As we’ve seen, Anglo-American philosophers distinguish meta- and normative levels of epistemological inquiry. Normative-level inquiry pursues such issues as the correct definition (or theory) of knowledge. Goldman’s normative-level theory of knowledge, for example, defines correspondence truth as a necessary condition knowledge. Meta-epistemological inquiry investigates the semantics, metaphysics, and epistemology of knowledge claims as well as the nature of epistemology itself. Goldman moves illegitimately from the normative level claim that truth is a necessary (defining) condition of knowledge to the logically distinct meta-level claim that truth is a necessary (defining) condition of epistemology proper. This leads Goldman to reject all non-veritistic conceptions of epistemology not on the grounds that they advocate a posteriori false theories of knowledge but on the grounds that they fail ex hypothesi to be epistemology per se.

In doing so, Goldman illegitimately construes his own peculiar meta-level theory about the correct ends of cognition from an epistemological point of view as a general definition of epistemology per se. Rather than being willing to see his view as one among many possible ways of conceiving knowledge, epistemic ends, etc., Goldman treats his way as the one and only way. In doing so, he forecloses ex hypothesi the possibility of genuine epistemological alternatives to – as well as legitimate dissent from – his own veritism.

Fifth, the “thin” conception leaves open the possibility of relativism concerning definitions of the proper ends of cognition from the epistemological point of view as well as relativism concerning definitions of knowledge, justification, evidence, right (good) belief. “Thicker” approaches, such as veritism, rule out relativism ex hypothesi; anyone who disagrees is simply not doing epistemology. Yet relativism should remain an open and contingent question; one to be resolved via a posteriori inquiry — not by conceptual fiat prior to inquiry.

Lastly, the “thin” view is less ethnocentric than the “thick.” While it is true that the “thin” view requires that others engage in the same kinds of reflective processes that we do on pain of not doing epistemology, it does not require that others arrive at the same substantive conclusions that we do in the way that “thicker” views require. Indeed, the “thin” view includes every cognitive practice we might feel inclined to translate/interpret as “epistemology.” In addition, it turns out that in most, if not all, cultures, individuals practice epistemology as “thinly” conceived.

In sum, ethnoepistemology strives to conceive epistemology as broadly, ecumenically, and open-endedly as possible without lapsing into triviality. In light of this, it adopts the “thin” definition above (at least until something better comes along).

iv. Two Further Issues

Implicit in the discussion above are two further closely related issues. First, does epistemology enjoy a metaphysical essence that necessarily distinguishes it from ethics, soccer, cooking, and pragmatics? In brief, it would seem not. Naturalism appears to afford us no such metaphysical underpinnings for human activities and no transcendental assurances concerning the eternal essence of epistemology, the ends of cognition from the epistemological point of view, or epistemology’s distinctness from other human activities such as doing science, playing chess or raising children. There is no pre-existing sui generis epistemological reality for humans to seek to discover through epistemology. Similarly, epistemology (like other human activities) does not appear to qualify as a natural kind like say, H2O, quark, and humanness. Rather, epistemology is a contingent enterprise fashioned by humans and for humans. Our conceptions of knowledge, justification and evidence as well as of epistemology itself are all contingent human fabrications.

However, this fact entails neither epistemological relativism nor metaphysical irealism regarding the ontological status of epistemological properties. Whether humankind’s epistemological activities are characterized by unity or relativity remains an open factual question to be settled a posteriori. Similarly, anti-essentialism regarding the essence of the enterprise of epistemology is compatible with realism regarding epistemic properties such as justification. (For supporting argument, see Maffie 1990, 1993, 1995, 1999).

Second, if epistemology is underpinned neither by a metaphysical essence nor by a natural kind, can we maintain that there is a pre-existing fact of the matter whether someone in another culture is really doing epistemology as opposed to something else? Can we maintain that it is precisely such facts that an adequate ethnoepistemology must capture? On the other hand must we deny the existence of such facts and maintain instead that whether or not someone is doing epistemology is ultimately a matter of our translation/interpretation of their behavior? (For relevant discussion, see Quine 1960; Davidson 1984; and Roth 1987).

b. What is the Nature of the Object of Epistemological Evaluation?

A second set of a posteriori issues confronting ethnoepistemology concerns the nature of the object of epistemological evaluation. First, assuming we define epistemology as concerned with evaluating whether or not some item qualifies as knowledge, how shall we construe the nature of knowledge: as something psychological, sociological, biological, behavioral, or ecological? Shall we think of knowledge as an entity one apprehends and possesses, as a map one uses, as an appellation bestowed by one’s social peers or as a way of acting in the world? Finally, does the actual practice of epistemology require that one construes knowledge in one of these ways rather than another?Ethnoepistemology ought to remain neutral regarding these questions in order to be as inclusive as possible regarding the variety of possible epistemologies in the world. There appears to be no compelling reason to think that the practice of epistemology proper requires that knowledge be defined as a private, mental entity as opposed to a behavioral or practical disposition; or that it be theorized as an entity to be acquired and possessed as opposed to a way of conducting one’s life, etc.

Second, if epistemology is concerned with knowledge, how shall we understand knowledge: in propositional or sentential terms (that is, as “theoretical knowledge” or “knowledge that”), or in practical terms (that is, as “practical knowledge” or “know how”)? Should we even accept this distinction? Similarly, if epistemology evaluates cognitive attitudes such as belief, should such cognitive attitudes be defined sententially, propositionally, or practically? Finally, how does this question bear upon whether a group or culture may be said to do epistemology?

Western epistemology has traditionally focused upon theoretical to the exclusion of practical knowledge. If one agrees and defines the proper concern of epistemological evaluation to be propositional knowledge (or belief), then it would appear to follow that those individuals, groups, and cultures that conceive knowledge (and belief) non-propositionally must a fortiori fail to be doing epistemology. Whatever they are doing, it simply is not epistemology.

Yet classical Chinese thought (as embodied in pre-Han Taoist and Confucian traditions) focused upon neither propositional (sentential) and theoretical attitudes nor propositional and theoretical (sentential) knowledge. Chinese linguistic theory is pragmatic, not semantic. According to Hansen, it is concerned with the assertability of “words, phrases, sentences, arguments and even whole dialogues” (Hansen 1992:44), rather than the truth of sentences or propositions. Chinese epistemology discusses zhi (knowledge) but interprets zhi non-propositionally.

The grammatical object of zhi (know) is always a noun or phrase, not a subject-predicate sentence. The kind of knowing that makes sense of Chinese views is knowing-how to do something, knowing-to-do something, or knowing-of (about) something (Hansen 1992:44).

According to Roger Ames, zhi is a way of acting in the world; it is “knowing…the ‘way’…” (Ames 1997:259). A host of indigenous North and Mesoamerican philosophies embrace remarkably similar pragmatic accounts of knowledge (and belief) (e.g., see Deloria, et al (eds.), 1999: Hester and Cheney, 2001: Gingerich, 1987: Maffie, 2002: and Waters (ed.), 2004).

Shall we conclude that East Asian and indigenous North and Mesoamerican philosophers cannot be said to be doing epistemology since they define knowledge in non-propositional, behavioral terms — that is, because they define knowledge incorrectly according to (some) Western philosopheis? Doing so clearly appears too restrictive, and ethnoepistemology therefore adopts a more ecumenical approach. We are simply confronted with different kinds of epistemologies: those concerned with propositional knowing, those concerned with non-propositional knowing, and those which reject the propositional vs. non-propositional dichotomy when characterizing knowing. Furthermore, defining the practice of epistemology per se in terms of a particular normative level theory about the nature of knowledge commits the fallacy of treating a normative level claim as a meta-epistemological level claim (see above).

c. How Important is Belief to Epistemology?

A third issue facing ethnoepistemology concerns the relevance of belief. Western epistemologists have commonly defined knowledge in terms of justified true belief, and commonly construed epistemology as being concerned with evaluating the epistemic credentials of belief. If we accept this account, what happens if there is no such thing as belief? Does epistemology go out of business? If beliefs exist but turn out to be a culturally specific cognitive phenomenon such that individuals in some cultures do not have beliefs, can they be said to practice epistemology?

Rodney Needham persuasively argues against the idea that “the institutions of…belief…express a distinct and universal mode of stable experience (Needham 1972:217), and hence the idea that belief is natural kind that cuts across culture. He quotes E.E. Evans-Pritchard as saying, “There is…no word in the Nuer language which could stand for ‘I believe'” (Needham 1972:23); no word with which to express belief. Whatever mental states, cognitive attitudes or sentiments the Nuer adopt towards the existence of, say, their gods or cosmologies, Evans-Pritchard denies they are felicitously translated/interpreted into English as “believe.” People in other cultures appear to employ different folk psychologies when characterizing their mental states (just as they employ different folk physics when characterizing their environments), and these folk psychologies need not include belief. As a consequence, we should not expect individuals in other cultures to have beliefs. Belief is simply not a useful notion in representing the mental states of individuals in (at least some) other cultures.

If Needham is correct, then it would seem that the epistemologies of such cultures as the Nuer, for example, focus upon evaluating some mental state or cognitive attitudes other than belief. But would this endeavor still qualify as epistemology? Does epistemology require that one evaluates belief specifically?

Hallen and Sodipo (1997) contend the most plausible translation/interpretation of Yoruba linguistic behavior containing abstract terms and concepts used in the evaluation and grading of information yields a reading which does not map neatly onto the English terms “belief” and “knowledge.” The Yoruba’s notions of gbagbo and mo are not logically equivalent to the English notions of belief and knowledge, respectively. Yoruba epistemological concepts and distinctions simply do not map neatly onto Anglo-American epistemological concepts and distinctions. In so arguing, the authors make a strong prima facie case for the non-universality of propositional attitudes as well as the non-universality of epistemological concepts (e.g., the concept of knowledge as justified true belief). Is the Yoruba’s evaluation of information properly characterized as epistemology? Does epistemology cease to exist in a culture wherein there is no belief to evaluate?

Chad Hansen argues that classical Chinese does not possess the notion of belief as a propositional or sentential attitude:

[It] has no grammatically parallel verb for propositional belief…. The closest counterparts to belief…focus on the term, not the sentence. Where we would say, “He believes it is good,” classical Chinese would use a structure something like, “He goods it” or He yi…(with regard to) that, wei (deems) [it] good” (Hansen 1992:44).

The closest counterparts to belief are best understood as “dispositions to use a term of some object” (Hansen 1992:44) rather than as propositional attitudes. Is epistemology possible under these circumstances?

Finally, Paul Churchland (1979, 1981), Patricia Churchland (1986, 1987), and Stephen Stich (1983) contend that the notion of belief is a theoretical constituent of Western culture’s folk psychology about what is the nature of mind. Western folk psychology will undoubtedly be supplanted by neuroscience, just as Western folk physics has been supplanted by Western scientific physics. In the process, they predict, the notion of belief will simply be eliminated, tossed into the rubbish bin of outmoded folk theoretical notions alongside unicorns, faeries, and leprechauns. If this is correct, will epistemology go out of business, or will it shift its focus to the evaluation of neurological states instead?

On this issue ethnoepistemology ought to remain neutral so as to be as inclusive as possible regarding the variety of possible world epistemologies. There are no compelling reasons for requiring that individuals have specific cognitive attitudes such as belief in order for there to be epistemology.

3. Three Areas of Ethnoepistemological Inquiry

Ethnoepistemology examines the epistemological activities of three groups of epistemic agents: ordinary folk, cognitive specialists (e.g., scientists and diviners), and epistemologists. In what follows, these are called “the ethnoepistemology of folk epistemology,” “the ethnoepistemology of cognitive specialists,” and “the ethnoepistemology of epistemology,” respectively. The three exist along a continuum since their activities differ in degree, not in kind. They differ in terms of their degree of critical self-reflection, abstraction and generality of theorizing. In one degree or another, and from time to time, ordinary folk as well as cognitive specialists engage in epistemological reflection. Reflection upon the general nature of evidence, justification, and knowledge is by no means the monopoly of professional philosophers (For supporting argument, see Maffie 1995, 1999).

Ethnoepistemology’s examination of each group admits of descriptive and critical as well as domestic and non-domestic varieties. Domestic ethnoepistemologies examine the evidential practices of one’s own culture; whereas non-domestic ethnoepistemologies examine those of alien cultures. Descriptive studies aim to describe and report faithfully the goals, norms and methodologies of various human epistemic activities. Critical studies aim to evaluate and critically reflect upon these practices. They also issue in critical or prescriptive reforming accounts of human epistemic norms, theories, and judgments.

a. The Ethnoepistemology of Ordinary Folk

The ethnoepistemology of ordinary folk examines what Goldman (1992) calls the “epistemic folkways” — i.e., the largely pre-reflective, untutored, and uncritical workaday epistemic concepts, intuitions, judgments, and norms of ordinary people.

Descriptive studies aim to describe faithfully the intuitions, judgments, standards, and goals of some particular folk epistemic practice. Such studies issue in reported accounts of epistemic folkways. They include (among others): Belenky, et al. (eds.), (1986), Code (1991), Coetze and Roux (eds.), (1998), P. Collins (1991), Crick (1982), Deloria et al (eds.), (1999), Eze (ed.), (1996), Goldman, (1986, 1992), Hallen and Sodipo, (1986), Lopez Austin, (1988), Kitchener (ed.), (2002), Radin, (1957), and Waters (ed.), (2004).

Critical studies reflect critically upon epistemic folkways and typically issue in critical evaluations of these folkways or reforming and prescriptive accounts of folk epistemic norms and concepts. Such projects include the naturalized epistemologies of Code (1991), P. Collins (1991), Goldman (1986, 1992, 1999) and Kornblith (ed.) (1997).

Incidentally, from the perspective of ethnoepistemology, self-proclaimed non-naturalist epistemologists such as Bonjour (1985) and Chisholm (1977) unwittingly practice descriptive or critical domestic ethnoepistemology of their epistemic folkways. After all, they rely upon ordinary intuitions and concepts, common sense judgments, etc., as the raw data for their a priori reflections and theories. Yet as Stephen Stich (1991:209) points out, their studies constitute “a sort of domestic cognitive anthropology which records and formalizes our culture’s commonsense epistemic notions.” Moreover, their projects are epistemologically flawed because their use of intuitions, judgments and thought-experiments amounts to little more than an appeal to anecdotal evidence.

b. The Ethnoepistemology of Cognitive Specialists

The ethnoepistemology of cognitive specialists examines the epistemological activities of curers, shamans, diviners, priests, scientists, etc. Cognitive specialists are individuals who cultivate the use of one (or more) specific method or style (e.g., altered states of consciousness, intuition, reason or observation) in the formation and regulation of cognitive attitudes. Trained in a specific cognitive method, they tend to be more self-conscious about their use of evidence, rules of evidence, evidential goals, etc., than most ordinary folk.

Descriptive studies aim to describe faithfully the epistemological concepts, judgments, norms and goals of cognitive specialists in various cultures. They may examine the practices of domestic or non-domestic cognitive specialists. Such studies include: Biagioli (1990), Bloor (1976), Deloria et al (eds.) (1999), Evans-Pritchard (1976), Goonatilake (1998), Horton (1993), Latour and Woolgar (1986), Leon-Portilla (1963, 1988), Lopez Austin (1988), Middleton (ed.) (1967), Peek (ed.) (1991), Shapin and Schaffer (1985), Sivan (1995), Turnbull (1993-1994), Watson-Verran and Turnbull (1995), and Wylie (2002).

Critical studies reflect critically upon the evidential concepts, norms, etc. of cognitive specialists. Such studies include: Bloor (1991), Callebaut (1993), Harding (1997, 1998), Harding (ed.) (1987, 1993), Latour and Woolgar (1986), Keller (1985), Quine (1951, 1969, 1975), Roth (1987, 1989) and Wylie (2002).

c. The Ethnoepistemology of Epistemologists

The ethnoepistemology of epistemologists examines the epistemological activities of epistemologists, i.e., individuals who reflect critically, abstractly, systematically, theoretically, and generally upon the nature, source and limits of knowledge per se — as opposed to the nature, source and limits of knowledge as conceived within the limits of some cognitive practice (e.g., science, religion, etc.). The ethnoepistemology of epistemologists is undoubtedly the most controversial area of ethnoepistemology since it conceives the activity of epistemologists as a straightforward natural phenomenon susceptible to a posteriori examination by cognitive psychologists, anthropologists, sociologists of knowledge, etc. Much like priests and shamans, epistemologists (and philosophers generally) typically maintain their activities and claims reside beyond the limits of naturalistic explanation since they fancy themselves able to transcend the natural realm by dint of special, non-natural cognitive faculties that provide them with privileged access to non-natural metaphysical truths, principles or facts. Ethnoepistemology insists upon studying the activities of philosophers in the same manner as anthropology studies the activities of priests, shamans, and scientists.

Descriptive ethnoepistemologies of epistemologists aim to describe faithfully the epistemological theories, intuitions, judgments, and goals of epistemologists. Such studies may be domestic or non-domestic. They include: Coetze and Roux (eds.) (1998), R. Collins (1998), Deutsche and Bontekoe (eds.) (1997), Deloria, et al (eds.) (1999), Eze (ed.) (1996), Gingerich (1987), Hall and Ames (1987, 1998), Hallen and Sodipo (1986), Kusch (1995), Leon-Portilla (1963), Maffie (2000b, 2002, 2003), Maffie (ed.) (2001), Nuccetelli and Seay (eds.) (2004), Oruka (1990), Presbey et al (eds.) (2002), Scharfstein (1998) and Waters (ed.) (2004).

Critical ethnoepistemologies of epistemologists engage critically with the epistemological concepts, principles, theories, etc., of epistemologists, both domestic and non-domestic. Such studies include: Code (1991), P. Collins (1991), Deloria et al (eds.) (1999), Deloria, Jr. and Wildcat (2001), Hall and Ames (1987, 1988), Harding (1991, 1998), Harding (ed.) (1987, 1993), Maffie (1995, 2000a, 2002, 2003), Maffie (ed.) (2001), Nuccetelli and Seay (eds.) (2004), Presbey et al (eds.) (2002), Roth (1987, 1989), Scharfstein (1993, 1998, 2001) and Waters (ed.) (2004).

Critical ethnoepistemology of epistemologists also involves high level philosophical reflection concerning the nature, aims and province of as well as motivations for epistemology. It is here that the questions enumerated above are most fruitfully addressed. How do we define epistemology itself? Is there a unique epistemological point of view, and if so what is it? How do we avoid begging the question in favor of our domestic definition? Is humankind characterized by epistemological unity or relativity? Seeing as these questions remain largely unanswered, there is much research yet to be done by ethnoepistemology.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Ames, Roger T. “Images of Reason in Chinese Culture.” Introduction to World Philosophies, Ed. Eliot Deutsche Upper Saddle River: Prentice Hall, 1997. 254-259.
  • Bernasconi, Robert. “African Philosophy’s Challenge to Continental Philosophy.” Postcolonial African Philosophy: A Critical Reader. Ed. Emmanuel Chukwadi Eze. Oxford: Blackwell, 1997. 183-193.
  • Biagioli, Mario. “The Anthropology of Incommensurability.” Studies in the History and Philosophy of Science 21 (1990):183-209.
  • Bloor, David. Knowledge and Social Imagery, 2nd ed. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1991.
  • Bonjour, L. The Structure of Empirical Knowledge. Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1985.
  • Callebaut, Werner. Taking the Naturalistic Turn or How Real Philosophy of Science is Done. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1993.
  • Campbell, Donald T. “Evolutionary Epistemology.” The Philosophy of Karl Popper. Ed. P.A. Schilpp. La Salle: Open Court, 1974. 413-463.
  • Cheney, Jim. “Universal-Consideration: An Epistemological Map of the Terrain.” Environmental Ethics 20 (1998):265-277.
  • Chisholm, R. Theory of Knowledge. 2nd Ed. Englewood Cliffs: Prentice-Hall 1977.
  • Churchland, Patricia. Neuroscience. Cambridge: MIT Press, 1986.
  • Churchland, Patricia . “Epistemology in the Age of Neuroscience.” Journal of Philosophy. 84 (1987): 544-553.
  • Churchland, Paul. Scientific Realism and the Plasticity of Mind. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1979.
  • Churchland, Paul . “Eliminative Materialism and the Propositional Attitudes.” Journal of Philosophy. 78 (1981):67-90.
  • Code, Lorraine. What Can She Know? Feminist Theory and the Construction of Knowledge. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1991.
  • Coetze, P.H., and A.P.J. Roux, eds. The African Philosophy Reader. New York: Routledge, 1998.
  • Collins, Patricia Hill. Black Feminist Thought: Knowledge, Consciousness, and the Politics of Empowerment. London: Routledge, 1991.
  • Collins, Randall. The Sociology of Philosophies: A Global Theory of Intellectual Change. Cambridge: Belknap Press, 1998.
  • Davidson, Donald. Inquiries into Truth and Interpretation. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1984.
  • Deloria, Barbara, Kristen Foehner, and Sam Scinta, eds. Spirit and Reason: The Vine DeLoria Jr., Reader. Golden, Colorado: Fulcrum, 1999.
  • Deloria, Jr., Vine, and Daniel Wildcat. Power and Place: Indian Education in America. Golden, Colorado: Fulcrum, 2001.
  • Deutsche, E., and R. Bontekoe, eds. A Companion to World Philosophies. Oxford: Blackwell, 1997.
  • Evans-Pritchard, E.E. Witchcraft, Oracles, and Magic Among the Azande. Abridged Ed., E. Giles. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1976.
  • Eze, Emmanuel Chukweze, ed. African Philosophy: A Reader. Oxford: Blackwell, 1996.
  • Giere, Ronald. Explaining Science. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1988.
  • Gingerich, Willard. “Heidegger and the Aztecs: The Poetics of Knowing in Pre-Hispanic Nahuatl Poetry.” Recovering the Word: Essays on Native American Literature. Eds. B. Swann and A. Krupat. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1987. 85-112.
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Author Information

James Maffie
University of Maryland
U. S. A.

Dualism and Mind

Dualists in the philosophy of mind emphasize the radical difference between mind and matter. They all deny that the mind is the same as the brain, and some deny that the mind is wholly a product of the brain. This article explores the various ways that dualists attempt to explain this radical difference between the mental and the physical world. A wide range of arguments for and against the various dualistic options are discussed.

Substance dualists typically argue that the mind and the body are composed of different substances and that the mind is a thinking thing that lacks the usual attributes of physical objects: size, shape, location, solidity, motion, adherence to the laws of physics, and so on. Substance dualists fall into several camps depending upon how they think mind and body are related. Interactionists believe that minds and bodies causally affect one another. Occasionalists and parallelists, generally motivated by a concern to preserve the integrity of physical science, deny this, ultimately attributing all apparent interaction to God. Epiphenomenalists offer a compromise theory, asserting that bodily events can have mental events as effects while denying that the reverse is true, avoiding any threat to the scientific law of conservation of energy at the expense of the common sense notion that we act for reasons.

Property dualists argue that mental states are irreducible attributes of brain states. For the property dualist, mental phenomena are non-physical properties of physical substances. Consciousness is perhaps the most widely recognized example of a non-physical property of physical substances. Still other dualists argue that mental states, dispositions and episodes are brain states, although the states cannot be conceptualized in exactly the same way without loss of meaning.

Dualists commonly argue for the distinction of mind and matter by employing Leibniz’s Law of Identity, according to which two things are identical if, and only if, they simultaneously share exactly the same qualities. The dualist then attempts to identify attributes of mind that are lacked by matter (such as privacy or intentionality) or vice versa (such as having a certain temperature or electrical charge). Opponents typically argue that dualism is (a) inconsistent with known laws or truths of science (such as the aforementioned law of thermodynamics), (b) conceptually incoherent (because immaterial minds could not be individuated or because mind-body interaction is not humanly conceivable), or (c) reducible to absurdity (because it leads to solipsism, the epistemological belief that one’s self is the only existence that can be verified and known).

Table of Contents

  1. Dualism
  2. Platonic Dualism in the Phaedo
    1. The Argument From Opposites
    2. The Argument From Recollection
    3. The Argument From Affinity
    4. Criticisms of the Platonic Arguments
  3. Descartes’ Dualism
    1. The Argument From Indivisibility
    2. Issues Raised by the Indivisibility Argument
    3. The Argument From Indubitability
    4. The Real Distinction Argument
  4. Other Leibniz’s Law Arguments for Dualism
    1. Privacy and First Person Authority
    2. Intentionality
    3. Truth and Meaning
    4. Problems with Leibniz’s Law Arguments for Dualism
  5. The Free Will and Moral Arguments
  6. Property Dualism
  7. Objections to Dualism Motivated by Scientific Considerations
    1. Arguments from Human Development
    2. The Conservation of Energy Argument
    3. Problems of Interaction
    4. The Correlation and Dependence Arguments
  8. The Problem of Other Minds
  9. Criticisms of the Mind as a Thinking Thing
  10. References and Further Reading

1. Dualism

The most basic form of dualism is substance dualism, which requires that mind and body be composed of two ontologically distinct substances. The term “substance” may be variously understood, but for our initial purposes we may subscribe to the account of a substance, associated with D. M. Armstrong, as what is logically capable of independent existence. (Armstrong, 1968, p. 7). According to the dualist, the mind (or the soul) is comprised of a non-physical substance, while the body is constituted of the physical substance known as matter. According to most substance dualists, mind and body are capable of causally affecting each other. This form of substance dualism is known as interactionism.

Two other forms of substance dualism are occasionalism and parallelism. These theories are largely relics of history. The occasionalist holds that mind and body do not interact. They may seem to when, for example, we hit our thumb with a hammer and a painful and distressing sensation occurs. Occassionalists, like Malebranche, assert that the sensation is not caused by the hammer and nerves, but instead by God. God uses the occasion of environmental happenings to create appropriate experiences.

According to the parallelist, our mental and physical histories are coordinated so that mental events appear to cause physical events (and vice versa) by virtue of their temporal conjunction, but mind and body no more interact than two clocks that are synchronized so that the one chimes when hands of the other point out the new hour. Since this fantastic series of harmonies could not possibly be due to mere coincidence, a religious explanation is advanced. God does not intervene continuously in creation, as the occasionalist holds, but builds into creation a pre-established harmony that largely eliminates the need for future interference.

Another form of dualism is property dualism. Property dualists claim that mental phenomena are non-physical properties of physical phenomena, but not properties of non-physical substances. Some forms of epiphenomenalism fall into this category. According to epiphenomenalism, bodily events or processes can generate mental events or processes, but mental phenomena do not cause bodily events or processes (or, on some accounts, anything at all, including other mental states). (McLaughlin, p. 277) Whether an epiphenomenalist thinks these mental epiphenomena are properties of the body or properties of a non-physical mental medium determines whether the epiphenomenalist is a property or substance dualist.

Still other dualists hold not that mind and body are distinct ontologically, but our mentalistic vocabulary cannot be reduced to a physicalistic vocabulary. In this sort of dualism, mind and body are conceptually distinct, though the phenomena referred to by mentalistic and physicalistic terminology are coextensive.

The following sections first discuss dualism as expounded by two of its primary defenders, Plato and Descartes. This is followed by additional arguments for and against dualism, with special emphasis on substance dualism, the historically most important and influential version of dualism.

2. Platonic Dualism in the Phaedo

The primary source for Plato‘s views on the metaphysical status of the soul is the Phaedo, set on the final day of Socrates’ life before his self-administered execution. Plato (through the mouth of Socrates, his dramatic persona) likens the body to a prison in which the soul is confined. While imprisoned, the mind is compelled to investigate the truth by means of the body and is incapable (or severely hindered) of acquiring knowledge of the highest, eternal, unchanging, and non-perceptible objects of knowledge, the Forms. Forms are universals and represent the essences of sensible particulars. While encumbered by the body, the soul is forced to seek truth via the organs of perception, but this results in an inability to comprehend that which is most real. We perceive equal things, but not Equality itself. We perceive beautiful things but not Beauty itself. To achieve knowledge or insight into the pure essences of things, the soul must itself become pure through the practice of philosophy or, as Plato has Socrates provocatively put it in the dialogue, through practicing dying while still alive. The soul must struggle to disassociate itself from the body as far as possible and turn its attention toward the contemplation of intelligible but invisible things. Though perfect understanding of the Forms is likely to elude us in this life (if only because the needs of the body and its infirmities are a constant distraction), knowledge is available to pure souls before and after death, which is defined as the separation of the soul from the body.

a. The Argument From Opposites

Plato’s Phaedo contains several arguments in support of his contention that the soul can exist without the body. According to the first of the Phaedo‘s arguments, the Argument from Opposites, things that have an opposite come to be from their opposite. For example, if something comes to be taller, it must come to be taller from having been shorter; if something comes to be heavier, it must come to be so by first having been lighter. These processes can go in either direction. That is, things can become taller, but they also can become shorter; things can become sweeter, but also more bitter. In the Phaedo, Socrates notes that we awaken from having been asleep and go to sleep from having been awake. Similarly, since dying comes from living, living must come from dying. Thus, we must come to life again after we die. During the interim between death and rebirth the soul exists apart from the body and has the opportunity to glimpse the Forms unmingled with matter in their pure and undiluted fullness. Death liberates the soul, greatly increasing its apprehension of truth. As such, the philosophical soul is unafraid to die and indeed looks forward to death as to liberation.

b. The Argument From Recollection

A second argument from the Phaedo is the Argument from Recollection. Socrates argues that the soul must exist prior to birth because we can recollect things that could not have been learned in this life. For example, according to Socrates we realize that equal things can appear to be unequal or can be equal in some respects but not others. People can disagree about whether two sticks are equal. They may disagree about if they are equal in length, weight, color, or even whether they are equally “sticks.” The Form of Equality—Equality Itself—can never be or appear unequal. According to Socrates, we recognize that the sticks are unequal and that they are striving to be equal but are nevertheless deficient in terms of their equality. Now, if we can notice that the sticks are unequal, we must comprehend what Equality is. Just as I could not recognize that a portrait was a poor likeness of your grandfather unless I already knew what your grandfather looked like, I cannot reccognize that the sticks are unequal by means of the senses, without an understanding of the Form of Equality. We begin to perceive at birth or shortly thereafter. Hence, the soul must have existed prior to birth. It existed before it acquires a body. (A similar argument is developed in Plato’s Meno (81a-86b).

c. The Argument From Affinity

A third argument from the Phaedo is the Argument from Affinity. Socrates claims that things that are composite are more liable to be destroyed than things that are simple. The Forms are true unities and therefore least likely ever to be annihilated. Socrates then posits that invisible things such as Forms are not apt to be disintegrated, whereas visible things, which all consist of parts, are susceptible to decay and corruption. Since the body is visible and composite, it is subject to decomposition. The soul, on the other hand, is invisible. The soul also becomes like the Forms if it is steadfastly devoted to their consideration and purifies itself by having no more association with the body than necessary. Since the invisible things are the durable things, the soul, being invisible, must outlast the body. Further, the philosophical soul, that becomes Form-like, is immortal and survives the death of the body.

d. Criticisms of the Platonic Arguments

Some of these arguments are challenged even in the Phaedo itself by Socrates’ friends Simmias and Cebes and the general consensus among modern philosophers is that the arguments fail to establish the immortality of the soul and its independence and separability from the body. (Traces of the Affinity argument in a more refined form will be observed in Descartes below). The Argument from Opposites applies only to things that have an opposite and, as Aristotle notes, substances have no contraries. Further, even if life comes from what is itself not alive, it does not follow that the living human comes from the union of a dead (i.e. separated) soul and a body. The principle that everything comes to be from its opposite via a two-directional process cannot hold up to critical scrutiny. Although one becomes older from having been younger, there is no corresponding reverse process leading the older to become younger. If aging is a uni-directional process, perhaps dying is as well. Cats and dogs come to be from cats and dogs, not from the opposites of these (if they have opposites). The Arguments from Recollection and Affinity, on the other hand, presuppose the existence of Forms and are therefore no more secure than the Forms themselves (as Socrates notes in the Phaedo at 76d-e).

We turn now to Descartes’ highly influential defense of dualism in the early modern period.

3. Descartes’ Dualism

The most famous philosophical work of René Descartes is the Meditations on First Philosophy (1641). In the Sixth Meditation, Descartes calls the mind a thing that thinks and not an extended thing. He defines the body as an extended thing and not a thing that thinks (1980, p. 93). “But what then am I? A thing that thinks. What is that? A thing that doubts, understands, affirms, denies, wills, refuses, and which also imagines and senses.” (1980, p. 63). He expands on the notion of extension in the Fifth Meditation saying, “I enumerate the [extended] thing’s various parts. I ascribe to these parts certain sizes, shapes, positions, and movements from place to place; to these movements I ascribe various durations” (1980, p. 85). Bodies, but not minds, are describable by predicates denoting entirely quantifiable qualities and hence bodies are fit objects for scientific study.

Having thus supplied us with the meanings of “mind” and “body,” Descartes proceeds to state his doctrine: “I am present to my body not merely in the way a seaman is present to his ship, but . . . I am tightly joined and, so to speak, mingled together with it, so much so that I make up one single thing with it” (1980, p. 94). The place where this “joining” was believed by Descartes to be especially true was the pineal gland—the seat of the soul. “Although the soul is joined to the whole body, there is yet in the body a certain part in which it seems to exercise its functions more specifically than in all the others. . . I seem to find evidence that the part of the body in which the soul exercises its functions immediately is. . . solely the innermost part of the brain, namely, a certain very small gland.” (1952, p. 294). When we wish to “move the body in any manner, this volition causes the gland to impel the spirits towards the muscles which bring about this effect” (1952, p. 299). Conversely, the body is also able to influence the soul. Light reflected from the body of an animal and entering through our two eyes “form but one image on the gland, which, acting immediately on the soul, causes it to see the shape of the animal.” (1952, p. 295-96).

It is clear, then, that Descartes held to a form of interactionism, believing that mental events can sometimes cause bodily events and that bodily events can sometimes cause mental events. (This reading of Descartes-as-interactionist has recently been challenged. See Baker and Morris (1996). Also, Daniel Garber suggests that Descartes is a quasi-occasionalist, permitting minds to act on bodies, but invoking God to explain the actions of inanimate bodies on each other and phenomena where bodies act on minds, such as sensation. See Garber, 2001, ch. 10).

a. The Argument From Indivisibility

Descartes’ primary metaphysical justification of the distinction of mind and body is the Argument from Indivisibility. He writes, “there is a great difference between a mind and a body, because the body, by its very nature, is something divisible, whereas the mind is plainly indivisible. . . insofar as I am only a thing that thinks, I cannot distinguish any parts in me. . . . Although the whole mind seems to be united to the whole body, nevertheless, were a foot or an arm or any other bodily part amputated, I know that nothing would be taken away from the mind. . .” (1980, p. 97). Decartes argues that the mind is indivisible because it lacks extension. The body, as an object that takes up space, can always be divided (at least conceptually), whereas the mind is simple and non-spatial. Since the mind and body have different attributes, they must not be the same thing, their “unity” notwithstanding.

This Indivisibility Argument makes use of Leibniz’s Law of Identity: two things are the same if, and only if, they have all of the same properties at the same time. More formally, x is identical to y if, and only if, for any property p had by x at time t, y also has p at t, and vice versa. Descartes uses Leibniz’s Law to show that the mind and body are not identical because they do not have all of the same properties. An illustration (for present purposes a property can be considered anything that may be predicated of a subject): If the man with the martini is the mayor, it must be possible to predicate all and only the same properties of both “the man” and “the mayor,” including occupying (or having bodies that occupy) the same exact spatial location at the same time.

Since divisibility may be predicated of bodies (and all of their parts, such as brains) and may not be predicated of minds, Leibniz’s Law suggests that minds cannot be identical to bodies or any of their parts or systems. Although it makes sense to speak of the left or right half of the brain, it makes no sense to speak of half of a desire, several pieces of a headache, part of joy, or two-thirds of a belief. What is true of mental states is held to be true of the mind that has the states as well. In the synopsis of the Meditations, Descartes writes, “we cannot conceive of half a soul, as we can in the case of any body, however small.” (1980, p. 52). The mind has many ideas, but they are all ideas of one indivisible mind.

b. Issues Raised by the Indivisibility Argument

John Locke argued that awareness is rendered discontinuous by intervals of sleep, anesthesia, or unconsciousness. (Bk.II, ch.I, sect.10). Is awareness then divisible? Locke suggests that the mind cannot exhibit temporal discontinuity and also have thought as its essence. But even if Descartes was wrong to consider the mind an essentially thinking thing, the concept of mind is not reduced to vacuity if some other, positive characteristic can be found by which to define it. But what might that be? (Without some such means of characterizing the mind it would be defined entirely negatively and we would have no idea what it is).

Against Locke, Dualists can argue in several ways. (1) That the mind has both conscious and unconscious thoughts and that Locke’s argument shows only that the mind is not always engaged in conscious reflection, though it may be perpetually busy at the unconscious level. Locke argues that such a maneuver creates grave difficulties for personal identity (Bk.II, Ch.I, sect.11), however, and denies that thoughts can exist unperceived. (2) Dualists can argue that the soul always thinks, but that the memory fails to preserve those thoughts when asleep or under anesthesia. (3) Dualists can argue that the Lockean observation is not relevant to the Argument from Indivisibility because the discontinuity Locke identifies in consciousness is not a spatial discontinuity but a temporal one. The Argument from Indivisibility seeks to show that bodies but not minds are spatially divisible and that argument is not rebutted by pointing out that consciousness is temporally divisible. (Indeed, if minds are temporally divisible and bodies are not, we have an argument for dualism of a different sort).

David Hume, on the other hand, questioned of what the unity of consciousness might consist. The Indivisibility Argument suggests that the mind is a simple unity. Hume finds no reason to grant or assume that the diversity of our experiences (whether visual perception, pain or active thinking and mathematical apprehension) constitute a unity rather than a diversity. For Hume, all introspection reveals is the presence of various impressions and ideas, but does not reveal a subject in which those ideas inhere. Accordingly, if observation is to yield knowledge of the self, the self can consist in nothing but a bundle of perceptions. Even talk of a “bundle” is misleading if that suggests an empirically discoverable internal unity. Thus, Descartes’ commitment to a res cogitans or thing which thinks is unfounded and substance dualism is undermined. (For a contrary view on what constitutes the unity of the self, see Madell’s view that, “What unites all of my experiences…is simply that they all have the irreducible and unanalyzable property of ‘mineness,'” in Nagel, 1986, p. 34, n. 5).

Immanuel Kant replied to Hume that we must suppose or posit the unity of the ego (which he called the “transcendental unity of apperception”) as a preliminary to all experience since without such a unity the manifold of sense-data (or “sensibility”) could not constitute, for example, the experience of seeing a clock. However, Kant agreed that we must not mistake the unity of apperception for the perception of unity—that is, the perception of a unitary thing or substance. Kant also argued that there is little reason to suppose that the mind or ego cannot be destroyed despite its unity since its powers may gradually attenuate to the point where they simply fade away. The mind need not be separated into non-physical granules to be destroyed since it can suffer a kind of death through loss of its powers. Awareness, perception, memory and the like admit of degrees. If the degree of consciousness decreases to zero, then the mind is effectively annihilated. Even if, as Plato and Descartes agree, the mind is not divisible, it does not follow that it survives (or could survive) separation from the body. Additionally, if the mind is neither physical nor identical to its inessential characteristics (1980, p. 53), it is impossible to distinguish one mind from another. Kant argues that two substances that are otherwise identical can be differentiated only by their spatial locations. If minds are not differentiated by their contents and have no spatial positions to distinguish them, there remains no basis for individuating their identities. (On numerically individuating non-physical substances, see Armstrong, 1968, pp. 27-29. For a general discussion of whether the self is a substance, see Shoemaker, 1963, ch. 2).

c. The Argument From Indubitability

Descartes’ other major argument for dualism in the Meditations derives from epistemological considerations. After taking up his celebrated method of doubt, which commits him to reject as false anything that is in the slightest degree uncertain, Descartes finds that the entirety of the physical world is uncertain. Perhaps, after all, it is nothing but an elaborate phantasm wrought by an all-powerful and infinitely clever, but deceitful, demon. Still, he cannot doubt his own existence, since he must exist to doubt. Because he thinks, he is. But he cannot be his body, since that identity is doubtful and possibly altogether false. Therefore, he is a non-bodily “thinking thing,” or mind. As Richard Rorty puts it: “If we look in Descartes for a common factor which pains, dreams, memory-images, and veridical and hallucinatory perceptions share with concepts of (and judgments about) God, number, and the ultimate constituents of matter, we find no explicit doctrine. . . . The answer I would give to the question ‘What did Descartes find?’ is ‘Indubitability'” (1979 p. 54). In sum, I cannot doubt the existence of my mind, but I can doubt the existence of my body. Since what I cannot doubt cannot be identical to what I can doubt (by Leibniz’s Law), mind and body are not identical and dualism is established.

This argument is also featured in Descartes’ Discourse on Method part four: “[S]eeing that I could pretend that I had no body and that there was no world nor any place where I was, but that I could not pretend, on that account, that I did not exist; and that, on the contrary, from the very fact that I thought about doubting the truth of other things, it followed very evidently and very certainly that I existed. . . . From this I knew that I was a substance the whole essence or nature of which was merely to think, and which, in order to exist, needed no place and depended on no material things. Thus this ‘I,’ that is, the soul through which I am what I am, is entirely distinct from the body. . .” (1980, p. 18).

The Argument from Indubitability has been maligned in the philosophical literature from the very beginning. Most famously, Arnauld comments in the objections originally published with the Meditations that, “Just as a man errs in not believing that the equality of the square on its base to the squares on its sides belongs to the nature of that triangle, which he clearly and distinctly knows to be right angled, so why am I perhaps not in the wrong in thinking that nothing else belongs to my nature which I clearly and distinctly know to be something that thinks, except that fact that I am this thinking being? Perhaps it also belongs to my essence to be something extended.” (1912, p. 84). Suppose that I cannot doubt whether a given figure is a triangle, but can doubt whether its interior angles add up to two right angles. It does not follow from this that the number of degrees in triangles may be more or less than 180. This is because the doubt concerning the number of degrees in a triangle is a property of me, not of triangles. Similarly, I may doubt that my body is not a property of my body, believing it to be a property of whatever part of me it is that doubts, and that “whatever” may be something extended.

The dualist can reply in two ways. First, he or she may argue that, while doubting the body is not a property of bodies, being doubtable is a property of bodies. Since bodies have the property of being doubtable, and minds do not, by Leibniz’s Law the diversity of the two is established. Second, the dualist may reply that it is always possible to doubt whether the figure before me is a triangle. As such, Arnauld’s supposedly parallel argument is not parallel at all. Similar objections are open against other, more recent rebuttals to Descartes’ argument. Consider, for example, the following parallel argument from Paul Churchland (1988, p. 32): I cannot doubt that Mohammed Ali was a famous heavyweight boxer but can doubt that Cassius Clay was a famous heavyweight boxer. Following Descartes, it ought to be that Ali is not Clay (though in fact Clay was a famous heavyweight and identical to Ali). By way of reply, surely it is possible for an evil demon to deceive me about whether Mohammed Ali was a famous heavyweight boxer. So, the dualist might insist, the case of mind is unique in its immunity from doubt. It is only with reference to our own mental states that we can be said to know incorrigibly.

d. The Real Distinction Argument

A third argument in the Meditations maintains that the mind and body must really be separate because Descartes can conceive of the one without the other. Since he can clearly and distinctly understand the body without the mind and vice versa, God could really have created them separately. But if the mind and body can exist independently, they must really be independent, for nothing can constitute a part of the essence of a thing that can be absent without the thing itself ceasing to be. If the essence of the mind is incorporeal, so must be the mind itself.

4. Other Leibniz’s Law Arguments for Dualism

a. Privacy and First Person Authority

As noted earlier, dualists have argued for their position by employing Leibniz’s Law in many ingenious ways. The general strategy is to identify some property or feature indisputably had by mental phenomena but not attributable in any meaningful way to bodily or nervous phenomena, or vice versa. For example, some have suggested that mental states are private in the sense that only those who possess them can know them directly. If I desire an apple, I know that I have this desire “introspectively.” Others can know of my desire only by means of my verbal or non-verbal behavior or, conceivably, by inspection of my brain. (The latter assumes a correlation, if not an identity, between nervous and mental states or events). My linguistic, bodily and neural activities are public in the sense that anyone suitably placed can observe them. Since mental states are private to their possessors, but brain states are not, mental states cannot be identical to brain states. (Rey pp. 55-56).

A closely related argument emphasizes that my own mental states are knowable without inference; I know them “immediately.” (Harman, 1973, pp. 35-37). Others can know my mental states only by making inferences based on my verbal, non-verbal or neurophysiological activity. You may infer that I believe it will rain from the fact that I am carrying an umbrella, but I do not infer that I believe it will rain from noticing that I am carrying an umbrella. I do not need to infer my mental states because I know them immediately. Since mental states are knowable without inference in the first person case, but are knowable (or at least plausibly assigned) only by inference in the third person case, we have an authority or incorrigibility with reference to our own mental states that no one else could have. Since beliefs about the physical world are always subject to revision (our inferences or theories could be mistaken), mental states are not physical states.

b. Intentionality

Some mental states exhibit intentionality. Intentional mental states include, but are not limited to, intendings, such as plans to buy milk at the store. They are states that are about, of, for, or towards things other than themselves. Desires, beliefs, loves, hates, perceptions and memories are common intentional states. For example, I may have a desire for an apple; I may have love for or towards my neighbor; I may have a belief about republicans or academics; or I may have memories of my grandfather.

The dualist claims that brain states, however, cannot plausibly be ascribed intentionality. How can a pattern of neural firings be of or about or towards anything other than itself? As a purely physical event, an influx of sodium ions through the membrane of a neural cell creating a polarity differential between the inside and outside of the cell wall, and hence an electrical discharge, cannot be of Paris, about my grandfather, or for an apple. [Although Brentano goes further than most contemporary philosophers in regarding all mental phenomena as intentional, he argues that “the reference to something as an object is a distinguishing characteristic of all mental phenomena. No physical phenomena exhibits anything similar.” (Brentano, 1874/1973, p. 97, quoted in Rey, 1997, p. 23).] Thus, by Leibniz’s Law, if minds are capable of intentional states and bodies are not, minds and bodies must be distinct. (Taylor, pp. 11-12; Rey pp. 57-59).

c. Truth and Meaning

Another attempt to derive dualism by means of Leibniz’s Law observes that some mental states, especially beliefs, have truth-values. My belief that it will rain can be either true or false. But, the dualist may urge, as a purely physical event, an electrical or chemical discharge in the brain cannot be true or false. Indeed, it lacks not only truth, but also linguistic meaning. Since mental states such as beliefs possess truth-value and semantics, it seems incoherent to attribute these properties to bodily states. Thus, mental states are not bodily states. Presumably, then, the minds that have these states are also non-physical. (Churchland, 1988, p. 30; Taylor, 1983, p. 12).

d. Problems with Leibniz’s Law Arguments for Dualism

Although each of these arguments for dualism may be criticized individually, they are typically thought to share a common flaw: they assume that because some aspect of mental states, such as privacy, intentionality, truth, or meaning cannot be attributed to physical substances, they must be attributable to non-physical substances. But if we do not understand how such states and their properties can be generated by the central nervous system, we are no closer to understanding how they might be produced by minds. (Nagel, 1986, p. 29). The question is not, “How do brains generate mental states that can only be known directly by their possessors?” Rather, the relavent question is “How can any such thing as a substance, of whatever sort, do these things?” The mystery is as great when we posit a mind as the basis of these operations or capacities as when we attribute them to bodies. Dualists cannot explain the mechanisms by which souls generate meaning, truth, intentionality or self-awareness.Thus, dualism creates no explanatory advantage. As such, we should use Ockham’s razor to shave off the spiritual substance, because we ought not to multiply entities beyond what is necessary to explain the phenomena. Descartes’ prodigious doubt notwithstanding, we have excellent reasons for thinking that bodies exist. If the only reasons for supposing that non-physical minds exist are the phenomena of intentionality, privacy and the like, then dualism unnecessarily complicates the metaphysics of personhood.

On the other hand, dualists commonly argue that it makes no sense to attribute some characteristics of body to mind; that to do so is to commit what Gilbert Ryle called a “category mistake.” For example, it makes perfect sense to ask where the hypothalamus is, but not, in ordinary contexts, to ask where my beliefs are. We can ask how much the brain weighs, but not how much the mind weighs. We can ask how many miles per hour my body is moving, but not how many miles per hour my mind is moving. Minds are just not the sorts of things that can have size, shape, weight, location, motion, and the other attributes that Descartes ascribes to extended reality. We literally could not understand someone who informed us that the memories of his last holiday are two inches behind the bridge of his nose or that his perception of the color red is straight back from his left eye. If these claims are correct, then some Leibniz’s Law arguments for dualism are not obviously vulnerable to the critique above.

5. The Free Will and Moral Arguments

Another argument for dualism claims that dualism is required for free will. If dualism is false, then presumably materialism, the thesis that humans are entirely physical beings, is true. (We set aside consideration of idealism—the thesis that only minds and ideas exist). If materialism were true, then every motion of bodies should be determined by the laws of physics, which govern the actions and reactions of everything in the universe. But a robust sense of freedom presupposes that we are free, not merely to do as we please, but that we are free to do otherwise than as we do. This, in turn, requires that the cause of our actions not be fixed by natural laws. Since, according to the dualist, the mind is non-physical, there is no need to suppose it bound by the physical laws that govern the body. So, a strong sense of free will is compatible with dualism but incompatible with materialism. Since freedom in just this sense is required for moral appraisal, the dualist can also argue that materialism, but not dualism, is incompatible with ethics. (Taylor, 1983, p. 11; cf. Rey, 1997, pp. 52-53). This, the dualist may claim, creates a strong presumption in favor of their metaphysics.

This argument is sometimes countered by arguing that free will is actually compatible with materialism or that even if the dualistic account of the will is correct, it is irrelevant because no volition on the part of a non-physical substance could alter the course of nature anyway. As Bernard Williams puts it, “Descartes’ distinction between two realms, designed to insulate responsible human action from mechanical causation, insulated the world of mechanical causation, that is to say, the whole of the external world, from responsible human action. Man would be free only if there was nothing he could do.” (1966, p. 7). Moreover, behaviorist opponents argue that if dualism is true, moral appraisal is meaningless since it is impossible to determine another person’s volitions if they are intrinsically private and otherworldly.

6. Property Dualism

Property dualists claim that mental phenomena are non-physical properties of physical phenomena, but not properties of non-physical substances. Property dualists are not committed to the existence of non-physical substances, but are committed to the irreducibility of mental phenomena to physical phenomena.

An argument for property dualism, derived from Thomas Nagel and Saul Kripke, is as follows: We can assert that warmth is identical to mean kinetic molecular energy, despite appearances, by claiming that warmth is how molecular energy is perceived or manifested in consciousness. Minds detect molecular energy by experiencing warmth; warmth “fixes the reference” of heat. (“Heat” is a rigid designator of molecular motion; “the sensation of heat” is a non-rigid designator.) Similarly, color is identical to electromagnetic reflectance efficiencies, inasmuch as color is how electromagnetic wavelengths are processed by human consciousness. In these cases, the appearance can be distinguished from the reality. Heat is molecular motion, though it appears to us as warmth. Other beings, for example, Martians, might well apprehend molecular motion in another fashion. They would grasp the same objective reality, but by correlating it with different experiences. We move toward a more objective understanding of heat when we understand it as molecular energy rather than as warmth. in our case, or as whatever it appears to them to be in theirs. Consciousness itself, however, cannot be reduced to brain activity along analogous lines because we should then need to say that consciousness is how brain activity is perceived in consciousness, leaving consciousness unreduced. Put differently, when it comes to consciousness, the appearance is the reality. Therefore, no reduction is possible. Nagel writes:

Experience . . . does not seem to fit the pattern. The idea of moving from appearance to reality seems to make no sense here. What is the analogue in this case to pursuing a more objective understanding of the same phenomena by abandoning the initial subjective viewpoint toward them in favor of another that is more objective but concerns the same thing? Certainly it appears unlikely that we will get closer to the real nature of human experience by leaving behind the particularity of our human point of view and striving for a description in terms accessible to beings that could not imagine what it was like to be us. (Nagel 1974; reprinted in Block et. al. p. 523).

Consciousness is thus sui generis (of its own kind), and successful reductions elsewhere should give us little confidence when it comes to experience.

Some property dualists, such as Jaegwon Kim, liken “having a mind” to “a property, capacity, or characteristic that humans and some higher animals possess in contrast with things like pencils and rocks. . . . Mentality is a broad and complex property.” (Kim, 1996, p. 5). Kim continues: “[Some properties] are physical, like having a certain mass or temperature, being 1 meter long, and being heavier than. Some things—in particular, persons and certain biological organisms—can also instantiate mental properties, like being in pain and liking the taste of avocado.” (p. 6). Once we admit the existence of mental properties, we can inquire into the nature of the relationship between mental and physical properties. According to the supervenience thesis, there can be no mental differences without corresponding physical differences. If, for example, I feel a headache, there must be some change not only in my mental state, but also in my body (presumably, in my brain). If Mary is in pain, but Erin is not, then, according to the supervenience thesis, there must be a physical difference between Mary and Erin. For example, Mary’s c-fibers are firing and Erin’s are not. If this is true, it is possible to argue for a type of property dualism by arguing that some mental states or properties, especially the phenomenal aspects of consciousness, do not “supervene on” physical states or properties in regular, lawlike ways. (Kim, p. 169).

Why deny supervenience? Because it seems entirely conceivable that there could exist a twin Earth where all of the physical properties that characterize the actual world are instantiated and are interrelated as they are here, but where the inhabitants are “zombies” without experience, or where the inhabitants have inverted qualia relative to their true-Earth counterparts. If it is possible to have mental differences without physical differences, then mental properties cannot be identical to or reducible to physical properties. They would exist as facts about the world over and above the purely physical facts. Put differently, it always makes sense to wonder “why we exist and not zombies.” (Chalmers, 1996, p. 110). (Kim, 169 and following.; Kripke, 1980, throughout; Chalmers, 1996, throughout, but esp. chs. 3 & 4).

Some have attempted to rebut this “conceivability argument” by noting that the fact that we can ostensibly imagine such a zombie world does not mean that it is possible. Without the actual existence of such a world, the argument that mental properties do not supervene on physical properties fails.

A second rebuttal avers that absent qualia thought experiments (and inverted spectra though experiments) only support property dualism if we can imagine these possibilities obtaining. Perhaps we think we can conceive a zombie world, when we really can’t. We may think we can conceive of such a world but attempts to do so do not actually achieve such a conception.

To illustrate, suppose that Goldbach’s Conjecture is true. If it is, its truth is necessary. If, then, someone thought that they imagined a proof that the thesis is false, they would be conceiving the falsity of what is in reality a necessary truth. This is implausible. What we should rather say in such a case is that the person was mistaken, and that what they imagined false was not Goldbach’s Conjecture after all, or that the “proof” that was imagined was in fact no proof, or that what they were really imagining was something like an excited mathematician shouting, “Eureka! So it’s false then!” Perhaps it is likewise when we “conceive” a zombie universe. We may be mistaken about what it is that we are actually “picturing” to ourselves. Against this objection, however, one could argue that there are independent grounds for thinking that the truth-value of Goldbach’s theorem is necessary and no independent reasons for thinking that Zombie worlds are impossible; therefore, the dualist deserves the benefit of the doubt.

But perhaps the physicalist can come up with independent reasons for supposing that the dualist has failed to imagine what she claims. The physicalist can point, for example, to successful reductions in other areas of science. On the basis of these cases she can argue the implausibility of supposing that, uniquely, mental phenomena resist reduction to the causal properties of matter. That is, an inductive argument for reduction outweighs a conceivability argument against reduction. And in that case, the dualist must do more than merely insist that she has correctly imagined inverted spectra in isomorphic individuals. (For useful discussions of some of these issues, see Tye 1986 and Horgan 1987.)

7. Objections to Dualism Motivated by Scientific Considerations

The Ockham’s Razor argument creates a strong methodological presumption against dualism, suggesting that the mind-body split multiplies entities unnecessarily in much the way that a demon theory of disease complicates the metaphysics of medicine compared to a germ theory. It is often alleged, more broadly, that dualism is unscientific and renders impossible any genuine science of mind or truly empirical psychology.

a. Arguments from Human Development

Those eager to defend the relevance of science to the study of mind, such as Paul Churchland, have argued that dualism is inconsistent with the facts of human evolution and fetal development. (1988, pp. 27-28; see also Lycan, 1996, p. 168). According to this view, we began as wholly physical beings. This is true of the species and the individual human. No one seriously supposes that newly fertilized ova are imbued with minds or that the original cell in the primordial sea was conscious. But from those entirely physical origins, nothing non-physical was later added. We can explain the evolution from the unicellular stage to present complexities by means of random mutations and natural selection in the species case and through the accretion of matter through nutritional intake in the individual case. But if we, as species or individuals, began as wholly physical beings and nothing nonphysical was later added, then we are still wholly physical creatures. Thus, dualism is false. The above arguments are only as strong as our reasons for thinking that we began as wholly material beings and that nothing non-physical was later added. Some people, particularly the religious, will object that macro-evolution of a species is problematic or that God might well have infused the developing fetus with a soul at some point in the developmental process (traditionally at quickening). Most contemporary philosophers of mind put little value in these rejoinders.

b. The Conservation of Energy Argument

Others argue that dualism is scientifically unacceptable because it violates the well-established principle of the conservation of energy. Interactionists argue that mind and matter causally interact. But if the spiritual realm is continually impinging on the universe and effecting changes, the total level of energy in the cosmos must be increasing or at least fluctuating. This is because it takes physical energy to do physical work. If the will alters states of affairs in the world (such as the state of my brain), then mental energy is somehow converted into physical energy. At the point of conversion, one would anticipate a physically inexplicable increase in the energy present within the system. If it also takes material energy to activate the mind, then “physical energy would have to vanish and reappear inside human brains.” (Lycan, 1996, 168).

The dualists’ basically have three ways of replying. First, they could deny the sacredness of the principle of the conservation of energy. This would be a desperate measure. The principle is too well established and its denial too ad hoc. Second, the dualist might offer that mind does contribute energy to our world, but that this addition is so slight, in relation to our means of detection, as to be negligible. This is really a re-statement of the first reply above, except that here the principle is valid in so far as it is capable of verification. Science can continue as usual, but it would be unreasonable to extend the law beyond our ability to confirm it experimentally. That would be to step from the empirical to the speculative—the very thing that the materialist objects to in dualism. The third option sidesteps the issue by appealing to another, perhaps equally valid, principle of physics. Keith Campbell (1970) writes:

The indeterminacy of quantum laws means that any one of a range of outcomes of atomic events in the brain is equally compatible with known physical laws. And differences on the quantum scale can accumulate into very great differences in overall brain condition. So there is some room for spiritual activity even within the limits set by physical law. There could be, without violation of physical law, a general spiritual constraint upon what occurs inside the head. (p. 54)

Mind could act upon physical processes by “affecting their course but not breaking in upon them” (1970, p. 54). If this is true, the dualist could maintain the conservation principle but deny a fluctuation in energy because the mind serves to “guide” or control neural events by choosing one set of quantum outcomes rather than another. Further, it should be remembered that the conservation of energy is designed around material interaction; it is mute on how mind might interact with matter. After all, a Cartesian rationalist might insist, if God exists we surely wouldn’t say that He couldn’t do miracles just because that would violate the first law of thermodynamics, would we?

c. Problems of Interaction

The conservation of energy argument points to a more general complaint often made against dualism: that interaction between mental and physical substances would involve a causal impossibility. Since the mind is, on the Cartesian model, immaterial and unextended, it can have no size, shape, location, mass, motion or solidity. How then can minds act on bodies? What sort of mechanism could convey information of the sort bodily movement requires, between ontologically autonomous realms? To suppose that non-physical minds can move bodies is like supposing that imaginary locomotives can pull real boxcars. Put differently, if mind-body interaction is possible, every voluntary action is akin to the paranormal power of telekinesis, or “mind over matter.” If minds can, without spatial location, move bodies, why can my mind move immediately only one particular body and no others? Confronting the conundrum of interaction implicit in his theory, Descartes posited the existence of “animal spirits” somewhat subtler than bodies but thicker than minds. Unfortunately, this expedient proved a dead-end, since it is as incomprehensible how the mind could initiate motion in the animal spirits as in matter itself.

These problems involved in mind-body causality are commonly considered decisive refutations of interactionism. However, many interesting questions arise in this area. We want to ask: “How is mind-body interaction possible? Where does the interaction occur? What is the nature of the interface between mind and matter? How are volitions translated into states of affairs? Aren’t minds and bodies insufficiently alike for the one to effect changes in the other?”

It is useful to be reminded, however, that to be bewildered by something is not in itself to present an argument against, or even evidence against, the possibility of that thing being a matter of fact. To ask “How is it possible that . . . ?” is merely to raise a topic for discussion. And if the dualist doesn’t know or cannot say how minds and bodies interact, what follows about dualism? Nothing much. It only follows that dualists do not know everything about metaphysics. But so what? Psychologists, physicists, sociologists, and economists don’t know everything about their respective disciplines. Why should the dualist be any different? In short, dualists can argue that they should not be put on the defensive by the request for clarification about the nature and possibility of interaction or by the criticism that they have no research strategy for producing this clarification.

The objection that minds and bodies cannot interact can be the expression of two different sorts of view. On the one hand, the detractor may insist that it is physically impossible that minds act on bodies. If this means that minds, being non-physical, cannot physically act on bodies, the claim is true but trivial. If it means that mind-body interaction violates the laws of physics (such as the first law of thermodynamics, discussed above), the dualist can reply that minds clearly do act on bodies and so the violation is only apparent and not real. (After all, if we do things for reasons, our beliefs and desires cause some of our actions). If the materialist insists that we are able to act on our beliefs, desires and perceptions only because they are material and not spiritual, the dualist can turn the tables on his naturalistic opponents and ask how matter, regardless of its organization, can produce conscious thoughts, feelings and perceptions. How, the dualist might ask, by adding complexity to the structure of the brain, do we manage to leap beyond the quantitative into the realm of experience? The relationship between consciousness and brain processes leaves the materialist with a causal mystery perhaps as puzzling as that confronting the dualist.

On the other hand, the materialist may argue that it is a conceptual truth that mind and matter cannot interact. This, however, requires that we embrace the rationalist thesis that causes can be known a priori. Many prefer to assert that causation is a matter for empirical investigation. We cannot, however, rule out mental causes based solely on the logic or grammar of the locutions “mind” and “matter.” Furthermore, in order to defeat interactionism by an appeal to causal impossibility, one must first refute the Humean equation of causal connection with regularity of sequence and constant conjunction. Otherwise, anything can be the cause of anything else. If volitions are constantly conjoined with bodily movements and regularly precede them, they are Humean causes. In short, if Hume is correct, we cannot refute dualism a priori by asserting that transactions between minds and bodies involve links where, by definition, none can occur.

Some, such as Ducasse (1961, 88; cf. Dicker pp. 217-224), argue that the interaction problem rests on a failure to distinguish between remote and proximate causes. While it makes sense to ask how depressing the accelerator causes the automobile to speed up, it makes no sense to ask how pressing the accelerator pedal causes the pedal to move. We can sensibly ask how to spell a word in sign language, but not how to move a finger. Proximate causes are “basic” and analysis of them is impossible. There is no “how” to basic actions, which are brute facts. Perhaps the mind’s influence on the pineal gland is basic and brute.

One final note: epiphenomenalism, like occasionalism and parallelism, is a dualistic theory of mind designed, in part, to avoid the difficulties involved in mental-physical causation (although occasionalism was also offered by Malebranche as an account of seemingly purely physical causation). According to epiphenomenalism, bodies are able to act on minds, but not the reverse. The causes of behavior are wholly physical. As such, we need not worry about how objects without mass or physical force can alter behavior. Nor need we be concerned with violations of the conservation of energy principle since there is little reason to suppose that physical energy is required to do non-physical work. If bodies affect modifications in the mental medium, that need not be thought to involve a siphoning of energy from the world to the psychic realm. On this view, the mind may be likened to the steam from a train engine; the steam does not affect the workings of the engine but is caused by it. Unfortunately, epiphenomenalism avoids the problem of interaction only at the expense of denying the common-sense view that our states of mind have some bearing on our conduct. For many, epiphenomenalism is therefore not a viable theory of mind. (For a defense of the common-sense claim that beliefs and attitudes and reasons cause behavior, see Donald Davidson.)

d. The Correlation and Dependence Arguments

The correlation and dependence argument against dualism begins by noting that there are clear correlations between certain mental events and neural events (say, between pain and a-fiber or c-fiber stimulation). Moreover, as demonstrated in such phenomena as memory loss due to head trauma or wasting disease, the mind and its capacities seem dependent upon neural function. The simplest and best explanation of this dependence and correlation is that mental states and events are neural states and events and that pain just is c-fiber stimulation. (This would be the argument employed by an identity theorist. A functionalist would argue that the best explanation for the dependence and correlation of mental and physical states is that, in humans, mental states are brain states functionally defined).

Descartes himself anticipated an objection like this and argued that dependence does not strongly support identity. He illustrates by means of the following example: a virtuoso violinist cannot manifest his or her ability if given an instrument in deplorable or broken condition. The manifestation of the musician’s ability is thus dependent upon being able to use a well-tuned instrument in proper working order. But from the fact that the exhibition of the maestro’s skill is impossible without a functioning instrument, it hardly follows that being skilled at playing the violin amounts to no more than possessing such an instrument. Similarly, the interactionist can claim that the mind uses the brain to manifest it’s abilities in the public realm. If, like the violin, the brain is in a severely diseased or injurious state, the mind cannot demonstrate its abilities; they of necessity remain private and unrevealed. However, for all we know, the mind still has its full range of abilities, but is hindered in its capacity to express them. As for correlation, interactionism actually predicts that mental events are caused by brain events and vice versa, so the fact that perceptions are correlated with activity in the visual cortex does not support materialism over this form of dualism. Property dualists agree with the materialists that mental phenomena are dependent upon physical phenomena, since the fomer are (non-physical) attributes of the latter. Materialists are aware of these dualist replies and sometimes invoke Ockham’s razor and the importance of metaphysical simplicity in arguments to the best explanation. (See Churchland, 1988, p. 28). Other materialist responses will not be considered here.

8. The Problem of Other Minds

The problem of how we can know other minds has been used as follows to refute dualism. If the mind is not publicly observable, the existence of minds other than our own must be inferred from the behavior of the other person or organism. The reliability of this inference is deeply suspect, however, since we only know that certain mental states cause characteristic behavior from our own case. To extrapolate to the population as a whole from the direct inspection of a single example, our own case, is to make the weakest possible inductive generalization. Hence, if dualism is true, we cannot know that other people have minds at all. But common sense tell us that others do have minds. Since common sense can be trust, dualism is false.

This problem of other minds, to which dualism leads so naturally, is often used to support rival theories such as behaviorism, the mind-brain identity theory, or functionalism (though functionalists sometimes claim that their theory is consistent with dualism). Since the mind, construed along Cartesian lines, leads to solipsism (that is, to the epistemological belief that one’s self is the only existence that can be verified and known), it is better to operationalize the mind and define mental states behaviorally, functionally, or physiologically. If mental states are just behavioral states, brain states, or functional states, then we can verify that others have mental states on the basis of publicly observable phenomena, thereby avoiding skepticism about other selves.

Materialist theories are far less vulnerable to the problem of other minds than dualist theories, though even here other versions of the problem stubbornly reappear. Deciding to define mental states behaviorally does not mean that mental states are behavioral, and it is controversial whether attempts to reduce mentality to behavioral, brain, or functional states have been successful. Moreover, the “Absent Qualia” argument claims that it is perfectly imaginable and consistent with everything that we know about physiology that, of two functionally or physiologically isomorphic beings, one might be conscious and the other not. Of two outwardly indistinguishable dopplegangers, one might have experience and the other none. Both would exhibit identical neural activity; both would insist that they can see the flowers in the meadow and deny that they are “blind”; both would be able to obey the request to go fetch a red flower; and yet only one would have experience. The other would be like an automaton. Consequently, it is sometimes argued, even a materialist cannot be wholly sure that other existing minds have experience of a qualitative (whence, “qualia”) sort. The problem for the materialist then becomes not the problem of other minds, but the problem of other qualia. The latter seems almost as severe an affront to common sense as the former. (For an interesting related discussion, see Churchland on eliminative materialism, 1988, pp. 43-49.)

9. Criticisms of the Mind as a Thinking Thing

We earlier observed that some philosophers, such as Hume, have objected that supposing that the mind is a thinking thing is not warranted since all we apprehend of the self by introspection is a collection of ideas but never the mind that purportedly has these ideas. All we are therefore left with is a stream of impressions and ideas but no persisting, substantial self to constitute personal identity. If there is no substratum of thought, then substance dualism is false. Kant, too, denied that the mind is a substance. Mind is simply the unifying factor that is the logical preliminary to experience.

The idea that the mind is not a thinking thing was revived in the twentieth century by philosophical behaviorists. According to Gilbert Ryle in his seminal 1949 work The Concept of Mind, “when we describe people as exercising qualities of mind, we are not referring to occult episodes of which their overt acts and utterances are effects; we are referring to those overt acts and utterances themselves.” (p. 25). Thus, “When a person is described by one or other of the intelligence epithets such as ‘shrewd’ or ‘silly’, ‘prudent’ or ‘imprudent’, the description imputes to him not the knowledge, or ignorance, of this or that truth, but the ability, or inability, to do certain sorts of things.” (p. 27). For the behaviorist, we say that the clown is clever because he can fall down deliberately yet make it look like an accident We say the student is bright because she can tell us the correct answer to complex, involved equations. Mental events reduce to bodily events or statements about the body. As Ludwig Wittgenstein notes in his Blue Book:

It is misleading then to talk of thinking as of a “mental activity.” We may say that thinking is essentially the activity of operating with signs. This activity is performed by the hand, when we think by writing; by the mouth and larynx, when we think by speaking; and if we think by imagining signs or pictures, I can give you no agent that thinks. If then you say that in such cases the mind thinks, I would only draw your attention to the fact that you are using a metaphor. (1958, p. 6)

John Wisdom (1934) explains: “‘I believe monkeys detest jaguars’ means ‘This body is in a state which is liable to result in the group of reactions which is associated with confident utterance of ‘Monkeys detest jaguars,’ namely keeping ‘favorite’ monkeys from jaguars and in general acting as if monkeys detested jaguars.'” (p. 56-7).

Philosophical behaviorism as developed by followers of Wittgenstein was supported in part by the Private Language Argument. Anthony Kenny (1963) explains:

Any word purporting to be the name of something observable only by introspection (i.e. a mental event)… would have to acquire its meaning by a purely private and uncheckable performance . . . If the names of the emotions acquire their meaning for each of us by a ceremony from which everyone else is excluded, then none of us can have any idea what anyone else means by the word. Nor can anyone know what he means by the word himself; for to know the meaning of a word is to know how to use it rightly; and where there can be no check on how a man uses a word there is no room to talk of “right” and “wrong” use (p. 13).

Mentalistic terms do not have meaning by virtue of referring to occult phenomena, but by virtue of referring to something public in a certain way. To understand the meaning of words like “mind,” “idea,” “thought,” “love,” “fear,” “belief,” “dream,” and so forth, we must attend to how these words are actually learned in the first place. When we do this, the behaviorist is confident that the mind will be demystified.

Although philosophical behaviorism has fallen out of fashion, its recommendations to attend to the importance of the body and language in attempting to understand the mind have remained enduring contributions. Although dualism faces serious challenges, we have seen that many of these difficulties can be identified in its philosophical rivals in slightly different forms.

10. References and Further Reading

  • Aristotle, Categories.
  • Armstrong, D. M.: A Materialist Theory of the Mind (Routledge and Kegan Paul, London 1968) Chapter Two.
  • Baker, Gordon and Morris, Katherine J. Descartes’ Dualism (Routledge, London 1996).
  • Block, Ned, Owen Flanagan, and Gueven Guezeldere eds. The Nature of Consciousness: Philosophical Debates (MIT Press, Cambridge 1997).
  • Brentano, Franz: Psychology from an Empirical Standpoint trans. A. Rancurello, D. Terrell, and L. McAlister (Routledge and Kegan Paul, London 1874/1973).
  • Broad, C. D. Mind and Its Place in Nature (Routledge and Kegan Paul, London 1962).
  • Campbell, Keith: Body and Mind (Anchor Books, Doubleday & Co., Garden City NJ 1970).
  • Chalmers, David J.: The Conscious Mind: In Search of a Fundamental Theory (Oxford University Press, Oxford 1996).
  • Churchland, Paul: Matter and Consciousness, Revised Edition (MIT Press, Cambridge MA 1988).
  • Davidson, Donald: “Actions, Reasons and Causes” The Journal of Philosophy 60 (1963) pp. 685- 700, reprinted in The Philosophy of Action, Alan White, ed. (Oxford University Press, Oxford 1973).
  • Descartes, Rene: Discourse on Method and Meditations on First Philosophy, Donald A. Cress trans. (Hackett Publishing Co., Indianapolis 1980).
  • Descartes, Rene: Descartes’ Philosophical Writings, selected and translated by Norman Kemp Smith (Macmillan, London 1952).
  • Descartes, Rene: The Philosophical Works of Descartes, vol.2, Elizabeth S. Haldane, trans. (Cambridge University Press, 1912).
  • Dicker, Georges: Descartes: An Analytical and Historical Introduction (Oxford University Press, Oxford 1993).
  • Ducasse, C. J.: “In Defense of Dualism” in Dimensions of Mind, Sydney Hook, ed. (Macmillan, NY 1961).
  • Garber, Daniel: Descartes Embodied: Reading Cartesian Philosophy through Cartesian Science (Cambridge University Press, Cambridge 2001).
  • Harman, Gilbert: Thought (Princeton University Press, Princeton 1973).
  • Hart, William D. “Dualism” in A Companion to the Philosophy of Mind, Samuel Guttenplan, ed. (Basil Blackwell, Oxford 1994) pp. 265-269.
  • Horgan, Terence: “Supervenient Qualia” Philosophical Review 96 (1987) pp. 491-520.
  • Hume, David: An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding (Hackett Publishing, Indianapolis 1977).
  • Joad, C. E. M.: How Our Minds Work (Philosophical Library, 1947).
  • Kant, Immanuel: Critique of Pure Reason, Norman Kemp Smith, trans. (Macmillan, London 1963).
  • Kenny, Anthony: Action, Emotion and the Will (Routledge & Kegan Paul, London 1963).
  • Kim, Jaegwon: Philosophy of Mind (Westview Press, Boulder 1996).
  • Kripke, Saul: Naming and Necessity (Harvard University Press, Cambridge 1980).
  • Locke, John: Essay Concerning Human Understanding vol. 1, collated and annotated by Alexander Fraser (Dover Publications, NY 1959).
  • Lycan, William: “Philosophy of Mind” in The Blackwell companion to Philosophy, Nicholas Bunnin and E. P. Tsui-James eds. (Blackwell Publishers, Oxford 1996).
  • Madell, G. The Identity of the Self (Edinburgh University Press, 1983).
  • Malcolm, Norman: “Knowledge of Other Minds” in The Philosophy of Mind, V. C. Chappell, ed. (Prentice-Hall , Englewood Cliffs 1962).
  • McLaughlin, Brian P.: “Epiphenomenalism” in A Companion to the Philosophy of Mind, Samuel Guttenplan, ed. (Blackwell, Oxford 1994).
  • Mill, J. S. : An Examination of Sir William Hamilton’s Philosophy, 6th ed. (Longman’s, London 1889).
  • Nagel, Thomas: “Brain Bisection and the Unity of Consciousness” in Jonathan Glover, ed. The Philosophy of Mind (Oxford University Press, Oxford 1976).
  • Nagel, Thomas: The View From Nowhere (Oxford University Press, Oxford 1986).
  • Nagel, Thomas: “What Is It Like to Be a Bat?” Philosophical Review 83 (1974) 435-450.
  • Plato: Meno.
  • Plato: Phaedo.
  • Rey, Georges: Contemporary Philosophy of Mind (Blackwell Publishers, Cambridge 1997).
  • Rorty, Richard: Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature (Princeton University Press, Princeton NJ 1979).
  • Rorty, Richard: “Mind-Body Identity, Privacy and Categories” in The Mind/Brain Identity Theory, C. V. Borst ed. (Macmillan, London 1970).
  • Ryle, Gilbert: The Concept of Mind, (University Paperbacks, Barnes & Noble, NY 1949).
  • Shoemaker, Sydney: Self-Knowledge and Self-Identity (Cornell University Press, Ithaca 1963).
  • Taylor, Richard: Metaphysics, 3rd edition (Prentice Hall, Englewood Cliffs 1983).
  • Tye, Michael: “The Subjective Qualities of Experience” Mind 95 (Jan. 1986) pp. 1-17.
  • Williams, Bernard: “Freedom and the Will” in Freedom and the Will, D. F. Pears, ed. (Macmillan, London 1966).
  • Wisdom, John: Problems of Mind and Matter, (Cambridge University Press, 1934).
  • Wittgenstein, Ludwig: The Blue and Brown Books (Harper & Row, NY 1958).

Author Information

Scott Calef
Ohio Wesleyan University
U. S. A.

Donald Davidson: Anomalous Monism

davidson2Anomalous Monism is a type of property dualism in the philosophy of mind. Property dualism combines the thesis that mental phenomena are strictly irreducible to physical phenomena with the denial that mind and body are discrete substances. For the anomalous monist, the plausibility of property dualism derives from the fact that although mental states, events and processes have genuine causal powers, the causal relationships that they enter into with physical entities cannot be explained by appeal to fundamental laws of nature. This doctrine about the relationship between mind and body was first explicitly defended by Donald Davidson in his paper “Mental Events,” though its root in the Western philosophical tradition go back at least as far as Spinoza. It was a topic of energetic debate and disagreement among English-speaking philosophers for the last thirty years of the twentieth century.

The extent to which Davidson’s commitment to anomalous monism turns out to derive from his views about methodology is partly obscured by his own tendency (shared by the majority of both his followers and his critics) to discuss issues connected with the mind/body problem in traditionally metaphysical terms. But whenever he actually sets about the task of defending the statement that mental events cause physical events, what is at issue always turns out to be a distinctively methodological question: When we set about explaining the actions of other human beings, to what extent must we employ our own, perhaps entirely parochial, standards for determining what counts as rational behavior?

Table of Contents

  1. A Trilemma
  2. Historical Precursors
    1. Parallelism
    2. Verstehen Theory
  3. Mental Events are Physical Events
  4. The Irreducibility of the Mental
    1. Supervenience and Anomalous Monism
    2. “Strict” and “Non-Strict” Natural Laws
  5. A Methodological Postscript
  6. References and Further Reading

1. A Trilemma

Anomalous Monism (AM) is a philosophical thesis about the place of the mind and of mental states in the natural order. The term was first used by Donald Davidson in his 1970 paper “Mental Events.” Since the publication of this paper, Davidson has re-described and refined his position on the mind/body problem in a number of different ways, and both critics and supporters of AM have come up with their own characterizations of the thesis, many of which appear to differ from Davidson’s in non-trivial ways. Nonetheless, AM is distinguished from other positions in the philosophy of mind by the three following claims:

  1. Mental events cause physical events.
  2. All causal relationships are backed by natural laws.
  3. There are no natural laws connecting mental phenomena with physical phenomena.

Taken separately, none of these claims has won anything like universal support from philosophers in the contemporary tradition. So-called “epiphenomenalists” about the nature of mental events and processes would certainly deny the truth of (1). (2) appears to require both denying that the notion of a causal disposition is more primitive than that of a natural law, as well as affirming an implausibly strict distinction between genuine laws of nature and mere statistical generalizations. And proponents of a reductionist view of the mind, at least as this sort of position has traditionally been articulated, would certainly have to deny the truth of (3).

Even if none of these arguments are successful, this trio of claims gives off a pretty strong whiff of inconsistency. Nonetheless, Davidson maintains that all three are true. The best route to understanding this is to start out by taking a somewhat broader look at the relevant historical backdrop. It is also necessary to acquaint oneself with Davidson’s broader philosophical program.

2. Historical Precursors

a. Parallelism

The early modern philosopher whose views on the relationship between mind and body bear the closest similarity to AM is Benedict De Spinoza. Like most philosophers of his period, Spinoza was preoccupied with the central problem of the Cartesian inheritance, namely, that of accounting for the apparently systematic causal interaction between mind and body. This problem had arisen for Descartes specifically because he had believed that mind and body were discrete types of substances with irreconcilable natures. ContraDescartes, Spinoza denied that mind and body were separate substances at all, and proposed instead that they are merely separate attributes of a single substance. He suggested that, for every physical item P, there is a corresponding mental item I(P), which he identified as “the idea of P.” The human mind, for example, was nothing for Spinoza but the “idea” of the human body. These “ideas” differ from one another in “perfection,” based upon the complexity of the physical object to which each corresponds.

In Book Two of the Ethics, Spinoza goes on to defend (very briefly) the doctrine of psycho-physical parallelism. He proposes that “the order and connection of ideas is the same as the order and connection of things.” [de Spinoza, 1949, p. 83] This remark is usually taken to imply that for every causal chain of ideas, there is a sequence of physical causes and effects that run parallel to it through time, like so [see Bennett pp. 127-132]:

t1 t2 t3 t4 t5
Sequence A P1 P2 P3 P4 P5
Sequence B I(P)1 I(P)2 I(P)3 I(P)4 I(P)5

Spinoza showed no obvious sign of interest in whether one of these two causal orders is more fundamental. But since he was a strict determinist, it seems he believed that the relations that obtain among the items belonging to both causal sequences were law-like in nature. He may thus plausibly be read as having accepted the truth of something like statement (1).

A further distinctive feature of Spinoza’s metaphysical monism, however, was his denial that there could be any ‘causal flow’ between different attributes of the single substance that he identified both with God and with Nature. This might make it appear that he have endorsed statement (3) of our original trilemma at the price of rejecting statement (1).

But when we read the Ethics from the other side of the ‘linguistic turn’ in twentieth century Western philosophy, there is a strong temptation to reinterpret Spinoza’s metaphysical distinction between a single substance and its many attributes. Post linguistic turn, this amounts to the distinction between a single class of entities and the plurality of equally well-grounded ways that may exist of describing them. It is thus perhaps not too coercive to interpret Spinoza’s parallelism as implying that there is a systematic problem with the practice of referring to mental and physical phenomena as entering into causal relations with one another. But this is perfectly consistent with the truth of statement (1). In this qualified sense, then, Spinozistic parallelism may be viewed as a genuine historical precursor to AM.

Two questions immediately arise about the doctrine of parallelism as just described. First, if there really is an absolutely reliable pairing-off between the constituents of physical and mental causal chains, then why couldn’t we just use characterizations of items in Sequence B as though they referred to items in Sequence A? Why couldn’t claims about the “ideas” of objects be used in the natural sciences, but there understood as merely abbreviating claims about those physical objects themselves? The feature of Spinoza’s philosophy that makes it impossible for him to allow for this is his commitment to causal rationalism – the thesis that for any genuinely causal relationship one should always be able to deduce the effect from a true description of the cause [see de Spinoza, 1949, p. 42ff]. This is not a doctrine that would appeal to the sensibilities of many contemporary philosophers, but it does turn out to have an important analog in Davidson’s treatment of the mind/body problem.

The second question that arises about Spinoza’s parallelism concerns the fact that even the very simplest and most transparent of mental phenomena appear to depend for their existence upon a highly complex collection of physical phenomena. But then why suppose that just any physical event, no matter how simple (the movement of a single electron, say) must have an ideational correlate? If one chooses to hypothesize that a specific degree of physical complexity is necessary for a mental phenomenon to occur, then the threat (or promise) of reductionism looms. But most contemporary philosophers would certainly favor reductionism over the alternative of panpsychism that Spinoza himself embraces [de Spinoza, 1949, p. 90]. Interestingly Davidson himself also ends up embracing an analog of panpsychism in the course of his struggle to harmonize statements (1) –(3).

b. Verstehen Theory

Davidson’s own views about the nature of mind emerged out of a set of disputes that were instructively similar to the arguments that took place among philosophers during the Cartesian era. For most of the twentieth century, philosophers both on the European continent and in English-speaking universities had been preoccupied with the autonomy of humanistic enquiry. This issue was (and continues to be) a source of disagreements that extend well beyond the relatively narrow boundaries of metaphysical debate and into the realms of institutional policymaking and literary and artistic culture. Among analytic philosophers of the 1960s, disputes upon this general topic were focused largely around a question that was partly epistemological and partly ontological in its significance, whether or not it is appropriate to view thereasons that people have for performing specific actions as also themselves being causes of those actions.

According to one school of thought, which more or less began with the Verstehen theorists of the nineteenth century – Wilhelm Dilthey, Max Weber and Bendetto Croce, among others – the aim of the social sciences and of humanistic enquiry in general is not the discovery of causal relationships at all. To others, however – mechanists, materialists and methodological monists about the sciences – such claims were deemed to be either patently false or well-nigh incomprehensible [See Anthony, 1989, p. 155, for a full discussion]. Seen against this backdrop, Davidson’s own approach to the issue of how reasons relate to causes takes on the appearance of a compromise position. For Davidson both rejects reductionism and denies the view that the distinction between reasons and causes is as absolute as the Verstehentheorists wanted to claim.

In a famous example, Davidson describes a situation in which a mountain climber accidentally causes the death of another man by loosening his grip on a tethering rope. Suppose that this happened, not because the first climber was deliberately setting out to do in his comrade, but rather because he was merely “unnerved” by the thought that he could make himself safer by ridding himself of the extra weight. What we need, Davidson suggests, is to be able to distinguish this sort of circumstance from a situation in which the climber really does drop his comrade intentionally to rid himself of the extra weight. In this second case, the reason (that the first climber had for being concerned for his own safety) was also a cause (of the death of the second climber). But then there is a differentiation between reasons that are not causes and reasons which are. [Davidson, 1973, p. 79]

In “Thinking Causes,” Davidson explains the metaphysical significance of these observations. He says here that “anomalous monism holds that mental entities (particular time- and space-bound objects and events) are physical entities, but that mental concepts are not reducible by definition or natural law to physical concepts.” [Davidson, 1993, p. 3]. Thus, while the sorts of mental events that we habitually identify as reasons (under which broad classification he includes “perceivings, notings, calculations, judgements, decisions, internal actions and changes of belief” [Davidson, 1970, p. 208]) may also beidentified as causes, this does not preclude us from being able to appeal to the difference between reasons and causes as part of a general characterization of what is distinctive about the human sciences.

The description of AM given thus far does nothing to distinguish it from other, substantively different forms of so-called “property dualism” in the contemporary philosophy of mind. We must first ask why Davidson believes that mental events are identical with physical events, and then ask why he nonetheless denies the reducibility of the one to the other.

3. Mental Events are Physical Events

A crucial part of Davidson’s overall strategy for reconciling statements (1)-(3) is his endorsement of the thesis of token physicalism (TKP). This is the doctrine that while mental properties (types) cannot be identified with physical properties, mental particulars (tokens) can be identified with particular, spatio-temporally determinate physical entities. Davidson is not the only influential analytic philosopher to have defended this doctrine, but his reasons for doing so arise from a fairly idiosyncratic set of views.

The most distinctive feature of Davidson’s version of TKP is that it is a doctrine about events, rather than processes, states, or (at least in the primary instance) objects [see Davidson, 1970, p. 210]. His belief in the ontological primacy of events arises from the underlying logical form of certain types of English sentences; the fact that we can comprehend that sentences like “Jones buttered the toast deliberately in the bathroom with a knife at midnight” entails the sentence “Jones buttered the toast” cannot be explained (Davidson thinks) without supposing that both make implicit reference to some spatio-temporally bounded particular event [for the full argument, see Davidson, 1967, pp. 105-107]. The identity conditions of events can furthermore, he thinks, be established purely extensionally: event A and event B are identical if and only if they have all of the same causes and all of the same effects. [Davidson, 1969, p. 179]

When we successfully pick out an event by means of a mentalistic description as being the cause of some other, physical event, we have according to Davidson done all that is necessary to show that there is mental causation. He traces this minimalist approach to the classification of events as mental back to the writings of Elizabeth Anscombe, who famously defended the view that all that is necessary for an act’s having been intended is that it be truly describable as such [Davidson, 1967, p. 147]. So what, then counts as a genuinely mentalistic description of any given event? Davidson’s own views upon this subject are less than entirely clear. In “Mental Events” he makes the more general proposal that the hallmark of the mental is intensionality. That is, true descriptions of mental events include a verb with a subject that refers to a person, and a complement for which the usual rules of substitution break down. Thus, while “Lois thought that Clark Kent was lovely” would clearly count as a mentalistic description of an event, since she might not have thought the same about Superman, “Lois was smaller than Clark Kent” would fail to satisfy the aforementioned criterion.

It is important to recognize, however, that intensionality is for Davidson merely a sufficient condition for mentality; he does not seem to regard it as being even close to necessary. This is clear from some rather startling remarks that he makes in “Mental Events.” He asks us to consider “some event that we all intuitively accept as physical, let’s say the collision of two stars in distant space.” If we can truthfully describe this event as being merely simultaneous to some other clearly mental event, then this fact is enough by itself, Davidson thinks, for us to be warranted in describing the former occurrence as a mental event too [Davidson, 1970, p. 211].

Davidson suggests that this sort of “Spinozistic extravagance” is philosophically harmless to the case for AM because it provides us with all the better reason for believing TKP. For the more inclusive our criteria for mentality are, the more reason we will have to accept that all mental events are identical to physical events [Davidson, 1970, p. 212]. But one thing that these considerations seem to imply is that every event A that is caused by some mental event B will also have the very same event as a physical cause. And this makes it look as though the defender of AM will either have to explain away an unpalatable form of causal over-determination in the natural sciences, or else regard mental events as being purely epiphenomenal.

The claim that AM is really just epiphenomenalism in disguise has been the single most common and widespread criticism of Davidson’s thesis since the publication of “Mental Events.” The suggestion was first made by Ted Honderich in a paper from 1982. Honderich draws a suggestive analogy between mental properties and the properties possessed by a bunch of green pears sitting on a grocer’s scale. These pieces of fruit maybe truly described as green, or as French, but the fact that they possess these properties is clearly not what causes them to make the scale read “1 lb.” So why should the fact that we can describe some events in ways that satisfy Davidson’s rather permissive criteria for mentality lead us to believe that the natural world contains even a single instance of mental causation? [Honderich , 1982, pp. 61-62]. The same objection is made somewhat more abstractly by Jaegwon Kim when he described what he calls the “exclusion problem” for mental causation. Suppose that an event m causes a distinct event e, and that m has two properties, M and P. Furthermore suppose that only the property P of m is connected by a strict causal law to some property of e. But then, Kim asks how the property M can be understood to be doing any “causal work” whatsoever [Kim, 1993, pp. 25-26].

Davidson responds to challenges of this general type by re-iterating his commitment to a strictly extensionalist account of event-causation. It is simply infelicitous, he thinks, to suppose that whether or not one event is the cause of another depends upon our ability to connect up their properties in any sort of statement whatsoever, whether law-like or not. As he puts it in “Thinking Causes,”

There is…no room for a concept of ‘cause as’ that would make causality a relation among three or four entities rather than two. On the view of events and causality assumed here, it makes no more sense to say event c caused event e as instantiating law L than it makes to say that a weighs less than b as belonging to sort c [Davidson, 1993, p. 6].

Many philosophers have found this characterization of causality by Davidson singularly implausible. For it does not seem as though extensionalism by itself simply implies that events do not have the causal powers that they do by virtue of falling under causal laws [see McLaughlin, 1993, pp. 30-34]. And regardless of whether one is talking about events, physical objects, thoughts, or whatever, it is surely a perfectly natural and coherent question to ask whether it is because something has a property M that it causes something else to have property N. At least one recent defender of AM has suggested that perhaps the very notion of causation itself is a fundamentally ambiguous one, in the sense that its content changes depending upon whether we employ the discrete standards of rational intelligibility that are required by either a “personal” or an “impersonal” perspective upon the natural world [see Hornsby, 1997, p. 140]. To adopt this thesis about causation would appear to represent an abandonment of the project of finding a genuinely intermediate position between the approach favored by Verstehen theorists to explanation in the human sciences and the traditional forms of metaphysical materialism to which Davidson himself appears to be willing to give at least qualified endorsement.

One of Davidson’s earlier claims about the relationship between mind and body is that the mentalsupervenes upon the physical. To say that properties of type X supervene upon properties of type Y is at the very least to commit oneself to the view that objects and events cannot differ X-wise without also differing Y-wise. If this were in fact the case, one could argue that there is at least some minimal sense in which the possession of mental properties “makes a difference” to the causal relations exhibited by particular physical events. For, unlike the properties of color and nationality possessed by the pears in Honderich’s famous example, supervenient mental properties are always going to stand in an empirically significant relationship to the physical regularities that that are exhibited among the physical properties that they supervene upon.

But the supervenience relation is one that has been characterized in multitudinous different ways in late twentieth-century philosophy [See Kim, 1990 for a fairly exhaustive catalogue]. Not all of the accounts that have been given would provide equally good support for this contention. According to Kim, the most pressing question about the supervenience relation is whether it might actually entail the reducibility of the supervenient class of properties or concepts to their subvenient base. What, then, are some reasons that the defender of AM might give for denying that mental concepts are simply reducible to physical ones?

4. The Irreducibility of the Mental

a. Supervenience and Anomalous Monism

Davidson describes the relationship of supervenience as the key to understanding how mental phenomena may be “in some sense dependent” upon physical phenomena in spite of there not being any strict psycho-physical laws [Davidson, 1970, p. 214]. He clearly regards the notion of supervenience as representing a sort of panacea for anyone skeptical about the possibility of reconciling statements (1)-(3) [Davidson, 1993, p. 4]. So what, precisely, is the supervenience relation supposed to amount to?

The earliest instance of an appeal to the notion of supervenience in the twentieth century was by S.E. Pepper, in a paper first published in 1926. Pepper used the word “supervenient” to refer to a type ofchange that gives rise to emergent properties in the objects undergoing the relevant transformation [see van Brakel, 1999, pp. 4-5]. Over the last thirty years of the twentieth century, the term “supervenience” came to be used by philosophers in a wide variety of contexts, not only in ethics and the philosophy of mind, but in areas as diverse as aesthetics, modal metaphysics, the philosophy of biology and philosophical theology. Davidson himself acknowledges having borrowed the term from R.M. Hare’s discussion of the relationship between ethical and natural properties in The Language of Morals. Unlike Pepper, both Hare and Davidson characterize supervenience in explicitly linguistic terms, without reference to metaphysical notions like emergence that is supposed to be antecedently clear. Thus, for Davidson, “a predicate P is supervenient on a set of predicates S if and only if P does not distinguish any entities that cannot be distinguished by S” [Davidson, 1993, p. 4].

What is most striking about this characterization of the supervenience relation is its apparent weakness. When we make a Davidsonian supervenience claim we do not undertake any commitment whatsoever to the thesis that the supervening predicate can be could be shown to be redundant by even the most vigorous applications of Ockham’s razor.

In “Mental Events” Davidson develops two puzzling but suggestive analogies for the way in which the mental may be thought of as supervening upon the physical. He first suggests that we think of mentalistic predicates as being like the Tarskian truth predicate and the vocabulary of physics as being like the resources that are present within a natural language to describe its own syntax. For the truth predicate as Tarski describes it had the following important characteristic: it cannot be defined using only the resources of the object language, even though one might well be able to pick out all of the sentences that lie within its extension [see Davidson, 1970, pp. 214-215]. The other comparison that he makes involves an allusion to the failure of what he refers to as “definitional behaviorism” in scientific psychology. This theory was abandoned by empirical psychologists, he suggests, not because of any single piece of disconfirming evidence, but rather because they noticed “system in the failures” of behaviorists to define concepts like belief and desire in explicitly behavioral terms [see Davidson, 1970, p. 217].

In contrast to these suggestive but rather underdeveloped analogies, Jaegwon Kim famously argues that the supervenience of a class of properties G upon another class D actually entails that G is reducible to D[see Kim, 1984, p. 78]. If this claim were correct, then it would certainly be difficult to see how a Davidsonian could claim that there were no strict laws of nature connecting mental properties with physical ones. It is less clear that from Davidson’s own characterizations of supervenience in terms of the mere distinguishability of objects represents a weaker notion than that which is favored by reductionists following Kim.

A somewhat more subtle and less radical criticism of Davidson’s use of the supervenience relation to defend AM has been offered by Simon Blackburn. Blackburn parses supervenience claims as non-trivial restrictions upon how we conceive of the possibility that different sorts of objects could exist within the same world. Even the weakest sorts of supervenience claims, he suggests, involves implicit reference to the notion that an object has some property as the result of also possessing what he refers to an “underlying” set of natural (i.e. physical) properties. To say that property M supervenes upon property P, then, is to make an assertion with the following logical form:

(S) Necessarily, if there exists some x such that Mx and Px and if Px underlies Mx, then, for all y, if Py then My [Blackburn, 1985, p. 131].

Blackburn points out that the truth of any instance of (S) would be perfectly consistent with there beingsome possible worlds containing objects which have P (which may turn out to be some extremely complex or disjunctive physical property) while lacking M. Nonetheless, he thinks that our default modal intuitions should cause us to rankle whenever we are presented with a claim having the form of (S). We should react this way, he thinks, because (S) represents a violation of what he calls the “principle of plentitude” about possible worlds. Why shouldn’t there be possible worlds in which some objects or events that instantiate a given set of physical predicates also instantiate a given mental property, while others do not? This, according to Blackburn, is the key metaphysical question that the doctrine of AM compels us to ask, but for which its advocates have never really provided an answer [Blackburn, 1985, p. 135].

According to Blackburn’s recipe for supervenience, “underlying” properties will always be physical ones. It thus seems pretty clear that violations of the “principle of plentitude” about possible worlds of the sort that Blackburn is talking about here must occur at the level of nomological (as opposed to logical, metaphysical or epistemic) possibility. The advocate of AM would surely, after all, not want to deny that it is at least logically possible for a world to contain two physically identical beings, one with a mind and one without, not that such a circumstance fell entirely outside the range of human conceivability. Thus, if the question that Blackburn asks about supervenience is the right one to pose to the anomalous monist, then we may at this stage draw an important methodological conclusion. It looks as though Davidson’s claim that the mental supervenes upon the physical is, after all, really just another way of stating his commitment to the impossibility of strict natural laws connecting mental and physical phenomena. In order to understand why the advocate of AM will be committed to the irreducibility of the mental, then, one need only ask what he thinks it is about instances of mental causation that makes them insusceptible to the sort of explanation that can be provided by appeal to so-called “strict” natural laws.

b. “Strict” and “Non-Strict” Natural Laws

A universal generalization is law-like, according to Davidson, just so long as it provides support for a suitably broad set of subjunctive and counterfactual conditionals. For example, the statement “Whenever it rains, the grass gets wet” might well count as law-like, since it provides at least partial supports for the claims “If it were to rain next week, the grass would be wet” and “If it had not rained this morning, the grass would not presently be wet” – provided, at least, that we restrict our attention to possible words where a sprinkler is not available. A law-like statement also qualifies as “homonomic” if the scope of its generality can be increased by means of “adding further provisos and conditions,” all of which can be stated in “the same general vocabulary as the original statement.” “Whenever it rains, the grass gets wet” would thus presumably fail to count as homonomic, since the ceteris paribus clause “…unless someone has pitched a tent in the yard” is not a statement that makes exclusive use of the language of meteorology.

A strict law of nature for Davidson will thus be a homonomic law-like generalization that has been supplemented to the fullest possible extent by ceteris paribus clauses that do not violate this restriction. All general causal statements connecting mentalistic and physicalistic concepts must, according to Davidson, be regarded as non-strict, or “heteronomic” in nature.

Davidson proposes, controversially, that the criterion just described for what it takes to be a natural law is an a priori truth [see Davidson, 1970, pp. 216-220]. But from whence comes his confidence that it is possible, even in principle, to come up with these sorts of generalization anywhere in the natural sciences? He repeatedly claims that such completely exceptionless generalizations are most likely to be found in theoretical physics. But this assertion is not defended. Furthermore, even if he is right that such perfectly “strict” laws of nature could in principle be set down, the question remains whether there are good reasons to suspect that any of the vocabulary currently available for use in the natural sciences is suitable for the formulation of these sorts of statements. In response to these sorts of concerns, a fairly broad contingent of philosophers of science have defended accounts of the concept of a natural law which represent scientific knowledge as being heteronomic through and through [See e.g. Cartwright, 1994 and Fodor 1974].

Another more subtle issue has been raised by some philosophers in connection with Davidson’s rather thin conception of natural law. It seems possible to identify a fairly broad class of generalizations whose status as laws of nature does not depend upon either their predictive usefulness or the vocabulary within which ceteris paribus clauses for them are formulated. These are what Robert Cummins calls “instantiation laws.” The logical form of instantiation laws, as Cummins describes them, is as follows: Anything having components C1…Cn organized in manner O has property P [See Cummins, 1981, p. 17]. Such generalizations serve to explain what it is about the structure of some system that makes the system an instantiation of a given property. They do not explain how it is that that system’s properties change over time. Entries in the Periodic Table of the elements would appear to qualify as expressions of this sort of law, since the information that they communicate is that the arrangement of a specific number of electrons around an atomic nucleus at a given set of energy levels is what makes one atom count as a sample of hydrogen, oxygen, iron, etc.

Even if there were no psycho-physical laws in Davidson’s sense of the term, mightn’t there in fact be plenty of psycho-physical instantiation laws? Perhaps the only way to explain changes in belief or short-term memory is by making generalizations that refer (either implicitly or explicitly) to other beliefs or memories. But it seems perfectly cogent to suppose that, even if this were true, we might be able to explain what it is that makes some particular state of a person (or her neurosystem) a belief or a memory in a purely neurophysiological vocabulary. How would it affect the case for AM if it were to turn out that we could make these sorts of generalizations connecting physical concepts with mentalistic ones?

Upon this topic, opinions diverge quite broadly. Louise Anthony has suggested that, once we recognize the possibility of formulating psycho-physical “instantiation laws,” we will be able to reject statement (3) in a way sensitive to the intuition underlying Davidson’s mountain climber thought experiment. This would, of course, be bad news for the advocate of AM. But Nick Zangwill has suggested that something like the spirit of AM could be preserved even if one were to accept the possibility of what he calls “strict derivative causal laws” (SDLs). Laws of this character, which are quite common in the sciences (according to Zangwill) combine the causal information that instantiations of a property M are followed by instantiations of a property M* with the “metaphysical” information that a system that instantiates M* will do so because it is of type P. It seems easy enough, indeed, to think up putative instances of this type of natural law – consider, for example, the claim that an occurrent general desire for nourishment (M) in a creature whose senses can detect hot oatmeal nearby (P) will normally (ceteris paribus, of course) bring about a more specific desire for oatmeal (M*).

If there are true SDLs that connect up the vocabulary of psychology with the vocabulary of physical science in this sort of way, then there is at least one sense in which statement (3) must clearly be regarded as false. But Zangwill proposes that the defender of AM may still have good grounds for believing that mental phenomena are anomalous in something very much like the way that Davidson originally supposed. For SDLs will generally lack the sort of explanatory significance that “strict” laws of nature, in the Davidsonian sense of the term, may generally be thought to have. They are clearly not the sorts of generalizations that could be conclusively verified without appeal to a background theory consisting at least for the most part of more simply structured law-like generalizations. Furthermore, the underlying physical properties referred to within putatively psycho-physical SDLs are likely to be so wildly disjunctive in nature that such “laws” might normally end up covering nothing more than a single actual instance of mental causation [see Zangwill, 1993, pp. 69-76].

There do, then, appear to be a wide variety of claims that differ both in content and in logical form, but which may nonetheless be entirely plausible candidates for the status of laws of nature. But then from whence comes the surprisingly powerful conviction shared by Davidson and his sympathizers of the falsity of statement (3)? It is impossible to understand why Davidson subscribes to this radical view without becoming acquainted with his views about the norms of empirical methodology that govern all forms of humanistic enquiry. An examination of what he says upon this general subject will therefore help to shed light upon what motivates him to claim that the concepts referred to by mental and physical predicates are simply not ‘made for’ one another.

5. A Methodological Postscript

The extent to which Davidson’s commitment to AM turns out to derive from his views about methodology is partly obscured by his own tendency (shared by the majority of both his followers and his critics) to discuss issues connected with the mind/body problem in traditionally metaphysical terms. But whenever he actually sets about the task of defending statement (1), what is at issue always turns out to be a distinctively methodological question. When we set about explaining the actions of other human beings, to what extent must we employ our own, perhaps entirely parochial, standards for determining what counts as rational behavior?

In his discussion of the two mountain climbers, for example, the identification of the second climber’s decision to let his companion fall as mental causation serves the purpose of providing us with a means for ascribing responsibility. And one could think up other scenarios with relative ease within which the same sort of appeal to the causal efficacy of the mental could be used to bolster our intuitions about an agent’smoral praiseworthiness, his independence from physical coercion or his very sanity. It is this cluster of distinctly normative concepts that seem to represent the principal ingredients in our everyday concept of rationality.

Once one understands this feature of Davidson’s philosophical program, it becomes considerably clearer what is really going on in the two analogies from “Mental Events,” that is, his comparison of the mental/physical distinction in metaphysics to the difference between semantics and syntax and to the failure of behaviorism to supplant belief/desire psychology. Because the methodology whereby radically unfamiliar languages may be interpreted requires us to treat the speakers of these languages as predominantly rational, for Davidson semantics cannot be reduced to syntax [Davidson, 1973b, pp. 134-137]. And it is because the attribution of rationally ordered beliefs and desires is a constitutive feature of all psychological explanation that this pair of concepts are not susceptible to the sorts of reductive accounts sought by the “definitional behaviorist.” Davidson’s belief in the impossibility of fitting together mental and physicalistic concepts into statements that express strict laws of nature is just one more instance of this general pattern of insisting upon a rigorous distinction between descriptive and normative considerations in scientific methodology.

New problems will of course arise for the defender of AM who treats it as a straightforward consequence of these sorts of methodological considerations. It might, for example, be protested that considerations to do with the a priori, constitutive constraints that govern the interpretation of human speech, thought, and action have no obvious implications at all when it comes to assessing the plausibility of statement (3). Philosophers have, after all, had widely divergent intuitions about just what the connection might be between such normative injunctions and the laws of nature. Kim, for example, suggests that if the relevant constraints upon human ethology are as different from those that operate in the rest of the sciences as Davidson thinks they are, then there should surely be no true law-like generalizations – strict or non-strict – connecting mental properties with physical ones [Kim, 1993, p. 25]. Whereas Blackburn remarks that there seems to be no intrinsic reason to suppose that “interesting laws” could be discovered even between properties the attribution of which “answers to different constraints.” [Blackburn, 1985, p. 140]

Other more general worries arise in connection with the very idea that the concept of causation has a distinctive sort of usefulness in explicitly normative contexts. This belief of Davidson’s makes it look as though he might, after all, be implicitly committed to a type of causal rationalism. For suppose our claim that the malicious climber’s deliberate decision to cut his comrade loose caused the latter’s death is partially underwritten by the sorts of normative considerations that Davidson identifies. Our very decision to describe the climber as having deliberated at all, then, will have been partly motivated by our felt need to hold him responsible for the death of his comrade.

But in this case, our descriptions of the cause and of the effect would appear to lack the sort of logical independence from one another that true causal statements are usually (or at least common-sensically) required to have. This observation does not by itself represent a straightforward refutation of Davidson’s position – after all, as we have seen, causal rationalism was openly embraced by Spinoza, as well as by many other philosophers of the early Enlightenment. But it does make Davidson’s views about causation start to look very strange to contemporary sensibilities.

It appears as though coming to a final verdict upon the plausibility of AM would require one to engage in some much more general reflections about the relationship between how we go about obtaining our beliefs about the world – specifically the parts of it that are relevant to the aspiring interpreter of human thought and language – and what sorts of beings that world objectively contains. That we find ourselves faced with this daunting prospect when we try to determine the prospects for achieving a reconciliation of statements (1)-(3) is perhaps something of a disappointment. But it should also perhaps not surprise one too much. The general problem of discerning where the boundary lies between epistemology and metaphysics is, after all, just one more part of the Cartesian legacy.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Anthony, Louise, “Anomalous Monism and the Problem of Explanatory Force,” The Philosophical Review vol. 48 (1989), 153-187.
  • Anthony, Louise, “The Inadequacy of Anomalous Monism as A Realist Theory of Mind,” in G. Preyer et. al (eds.) Language, Mind and Epistemology: On Donald Davidson’s Philosophy (Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1994), 223-253.
  • Bennett, Jonathan, A Study of Spinoza’s Ethics (Indianapolis: Hackett, 1984).
  • Blackburn, Simon, “Supervenience Revisited,” reprinted in Essays in Quasi-Realism (New York: Oxford University Press, 1993), 130-148. First published in 1985.
  • Cartwright, Nancy, “Fundamentalism versus the Patchwork of Laws,” Proceedings from the Aristotelian Society 94 (1994), 279-292.
  • Cummins, Robert, The Nature of Psychological Explanation (Cambridge, Mass.: The MIT Press, 1981).
  • Davidson, Donald, “The Logical Form of Action Sentences,” reprinted in Essays on Actions and Events(Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1980), 105-149. First published in 1967.
  • Davidson, Donald, “The Individuation of Events,” reprinted in Essays on Actions and Events (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1980), 163-180. First published in 1969.
  • Davidson, Donald, “Mental Events,” reprinted in Essays on Actions and Events (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1980), 207-224. First published in 1970.
  • Davidson, Donald, “Freedom to Act,” reprinted in Essays on Actions and Events (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1980), 63-82. First published in 1973.
  • Davidson, Donald, “Radical Interpretation,” reprinted in Inquiries into Truth and Interpretation(Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1984), 125-150. First published in 1973 (b).
  • Davidson, Donald, “Psychology as Philosophy,” reprinted in Essays on Actions and Events (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1980), 229-239. First published in 1974.
  • Davidson, Donald, “Thinking Causes,” in John Heil and Alfred Mele (eds.) Mental Causation (Oxford, Clarendon Press, 1993), 3-18.
  • Fodor, Jerry, “Special Sciences (or, the Disunity of Science as a Working Hypothesis),” Synthese 28 (1974), 97-115.
  • Honderich, Ted, “The Argument for Anomalous Monism,” Analysis 16 (1982), 59-64.
  • Hornsby, Jennifer, Simple Mindedness (Cambridge, Mass: Harvard University Press, 1997).
  • Kim, Jaegwon, “Concepts of Supervenience” reprinted in Supervenience and Mind (New York: Cambridge University Press, 1993), 53-78. First published in 1984.
  • Kim, Jaegwon, “Supervenience as a Philosophical Concept,” Metaphilosophy 20 (1990), 1-27.
  • Kim, Jaegwon, “Can Supervenience Save Anomalous Monism?” in John Heil and Alfred Mele (eds.)Mental Causation (Oxford, Clarendon Press, 1993), 19-27.
  • McLaughlin, Brian, “On Davidson’s Response to the Charge of Epiphenomenalism in John Heil and Alfred Mele (eds.) Mental Causation (Oxford, Clarendon Press, 1993), 27-41.
  • Spinoza, Benedict de, Ethics, James Gutmann, ed. (New York: Hafner, 1949).
  • Van Brakel, J., “Supervenience and Anomalous Monism,” Dialectica 53 (1999), 3-24.
  • Zangwill, Nick, “Supervenience and Anomalous Monism: Blackburn On Davidson,” Philosophical Studies 71 (1993), 59-79.

Author Information

Mark Silcox
Auburn University
U. S. A.

Gottlob Frege: Language

FregeGottlob Frege (1848-1925) is most celebrated today for his contributions to mathematical logic and the philosophy of language. The first section below considers why a philosophical investigation of language mattered at all for Frege, the mathematician, and why it should have mattered to him.  At the same time, the considerations may serve to illustrate some general motivations that were behind the development of philosophy of language as a separate branch of philosophy in the 20th century. Section 2 deals with Frege’s idea of a formal language and the motivations for developing and employing such a language for purposes of logico-philosophical analysis. The shift from Frege’s early semantics to his famous distinction between sense and significance is explained in Section 3, as are the motivations for this shift. The section also contains a discussion of the difficulties that scholars have encountered when trying to find a proper English translation of Frege’s key semantic terms. Michael Dummett‘s claim that Frege had brought the modern tradition to an end by replacing epistemology with the theory of meaning as the foundation of philosophy in general has been an influential interpretation, but has increasingly been challenged in the past decades.  The present article emphasizes that  Frege’s philosophy of language should be regarded as a branch of epistemology, even if Frege himself did not fully engage in epistemology in the narrower sense of the term.

Table of Contents

  1. Language and Thought
    1. Communication
    2. Language and Memory
    3. Rationalism, Platonism, and Empiricism about Thoughts
  2. The Formal Language Approach
    1. The Concept Script
    2. The Logical Imperfections of Ordinary Language
      1. Non-Observance of the Difference Between Concept and Object
      2. Empty Proper Names
      3. The Vagueness of Predicates
      4. Grammatical versus Logical Categories
      5. The Intermingling of Subjective and Objective Aspects of Meaning
  3. From Conceptual Contents to Sinn and Bedeutung: The Development of Frege’s Semantics
    1. The Monism of Frege’s Early Semantics
    2. Sense and Significance
    3. Some Issues of Translation
    4. The Context Principle and the Priority of Judgments over Concepts
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Frege’s Writings
    2. Other Recommended Literature
      1. General Introductions and Companions to Frege’s Work
      2. General Introductions to the Philosophy of Language
      3. On (Various Aspects of) Frege’s Philosophy of Language
      4. Other Philosophy of Language Relevant to or Referenced in this Article
      5. Some Specialized Literature on the Epistemological Dimensions of Frege’s Thought
      6. General Contributions and Companions to the History of Early Analytic Philosophy
      7. Literature on Other Aspects of Frege’s Philosophy
      8. Other Literature Referenced in this Article
    3. Related Entries

1. Language and Thought

Long before Frege, it was considered commonplace that language is a necessary vehicle for human thought. In the modern period, Thomas Hobbes and John Locke had assigned two main characteristic uses to language with regard to thought: First, it is used to assist memory, or the representation and recording of one’s own thoughts; and second, it is used as a required vehicle of communication of one’s own thoughts to other people (Hobbes 1655:192-97; Locke 1690, Bk. III, §1). It was not before the later decades of the 19th century, however, that philosophical method was finally beginning to take a radically “linguistic turn” – investigating language in order to best deal with ontological or conceptual problems – and Frege has been regarded as one of the first and the most innovative thinkers in this respect.

For Frege, too, it was the very insight that human thought depends in certain ways on language, or on symbols in general, that compelled him to analyze the workings of language in order to investigate the logical structure of thought. Indeed, it seems that language itself was never the primary object of his philosophical interest. Rather, most of the general philosophical issues upon which Frege reflected, aside from his more specialized projects in the philosophy of mathematics, had to do with the nature of thought in general and its relation to logic, to truth, to language, and to the objects it can be about. In 1918, Frege published a lengthy essay titled “Thoughts,” in which he describes his motives for investigating the nature of language:

I am not here in the happy position of a mineralogist who shows his audience a rock-crystal: I cannot put a thought in the hands of my readers with the request that they should examine it from all sides. Something in itself not perceptible by sense, the thought is presented to the reader – and I must be content with that – wrapped up in a perceptible linguistic form. The pictorial aspect of language presents difficulties. The sensible always breaks in and makes expressions pictorial and so improper. So one fights against language, and I am compelled to occupy myself with language although it is not my proper concern here. I hope I have succeeded in making clear to my readers what I want to call ‘thought’ (1997:333f., n.).

Frege presents us with a dilemma that lies at the heart of his lifelong attitude toward language. On the one hand, language is indispensable for us in order to get access to thought. On the other hand, language – because of its sensible character – obscures thought (which by itself is insensible). Thus, Frege saw himself forced to deal with language by way of a continuous struggle – fighting the distortions that are imposed on thought by language, and diagnosing as well as clarifying the misunderstandings that result from these distortions.

But why is language indispensable for thought, and why did Frege think that it is? These two questions are central for an understanding of the rise of philosophy of language in general, and of Frege’s engagement in philosophy of language in particular. They are important because, if it turns out that we cannot find a convincing reason for the indispensability of language for thought, then the struggle with language that Frege is talking about above would not seem necessary for philosophical inquiry: we could just circumvent the obstacle of language and access our concepts and thoughts directly. Historically, dealing with the second question in particular might give us some insight about the extent of Frege’s possible indebtedness, or lack thereof, to earlier conceptions of the relations between language and thought and language as such.

Thus, it would be worthwhile taking a closer look at the two traditional functions of language with regard to thought that Hobbes and Locke distinguished in the context of their respective epistemological reflections. These were: (a) the indispensable assistance of language to memory, or to the representation and recording of one’s own thoughts, and (b) its role as a necessary vehicle of the communication of one’s own thoughts to other people.

a. Communication

If we take a closer look at those two characteristic functions of language as traditionally distinguished we find that they seem to be intimately connected. For one thing, if we conceive of human communication as essentially intentional – as has been the standard view probably throughout the history of philosophy, and most prominently advocated in the 20th century by Paul Grice – then we must ask just how we could even intend to convey a certain piece of information to someone else if we are not able to represent this information to ourselves in conscious thought. Our communicative intention would be quite void – there would be a missing element in the three-place relation “X intends to convey Y to Z”. Even less, it seems, could intentional communication ever succeed if the speaker is not herself aware of what she intends to communicate – unless, perhaps, we also acknowledge the existence of subconscious communicational intentions. But even in this case, it could be argued, the speaker presumably would need to be able to have a representation of what she subconsciously intends to convey in order to do so, and if such a representation is only to be had through language then even the kind of communication that rests on subconscious intentions could not take place without language.

To be sure, information may in principle be conveyed even without the conveyor’s intention, and perhaps it is merely a matter of terminology whether or not we acknowledge that there is also something like unintentional human communication: slips of the tongue, a blushful face, or mere movements of a face muscle, can only too well convey information about the thoughts or attitudes of the conveyor, and even indirectly about what these thoughts and attitudes are about.  However, even if we include such phenomena in the category of “human communication”, it still appears that language is required for communication precisely insofar as it is required for the representation and recording of one’s own thoughts.  For, in such a case, the very act of understanding the piece of information conveyed requires the person to whom it is conveyed to be able to record it for herself in her own memory; and, inasmuch as this requires language, human communication always requires language at least on he side of the receiver of the information – even if communication is to be understood as not presupposing communicational intentions. On this account, language appears as a necessary vehicle of human communication precisely because it is a necessary vehicle to record one’s own thoughts. Thus, communication of one’s own thoughts to another appears to be entirely dependent on representing and recording one’s own thoughts to herself.

b. Language and Memory

Why should language be a necessary vehicle to record one’s own thoughts? And what does this exactly mean? Does it mean that language constitutes thought, so that the latter could not be without the former? Or does it merely mean that we could not become aware of our thoughts or could not grasp them without language?

Let us look at what Frege thought about this matter. His earliest and at the same time most comprehensive attempt to answer the first question above is in his 1882 piece “On the Scientific Justification of a Begriffsschrift”. The relevant passages are cited at full length:

Our attention is directed by nature to the outside. The vivacity of sense-impressions surpasses that of memory-images to such an extent that, at first, sense-impressions determine almost by themselves the course of our ideas, as is the case in animals. And we would scarcely ever be able to escape this dependency if the outer world were not to some degree dependent on us.

Even most animals, through their ability to move about, have an influence on their sense-impressions: They can flee some, seek others. And they can even effect changes in things. Now humans have this ability to a much greater degree; but nevertheless, the course of our ideas would still not gain its full freedom from this ability alone: It would still be limited to that which our hand can fashion, our voice intone, without the great invention of symbols, which call to mind that which is absent, invisible, perhaps even beyond the senses.

I do not deny that even without symbols the perception of a thing can gather about itself a group of memory-images; but we could not pursue these further: A new perception would let these images sink into darkness and allow others to emerge. But if we produce the symbol of an idea that a perception has called to mind, we create in this way a firm, new focus about which ideas gather. We then select another idea from these in order to elicit its symbol. Thus we penetrate step by step into the inner world of our ideas and move about there at will, using the realm of sensibles itself to free ourselves from its constraint. Symbols have the same importance for thought that discovering how to use the wind to sail against the wind had for navigation….

Also, without symbols we would scarcely lift ourselves to conceptual thinking. Thus in applying the same symbol to different but similar things, we actually no longer symbolize the individual thing, but rather what the similarities have in common: the concept. This concept is first gained by symbolizing it; for since it is, in itself, imperceptible, it requires a perceptible representative in order to appear to  us” (1972:83f. Note, Frege’s expression “men” has been changed to “humans”).

Frege appears to locate the source of the dependence of human thought on language in the power that sensation exerts on our attention. Based on this he specifies three main characteristic domains of thought for which we need symbols. First, without symbols we could not become aware of things that are physically absent or insensible. Without them we could only become aware of our immediate sensations and some fleeting memory images of these sensations. This view, however – that we could not grasp or become aware of thoughts about invisible things – does not by itself imply that the thoughts themselves could not be without language.

The second domain concerns memory in general. Though according to Frege, the mere perception of a physical object can serve as a focus around which memory images gather even without the help of symbols, these would not be stable and lasting, for new perceptual images would soon take their place. Immediate sensations are usually so much stronger than memory images that without the help of a tool by means of which we could regulate the train and content of our thought independently of sensation it would be almost entirely determined by immediate sensory input. Thus, what Frege seems to have in mind here is that only by using symbols do we enable ourselves to memorize ideas in such a way that we can henceforth call them up more or less at will. In this way, symbols – though themselves sensible – are able, to a large extent, to free us from our dependence on the sensible world. Again, this argument leads only to the conclusion that we could not freely call up past thoughts about the world – it does not show that these thoughts could not exist in the first place without language.

In any case, why should the memory of symbols be less subject to the overwhelming influence of immediate sensations than the fleeting memory images caused by perception without the help of symbols? Perhaps a later passage in the same paper gives us a clue about how it seemed possible to Frege that due to its very nature language could give us power over the immediate impact of sensation and thus enable us to memorize our thoughts:

It is impossible, someone might say, to advance science with a conceptual notation, for the invention of the latter already presupposes the completion of the former. Exactly the same apparent difficulty arises for [ordinary] language. This is supposed to have made reason possible, but how could humans have invented language without reason? Research into the laws of nature employs physical instruments; but these can be produced only by means of an advanced technology, which again is based upon knowledge of the laws of nature. The circle is resolved in each case in the same way: An advance in physics results in an advance in technology, and this makes possible the construction of new instruments by means of which physics is advanced. The application to our case is obvious (1972:89).

Here, Frege draws an analogy between language and reason on the one hand, and technology and science on the other. In both cases, each of the two elements in the respective pairs is needed in order to advance the other. Thus, language is needed to develop and/or employ our faculty of reasoning, on the one hand, but at the same time reason has to be presupposed to a certain degree in order for language to be possible. Hence, for Frege there is something which is the condition of possibility of language, even though that something –which he calls reason – may not fully function or be applicable without language as its tool. This suggests that for Frege reason is also what enables us to overcome the power of immediate sensual input by using language as a tool; it enables us to memorize links between symbols and what they symbolize even despite the continuous influx of fleeting sensations and memory images. In effect, Frege appears to propose a non-vicious circle between reason and language such that, roughly, the former enables us – by its very nature – to hold in memory a small initial assortment of symbols, and such that the use of these symbols then expands our rational capacities to allow for the combinations and application of those symbols, which in turn are stored in the memory to lead to further combinations – as well as the possible invention of new symbols or symbolic systems – whose use leads to further mental expansion, etc. This conception seems to rule out that language could be the product of mere sensation, at least if sensation is not to be conceived of as part of reason or as its basis.

Frege’s third explanation for why we need language in order to think is that without the help of symbols we could never raise ourselves to the level of specifically conceptual thinking. For, according to Frege in the passage above, we acquire concepts only by applying the same symbol to different but similar things, thereby no longer symbolizing the individual things, but rather what they have in common: the concept.  Again, this argument does not show that concepts could not exist without language or symbols; rather, it shows that concepts could not become available to us without language. In Frege’s own terms, it shows that we could not represent to ourselves what a group of similar things have in common, which is what he calls a concept.

c. Rationalism, Platonism, and Empiricism about Thoughts

Scholars point out that aspects of Frege’s 1882 explanation of why we need language in order to think suggest an empiricist, psychologist account (at least of thought content) according to which thought content derives simply from sense impressions via memory images; however, this stands in contrast at least to Frege’s later views on the matter (for example, Sluga 2002:82). Indeed, Frege’s above admission that at the most basic level sense perception and memory are possible without prior possession of non-sensual conceptual elements seems to stand in direct contrast to rationalist as well as Kantian accounts of the nature of perception. Though, as we saw in the previous section, none of Frege’s arguments for the dependency of thought on language explicitly commit him to the view that the very existence of concepts or thought contents depend on language, the idea that at least basic thoughts and memories are possible on the basis of sensation alone raises the question of why then not all thought and memory content may derive – by means of language – from sensual images (which clearly would be an empiricist view).

If this assessment of Frege’s 1882 view of content is correct, then it might also be relevant to our evaluation of the above argument as an attempt at explaining why language is necessary for thought. For if, by contrast, we assume that the human mind is furnished with innate ideas in addition to the faculty of sensation – as had been the standard view in modern Continental Rationalism – then it might need some more argumentation to show why concepts become available to us only through the application of general symbols to things that we perceive through the senses, or why we could think of invisible, insensible things only by creating symbols for them. After all, innate ideas – if they exist – are in a certain sense continually present in the mind, if not in our consciousness, and this very presence could perhaps already explain why we are able to memorize perceptual experiences, to engage in conceptual thinking, and in general to overcome the continuous impact of sensation on our attention. In other words, if our minds were already furnished with innate ideas then it would need further explanation to understand why reason could not have a direct impact on human consciousness, that is, why it needs language in addition in order to guide and develop our capacity of thinking. If we assume, however, that thought contents are by their very nature entirely made up of sensations and images gained through sensation, then it would seem much more obvious that without the acquisition of general symbols to represent concepts – instead of the individual, elusive images delivered by sensation – there would be no way for us to make use of and memorize them.

Thus, if Frege held a rationalist view of thought contents at this early point, his argument above for the indispensability of thought for language would still appear somewhat incomplete, and if he was an empiricist about thought content at the time but changed his view later, he should have been expected to supplement his argument at that later time in order to convince us of the necessity to study language in order to explore concepts and thoughts. So let us take a closer look both at Frege’s views of the nature of thought content and at plausible rationalist motivations for the philosophical study of language based on the idea that language is necessary for human thought.

Let us first get back to Frege’s apparent view – in his 1882 piece – that basic forms of sense perception and memory are possible without prior possession of non-sensual thought contents. This view appears to contradict his own later remarks on perception in, for instance, 1918’s “Thought”. There he emphasizes that:

Sense impressions alone do not reveal the external world to us. Perhaps there is a being that has only sense impressions without seeing or touching things….Having visual impressions is certainly necessary for seeing things, but not sufficient. What must still be added is not anything sensible. And yet this is just what opens up the external world for us; for without this non-sensible something everyone would remain shut up in his inner world. So perhaps, since the decisive factor lies in the non-sensible, something non-sensible, even without the cooperation of sense impressions, could also lead us out of the inner world and enable us to grasp thoughts (1997: 342f.).

For Frege, forming a thought about the external world — even the kind of thought involved in the mere perception of an object — requires more than sense impressions that are available to the human mind. In addition, something non-sensible has to be assumed in order to account for the possibility of perception. The aim of “Thought” was to show that this something is the thought itself — an entity that, as Frege argues here, belongs neither to the inner world of subjective ideas nor to the world of spatio-temporal, perceivable objects, but rather to a third realm of objective but non-physical things. Indeed, as we read in an earlier passage of the piece, “although the thought does not belong with the contents of the thinker’s consciousness, there must be something in his consciousness that is aimed at the thought. But this should not be confused with the thought itself” (ibid.: 342).  In this last passage, Frege clearly distinguishes between a conscious act of thinking – which must be in a certain way “aimed at” an abstract, objective thought – and the thought itself at which it is aimed.

In addition, Frege explicitly rejects the idea that sense impressions alone could enable our minds to grasp such an objective, non-sensible thought — rather, what is required is again something “non-sensible.” This idea obviously fits in with what he said in his 1882 piece about the relation between language and reason. For according to that remark, language – as a means for grasping thoughts – presupposes reason at least as an independent potential. Reason, then, is a likely candidate for the “something non-sensible” that may be required, according to Frege in 1918, “to lead us out of the inner world and enable us to grasp thoughts.”  Since language itself consists of and works through the perception and use of sensible symbols, it could not be language that Frege has in mind here. However, Frege does not make use of the term “reason” in his 1918 piece but speaks more concretely of a “special mental capacity, the power of thinking”, which is supposed to explain our ability to grasp a thought (ibid.: 341).

In any case, these remarks provide clear evidence that Frege in 1918 conceived of thoughts as existing independently of both physical and empirically psychological reality – thereby ruling out an empiricist account of their constitution. They do not provide conclusive evidence that Frege endorsed a rationalist or transcendentalist view of the origin or nature of conceptual entities, if by this we understand a view according to which either a special faculty of reason – or pure understanding – or alternatively a certain normative value or principle that is constitutive of rationality in general serve to provide the conceptual content of our thought episodes. Rather, Frege’s 1918 remarks would just as well be compatible with a naive Platonist view about thought contents, according to which their objective existence is a brute fact, that is, not accountable or explainable in terms of anything else. (This still seems to be one of the most dominant readings of the nature of Fregean thoughts, as well as concepts and numbers; see Baker and Hacker 1984, Dummett 1991, Burge 1992, & al.)

It seems obvious, however, that Frege favored a broadly rationalist or transcendentalist account of the origin of conceptual entities both in his first monograph Conceptual Notation (1879) and in his second, The Foundations of Arithmetic (1884). For in §23 of Conceptual Notation, Frege claims to have shown “how pure thought, regardless of any content given through the senses or even given a priori through an intuition, is able, all by itself, to produce from the content which arises from its own nature judgments that at first glance seem to be possible only on the grounds of some intuition.” What Frege has in mind here by “the content that arises from its [pure thought’s] own nature” obviously is the content of the laws of logic, which he also calls the “laws of thought” in his preface to Conceptual Notation. Those judgments, by contrast, which “at first glance seem to be possible only on the grounds of some intuition” presumably are those of arithmetic, which Kant had believed to be grounded on the pure intuition of time. This 1879 metaphor of pure thought as grounding arithmetical judgments by way of “the content that arises from its own nature” not only appears inconsistent with Frege’s 1882 seeming slip into psychologism about mental content, but at the same time suggests a rationalist or transcendental approach to the nature of at least some of the contents of our judgments. This is so if we conceive of “pure thought” as referring to a capacity or principle that is constitutive of the rational mind, which is how this expression, and similar ones, had been used by Leibniz, Kant, and their successors.

Indeed, in Foundations Frege explicitly sympathizes with Leibniz’s view that “the whole of arithmetic is innate and is in virtual fashion in us;” a view according to which even what is innate may need to be learned in order for us to become consciously aware of it (1953, §11). In other passages of Foundations, Frege presents objectivity itself as being constituted by reason, and numbers as its nearest kin:

I understand objective to mean what is independent of our sensations, intuition and imagination, and of all construction of mental pictures out of memories of earlier sensations, but not what is independent of the reason, – for what are things independent of the reason? To answer that would be as much as to judge without judging, or to wash the fur without wetting it (1953, §26).

[O]bjectivity cannot, of course be based on any sense-impression, which as an affection of our mind is entirely subjective, but only, so far as I can see, on the reason (ibid., §27).

On this view of numbers the charm of work on arithmetic and analysis is, it seems to me, easily accounted for. We might say, indeed, almost in the well-known words: The reason’s proper study is itself. In arithmetic we are not concerned with objects which we come to know as something alien from without through the medium of the senses, but with objects given directly to our reason and, as its nearest kin, utterly transparent to it. And yet, or rather for that very reason, these objects are not subjective fantasies. There is nothing more objective than the laws of  arithmetic” (ibid., §105).

The first passage above, in particular, recalls Kant´s idea that objectivity is not a feature of things-in-themselves, but of things as they are constituted and apprehended by means of logical forms of judgment, pure categories of understanding and pure forms of intuition. These latter constitute part of the transcendental as opposed to the subjective, psychological aspect of the mind according to Kant. Scholars who tend to read Frege from the perspective of Neo-Kantianism have therefore taken passages like those above as strong evidence for the thesis that his notion of objectivity was not dogmatically metaphysical but epistemological in the tradition of transcendental philosophy (cf. Sluga 1980:120).

In any case, it seems that under the presupposition of either a naive Platonist or a rationalist/transcendentalist account of the origins of objective thought contents, the strength of Frege’s 1882 argument for the indispensability of symbols for human thought rests largely on assumptions about the causal influence of sensation on our train of thought. Indeed, as we saw, Frege had initiated this argument with observations about the effect of sense-impressions on our attention. In this he simply followed Leibniz, who – although a rationalist about the origin of thought – had granted that the senses are required to make the mind attentive to truths and to direct it towards some truths rather than others. For this reason, according to Leibniz, even though intellectual ideas and the truths arising from them do not “originate in the senses”, without the senses we would never think of them (ibid., I, i, §§5, 11). Similarly, Kant points out in the Critique of Pure Reason that our empirical consciousness must be prompted by sensation or sensible impressions in order to have a beginning in time; hence “all our cognitions commence with experience” (1781/86:B1). Frege obviously agrees with Kant and Leibniz on this point, as he regards sense impressions as necessary – if not sufficient – for perception insofar as they “occasion our judgments” (1924/5, 1979:267; see also Frege’s preface to Conceptual Notation, 1972:103). Indeed, with regard to the causality of consciousness we would be “as stupid as rocks” without sense impressions, “and should know nothing either of numbers or of anything else” (1953, §105, n.).

Given such presuppositions about the causal role sensation plays in the generation of actual processes of conscious thought, Frege can still make his case for the necessity of language for thinking by arguing as follows: Without sensible symbols, which – due to their intimate connection to reason (perhaps in the form of a set of innate ideas) – are able to draw our attention away from other sensory input and toward conceptual thought, our entire mental life would be largely dictated by the nature of our immediate sensations. Therefore, we would be psychologically unable to rise to higher forms of conscious awareness and contemplation than those provided by immediate sense perception and the fleeting memory images arising from it. This way of arguing would not commit him to the view that concepts or conceptual thought contents themselves depend for their existence on symbols or on any other sensible images. Rather, the dependence of human thought on language could itself be thought of as merely causal (Baker and Hacker 1984:65f.). As we saw before, Frege apparently sympathized with Leibniz’s view that what is innate may need to be learned in order for us to become consciously aware of it. But if we need to learn about truths and concepts that have been in our understanding all along – as Leibniz saw it – then this is compatible with the claim that in order to learn them we need to use language.

Indeed, in a much later piece written and submitted for publication shortly before his death (“Sources of Knowledge of Mathematics and the Mathematical Natural Sciences”), Frege finally comes to explicitly commit himself to the view that language is necessary not for the existence of thought contents themselves, but only for our conscious awareness of them, that is, for our acts of thinking. In this context, he speaks of a “logical source of knowledge” and a “logical disposition” in us that must be at work in the formation of language, where he made use in 1882 of the ambiguous word “reason” and in 1918 of the expression “power of thinking” to denote a special mental capacity:

The senses present us with something external and because of this it is easier to comprehend how mistakes can occur than it is in the case of the logical source of knowledge which is wholly inside us and thus appears to be more proof against contamination. But appearances are deceptive. For our thinking is closely bound up with language and thereby with the world of the senses. Perhaps our thinking is at first a form of speaking which then becomes an imaging of speech. Silent thinking would in that case be speech that has become noiseless, taking place in the imagination. Now we may of course also think in mathematical signs; yet even then thinking is tied up with what is perceptible to the senses. To be sure, we distinguish the sentence as the expression of a thought from the thought itself. We know we can have various expressions for the same thought. The connection of a thought with one particular sentence is not a necessary one; but that a thought of which we are conscious is connected in our mind with some sentence or other is for us humans necessary.

But that does not lie in the nature of the thought but in our own nature. There is no contradiction in supposing there to exist beings that can grasp the same thought as we do without needing to clad it in a form that can be perceived by the senses. But still, for us humans there is this necessity. Language is a human creation; and so humans had, it would appear, the capacity to shape it in conformity with the logical disposition alive in them. Certainly the logical disposition of humans was at work in the formation of language but equally alongside this many other dispositions – such as the poetic disposition. And so language is not constructed from a logical “blueprint” (1979:269).

Here, Frege explains how it comes about that language in a certain sense “contaminates” the logical source of knowledge – that is, the faculty in us that enables us to have knowledge about logical structures and relations. As he sees it here, this logical disposition in us is not identical to the ability to speak a language, although it is required for the development and acquisition of a language. As he points out in a later passage,

If we disregard how thinking occurs in the consciousness of an individual, and attend instead to the true nature of thinking, we shall not be able to equate it with speaking. In that case we shall not derive thinking from speaking; thinking will then emerge as that which has priority and we shall not be able to blame thinking for the logical defects we have noted in language” (ibid.: 270).

Accordingly, thoughts are not to be identified with their linguistic expressions, and they do not in principle require any language in order to be accessible to rationally ideal beings that are capable of grasping them in an entirely non-sensible way. Presumably, these beings would possess a logical source of knowledge that is so powerful that it doesn’t require language at all in order to produce acts of thought. This idea again recalls Leibniz’s account of the nature of thought, and in particular of his admission that God and the angels were exactly such rational beings who do not – like human beings – require language in order to think (Leibniz 1704/1765, Bk. IV, ch. 5, §1). They do not require language precisely because their attention is not distracted or dominated by the continuous impact of sense impressions.

As opposed to this, Frege points out human beings require language in order to become conscious of a thought. And this, together with the fact that ordinary language – the kind of language in which human beings normally learn to think – is shaped also by other, less rational aspects of human nature, explains for Frege why actual human thought (as opposed to the bare content of pure thought, or that at which an act of thinking, as part of human consciousness, has to aim in order to be a thought at all) is prone to impurity through the influence of the language in which it is normally clad.

These results raise doubts about Michael Dummett‘s  notorious claim that Frege brought the modern tradition to an end by replacing epistemology with the theory of meaning as the foundation of philosophy in general (1981a: 669f.).  Dummett’s central claim about Frege’s philosophy of language is that Frege simply converted traditional problems of epistemology into questions about language (1991: 111-112).  The question, for instance, of how “numbers [are] given to us, if we cannot have any ideas or intuitions of them” raised by Frege in §62 of Foundations, is clearly epistemological. However, according to Dummett, it simply becomes the question of how we refer to, that is, succeed in talking about, numbers. And as Dummett understands this question, it is answered simply by Frege’s account of the meanings of conventionally introduced expressions. The problem with this interpretation is that, presumably, for Frege any complete account of how expressions can possess meaning at all would have to involve a complete account of how we can grasp and understand pure thoughts – and it does not appear that he thought this question could be sufficiently answered with recourse to language simply because for Frege language itself presupposes certain rational capacities in order to be capable of expressing thoughts.

This seems to be precisely why Frege repeatedly takes refuge in various metaphors to indicate the existence of certain rational faculties that enable us to grasp a thought, like the mysterious “power of thinking” that he talks about in “Thought”. Indeed, in a draft dating from 1897 he explicitly describes the act of thinking as “perhaps the most mysterious of all”, and adds that he regards the question of how it is possible as “still far from being grasped in all its difficulty” (1979:145). At the same time, he explicitly denies that this question could ever be answered in terms of empirical psychology or in terms of logic. Certainly, then, he could not seriously hold that specifying a relation between expressions and what they designate, or between sentences and their truth-values, could ever fully replace the question of how it is possible that we can think of anything at all.

Consequently, this also means that a philosophy of language in Frege’s view could never be more than a fragment of a complete philosophy of human thought, albeit an important one. Dummett is aware that in this sense, Frege’s philosophical account of thought and understanding is still incomplete; however, it is doubtful that Frege would have agreed that it could be completed by reflecting further on the uses and functions of language – which is Dummett’s own proposal (1981:413). In fact, whether the question of what thoughts consist in and what their preconditions are could be completely settled within the philosophy of language or not has been one of the major – and most interesting – issues of dispute in 20th century analytic philosophy.  (For detailed discussions of Dummett’s interpretation of Frege see Dummett and Lotter 2004, chap. 2.4.)

2. The Formal Language Approach

We now begin to understand why language was a serious matter to Frege, even though he did not consider it his primary object of interest. His interest in the philosophy of language was based on his firm belief that language is necessary for human thought, and it was triggered in particular by his investigations into the foundations of mathematics, in which he faced a serious problem concerning the symbolic tools that were available at the time for such investigations. In his 1919 “Notes for Ludwig Darmstaedter,” he describes the problem that first led him to investigate language as follows:

I started out from mathematics. The most pressing need, it seemed to me, was to provide this science with a better foundation. I soon realized that number is not a heap, a series of things, nor a property of a heap either, but that in stating a number that we have arrived at as the result of counting we are making a statement about a concept.

The logical imperfections of language stood in the way of such investigations. I tried to overcome these obstacles with my concept-script. In this way I was led from mathematics to logic” (1979:253).

Frege Points out that the logical imperfections of language – by which he means the natural language of everyday life, or the “language of life”, as he sometimes calls it – had proven to be an obstacle for his investigations into the ontology of numbers and the epistemology of mathematics, especially arithmetic. He was trying to find out whether all arithmetic formulas could be proven on the basis of logical axioms and definitions alone, and whether numbers could therefore be construed as logical objects – a view that later came to be called “logicism.” In order to find this out, Frege had to see just “how far one could get in arithmetic by inferences alone, supported only by the laws of thought that transcend all particulars” (1997:48). However, the formula language of arithmetic, in which numbers and their relations are expressed, did not contain expressions for specifically logical relations; and ordinary language proved to be insufficiently transparent with regard to the discovery of logical relations – especially logical consequence – to serve Frege’s purposes well. Therefore, Frege decided to create what he regarded as a logically superior notational system for arithmetic – a notational system that was supposed to be as transparent as possible with respect to the logical structure of thought in that area, and one that contained symbols not only for arithmetical entities but also for specifically logical relations and concepts. Moreover, each term contained or introduced into this notational system should be given a precise and fixed meaning by way of definitions in terms of small number of primitive terms.

a. The Concept Script

Following Adolf Trendelenburg (in his 1867 essay “On Leibniz’s Project of a Universal Characteristic”) Frege baptized his new symbolic system “Begriffsschrift”.  (Although “Begriffsschrift” is usually translated as “concept script” or “conceptual notation”, it is sometimes translated differently; in Frege 1952, for example, it is translated as “ideography”.)  He gives two independent reasons for the choice of this terminology: First – as he explains in the preface to Conceptual Notation – because in it all and only that part of the content of natural language expressions is to be represented that is of significance for logical inference; and this is what Frege called the “conceptual content” of an expression (1997:49). Secondly – as we learn again from his 1882 piece mentioned earlier – Frege means by “Begriffsschrift” a symbolic system in which, contrary to natural language, the written symbols come to express their subject matter directly, that is, without the intervention of speech (1972:88). In this way, expressions of conceptual content could be radically abbreviated; for instance, a simple statement could be accommodated in one line as a formula of the concept script. Frege also decided to represent complex statements of propositional logic – statements linking two or more simple statements – in a two-dimensional manner for reasons of perspicuity.

Historically, the idea of a concept script derives from the Leibnizian project of developing a so-called “universal characteristic” (characteristica universalis): A universal symbolic system in which every complex concept is completely defined based on a set of primitive concepts and logical rules of inference and definition, and which thus enables us to make the conceptual structure of our universe explicit. Such a symbolic system would also contain a logical calculus (calculus ratiocinator) consisting of purely syntactic inference rules based on the types of symbols used within the formal language. However, according to the Leibnizian conception, logic itself is not merely a calculus but expressible in an ideal language, that is, in the universal characteristic. Frege certainly adopted this view of logic from Leibniz; his main source of his understanding of Leibniz’s conception very likely was again Trendelenburg’s essay (Sluga 1980, ch. 2.4). However, 20th and 21st century mainstream analytic philosophy has somewhat misleadingly characterized Frege as regarding logic itself as a universal language rather than a calculus (for example, van Heijenoort, 1967).

The latter characterization is misleading for two reasons. The first is that, as we have seen, Frege did not regard language as the source of thought contents; he did regard logic, however, as consisting of (true) thought contents (though this has been recently disputed for the Frege of the Conceptual Notation period in Linnebo 2003). Hence, he could not have regarded logic as being identical with any language. Secondly, Frege did not actually attempt to develop his concept script as a universal language in Leibniz’s sense (though he agrees that logic itself contains universally applicable laws of thought). Rather, he held the more cautious belief that if such a language could be developed at all, its development would have to proceed gradually, in a step-by-step manner:

“Arithmetical, geometrical and chemical symbols can be regarded as realizations of the Leibnizian conception in particular fields. The concept script offered here adds a new one to these – indeed, the one located in the middle, adjoining all the others. From here, with the greatest prospect of success, one can then proceed to fill in the gaps in the existing formula languages, connect their hitherto separate fields into the domain of a single formula language and extend it to fields that have hitherto lacked such a language” (1997:50).

Thus, Frege intended his concept script primarily for the expression of logical relations within the realm of arithmetic – the field that he saw as located in the middle of all other areas of possible inquiry. He did seem optimistic that his concept-script could be successfully applied “wherever a special value has to be placed on the validity of proof” (ibid.); and this seemed appropriate not only with regard to mathematics but also with regard to “fields where, besides conceptual necessity, natural necessity prevails” – that is, the pure theory of motion, mechanics and physics (ibid.). He also expressed – in the 1882 piece mentioned earlier – the belief that in principle the concept-script could be applied wherever logical relations pertain, and that therefore philosophers as well should pay attention to it. However, he was never ambitious or even interested in examining how it could be applied to areas that were remote from arithmetic.

Frege’s revival of the idea of a universal, logically ideal language for the analysis and advancement of science and human knowledge subsequently became extremely influential especially through the writings of Russell and the early Wittgenstein and it contributed to the development of Logical Positivism in the first half of the 20th century. Rudolf Carnap and other members of the Vienna Circle actually worked on the establishment of a universal formal language of science in which not only every scientific theory could be expressed in a unified way, but also every meaningful philosophical problem would be soluble by way of logical reconstruction (Carnap 1928a and 1928b). Still in the fifties and sixties of the last century, after attempts at establishing a universal formal language of science had eventually proven unsuccessful, Nelson Goodman practiced and endorsed an axiomatic approach — based on the idea of multiple formal reconstructions of certain areas of philosophical inquiry — for investigating the conceptual relation between universals and particulars and between the world of phenomenal experience and that of physical objects (Goodman 1951, 1963). Frege, by contrast, never applied his concept-script to fields other than logic and mathematics, choosing an informal, argumentative (rather than formal) and “constructivist” approach to dealing with philosophical issues arising from – or underlying – his logicist project. Some remarks in the preface to Conceptual Notation might give us a clue as to why he did not go so far as Carnap and Goodman in his adherence to formula language in philosophical inquiry. There, Frege uses the analogy of the microscope and the eye in order to explain the relation between ordinary language (or the “language of life”, as Frege calls it) and concept-script:

The latter (that is, the eye), because of the range of its applicability and because of the ease with which it can adapt itself to the most varied circumstances, has a great superiority over the microscope. Of course, viewed as an optical instrument it reveals many imperfections, which usually remain unnoticed only because of its intimate connection with mental life. But as soon as scientific purposes place strong requirements upon sharpness of resolution, the eye proves to be inadequate. On the other hand, the microscope is perfectly suited for just such purposes; but, for this very reason, it is useless for all others” (1972:105).

According to Frege, the concept-script is not to replace ordinary language in all its uses; on the contrary, he regards it as “useless” in all contexts but “scientific” ones. Given this belief, it remains undecided whether Frege regarded philosophy itself as an entirely scientific discipline or whether he thought that there are areas of philosophy in which the concept-script would be useless in principle. That he never even considered formalizing his claims about perception, meaning, the nature of thought, or the basis of objectivity may be taken as some evidence for the latter, although it would not be conclusive.

b. The Logical Imperfections of Ordinary Language

What all of these “formal language” approaches have in common is not merely the insight that ordinary language lacks a certain amount of transparency when it comes to exploring the meanings and logical relations between words and sentences. It is moreover the assumption that an artificial formula language is in principle able to capture the logical structure of thought – or even of the world itself as it is reflected in thought – better than any natural language that characterizes the approach to language taken by Frege – and after him Russell, the early Wittgenstein, and the Logical Positivists.

The following is a brief survey of what Frege considered the most prominent logical impurities of natural language that stood in the way of his logical investigations into the foundations of arithmetic, and how Frege thought them to be eliminated in a logically perfect language like his concept-script.

i. Non-Observance of the Difference Between Concept and Object

According to Frege, the difference between concept and object is not generally well observed in natural languages. Often, the same word serves to designate both a concept and an object that falls under it. The word “horse”, for instance, sometimes serves to denote a concept, as in “This is a horse”, other times a single object, as in “This horse is black”, and sometimes also an entire biological species, as in “The horse is an herbivorous animal” (1972:84). Even though we could read the second sentence above as “There is exactly one x at location y such that x is a horse and x is black”, thereby maintaining the same logical category for “horse” as in the first sentence, this syntactical structure is not transparent in ordinary language. In a logically ideal language, by contrast, every word or complex expression would have to stand for exactly one object, concept, or relation, and it would have to be clear from the syntax of the language — that is, from the syntactical categories of the expressions themselves — to which of those ontological categories the entity designated belongs. Thus, the logical syntax of the language would reflect the logical structure within the realm of entities to which it is applied.

The main rationale for Frege’s strict distinction between concepts and objects, as well as their corresponding syntactic categories, appears to lie in his understanding of logical unity. In his “Notes for Ludwig Darmstaedter” Frege points out that:

[W]here logic is concerned, it seems that every combination of parts results from completing something that is in need of supplementation; where logic is concerned, no whole can consist of saturated parts alone. The sharp separation of what is in need of supplementation from what is saturated is very important” (1983:254).

Frege does not think that a logical unit such as a sentence,  a thought, or truth value could consist of components all of which are logically complete; such components could not really hang together to constitute a logical whole. Rather, in order to account for the possibility of logically complex units at all, we have to assume that they are composed of a combination of two types of logical components; saturated, complete, self-subsisting ones, on the one hand, and unsaturated, incomplete ones – ones that essentially are in need of supplementation – on the other. On the level of ontology, Frege calls every unsaturated entity a “concept” or “relation”, and every saturated one an “object”. Up until the very last phase of his intellectual career, he included in the latter category not only physical things, and psychological events, but also abstract entities like sets, numbers, truth values, and even entire thoughts (in his specific sense of that which is grasped in an act of thinking).

On the syntactic level, the contrast between saturated and unsaturated entities is reflected in the distinction between proper names, on the one hand, and predicates (which Frege calls “concept-words”) on the other. In this sense, we can say that in Frege, syntactic distinctions as well as relations are not only presupposed in the creation of any meaningful linguistic unit but they already have a meaning in themselves. Thus, the mere combination of a proper name with a predicate in a logically ideal language as such already expresses something – namely, it expresses that an object falls under a concept (which was for Frege the most basic logical relation one can think of).

A proper name in Frege’s sense is any singular expression, that is, a proper name is any expression that serves to designate one and only one particular object; a predicate, by contrast, designates a concept or a relation. Thus, the class of Fregean proper names in ordinary language comprises not only names in the narrow sense like “Aristotle” but also any other expression that is used to refer to one particular object. Notoriously, since at least from 1891 onwards Frege conceives of truth values as objects and of sentences as referring to truth values (1892a), he regards complete sentences of ordinary language as proper names as well – unlike assertions or asserted judgments, which are represented in the concept script by means of an assertion sign (1906a; 1979:195).

ii. Empty Proper Names

Besides its lack of exact correspondence between syntactical and ontological categories, another problem of ordinary language – which Frege encountered not only in fictional but also in scientific contexts – is that of empty proper names. These are grammatically well-formed singular expressions that do not happen to denote anything, or that apply to more than one thing and therefore do not actually fulfill their function as singular terms. One example that Frege cites is the syntactically well-formed expression “the celestial body most distant from the Earth”; it is doubtful whether this expression denotes anything at all. This is even more obvious with expressions like “the least rapidly convergent series”, which are just as void of an object of designation as is the name “Odysseus” (1892a; 1952:58; 1997:153). In his very late phase, Frege traces back the paradoxes of set theory, which brought about the failure of his logicist project, to this very problem of empty singular terms in natural language, as it had misled him into believing that sets,  (that is, extensions of concepts) and numbers were logical objects (1979:269f.; 1997:369f.).

In a logically perfect language, by contrast, “every expression grammatically well constructed as a proper name out of signs already introduced shall in fact designate an object, and… no new sign shall be introduced as a proper name without being secured a significance” (1952:70, 1997:163). In addition Frege suggested that, if need be, an artificial significance could be stipulated for all those proper names that turn out to lack reference to an actually existing object (ibid.).

iii. The Vagueness of Predicates

According to Frege, while proper names serve to designate objects, concept-words serve to designate concepts, which as such belong to an entirely separate logical category (1892:5). This is also reflected in the use of concept-words, which — in contrast to proper names — can refer even if no object falls under the concept they designate (1979:123ff). Nonetheless, a concept-word lacks significance just like an empty proper name if it does not clearly express under which conditions an object falls under the designated concept and under which it doesn’t. For Frege, the logic of pure thought cannot acknowledge concepts with undetermined boundaries (1891a, 1891b).

It seems obvious that most, if not all, concept-words in natural language lack the kind of semantic precision that Frege expects of a logically perfect language. For instance, do we know exactly under what conditions anyone falls under the concept of baldness and under what conditions s/he does not? If not then – barring the remote possibility that there really is a sharp boundary of which we are more or less ignorant – most if not all ordinary language concept-words have vague meanings in Frege’s sense. Hence, strictly speaking most, if not all, concept-words in ordinary language would lack significance, according to Frege’s logic.

In a logically perfect language – as Frege conceived of it – the vagueness of predicates could be eliminated through their arrangement in an axiomatic system, through logical analysis, as well as informal elucidations and clarification of the primitive terms by way of examples. Frege strictly distinguishes definitions from illustrative examples. The latter, together with other forms of elucidation, merely serve to clarify the meanings of primitive signs (signs whose meanings cannot be analyzed further into logical components). Theoretically, one would never be able to fully clarify the meaning of such an expression by way of examples; however, according to Frege “we do manage to come to an understanding about the meanings of words” in practice. Whether we do, of course, will in this case always depend on a “meeting of minds, on others guessing what we have in mind” (1914/1979:207).

Definitions in the proper sense are constructive, in that they introduce a new sign to abbreviate a more complex expression that we have constructed out of its logical components. Frege distinguishes from these purely stipulative definitions cases of what were in his time called “analytic definitions”. These display a logical analysis of the sense of a sign that has long been in use before by identifying its sense with that of a complex expression; this sense then is a function of the senses of the latter’s logical parts. In this case the meaning equation is not a mere matter of arbitrary stipulation but can only be recognized by “an immediate insight.”

iv. Grammatical versus Logical Categories

For Frege, the logician’s main goal in her struggle with language is to “separate the logical from the psychological;” that is, the logician’s main goal in her struggle with language is to isolate the logically relevant aspects of grammar and meaning from those that are not. Frege defines “logically relevant aspects of grammar” as only those aspects of language that have a bearing on logical inference (1979:4). Accordingly, as philosophers interested in pure thought we “have to turn our backs on” any grammatical distinctions and elements of meaning that are not relevant for logical inferences, or that may even obscure them.

This includes, but is not limited to, the grammatical distinction between the subject and the predicate of a sentence, which Frege contends misled logicians for centuries. Grammatically speaking, the subject of a sentence is the expression that signifies what the sentence is “about”, or as Frege puts it, the subject of the sentence is “the concept with which the judgment is chiefly concerned” (1979:113). The predicate, by contrast, would then be the expression that signifies what is being said about the subject or, alternatively, the concept that is applied to the subject. So, for instance, in the sentence “Archimedes perished at the conquest of Syracuse,” the word “Archimedes” appears to be the subject; and “…perished at the conquest of Syracuse, “the predicate. According to Frege, however, the grammatical distinction between subject and predicate, which used to be the model for traditional logic, does not match the logical structure of that part of the content of sentences that is relevant for logic.

More precisely, Frege thought the distinction between subject and predicate to be neither necessary nor sufficient to describe the logical structure of thought. It is not necessary because it yields distinctions between sentences that appear to have the same logical power of inference. For instance, the following two sentences obviously are grammatically distinct:

(1) “At Plataea the Greeks defeated the Persians.”
(2) “At Plataea the Persians were defeated by the Greeks.”

In (1) “the Greeks” appears to be the grammatical subject, while in (2) it is “the Persians”. Yet from a logical point of view the two sentences have the same conceptual content, and therefore do not need to be distinguished in a logically perfect language (ibid.:112f.); all the consequences that can be derived from (1) combined with certain others can also be derived from (2) combined with the same others, which means that the logically relevant part of their content, which Frege decides to call “conceptual content”, is the same.

The second reason why Frege thought the grammatical distinction between subject and predicate is unnecessary for the expression of, or distinction between, conceptual contents and their components is that, logically speaking, the linguistic expression of a judgment or assertion can always be rephrased as a combination of a nominal phrase, which contains the entire conceptual content, and a grammatical predicate like “is a fact” or “is true”, which does not add anything to that content. Hence, as Frege points out, “we can imagine a language in which the proposition “Archimedes perished at the conquest of Syracuse” would be expressed in the following way: “The violent death of Archimedes at the conquest of Syracuse is a fact” (1879, §3; 1972:113). In such a case the grammatical subject contains the whole content of the judgment and the predicate serves only to present this content as a judgment; hence, strictly speaking, nothing at the level of conceptual content — at the level of what is relevant to logical inference — corresponds to the predicate here. In fact, for Frege a logically ideal language like the concept-script is a language in which the only grammatical predicate is “is a fact”, represented by a combination of the so-called judgment stroke ” |-” and the content stroke “~”; and occurring to the left of judgable contents (” ….”) (1879, §2). Because Frege conceives of such contents as identical to the contents of nominal phrases and thus all complete expressions in his system are names (or “terms” in Russellian terminology), his sentential logic today is sometimes called “term logic” (for example, Zalta 2004) as opposed to standard propositional logic, in which propositions or sentences are regarded as a logical category distinct from both predicates and terms.

Furthermore, even for cases when we do seem to be able to use the distinction between predicate and subject to analyze judgable contents into their components, Frege thought the grammatical opposition of subject and predicate to be insufficient for capturing important logical distinctions that apply to the contents of sentences in a logically ideal language. In particular, it does not appear to suffice for an analysis of the differences between singular, particular, and general propositions. Singular propositions, according to Frege, are those in which an object is subsumed or falls under a concept; this is what he regarded as the fundamental relation in logic to which all others can be reduced (1979:118). Nevertheless, for the purposes of understanding the structure and logical impact of general and existential propositions, Frege distinguishes two other structural relations within conceptual contents: First, that of subordination or bringing something under something else, which pertains between two concepts of the same logical order; and second, that of a concept’s falling within a concept of higher order.

In a proposition like “All whales are mammals”, for instance, the expression “all whales” again appears as grammatical subject, but “all whales” does not seem to denote a particular object, hence it cannot be construed as a proper name. Instead, what we actually mean is this: “If anything is a whale then it is a mammal”. This indicates that what the sentence actually is about is a relation between two concepts, that of a whale and that of a mammal. What the sentence says about these concepts is that whatever falls under the first also falls under the second; it thereby subordinates the first under the second concept (1979:119; 1884, §47). However, the second concept is not a property of the first; being a mammal is not a property of the concept of being a whale but rather of the objects falling under that concept, just as being a whale itself is. Hence, the two concepts are of the same logical order – they both apply to objects.

This is different in statements that concern the existence of things of a certain kind. If one says “Mammals exist”, or “Some mammals are elephants” then one is not talking about about any particular mammal or elephant but rather about the concepts of a mammal or an elephant; and what one means is that these concepts are satisfied in at least one case. Frege, therefore, regards existence as a concept of the second order. A concept of the second order is one that applies to concepts of the first order; that is, a concept of the second order does not apply to objects but to concepts of the first order, and it is concepts of the first order, not concepts of the second order, that apply directly to objects. Thus, contrary to the use of ordinary language, statements like “Caesar exists” turn out to be senseless because they contain a category mistake (1892b/1997:189). By contrast, we could meaningfully say, “There is one man named ‘Caesar;'” but in this case one is again ascribing existence to a concept; that is, one is ascribing existence to the concept of being named “Caesar”. Moreover, if one rephrases her original singular existence statement as “There is one and only one man named Caesar”, she does not only say something false (for surely there have been plenty of people baptized “Caesar”) but is again just referring to the concept of being named “Caesar;” that is, one is again incorrectly stating that the name “Caesar” applies to exactly one object.

For these reasons, Frege decided to replace the traditional logical distinction between subject and predicate (which in his view is derived from the grammatical distinction between subject and predicate expressions) with the distinction between function and argument a distinction with which he was familiar through his expertise in mathematical analysis. In Conceptual Notation, this distinction is introduced in connection with the notion of judgment. For Frege, “in the expression of a judgment we can always regard the combination of symbols to the right of the turnstile as a function of one of the symbols occurring in it” (1879, §11).  As one can see, the terms “function” and “argument” apply to to expressions rather than to what they stand for. In Conceptual Notation those terms in fact are still used for both; only later did Frege reserve them for those entities that a functional expression and an argument expression respectively stand for.

Functional expressions typically contain placeholders (or variables), which in singular sentences have to be replaced by an argument in order to determine a definite truth-value. For instance, the expression “2 + x = 5” is functional in the sense that its truth-value depends on the value of the variable “x” that occurs in it. If “x” is replaced by “3” then the expression becomes a true sentence or formula of arithmetic; if it is replaced by any other numeral the resulting sentence or formula will be false. Thus, for Frege a function is what such a functional expression stands for. A potential argument for that function is an entity denoted by an expression that serves to supplement the functional expression so as to yield a complete sentence. On the basis of this distinction between function and argument, Frege achieved a new, mathematically oriented understanding of concepts and relations: a concept simply is a function whose value always is a truth value for any suitable argument, and a relation is a function that has more than one such argument place. This idea of concepts or relations as functions covers even cases of higher-order properties: those are conceived of as functions that take on only other, lower-order functions as arguments so as to determine a truth-value. Finally, by contrast to subject-predicate analyses of expressions and their meanings, the distinction between function and argument can be applied also to those logical components that do not by themselves constitute complete sentences, that is, the distinction can be applied to operations like that expressed by “the father of ( )”.

v. The Intermingling of Subjective and Objective Aspects of Meaning

The general motivation for Frege’s abandonment of logical distinctions that are, in his view, still too close to the grammar of natural language was his conviction that ordinary language grammar “is a mixture of the logical and the psychological” (1979:3)  He thought that theses two areas of inquiry should be strictly distinguished both with regard to the questions they raise and to their respective ways of answering them. This anti-psychologism about logic itself extends also to the contents of natural language and thought. As we saw above, one of Frege’s reasons for calling his symbolic system “concept-script” was the fact that it was supposed to represent only that part of the content of natural language expressions that is of significance for logical inference. This implies, however, that according to Frege the content of ordinary language expressions comprises more than just their “conceptual content”. Frege is quite explicit about this point both in early and in later writings. Concerning the two sentences “At Plataea the Greeks defeated the Persians” and “At Plataea the Persians were defeated by the Greeks” he points out in Begriffsschrift that:

Even if one can perceive a slight difference in sense, the agreement still predominates. Now I call the part of the content which is the same in both the conceptual content” (1972, §3:112).

It seems clear that the words “sense” and “content” are being used to cover both logically relevant and other aspects of the meaning of a linguistic expression; for the former constitute only part of the content of an expression. The meaning of “sense” (Sinn) in Frege’s later writings comes closer to that of “conceptual content” in his earlier works. However, the general word “content” still appears to retain its very broad use in works that were written even after Frege’s famous distinction between sense and significance. In a letter to Husserl, for instance, Frege points out that the content of a sentence can include more than just that which can be true or false: for example, a sentence content can also contain “a mood, feelings, and ideas”, none of which can be judged as true or false and none of which, therefore, concerns logic (1906b:106). Note that at this point, interestingly, Frege’s criterion of the logical relevance of linguistic content is no longer articulated in terms of inference but rather in terms of the capacity to be true or false. Frege here lays the ground for that movement in 20th century philosophy of language that rests on the principle that linguistic meaning consists solely in truth conditions, and that therefore a theory of meaning can either be derived from or is identical to a theory of truth – a movement whose most prominent representative was Donald Davidson.

However, the isolated word “content” in Frege’s own writings still covers both logically relevant and logically irrelevant aspects of ordinary language meaning. Hence, to distinguish the two, and sort out the latter, is in Frege’s view one of the main tasks of the logician. What is also peculiar about Frege’s view of natural language content is that he appears to regard all of that part of it which is logically irrelevant as being purely subjective and thus a matter only of psychology, as his mentioning of “moods, feelings, and ideas” already shows. That is, he does not appear to recognize any but subjective and purely psychological meaning elements that are not, strictly speaking, logically relevant. He writes:

The task of logic being what it is, it follows that we must turn our backs on anything that is not necessary for setting up the laws of inference. In particular, we must reject all distinctions in logic that are made from a purely psychological standpoint and have no bearing on inference…. In the form in which thinking naturally develops the logical and the psychological are bound up together. The task in hand is precisely that of isolating what is logical” (between 1879 and 1891, in 1979:3).

According to Frege, such logically irrelevant distinctions include “all aspects of language that result only from the interaction of speaker and listener” such as all information conveyed to the latter by way of intonation or word-order in order to draw the listener’s attention to a particular part of speech (between 1879 and 1891, in 1979:3). They also include merely connotational differences between words denoting the same entities, as exemplified by groups of expressions like “walk”, “stroll”, and “saunter”. Though all of these expressions stand for the same concept, Frege thinks that they all act in different ways on the imagination of the listener, adding to the meaning of the sentences in which they are used an element that is irrelevant to logical inference. Whether one says, “This dog howled the whole night”, or one says, “This cur howled the whole night,” makes no difference with regard to the logical inferences one can draw from them in connection with sentences, nor with regard to their truth or falsity. One tends to associate with the word “cur” rather unpleasant ideas;  however, for Frege, even if one disagrees that these associations match the dog in question, this would still not make the second sentence above false (1979:140).

According to how Frege characterizes these extra-logical, yet, rule-governed features of ordinary language meaning, these are not different from the merely arbitrary association of images with certain words in the minds of individual speakers. In other words, the difference between the meanings of the words “dog” and “cur” would be just as intangible and subjective as the difference between the internal image that a horseman, painter, or zoologist may have come to associate with the name “Bucephalus” and which Frege considers just as subjective “coloring and shading” of a piece of linguistic information (1997:154). And while Frege admits that “without some affinity in human ideas art would certainly be impossible,” he does not seem to see – or be interested in exploring – the conventional rules that govern the difference in meaning between the pejorative “cur” and the neutral “dog”(1997:155).

In other words, Frege does not even seem to acknowledge an entire field of philosophy of language that has been explored subsequently by John Austin, John Searle, Paul Grice and others and that is based on the assumption that we can philosophically – not just psychologically – explore the meaning of utterances as opposed to, or even underlying, the meaning of sentences. Frege reduces this entire area of inquiry to “all aspects of language that result only from the interaction of speaker and listener”, and he thereby overlooks that the phenomena described above do not result just from the interaction between two people. Rather, they are either based on conventional rules and maxims – adherence to which is generally rational or even essential for the possibility of linguistic communication – or at least presuppose knowledge of some such maxims or conventions in order to be properly understood. Therefore, solutions of problems connected to speaker meaning and speech acts are not at all just a matter of psychology; rather, they are at least as philosophically important in any comprehensive account of linguistic communication as problems of the relation between expressions and things in the world, or between expression and what they express.

3. From Conceptual Contents to Sinn and Bedeutung: The Development of Frege’s Semantics

The development of Frege’s view of the semantics of a logically perfect language can be divided up in two major phases, corresponding to two styles of semantic analysis that Frege consecutively adopted. Following Alberto Coffa, we can regard the first as a form of semantic monism and the second as a form of semantic dualism (1991:79f.). What both styles have in common is a broadly picture-theoretic idea of the relation between language and world, and a corresponding ideal of semantic analysis; to serve its purpose, language has to be partitioned into basic syntactical units, each of which is to be associated with an appropriate semantic correlate, which is conceived as an entity. For this reason, monism and dualism can also be regarded as varieties of an entity theory of meaning as defined more recently by Lycan (2000: 78, 83). This is so at least if we keep in mind that for Frege not all those entities that his semantic theory associates with linguistic expressions are supposed to be “individual things”, as Lycan’s characterization of an entity theory of meaning suggests. Rather, as we have seen, some semantic entities in Frege are intrinsically incomplete, like concepts and relations.

A disagreement between monism and dualism arises with regard to the number and character of the entities that are associated with the logical components of sentences. The monist believes that only one such entity needs to be postulated in order to explain how linguistic expressions mean anything and how sentences can be true or false. The dualist, by contrast, holds that linguistic expressions can have truth value potential only if we assign them not one but two different kinds of values, one of which then becomes our link to extra-linguistic reality (that is, to the entities denoted by expressions of our language).

a. The Monism of Frege’s Early Semantics

Frege’s early account of semantics given in Conceptual Notation and Foundations appears to be monistic in the sense above. Frege’s early semantics is based on the notion of a conceptual content, that is, it is based on that part of meaning that is relevant for logical inferences. The class of conceptual contents in turn is divided up into judgable and non-judgable ones, whereby the former are logically composed of and can be decomposed into the latter. What Frege may have had in mind – although he does not put it exactly this way – with his distinction between judgable and non-judgable contents is the following consideration: a judgable content is such that we can reasonably either affirm or deny it: it is acceptable to say “Archimedes’s death is/is not true”, where one of the two alternatives must be correct. Thus, “Archimedes death” is a judgable content. However, this is different in a statement like “This house is/is not true ” – unless we take it to be elliptic for something like “The existence of this house is/is not true”. For a house by itself (unlike its existence) does not belong to the category of things for which the question of whether they are true or false is logically appropriate under the law of excluded middle (tertium non datur), since by itself it can be neither true nor false (alternatively, we can say that it is both not true and not false). For this reason, “this house” is a non-judgable content.

In Conceptual Notation and Foundations, Frege does not appear to acknowledge any ontological difference between a non-judgable content and the object or function that the expression having this content stands for. There are at least three main pieces of textual as well as theoretical evidence for this. The first has to do with Frege’s early account of identity as a relation between signs.  Conceptual content in Frege’s early account is explained by recourse to the illustrative example of the the two propositions “At Plataea the Greeks defeated the Persians” and “At Plataea the Persians were defeated by the Greeks”. This appears to be the first example Frege gives for the relation of “identity of content”. The relation then is explicitly introduced in §8 of Conceptual Notation. There it is explained in the following way:

Identity of content differs from conditionality and negation by relating to names, not to contents. Although symbols are usually only representative of their contents…they at once appear in propria persona as soon as they are combined by the symbol for identity of content, for this signifies the circumstance that the two names have the same content” (1972:124).

As Frege points out, the symbol of content identity has the peculiarity that wherever it is used the resulting judgment no longer is about the contents of the names connected by the identity sign but rather about those names themselves. What such a judgment of identity expresses then is that those names have the same content, whatever this content is. Because Frege considers judgable contents to be fully expressible by nominal phrases of the form “The violent death of Archimedes at the conquest of Syracuse”, and as he considers the concept-script to be a symbolism in which every judgable content is so expressed, we can include names and nominal phrases that stand for judgable contents among the symbols that are suitable candidates for the relation of content identity.

Somewhat later in the same paragraph, Frege goes on to explain what exactly he means by the content of a name in the context of identity of content. He does so in order to show why the identity sign does not merely serve to state trivial tautologies or to introduce abbreviations for complex expressions. Taking an example from geometry he lets a straight line rotate about a fixed point ‘A’ on the circumference of a circle. This shows that ‘A’ can be determined in various ways; for instance, it can be determined either directly through perception, or indirectly, through a description. ‘A’ is also uniquely determined as the point corresponding to the rotating straight line’s being perpendicular to the diameter of the circle on ‘A’. Thus, for Frege the need of a special symbol for identity of content rests on the fact that the same content, in this case point ‘A’, can be determined in different ways and that this fact cannot always be known in advance; rather, it is itself the content of a judgment that requires proof.

Thus, what Frege regards as the conceptual content of a geometrical name, that is, of the description of a single object, appears to be the object itself: the same train of thought that he applied to geometrical points, their ways of determination, and their names, can also be applied to physical (or any other) objects.  Frege contends that the conceptual content of the name “evening star” is the planet Venus, as is the conceptual content of the name “morning star”, though this content is determined in each case in a different way. In the case of names for judgable contents, the object seems to be a true or false circumstance, whereby its truth or falsity are themselves to be regarded as part of the conceptual content in this case. For after his distinction between sense and significance Frege would point out that he has now divided up what he regarded as judgable content in his earlier account into the thought on the one hand and its truth value on the other (1891c:63). Thus, a judgable content in Frege’s early semantics comprises both aspects while – at least in the case of names – a non-judgable content does not appear to contain more than the object denoted by the name. It does not, apparently, contain the way this object is determined – instead, this way of being determined is conceived of as part of the name itself: there is, in a certain sense, no clear logical distinction between the name as a purely syntactic string of characters and its symbolic character or force, in virtue of which it is able to pick out the object it denotes, in Frege’s early semantics.

More concrete evidence for the monistic character of Frege’s early semantics arises from the fact that it does not allow for the difference between meaningful sentences that lack a truth-value on the one hand, and sentences that are completely meaningless on the other. In other words, it does not account for the existence of sentences expressing mock thoughts, which are so plentiful both in fiction and everyday life. This would not be so, had Frege’s early semantics incorporated a second layer of meaning, which a sentence or expression can possess even if nothing exists to which it actually refers. Frege appears to be quite aware of the advantage that his later distinction between sense and significance in this respect provided. In Foundations he still took it for granted that an expression that fails to denote anything lacks any sense or meaning (1884, §§97: 100-102). After his distinction between sense and significance, however, he is quick to point out that he would now prefer to replace the word “Sinn” (“sense”) in those contexts by “Bedeutung” (“reference” or “significance”) (1980:63).

Finally, objects and concepts – the entities that expressions of a logically perfect notational system would stand for – are discussed in Foundations in the context of Frege’s distinction between objective and subjective ideas, a distinction that was supposed to help clarify Kant’s “true views”:

An idea [Vorstellung] in the subjective sense is what is governed by the psychological laws of association; it is of a sensible, pictorial character. An idea in the objective sense belongs to logic and is in principle non-sensible, although the word which refers to an objective idea is often accompanied by a subjective idea, which nevertheless is not its significance. Subjective ideas are often demonstrably different in different people, objective ideas are the same for all. Objective ideas can be divided into objects and concepts. I shall myself, to avoid confusion, use “idea” only in the subjective sense. It is because Kant associated both meanings with the word that his doctrine assumed such a very subjective, idealist complexion, and his true view was made so difficult to discover. The distinction here drawn stands or falls with that between psychology and logic. If only these themselves were to be kept always rigidly distinct!” (1884, §27, n.).

Frege claims to have clarified the Kantian view with his distinction between objective and subjective ideas. It is disputable just how serious we are to take this lip service to Kantianism, and it is also doubtful that Kant would have accepted Frege’s proposed amendment – for Kant and Frege do not appear to have shared the same notion of objectivity. Nevertheless, Frege’s terminological amendment here certainly serves to clarify his own earlier terminology; for in Conceptual Notation, he still uses the expression “combinations of ideas” to refer to judgable contents (1879, §2). In light of this, however, claiming that objective ideas can be divided up into objects and concepts, as Frege does in the above passage, supports the notion that those judgable contents — as combinations of objective ideas — were at the same time combinations of objects and concepts. Thus, this too supports the claim that early Fregean linguistic symbols have only one semantic dimension, namely, the objects, concepts, and true or false judgable contents that they designate.

One should note that Frege’s distinction between subjective and objective ideas (the latter includes physical objects and properties), as well as his later distinction between the inner and the outer realms of entities, suggests that “subjective”, inner states of the mind (like acts of thinking) cannot be conceived of in physical terms. This, of course, is in striking contrast to physicalist accounts of “the mental” and may strike many contemporary philosophers of mind as naive.

b. Sense and Significance

Around 1891, Frege revised his semantics. This revision solves a number of problems that the earlier, monistic account is not able to handle without further expansion. According to Frege’s mature account, each expression has a sense (“Sinn”), which contains a unique way in which the object (or function) that the expression stands for is given to us. The sense is a way an object is determined by an expression . (Roughly, “sense” in Frege’s 1891 account resembles a way an object is determined by an expression in his earlier account.) The object or function that the expression stands for is the expression’s significance (“Bedeutung”), also called “reference” or “referent” both in English translations of Frege’s work and in Anglo-Saxon Frege scholarship. It follows that for each particular sense there can be maximally one significance/reference, while numerous distinct senses may correspond to the same significance, representing the various ways the object (or concept) that an expression stands for can be uniquely given to us in thought. For Frege, not only proper names but also concept words and relational expressions possess sense and significance. Their significance then is a concept or relation, not an object, and their sense – though Frege does not say much about it – presumably consists in a logical thought component that contains the necessary and sufficient conditions for an object to fall under the concept (or stand in the relation to another object). Finally, the sense of a complete sentence is a thought, and its significance a truth-value.

Although the terms “Sinn” and “Bedeutung” appear already in Foundations of 1884, the distinction itself and the semantic account connected with it do not occur in Frege’s writings before 1891.  Part of that distinction is a logical bifurcation of what Frege earlier calls the “judgable content” into a truth-value and a thought as the truth-value bearer. At the same time, the new account classifies ways an object is given as logical components of thoughts, while the relation between ways an object can be determined according to his earlier account to the judgable contents of which it is a logical component had never been clarified. Thus, the new account appears more consistent and complete with regard to the question of how semantic wholes are composed of their parts. On both levels, that of sense and that of significance, wholes are conceived of as functionally composite units that depend on the nature of their parts. On each level, moreover, the unit of a whole requires the supplement of a function by a suitable argument. A truth-value for Frege simply is the value of a concept or relation relative to certain arguments. Likewise, a thought is a composite of senses, at least one of which plays the part of a function and the other of its argument.

Furthermore, the new account opens up an approach to the semantics of fictional language, that is, it opens up an approach to sentences “about” fictional characters or locations. Such sentences typically contain thoughts that have no truth-value because one or the other of their logical components – senses of fictional terms – lacks a corresponding significance in terms of a real object (or concept). Frege’s idea here is based on the dependence of truth-values on arguments and functions – the non-existence of an object corresponding to a specific sense amounts to the lack of an argument for the functional part of the sentence, and therefore leads to the lack of a value for that function in this case.

Also, the distinction between sense and significance allows for an expansion of Frege’s semantics to belief ascriptions, that is, to sentences of the form “John believed that the earth is flat.” The idea is that this sentence may be true independently of whether the embedded part of it (“the earth is flat”) is true. But this means that — since the truth-value of the entire sentence functionally depends on the significance of each part — what the embedded part stands for cannot be a truth-value. Rather, Frege concludes that in the case of indirect speech and belief ascriptions, embedded sentences take on their original sense – the thought they normally express – as an indirect significance. Thus, while the thought they normally express is their sense in direct speech, it becomes their significance in indirect speech.

Finally, the distinction between sense and significance gives a more consistent account of the informative nature of certain kinds of identity statements (like “The evening star is the morning star”) than Frege’s earlier distinction between what is designated by a name and the way it is determined by means of the name. By introducing this new distinction, Frege no longer needs to regard the concept (or relation) of identity as having the peculiar feature of taking on names rather than objects themselves as its arguments. Thus, within his mature semantics, identity once again becomes an ontological relation in which each object stands to itself (though this has been recently disputed in Caplan & Thau 2001). Identity statements no longer are conceived as being about the fact that two different names have the same conceptual content but rather about the fact that the object given to us in one particular way is the same as the object given in another. The idea is similar to Frege’s early solution to the puzzle of informative identity statements: some identity statements are informative insofar as they state that an object determined or given to us in one way is the same as an object determined or given to us in some other way. However, how this idea is theoretically applied and connected to a general account of semantic content appears more consistent in Frege’s later semantics than in his earlier one.

c. Some Issues of Translation

There have been a number of suggestions as to how to translate “Bedeutung” as opposed to “Sinn” in later Frege into English. Besides “meaning”, which in 1970 was officially chosen as the standard translation in all Blackwell editions of Frege’s works because of its exegetical neutrality (see Beaney 1997: 36, n. 84), the two main other alternatives that have been proposed are “reference” and “significance”, by Dummett and Tugendhat, respectively. Dummett also suggests that we distinguish between “reference” for the relation between an expression and the object it refers to and “referent” for this object itself (1981a:93f.). The term “meaning”, by contrast, is problematic as a translation for “Bedeutung” because meaning often is taken to be either something like sense – that is, the thought connected to a sentence in our minds – or something like the rules of use for an expression in any given context: but none of this is what Frege had in mind when he spoke of “Bedeutung”.

Tugendhat’s proposal to translate “Bedeutung” in Frege as “significance” is based on the insight that, while “reference” or “referent” may be regarded as an adequate rendering of “Bedeutung” in the case of proper names, it is quite misleading in that of predicate expressions (Tugendhat 1970:177; cp.. Dummett 1981a:182f.). Indeed, Frege himself points out that in the case of concepts we could not properly speak about the “Bedeutung” – in the sense of “referent” – of the expression, since then we would imply that we were talking about an object, which cannot be the case in light of Frege’s distinction between objects and concepts (1997: 177, 365). Thus, rendering “Bedeutung” always as “reference” or “referent” would in fact require us to introduce some general notion of “entity”, which comprises both concepts and objects in order to explain just what  “Bedeutung” in general is. However, Frege obviously never saw any need for such a general, all-embracing ontological category like “entity”.

Dummett admits that besides the idea of the name-bearer relation, which he regarded as Frege’s prototype relation of reference, a secondary aspect of reference must be acknowledged as well, which consists in the semantic role of the respective expression, that is, in its contribution the truth-values of sentences in which it may occur (1981a:190f.). On this view, predicate expressions behave like proper names in having the function of contributing to the truth-values of sentences in which they occur by means of their respective references, though their semantic role is different from that of proper names. However, Tugendhat (1970) claims that “Bedeutung” in Frege should be understood to always mean primarily the semantic role of an expression, that is, its truth-value potential, and precisely for this reason “Bedeutung” should be translated as “significance” or “importance”. The main evidence in favor of this interpretation is that, for Frege, which reference an expression has, and whether it has any at all, is logically significant only for determining the truth-values of the sentences in which it may occur (as well as whether they have a truth-value at all). Thus, for Tugendhat, there appears to be no additional aspect of the reference of proper names that would justify regarding it as the “prototype” semantic relation, that is, as somewhat superior to the relation between predicates and the concepts or relations that they stand for.

Unlike “reference”, “significance” as a candidate translation for Fregean “Bedeutung” has the advantage that it is generally accepted as a regular connotative aspect of the various meanings of “Bedeutung” in standard German usage, and that it is explicitly used in this meaning by Frege himself (1997:80; cp.. Gabriel 1984:192). Moreover, it seems to be supported by an important principle that Frege endorses, namely, the so-called context principle.

d. The Context Principle and the Priority of Judgments over Concepts

According to the context principle, which is most explicitly stated in Foundations – though nowhere called “context principle” by Frege himself – the sense and/or significance of a word cannot be explained or inquired after in isolation but only in the context of a proposition/sentence (1984: x, §106). It has been a matter of scholarly dispute whether Frege understood this principle to be about sense, or about significance, or about both, since at the time of Foundations the distinction between the two had not been made yet. There has also been a long debate about what exactly the principle implies and how it is to be understood, especially since in one of its formulations, Frege goes so far as to state that a word possesses sense and/or significance only in the context of a sentence (ibid., §62). In fact, this latter formulation has received the most attention in the secondary literature, leading to a widespread conviction that Frege proposes a principle of semantic holism.

However, some scholars, including Dummett, claim that Frege drops the principle in his later writings while others argue that there are passages even in later writings where Frege seems to articulate semantic or non-semantic versions of it in the light of the distinction between sense and significance. For instance, in “Notes for Ludwig Darmstaedter,” Frege points out that one comes at the parts of a thought only by analyzing the whole – which may be taken as a version of the context principle as a holistic principle at the level of sense (1997:362). It is also conceivable to regard the context principle, as some scholars have, as a semantic version of what has been called the “principle of priority of judgments over concepts” (see Bell 1979, Sluga 1980), which figures in Frege’s very early writings composed before Foundations. According to this latter principle, which Frege explicitly presents as a novel principle in the history of logic, the judgment and its content are to be regarded as logically primitive while concepts, as components of judgable contents in Frege’s early account, are derivative logical entities that can be isolated only by analysis of judgable contents (1979:17, 1983:19). In this respect, Frege is thought to deviate from traditional Aristotelian logic much further than logicians of his time or earlier, who tend to naively presuppose the concepts required to create judgable contents as independently given.

Be that as it may, Tugendhat’s claim is that the context principle was an early statement by Frege that points to his conception of “Bedeutung” as truth-value potential and thus to “significance” as the most basic and general meaning of that term (1970:182; cp.. Gabriel 1984:189ff.). It is clear from this that he believed Frege to have held the context principle as a principle about the dependency of significance on truth-value, that is, on what is characteristically denoted only by sentences. For why should a word have significance only in the context of a sentence if not for the reason that its significance simply consists in a truth-value potential, and that sentences are the only kind of expressions considered as true or false? From this it naturally follows that the question of whether an expression has significance can only arise in connection with the question of whether a sentence is true or false. And this idea indeed is used extensively in Frege’s later writings, especially in the context of his distinction between the realms of  art and science (1997:157). “Bedeutung” in this sense is a purely normative term always directed towards an aim or value. And what Frege appears to focus on in “On Sense and Reference” is the question relative to what value or aim the relation of proper names to the objects they stand for – that is, their reference in Dummett’s terminology – is significant: namely, relative to the scientific value of truth alone, and this is a value that only sentences can have.

However, one should note that the context principle has been perceived to clash with another principle commonly assigned to Frege, namely, that of the principle of functionality or compositionality. According to this principle, as it has been interpreted by some scholars, the senses of sentences are ultimately made up of atomic building blocks. According to this interpretation, then, Frege was an atomist and not a holist about meaning components; and this view — though irreconcilable with the context principle, at least as it has been commonly understood — would support Dummett’s interpretation of the reference relation between names and objects as the paradigm relation of logical semantics. (For a detailed critical overview and discussion of the debate about the context principle and the principle of compositionality in Frege see Pelletier 2000).

4. References and Further Reading

a. Frege’s Writings

  • 1879. Begriffsschrift, eine der arithmetischen nachgebildete Formelsprache des reinen Denkens, Halle: L. Niebert; reprinted in Frege 1998a; trans. as “Begriffsschrift, a Formula Language, Modeled upon that of Arithmetic, for Pure Thought” in From Frege to Gödel, edited by J. van Heijenoort, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press 1967, and as “Conceptual Notation” in Frege 1972; selections in Frege 1997.
  • 1879-1891: “Logik”, in Frege 1983: 1-8; trans. as “Logic” in Frege 1979: 1-8.
  • 1880/1: “Booles rechnende Logik und meine Begriffsschrift”, in Frege 1983: 9-52; trans. As “Boole’s Logical Calculus and the Concept-Script”, in Frege 1979: 9-46.
  • 1882: “Über die wissenschaftliche Berechtigung einer Begriffsschrift”, in Zeitschrift für Philosophie und philosophische Kritik 81: 48-56; repr. in Frege 1998: 106-14; trans. as “On the Scientific Justification of a Begriffsschrift”, in Frege 1972: 83-89.
  • 1884: Die Grundlagen der Arithmetik, eine logisch mathematische Untersuchung über den Begriff der Zahl, Breslau: W. Koebner; reprinted with an introduction and afterword by J. Schulte, Stuttgart: Reclam 1987; trans. by J. L. Austin as The Foundations of Arithmetic: A Logico-Mathematical Enquiry into the Concept of Number in Frege 1953; selections in Frege 1997.
  • 1891a: “Funktion und Begriff”, Jena: Hermann Pohle, 1891; reprinted in Frege 1990: 125-42; trans. as “Function and Concept” in Frege 1984: 137-56, in Frege 1952: 21-41, and in Frege 1997:130-48.
  • 1891b: “Über das Trägheitsgesetz”, in Zeitschrift für Philosophie und philosophische Kritik 98: 145-61; reprinted in Frege 1990: 113-24; trans. as “On the Law of Inertia” in Frege 1984: 123-36.
  • 1891c: Letter to Husserl of 5/24/1891, in Frege 1976: 94-98; trans. in Frege 1980: 61-64.
  • 1892a: “Über Sinn und Bedeutung”, in Zeitschrift für Philosophie und philosophische Kritik 100: 25-50; reprinted in Frege 1990: 143-62; trans. as “On Sense and Meaning” Frege 1984: 157-77, as “On Sinn and Bedeutung” in Frege 1997: 151-71, and as “On Sense and Reference” in Frege 1952: 56-78.
  • 1892b: “Über Begriff und Gegenstand”, in Vierteljahresschrift für wissenschaftliche Philosophie 16: 192-205, reprinted in Frege 1990: 167-178; trans. as “On Concept and Object” in Frege 1980: 182-94, in Frege 1952: 42-55, and in Frege 1997: 181-93.
  • 1892-95: “Ausführungen über Sinn und Bedeutung”, in Frege 1983: 128-36; trans. as “Comments on Sense and Meaning” in Frege 1979: 118-25, and as “Comments on Sinn and Bedeutung” in Frege 1997: 172-80.
  • 1893: Die Grundgesetze der Arithmetik, vol. I, Jena: Verlag Hermann Pohle; reprinted in Frege 1998b; incomplete translation in Frege 1982.
  • 1903: Die Grundgesetze der Arithmetik, vol. II, Jena: Verlag Hermann Pohle; reprinted in Frege 1998b; trans. in Frege 1982.
  • 1906a: “Einleitung in die Logik”, in Frege 1983: 201-18; trans. as “Introduction to Logic” in Frege 1979: 185-96, and in Frege 1997: 293-8.
  • 1906b: “Brief an Husserl, 9.12.1906”, in Frege 1976: 105-6; trans. in Frege 1997: 305-307.
  • 1914: “Logik in der Mathematik” in Frege 1983: 219-70; trans. as “Logic in Mathematics” in Frege 1979: 203-50.
  • 1918: “Der Gedanke”, in Beiträge zur Philosophie des deutschen Idealismus 1 (1918-9): 58-77, reprinted in Frege 1990: 342-78; trans. as “Thoughts” in Frege 1984: 351-72, and as “Thought” in Frege 1997: 325-45.
  • 1919a: “Die Verneinung”, in Beiträge zur Philosophie des deutschen Idealismus 1 (1918-19): 143-57, reprinted in Frege 1990: 362-78; trans. as “Negation” in Frege 1984: 373-89 and in Frege 1997: 346-61.
  • 1919b: “Aufzeichnungen für Ludwig Darmstaedter” in Frege 1983: 273-77; trans. as “Notes for Ludwig Darmstaedter” in Frege 1979: 253-57, and in Frege 1997: 362-7.
  • 1924/5: “Erkenntnisquellen der Mathematik und der mathematischen Naturwissenschaften”, in Frege 1983: 286-294; trans. as “Sources of Knowledge of Mathematics and the Mathematical Natural Sciences” in Frege 1979: 267-274.
  • 1952: Translations from the Philosophical Writings of Gottlob Frege, ed. by: Geach and M. Black, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
  • 1953: The Foundations of Arithmetic: A Logico-Mathematical Enquiry into the Concept of Number/Die Grundlagen der Arithmetik, eine logisch mathematische Untersuchung über den Begriff der Zahl, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
  • 1972: Conceptual Notation and Related Articles, ed. by T. W. Bynum. London: Oxford University Press.
  • 1976: Wissenschaftlicher Briefwechsel, Hamburg: Felix Meiner Verlag; trans. as Frege 1980.
  • 1979: Posthumous Writings, trans. by: Long and R. White, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
  • 1980: Philosophical and Mathematical Correspondence, trans. by H. Kaal, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • 1982: The Basic Laws of Arithmetic, ed. and trans. by Montgomery Furth, Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • 1983: Nachgelassene Schriften, ed. by H. Hermes, F. Kambartel, F. Kaulbach, Hamburg: Felix Meiner Verlag (2nd ed.).
  • 1984: Collected Papers on Mathematics, Logic and Philosophy, trans. by M. Black, V. Dudman: Geach, H. Kaal, E.-H. W. Kluge, B. McGuinness, and R. H. Stoothoff, New York: Basil Blackwell.
  • 1990: Kleine Schriften, ed. by I. Angelelli, Hildesheim: Georg Olms Verlag (2nd ed.); trans. as Frege 1984.
  • 1997: The Frege Reader, ed. M. Beaney, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
  • 1998a: Begriffsschrift und andere Aufsätze, ed. by I. Angelelli, Hildesheim: Georg Olms Verlag (2nd ed. reprint); trans. by T. W. Bynum as Frege 1972.
  • 1998b: Die Grundgesetze der Arithmetik I/II, Hildesheim: Georg Olms Verlag (2nd reprint of the 1893/1903 editions); trans. as Frege 1982.

b. Other Recommended Literature

i. General Introductions and Companions to Frege’s Work

  • Baker, G.P. and P.M. S. Hacker, 1984, Frege: Logical Excavations, New York: Oxford University Press.
    • Comprehensive introduction to and critique of Frege’s work from a Wittgensteinian perspective; takes issue especially with Dummett’s interpretation of Frege.
  • Beaney, Michael, 1997: “Introduction” in Frege 1997: 1-46.
    • Good and concise introduction to both Frege’s work and the state of Frege scholarship at the time.
  • Bynum, Terrell W., 1972: “On the Life and Work of Gottlob Frege”, in Frege 1972: 1-54.
    • Good first source of information on Frege, including biographical information about his life and career.
  • Currie, Gregory, 1982, Frege: An Introduction to His Philosophy, Sussex: Harvester Press.
    • Good and well-written general introduction to Frege’s work with emphasis on his epistemological and ontological views and his indebtedness to the Kantian tradition.
  • Dummett, Michael, 1978: “Frege’s Philosophy”, in Dummett, M., Truth and Other Enigmas, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press; earlier version published in the Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Volume 3), ed. Edwards, New York: MacMillan, 1967.
    • One of the first attempts to locate Frege’s place within the history of philosophy; good as a very first orientation but opinionated and no longer generally accepted.
  • Dummett, Michael, 1981b, The Interpretation of Frege’s Philosophy, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
    • Is a follow-up to Dummett’s Frege: Philosophy of Language and contains extensive discussions of and defense against Sluga’s critique of that book.
  • Gabriel, Gottfried and Uwe Dathe (eds.), 2000, Gottlob Frege: Werk und Wirkung, Paderborn: Mentis Verlag.
    • In German; contains historical assessments of Frege’s work and influence on 20th century philosophy on occasion of his 150th birthday; also contains his hitherto unpublished proposals for a reform of the Germanelection law.)
  • George, Alexander and Richard Heck (1998, 2003): “Frege, Gottlob”, In E. Craig (ed.), Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy, London: Routledge.
    • Very concise; good to get a very first overview over Frege’s work, especially in the philosophy of logic and mathematics.
  • Haaparanta, Leila and Jaakko Hintikka (eds.), 1986, Frege Synthesized. Boston: D. Reidel
    • Contains specialized articles on various aspects of Frege’s thought.
  • Ricketts, Thomas G. (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Frege, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, forthcoming.
    • Contains scholarly articles on all the main aspects of Frege’s thought.
  • Schirn, Matthias (ed.), 1976, Studien zu Frege, 3 vols., Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Verlag Frommann-Holzboog.
    • Contains various scholarly interpretations of the core aspects of Frege’s work; articles in German and English.
  • Schirn, Matthias (ed.), 1996, Frege – Importance and Legacy, Berlin-New York: DeGruyter.
    • Contains further scholarly interpretations of the core aspects of Frege’s work.
  • Sluga, Hans, 1980, Gottlob Frege, London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
    • Comprehensive historical introduction; lays emphasis on the historical roots and background of Frege’s thought in 19th century German philosophy, especially Lotze; good to gain a comprehensive picture of the original historical setting of Frege’s thought.
  • Sluga, Hans (ed.), 1993, The Philosophy of Frege, 4 vols., New York: Garland Publishing.
    • Contains specialist papers on various aspects of Frege’s thought.
  • Weiner, Joan, 1999, Frege (Past Masters), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Brief and concise; good as first introduction.
  • Weiner, Joan, 2004, Frege Explained, Open Court Publishing.
    • Even briefer; good as first introduction.
  • Wright, Crispin (ed.), 1984, Frege: Tradition and Influence, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
    • Contains specialist papers on various aspects of Frege’s thought.

ii. General Introductions to the Philosophy of Language

  • Devitt, Michael and Kim Sterelny, 1999, Language and Reality: An Introduction to the Philosophy of Language, 2nd edition, The MIT Press.
    • Decent introduction to the philosophy of language from a naturalistic point of view; may presuppose some familiarity with ‘analytic’ terminology.
  • Lycan, William, 2000, Philosophy of Language, London/New York: Routledge.
    • Good overview over the various problems and theories in 20th century analytic philosophy of language; includes questions for discussion and further references; does not presuppose particular familiarity with analytic terminology.
  • Nye, Andrea, 1998 (ed.), Philosophy of Language: The Big Questions, London: Basil Blackwell.
    • Comprehensive anthology of text fragments from various sources with introductory essays by the editor.

iii. On (Various Aspects of) Frege’s Philosophy of Language

  • Beaney, Michael, 1996, Frege: Making Sense. London: Duckworth.
  • Bell, David, 1979, Frege’s Theory of Judgment, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Burge, Tyler, 1979: “Sinning against Frege”, The Philosophical Review 88: 398-432.
  • Burge, Tyler, 1986: “Frege on Truth”, in Haaparanta/Hintikka 1986.
  • Burge, Tyler, 1990: “Frege on Sense and Linguistic Meaning”, in Bell/Cooper 1990.
  • Caplan, Ben & Mike Thau, 2001: “What’s Puzzling Gottlob Frege?”, Canadian Journal of Philosophy 31, 2: 159-200.
  • Carl, Wolfgang, 1994, Frege’s Theory of Sense and Reference, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Dummett, Michael, 1981a, Frege: Philosophy of Language, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press (2nd ed.).
  • Gabriel, Gottfried, 1984: “Fregean Connection: Bedeutung, Value and Truth-Value”, in Wright 1984.
  • Greimann, Dirk, 2003, Freges Konzeption der Wahrheit, Hildesheim: Georg Olms Verlag.
  • Pelletier, Francis Jeffry, 2000: “Did Frege Believe Frege’s Principle?” Journal of Logic, Language, and Information 10: 87-114.
  • Sluga, Hans, 2002: “Frege on Truth”, in Reck 2002.
  • Tugendhat, Ernst 1970: “The Meaning of “Bedeutung” in Frege”, Analysis 30: 177-189.

iv. Other Philosophy of Language Relevant to or Referenced in this Article

  • Carnap, Rudolph, 1956, Meaning and Necessity, Chicago: University of Chicago Press (2nd ed.).
  • Grice, Paul, 1989, Studies in the Ways of Words, Cambridge, Mass: Harvard University Press.
  • Russell, Bertrand, 1905: “On Denoting”, Mind 14: 479-93; reprinted in Russell, B., 1956, Logic and Knowledge, London.
  • Searle, John, 1969, Speech Acts: An Essay in the Philosophy of Language, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

v. Some Specialized Literature on the Epistemological Dimensions of Frege’s Thought

  • Burge, Tyler, 1992: “Frege on Knowing the Third Realm”, Mind 101: 633-650.
  • Carl, Wolfgang, 1994, Frege’s Theory of Sense and Reference, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Lotter, Dorothea, 2004, Logik und Vernunft: Freges Rationalismus im Kontext seiner Zeit, Freiburg: Karl Alber Verlag.
  • Weiner, Joan, 1990, Frege in Perspective, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.

vi. General Contributions and Companions to the History of Early Analytic Philosophy

  • Bell, David and Neil Cooper (eds.), 1990, The Analytic Tradition, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Coffa, Alberto, 1991, The Semantic Tradition from Kant to Carnap to the Vienna Station, L. Wessels (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Dummett, Michael, 1991a, Frege and Other Philosophers, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Dummett, Michael, 1993, The Origins of Analytical Philosophy, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Reck, Erich (ed.), 2002, From Frege to Wittgenstein: Perspectives on Early Analytic Philosophy, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Tait, William W. (ed.), 1997, Early Analytic Philosophy: Essays in Honor of Leonard Linsky, La Salle.

vii. Literature on Other Aspects of Frege’s Philosophy

  • Dummett, Michael, 1991b, Frege: Philosophy of Mathematics, London: Duckworth; repr. 1995.
  • Linnebo, Øystein, 2003: “Frege’s Conception of Logic: From Kant to the Grundgesetze“, Manuscrito 26: 2 (2003), 235-252.
  • Van Heijenoort, Jean, 1967: “Logic as Calculus and Logic as Language”, Synthese 17, 324–330.

viii. Other Literature Referenced in this Article

  • Carnap, Rudolph, 1928a, Der Logische Aufbau der Welt, Berlin: Weltkreis Verlag; trans. by Rolf A. George as The Logical Structure of the World, in Carnap 2003.
  • Carnap, Rudolph, 1928b, Scheinprobleme in der Philosophie, Berlin: Weltkreis Verlag; trans. by Rolf A. George as Pseudoproblems in Philosophy in Carnap 2003.
  • Carnap, Rudolph, 2003, The Logical Structure of the World/Pseudoproblems in Philosophy, Open Court Publishing.
  • Goodman, Nelson, 1951, The Structure of Appearance, Dordrecht: Reidel.
  • Goodman, Nelson, 1963: “The Significance of Carnap’s Der logische Aufbau der Welt,” in Schilpp 1963.
  • Hobbes, Thomas, 1655, De Corpore, Part I: Computatio Sive Logica, tr. by A. Martinich as Logic, New York: Abaris 1981.
  • Kant, Immanuel, 1781/1786, Kritik der reinen Vernunft, Riga: Johann Friedrich Hartknoch, 1st edition (A), 1781; 2nd edition (B), 1787; ed. and transl. by: Guyer and A. Wood as Critique of Pure Reason, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press 1997.
  • Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm, 1704/1765, Nouveaux Essais Sur L’Entendement Humain, ed. and trans. as New Essays on the Human Understanding by: Remnant and J. Bennett, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press 1981.
  • Locke, John, 1690, An Essay Concerning Human Understanding, ed. by P.H. Nidditch, Oxford: Clarendon Press 1975.
  • Trendelenburg, Friedrich Adolf, 1867: “Über Leibnizens Entwurf einer allgemeinen Charakteristik”, Historische Beiträge zur Philosophie, vol. III, Berlin.

c. Related Articles

Author Information

Dorothea Lotter
U. S. A.

Naturalistic Epistemology

Naturalistic epistemology is an approach to the theory of knowledge that emphasizes the application of methods, results, and theories from the empirical sciences. It contrasts with approaches that emphasize a priori conceptual analysis or insist on a theory of knowledge that is independent of the particular scientific details of how mind-brains work.

Varieties of naturalistic epistemology differ in terms of how they conceive the relationship between empirical science and epistemology, how much they rely on empirical science in theorizing about knowledge, and which sciences they take to be particularly relevant to epistemological questions. Naturalistic epistemologists such as W.V. Quine regard epistemology as part of psychology while others such as Alvin Goldman think it merely needs aid from the empirical sciences. On the other hand, Thomas Kuhn thinks that the social sciences should be applied to epistemology. Regardless, the importance of the sciences to epistemology is undisputed among naturalistic epistemologists.

Among the topics within this discipline, the debate on the internal and external theories for the justification of beliefs is one of the main issues. Donald Davidson and John Pollock are major naturalistic epistemologists who support internalism. Alvin Goldman, on the other hand, supports externalism. The issue of a priori knowledge and the problem of induction are also topics for debate within naturalistic epistemology.

Lastly, naturalistic epistemology is not without criticism. Among the problems for naturalistic epistemology are the circularity problem and the problem of normativity. With regard to the aims of unifying science and philosophy, solutions to these problems are of crucial importance for naturalistic epistemologists.

Table of Contents

  1. Key Figures in Naturalistic Epistemology
    1. W. V. Quine
    2. Alvin Goldman
    3. Thomas Kuhn
  2. Naturalistic Epistemology and Current Controversies
    1. Internalism and Externalism
    2. A priori Knowledge
    3. The Problem of Induction
  3. Problems for Naturalistic Epistemology
    1. The Circularity Problem
    2. The Problem of Normativity
  4. Conclusion
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Key Figures in Naturalistic Epistemology

a. W. V. Quine

W. V. Quine usually gets credit for initiating the contemporary wave of naturalistic epistemology with his essay, “Epistemology Naturalized.” In that essay, he argues for conceiving epistemology as a “chapter of psychology,” and for seeing epistemology and empirical science as containing and constraining one another.

Quine’s argument depends on three potentially controversial assumptions. First is confirmation holism – the view that only substantial bodies of theory, rather than individual claims, are empirically testable. Second, Quine assumes epistemology’s main problem is to explain the relationship between theories and their observational evidence. Third, he assumes there are only two ways to approach that problem. One is the psychological study of how people produce theoretical “output” from sensory “input,” and the other is the logical reconstruction of our theoretical vocabulary in sensory terms. In Quine’s view, the second approach cannot succeed, and so we are left with psychology.

The idea behind reconstructing theoretical vocabulary in sensory terms is to model epistemology on studies in the foundations of mathematics. Such studies show how to translate mathematical statements into the language of logic and set theory, and they show how to deduce suitably translated mathematical theorems from logical truths and set theoretic axioms. This allows us to judge the strength of our justification in believing mathematical claims: we are as justified in believing them as we are in believing the logical truths and set-theoretic axioms.

Logical Empiricists such as Rudolf Carnap sought a similar account of our justification for believing scientific theories. Given a translation of theoretical claims into observational vocabulary, we might be able to show how our theories could be derived logically from observation sentences, logical truths, and set theory.

Such a project could not be a complete success. For one thing (as Carnap was well aware), our theories cannot be derived logically from observations – the theories include generalizations covering unobserved cases. Nevertheless, such philosophers as Carnap thought the translation of theory into observational terms would be useful. It would allow us to see just how far our theories outstrip their observational evidence.

Quine emphasizes a second reason why the reconstructive approach must fail: Theoretical statements cannot, in general, be translated into purely observational vocabulary. To effect such translations, we would need to identify the observational conditions of verification (or disconfirmation) for individual theoretical statements. But, as Quine argues in his other most famous essay, “Two Dogmas of Empiricism,” individual theoretical statements do not have unique conditions of verification (or disconfirmation). Rather, we must test theoretical statements in groups large enough to have observational consequences, and the results confirm or disconfirm the groups as wholes. When the observations a theory predicts do not pan out, there is typically a wide range of adjustments we could make in response. We might, for example, give up the claim that this liquid is an acid, or the claim that this is a piece of litmus paper, or the claim we are not hallucinating, and so forth.

So, Quine’s assumption of confirmation holism undermines the possibility of reconstructing theoretical vocabulary in observational terms. Consequently, the reconstructionist approach cannot succeed. Given Quine’s other assumptions, then, the only method left for epistemology is the psychological method: to study empirically how people transform sensory input into theoretical output.

Knowledge thus approached is a natural phenomenon, the outcome of a natural process whereby sensory stimulation leads to theories about the world. To understand the connection between the stimulation and the theories – and to understand how far beyond the stimulation our theories go – we study the process scientifically. The point is not to “reconstruct” the transition, but to understand it as it actually occurs.

Quinian naturalistic epistemology is thus “contained” in psychology as a subdiscipline. Quine also notes, however, that there is a sense in which naturalistic epistemology “contains” the rest of science. Our theories and beliefs about the world, which constitute our science, are part of epistemology’s subject matter. Because they “contain” one another, epistemology and the rest of science can be mutually constraining. Not only should our scientific theories pass epistemic muster, but our epistemological theories must fit appropriately with the rest of our scientific worldview. This conception of the relationship between science and epistemology contrasts vividly with the traditional view of epistemology as “queen of the sciences.” It is probably the most influential aspect of Quine’s naturalism.

b. Alvin Goldman

Unlike Quine, Alvin Goldman is concerned with such traditional epistemological problems as developing an adequate theoretical understanding of knowledge and justified believing. Also in contrast to Quine, he does not see epistemology as part of science. Instead, Goldman thinks that answering traditional epistemological questions requires both a priori philosophy and the application of scientific results. As he often puts it, Goldman’s naturalism is the view that epistemology “needs help” from science.

Goldman’s theory of knowledge is a form of causal reliabilism. On such a view, a justified true belief counts as knowledge only if it is caused in a suitably reliable way. To be “suitably reliable,” a belief-forming process must have a propensity to produce more true beliefs than false ones, and the process’s own causal ancestry must have a greater propensity to produce reliable processes than unreliable ones. Though Goldman argues for this view of knowledge on primarily a priori grounds – for example, by considering how well it captures our intuitive classifications of beliefs as cases of knowledge or not – the theory itself gives empirical science an important place in our understanding of knowledge.

The most obvious place where psychology matters in this theory of knowledge is in the identification and evaluation of belief-forming processes. It is psychology that tells us what processes cause our beliefs, and it is psychology that enables us to judge their reliability. Consequently, the determination whether a particular belief is a case of knowledge will turn on both philosophical and psychological considerations. Philosophically, we can say that the belief (if justified and true) is knowledge if it was caused in a suitably reliable way. The question whether it was caused in such a way, however, is a question for empirical science.

A related role for psychology is in addressing skeptical problems. If true, causal reliabilism shows only that knowledge is logically possible. (It is logically possible for a person to have justified, true beliefs caused by suitably reliable processes.) The question whether knowledge is humanly possible, and the question whether anyone actually knows anything, are both questions whose answers depend on which cognitive processes are available to humans, and on how reliable those processes are.

Goldman’s approach to epistemic justification is also reliabilist and grounded in science. The core of his view is that justification is at least partly a matter of beliefs’ being produced by reliable cognitive processes. Goldman has made numerous modifications to this view, and he has worked out its details in various ways at different times.

The account of justification Goldman now favors has two components. First, he thinks it is an important task of epistemology to clarify and describe our “epistemic folkways,” the set of our commonsense epistemological concepts and principles, including the concept of justified belief. The second component is a theory of what justified believing is, based on the principles underlying our commonsense judgments but perhaps departing from those judgments in certain cases.

To study our epistemic folkways, Goldman thinks it is necessary to examine empirically the ways in which we apply and acquire our epistemic concepts, in hopes of determining those concepts’ structures. He hypothesizes that we apply epistemic concepts to individual cases in much the same way we apply most of our concepts: by judging how similar or different a particular case is to stereotypical instances of the concept. In the case of epistemic justification, he thinks we compare the process whereby a person has come to believe something with what we take to be typical justification-conferring processes, such as perception or deduction. He contends that we take such processes to confer justification because we take them to be reliable.

Our commonsense understanding of what processes people use to arrive at their beliefs, and our commonsense assessments of their reliability, are apt to be quite different from the psychological truth of the matter. So, in Goldman’s view, it is necessary also to construct a theory of what epistemic justification really is, as opposed to how common sense takes it to be. That theory will be grounded in our psychological understanding of how beliefs are formed, and it will include assessments of those processes in terms of reliability (as well as problem-solving power and speed, though Goldman thinks those assessments are only loosely connected to justification, if at all).

c. Thomas Kuhn

Much naturalistic epistemology looks to psychology and, in certain cases, the natural sciences to develop an understanding of knowledge. Especially in the philosophy of science, however, Thomas Kuhn’s work has inspired a naturalistic approach that applies the social sciences to epistemological questions. Kuhn-inspired naturalism is not incompatible with the naturalism that draws on psychology and the natural sciences. Such naturalistic epistemologists as Alvin Goldman and Philip Kitcher have fruitfully applied insights from both the natural and the social sciences in the attempt to understand knowledge as a simultaneously cognitive and social phenomenon.

In his highly influential book, The Structure of Scientific Revolutions, Kuhn carefully examines the process of theory change in science. Unlike earlier approaches, which might, in Carnapian style, have tried to reconstruct theory changes as driven entirely by evidence, Kuhn emphasizes how rare it is that scientists reject old theories in favor of new ones on the basis of data alone. Especially in the case of “revolutionary” changes – such as the transition from Ptolemaic to Copernican astronomy – the data available to scientists can be highly ambiguous, and the data often fail to establish determinately what theoretical framework should win out.

On Kuhn’s view, scientific practice is guided by paradigms – theories, methodologies, and conceptual frameworks that give scientists examples of “good science” and shape their understanding not only of the world, but of what science itself is supposed to be like. As paradigms age, however, they build up not only a record of explanatory and predictive success, but also a record of failures and unsolved problems. Revolutions occur when scientists come to see some of the unsolved problems as both very important and unsolvable from within the reigning paradigms. New paradigms emerge, and debates rage about whether to adopt them or to stick to the old way of doing things, in hopes of eventually solving the threatening problems.

Debates about whether to give up on an old paradigm, Kuhn emphasizes, cannot be settled by the available data. One reason for this is that paradigms help scientists to decide what will and what will not count as data, and they help to determine scientists’ judgments about the import or interpretation of data. Furthermore, it is at most only rarely that a newly proposed paradigm is incremental in the sense that it provides solutions to all or most of the problems solved by the old paradigm, as well as the new problems that have raised questions about the old paradigm. For example, Kuhn attacks the common view that Newtonian mechanics is a limiting case of Relativistic mechanics. Relativity, on his view, does not solve all the Newtonian problems and others besides. Rather, it replaces the old problems with new ones it can solve. Adopting a new paradigm, in such cases, is more like changing the subject than being compelled by the rational force of evidence.

Kuhn attempts to trace the social and political factors behind theory changes in science. The available data do not unequivocally favor one paradigm over others, and scientists do not choose paradigms on the basis of data. Instead, Kuhn believes social and political forces guide paradigm changes. Thus, an adequate explanation of scientific revolutions will be an application of social, political, and historical analysis, not the logical analysis of the relationship between theories and evidence. To understand science in Kuhnian fashion, it is at least as important to understand scientists and what they do as it is to understand the theories they offer and the experiments they conduct.

Kuhn’s dual emphases on socio-political factors in theory choice and understanding science by studying the practices of scientists have led to several different strands of Kuhn-inspired naturalistic philosophy of science.

The most radical strand is the so-called “sociology of scientific knowledge,” often identified with the “strong programme” of David Bloor. At the heart of this program is a “symmetry principle,” to the effect that true and false, rational and irrational scientific beliefs are to be explained in the same way. The explanation of scientific beliefs is thus to be indifferent to the actual truth of those beliefs. This agnosticism about the truth of scientific theories leads strong programme advocates to attempt to explain almost everything scientists do and say in sociological terms, specifically avoiding any appeals to how the extra-social world is in explaining scientists’ behavior. The official agnosticism also sometimes appears to transform itself into a form of constructivism, the view that scientists and others make the world be as it is by adopting theories, instead of the world determining (at least partly) what theories scientists will or should adopt.

A much less radical strand of Kuhn-inspired philosophy of science (which also owes a debt to Quine) is to be found in the work of Larry Laudan. He offers a “reticulated model” of science, in which issues concerning scientific theories, scientific methods, and scientific aims interact with one another. On this model, theories are not adopted independently of methodological and axiological commitments, but neither are those commitments undertaken independently of theoretical commitments. As one would expect from a naturalist, much of Laudan’s case turns on details concerning the actual unfolding of the history of science.

In a somewhat similar spirit, such philosophers as Philip Kitcher and Alvin Goldman have advocated a “social epistemology” partly inspired by Kuhn. A psychological fact about the conduct of science is that it is not the mere construction of theories in the face of evidence. Rather, it is the construction of theories both in the face of evidence and from within a social context. Scientists’ theory choices thus depend on what evidence they gather and also on social and political factors, including the organization of the social structures in which they pursue knowledge. To understand how science happens, then, one must understand those social structures. As Kitcher and Goldman emphasize, however, those structures themselves can be evaluated in reliabilist terms; we can ask (and try to find out) how well a given social structure promotes the aim of producing true theories rather than false ones. Kitcher and Goldman have attempted to answer such questions, and to describe what kinds of social structures would be most conducive to the promotion of our epistemic and scientific goals.

2. Naturalistic Epistemology and Current Controversies

Because naturalistic epistemologies can differ from one another so much, there is rarely a single or standard “naturalistic” approach to an issue in epistemology. Instead, different naturalists will take different approaches, depending on their precise views of the relationship between science and epistemology. This section describes some naturalistic approaches to three current issues in epistemology: the internalism/externalism debate, the problem of a priori knowledge, and the problem of induction.

a. Internalism and Externalism

The debate between internalists and externalists concerns whether anything besides mental states helps to constitute the justification of beliefs. Internalists hold that a belief is justified only if it is appropriately related to other mental states, and externalists hold that justification comes at least partly from elsewhere, for example from the reliability of the process that generated a belief.

Naturalistic epistemology is not committed to either internalism or externalism. Many, perhaps most, naturalistic epistemologists endorse reliabilist theories of justification or knowledge, and so they are externalists. Goldman in particular has been a standard-bearer for externalism.

Among naturalistic epistemologists who endorse internalism are Donald Davidson and John Pollock. Davidson’s naturalism is fairly weak, in the sense that Davidson does not directly apply much hard science to epistemological problems. Nevertheless, he does take seriously Quine’s admonition that epistemology is just one part of our going theory of the world, and he feels free to take for granted such things as the existence of the external world when it comes to explaining how we could have knowledge concerning the external world. He also holds that only another belief can justify a belief, and he thus sees justification as arising from the relationships among one’s beliefs.

Pollock endorses a view he calls “norm internalism.” He holds that beliefs are justified when formed in accord with certain internalized rules concerning the correct ways to form beliefs. Those internalized rules are, in his term, “psychologically real,” contingent features of our cognitive architecture. Nevertheless, he also thinks that experimental studies of reasoning will not be very helpful in determining the contents of the internalized rules. Rather, he thinks the best way to learn their contents is by examining our intuitions about what counts as knowledge or justified belief and what does not.

b. A priori Knowledge

A priori knowledge, if there is any, is knowledge obtained independently of experience. Quine denies there is a priori knowledge. To know something a priori, he thinks, it would have to be analytic (that is, true in virtue of the meanings of the concepts involved), but there is no analyticity. This rejection of the a priori and analyticity is part of the package that includes Quine’s confirmation holism. In fact, Quine claims in “Two Dogmas of Empiricism” that his anti-reductionism (that is, his confirmation holism) is really the same thing as his rejection of analytic truth and a priori knowledge. It is unsurprising, then, that one might take naturalistic epistemology to be radically empiricistic and committed to the non-existence of a priori knowledge.

Recent work in naturalistic epistemology has been far more sympathetic to the a priori than Quine’s. Philip Kitcher has defended a naturalistic account of a priori knowledge that turns on the characteristics of the process that produces a belief. Roughly, he claims that one’s knowledge that p is a priori if and only if it comes from the operation of a process that would have produced knowledge that p no matter what particular experiences one might have had. It is important to note here that we cannot simply reflect on the content of a proposition to determine whether it is knowable a priori in this sense. Rather, we have to take into account the actual facts about how our minds work and see whether there is any process that would produce knowledge of that proposition regardless of one’s particular experiences. It is also doubtful that this sort of a priori knowledge could play the foundational role rationalists have typically assigned to the a priori.

Alvin Goldman has outlined a similar account of a priori knowledge. His account is based on two assumptions. First is his reliabilist account of epistemic justification. Second is the general idea that a priori knowledge is knowledge based on processes of “pure thought,” which operate independently of experience or perception. If we are able to discover that human beings have reliable innate mechanisms of ratiocination and calculation – and there is some evidence that we do – then those mechanisms are reasonably counted as conferring a priori justification on beliefs. In particular, beliefs derived from the operations of those mechanisms, without any reliance on perception, are strong candidates for a priori knowledge.

c. The Problem of Induction

There is no standard naturalistic solution to the problem of induction, but naturalism does provide a general strategy for dealing with the problem. In broad strokes, the approach is to look at the ways in which people actually do perform inductive inferences and to evaluate those inductive methods along such dimensions as reliability.

One kind of inductive inference involves the projection of properties. For example, one might believe that robins and sparrows have Factor X in their blood, and one might then infer that cardinals also have Factor X in their blood. Hilary Kornblith advocates a naturalistic but metaphysical explanation for why such patterns of reasoning tend to be reliable. The causal structure of the world, in his view, leads to a “clustering” of properties in natural kinds. So, if bird is a natural kind, then there will be a number of properties birds have in common, and it is the causal structure of the world that “binds” those properties together. Furthermore, claims Kornblith, our best understanding of human inference points to the view that our minds are natively equipped with mechanisms tuned to the world’s causal structure and to the clustering of properties in natural kinds. In short, we are hard wired to project properties typically in cases where the projections will work, owing to the world’s causal structure.

Another kind of inductive inference, however, is probabilistic inference. For example, we might infer that the next card dealt from the deck probably will not be a heart, since only one card in four is a heart. A great deal of work has been done to study how people make probabilistic inferences, much of it initiated by Daniel Kahneman and Amos Tversky. The news here has not all been good. Our probabilistic inferences are often guided by heuristics and biases that lead us to wrong answers. This could be a case in which investigation of commonly used cognitive processes shows that they are not reliable or do not produce justified beliefs. However, some recent work on so-called “fast and frugal heuristics” aims to show that processes implementing inference patterns that are formally fallacious – that is, that violate the probability calculus – can be effective, fast, and reasonably reliable in the sorts of environments where those processes evolved.

3. Problems for Naturalistic Epistemology

Naturalistic epistemologies have it in common that they apply scientific methods, results, and theories to epistemological problems, though they differ in just which sciences they draw on and how central a place they give to those sciences. Despite this variation among naturalistic views, there are also some important objections to doing epistemology naturalistically at all. Two of those objections center on the Circularity Problem and the Problem of Normativity.

a. The Circularity Problem

Many philosophers suppose one of epistemology’s most important tasks is to answer the Cartesian skeptic. Such a skeptic denies we could know most of the things we take ourselves to know, because we cannot rule out the logical possibility that we are massively deceived about the world. We might be victims of an evil demon, who is ultimately responsible for the nature of our experiences, or we might be brains in vats whose apparent experiences of an apparent external world come from a scientist armed with electrodes and chemicals.

Naturalistic epistemology seeks to explain knowledge by applying our best scientific understanding of the mind-brain. When the issue is skepticism, however, it might appear that using science would be viciously circular. Our scientific theories depend on our sensory experience, and so (says the skeptic or the anti-naturalist) we cannot legitimately appeal to those theories in explaining the possibility or actuality of perceptual knowledge (for example).

This line of objection to naturalistic epistemology is old, and Quine discusses it in “Epistemology Naturalized.” In general, advocates of naturalism have had two things to say about it.

First, they point out (as did Hume) that we simply cannot step outside our going view of the world and evaluate it with no empirical presuppositions. So, the skeptic’s demand for an external validation of science is misplaced. To understand what knowledge is and how it is possible, it is necessary to show how the phenomenon of knowledge fits into the rest of our understanding of things. The result will not be certainty that our scientific theories are correct, but we do not need that sort of certainty in order to get by.

Second, and perhaps more importantly, naturalistic epistemologists sometimes contend the circularity involved is not vicious because it does not beg the question. There is no guarantee our worldview will be self-supporting in the sense that our best scientific understanding of what knowledge is also shows that we do indeed have knowledge of the external world. It could turn out that, by their own lights, our scientific theories and our perceptual beliefs are not justified. Such a result would be disastrous, but naturalistic epistemology does not exclude it as a possibility. Even though we might not be able to validate our knowledge of the external world a priori, the fact that we can validate it at all is significant and non-trivial.

b. The Problem of Normativity

Another problem for naturalistic epistemology is explaining epistemic normativity. The ideas of knowledge and justified belief are normative in the sense that they include notions about what is right or wrong for a person to believe. Though science might be able to tell us about how people do come to believe as they do, critics of naturalistic epistemology often claim it cannot tell us about how people should come by their beliefs. This objection has been pressed by Jaegwon Kim, and it dates back at least to Wilfrid Sellars’ Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind.

Advocates of naturalistic epistemology have typically countered by emphasizing the role of our cognitive goals in normative epistemic evaluations. For example, Goldman points to true belief as one of our most important cognitive goals, and Quine discusses the “anticipation of sensory stimulation” as providing a normative checkpoint for science. Naturalistic epistemology can be normative, on this view, because it can explain and detect the causal connections between our belief-forming processes and our cognitive goals. So, one might claim, epistemic justification is a “good” property of beliefs because justified beliefs come from reliable processes, and reliable processes are those whose use tends to promote the valuable goal of believing what is true and not what is false.

Epistemic value, on this approach, is a form of instrumental value; it derives from the causal ties between cognitive means and valuable cognitive ends. Some critics of naturalistic epistemology, notably Harvey Siegel, have argued that there must be some form of non-instrumental epistemic value. In light of their criticisms, advocates of naturalistic epistemology need either to show how a scientific approach can accommodate non-instrumental value or to explain why there is no need to do so.

4. Conclusion

Naturalistic epistemologists seek an understanding of knowledge that is scientifically informed and integrated with the rest of our understanding of the world. Their methods and commitments differ, because they have varying views about the precise relationship between science and epistemology and even about which sciences are most important to understanding knowledge.

In addressing particular issues, naturalists often make one of two general sorts of moves. The first is to try to show the issue is empirical and then to apply scientific data, results, methods, and theories to it directly. This is what happens when naturalists offer accounts of a priori knowledge based on cognitive psychology, and even when they offer naturalized conceptual analyses that they take to be based on empirical information concerning how concepts are applied.

A second common naturalistic move is to undermine a problem’s motivation by showing it arises only on certain false, non-naturalistic assumptions. This is what happens when naturalists reject Cartesian skeptical problems, on the grounds those problems presuppose that our beliefs about the external world require external validation before they can be fully justified.

Despite its promise, naturalistic epistemology does face serious challenges from the problems of circularity and normativity. It is far from clear they are more serious than the challenges traditional, a priori epistemology faces, but naturalists certainly need solutions to the problems. Finding those solutions is one of the most important philosophical projects in this field that aims to unify science and philosophy.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Bloor, D. 1981. The strengths of the strong programme. Philosophy of the social sciences, v. 11, pp. 199-213.
  • Davidson, D. 1984. A coherence theory of truth and knowledge. In his: Inquiries into truth and interpretation. Oxford, UK: Clarendon.
  • Gigerenzer, G., Todd, P., and the ABC Research Group. 1999. Simple heuristics that make us smart. New York: Oxford U P.
  • Goldman, A. 1967. A causal theory of knowing. Journal of philosophy, v. 64, pp. 357-372.
  • Goldman, A. 1976. Discrimination and perceptual knowledge. Journal of philosophy, v. 73, pp. 771-791.
  • Goldman, A. 1986. Epistemology and cognition. Cambridge, MA: Harvard U P.
  • Goldman, A. 1992. Liasons: Philosophy meets the cognitive and social sciences. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Goldman, A. 1999. a priori warrant and naturalistic epistemology. In: Tomberlin, J. E., ed., Philosophical Perspectives, v. 13. Cambridge, UK: Blackwell.
  • Goldman, A. 1999. Knowledge in a social world. Oxford, UK: Clarendon.
  • Kahneman, D., Slovic, P., and Tversky, A. Judgment under uncertainty: Heuristics and biases. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge U P.
  • Kim, J. 1988. What is “naturalized epistemology”? In: Tomberlin, J. E., ed. Philosophical Perspectives, v. 2. Atascadero, CA: Ridgeview. pp. 381-405.
  • Kitcher, P. 1980. a priori knowledge. The philosophical review, v. 86. pp. 3-23.
  • Kitcher, P. 1992. The naturalists return. Philosophical Review, v. 101, n. 1. pp. 53-114.
  • Kitcher, P. 1993. The advancement of science. New York: Oxford U P.
  • Kornblith, H. 1993. Inductive inference and its natural ground. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Kornblith, H. ed. 1994. Naturalizing epistemology, 2d ed. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Kuhn, T. S. 1996. The structure of scientific revolutions, 3d ed. Chicago: U of Chicago Press.
  • Lakatos, I. 1971. Philosophical papers. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge U P.
  • Laudan, L. 1977. Progress and its problems. Berkeley: U of California Press.
  • Laudan, L. 1990. Normative naturalism. Philosophy of science, v. 57, n. 1, pp. 44-59.
  • Pollock, J. and Cruz, J. 1999. Contemporary theories of knowledge, 2d ed. Oxford: Rowman and Littlefield.
  • Quine, W. V. 1960. Word and object. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Quine, W. V. 1969. Ontological relativity and other essays. New York: Columbia U P.
  • Quine, W. V. 1980. From a logical point of view. 2d ed. Cambridge, MA: Harvard U P.
  • Quine, W. V. 1992. Pursuit of truth. Rev. ed. Cambridge, MA: Harvard U P.
  • Sellars, W. 1963. Science, perception, and reality. London: Routledge and Kegan Paul.
  • Siegel, H.1990. Laudan’s normative naturalism. Studies in history and philosophy of science, v. 21, n. 2, pp. 295-313.

Author Information

Chase B. Wrenn
University of Alabama
U. S. A.

Robert Nozick (1938—2002)

NozickA thinker with wide-ranging interests, Robert Nozick was one of the most important and influential political philosophers, along with John Rawls, in the Anglo-American analytic tradition. His first and most celebrated book, Anarchy, State, and Utopia (1974), produced, along with his Harvard colleague John Rawls’ A Theory of Justice (1971), the revival of the discipline of social and political philosophy within the analytic school. Rawls’ influential book is a systematic defense of egalitarian liberalism, but Nozick’s Anarchy, State, and Utopia is a compelling defense of free-market libertarianism.

Unlike Rawls, Nozick neglected political philosophy for the rest of his philosophical career. He moved on to address other philosophical questions and made significant contributions to other areas of philosophical inquiry. In epistemology, Nozick developed an externalist analysis of knowledge in terms of counterfactual conditions that provides a response to radical skepticism. In metaphysics, he proposed a “closest continuer” theory of personal identity.

His final work, Invariances (2001), offers a theory of objective reality. His other significant contributions to analytic philosophy notwithstanding, Nozick’s defense of libertarianism remains his most notable intellectual mark on philosophical inquiry.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Anarchy, State, and Utopia and Libertarianism
    1. Self-Ownership, Individual Rights, and the Minimal State
    2. Refuting the Anarchist
    3. Distributive Justice
    4. Utopia
  3. Epistemology
  4. Personal Identity
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Life

Robert Nozick was born in Brooklyn, New York in 1938, and he taught at Harvard University until his death in January 2002. He was a thinker of the prodigious sort who gains a reputation for brilliance within his chosen field while still in graduate school, in his case at the Princeton of the early 1960’s, where he wrote his dissertation on decision theory under the supervision of Carl Hempel. He was also, like so many young intellectuals of that period, drawn initially to the politics of the New Left and to the socialism that was its philosophical inspiration. But encountering the works of such defenders of capitalism as F.A. Hayek, Ludwig von Mises, Murray Rothbard, and Ayn Rand eventually led him to renounce those views, and to shift his philosophical focus away from the technical issues then dominating analytic philosophy and toward political theory. The result was his first and most famous book, Anarchy, State, and Utopia (1974), an ingenious defense of libertarianism that immediately took on canonical status as the major right-wing philosophical counterpoint to his Harvard colleague John Rawls’s influential defense of social-democratic liberalism, A Theory of Justice (1971).

Like Rawls’s book, Nozick’s generated lively debate and an enormous secondary literature. But where Rawls made the development of his theory of justice and its defense against critics his life’s work, Nozick took little interest either in responding to critics of Anarchy, State, and Utopia in particular or in continuing to do systematic work in political philosophy in general. Instead, he moved on to produce groundbreaking work in several other areas of philosophical inquiry, particularly in epistemology and metaphysics. His development of an externalist theory of knowledge and his “closest continuer” account of personal identity have been particularly influential. It remains to be seen what impact on philosophy will be made by the general theory of objective truth developed in his last book, Invariances (2001), published shortly before his untimely death from stomach cancer. In any case, it seems clear, judging from the disproportionate amount of attention that it has received relative to the rest of his writings, that it is his early work in political theory that will stand as his most significant and lasting contribution.

2. Anarchy, State, and Utopia and Libertarianism

Anarchy, State, and Utopia is, together with Rawls’s A Theory of Justice, generally regarded as one of the two great classics of twentieth-century analytic political philosophy. Indeed, these two works essentially revived the discipline of political philosophy within the analytic school, whose practitioners had, until Rawls and Nozick came along, largely neglected it. Nozick’s book also revived interest in the notion of rights as being central to political theory, and it did so in the service of another idea that had been long neglected within academic political thought, namely libertarianism.

Libertarianism is a political philosophy holding that the role of the state in society ought to be severely limited, confined essentially to police protection, national defense, and the administration of courts of law, with all other tasks commonly performed by modern governments – education, social insurance, welfare, and so forth – taken over by religious bodies, charities, and other private institutions operating in a free market. Many libertarians appeal, in defending their position, to economic and sociological considerations – the benefits of market competition, the inherent mechanisms inclining state bureaucracies toward incompetence and inefficiency, the poor record of governmental attempts to deal with specific problems like poverty and pollution, and so forth. Nozick endorses such arguments, but his main defense of libertarianism is a moral one, his view being that whatever its practical benefits, the strongest reason to advocate a libertarian society is simply that such advocacy follows from a serious respect for individual rights.

a. Self-Ownership, Individual Rights, and the Minimal State

Nozick takes his position to follow from a basic moral principle associated with Immanuel Kant and enshrined in Kant’s second formulation of his famous Categorical Imperative: “Act so that you treat humanity, whether in your own person or in that of another, always as an end and never as a means only.” The idea here is that a human being, as a rational agent endowed with self-awareness, free will, and the possibility of formulating a plan of life, has an inherent dignity and cannot properly be treated as a mere thing, or used against his will as an instrument or resource in the way an inanimate object might be.

In line with this, Nozick also describes individual human beings as self-owners (though it isn’t clear whether he regards this as a restatement of Kant’s principle, a consequence of it, or an entirely independent idea). The thesis of self-ownership, a notion that goes back in political philosophy at least to John Locke, is just the claim that individuals own themselves – their bodies, talents and abilities, labor, and by extension the fruits or products of their exercise of their talents, abilities and labor. They have all the prerogatives with respect to themselves that a slaveholder claims with respect to his slaves. But the thesis of self-ownership would in fact rule out slavery as illegitimate, since each individual, as a self-owner, cannot properly be owned by anyone else. (Indeed, many libertarians would argue that unless one accepts the thesis of self-ownership, one has no way of explaining why slavery is evil. After all, it cannot be merely because slaveholders often treat their slaves badly, since a kind-hearted slaveholder would still be a slaveholder, and thus morally blameworthy, for that. The reason slavery is immoral must be because it involves a kind of stealing – the stealing of a person from himself.)

But if individuals are inviolable ends-in-themselves (as Kant describes them) and self-owners, it follows, Nozick says, that they have certain rights, in particular (and here again following Locke) rights to their lives, liberty, and the fruits of their labor. To own something, after all, just is to have a right to it, or, more accurately, to possess the bundle of rights – rights to possess something, to dispose of it, to determine what may be done with it, etc. – that constitute ownership; and thus to own oneself is to have such rights to the various elements that make up one’s self. These rights function, Nozick says, as side-constraints on the actions of others; they set limits on how others may, morally speaking, treat a person. So, for example, since you own yourself, and thus have a right to yourself, others are constrained morally not to kill or maim you (since this would involve destroying or damaging your property), or to kidnap you or forcibly remove one of your bodily organs for transplantation in someone else (since this would involve stealing your property). They are also constrained not to force you against your will to work for another’s purposes, even if those purposes are good ones. For if you own yourself, it follows that you have a right to determine whether and how you will use your self-owned body and its powers, e.g. either to work or to refrain from working.

So far this all might seem fairly uncontroversial. But what follows from it, in Nozick’s view, is the surprising and radical conclusion that taxation, of the redistributive sort in which modern states engage in order to fund the various programs of the bureaucratic welfare state, is morally illegitimate. It amounts to a kind of forced labor, for the state so structures the tax system that any time you labor at all, a certain amount of your labor time – the amount that produces the wealth taken away from you forcibly via taxation – is time you involuntarily work, in effect, for the state. Indeed, such taxation amounts to partial slavery, for in giving every citizen an entitlement to certain benefits (welfare, social security, or whatever), the state in effect gives them an entitlement, a right, to a part of the proceeds of your labor, which produces the taxes that fund the benefits; every citizen, that is, becomes in such a system a partial owner of you (since they have a partial property right in part of you, i.e. in your labor). But this is flatly inconsistent with the principle of self-ownership.

The various programs of the modern liberal welfare state are thus immoral, not only because they are inefficient and incompetently administered, but because they make slaves of the citizens of such a state. Indeed, the only sort of state that can be morally justified is what Nozick calls a minimal state or “night-watchman” state, a government which protects individuals, via police and military forces, from force, fraud, and theft, and administers courts of law, but does nothing else. In particular, such a state cannot regulate what citizens eat, drink, or smoke (since this would interfere with their right to use their self-owned bodies as they see fit), cannot control what they publish or read (since this would interfere with their right to use the property they’ve acquired with their self-owned labor – e.g. printing presses and paper – as they wish), cannot administer mandatory social insurance schemes or public education (since this would interfere with citizens’ rights to use the fruits of their labor as they desire, in that some citizens might decide that they would rather put their money into private education and private retirement plans), and cannot regulate economic life in general via minimum wage and rent control laws and the like (since such actions are not only economically suspect – tending to produce bad unintended consequences like unemployment and housing shortages – but violate citizens’ rights to charge whatever they want to for the use of their own property).

b. Refuting the Anarchist

It might be thought that given Nozick’s premises, no state at all, minimal or otherwise, could be justified, that full-blown anarchism is what really follows from the notion of self-ownership. For the activities of even a minimal state would need to be funded via taxation. Wouldn’t this taxation also amount to forced labor and partial slavery? Nozick thinks not. Indeed, in his view it turns out that even if an anarchistic society existed, not only could a minimal state nevertheless arise out of it in a way that violates no one’s self-ownership rights, in fact such a state would, morally speaking, have to come into existence.

Suppose there is a certain geographical area in which no state exists, and everyone must protect his own rights to life, liberty, and property, without relying on a government and its police and military to do so. Given that doing so would be costly, difficult, and time-consuming, people would, Nozick says, inevitably band together to form voluntary protection associations, agreeing to take turns standing watch over each others’ property, to decide collectively how to punish rights-violators, and so forth. Eventually some members of this anarchistic community would decide to go into the protection business full-time, instituting a private firm that would offer protection services to members of the community in exchange for a fee. Other members of the community might start competing firms, and a free market would develop in protection services.

Inevitably, Nozick argues, this process will (via a kind of “invisible hand” mechanism of the sort discussed by economists) give rise to either a single dominant firm or a dominant confederation of firms. For most people will surely judge that where protection of their lives and property is concerned, nothing short of the biggest and most powerful provider of such protection will do, so that they will flock to whatever firm is perceived as such; and the “snowball” effect this will create will ensure that that firm ends up with an overwhelming share of the market. Even if multiple large firms come into being, however, they are likely to form a kind of single dominant association of firms. For there will be occasions when the clients of different firms come into conflict with one another, one client accusing the other of violating his rights, the other insisting on his innocence. Firms could go to war over the claims of their respective clients, but this would be costly, especially if (as is likely) such conflicts between clients became frequent. More feasible would be an agreement between firms to abide by certain common rules for adjudicating disputes between clients and to go along with the decisions of arbitrators retained by the firms to interpret these rules – to institute, that is, a common quasi-legal system of sorts. With the advent of such a dominant protection agency (or confederation of agencies) – an organization comprised essentially of analogues of police and military forces and courts of law – our anarchistic society will obviously have gone a long way toward evolving a state, though strictly speaking, this agency is still a private firm rather than a government.

How will the dominant protection agency deal with independents – those (relatively few) individuals who retain no protection firm and insist on defending their rights themselves – who attempt to mete out justice to those of its clients they accuse of rights violations? Will it allow them to try and punish its clients as they see fit? Nozick argues that the dominant agency will not allow this and, morally speaking, must not. For the agency was hired to protect its clients’ rights, and that includes a right not to be arrested, tried, or punished unjustly or, where one really is guilty of a rights violation, to be punished more harshly than one deserves. Of course, its clients might really be guilty; but the point is, so long as the dominant agency doesn’t itself know that they are, it cannot allow them to be punished. The dominant agency must, accordingly, generally prohibit independents from defending their own rights against its clients; it must take upon itself the exclusive right to decide which of its clients is worthy of punishment, and what sort of punishment that ought to be.

In doing so, however, it has taken on one of the defining features of a state, namely, a monopoly on the legitimate use of force. It has become what Nozick calls an “ultra-minimal state.” In doing so, however, the dominant agency seems to have jeopardized the rights of independents – for though it has (rightly) prohibited those independents from exacting justice on its own clients, lest they inflict unjust punishments, it has thereby also left them unable to defend their own rights. To avoid committing an injustice against independents, then, the dominant agency or ultra-minimal state must compensate them for this – it must, that is, defend their rights for them by providing them the very protection services it affords its own clients. It can, Nozick says, legitimately charge them for this protection, but only the amount that they would have spent anyway in defending themselves. The end result of this process, though, is that the ultra-minimal state has taken on another feature of a state, namely the provision of protection to everyone within its borders. Moreover, in charging everyone for this protection it engages, in effect, in a kind of taxation (though this taxation – and only this taxation – does not violate self-ownership rights, because the original clients of the agency pay voluntarily, while the later, formerly independent, clients are charged only an amount they would have spent anyway for protection). The ultra-minimal state has thus become a full-fledged minimal state.

A minimal state would thus inevitably arise out of an originally anarchic society, given both practical circumstances and the moral requirements – concerning the prohibition of potentially rights-violating self-defense and compensation for this prohibition – binding on any agency acting to enforce the rights of others. And it would do so in a way that violates no one’s rights of self-ownership. So the anarchist can have no principled objection to it.

Nozick’s conception of the origins of the state is reminiscent of the social contract tradition in political thought represented by Hobbes, Locke, Rousseau, and, in contemporary thought, Rawls. For insofar as the state arises out of a process that begins with the voluntary retention by individuals of the services of an agency that will inevitably take on the features of a state, it can be seen to be the result of a kind of contract. The details of the state-originating process in Nozick’s account are very different from those of other social contract accounts, however; and, most importantly, for Nozick, unlike other social contract theorists, individual rights do not result from, but exist prior to, any social contract, and put severe constraints on the shape such a contract can take. Furthermore, the parties to the contract in Nozick’s conception are to be imagined very much on the model of human beings as we know them in “real life,” rather than along the lines of the highly abstractly conceived rational agents deliberating behind a “veil of ignorance” in Rawls’s “original position” thought experiment.

c. Distributive Justice

Most critics of the libertarian minimal state don’t complain that it allows for too much government; they say that it allows for far too little. In particular, they claim that a more-than-minimal state is necessary in order to fulfill the requirements of distributive justice. The state, it is held (by, for instance, Rawls and his followers), simply must engage in redistributive taxation in order to ensure that a fair distribution of wealth and income obtains in the society it governs. Nozick’s answer to this objection constitutes his “entitlement theory” of justice.

Talk about “distributive justice” is inherently misleading, Nozick argues, in that it seems to imply that there is some central authority who “distributes” to individuals shares of wealth and income that pre-exist the distribution, as if they had appeared like “manna from heaven.” Of course this is not really the way such shares come into existence, or come to be “distributed,” at all; in fact they come to be, and come to be held by the individuals who hold them, only through the scattered efforts and transactions of these innumerable individuals themselves, and these individuals’ efforts and transactions give them a moral claim over these shares. Talk about the “distribution of wealth” covers this up, and unjustifiably biases most discussions of distributive justice in a socialist or egalitarian liberal direction.

A more adequate theory of justice would in Nozick’s view enumerate three principles of justice in holdings. The first would be a principle of justice in acquisition, that is, the appropriation of natural resources that no one has ever owned before. The best-known such principle, some version of which Nozick seems to endorse, is the one enshrined in Locke’s theory of property, according to which a person (being a self-owner) owns his labor, and by “mixing his labor” with a previously unowned part of the natural world (e.g. by whittling a stick found in a forest into a spear) thereby comes to own it. The second principle would be a principle of justice in transfer, governing the manner in which one might justly come to own something previously owned by another. Here Nozick endorses the principle that a transfer of holdings is just if and only if it is voluntary, a principle that would seem to follow from respect for a person’s right to use the fruits of the exercise of his self-owned talents, abilities, and labor as he sees fit. The final principle would be a principle of justice in rectification, governing the proper means of setting right past injustices in acquisition and transfer.

Anyone who got what he has in a manner consistent with these three principles would, Nozick says, accordingly be entitled to it – for, his having abided by these principles, no one has any grounds for complaint against him. This gives us Nozick’s entitlement theory of distributive justice: a distribution of wealth obtaining in a society as a whole is a just distribution if everyone in that society is entitled to what he has, i.e. has gotten his holdings in accordance with the principles of acquisition, transfer, and rectification. And it is therefore just however equal or unequal it happens to be, and indeed however “fair” or “unfair” it might seem intuitively to be. Standard theories of distributive justice, Nozick says, are either ahistorical “end-state” or “end-result” theories, requiring that the distribution of wealth in a society have a certain structure, e.g. an egalitarian structure (regardless of how the distribution came about or how people got what they have); or they are historical theories requiring that the distribution fit a certain pattern reflecting such historical circumstances as who worked the hardest or who deserves the most. The entitlement theory of justice is historical yet unpatterned: The justice of a distribution is indeed determined by certain historical circumstances (contrary to end-state theories), but it has nothing to do with fitting any pattern guaranteeing that those who worked the hardest or are most deserving have the most shares. What matters is only that people get what they have in a manner consistent with the three principles of justice in holdings, and this is fully compatible with some people having much more than others, unlucky hard workers having less than lazier but luckier ones, morally repulsive individuals having higher incomes than saints, and so forth.

Nozick illustrates and defends the entitlement theory in a famous thought-experiment involving the basketball player Wilt Chamberlain. Imagine a society in which the distribution of wealth fits a particular structure or pattern favored by a non-entitlement conception of justice – suppose, to keep things simple, that it is an equal distribution, and call it D1. Nozick’s opponent must of course grant that this distribution is just, since Nozick has allowed the opponent himself to determine it. Now suppose that among the members of this society is Wilt Chamberlain, and that he has as a condition of his contract with his team that he will play only if each person coming to see the game puts twenty-five cents into a special box at the gate of the sports arena, the contents of which will go to him. Suppose further that over the course of the season, one million fans decide to pay the twenty-five cents to watch him play. The result will be a new distribution, D2, in which Chamberlain now has $250,000, much more than anyone else – a distribution which thereby breaks the original pattern established in D1. Now, is D2 just? Is Chamberlain entitled to his money? The answer to these questions, Nozick says, is clearly “Yes.” For everyone in D1 was, by hypothesis, entitled to what he had; there is no injustice in the starting point that led up to D2. Moreover, everyone who gave up twenty-five cents in the transition from D1 to D2 did so voluntarily, and thus has no grounds for complaint; and those who did not want to pay to see Chamberlain play still have their twenty-five cents, so they have no grounds for complaint either. But then no one has any grounds for a complaint of injustice; and thus there is no injustice.

What this shows, in Nozick’s view, is that all non-entitlement theories of justice are false. For all such theories claim that it is a necessary condition for a distribution’s being just that it have a certain structure or fit a certain pattern; but the Wilt Chamberlain example (which can be reformulated so that D1 is, instead of an egalitarian distribution, a distribution according to hard work, desert, or whatever) shows that a distribution (such as D2) can be just even if it doesn’t have a particular structure or pattern.

Moreover, the example shows that “liberty upsets patterns,” that allowing individuals freely to use their holdings as they choose will inevitably destroy any distribution advocated by non-entitlement theories, whether they be socialist, egalitarian liberal, or some other theory of distribution. And the corollary of this is that patterns destroy liberty, that attempts to enforce a particular distributional pattern or structure over time will necessarily involve intolerable levels of coercion, forbidding individuals from using the fruits of their talents, abilities, and labor as they see fit. As Nozick puts it, “the socialist society would have to forbid capitalist acts between consenting adults.” This is not merely a regrettable side-effect of the quest to attain a just distribution of wealth; it is a positive injustice, for it violates the principle of self-ownership.

Distributive justice, properly understood, thus does not require a redistribution of wealth; indeed, it forbids such a redistribution. Accordingly, the minimal state, far from being inconsistent with the demands of distributive justice, is in fact the only sure means of securing those demands.

d. Utopia

The minimal state might seem, even to those sympathetic to the arguments for it, to make for a rather austere vision of political life. But Nozick insists that we ought to see it as “inspiring, as well as right.” Indeed, the minimal state constitutes in his view a kind of utopia. For, among all models of political order, it alone makes possible the attempt to realize every person’s and group’s vision of the good society. It is often thought that libertarianism entails that everyone must live according to a laissez faire capitalist ethos, but this is not so; it requires only that, whatever ethos one is committed to, one not impose it by force on anyone else without his consent. If some individuals or groups want to live according to socialist or egalitarian principles, they are free to do so as far as Nozick is concerned; indeed, they may even establish a community, of whatever size, within the boundaries of the minimal state, and require that everyone who comes to live within it must agree to have a portion of his wealth redistributed. All they are forbidden from doing is forcing people to join or contribute to the establishment of such a community who do not want to do so.

The minimal state thus constitutes a “framework for utopia” – an overarching system within the boundaries of which any number of social, moral, and religious utopian visions may be realized. It thereby provides a way for people even of radically opposed points of view – socialists and capitalists, liberals and conservatives, atheists and religious believers, whether Jews, Christians, Muslims, Buddhists, Hindus – to make a go of implementing their conceptions of how life ought to be lived, within their own communities, while living side by side in peace. This gives us, in Nozick’s view, a further reason to endorse it.

3. Epistemology

Nozick’s most influential contributions to philosophy outside of political theory have been in epistemology and the metaphysics of personal identity. In the case of the former, he is best known for his version of an “externalist” theory of knowledge, developed in his second book, Philosophical Explanations (1981).

Traditional theories of knowledge hold that a knower S knows a proposition p if and only if S believes p, p is true, and S is justified in believing p.

The third condition has always been the most problematic: the logical possibility of skeptical scenarios in which the would-be knower is the hapless victim of an omnipotent, omniscient, and deceiving Cartesian demon, or a brain in a vat hooked up by mad scientists to a virtual reality supercomputer feeding it non-stop hallucinations, threaten to make the justification of almost any belief impossible. Examples of the sort made famous by Edmund Gettier – wherein S has a justified true belief (say, a belief that it is now 5:00, based on S’s glance at a nearby clock) that nevertheless does not plausibly amount to knowledge (say, because the clock is broken, and just by chance happens to be displaying the correct time) – also cast doubt on the adequacy of the traditional analysis of knowledge, whatever one says about the threat of skepticism.

These supposed inadequacies in the traditional view of knowledge are often said by its critics to stem from its “internalism” – the assumption that the factors that warrant S’s claim to knowledge must be factors of which S is aware: factors internal to the set of his consciously held beliefs. But these inadequacies can, it is argued, be remedied by adopting an externalist perspective instead, on which the factors that warrant S’s belief, and make it genuine knowledge rather than mere belief, may well be factors of which S is entirely unaware, and which are external to his conscious cognitive processes. One such factor (emphasized by “reliabilist” versions of externalism) might be a belief’s having been produced by a reliable belief-producing mechanism: a mechanism of the existence and operations of which S might be utterly ignorant.

Nozick’s unique contribution to the externalist approach is to suggest that the conditions that make S’s true belief that p count as knowledge are the counterfactuals: (a) that were p not true S would not believe it (the “variation” condition), and (b) that were p still true in somewhat different circumstances, S would still believe it and would not believe that not-p (the “adherence” condition). A belief that fulfills these conditions is one that, in Nozick’s expression, “tracks the truth.” (S’s belief that it is 5:00 in the example above would fail to meet these conditions, and thus fails to track the truth: had it in fact been 4:55 when S looked at the broken clock, he would still have believed that it is 5:00; and had the clock been stopped at 4:55 instead, S would not believe that it is 5:00, and indeed would believe that it is not 5:00.)

Nozick applies this analysis to answering skepticism as follows. We ought to concede to the skeptic that S cannot know that he is not in fact a brain in a vat, for his belief that he isn’t is not one that tracks the truth (since the variation condition can’t be met – if it were not true that S is not a brain in a vat, S would still believe he isn’t). But though this might appear to give away the store to skepticism, in fact it does not. For what the skeptic claims to threaten are everyday beliefs such as, e.g., S’s belief that he is driving in his car – for obviously, if S is actually a brain in a vat, he isn’t really driving in his car. Nozick argues that S can indeed know that he is driving and know that if he is driving then he isn’t a brain in a vat, even though he cannot know that he isn’t a brain in a vat. For it may well be that S’s belief that he is driving tracks the truth (it might, for instance, be produced by a reliable belief-forming process) even if his belief that he isn’t a brain in a vat doesn’t; and if so, then it is at least possible, contra the skeptic, to know, for example, that one is driving in one’s car. In taking this position, Nozick famously, and controversially, denies what is known among epistemologists as the “closure principle,” the principle that if S knows that p and that p entails q, then S knows that q.

4. Personal Identity

Nozick’s contribution to the debate over personal identity is his “closest continuer” theory, also presented in Philosophical Explanations. Philosophical puzzles over personal identity arise from various bizarre thought experiments that seem to present genuine logical possibilities. For instance, there is Locke’s famous example of the prince and the cobbler, wherein the man who wakes up in the cobbler’s body one morning appears to have all the memories of the prince, and none of the memories of the cobbler. So who is the man actually in the cobbler’s body, the prince or the cobbler himself? Or we can imagine a person A stepping into a teleportation machine of the sort described in science-fiction stories, and, due to some glitch in the machine’s operation, not one but two persons similar to A, call them B and C, appearing in the spot where the machine was supposed to send A. Which, if either, is the “real” A?

Nozick’s answer to such questions is that it is the later person who “most closely continues” the earlier one who is the one who is truly identical to the latter. What counts as closeness in this context is not susceptible of a simple, cut and dried answer. If we take psychological properties to be of greater importance to personhood than bodily ones, the closest continuer of the prince in Locke’s example would be the man who wakes up in the cobbler’s body, even though he has none of the prince’s bodily traits (and indeed, even though the prince’s body may still exist, and especially if someone else – the cobbler, say -seems to be in the prince’s body now). If instead we take bodily properties to be of greatest importance, then the closest continuer of the prince would be the person in the prince’s body, whatever memories, if any, that person has. In any case, part of what counts as contributing to closeness is, in Nozick’s view, going to be determined by a person’s own self-conception, by what a person himself takes to be most important to his identity.

What about the case where two or more individuals seem equally close continuers of an earlier person, as in the transporter example? Here Nozick’s view is that, in the latter case, neither B nor C is identical to A – since there is no single closest continuer – and thus A no longer exists; though had only one person arrived in the spot to which the machine was supposed to send A, A would have continued to exist. Personal identity thus depends in part on factors extrinsic to the person himself.

5. Conclusion

Nozick made contributions to other areas of philosophy as well, developing a complex theory of rationality in The Nature of Rationality (1993) and meditating on the meaning of life in The Examined Life (1989), though these works received nothing like the attention garnered by Anarchy, State, and Utopia. But his work in epistemology and metaphysics has been nearly as controversial as his work in political philosophy, and has generated as large a literature. Time will tell whether similar controversy will be generated by his final work, Invariances, wherein he developed a theory of objective reality on which the mark of the objectively real or true, whether in science, metaphysics, or ethics, is “invariance under transformations,” a property of the sort exhibited by the relationships between the numbers we use to measure the temperature, relationships which remain constant or “invariant” whether we use the Fahrenheit or centigrade scales, despite the various differences these scales exhibit in other respects.

In any event, it is almost certain that it is Nozick’s defense of libertarianism that will stand as his most significant contribution to philosophy.

See also Robert Nozick’s Political Philosophy.

6. References and Further Reading

  • G.A. Cohen, Self-Ownership, Freedom, and Equality (New York: Cambridge, University Press, 1995)
  • Edward Feser, On Nozick (Belmont, CA: Wadsworth, 2003)
  • Simon Hailwood, Exploring Nozick: Beyond Anarchy, State, and Utopia (Sydney: Avebury, 1996)
  • A.R. Lacey, Robert Nozick (Acumen Publishing Ltd., 2001)
  • Robert Nozick, Anarchy, State, and Utopia (New York: Basic Books, 1974)
  • Robert Nozick, Philosophical Explanations (Cambridge, MA: Belknap Press, 1981)
  • Robert Nozick, The Examined Life: Philosophical Meditations (New York: Simon and Schuster, 1989)
  • Robert Nozick, The Nature of Rationality (Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1993)
  • Robert Nozick, Socratic Puzzles (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1997)
  • Robert Nozick, Invariances: The Structure of the Objective World (Cambridge, MA: Belknap Press, 2001)
  • Jeffrey Paul, ed., Reading Nozick: Essays on Anarchy, State, and Utopia (Totowa, NJ: Rowman and Littlefield, 1991)
  • David Schmidtz, ed., Robert Nozick (New York: Cambridge University Press, 2002)
  • Jonathan Wolff, Robert Nozick: Property, Justice, and the Minimal State (Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press, 1991)

Author Information

Edward Feser
Pasadena City College
U. S. A.

Jean-Luc Nancy (1940—)

nancyThe French philosopher Jean-Luc Nancy  has written more than twenty books and hundreds of texts or contributions to volumes, catalogues and journals. His philosophical scope is very broad: from On Kawara to Heidegger, from the sense of the world and the deconstruction of Christianity to the Jena romantics of the Schlegel brothers.

Nancy is influenced by philosophers like Jacques Derrida, Georges Bataille and Martin Heidegger. He became famous with La communauté désoeuvrée (translated as The Inoperative Community in 1991), at the same time a work on the question of community and a comment on Bataille. He has also published books on Heidegger, Kant, Hegel and Descartes. One of the main themes in his work is the question of our being together in contemporary society. In Être singulier pluriel (translated as Being Singular Plural in 2000) Nancy deals with the question how we can still speak of a ‘we’ or of a plurality, without transforming this ‘we’ into a substantial and exclusive identity. What are the conditions to speak of a ‘we’ today?

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Lacan
  3. Deconstruction
  4. Community
    1. Immanentism
    2. Heidegger and being-with
  5. Ontology
    1. Globalization
    2. Deconstructing Christianity
  6. Sovereignty
  7. Art and Culture
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Biography

Jean-Luc Nancy was born on the 26th of July 1940 in Caudéran, near Bordeaux in France. When exactly the philosopher Nancy emerged is difficult to ascertain, but it is clear that his first philosophical interests began to arise during his youth in the catholic environment of Bergerac. Shortly after he obtained his graduate in philosophy in 1962 in Paris, Nancy began to write explicitly philosophical texts. He published on authors like Karl Marx, Immanuel Kant, Friedrich Nietzsche and André Breton. This engagement with various different types of thinkers also came to be characteristic of his later work, which is renowned for its versatility.

After his aggregate in philosophy in Paris and a short period as a teacher in Colmar, in 1968 Nancy became an a assistant at the Institut de Philosophie in Strasbourg—he lives and works in Strasbourg. In 1973, he obtained his Phd under the supervision of Paul Ricoeur, via a dissertation on Kant. Soon after, he became the ‘maître de conférences’ at the Université des Sciences Humaines in Strasbourg, the institute to which he is still attached. In 1987, Nancy was elected docteur d’état (doctor of state) in Toulouse with the congratulations of the jury. His dissertation handled the topic of freedom in the work of Kant, Schelling and Heidegger, and was published as L’expérience de la liberté (translated as The Experience of Freedom) in 1988. His supervisor was Gérard Granel and members of the jury included Jacques Derrida and Jean-François Lyotard.

However, Nancy didn’t wait until 1987 to extend his academic career. In the seventies and eighties he was a guest professor at the most diverse universities, from the Freie Universität in Berlin to the University of California. As a professor in philosophy, he was also involved in many cultural delegations of the French ministry of external affairs, particularly in relation to Eastern Europe, Great Britain and the United States of America. Together with his ever-growing publication list, this began to procure Nancy an international reputation. The quick translation of his work into several languages enhanced his fame (Nancy mastered, besides his mother tongue, also German, Italian and English).

This hyperactivity suddenly came to an end when he became gravely ill at the end of the eighties. He was forced to undergo a heart transplant (which Derrida talks about in his recently released book on Nancy, Le Toucher) and his recovery from this was inhibited by a long-term fight with cancer. These diseases marked his career fundamentally. Out of sheer necessity, he put an end to all of his courses at the beginning of the nineties and quit his membership of almost all of the committees that he participated in. He has recently restarted most of his activities, but it is surprising that during these troubles Nancy never stopped writing and publishing. A lot of his main works, most of which are related to social and political philosophical topics, were published in the nineties and he even wrote a text on his disease. It was published as a book in 2000 with the title L’intrus: the intruder. For the moment, now over sixty, he is a very active philosopher. He travels around the world as a popular speaker and thinker on many philosophical congresses and writes one text after another. Nancy is more alive than ever, both as a man and as a philosopher.

2. Lacan

Nancy’s first book appears in 1973: Le titre de la lettre (The Title of the Letter). He wrote it with his philosophical partner Philippe Lacoue-Labarthe. Up until now, it has frequently been described as a critical study on the work of the French psychoanalyst Jacques Lacan. Without working this through here, it is worth mentioning that Nancy quite consistently refers to Lacan, or to psychoanalysis in general, and most of the time in quite a critical way. In The Sense of the World he describes the Lacanian notion of the ‘Other’ as a ‘theological excrement’. That, in a nutshell, is what he had already said in The Title of the Letter: Nancy argues that Lacan questions the metaphysical subject, but does this in a metaphysical way. Since then, Nancy has continued to formulate his reservations against psychoanalytic concepts like Law, Father, Other, Subject, etc. While he contends that psychoanalytic jargon still bears some theological remnants, Nancy also thinks that a lot of its concepts are worth thinking through.

3. Deconstruction

Nevertheless, Lacan is not the author that Nancy and Lacoue-Labarthe explicitly study or look up to. It is the other Jacques, Jacques Derrida, who makes an enormous impression on both of them. With Derrida, Nancy affirms in several interviews, he had the impression that, after Sartre, something new and very contemporary was born in philosophy. Derrida’s work inspired both Nancy and Lacoue-Labarthe to such a degree that they organise the famous conference in 1980, Les fins de l’homme, in Cerisy-la-Salle on Derrida and politics. This conference helped to consolidate Derrida’s solid place at the pinnacle of contemporary philosophy.

For Nancy and Lacoue-Labarthe, this conference on Derrida and politics served as the starting point to deal with more politics. In the same year, they set up a philosophical platform to investigate the political. The ‘Centre de recherches philosophiques sur le politique’ (The Centre of Philosophical Research of the Political) started from the demand to rethink the political and not to rest on the blinding rhetoric of our current democracy. Over several years, philosophers such as Claude Lefort and Jean-François Lyotard give lectures on this topic, and out of this two books sprang up: Rejouer le politique (1981) and Le retrait du politique (translated as Retreating the Political in 1997).

In 1984, Nancy and Lacoue-Labarthe put an end to the activities of the Centre, because, according to them, its role as a place of encounter ‘had become almost completely dissociated from that as a place of research and questioning’. The Centre had too often been the mere successive reception of speakers, rather than a common space with common concerns. Despite the closing down of the Centre in 1984, Nancy’s concern with the question of the political, and that of community, has never disappeared.

Nancy is, of course, much more than a pupil of Derrida. His work is from the beginning marked by lots of diverse influences, from Georges Bataille and Maurice Blanchot to Descartes, Hegel, Kant, Nietzsche and Heidegger. These authors are already evident in the very first books that Nancy published: Le discours de la syncope (1976) and L’impératif catégorique (1983) on Kant, La remarque spéculative (translated as The Speculative Remark, 2001) on Hegel, Ego sum (1979) on Descartes and Le partage des voix (1982) on Heidegger.

The book that Nancy became famous with is La communauté désoeuvrée (1982), a comment on the work of Bataille. This text led Maurice Blanchot to discuss the question of community, and also to consider Nancy’s comments on Bataille, in his La communauté inavouable (translated as The Unavowable Community in 1988). Later on, a compilation of essays centring around the theme of community, La communauté désoeuvrée, is also published as a book. Besides offering an excellent analysis of the problem of community, this volume is an interesting introduction to the author Nancy. One can learn to read Nancy in it, and this is not always an easy job because he starts mostly from a commentary on the work of other authors and develops his own thesis out of this commentary. This strategy of reading and thinking is named deconstruction and Nancy continues Derrida’s work with it. This is one reason why one can call La communauté désoeuvrée a key text in Nancy’s work.

Besides revealing his strategy of thinking, in this text one can also discover the main philosophical themes that Nancy is concerned with in his later work. These often circle around social and political philosophical problems, like the question how to develop our modern society with the twentieth century knowledge that political projects that start by trying to build society according to a well-defined shape or plan have frequently led to political terror and social violence. In this respect, Nancy is obviously thinking of the former socialist states, as well as the nazi and fascist states of the twentieth century.

When Nancy, in the footsteps of Derrida, deconstructs texts of an author, he researches in the most meticulous way what the author writes, but also and especially, what he or she doesn’t write, where his or her thinking halts or recoils to think a problem through. He looks for the place where thinking stumbles. Out of this slip, Nancy tries to make clear the next step the author wanted to take/should have taken in order to think his or her problem but nevertheless didn’t.

4. Community

In La communauté désoeuvrée, Nancy applies this deconstruction to the cry for the restoration of a transparent, small-scale community, a ‘Gemeinschaft’ that might liberate us from the ‘alienation’ in modern society, the ‘Gesellschaft’. Nancy’s thesis is that at the core of western political thinking, there is a longing for an ‘original community’. It is the longing for an immediate being together, out of the idea that we once lived in a harmonious and intimate community, but that this harmony has declined throughout history. The modern society, the Gesellschaft, stands for the opposite of the warm and cosy pre-modern community, the Gemeinschaft. According to this line of thinking, we live now in an anonymous society full of selfish individuals and the close communal ties are no more than memories. This leads not only to the disintegration of society, but also to violence, the decline of norms and values, and so forth. The only solution to fight disintegration is to turn back to the period where the communal ties were present, or to strive for a future community where the former ties are restored.

This historic-philosophical scheme is not only used by a large number of philosophers or social and political thinkers, it is also a central theme within western society and culture in general. According to Nancy:

The lost or broken community can be exemplified in all kinds of ways and by all kinds of paradigms: the natural family, the Athenian city, the Roman Republic, the first Christian community, corporations, communes, or brotherhoods—always it is a matter of a lost age in which community was tight and bound to harmonious bonds in which above all it played back to itself, through its institutions, its rituals, and its symbols, the representation, indeed the living offering, of its own immanent unity, intimacy and autonomy’ (The Inoperative Community, p. 9).

Nancy is thinking largely of the period of the German romantics, of Jean-Jacques Rousseau who left us a mythical natural community as a counterpoint to modern society, but the target of his analysis is also of contemporary communitarianisms, like Alasdair MacIntyre, who speak of the need for a return to pre-modern communities. The nostalgic thought that the past or the old days were better, that we have lost something that was present in the past, is a recognizable paradigm within our everyday life. This nostalgia is not only present in the programs of conservative political parties. A quick look at the commercials from various mediums (especially television) shows us that a lot of products are pretending to give us back a ‘natural’ biological condition of hair colour, for example. Also, in everyday life, people consistently voice their frustrations with the ‘lawless and wild youths’ who have alienated themselves from the community that they were born in.

It is, of course, remarkable that every generation seems to go back to the same criticism again and again. Therefore, Nancy says, the longing for an original community is not a reference to a real period in our history. It is rather a mythical thought, an imaginary picture of our past. As such, this nostalgic imagination is innocent, but when it becomes the starting point for a politics of community, the innocence disappears. We should become suspicious, Nancy says, of the retrospective consciousness of the lost community and its identity:

‘whether this consciousness conceives of itself as effectively retrospective or whether, disregarding the realities of the past, it constructs images of this past for the sake of an ideal or prospective vision. We should be suspicious of this consciousness first of all because it seems to have accompanied the Western world from its very beginnings: at every moment in history, the Occident has rendered itself to the nostalgia for a more archaic community that has disappeared, and to deploring a loss of familiarity, fraternity and conviviality. Our history begins with the departure of Ulysses and with the onset of rivalry, dissension, and conspiracy in his palace. Around Penelope, who reweaves the fabric of intimacy without ever managing to complete it, pretenders set up the warring and political scene of society—pure exteriority’ (The Inoperative Community, p. 10).

Let us take a contemporary example. The harmonic community of which MacIntyre speaks, is a community of common norms and values, shared by people with the same identity and background, otherwise the community wouldn’t be harmonic anymore. If we take this moral inclination for a community of people with the same identity as a political longing, one is not that far removed from the logic of many nationalisms that are still present in Western Europe today. Of course, the intentions are manifestly different but the international political scene shows that the longing for a pure social identity can still lead to violent conflicts. The Balkan wars of the nineties, which erupted one by one, are a sad example of that. Whatever the motives of these wars, the belonging to an ethnic group has been the criterion in making the difference between good and evil, between us and them, between authentic Serbs or real Croats and others. What was sought after was a pure and undivided social identity, no longer soiled by the stains of other blood.

In other and fortunately less violent contexts, it is a certain culture of shared values and norms which delivers the foundations for social identity. Flemish people are defined as different from Dutch people, although they are neighbours, speak the same language and have almost everything in common. Another example is the current ‘migration problem’: there is often a suspicion on behalf of citizens around the world that the values of groups of immigrants might threaten the identity of a region and thereby affect the social solidarity. The fear in Western Europe, and elsewhere, seems to be that any influx of foreigners might change public life so dramatically that our ‘own’ former identity would be in danger. Symbols like the headscarf of Muslim females, for example, play an important role in that debate and are at the basis of hot political discussions on the identity and the values of many European nations.

a. Immanentism

Nancy summarises the communal desire for a closed and undivided social identity with his concept of immanentism. The French word ‘immanence’ means to be fully present with oneself, to be closed upon oneself. In La communauté désoeuvrée, immanentism is the concept by which Nancy describes the horizon of our attitudes towards identity and community. He points at two examples. On the one hand, he is thinking of the way that communities, nations or ethnics try to protect their identity from the influences of others, so that they are united around their undivided selfhood, culture or values. On the other hand, immanentism is also present in the way that the former socialist regimes in Eastern Europe understood the communist form of constitution as the final destination of humanity. There too, you can discover a desire for the annihilation of social alienation and for an immediate and transparent being together. The ultimate goal of human acting is to reach the transparent communist way of life. Once that goal has been realised, the idea is that all alienation of the capitalist way of life would disappear and society would finally be harmoniously present with itself.

With its detailed articulation of this political and philosophical paradigm of thinking, intertwined with a commentary on Bataille, Nancy’s La communauté désoeuvrée obtained international fame. Nevertheless, he never elaborated a theory of community, just like he has not done so with the other main themes from his work. Far more often, he launches a few theses, offers fragments and traces of thinking, which he then develops further in later texts. This fragmentary character of his work sometimes makes it difficult to come to grips with, but on the other hand, you get in every book or text a lot of new perspectives and stimulating insights on contemporary political, philosophical and ontological problems.

b. Heidegger and being-with

Besides his enduring preoccupation with the work of classic philosophers like Kant, Hegel and Nietzsche, Nancy’s thought concentrates primarily on a reorientation of the work of Martin Heidegger, especially since his ‘doctorat d’état’ in 1987. Not that Nancy’s work is just a comment on Heidegger. In The Experience of Freedom for example, Nancy’s study of the notion of freedom within Heidegger’s work, is not only a discussion of Heidegger, but also of Kant, Schelling and Sartre. Nancy is looking for a sort of ‘non-subjective’ freedom, a concept of freedom that tries to think the existential ground from which every freedom (thought as a property of the individual or a collectivity) starts from. Freedom, instead of being seen as the classical ‘liberum arbitrium’ or the subjectivistic free will, lies in the being thrown into the world, and into existence. As Heidegger does, Nancy accentuates the fact that freedom in Kant’s work is a sort of unconditional causality. In ‘the second analogy of the experience’ of the Kritik der reinen Vernunft (The Critique of Pure Reason), Kant argues that the specific form of causality that human freedom is—the subject acts ‘spontaneously’—means that the subject must withdraw itself out of time, to not be determined by empirical causality. Therefore, as in Heidegger’s Vom Wesen der menschlichen Freiheit, Nancy determines Kantian freedom as a autopositional freedom, the freedom of a subject who ‘forgets’ that it is always already thrown into existence, even before it can decide to be free. So, one has to think freedom from its existential ground, its finite being. As long as one thinks freedom as the property of an ‘infinite’ subject, every form of finite being will appear a kind of heteronomy, as a restraint of my freedom’. My freedom, says Nancy, does not end where that of the other starts, but the existence of the other is the necessary condition to be free. There is no freedom without the presupposition of our being-in-the-world, and of our being thrown into the existence. That is why Heidegger’s work is interesting, because he was the first to think the existential condition, the being of the freedom through.

Nancy’s interest in Heidegger’s work also has something to do with the question of community, the question of being-with (Mitsein) in Heidegger’s words. Especially in his book Être singulier pluriel (Being Singular Plural), written in 1996, Nancy focuses upon that. This book, together with Une pensée finie from 1990 and Le sens du monde from 1993, is one of the most important texts in Nancy’s work during the nineties and of his work in general.

In Être singulier pluriel, Nancy deals with the question how we can still speak of a ‘we’ or of a plurality, without transforming this ‘we’ into a substantial and exclusive identity. What are the conditions to speak of a ‘we’ today? From Heidegger, Nancy learnt that our being in the world with others determines us, before we can speak of a division between and individual and a community. We are always already thrown into the world, but this contingent positioning can never be the basis to speak of a natural or original community. Contrary to Aristotle or Plato, we can no longer fall back on a fixed metaphysical or natural (phusis) ground. Neither is the world an entity created by God, wherein we occupy a well-defined place. The modern philosophical order, especially since Nietzsche, has finished with there ‘truths’. Once community or being-together is no longer a ‘natural’ fact wherein I’m originally dwelling, community becomes a capital question for modern political philosophy. Also, in our time the problem of community is confronted with the further question: how to understand community when it is no longer given to us as a gift of God, or as a harmonic being-together and identification with our ‘own’ people?

To Nancy, Heidegger is the philosopher who handles this question in a quite ambiguous way and that makes him controversial, still today. Everyone who drops the name Heidegger in philosophical circles, knows of the controversy he still evokes. More than is the case with, for example, Maurice Blanchot, Heidegger’s extreme right sympathies are still the cause of hot polemics, certainly when one, as Nancy does explicitly, touches the ethical and political terrains. Nancy does not deny this ambiguity. On the contrary, he takes it as the starting point of his reorientation of Heidegger. On the one hand, Nancy argues that Heidegger makes it clear, in the most radical way, that every human being (Dasein as he calls it) is always being opened unto a world. Being in the world is being with others, and this being-with is an essential trait—if one can still speak of essence; rather it is the unsubstantial essence, the being of every being-there. So, being-there is being-with, to exist is to coexist.

According to Nancy, there is no more radicalised point of view to think community in a modern, contingent way. We are always being-with, but this being-with is no longer a substantial being-together out of a shared trait, identity of race. On the other hand, he realises very well that Heidegger is the author who at a certain moment speaks of a true German community and leaves behind the openness and radical point of view he himself had postulated. Only this community, so Heidegger says in his famous rectoral speech, can lead to a proper existence. Heidegger was convinced the national-socialist movement would guarantee a collective escape from an improper existence. How this had to happen in a concrete way, Heidegger seemingly didn’t know when he wrote Being and Time. He left his readers in a state of uncertainty, but this uncertainty didn’t stop him from partaking in a horrible political regime, from connecting his thought to the national-socialist movement and from identifying himself with one of the most murderous political regimes ever.

It seems quite preposterous that an author like Nancy who announces the end of every immanent community, appeals to a philosopher who puts forward a true German community. How can Nancy, who explicitly writes against all nostalgia for provincialism, refer to Heidegger who withdrew into his hut in Todtnauberg?

As already said, Nancy’s attitude towards Heidegger is twofold, and he also makes this clear in his text ‘La decision d’existence’ (published in Une pensée finie). On the one hand, he is inspired by Heidegger’s articulation of being-with. On the other hand, he wants to question fundamentally every claim that Heidegger makes regarding a proper or original community. Out of Nancy’s analysis in Être singulier pluriel it becomes clear that this is exactly the obstacle in Heidegger’s philosophical reflection on being-with, and in the contemporary philosophical and ethical complaint of a lost community (although one cannot compare the two in many points). In this respect, think again of the important role that the communitarians are playing nowadays, with very influential authors like Charles Taylor, Michael Sandel and Alasdair MacIntyre.

In his interest in Heidegger, Nancy is touching the problem of community at its deepest core. Heidegger’s ambiguity is a signal for him to develop the ‘with’, the constitutive relationality of being-there, and to radicalise it in what he calls an analysis of the coexistential. This is a fundamental analysis of the way that we stand to each other and to the world and how this can be the basis for a thinking of community. This, and the attempt to think community in a radical way as being-with, gets its start in Heidegger’s Being and Time but is, according to Nancy, largely insufficient.

5. Ontology

a. Globalization

The theme of community is one of the main and most interesting threads throughout Nancy’s work, but there are numerous other themes and questions in his work. Nancy is not only very familiar with a large part of the history of philosophy (see his books on Kant, Descartes, Hegel, and so forth), but he also discusses in his work political themes like justice, sovereignty and freedom, and how they may apply in our increasingly global world. He always maintains a very singular voice and perspective. Take for example the contemporary debate on globalization. In 1993, Nancy wrote his book Le sens du monde in which he searched for what we mean when we say that we are living in a world, or in one world; about what we mean when we say that the sense of the world is no longer situated above but within the world. The world, the existence, that is our radical responsibility he says, but by this doesn’t mean that we are always responsible for everything and everyone. He wants to make clear that the political, juridical or moral responsibility in concrete situations is based on a preceding ontological responsibility. From the moment that the measure for our responsibility is no longer given by a metaphysical or divine order, we are living in a world where we are exposed to a naked existence, without the possibility to fall back upon a preceding fundamental cause of the world. For Nancy, the contingency of our naked existence is not in the first place a moral problem. It is an ontological question. Whereas in a feudal world the meaning and destination of life was clear and fixed, contemporary existence can no longer refer to a general metaphysical framework. Nothing other than this contingency is the challenge for our global existence today, says Nancy. It is indeed the case that today we are confronted with a lot of uncertainties and that we are thrown into many complex situations, but it is not certain at all whether that is something we should complain about.

For Nancy, becoming-worldly means, in the first place, responding to the demands of our time. He asks what it means when we think today that we are living in a world. Becoming-worldwide is in a radical way being exposed to sense, to the world as such. The ‘sense of the world’ is in no way still given by a creator. What is left as a horizon is that the world, and only the world, is there. Sense is not so much something that we, as secularised successors to God, ascribe to the world. This would only confirm the idea that the world stands for a lack of sense, or for an ‘object’ to which sense is given from outside by a ‘subject’. Thus Nancy says we have to think ‘world’ as beings who are always already in the world. There is nothing new about that and yet, he does not stop telling us. It seems so evident, almost banal, and this banality is what counts today. There’s nothing hidden anymore behind the question of the world. We have to confront ourselves with this nothing, with this ex nihilo of the world. This ontology, this logic of the ontos, is what Nancy wants us to deal with, as he makes clear in one of his most recent books La création du monde ou la mondialisation.

b. Deconstructing Christianity

Thinking through the problem of globalisation means for Nancy at the same time deconstructing Christianity. Of course, a deconstruction of Christianity is different from a mere criticism of Christianity. It is the question of whether atheism is the antipode of religion, or if religion has a sort of auto-critical gesture towards itself. We ‘moderns’ love to say that we are no longer Christians, but maybe the Christian aspects of our existence are so evident that we are no longer conscious of them. Take for example the question whether our existence has a meaning. The thought that existence has indeed a meaning and that this meaning is attached to existence by some self constituting thing—whether it is a God or a subject—is present in atheism as much as in Christianity. Also the nihilistic claim that existence is meaningless starts from this idea.

Nancy therefore tries to think ‘the sense of the world’ out of the transcendental conditions of our existence. An atheist’s world is a world in which sense is no longer attached to the world, but where it is the condition of our being-in-the-world as such. The world does not have sense, it is sense, and this naked existence means that we have to exist in the sense that we are, and can no longer hide behind some or another presupposed meaning of life. We are exposed to the world and to ourselves, and that is the sense of existence.

At first sight, Nancy seems to limit himself to a sort of affirmation of the status quo of the world as it is, and it seems that he affirms the common idea that since the collapse of the former socialist states we would live in an accomplished humanity. It seems, especially, that we cannot disagree on the ‘good’ of some matters: there are human rights, individual liberties and humanitarian missions of the UN to keep guard over this moral world order, and so forth. Nancy’s thesis is nothing but the questioning of that very idea, and it seems to me that the work of Nancy in general becomes interesting when it is used as a hyperbolic questioning of that sort of philosophical or political correctness.

6. Sovereignty

As much as in his earlier work like L’oubli de la philosophie in 1986 as in many other texts like Changement de monde in 1998, Nancy questions in a very singular way the evidences and rhetorics of our time. That certainly does not mean that he is only a social or political philosopher. If philosophy has to be engaged today, he says, it has in the first place the task to philosophize. Let’s take one example to make that clear.

One sees that with an ever growing number of missions the UN continually tries, with or without success, to quench potential hotspots here and there, and thus to maintain the order in and of the world. By means of humanitarian interventions one wants to apply international law in places where it is violated. These interventions seem to indicate that there is no longer any sovereignty. There is no longer a declaration of war from one sovereign to another, but an application of international law in the name of humanity in general. There are nevertheless, Nancy analyses, a number of signs or symptoms that seem to show that sovereignty is still playing a part in contemporary politics, albeit in a subdued, private manner. This reluctance to talk about sovereignty on the one hand, and the full use of its symbolic values on the other, were the motivations for Nancy to write a text about the Gulf War. In it, he examined what part sovereignty can still play in contemporary political and social thinking. The waning role of sovereignty in the West, and its subdued return in the Gulf War, is a given which he consciously wants to confront rather than forget. For his analysis, Nancy was inspired by what Carl Schmitt made clear with the slogan: one who says humanity, wants to cheat. Even if a state pretends to make war in the name of humanity, it takes over a universal concept to use it polemically against its opponent, its enemy. A world which is becoming worldwide tends to, explains Schmitt, criminalize its enemies. It no longer suffices to put the enemy back behind his borders. One goes looking for him in his own national territory and disqualifies him in a moral way. He becomes literally inhuman: he falls out of the moral human order, he is an illegal combatant, as the U.S. government called the Taliban prisoners.

7. Art and Culture

Finally I want to point to the fact that Nancy is also a very influential philosopher of art and culture. Already in 1978 he published with Lacoue-Labarthe a book on the Jena-romantics of the Schlegel brothers. The book is called L’absolu littéraire (translated as The Literary Absolute in 1987) and sets up a large discussion of the Jena romantiek, the German ‘Frühromantik’: the place and the group of the brothers August Wilhelm and Friedrich Schlegel (and partially also Novalis and Schelling). This study focuses on the review Athenaeum published by the brothers Schlegel at Jena, who thereafter founded a literary circle. Lacoue-Labarthe and Nancy focus on the question of literature realising and fulfilling itself as a work, an œuvre as it is called in the French language: the writer produces himself in the literary work he writes so that he, as the subject, the support of this work, becomes himself an œuvre, a self-productive individual. L’absolu littéraire points at the fact that a lot of these romantic themes still play a substantial role in our modern society.

Besides his interest for literature, film, theatre and poetry, Nancy also writes many contributions in art catalogues, especially in relation to contemporary art. At various different times, Nancy also exhibited some of his own work together with the French artist François Martin, and he has also written a few poems and theatre texts. One can read his philosophical reflections on the statute of art in general, in the book Les Muses, published in 1994 (translated as The Muses in 1996). In it, Hegel’s thesis of the death of art takes a central place. There is also a text from a lecture from 1992 at the Louvre museum in Paris on the painting ‘The death of the virgin’ by the Italian painter Caravaggio. This text was already published in 1993, in a number of Paragraph, fully dedicated to Nancy’s work. From Caravaggio’s painting, Nancy is looking for another conception of painting. The painting is not a representation of the empirical world—understood in the platonic, metaphysical way—but a presentation of world, of sense, of existence:

‘From the inside of (the)painting to the outside of (the) painting, there is nothing, no passage. There is painting, there is us, indistinctly, distinctly. Here, (the) painting is our access to the fact that we do not accede—either to the inside or to the outside of ourselves. Thus we exist. This [Caravaggio’s] painting paints the threshold of existence. In these conditions, to paint does not mean to represent, but simply to pose the ground, the texture, and the pigment of the threshold’ (in Kamuf P. (ed.), Paragraph, 1993, p. 115)

In 2001, Nancy published The Evidence of Film, a book on the Iranian filmmaker Abbas Kiarostami. In it, he writes that:

‘Cinema presents—that is to say shares (communicates)—the intensity of a look upon a world of which it is itself part and parcel (a film properly speaking and as video, as television, but also as photography and as music: these motives will come up again). It is part of it precisely in the sense that it has contributed to its structure as it is now: as a world where looking at what is real is resolutely substituting for every kind of visionary seeing, foreseeing and clairvoyant gazing. […] Clearly, films turn out (with photography, of course, and starting with it: Kiarostami never forgets this, and this will have to be discussed) to be something very different from a relatively new support for received ways of experience (stories or feelings, myth or dream, etc.). Well beyond the medium that it also is, cinema adds up an element: the element of looking and of what is real insofar as it is looked at. All in one, film is ubiquitous, it can take in everything, from one far end of the earth to the other …’ (The Evidence of Film, p. 20).

Nancy also wrote numerous texts on art in several international journals. Texts on Baudelaire, the relation between image and violence, the problem of representation in art, the statute of literature, on Hölderlin, on contemporary artists On Kawara and Soun-gui and even on techno-music. It seems that nothing is unfamiliar with the philosopher Nancy.

8. References and Further Reading

Major works of Nancy:

  • La Remarque spéculative (Un bon mot de Hegel), Paris, Galilée, 1973.
  • La titre de la lettre, Paris, Galilée, 1973 (with Philippe Lacoue-Labarthe)
  • Le Discours de la syncope. I. Logodaedalus, Paris, Flammarion, 1975.
  • L’absolu littéraire. Théorie de la littérature du romantisme allemand, Paris, Seuil, 1978 (with Philippe Lacoue-Labarthe).
  • Ego sum, Paris, Flammarion, 1979.
  • Le partage des voix, Paris, Galilée, 1982.
  • La communauté désoeuvrée, Paris, Christian Bourgois, 1983.
  • L’Impératif catégorique, Paris, Flammarion, 1983.
  • L’oubli de la philosophie, Paris, Galilée, 1986.
  • Des lieux divins, Mauvezin, T.E.R, 1987.
  • L’expérience de la liberté, Paris, Galilée, 1988.
  • Une Pensée Finie, Paris, Galilée, 1990.
  • Le poids d’une pensée, Québec, Le griffon d’argile, 1991.
  • Le mythe nazi, La tour d’Aigues, L’Aube, 1991 (with Philippe Lacoue-Labarthe)
  • La comparution (politique à venir), Paris, Bourgois, 1991 (with Jean-Chrisophe Bailly).
  • Corpus, Paris, Métailié, 1992.
  • The birth to presence, Stanford, Stanford University Press, 1993.
  • Les Muses, Paris, Galilée, 1994.
  • Être singulier pluriel, Paris, Galilée, 1996.
  • Hegel. L’inquiétude du négatif, Paris, Hachette, 1997.
  • L’Intrus, Paris, Galilée, 2000.
  • Le regard du portrait, Paris, Galilée, 2000.
  • La pensée dérobée. Paris, Galilée, 2001.
  • The evidence of film. Bruxelles, Yves Gevaert, 2001.
  • La création du monde ou la mondialisation. Paris, Galilée, 2002.

English translations: almost all of Nancy’s major works are translated into English:

  • The Inoperative Community (1991). Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
  • The Birth to Presence (1993): Stanford University Press.
  • The Experience of Freedom (1993). Stanford University Press.
  • The Gravity of Thought (1997). New Jersey: Humanities Press.
  • Retreating the Political (1997). With Lacoue-Labarthe (edited by Simon Sparks). London: Routledge.
  • The Sense of the World (1998). Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
  • Being Singular Plural (2000). Stanford University Press

Secondary bibliography

  • Bernasconi R., On deconstructing nostalgia for community within the West: the debate between Nancy and Blanchot, Research in Phenomenology, 23, 3-21, 1993.
  • Derrida J., Le Toucher, Jean-Luc Nancy, Paris, Galilée, 2000.
  • Devisch I., A trembling voice in the desert. Jean-Luc Nancy’s re-thinking of the space of the political, Cultural Values, 4(2), 239-255, 2000.
  • Devisch I, La «Négativité Sans Emploi». SymposiumIV(2):167-87, 2000.
  • Devisch I, ‘Wij. Jean-Luc Nancy en het vraagstuk van de gemeenschap’ (Uitgeverij Peeters, Leuven, 2003, forthcoming)
  • Dow K., Ex-posing identity: Derrida and Nancy on the (im) possibility. Philosophy and Social Criticism, 19 (3-4), 261-271, 1993.
  • Kamuf P.(ed.), Paragraph. On the Work of Jean-Luc Nancy, 16(2), 1993.
  • May T., The community’s absence in Lyotard, Nancy and Lacoue-Labarthe. Philosophy Today, 275-284, 1993.
  • May T., Reconsidering difference. Nancy, Derrida, Levinas, and Deleuze. Pennsylvania, The Pennsylvania State University Press, 1997.
  • Sheppard D. e.a., On Jean-Luc Nancy. The sense of philosophy, London, Routledge, 1997.
  • Studies in Practical Philosophy 1(1), 1999 (fully dedicated to the work of Nancy).

Author Information

Ignaas Devisch
Free University Brussels

Nagarjuna (c. 150—c. 250)

NagarjunaOften referred to as “the second Buddha” by Tibetan and East Asian Mahayana (Great Vehicle) traditions of Buddhism, Nagarjuna offered sharp criticisms of Brahminical and Buddhist substantialist philosophy, theory of knowledge, and approaches to practice. Nagarjuna’s philosophy represents something of a watershed not only in the history of Indian philosophy but in the history of philosophy as a whole, as it calls into questions certain philosophical assumptions so easily resorted to in our attempt to understand the world.  Among these assumptions are the existence of stable substances, the linear and one-directional movement of causation, the atomic individuality of persons, the belief in a fixed identity or selfhood, and the strict separations between good and bad conduct and the blessed and fettered life.  All such assumptions are called into fundamental question by Nagarjuna’s unique perspective which is grounded in the insight of emptiness (sunyata), a concept which does not mean “non-existence” or “nihility” (abhava), but rather the lack of autonomous existence (nihsvabhava).  Denial of autonomy according to Nagarjuna does not leave us with a sense of metaphysical or existential privation, a loss of some hoped-for independence and freedom, but instead offers us a sense of liberation through demonstrating the interconnectedness of all things, including human beings and the manner in which human life unfolds in the natural and social worlds.  Nagarjuna’s central concept of the “emptiness (sunyata) of all things (dharmas),” which pointed to the incessantly changing and so never fixed nature of all phenomena, served as much as the terminological prop of subsequent Buddhist philosophical thinking as the vexation of opposed Vedic systems. The concept had fundamental implications for Indian philosophical models of causation, substance ontology, epistemology, conceptualizations of language, ethics and theories of world-liberating salvation, and the concept proved seminal even for Buddhist philosophies in India, Tibet, China and Japan very different from Nagarjuna’s own. Indeed it would not be an overstatement to say that Nagarjuna’s innovative concept of emptiness, though it was hermeneutically appropriated in many different ways by subsequent philosophers in both South and East Asia, was to profoundly influence the character of Buddhist thought.

Table of Contents

  1. Nagarjuna’s Life, Legend and Works
  2. Nagarjuna’s Skeptical Method and its Targets
  3. Against Worldly and Ultimate Substantialism
  4. Against Proof
  5. The New Buddhist Space and Mission
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Nagarjuna’s Life, Legend and Works

Precious little is known about the actual life of the historical Nagarjuna. The two most extensive biographies of Nagarjuna, one in Chinese and the other in Tibetan, were written many centuries after his life and incorporate much lively but historically unreliable material which sometimes reaches mythic proportions. However, from the sketches of historical detail and the legend meant to be pedagogical in nature, combined with the texts reasonably attributed to him, some sense may be gained of his place in the Indian Buddhist and philosophical traditions.

Nagarjuna was born a “Hindu,” which in his time connoted religious allegiance to the Vedas, probably into an upper-caste Brahmin family and probably in the southern Andhra region of India. The dates of his life are just as amorphous, but two texts which may well have been authored by him offer some help. These are in the form of epistles and were addressed to the historical king of the northern Satvahana dynasty Gautamiputra Satakarni (ruled c. 166-196 CE), whose steadfast Brahminical patronage, constant battles against powerful northern Shaka Satrap rulers and whose ambitious but ultimately unsuccessful attempts at expansion seem to indicate that he could not manage to follow Nagarjuna’s advice to adopt Buddhist pacifism and maintain a peaceful realm. At any rate, the imperial correspondence would place the significant years of Nagarjuna’s life sometime between 150 and 200 CE. Tibetan sources then may well be basically accurate in portraying Nagarjuna’s emigration from Andhra to study Buddhism at Nalanda in present-day Bihar, the future site of the greatest Buddhist monastery of scholastic learning in that tradition’s proud history in India. This emigration to the north perhaps followed the path of the Shaka kings themselves. In the vibrant intellectual life of a not very tranquil north India then, Nagarjuna came into his own as a philosopher.

The occasion for Nagarjuna’s “conversion” to Buddhism is uncertain. According to the Tibetan account, it had been predicted that Nagarjuna would die at an early age, so his parents decided to head off this terrible fate by entering him in the Buddhist order, after which his health promptly improved. He then moved to the north and began his tutelage. The other, more colorful Chinese legend, portrays a devilish young adolescent using magical yogic powers to sneak, with a few friends, into the king’s harem and seduce his mistresses. Nagarjuna was able to escape when they were detected, but his friends were all apprehended and executed, and, realizing what a precarious business the pursuit of desires was, Nagarjuna renounced the world and sought enlightenment. After having been converted, Nagarjuna’s adroitness at magic and meditation earned him an invitation to the bottom of the ocean, the home of the serpent kingdom. While there, the prodigy initiate “discovered” the “wisdom literature” of the Buddhist tradition, known as the Prajnaparamita Sutras, and on the credit of his great merit, returned them to the world, and thereafter was known by the name Nagarjuna, the “noble serpent.”

Despite the tradition’s insistence that immersion into the scriptural texts of the competing movements of classical Theravada and emerging “Great Vehicle” (Mahayana) Buddhism was what spurred Nagarjuna’s writings, there is rare extended reference to the early and voluminous classical Buddhist sutras and to the Mahayana texts which were then being composed in Nagarjuna’s own language of choice, Sanskrit. It is much more likely that Nagarjuna thrived on the exciting new scholastic philosophical debates that were spreading throughout north India among and between Brahminical and Buddhist thinkers. Buddhism by this time had perhaps the oldest competing systematic worldview on the scene, but by then Vedic schools such as Samkhya, which divided the cosmos into spiritual and material entities, Yoga, the discipline of meditation, and Vaisesika, or atomism were probably well-established. But new and exciting things were happening in the debate halls. A new Vedic school of Logic (Nyaya) was making its literary debut, positing an elaborate realism which categorized the types of basic knowable things in the world, formulated a theory of knowledge which was to serve as the basis for all claims to truth, and drew out a full-blown theory of correct and fallacious logical argumentation. Alongside it, within the Buddhist camp, sects of metaphysicians emerged with their own doctrines of atomism and fundamental categories of substance. Nagarjuna was to undertake a forceful engagement of both these new Brahminical and Buddhist movements, an intellectual endeavor till then unheard of.

Nagarjuna saw in the concept sunya, a concept which connoted in the early Pali Buddhist literature the lack of a stable, inherent existence in persons, but which since the third century BCE had also denoted the newly formulated number “zero,” the interpretive key to the heart of Buddhist teaching, and the undoing of all the metaphysical schools of philosophy which were at the time flourishing around him. Indeed, Nagarjuna’s philosophy can be seen as an attempt to deconstruct all systems of thought which analyzed the world in terms of fixed substances and essences. Things in fact lack essence, according to Nagarjuna, they have no fixed nature, and indeed it is only because of this lack of essential, immutable being that change is possible, that one thing can transform into another. Each thing can only have its existence through its lack (sunyata) of inherent, eternal essence. With this new concept of “emptiness,” “voidness,” “lack” of essence, “zeroness,” this somewhat unlikely prodigy was to help mold the vocabulary and character of Buddhist thought forever.

Armed with the notion of the “emptiness” of all things, Nagarjuna built his literary corpus. While argument still persists over which of the texts bearing his name can be reliably attributed to Nagarjuna, a general agreement seems to have been reached in the scholarly literature. Since it is not known in what chronological order his writings were produced, the best that can be done is to arrange them thematically according to works on Buddhist topics, Brahminical topics and finally ethics Addressing the schools of what he considered metaphysically wayward Buddhism, Nagarjuna wrote Fundamental Verses on the Middle Way (Mulamadhyamakakarika), and then, in order to further refine his newly coined and revolutionary concept, the Seventy Verses on Emptiness (Sunyatasaptati), followed by a treatise on Buddhist philosophical method, the Sixty Verses on Reasoning (Yuktisastika).. Included in the works addressed to Buddhists may have been a further treatise on the shared empirical world and its establishment through social custom, called Proof of Convention (Vyavaharasiddhi), though save for a few cited verses, this is lost to us, as well as an instructional book on practice, cited by one Indian and a number of Chinese commentators, the Preparation for Enlightenment (Bodhisambaraka). Finally is a didactic work on the causal theory of Buddhism, the Constituents of Dependent Arising (Pratityasumutpadahrdaya). Next came a series of works on philosophical method, which for the most part were reactionary critiques of Brahminical substantialist and epistemological categories, The End of Disputes (Vigrahavyavartani) and the not-too-subtly titled Pulverizing the Categories (Vaidalyaprakarana). Finally are a pair of religious and ethical treatises addressed to the king Gautamiputra, entitled To a Good Friend (Suhrlekha) and Precious Garland (Ratnavali). Nagarjuna then was a fairly active author, addressing the most pressing philosophical issues in the Buddhism and Brahmanism of his time, and more than that, carrying his Buddhist ideas into the fields of social, ethical and political philosophy.

It is again not known precisely how long Nagarjuna lived. But the legendary story of his death once again is a tribute to his status in the Buddhist tradition. Tibetan biographies tell us that, when Gautamiputra’s successor was about to ascend to the throne, he was anxious to find a replacement as a spiritual advisor to better suit his Brahmanical preferences, and unsure of how to delicately or diplomatically deal with Nagarjuna, he forthrightly requested the sage to accommodate and show compassion for his predicament by committing suicide. Nagarjuna assented, and was decapitated with a blade of holy grass which he himself had some time previously accidentally uprooted while looking for materials for his meditation cushion. The indomitable logician could only be brought down by his own will and his own weapon. Whether true or not, this master of skeptical method would well have appreciated the irony.

2. Nagarjuna’s Skeptical Method and its Targets

At the heart of what is called skepticism is doubt, a suspension of judgment about some states of affairs or the correctness of some assertion. There are of course many things, both in the world and in the claims people make about the world, which can be doubted, questioned, rejected, or left in skeptical abeyance. But in addition to the many different things which can be doubted, there are also different ways of doubting. Doubt can be haphazard, as when a person sees another person at night and is unsure of whether that other person is his friend; it can be principled, as when a scientist refuses to take into account non-material or divine causes in a physical process she is investigating; it can be systematic, as when a philosopher doubts conventional explanations of the world, only in search of a more fundamental, all-inclusive explanation of experience, a la Socrates, Descartes or Husserl (Nagarjuna was for the most part a skeptic of this sort). It can also be all-inclusive and self-reflective, an attitude demonstrated by the Greek philosopher Pyrrho, who doubted all claims including his own claim to doubt all claims. Consequently, there are as many different kinds of skeptics as there can be found different kinds or ways of doubting. Nagarjuna was considered a skeptic in his own philosophical tradition, both by Brahmanical opponents and Buddhist readers, and this because he called into question the basic categorical presuppositions and criteria of proof assumed by almost everyone in the Indian tradition to be axiomatic. HiBut despite this skepticism, Nagarjuna did believe that doubt should not be haphazard, it requires a method. This idea that doubt should be methodical, an idea born in early Buddhism, was a revolutionary innovation for philosophy in India. Nagarjuna carries the novelty of this idea even further by suggesting that the method of doubt of choice should not even be one’s own, but rather ought to be temporarily borrowed from the very person with whom one is arguing! But in the end, Nagarjuna was convinced that such disciplined, methodical skepticism led somewhere, led namely to the ultimate wisdom which was at the core of the teachings of the Buddha.

The standard philosophical interpretation of doubt in Indian thought was explained in the Vedic school of logic (Nyaya). Gautama Aksapada, the author of the fundamental text of the Brahminical Logicians, was probably a contemporary of Nagarjuna. He formulated what by then must have been a traditional distinction between two kinds of doubt. The first kind is the haphazard doubt about an object all people experience in their everyday lives, when something is encountered in one’s environment and for various reasons mistaken for something else because of uncertainty of what precisely the object is. The stock examples used in Indian texts are seeing a rope and mistaking it as a snake, or seeing conch in the sand and mistaking it as silver. The doubt that can arise as a result of realizing one is mistaken or unsure about a particular object can be corrected by a subsequent cognition, getting a closer look at the rope for instance, or having a companion tell you the object in the sand is conch and not silver. The correcting cognition removes doubt by offering some sort of conclusive evidence about what the object in question happens to be. The other kind of doubt is roughly categorical doubt, exemplified specifically by a philosopher who may wonder about or doubt various categories of being, such as God’s existence, the types of existing physical substance or the nature of time. In order to resolve this latter kind of philosophical doubt, the preferred method of the Logicians was a formal debate. Debates provided a space wherein judges presided, established rules for argument and counter-argument, recognized logical fallacies and correct forms of inference and two interlocutors seeking truth all played their roles in the establishment of the correct position. The point is that, according to traditional Brahminical thinking, certain and correct objective knowledge of the world was possible; one could in principle know whatever one sought to know, from what that object lying in darkness is to the types of causation that operated in the world to God’s existence and will for human beings. Skepticism, though a natural attitude and a fundamental aid to human beings in both their everyday and reflective lives, can be overcome provided one arms oneself with the methods of proof supplied by common-sense logic. For Nyaya, while anything and everything can be doubted, any and every doubt can be resolved. The Brahminical Logician, the Naiyayika, is a cagey and realistic but staunch philosophical optimist.

The early Buddhists were not nearly so sure about the possibility of ultimate knowledge of the world. Indeed, the founder of the tradition, Siddhartha Gautama Sakyamuni (the “Buddha” or “awakened one”), famously refused to answer questions about such airy metaphysical ponderings like “Does the world have a beginning or not?”, “Does God exist?” and “Does the soul perish after death or not?” Convinced that human knowledge was best suited and most usefully devoted to the diagnosis and cure of human beings’ own self-destructive psychological obsessions and attachments, the Buddha compared a person convinced he could find the answers to such ultimate questions to a mortally wounded soldier on a battlefield who, dying from arrow-delivered poison, demanded to know everything about his shooter before being taken to a doctor. Ultimate knowledge cannot be attained, at least cannot be attained before the follies and frailties of human life bring one to despair. Unless human beings attain self-reflective, meditative enlightenment, ignorance will always have the upper hand over knowledge in their lives, and this is the predicament they must solve in order to alleviate their poorly understood suffering. The early traditional texts show how the Buddha developed a method for refusing to answer such questions in pursuit of ultimate, metaphysical knowledge, a method which came to be dubbed the “four error” denial (catuskoti). When asked, for example, whether the world has a beginning or not, a Buddhist should respond by denying all the logically alternative answers to the query; “No, the world does not have a beginning, it does not fail to have a beginning, it does not have and not have a beginning, nor does it neither have nor not have a beginning.” This denial is not seen to be logically defective in the sense that it violates the law of excluded middle (A cannot have both B and not-B), because this denial is more a principled refusal to answer than a counter-thesis, it is more a decision than a proposition. That is to say that one cannot object to this “four error” denial by simply saying “the world either has a beginning or it does not” because the Buddha is recommending to his followers that they should take no position on the matter (this is in modern propositional logic known as illocution). This denial was recommended because wondering about such questions was seen by the Buddha as a waste of valuable time, time that should be spent on the much more important and doable task of psychological self-mastery. The early Buddhists, unlike their Brahminical philosophical counterparts, were skeptics. But in their own view, their skepticism did not make the Buddhists pessimists, but on the contrary, optimists, for even though the human mind could not answer ultimate questions, it could diagnose and cure its own must basic maladies, and that surely was enough.

But in the intervening four to six centuries between the lives of Siddartha Gautama and Nagarjuna, Buddhists, feeling a need to explain their worldview in an ever burgeoning north Indian philosophical environment, traded in their skepticism for theory. Basic Buddhist doctrinal commitments, such as the teaching of the impermanence of all things, the Buddhist rejection of a persistent personal identity and the refusal to admit natural universals such as “treeness,” “redness” and the like, were challenged by Brahminical philosophers. How, Vedic opponents would ask, does one defend the idea that causation governs the phenomenal world while simultaneously holding that there is no measurable temporal transition from cause to effect, as the Buddhists appeared to hold? How, if the Buddhists are right in supposing that no enduring ego persists through our experienced lives, do all of my experiences and cognitions seem to be owned by me as a unitary subject? Why, if all things can be reduced to the Buddhist universe of an ever-changing flux of atoms, do stable, whole objects seem to surround me in my lived environment? Faced with these challenges, the monk-scholars enthusiastically entered into the debates in order to make the Buddhist worldview explicable. A number of prominent schools of Buddhist thought developed as a result of these exchanges, the two most notable of which were the Sarvastivada (“Universal Existence”) and Sautrantika (“True Doctrine”). In various fashions, they posited theories which depicted causal efficacy as either present in all dimensions of time or instantaneous, of personal identity being the psychological product of complex and interrelated mental states, and perhaps most importantly, of the apparently stable objects of our lived experience as being mere compounds of elementary, irreducible substances with their “own nature” (svabhava). Through the needs these schools sought to fulfill, Buddhism entered the world of philosophy, debate, thesis and verification, world-representation. The Buddhist monks became not only theoreticians, but some of the most sophisticated theoreticians in the Indian intellectual world.

Debate has raged for centuries about how to place Nagarjuna in this philosophical context. Ought he to be seen as a conservative, traditional Buddhist, defending the Buddha’s own council to avoid theory? Should he be understood as a “Great Vehicle” Buddhist, settling disputes which did not exist in traditional Buddhism at all but only comprehensible to a Mahayanist? Might he even be a radical skeptic, as his first Brahminical readers appeared to take him, who despite his own flaunting of philosophy espoused positions only a philosopher could appreciate? Nagarjuna appears to have understood himself to be a reformer, primarily a Buddhist reformer to be sure, but one suspicious that his own beloved religious tradition had been enticed, against its founder’s own advice, into the games of metaphysics and epistemology by old yet still seductive Brahminical intellectual habits. Theory was not, as the Brahmins thought, the condition of practice, and neither was it, as the Buddhists were beginning to believe, the justification of practice. Theory, in Nagarjuna’s view, was the enemy of all forms of legitimate practice, social, ethical and religious. Theory must be undone through the demonstration that its Buddhist metaphysical conclusions and the Brahminical reasoning processes which lead to them are counterfeit, of no real value to genuinely human pursuits. But in order to demonstrate such a commitment, doubt had to be methodical, just as the philosophy it was meant to undermine was methodical.

The method Nagarjuna suggested for carrying out the undoing of theory was, curiously, not a method of his own invention. He held it more pragmatic to borrow philosophical methods of reasoning, particularly those designed to expose faulty argument, to refute the claims and assumptions of his philosophical adversaries. This was the strategy of choice because, if one provisionally accepts the concepts and verification rules of the opponent, the refutation of the opponent’s position will be all the more convincing to the opponent than if one simply rejects the opponent’s system out of hand. This provisional, temporary acceptance of the opponent’s categories and methods of proof is demonstrated in how Nagarjuna employs different argumentative styles and approaches depending on whether he is writing against the Brahmins or Buddhists. However, he slightly and subtly adapts each of their respective systems to suit his own argumentative purposes.

For the Brahminical metaphysicians and epistemologists, Nagarjuna accepts the forms of logical fallacies outlined by the Logicians and assents to enter into their own debate format. But he picks a variation on a debate format which, while acknowledged as a viable form of discourse, was not most to the Nyaya liking. The standard Nyaya debate, styled vada or “truth” debate, pits two interlocutors against one another who bring to the debate opposing theses (pratijna or paksa) on a given topic, for instance a Nyaya propoenet defending the thesis that authoritative verbal testimony is an acceptable form of proof and a Buddhist proponent arguing that such testimony is not a self-standing verification but can be reduced to a kind of inference. Each of these opposed positions will then serve as the hypothesis of a logical argument to be proven or disproven, and the person who refutes the adversary’s argument and establishes his own will win the debate. However, there was a variety of this kind of standard format called by the Logicians the vitanda or “destructive” debate. In vitanda, the proponent of a thesis attempts to establish it against an opponent who merely strives to refute the proponent’s view, without establishing or even implying his own. If the opponent of the proffered thesis cannot refute it, he will lose; but he will also lose if in refuting the opponent’s thesis, he is found to be asserting or implying a counter-thesis. Now, while the Brahminical Naiyayikas considered this format good logical practice as it were for the student, they did not consider vitanda to be the ideal form of philosophical discourse, for while it could possibly expose false theses as false, it could not, indeed was not designed to, establish truth, and what good is reason or philosophical analysis if they do not or cannot pursue and attain truth?

For his own part, Nagarjuna would only assent to enter a philosophical debate as a vaitandika, committed to destroying the Brahminical proponents’ metaphysical and epistemological positions without thereby necessitating a contrapositive. In order to accomplish this, Nagarjuna armed himself with the full battery of accepted rejoinders to fallacious arguments the Logicians had long since authorized, such as infinite regress (anavastha), circularity (karanasya asiddhi) and vacuous principle (vihiyate vadah) to assail the metaphysical and epistemological positions he found problematic. It should be noted that later, very popular and influential schools of Indian Buddhist thought, namely the schools of Cognition (Vijnanavada) and Buddhist Logic (Yogacara-Sautranta) rejected this purely skeptical stance of Nagarjuna and went on to establish their own positive doctrines of consciousness and knowledge, and it was only with later, more synthetic schools of Buddhism in Tibet and East Asia where Nagarjuna’s anti-metaphysical and anti-cognitivist approaches gained sympathy. There was no doubt however that among his Vedic opponents and later Madhyamika commentators, Nagarjuna’s “refutation-only” strategy was highly provocative and sparked continued controversy. But, in his own estimation, only by employing Brahminical method against Brahminical practice could one show up Vedic society and religion for what he believed they were, authoritarian legitimations of caste society which used the myths of God, divine revelation and the soul as rationalizations, and not the justified reasons which they were purported to be.

Against Buddhist substantialism, Nagarjuna revived the Buddha’s own “four error” (catuskoti) denial, but gave to it a more definitively logical edge than the earlier practical employment of Suddhartha Gautama. Up to this point in the Indian Buddhist tradition, there had been two skeptics of note, one of them the Buddha himself and the other a third century sage named Moggaliputta-tissa, who had won several pivotal debates against a number of traditional sectarian groups at the request of the Mauryan emperor Asoka and had as a result written the first great debate manual of the tradition. While the Buddha had provided the “four error” method to discourage the advocacy of traditional metaphysical and religious positions, Moggaliputta-tissa constructed a discussion format which examined various doctrinal disputes in early Buddhism, which, in his finding, represented positions which were equally logically invalid, and therefore should not be asserted (no ca vattabhe). Perhaps inspired by this logically sharpened skeptical approach, Nagarjuna refined the “four errors” method from the strictly illocutionary and pragmatic tool it had been in early Buddhism into a logic machine that dissolved Buddhist metaphysical positions which had been growing in influence. The major schools of Buddhism had accepted by Nagarjuna’s time that things in the world must be constituted by metaphysically fundamental elements which had their own fixed essence (svabhava), for otherwise there would be no way to account for persons, natural phenomena, or the causal and karmic process which determined both. Without assuming, for instance, that people had fundamentally fixed natures, one could not say that any particular individual was undergoing suffering, and neither could one say that any particular monk who had perfected his discipline and wisdom underwent enlightenment and release from rebirth in nirvana. Without some notion of essence that is, thought Nagarjuna’s contemporaries, Buddhist claims could not make sense, and Buddhist practice could do no good, could effect no real change of the human character.

Nagarjuna’s response was to “catch” this metaphysical position of Buddhist practice in the coils of the “four errors,” demonstrating that the change Buddhism was after was only really possible if people did not have fixed essences. For if one really examines change, one finds that, according to the catuskoti, change cannot produce itself, nor can it be introduced by an extrinsic influence, nor can it result from both itself and an extrinsic influence, nor from no influence at all. All the logical alternatives of a given position are tested and flunked by the “four error” method. There are basic logical reasons why all these positions fail. It would first of all be incoherent (no papadyate) to assume that anything with a fixed nature or essence (svabhava) could change, for that change would violate its fixed nature and so destroy the original premise. In addition, we do not experience anything empirically which does not change, and so never know of (na vidyate) fixed essences in the world about us. Once again, the proponent’s method has been taken up in an ingenious way to undermine his conclusions. The rules of the philosophical game have been observed, but not in this case for earning victory, but for the purpose of showing all the players that the game had all along had been just that, merely a game which had no tenable real-life consequences.

And so, Nagarjuna has rightly merited the label of skeptic, for he undertakes the dismantling of theoretical positions wherever he finds them, and does so in a methodically logical manner. Like the skeptics of the classical Greek tradition, who thought that resolved doubt about dogmatic assertions in both philosophy and social life could lead the individual to peace of mind, however, it is not the case that for Nagarjuna skepticism leads nowhere. On the contrary, it is the very key to insight. For in the process of dismantling all metaphysical and epistemological positions, one is led to the only viable conclusion for Nagarjuna, namely that all things, concepts and persons lack a fixed essence, and this lack of a fixed essence is precisely why and how they can be amenable to change, transformation and evolution. Change is precisely why people live, die, are reborn, suffer and can be enlightened and liberated. And change is only possible if entities and the way in which we conceptualize them are void or empty (sunya) of any eternal, fixed and immutable essence. Indeed, Nagarjuna even on occasion refers to his special use of the “four error” approach as the “refuting and explaining with the method of emptying” (vigraheca vyakhyane krte sunyataya vadet) concepts and things of essence. And like all properly Buddhist methods, once this logical foil has served its purpose, it can be discarded, traded in as it were for the wisdom it has conferred. Pretense of knowledge leads to ruin, while genuine skepsis can lead human being to ultimate knowledge. Only the method of skepticism has to conform to the rules of conventional knowing, for as Nagarjuna famously asserts: “Without depending on convention, the ultimate truth cannot be taught, and if the ultimate truth is not attained, nirvana will not be attained.”

3. Against Worldly and Ultimate Substantialism

By Nagarjuna’s lifetime, scholastic Buddhism had become much more than merely an institution which charged itself with the handing on of received scripture, tradition and council-established orthodoxy; it had grown into a highly variegated, inwardly and outwardly engaged set of philosophical positions. These schools took it upon themselves not merely to represent Buddhist teaching or make the benefits of its practice available, but also to explain Buddhism, to make it not only a reasonable philosophical discourse, but the most supremely reasonable of them all. The ultimate goal of life, liberation from rebirth, though in general shared by all soteriologies in Brahmanism, Jainism and Buddhism, was represented uniquely by Buddhists as the pacification of all psychological attachments through the extinguishing (nirvana) of desires, which would lead to a consequent extinguishing of karma and the prevention of rebirth. One particularly unique doctrine of Buddhism in its attempt to thematize these issues was the theory of no-self or no-soul (anatman) and what implications it carried. In the empirical sense, the idea of no-self meant that not only persons, but also what are normally considered the stable substances of nature are not in fact fixed and continuous, that everything from one’s sense of personal identity to the forms of objects could be analyzed away, as it were, into the atomic parts which were their bases. In the ultimate metaphysical sense, it meant that no one, upon release from rebirth, will live eternally as a spiritual, self-conscious entity (atman), but that the series of births caused by inherited karma will simply terminate, reducing, as its cash-value, the total amount of suffering in the world. These theories prompted sharp and deep questions and criticisms, such as, “if the things and persons of the world are nothing more than atoms in constant flux, how can a person have an orderly experience of a world of apparent substances?”, “if there is no enduring identity or self, who is it that practices Buddhism and is liberated?”, and “how should we account for the differences between enlightened beings like the Buddha and unenlightened ones, like ourselves?” Answering such questions intelligibly for the inquiring minds of the philosophical community were a number of distinct schools which came collectively to be known as schools involved with the “analysis of elements” (abhidharma). Nagarjuna received his philosophical training in the texts, vocabulary and debates of the Abhidharmikas.

The two most prevalent schools of Abhidharma were the school of “Universal Existence” (Sarvastivada) and the “True Doctrine” school (Sautrantika). These schools held in common a theory of substantialism which served as an explanation to both worldly and ultimate metaphysical questions. This theory of substantialism, formulated in slightly different ways by each school, had two fundamental linchpins. The first was a theory of causality, or the strict necessity of one event following from another event. The theory of causal necessity was essential for all Buddhist thought, for Gautama Siddhartha himself had firmly asserted that all suffering or psychological pain had a distinct cause, namely attachment or desire (tanha), and the key to removing suffering from one’s life and attaining the “tranquility of mind” or contentment (upeksa) of nirvana was to cut out its causal condition. Suffering was brought about by a definite cause, but that cause is contingent upon the human behaviors and practices of any given individual, and if attachment could be exorcized from these behaviors and practices, then the individual could live a life which would no longer experience impermanence and loss as painful, but accept the world for what it in fact is. Buddhist theory and practice had always been based on the notion that, not just psychological attachment, but all phenomena are causally interdependent, that all things and events which come to pass in the world arise out of a causal chain (pratityasamutpada). Buddhism is inconceivable without this causal theory, for it opens the door to the diagnosis and removal of suffering. For the Universal Existence and True Doctrine schools however, the second linchpin was a theory of fundamental elements, a theory which had to follow from any coherent causal theory. Causes, their philosophical exponents figured, are not merely arbitrary, but are regular and predictable, and their regularity must be due to the fact the things or phenomena have fixed natures of their own (svabhava), which determine and limit the kinds of causal powers they can and cannot exert on other things. Water, for example, can quench thirst and fire can burn other things, but water cannot cause a fire, just as fire cannot quench thirst. The pattern and limits of particular causal powers and their effects are therefore rooted in what kind of a thing a thing happens to be; its nature defines what it can and can’t do to other things. Now in their theoretical models, causal efficacy was contained not in any whole, unified object, but rather in the parts, qualities and atomic elements of which any object happened to be constituted, so in their formulation, it was not fire which burnt but the heat produced by its fire molecules, and it was not water which quenched thirst but the correspondence of its molecules to the receptivity of molecules in the body. Indeed, fire in these systems was only fire because of its molecular qualities, and the same with water. But these qualities, molecules and elements had fixed natures, and thus could emit or receive certain causal powers and not others.

The basic difference between the Universal Existence and True Doctrine schools in their advocacy of both Buddhist causal and fundamental elements theories were their respective descriptions of how such causes operated. For the Universal Existence school, the effect of a cause was already inherent in the nature of the cause (satkaryavada). My thirst is quenched not by any fundamental change in my condition, but because the water that I drank had the power to quench my thirst, and this power does not rest in me, but in what I am trying to drink; this is why fire cannot quench thirst. Change here is only an apparent transformation already potential in the actors who are interrelating. For the True Doctrine school, on the other hand, any effect by definition must be a change in the condition of the receptor of the causal power, and as such, causal potential only becomes actual where it can effect a real change in something else (asatkaryavada). Again, using water as an illustration, the properties of water effect a change in the properties of my body, transforming my condition from a condition of thirst to one of having my thirst quenched. Change is change of what is effected, otherwise it would be silly to speak of change.

This seemingly abstract or inconsequential difference turns out in these two opposed systems however to be quite relevant, for the substantialist ideas of fixed nature and essence provide the basis not only for conceptualizing the material, empirical world, but also for conceiving the knowledge and attainment of ultimate reality. For just as only metaphysical analysis could distinguish between phenomena and their ultimate causal constituents, such analysis was also the only reliable guide for purifying experience of attachments. Those causes which lead to enmeshment in the worldly cycle of rebirth (samsara) cannot be the same as those which lead to peace (nirvana). These states of existence are just as different as fire and water, samsara will quench thirst just as little as nirvana will lead to the fires of passion. And so, it is the Buddha’s words, for those who advocated the theory of the effect as pre-existent in the cause, which had the potential to purify consciousness, as opposed to the words of any unorthodox teacher; it was the practices of Buddhists, for those who championed the notion of external causal efficacy, which could liberate one from rebirth, and not the practices of those who perpetuated the ambitions of the everyday, workaday world. These schools were, each in their uniquely Buddhist turns, true exemplars of the age-old assumptions of the karma worldview in which a person is what he or she does, and what one does proceeds from what type of fundamental makeup one has inherited from previous lives of deeds, a worldview that is which intimately marries essence, existence and ethics. To be a Buddhist means precisely to distinguish between Buddhist and non-Buddhist acts, between ignorance and enlightenment, between the suffering world of samsara and the purified attainment of nirvana.

In his revolutionary tract of The Fundamental Verses on the Middle Way, Nagarjuna abjectly throws this elementary distinction between samsara and nirvana out the door, and does so in the very name of the Buddha. “There is not the slightest distinction,” he declares in the work, “between samsara and nirvana. The limit of the one is the limit of the other.” Now how can such a thing be posited, that is, the identity of samsara and nirvana, without totally undermining the theoretical basis and practical goals of Buddhism as such? For if there is no difference between the world of suffering and the attainment of peace, then what sort of work is a Buddhist to do as one who seeks to end suffering? Nagarjuna counters by reminding the Buddhist philosophers that, just as Gautama Sakyamuni had rejected both metaphysical and empirical substantialism through the teaching of “no-soul” (anatman) and causal interdependence (pratityasamputpada), so Scholastic Buddhism had to remain faithful to this non-substantialist stance through a rejection of the causal theories which necessitated notions of fixed nature (svabhava), theories which metaphysically reified the difference between samsara and nirvana. This later rejection could be based on Nagarjuna’s newly coined notion of the “emptiness,” “zeroness” or “voidness” (sunyata) of all things.

Recapitulating a logical analysis of the causal theories of the Universal Existence and True Doctrine schools, Nagarjuna rejects the premises of their theories. The basic claim these schools shared was that causal efficacy could only be accounted for through the fundamental nature of an object; fire caused the burning of objects because fire was made of fire elements and not water elements, the regularity and predictability of its causal powers consistent with its essential material basis. Reviving and logically sharpening the early Buddhist “four errors” (catuskoti) method, Nagarjuna attempts to dismantle this trenchant philosophical assumption. Contrary to the Scholastic Buddhist views, Nagarjuna finds that, were objects to have a stable, fixed essence, the changes brought about by causes would not be logically intelligible or materially possible. Let us say, along with the school of Universal Existence, that the effect pre-exists in the cause, or for example, that the burning of fire and the thirst-quenching of water are inherent in the kinds of substances fire and water are. But if the effects already exist in the cause, then it would be nonsensical to speak of effects in the first place, because in their interaction with other phenomena the pre-existent causes would not produce anything new, they would merely be manifesting the potential powers already exhibited. That is, if the potential to burn is conceived to exist within fire and the potential to quench thirst already inhered in water, then, Nagarjuna thinks, burning and thirst-quenching would be but appearances of the causal powers of fire and water substances, and this would make the notion of an effect, the production of a novel change, meaningless. If, on the other hand, we side with the True Doctrine school in supposing that the effect does not pre-exist in the cause, but is a novel change in the world, then the category of substance breaks down. Why? Because if fire and water are stable substances which possess fixed natures or essences, then what sort of relation could they bear to other objects which have entirely different fixed natures? How could fire be thought to effect a human being when the latter possesses a nature and thus takes on a form that is entirely dissimilar to fire? For the person to be effected by fire, his nature would have to change, would have to be destructible, and this vitiates the supposition that the person’s nature is fixed. Stable, fixed essences (svabhava) which are conceived to be entirely heterogeneous could have no way of relating without their initially supposed fixed essences being compromised. The conclusion is that neither of these two proffered substantialist Buddhist explanations of causal efficacy can survive logical examination.

We may be tempted, faced with these failures, to adopt alternative theories of causality advocated outside the Buddhist tradition in order to save the intelligibility of substance. We may suppose, along with Jaina philosophers, the effects somehow proceed both from inherent powers of substances as well as the vulnerabilities of objects with which these substances interact. This obviously will not do for Nagarjuna the logician, for it would be tantamount to suggesting that things and events arise or come about due both to their own causal powers and as effected by other things, that event A, such as burning or thirst-quenching is caused both by itself and by other things. This violates the law of excluded middle outright, since a thing cannot be characterized by both A and not-A, and so will not serve as an explanation. Exhausted by the search for a viable substantialist principle of causality, we may wish to opt for the completely anti-metaphysical stance of the Indian Materialist school, which denies both that events are brought about through the inherent causal powers of their relata and are caused by extraneous powers. This thorough denial would have us believe that no cause-and-effect relationship exists between phenomena, and Buddhists may not resort to this conclusion because it militates against the basic teachings of the Buddha that all empirical phenomena arise out of interdependence. This was the teaching of the Buddha himself, and so no Buddhist can allow that events are not caused.

What are we to draw from all this abstract logical critique? Are we to infer that Nagarjuna’s philosophy boils down to some strange paradoxical mysticism in which there is some ambiguous sense in which things should be considered causally interdependent but interdependent in some utterly unexplainable and inscrutable way? Not at all! Nagarjuna has not refuted all available theories of cause and effect, he has only rejected all substantialist theories of cause and effect. He thinks he has shown that, if we maintain the philosophical assumption that things in the world derive from some unique material and essential basis, then we shall come away empty-handed in a search to explain how things could possibly relate to one another, and so would have no way of describing how changes happen. But since both our eminently common sense and the words of the Buddha affirm unremittingly that changes do indeed happen, and happen constantly, we must assume that they happen somehow, through some other fact or circumstance of existence. For his own part, Nagarjuna concludes that, since things do not arise because phenomena relate through fixed essences, then they must arise because phenomena lack fixed essences. Phenomena are malleable, they are susceptible to alteration, addition and destruction. This lack of fixed nature (nihsvabhava), this alterability of things then means that their physical and empirical forms are built not upon essence, as both the Universal Existence and True Doctrine schools posit, but upon the fact that nothing (sunya) ever defines and characterizes them eternally and unconditionally. It is not that things are in themselves nothing, nor that things possess a positive absence (abhava) of essence. Change is possible because a radical indeterminancy (sunyata) permeates all forms. Burning happens because conditions can arise where temperatures become incindiary and singe flesh, just as thirst can be quenched when the process of ingestion transforms water into body. Beings relate to one another not because of their heterogeneous forms, but because their interaction makes them susceptible to ongoing transformation.

The Fundamental Verses on the Middle Way is a tour de force through the entire categorical system of the Buddhist metaphysical analysis (abhidharma) which had given birth to its scholastic movements. Nagarjuna attacks all the concepts of these traditions which were thematized according to substantialist, essentialist metaphysics, using at every turn the logically revised “four errors” method. But perhaps most revolutionary was Nagarjuna’s extension of this doctrine of the “emptiness” of all phenomena to the discussion of the relationship between the Buddha and the world, between the cycle of pain-inflicted rebirth (samsara) and contented, desire-less freedom (nirvana). The Buddha, colloquially known as “the one who came and went” (Tathagata), cannot properly be thought of for Nagarjuna in the way the Buddhist scholastics have, that is, as the eternally pure seed of the true teachings of peace which puts to rest the delusions of the otherwise defiled world. The name and person of “Buddha” should not serve as the theoretical basis and justification of distinguishing between the ordinary, ignorant world and perfected enlightenment. After all, Nagarjuna reminds his readers, all change in the world, including the transformations which lead to enlightenment, are only possible because of interdependent causality (pratityasamutpada), and interdependent causality in turn is only possible because things, phenomena, lack any fixed nature and so are open (sunya) to being transformed. The Buddha himself was only transformed because of interdependence and emptiness, and so, Nagarjuna infers, “the nature of Tathagata is the very nature of the world/” It stands to reason then that no essential delimitations can be made between the world of suffering and the practices which can lead to peace, for both are merely alternative outcomes in the nexus of worldly interdependence. The words and labels which attach to both the world and the experience of nirvana are not the means of separating the wheat of life from its chaff, nor true cultivators of the soil of experience from the over-ambitious “everyday” rabble. Rather, samsara and nirvana signify nothing but the lack of guarantees in a life of desire and the possibility of change and hope. “We assert,” Nagarjuna proffers to say on behalf of the Buddhists, “that whatever arises dependently is as such empty. This manner of designating things is exactly the middle path.” A Buddhist oath to avoid suffering cannot be taken as a denunciation of the world, but only as a commitment to harness the possibilities which already are entailed within it for peace. Talk about the Buddha and practices inspired by the Buddha are not tantamount to the raising of a religious or ideological flag which marks off one country from another; rather, the world of suffering and the world of peace have the same extension and boundary, and talk about suffering and the Buddha is only there to make us aware of the possibilities of the world, and how our realization of these possibilities depends precisely on what we do and how we interact.

4. Against Proof

The apparently anti-theoretical stance occupied by Nagarjuna did not win him many philosophical friends either among his contemporary Buddhist readers or the circles of Brahminical thought. While it was certainly the case that, over the next seven centuries of Buddhist scholastic thought, the concept of emptiness was more forcefully articulated, it was also hermeneutically appropriated into other systems in ways of which Nagarjuna would not necessarily have approved. Sunyata was soon made to carry theoretical meanings unrelated to causal theory in various Buddhists sects, serving as the support of a philosophy of consciousness for the later illustrious Vijnanavada or Cognition School and as the explication of the nature of both epistemology and ontology in the precise school of Buddhist Logic (Yogacara-Sautrantika). These schools, deriding Nagarjuna’s skepticism, retained their commitment to a style of philosophizing in India which allowed intellectual stands to be taken only on the basis of commitments to thesis, counter-thesis, rules of argument and standards of proof, that is, schools which equated philosophical reflection with competing doctrines of knowledge and metaphysics. This is all the more ironic given the overt attempt Nagarjuna made to head off the possibility that the idea of emptiness would be refuted or co-opted by this style of philosophizing, an attempt still preserved in the pages of his work The End of Disputes (Vigrahavyavartani).

The End of Disputes was in large measure a reactionary work, written only when philosophical objections were brought against Nagarjuna’s non-essentialist, anti-metaphysical approach to philosophy. The work was addressed to a relatively new school of Brahminical thought, the school of Logic (Nyaya) Philosophical debate, conducted in formalized fashions in generally court settings, had persisted in India for perhaps as much as eight hundred years before the time of the first literary systematizer of the school of logic, Gautama Aksapada. Several attempts had been made by Buddhist and Jaina schools before Nyaya to compose handbooks for formal debate. But Nyaya brought to the Indian philosophical scene a full-blown doctrine not only of the rules and etiquette of the debate process, but also an entire system of inference which distinguished between logically acceptable and unacceptable forms of argument. Finally, undergirding all forms of valid argument was a system of epistemology, a theory of proof (pramanasastra), which distinguished between various kinds of mental events which could be considered truth-revealing, or corresponding to real states of affairs and those which could not be relied upon as mediators of objective reality. Direct sensory perception, valid logical argument, tenable analogy and authoritative testimony were held by the Logicians to be the only kinds of cognitions which could correspond to real things or events in the world. They could serve as proofs to the claims we make to know. With some modifications, the approach of Nyaya came to be accepted as philosophical “first principles” by almost all the other schools of thought in India for centuries, both Vedic and non-Vedic. Indeed, in many philosophical quarters, before entering into the subtleties and agonism of advanced philosophical debate, a student was expected to pass through the prerequisites of studying Sanskrit grammar and logic. All thought, and so all positive sciences, from agriculture to Vedic study to statecraft, were at times even said to be fundamentally based on and entirely specious without basic training in “critical analysis” (anviksiki), which, according to Gautama Aksapada, was precisely what Nyaya was.

The Logicians, upon becoming aware very early of Nagarjuna’s thought, brought against his position of emptiness (sunyata) a sharp criticism. Certainly no claim, they insisted, should compel us to give it assent unless it can be known to be true. Now Nagarjuna has told us that emptiness is the lack of a fixed, essential nature which all things exhibit. But if all things are empty of a fixed nature, then that would include, would it not, Nagarjuna’s own claim that all things are empty? For one to say that all things lack a fixed nature would be also to say that no assertion, no thesis like Nagarjuna’s that all things are empty, could claim hold on a fixed reference. And if such a basic and all-encompassing thesis must admit of having itself neither a fixed meaning nor reference, then why should we believe it? Does not rather the thesis “all things lack a fixed essence, and are thus empty,” since it is a universal quantifier and so covers all things including theses, refute itself? The Logicians are not so much making the claim here that skepticism necessarily opts out of its own position, as when a person in saying “I know nothing” witnesses unwittingly to at least a knowledge of two things, namely how to use language and his own ignorance, as in the cases of the Socratic Irony and the Liar’s Paradox. It is more the direct charge that a philosophy which refuses to admit universal essences must be flatly self-contradictory, since a universal denial must itself be essentially true of all things. Should we not consider Nagarjuna as a person who, setting out on what would otherwise be an ingenious and promising philosophical journey, in a bit too much of a rush, tripped over his own feet on his way out the front door?

Nagarjuna, in The End of Disputes, responds in two ways. The first is an attempt to show the haughty Logicians that, if they really critically examine this fundamental concept of proof which grounds their theory of knowledge, they will find themselves in no better position than they claim Nagarjuna is in. How, Nagarjuna asks in an extended argument, can anything be proven to a fixed certainty in the way the Naiyayikas posit? When you get right down to it, a putative fact can be proven in only two ways; it is either self-evident or it is shown to be true by something else, by some other fact or piece of knowledge already assumed to be true. But if we assent to the very rules of logic and valid argument the Vedic Logicians espouse, we shall find, Nagarjuna thinks, that both of these suppositions are flawed. Let us take the claim that something can be proven to be true on the basis of other facts known to be true. Suppose, to use a favorite example from the Logician Gautama, I want to know how much an object weighs. I put it on a scale to measure its weight. The scale gives me a result, and for a moment that satisfies me; I can rely on the measurement because scales can measure weight. But hold on, Nagarjuna flags, your reliance on the trustworthiness of the scale is itself an assumption, not a piece of knowledge. Shouldn’t the scale be tested too? I measure the object on a second scale to test the accuracy of the first scale, and the measurement agrees with the first scale. But how can I just assume, once again, that the second scale is accurate? Both scales might be wrong. And the exercise goes on, there is nothing in principle which would justify me in assuming that any one test I use to verify a piece of knowledge is itself reliable beyond doubt. So, Nagarjuna concludes, the supposition that something can be proven through reference to some other putative fact runs into the problem that the series of proofs will never reach an end, and leaves us with an infinite regress. Should we commit ourselves to the opposite justification and propound that we know things to be true which are self-evident, then Nagarjuna would counter that we would be making a vacuous claim. The whole point of epistemology is to discover reliable methods of knowing, which implies that on the side of the world there are facts and on the side of the knower there are proofs which make those facts transparent to human consciousness. Were things just self-evident, proof would be superfluous, we should just know straightaway whether something is such and such or not. The claim of self-evidence destroys, in an ironic fashion which always pleased Nagarjuna, the very need for a theory of knowledge!

Having tested both criteria of evidence and come up short, the Logician might, and in fact historically did, try an alternative theory of mutual corroboration. We may not know for certain that a block of stone weighs too much to fit into a temple I am building, and we may not be certain that the scale being used to measure the stones is one hundred percent accurate, but if as a result of testing the stones with the scale I put the stones in the building and find that they work well, I have reason to rely on the knowledge I gain through the mutual corroborations of measurement and practical success. This process, for Nagarjuna, however, should not pass for an epistemologist who claims to be as strict as the Brahminical Logicians. In fact, this process should not even be considered mutual corroboration; it is actually circular. I assume stones have a certain measurable mass, so I design an instrument to confirm my assumption, and I assume scales measure weight so I assess objects by them, but in terms of strict logic, I am only assuming that this corroborative process proves my suppositions, but it in fact does nothing more than feed my preconceived assumptions rather than give me information about the nature of objects. We may say that a certain person is a son because he has a father, Nagarjuna quips, and we may say another person is a father because he has a son, but apart from this mutual definition, how do we know which particular person is which? By extension, Nagarjuna claims, this is the problem with the project of building a theory of knowledge as such. Epistemology and ontology are parasitic on one another. Epistemologies are conveniently formulated to justify preferred views of the world, and ontologies are presumed to be justified through systematic theories of proof, but apart from these projects being mutually theoretically necessary, we really have no honest way of knowing whether they in fact lend credence to our beliefs. Again, Nagarjuna has used tools from the bag of the logician, in this case, standard argumentational fallacies, to show that it is Brahminical Logic, and not his philosophy of emptiness, which has tripped itself up before having a chance to make a run in the world.

This, as said above, was Nagarjuna’s first response to the Logicians’ accusation that a philosophy of emptiness is fundamentally incoherent. There is however, Nagarjuna famously asserts, another pettito principii in the Nyaya charge that the thesis “all things are empty and lack a fixed nature” is incoherent. The statement “all things are empty” is actually, Nagarjuna says, not a formal philosophical thesis in the first place! According to the Nyaya rules of viable logical argument, the first step in proving an assertion true is the declared statement of the putative fact as a thesis in the argument (pratijna). Now in order for something to qualify as a formal philosophical thesis, a statement must be a fact about a particular object or state of knowable affairs in the world, and it is a matter of doctrine for Nyaya that all particular objects or states of affairs are classifiable into their categories of substances, qualities, and activities. Nagarjuna however does not buy into this set of ontological categories in the first place, and so the Logician is being disingenuous in trying to covertly pull him into the ontological game with this charge that the idea of emptiness is metaphysically unintelligible. The Brahminical Logician is insisting that no person can engage in a philosophical discussion without buying, at least minimally, into a theory of essences and issues surrounding how to categorize essences. It is exactly this very point, Nagarjuna demurs, that is eminently debatable! But since the Logician will not pay Nagarjuna the courtesy of discussion on Nagarjuna’s terms, the Buddhist replies to them on their terms: “If my statement (about emptiness) were a philosophical thesis, then it would indeed be flawed; but I assert no thesis, and so the flaw is not mine.”

With the exception of his two major commentators four centuries later, this stance of Nagarjuna satisfied no one in the Indian philosophical tradition, neither Brahmanas nor fellow Buddhists. It was the stance of the kind of debater who styled himself a vaitandika, a person who refutes rival philosophical positions while advocating no thesis themselves. Despite all their other disagreements, Brahmanas and Buddhists in following centuries did not consider such a stance to be truly philosophical, for while a person who occupied it may be able to expose dubious theories, one could never hope to learn the truth about the world and life from them. Such a person, it was suspected is more likely a charlatan than a sage. Despite the title of his work then, Nagarjuna’s attempt to call into “first question” theories of proof fell far short of ending all disputes. However, Nagarjuna closes this controversial and much-discussed work by reminding his readers of who he is. Paying reverence to the Buddha, the teacher, he says, of interdependent causality and emptiness, Nagarjuna tells his audience that “nothing will prevail for those in whom emptiness will not prevail, while everything will prevail for whom emptiness prevails.” This is a reiteration of Nagarjuna’s commitment that theory and praxis are not a partnership in which only through the former’s justification is the latter redeemed. The goal of practice is after all transformation, not fixity, and so if one insists on marrying philosophy to practice, philosophical reflection cannot be beholden to the unchanging, eternal essences of customary epistemology and metaphysics

5. The New Buddhist Space and Mission

There may be some extent to which the age-old debate as to whether Nagarjuna was a devotee of the traditional Theravada or Classical Buddhism or the Mahayana (Great Vehicle) sect turns on the authorship of the two letters attributed to him. Very little can be gleaned from the other works in Nagarjuna’s philosophical corpus that would lend much support to the supposition that the second-century scholar was even much aware of Great Vehicle doctrines or personages, even though the ground-breaking notion of emptiness was the one which Mahayana fixed on as its central idea. The two “ethical epistles” addressed to the historical Satvahana liege Gautamiputra Satkarni (r. ca. 166-196) would certainly give Nagarjuna a plausible historical locus. With their abundant references to the supremacy of the Great Vehicle teachings, they would also depict Nagarjuna as unequivocally within this movement. However, the non-existence of original Sanskrit versions of the Suhrllekha (To a Good Friend) and Ratnavali (Precious Garland), as well as their obviously heavy redactions in the Tibetan and Chinese editions, make any definitely reliable attribution of them to Nagarjuna practically impossible.

The familiar distinctions between the Classical and Great Vehicles are well-worn; the conservative scriptural and historical literalism of the former pitted against the mythological revisionism of the latter, the idealization of the reclusive ascetic pursuing his own perfection in the former as opposed to the angelic and socially engaged bodhisattva of the latter. Nagarjuna’s other works are filled with honorific passages dedicated only to the Buddha himself, while the two epistles abound in praise of the virtues of angelic bodhisattva-hood, though even these are found amidst passages extolling the perfections of the eightfold path and the nobility of the four truths. Whatever Nagarjuna’s precise sectarian identification, he never loses sight of the understanding that the practice of Buddhism is a new sort of human vehicle, a vehicle meant not to carry people from one realm to another realm, but a vehicle which could make people anew in the only realm where they have always lived.

Nagarjuna’s letters to the war-mongering Gautamiputra are somewhat conspicuous for the relative paucity of advice on the actual art of statecraft. Long sermons in To a Good Friend on the correct interpretation of subtle Mahayana teachings are intermingled with catechism-like presentations of the excellence of monastic virtues, and these are so numerous that even the author concedes toward the end of the correspondence that the king should keep as many of the enumerated precepts as he can, since keeping all of them would tax the fortitude of the most seasoned monk. But with all of these somewhat disconnected sections of the letter which even internally are wont to jump from one topic to another, a motif emerges which does seem to cohere with the more thematic approaches to the idea of emptiness in the other works, and that motif is the primacy of virtuous conduct and practice, which takes on even a higher and more relevant role than the achievements of wisdom.

This motif is surely significant, given the fact that the Classical and Great Vehicles, while both submitting that ultimate wisdom (prajna) and compassion (karuna) were the two paramount virtues, argued over which one was highest, the Theravada opting for wisdom and Mahayana for compassion. In these epistles, while Nagarjuna warns that the intentions behind moral acts must be informed by wisdom lest the benefits of the deed be spoiled, he stresses repeatedly the importance of steadfastly ethical conduct. Dharma or behavior upright in the eyes of the Buddha’s law of existence has two aspects, one which is characterized by meditative non-action and the other through positive action, and the road to Buddhahood, he says, passes through the positive action of the bodhisattva. For even though dharma is subtle and hard to comprehend, particularly where the notion of emptiness is involved and so easily misunderstood, its practice through the cultivation of moral intentions and attitudes will lead unerringly through the tangle of doctrinal debates. Beyond this general advice, which would apply to any monk or nun, counsel is given to the king that dharma as positive ethical conduct is also “the best policy,” for when one socially promotes adherence to ethical conduct, justice will prevail in the kingdom and benefits will accrue to all, benefits which rivals will envy beyond any transient material wealth and false senses of power.

In the worlds of the present and the future, it is after all only actions which matter. It is indeed the very physicality of deeds which leads to the accumulation of either meritorious or detrimental karma, and so one’s fate lies squarely in ones own hands. But through acts performed in the field of samsara, all conceivable changes are possible. A prince can become a pauper, either willingly, like the Buddha, or unwillingly. Young men become old, beauty morphs into decrepitude, friendship descends into enmity. It is this piercing contingency of samsara which is so often experienced with such anguish. But, Nagarjuna quickly reminds his readers, all these transformations can just as easily go in the opposite direction, with material poverty blossoming into spiritual riches, fathers reborn as sons and mothers as young wives, and the wounds of conflict sutured with the threads of reconciliation. Interdependent causality and the emptiness which change depends on mean that things can always go either way, and so which way they in fact go depends intimately on one’s own deeds. And this leads one to grasp that the proper site of practice for the Buddhist cannot be just the monastery, removed as it tries to be from the machinations of state, economy, social class and the other tumultuous and sundry affairs of suffering beings. As there is no difference between samsara and nirvana owing to the emptiness and constantly changing nature of both, so the change which a Buddhist effects upon herself and those around her is a change in the world, and this constant and purposeful change is the rightful mission of Buddhism. With his own peculiar and visionary interpretation of the concept of the emptiness of all things then, Nagarjuna has woven an anti-metaphysical and epistemological stance together with an ethics of action which was, true to its own implications, to transform the self-understanding of the Buddhist tradition for millennia to come.

6. References and Further Reading

Nagarjuna’s Works Addressed to Buddhists

  • Mulamadhyamakakarika, (Fundamental Verses on the Middle Way) translated as The Philosophy of the Middle Way by David J. Kalapuhana, SUNY Press, Albany, 1986.
  • Sunyatasaptati, (Seventy Verses on Emptiness) translated by Cristian Lindtner, Nagarjuniana: Studies in the Writings and Philosophy of Nagarjuna, Akademisk Forlag, Copenhagen, 1987, 35-69.
  • Yuktisastika, (Sixty Verses on Reasoning) translated by Christian Lindtner, Nagarjuniana: Studies in the Writings and Philosophy of Nagarjuna, Akademisk Forlag, Copenhagen, 1987, 103-19.
  • Pratityasamutpadahrdaya, (The Constituents of Dependent Arising) translated by L. Jamspal and Peter Della Santina in Journal of the Department of Buddhist Studies, University of Delhi, 2:1, 1974, 29-32.
  • Bodhisambharaka, (Preparation for Enlightenment) translated by Christian Lindtner, Nagarjuniana: Studies in the Writings and Philosophy of Nagarjuna, Akademisk Forlag, Copenhagen, 1987, 228-48.

Nagarjuna’s Works Addressed to Brahminical Systems

  • Vigrahavyavartani, (The End of Disputes) translated as The Dialectical Method of Nagarjuna by Kamaleswar Bhattacharya, Motilal Banarsidass, Delhi, 1978.
  • Vaidalyaprakarana, (Pulverizing the Categories) translated as Madhyamika Dialectics by Ole Holten Pind, Akademisk Forlag, Copenhagen, 1987.

Nagarjuna’s Ethical Epistles

  • Suhrllekha, (To a Good Friend) translated as Nagarjuna’s Letter to King Gautamiputra by L. Jamspal, N.S. Chophel and Peter Della Santina, Motilal Banarsidass, Delhi, 1978.
  • Ratnavali, (Precious Garland) translated as The Precious Garland and the Song of the Four Mindfulnesses by Jeffrey Hopkins, Lati Rimpoche and Anne Klein, Vikas Publishing, Delhi, 1975.

Author Information

Douglas Berger
Southern Illinois University
U. S. A.

Marcus Aurelius (121—180 C.E.)

aureliuThe philosophy of the Roman Emperor Marcus Aurelius can be found in a collection of personal writings known as the Meditations. These reflect the influence of Stoicism and, in particular, the philosophy of Epictetus, the Stoic. The Meditations may be read as a series of practical philosophical exercises, following Epictetus’ three topics of study, designed to digest and put into practice philosophical theory. Central to these exercises is a concern with the analysis of one’s judgements and a desire to cultivate a “cosmic perspective.”

From a modern perspective Marcus Aurelius is certainly not in the first rank of ancient philosophers. He is no Plato or Aristotle, nor even a Sextus Empiricus or Alexander of Aphrodisias. To a certain extent this judgement is perfectly fair and reasonable. However, in order to assess the philosophical qualities that Marcus does have and that are displayed in the Meditations it is necessary to emphasize that in antiquity philosophy was not conceived merely as a matter of theoretical arguments. Such arguments existed and were important, but they were framed within a broader conception of philosophy as a way of life. The aim was not merely to gain a rational understanding of the world but to allow that rational understanding to inform the way in which one lived. If one keeps this understanding of ‘philosophy’ in mind, then one becomes able to appreciate the function and the philosophical value of Marcus’ Meditations.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. The Meditations
  3. Philosophy
    1. Stoicism
    2. The Influence of Epictetus
    3. The Three topoi
    4. Philosophical Exercises
    5. The Point of View of the Cosmos
  4. Concluding Remarks
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Selected Editions and Translations of the Meditations
    2. Selected Studies

1. Life

Marcus Aurelius was born in 121 C.E.. His early education was overseen by the Emperor Hadrian, and he was later adopted by the Emperor Antoninus Pius in 138 C.E.. After an initial education in rhetoric undertaken by Fronto, Marcus later abandoned it in favor of philosophy. Marcus became Emperor himself in C.E. 161, initially alongside Lucius Verus, becoming sole Emperor in C.E. 169. Continual attacks meant that much of his reign was spent on campaign, especially in central Europe. However, he did find time to establish four Chairs of Philosophy in Athens, one for each of the principal philosophical traditions (Platonic, Aristotelian, Stoic, and Epicurean). He died in C.E. 180.

2. The Meditations

Marcus’ reputation as a philosopher rests upon one work, the Meditations. The Meditations take the form of a personal notebook and were probably written while Marcus was on campaign in central Europe, c. C.E. 171-175. The entries appear to be in no particular order and may simply be in the original order of composition. The repetition of themes and the occasional groups of quotations from other authors (see, for example, Med. 4.46, 11.33-39) add to this impression. Book One, however, is somewhat different from the rest of the text and may well have been written separately (a plan for it may be discerned in Med. 6.48).

The first recorded mention of the Meditations is by Themistius in C.E. 364. The current Greek title—ta eis heauton (‘to himself’)—derives from a manuscript now lost and may be a later addition (it is first recorded c. 900 by Arethas). The modern text derives primarily from two sources: a manuscript now in the Vatican and a lost manuscript (mentioned above), upon which the first printed edition (1558) was based.

Beyond the Meditations there also survives part of a correspondence between Marcus and his rhetoric teacher Fronto, probably dating from earlier in Marcus’ life (c. C.E. 138-166), discovered as a palimpsest in 1815. However, although this interesting discovery sheds some light on Marcus as an individual, it adds little to our understanding of his philosophy.

3. Philosophy

a. Stoicism

According to tradition, Marcus was a Stoic. His ancient biographer, Julius Capitolinus, describes him as such. Marcus also makes reference to a number of Stoics by whom he was taught and, in particular, mentions Rusticus from whom he borrowed a copy of the works of the Stoic philosopher Epictetus (Med. 1.7). However, nowhere in the Meditations does Marcus explicitly call himself a Stoic. This may simply reflect the likelihood that Marcus was writing only for himself rather than attempting to define himself to an audience. Yet it is probably fair to admit that Marcus was at least open to ideas from other philosophical traditions, being impressed by Stoic philosophy, but not merely an unthinking disciple of Stoicism.

b. The Influence of Epictetus

As has been noted, Marcus was clearly familiar with the Discourses of Epictetus, quoting them a number of times (see Med. 11.33-38). Epictetus’ fame in the second century is noted by a number of ancient sources, being hailed as the greatest of the Stoics (Aulus Gellius 1.2.6) and more popular than Plato (Origen Contra Celsus 6.2). If Marcus felt drawn towards Stoicism, then Epictetus would surely have stood out as the most important Stoic of the time. It is perhaps reasonable, then, to turn to Epictetus in order to explore the philosophical background to the Meditations.

c. The Three topoi

Central to Epictetus’ philosophy is his account of three topoi, or areas of study. He suggests that the apprentice philosopher should be trained in three distinct areas or topoi (see Epictetus Discourses 3.2.1-2):

  1. Desires (orexeis) and aversions (ekkliseis);
  2. Impulse to act (hormas) and not to act (aphormas);
  3. Freedom from deception, hasty judgement, and anything else related to assents (sunkatatheseis).

These three areas of training correspond to the three types of philosophical discourse referred to by earlier Stoics; the physical, the ethical, and the logical (see Diogenes Laertius 7.39). For Epictetus, it is not enough merely to discourse about philosophy. The student of philosophy should also engage in practical training designed to digest philosophical principals, transforming them into actions. Only this will enable the apprentice philosopher to transform himself into the Stoic ideal of a wise person or sage (sophos). It is to this end that the three topoi are directed.

The first topos, concerning desire (orexis), is devoted to physics. It is not enough for the philosopher to know how Nature works; he must train his desires in the light of that knowledge so that he only desires what is in harmony with Nature. For the Stoic, Nature is a complex inter-connected physical system, identified with God, of which the individual is but one part. What might be called the practical implication of this conception of Nature is that an individual will inevitably become frustrated and unhappy if they desire things without taking into account the operations of this larger physical system. Thus, in order to become a Stoic sage—happy and in harmony with Nature—one must train one’s desires in the light of a study of Stoic physical theory.

The second topos, concerning impulse (hormê), is devoted to ethics. The study of ethical theory is of course valuable in its own right, but, for the Stoic who is training to be a sage, these theories must be translated into ethical actions. In order to transform the way in which one behaves, it is necessary to train the impulses that shape one’s behavior. By so doing the apprentice philosopher will be able not merely to say how a sage should act but also to act as a sage should act.

The third topos, concerning assent (sunkatathesis), is devoted to logic. It is important to remember here that for the Stoics the term ‘logic’ included not only dialectic but also much of what one would today call epistemology. According to Epictetus every impression (phantasia) that an individual receives often includes a value-judgement (hupolêpsis) made by the individual. When an individual accepts or gives assent (sunkatathesis) to an impression, assent is often given to the value-judgement as well. For instance, when one sees someone drink a lot of wine, one often judges that they are drinking too much wine (see, for example. Epictetus Handbook 45). Epictetus suggests that, in the light of Stoic epistemological theory, the apprentice philosopher should train himself to analyze his impressions carefully and be on guard not to give assent to unwarranted value-judgements.

For Epictetus, then, the student of philosophy must not only study the three types of philosophical discourse but also engage in these three types of philosophical training or exercise in order to translate that theory into actions. Marcus may himself be seen as a student of Epictetus, and so some scholars have suggested that the three topoi form a key to understanding the Meditations. Indeed, the Meditations may be approached as an example of a form of personal writing in which the very act of writing constituted a philosophical exercise designed to digest the three types of philosophical theory. In other words, the Meditations are a text produced by someone engaged in the three topoi outlined by Epictetus. This is hinted at in Med. 9.7 where Marcus exhorts himself to ‘wipe out impression (phantasia), check impulse (hormê), and quench desire (orexis)’.

d. Philosophical Exercises

The Meditations certainly do not present philosophical theories similar to those that one can find in, say, the surviving works of Aristotle. Nor are they comparable to a theoretical treatise like the Elements of Ethics by the Stoic Hierocles, possibly a contemporary of Marcus. Nevertheless, the Meditations remain essentially a philosophical text. As has already been noted, the Meditations are a personal notebook, written by Marcus to himself and for his own use. They do not form a theoretical treatise designed to argue for a particular doctrine or conclusion; their function is different. In order to understand this function it is necessary to introduce the idea of a philosophical exercise (askêsis).

In the Meditations Marcus engages in a series of philosophical exercises designed to digest philosophical theories, to transform his character or ‘dye his soul’ in the light of those theories (see, for example, Med. 5.16), and so to transform his behavior and his entire way of life. By reflecting upon philosophical ideas and, perhaps more importantly, writing them down, Marcus engages in a repetitive process designed to habituate his mind into a new way of thinking. This procedure is quite distinct from the construction of philosophical arguments and has a quite different function. Whereas the former is concerned with creating a particular philosophical doctrine, the latter is a practical exercise or training designed to assimilate that doctrine into one’s habitual modes of behavior. Following the account of three types of philosophical training outlined by Epictetus, Marcus reflects in the Meditations upon a medley of physical, ethical, and logical ideas. These written reflections constitute a second stage of philosophical education necessary after one has studied the philosophical theories (see, for example, Epictetus Discourses 1.26.3). By engaging in such written philosophical exercises Marcus attempts to transform his soul or inner disposition that will, in turn, alter his behavior. Thus, this second stage of philosophical education is the process by which a philosophical apprentice trains himself to put theories into practice, and so make progress towards wisdom.

e. The Point of View of the Cosmos

Of all the philosophical exercises in the Meditations the most prominent centers around what might be called ‘the point of view of the cosmos’. In a number of passages Marcus exhorts himself to overcome the limited perspective of the individual and experience the world from a cosmic perspective. For example:

You have the power to strip away many superfluous troubles located wholly in your judgement, and to possess a large room for yourself embracing in thought the whole cosmos, to consider everlasting time, to think of the rapid change in the parts of each thing, of how short it is from birth until dissolution, and how the void before birth and that after dissolution are equally infinite. (Med. 9.32; see also 2.17, 5.23, 7.47, 12.32)

In passages such as this Marcus makes implicit reference to a number of Stoic theories. Here, for instance, the Stoic physics of flux inherited from Heraclitus is evoked. Perhaps more important though is the reference to one’s judgement and the claim that this is the source of human unhappiness. Following Epictetus, Marcus claims that all attributions of good or evil are the product of human judgements. As Epictetus put it, what upsets people are not things themselves but rather their judgements about things (see Handbook 5). According to Epictetus’ epistemological theory (to the extent that it can be reconstructed) the impressions that an individual receives and that appear to reflect the nature of things are in fact already composite. They involve not only a perception of some external object but also an almost involuntary and unconscious judgement about that perception. This judgement will be a product of one’s preconceptions and mental habits. It is this composite impression to which an individual grants or denies assent, creating a belief. The task for the philosopher is to subject one’s impressions to rigorous examination, making sure that one does not give assent to (that is, accept as true) impressions that include any unwarranted value judgements.

Marcus’ personal reflections in the Meditations may be read as a series of written exercises aimed at analyzing his own impressions and rejecting his own unwarranted value judgements. For instance, he reminds himself:

Do not say more to yourself than the first impressions report. […] Abide always by the first impressions and add nothing of your own from within. (Med. 8.49)

These ‘first impressions’ are impressions before a value judgement has been made. For Marcus, human well-being or happiness (eudaimonia) is entirely dependent upon correctly examining one’s impressions and judgements. For once one has overcome false value-judgements—for instance that wealth and social standing are valuable and that one should compete for them against others—one will experience the cosmos as a single living being (identified with God) rather than a site of conflict and destruction. As Cicero put it in his summary of Stoic physics:

The various limited modes of being may encounter many external obstacles to hinder their perfect realization, but there can be nothing that can frustrate Nature as a whole, since she embraces and contains within herself all modes of being. (On the Nature of the Gods 2.35)

It is to this end—cultivating an experience of the cosmos as a unified living being identified with God—that the philosophical exercises in the Meditations are directed.

4. Concluding Remarks

From a modern perspective Marcus Aurelius is certainly not in the first rank of ancient philosophers. He is no Plato or Aristotle, nor even a Sextus Empiricus or Alexander of Aphrodisias. To a certain extent this judgement is perfectly fair and reasonable. However, in order to assess the philosophical qualities that Marcus does have and that are displayed in the Meditations it is necessary to emphasize that in antiquity philosophy was not conceived merely as a matter of theoretical arguments. Such arguments existed and were important, but they were framed within a broader conception of philosophy as a way of life. The aim was not merely to gain a rational understanding of the world but to allow that rational understanding to inform the way in which one lived. If one keeps this understanding of ‘philosophy’ in mind, then one becomes able to appreciate the function and the philosophical value of Marcus’ Meditations.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Selected Editions and Translations of the Meditations

  • CROSSLEY, H., The Fourth Book of the Meditations of Marcus Aurelius Antoninus, A Revised Text with Translation and Commentary (London: Macmillan, 1882) – an excellent commentary, sadly of only one book.
  • DALFEN, J., Marci Aurelii Antonini Ad Se Ipsum Libri XII, Bibliotheca Scriptorum Graecorum et Romanorum Teubneriana (Leipzig: Teubner, 1979; 2nd edn 1987) – includes an invaluable word index.
  • FARQUHARSON, A. S. L., The Meditations of the Emperor Marcus Antoninus, Edited with Translation and Commentary, 2 vols (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1944) – arguably the definitive edition and essential for any serious study of the Meditations.
  • FARQUHARSON, A. S. L.,The Meditations of Marcus Aurelius Antoninus, With Introduction and Notes by R. B. Rutherford (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1989) – an edition reprinting only the translation from Farquharson’s 1944 edition, but supplemented with a helpful introduction and a selection from the correspondence with Fronto.
  • GATAKER, T., Marci Antonini Imperatoris de rebus suis, sive de eis qae ad se pertinere censebat, Libri XII (Cambridge: Thomas Buck, 1652) – a justly famous early edition of the Meditations containing a substantial commentary.
  • HAINES, C. R., The Communings with Himself of Marcus Aurelius Antoninus, A Revised Text and a Translation into English, The Loeb Classical Library (London: Heinemann, 1916; later reprints by Harvard University Press) – probably the most readily available edition of the Greek text, with a facing English translation. Haines also prepared a two-volume edition of the correspondence with Fronto for the Loeb Classical Library.
  • LEOPOLD, I. H., M. Antoninus Imperator Ad Se Ipsum, Scriptorum Classicorum Bibliotheca Oxoniensis (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1908) – the OCT edition, now out of print.
  • THEILER, W., Kaiser Marc Aurel, Wege Zu Sich Selbst (Zürich: Artemis, 1951) – a widely praised edition of the Greek text, with a facing German translation.

b. Selected Studies

  • AFRICA, T. W., ‘The Opium Addiction of Marcus Aurelius’, Journal of the History of Ideas 22 (1961), 97-102.
  • ARNOLD, E. V., Roman Stoicism: Being Lectures on the History of the Stoic Philosophy with Special Reference to its Development within the Roman Empire (Cambridge, 1911; repr. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1958)
  • ASMIS, E., ‘The Stoicism of Marcus Aurelius’, ANRW II 36.3 (1989), pp. 2228-2252.
  • BIRLEY, A. R., Marcus Aurelius: A Biography (London: Batsford, 1966; new edn Routledge 2000)
  • BRUNT, P. A., ‘Marcus Aurelius in his Meditations‘, Journal of Roman Studies 64 (1974), 1-20.
  • CLARKE, M. L., The Roman Mind: Studies in the History of Thought from Cicero to Marcus Aurelius (London: Cohen & West, 1956)
  • HADOT, P., ‘Une clé des Pensées de Marc Aurèle: les trois topoi philosophiques selon Épictète’, Les Études philosophiques 1 (1978), 65-83.
  • HADOT, P., The Inner Citadel: The Meditations of Marcus Aurelius, trans. M. Chase (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1998); a translation of La Citadelle Intérieure (Paris, 1992)
  • KRAYE, J., ‘Ethnicorum omnium sanctissimus: Marcus Aurelius and his Meditations from Xylander to Diderot’, in J. Kraye & M. W. F. Stones, eds, Humanism and Early Modern Philosophy (London: Routledge, 2000), pp. 107-134.
  • LONG, A. A., ‘Epictetus, Marcus Aurelius’, in T. J. Luce, ed., Ancient Writers: Greece and Rome (New York: Scribner’s, 1982), pp. 985-1002.
  • MORFORD, M., The Roman Philosophers: From the Time of Cato the Censor to the Death of Marcus Aurelius (London: Routledge, 2002)
  • NEWMAN, R. J., ‘Cotidie meditare: Theory and Practice of the meditatio in Imperial Stoicism’, ANRW II 36.3 (1989), pp. 1473-1517.
  • RIST, J. M., ‘Are You a Stoic? The Case of Marcus Aurelius’, in B. F. Meyers & E. P. Sanders, eds, Jewish and Christian Self-Definition 3 (London: SCM, 1982), pp. 23-45.
  • RUTHERFORD, R. B., The Meditations of Marcus Aurelius: A Study (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1989)
  • STANTON, G. R., ‘The Cosmopolitan Ideas of Epictetus and Marcus Aurelius’, Phronesis 13 (1968), 183-195.
  • WICKHAM LEGG, J., ‘A Bibliography of the Thoughts of Marcus Aurelius Antoninus’, Transactions of the Bibliographical Society 10 (1908-09, but publ. 1910), 15-81.

This article was written in 2002. Since then a number of new translations of the Meditations have been published, including ones by Robin Hard (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2011), Martin Hammond (London: Penguin, 2006), and Gregory Hays (London: Weidenfeld & Nicolson, 2003). Also, a number of new studies have also been published. The most important are Angelo Giavatto’s Interlocutore di se stesso: La dialettica di Marco Aurelio (Hildesheim: Georg Olms, 2008), Marcel van Ackeren’s Die Philosophie Marc Aurels, 2 vols (berlin: De Gruyter, 2011), and the chapters by many authors in Marcel van Ackeren, ed., A Companion to Marcus Aurelius (Chichester: Wiley-Blackwell, 2012). For an annotated and up-to-date guide to the literature on Marcus Aurelius see John Sellars, ‘Marcus Aurelius’, in D. Pritchard, ed., Oxford Bibliographies in Philosophy (New York: Oxford University Press, 2015), DOI 10.1093/obo/9780195396577-0278 (subscription required).

Author Information

John Sellars
Email: john.sellars (at)
King’s College London
United Kingdom


Nihilism is the belief that all values are baseless and that nothing can be known or communicated. It is often associated with extreme pessimism and a radical skepticism that condemns existence. A true nihilist would believe in nothing, have no loyalties, and no purpose other than, perhaps, an impulse to destroy. While few philosophers would claim to be nihilists, nihilism is most often associated with Friedrich Nietzsche who argued that its corrosive effects would eventually destroy all moral, religious, and metaphysical convictions and precipitate the greatest crisis in human history. In the 20th century, nihilistic themes–epistemological failure, value destruction, and cosmic purposelessness–have preoccupied artists, social critics, and philosophers. Mid-century, for example, the existentialists helped popularize tenets of nihilism in their attempts to blunt its destructive potential. By the end of the century, existential despair as a response to nihilism gave way to an attitude of indifference, often associated with antifoundationalism.

It has been over a century now since Nietzsche explored nihilism and its implications for civilization. As he predicted, nihilism’s impact on the culture and values of the 20th century has been pervasive, its apocalyptic tenor spawning a mood of gloom and a good deal of anxiety, anger, and terror. Interestingly, Nietzsche himself, a radical skeptic preoccupied with language, knowledge, and truth, anticipated many of the themes of postmodernity. It’s helpful to note, then, that he believed we could–at a terrible price–eventually work through nihilism. If we survived the process of destroying all interpretations of the world, we could then perhaps discover the correct course for humankind.

Table of Contents

  1. Origins
  2. Friedrich Nietzsche and Nihilism
  3. Existential Nihilism
  4. Antifoundationalism and Nihilism
  5. Conclusion

1. Origins

“Nihilism” comes from the Latin nihil, or nothing, which means not anything, that which does not exist. It appears in the verb “annihilate,” meaning to bring to nothing, to destroy completely. Early in the nineteenth century, Friedrich Jacobi used the word to negatively characterize transcendental idealism. It only became popularized, however, after its appearance in Ivan Turgenev’s novel Fathers and Sons (1862) where he used “nihilism” to describe the crude scientism espoused by his character Bazarov who preaches a creed of total negation.

In Russia, nihilism became identified with a loosely organized revolutionary movement (C.1860-1917) that rejected the authority of the state, church, and family. In his early writing, anarchist leader Mikhael Bakunin (1814-1876) composed the notorious entreaty still identified with nihilism: “Let us put our trust in the eternal spirit which destroys and annihilates only because it is the unsearchable and eternally creative source of all life–the passion for destruction is also a creative passion!” (Reaction in Germany, 1842). The movement advocated a social arrangement based on rationalism and materialism as the sole source of knowledge and individual freedom as the highest goal. By rejecting man’s spiritual essence in favor of a solely materialistic one, nihilists denounced God and religious authority as antithetical to freedom. The movement eventually deteriorated into an ethos of subversion, destruction, and anarchy, and by the late 1870s, a nihilist was anyone associated with clandestine political groups advocating terrorism and assassination.

The earliest philosophical positions associated with what could be characterized as a nihilistic outlook are those of the Skeptics. Because they denied the possibility of certainty, Skeptics could denounce traditional truths as unjustifiable opinions. When Demosthenes (c.371-322 BC), for example, observes that “What he wished to believe, that is what each man believes” (Olynthiac), he posits the relational nature of knowledge. Extreme skepticism, then, is linked to epistemological nihilism which denies the possibility of knowledge and truth; this form of nihilism is currently identified with postmodern antifoundationalism. Nihilism, in fact, can be understood in several different ways. Political Nihilism, as noted, is associated with the belief that the destruction of all existing political, social, and religious order is a prerequisite for any future improvement. Ethical nihilism or moral nihilism rejects the possibility of absolute moral or ethical values. Instead, good and evil are nebulous, and values addressing such are the product of nothing more than social and emotive pressures. Existential nihilism is the notion that life has no intrinsic meaning or value, and it is, no doubt, the most commonly used and understood sense of the word today.

Max Stirner’s (1806-1856) attacks on systematic philosophy, his denial of absolutes, and his rejection of abstract concepts of any kind often places him among the first philosophical nihilists. For Stirner, achieving individual freedom is the only law; and the state, which necessarily imperils freedom, must be destroyed. Even beyond the oppression of the state, though, are the constraints imposed by others because their very existence is an obstacle compromising individual freedom. Thus Stirner argues that existence is an endless “war of each against all” (The Ego and its Own, trans. 1907).

2. Friedrich Nietzsche and Nihilism

Among philosophers, Friedrich Nietzsche is most often associated with nihilism. For Nietzsche, there is no objective order or structure in the world except what we give it. Penetrating the façades buttressing convictions, the nihilist discovers that all values are baseless and that reason is impotent. “Every belief, every considering something-true,” Nietzsche writes, “is necessarily false because there is simply no true world” (Will to Power [notes from 1883-1888]). For him, nihilism requires a radical repudiation of all imposed values and meaning: “Nihilism is . . . not only the belief that everything deserves to perish; but one actually puts one’s shoulder to the plough; one destroys” (Will to Power).

The caustic strength of nihilism is absolute, Nietzsche argues, and under its withering scrutiny “the highest values devalue themselves. The aim is lacking, and ‘Why’ finds no answer” (Will to Power). Inevitably, nihilism will expose all cherished beliefs and sacrosanct truths as symptoms of a defective Western mythos. This collapse of meaning, relevance, and purpose will be the most destructive force in history, constituting a total assault on reality and nothing less than the greatest crisis of humanity:

What I relate is the history of the next two centuries. I describe what is coming, what can no longer come differently: the advent of nihilism. . . . For some time now our whole European culture has been moving as toward a catastrophe, with a tortured tension that is growing from decade to decade: restlessly, violently, headlong, like a river that wants to reach the end. . . . (Will to Power)

Since Nietzsche’s compelling critique, nihilistic themes–epistemological failure, value destruction, and cosmic purposelessness–have preoccupied artists, social critics, and philosophers. Convinced that Nietzsche’s analysis was accurate, for example, Oswald Spengler in The Decline of the West (1926) studied several cultures to confirm that patterns of nihilism were indeed a conspicuous feature of collapsing civilizations. In each of the failed cultures he examines, Spengler noticed that centuries-old religious, artistic, and political traditions were weakened and finally toppled by the insidious workings of several distinct nihilistic postures: the Faustian nihilist “shatters the ideals”; the Apollinian nihilist “watches them crumble before his eyes”; and the Indian nihilist “withdraws from their presence into himself.” Withdrawal, for instance, often identified with the negation of reality and resignation advocated by Eastern religions, is in the West associated with various versions of epicureanism and stoicism. In his study, Spengler concludes that Western civilization is already in the advanced stages of decay with all three forms of nihilism working to undermine epistemological authority and ontological grounding.

In 1927, Martin Heidegger, to cite another example, observed that nihilism in various and hidden forms was already “the normal state of man” (The Question of Being). Other philosophers’ predictions about nihilism’s impact have been dire. Outlining the symptoms of nihilism in the 20th century, Helmut Thielicke wrote that “Nihilism literally has only one truth to declare, namely, that ultimately Nothingness prevails and the world is meaningless” (Nihilism: Its Origin and Nature, with a Christian Answer, 1969). From the nihilist’s perspective, one can conclude that life is completely amoral, a conclusion, Thielicke believes, that motivates such monstrosities as the Nazi reign of terror. Gloomy predictions of nihilism’s impact are also charted in Eugene Rose’s Nihilism: The Root of the Revolution of the Modern Age (1994). If nihilism proves victorious–and it’s well on its way, he argues–our world will become “a cold, inhuman world” where “nothingness, incoherence, and absurdity” will triumph.

3. Existential Nihilism

While nihilism is often discussed in terms of extreme skepticism and relativism, for most of the 20th century it has been associated with the belief that life is meaningless. Existential nihilism begins with the notion that the world is without meaning or purpose. Given this circumstance, existence itself–all action, suffering, and feeling–is ultimately senseless and empty.

In The Dark Side: Thoughts on the Futility of Life (1994), Alan Pratt demonstrates that existential nihilism, in one form or another, has been a part of the Western intellectual tradition from the beginning. The Skeptic Empedocles’ observation that “the life of mortals is so mean a thing as to be virtually un-life,” for instance, embodies the same kind of extreme pessimism associated with existential nihilism. In antiquity, such profound pessimism may have reached its apex with Hegesias of Cyrene. Because miseries vastly outnumber pleasures, happiness is impossible, the philosopher argues, and subsequently advocates suicide. Centuries later during the Renaissance, William Shakespeare eloquently summarized the existential nihilist’s perspective when, in this famous passage near the end of Macbeth, he has Macbeth pour out his disgust for life:

Out, out, brief candle!
Life’s but a walking shadow, a poor player
That struts and frets his hour upon the stage
And then is heard no more; it is a tale
Told by an idiot, full of sound and fury,
Signifying nothing.

In the twentieth century, it’s the atheistic existentialist movement, popularized in France in the 1940s and 50s, that is responsible for the currency of existential nihilism in the popular consciousness. Jean-Paul Sartre’s (1905-1980) defining preposition for the movement, “existence precedes essence,” rules out any ground or foundation for establishing an essential self or a human nature. When we abandon illusions, life is revealed as nothing; and for the existentialists, nothingness is the source of not only absolute freedom but also existential horror and emotional anguish. Nothingness reveals each individual as an isolated being “thrown” into an alien and unresponsive universe, barred forever from knowing why yet required to invent meaning. It’s a situation that’s nothing short of absurd. Writing from the enlightened perspective of the absurd, Albert Camus (1913-1960) observed that Sisyphus’ plight, condemned to eternal, useless struggle, was a superb metaphor for human existence (The Myth of Sisyphus, 1942).

The common thread in the literature of the existentialists is coping with the emotional anguish arising from our confrontation with nothingness, and they expended great energy responding to the question of whether surviving it was possible. Their answer was a qualified “Yes,” advocating a formula of passionate commitment and impassive stoicism. In retrospect, it was an anecdote tinged with desperation because in an absurd world there are absolutely no guidelines, and any course of action is problematic. Passionate commitment, be it to conquest, creation, or whatever, is itself meaningless. Enter nihilism.

Camus, like the other existentialists, was convinced that nihilism was the most vexing problem of the twentieth century. Although he argues passionately that individuals could endure its corrosive effects, his most famous works betray the extraordinary difficulty he faced building a convincing case. In The Stranger (1942), for example, Meursault has rejected the existential suppositions on which the uninitiated and weak rely. Just moments before his execution for a gratuitous murder, he discovers that life alone is reason enough for living, a raison d’être, however, that in context seems scarcely convincing. In Caligula (1944), the mad emperor tries to escape the human predicament by dehumanizing himself with acts of senseless violence, fails, and surreptitiously arranges his own assassination. The Plague (1947) shows the futility of doing one’s best in an absurd world. And in his last novel, the short and sardonic, The Fall (1956), Camus posits that everyone has bloody hands because we are all responsible for making a sorry state worse by our inane action and inaction alike. In these works and other works by the existentialists, one is often left with the impression that living authentically with the meaninglessness of life is impossible.

Camus was fully aware of the pitfalls of defining existence without meaning, and in his philosophical essay The Rebel (1951) he faces the problem of nihilism head-on. In it, he describes at length how metaphysical collapse often ends in total negation and the victory of nihilism, characterized by profound hatred, pathological destruction, and incalculable violence and death.

4. Antifoundationalism and Nihilism

By the late 20th century, “nihilism” had assumed two different castes. In one form, “nihilist” is used to characterize the postmodern person, a dehumanized conformist, alienated, indifferent, and baffled, directing psychological energy into hedonistic narcissism or into a deep ressentiment that often explodes in violence. This perspective is derived from the existentialists’ reflections on nihilism stripped of any hopeful expectations, leaving only the experience of sickness, decay, and disintegration.

In his study of meaninglessness, Donald Crosby writes that the source of modern nihilism paradoxically stems from a commitment to honest intellectual openness. “Once set in motion, the process of questioning could come to but one end, the erosion of conviction and certitude and collapse into despair” (The Specter of the Absurd, 1988). When sincere inquiry is extended to moral convictions and social consensus, it can prove deadly, Crosby continues, promoting forces that ultimately destroy civilizations. Michael Novak’s recently revised The Experience of Nothingness (1968, 1998) tells a similar story. Both studies are responses to the existentialists’ gloomy findings from earlier in the century. And both optimistically discuss ways out of the abyss by focusing of the positive implications nothingness reveals, such as liberty, freedom, and creative possibilities. Novak, for example, describes how since WWII we have been working to “climb out of nihilism” on the way to building a new civilization.

In contrast to the efforts to overcome nihilism noted above is the uniquely postmodern response associated with the current antifoundationalists. The philosophical, ethical, and intellectual crisis of nihilism that has tormented modern philosophers for over a century has given way to mild annoyance or, more interestingly, an upbeat acceptance of meaninglessness.

French philosopher Jean-Francois Lyotard characterizes postmodernism as an “incredulity toward metanarratives,” those all-embracing foundations that we have relied on to make sense of the world. This extreme skepticism has undermined intellectual and moral hierarchies and made “truth” claims, transcendental or transcultural, problematic. Postmodern antifoundationalists, paradoxically grounded in relativism, dismiss knowledge as relational and “truth” as transitory, genuine only until something more palatable replaces it (reminiscent of William James’ notion of “cash value”). The critic Jacques Derrida, for example, asserts that one can never be sure that what one knows corresponds with what is. Since human beings participate in only an infinitesimal part of the whole, they are unable to grasp anything with certainty, and absolutes are merely “fictional forms.”

American antifoundationalist Richard Rorty makes a similar point: “Nothing grounds our practices, nothing legitimizes them, nothing shows them to be in touch with the way things are” (“From Logic to Language to Play,” 1986). This epistemological cul-de-sac, Rorty concludes, leads inevitably to nihilism. “Faced with the nonhuman, the nonlinguistic, we no longer have the ability to overcome contingency and pain by appropriation and transformation, but only the ability to recognize contingency and pain” (Contingency, Irony, and Solidarity, 1989). In contrast to Nietzsche’s fears and the angst of the existentialists, nihilism becomes for the antifoundationalists just another aspect of our contemporary milieu, one best endured with sang-froid.

In The Banalization of Nihilism (1992) Karen Carr discusses the antifoundationalist response to nihilism. Although it still inflames a paralyzing relativism and subverts critical tools, “cheerful nihilism” carries the day, she notes, distinguished by an easy-going acceptance of meaninglessness. Such a development, Carr concludes, is alarming. If we accept that all perspectives are equally non-binding, then intellectual or moral arrogance will determine which perspective has precedence. Worse still, the banalization of nihilism creates an environment where ideas can be imposed forcibly with little resistance, raw power alone determining intellectual and moral hierarchies. It’s a conclusion that dovetails nicely with Nietzsche’s, who pointed out that all interpretations of the world are simply manifestations of will-to-power.

5. Conclusion

It has been over a century now since Nietzsche explored nihilism and its implications for civilization. As he predicted, nihilism’s impact on the culture and values of the 20th century has been pervasive, its apocalyptic tenor spawning a mood of gloom and a good deal of anxiety, anger, and terror. Interestingly, Nietzsche himself, a radical skeptic preoccupied with language, knowledge, and truth, anticipated many of the themes of postmodernity. It’s helpful to note, then, that he believed we could–at a terrible price–eventually work through nihilism. If we survived the process of destroying all interpretations of the world, we could then perhaps discover the correct course for humankind:

I praise, I do not reproach, [nihilism’s] arrival. I believe it is one of the greatest crises, a moment of the deepest self-reflection of humanity. Whether man recovers from it, whether he becomes master of this crisis, is a question of his strength. It is possible. . . . (Complete Works Vol. 13)

Author Information

Alan Pratt
Embry-Riddle University
U. S. A.

Natural Law

The term “natural law” is ambiguous. It refers to a type of moral theory, as well as to a type of legal theory, but the core claims of the two kinds of theory are logically independent. It does not refer to the laws of nature, the laws that science aims to describe. According to natural law moral theory, the moral standards that govern human behavior are, in some sense, objectively derived from the nature of human beings and the nature of the world. While being logically independent of natural law legal theory, the two theories intersect. However, the majority of the article will focus on natural law legal theory.

According to natural law legal theory, the authority of legal standards necessarily derives, at least in part, from considerations having to do with the moral merit of those standards. There are a number of different kinds of natural law legal theories, differing from each other with respect to the role that morality plays in determining the authority of legal norms. The conceptual jurisprudence of John Austin provides a set of necessary and sufficient conditions for the existence of law that distinguishes law from non-law in every possible world. Classical natural law theory such as the theory of Thomas Aquinas focuses on the overlap between natural law moral and legal theories.  Similarly, the neo-naturalism of John Finnis is a development of classical natural law theory. In contrast, the procedural naturalism of Lon L. Fuller is a rejection of the conceptual naturalist idea that there are necessary substantive moral constraints on the content of law. Lastly, Ronald Dworkin’s theory is a response and critique of legal positivism. All of these theories subscribe to one or more basic tenets of natural law legal theory and are important to its development and influence.

Table of Contents

  1. Two Kinds of Natural Law Theory
  2. Conceptual Naturalism
    1. The Project of Conceptual Jurisprudence
    2. Classical Natural Law Theory
  3. The Substantive Neo-Naturalism of John Finnis
  4. The Procedural Naturalism of Lon L. Fuller
  5. Ronald Dworkin’s “Third Theory”
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Two Kinds of Natural Law Theory

At the outset, it is important to distinguish two kinds of theory that go by the name of natural law. The first is a theory of morality that is roughly characterized by the following theses. First, moral propositions have what is sometimes called objective standing in the sense that such propositions are the bearers of objective truth-value; that is, moral propositions can be objectively true or false. Though moral objectivism is sometimes equated with moral realism (see, e.g., Moore 1992, 190: “the truth of any moral proposition lies in its correspondence with a mind- and convention-independent moral reality”), the relationship between the two theories is controversial. Geoffrey Sayre-McCord (1988), for example, views moral objectivism as one species of moral realism, but not the only form; on Sayre-McCord’s view, moral subjectivism and moral intersubjectivism are also forms of moral realism. Strictly speaking, then, natural law moral theory is committed only to the objectivity of moral norms.

The second thesis constituting the core of natural law moral theory is the claim that standards of morality are in some sense derived from, or entailed by, the nature of the world and the nature of human beings. St. Thomas Aquinas, for example, identifies the rational nature of human beings as that which defines moral law: “the rule and measure of human acts is the reason, which is the first principle of human acts” (Aquinas, ST I-II, Q.90, A.I). On this common view, since human beings are by nature rational beings, it is morally appropriate that they should behave in a way that conforms to their rational nature. Thus, Aquinas derives the moral law from the nature of human beings (thus, “natural law”).

But there is another kind of natural law theory having to do with the relationship of morality to law. According to natural law theory of law, there is no clean division between the notion of law and the notion of morality. Though there are different versions of natural law theory, all subscribe to the thesis that there are at least some laws that depend for their “authority” not on some pre-existing human convention, but on the logical relationship in which they stand to moral standards. Otherwise put, some norms are authoritative in virtue of their moral content, even when there is no convention that makes moral merit a criterion of legal validity. The idea that the concepts of law and morality intersect in some way is called the Overlap Thesis.

As an empirical matter, many natural law moral theorists are also natural law legal theorists, but the two theories, strictly speaking, are logically independent. One can deny natural law theory of law but hold a natural law theory of morality. John Austin, the most influential of the early legal positivists, for example, denied the Overlap Thesis but held something that resembles a natural law ethical theory.

Indeed, Austin explicitly endorsed the view that it is not necessarily true that the legal validity of a norm depends on whether its content conforms to morality. But while Austin thus denied the Overlap Thesis, he accepted an objectivist moral theory; indeed, Austin inherited his utilitarianism almost wholesale from J.S. Mill and Jeremy Bentham. Here it is worth noting that utilitarians sometimes seem to suggest that they derive their utilitarianism from certain facts about human nature; as Bentham once wrote, “nature has placed mankind under the governance of two sovereign masters, pain and pleasure. It is for them alone to point out what we ought to do, as well as to determine what we shall do. On the one hand the standard of right and wrong, on the other the chain of causes and effects, are fastened to their throne” (Bentham 1948, 1). Thus, a commitment to natural law theory of morality is consistent with the denial of natural law theory of law.

Conversely, one could, though this would be unusual, accept a natural law theory of law without holding a natural law theory of morality. One could, for example, hold that the conceptual point of law is, in part, to reproduce the demands of morality, but also hold a form of ethical subjectivism (or relativism). On this peculiar view, the conceptual point of law would be to enforce those standards that are morally valid in virtue of cultural consensus. For this reason, natural law theory of law is logically independent of natural law theory of morality. The remainder of this essay will be exclusively concerned with natural law theories of law.

2. Conceptual Naturalism

a. The Project of Conceptual Jurisprudence

The principal objective of conceptual (or analytic) jurisprudence has traditionally been to provide an account of what distinguishes law as a system of norms from other systems of norms, such as ethical norms. As John Austin describes the project, conceptual jurisprudence seeks “the essence or nature which is common to all laws that are properly so called” (Austin 1995, 11). Accordingly, the task of conceptual jurisprudence is to provide a set of necessary and sufficient conditions for the existence of law that distinguishes law from non-law in every possible world.

While this task is usually interpreted as an attempt to analyze the concepts of law and legal system, there is some confusion as to both the value and character of conceptual analysis in philosophy of law. As Brian Leiter (1998) points out, philosophy of law is one of the few philosophical disciplines that takes conceptual analysis as its principal concern; most other areas in philosophy have taken a naturalistic turn, incorporating the tools and methods of the sciences. To clarify the role of conceptual analysis in law, Brian Bix (1995) distinguishes a number of different purposes that can be served by conceptual claims: (1) to track linguistic usage; (2) to stipulate meanings; (3) to explain what is important or essential about a class of objects; and (4) to establish an evaluative test for the concept-word. Bix takes conceptual analysis in law to be primarily concerned with (3) and (4).

In any event, conceptual analysis of law remains an important, if controversial, project in contemporary legal theory. Conceptual theories of law have traditionally been characterized in terms of their posture towards the Overlap Thesis. Thus, conceptual theories of law have traditionally been divided into two main categories: those like natural law legal theory that affirm there is a conceptual relation between law and morality and those like legal positivism that deny such a relation.

b. Classical Natural Law Theory

All forms of natural law theory subscribe to the Overlap Thesis, which asserts that there is some kind of non-conventional relation between law and morality. According to this view, then, the notion of law cannot be fully articulated without some reference to moral notions. Though the Overlap Thesis may seem unambiguous, there are a number of different ways in which it can be interpreted.

The strongest construction of the Overlap Thesis forms the foundation for the classical naturalism of Aquinas and Blackstone. Aquinas distinguishes four kinds of law: (1) eternal law; (2) natural law; (3) human law; and (4) divine law. Eternal law is comprised of those laws that govern the nature of an eternal universe; as Susan Dimock (1999, 22) puts it, one can “think of eternal law as comprising all those scientific (physical, chemical, biological, psychological, etc.) ‘laws’ by which the universe is ordered.” Divine law is concerned with those standards that must be satisfied by a human being to achieve eternal salvation. One cannot discover divine law by natural reason alone; the precepts of divine law are disclosed only through divine revelation.

The natural law is comprised of those precepts of the eternal law that govern the behavior of beings possessing reason and free will. The first precept of the natural law, according to Aquinas, is the somewhat vacuous imperative to do good and avoid evil. Here it is worth noting that Aquinas holds a natural law theory of morality: what is good and evil, according to Aquinas, is derived from the rational nature of human beings. Good and evil are thus both objective and universal.

But Aquinas is also a natural law legal theorist. On his view, a human law (that is, that which is promulgated by human beings) is valid only insofar as its content conforms to the content of the natural law; as Aquinas puts the point: “[E]very human law has just so much of the nature of law as is derived from the law of nature. But if in any point it deflects from the law of nature, it is no longer a law but a perversion of law” (ST I-II, Q.95, A.II). To paraphrase Augustine’s famous remark, an unjust law is really no law at all.

The idea that a norm that does not conform to the natural law cannot be legally valid is the defining thesis of conceptual naturalism. As William Blackstone describes the thesis, “This law of nature, being co-eval with mankind and dictated by God himself, is of course superior in obligation to any other. It is binding over all the globe, in all countries, and at all times: no human laws are of any validity, if contrary to this; and such of them as are valid derive all their force, and all their authority, mediately or immediately, from this original” (1979, 41). In this passage, Blackstone articulates the two claims that constitute the theoretical core of conceptual naturalism: 1) there can be no legally valid standards that conflict with the natural law; and 2) all valid laws derive what force and authority they have from the natural law.

It should be noted that classical naturalism is consistent with allowing a substantial role to human beings in the manufacture of law. While the classical naturalist seems committed to the claim that the law necessarily incorporates all moral principles, this claim does not imply that the law is exhausted by the set of moral principles. There will still be coordination problems (e.g., which side of the road to drive on) that can be resolved in any number of ways consistent with the set of moral principles. Thus, the classical naturalist does not deny that human beings have considerable discretion in creating natural law. Rather she claims only that such discretion is necessarily limited by moral norms: legal norms that are promulgated by human beings are valid only if they are consistent with morality.

Critics of conceptual naturalism have raised a number of objections to this view. First, it has often been pointed out that, contra Augustine, unjust laws are all-too- frequently enforced against persons. As Austin petulantly put the point:

Now, to say that human laws which conflict with the Divine law are not binding, that is to say, are not laws, is to talk stark nonsense. The most pernicious laws, and therefore those which are most opposed to the will of God, have been and are continually enforced as laws by judicial tribunals. Suppose an act innocuous, or positively beneficial, be prohibited by the sovereign under the penalty of death; if I commit this act, I shall be tried and condemned, and if I object to the sentence, that it is contrary to the law of God, who has commanded that human lawgivers shall not prohibit acts which have no evil consequences, the Court of Justice will demonstrate the inconclusiveness of my reasoning by hanging me up, in pursuance of the law of which I have impugned the validity (Austin 1995, 158).

Of course, as Brian Bix (1999) points out, the argument does little work for Austin because it is always possible for a court to enforce a law against a person that does not satisfy Austin’s own theory of legal validity.

Another frequently expressed worry is that conceptual naturalism undermines the possibility of moral criticism of the law; inasmuch as conformity with natural law is a necessary condition for legal validity, all valid law is, by definition, morally just. Thus, on this line of reasoning, the legal validity of a norm necessarily entails its moral justice. As Jules Coleman and Jeffrey Murphy (1990, 18) put the point:

The important things [conceptual naturalism] supposedly allows us to do (e.g., morally evaluate the law and determine our moral obligations with respect to the law) are actually rendered more difficult by its collapse of the distinction between morality and law. If we really want to think about the law from the moral point of view, it may obscure the task if we see law and morality as essentially linked in some way. Moral criticism and reform of law may be aided by an initial moral skepticism about the law.

There are a couple of problems with this line of objection. First, conceptual naturalism does not foreclose criticism of those norms that are being enforced by a society as law. Insofar as it can plausibly be claimed that the content of a norm being enforced by society as law does not conform to the natural law, this is a legitimate ground of moral criticism: given that the norm being enforced by law is unjust, it follows, according to conceptual naturalism, that it is not legally valid. Thus, the state commits wrong by enforcing that norm against private citizens.

Second, and more importantly, this line of objection seeks to criticize a conceptual theory of law by pointing to its practical implications ñ a strategy that seems to commit a category mistake. Conceptual jurisprudence assumes the existence of a core of social practices (constituting law) that requires a conceptual explanation. The project motivating conceptual jurisprudence, then, is to articulate the concept of law in a way that accounts for these pre-existing social practices. A conceptual theory of law can legitimately be criticized for its failure to adequately account for the pre-existing data, as it were; but it cannot legitimately be criticized for either its normative quality or its practical implications.

A more interesting line of argument has recently been taken up by Brian Bix (1996). Following John Finnis (1980), Bix rejects the interpretation of Aquinas and Blackstone as conceptual naturalists, arguing instead that the claim that an unjust law is not a law should not be taken literally:

A more reasonable interpretation of statements like “an unjust law is no law at all” is that unjust laws are not laws “in the fullest sense.” As we might say of some professional, who had the necessary degrees and credentials, but seemed nonetheless to lack the necessary ability or judgment: “she’s no lawyer” or “he’s no doctor.” This only indicates that we do not think that the title in this case carries with it all the implications it usually does. Similarly, to say that an unjust law is “not really law” may only be to point out that it does not carry the same moral force or offer the same reasons for action as laws consistent with “higher law” (Bix 1996, 226).

Thus, Bix construes Aquinas and Blackstone as having views more similar to the neo- naturalism of John Finnis discussed below in Section III. Nevertheless, while a plausible case can be made in favor of Bix’s view, the long history of construing Aquinas and Blackstone as conceptual naturalists, along with its pedagogical value in developing other theories of law, ensures that this practice is likely, for better or worse, to continue indefinitely.

3. The Substantive Neo-Naturalism of John Finnis

John Finnis takes himself to be explicating and developing the views of Aquinas and Blackstone. Like Bix, Finnis believes that the naturalism of Aquinas and Blackstone should not be construed as a conceptual account of the existence conditions for law. According to Finnis, the classical naturalists were not concerned with giving a conceptual account of legal validity; rather they were concerned with explaining the moral force of law: “the principles of natural law explain the obligatory force (in the fullest sense of ‘obligation’) of positive laws, even when those laws cannot be deduced from those principles” (Finnis 1980, 23-24). On Finnis’s view of the Overlap Thesis, the essential function of law is to provide a justification for state coercion (a view he shares with Ronald Dworkin). Accordingly, an unjust law can be legally valid, but it cannot provide an adequate justification for use of the state coercive power and is hence not obligatory in the fullest sense; thus, an unjust law fails to realize the moral ideals implicit in the concept of law. An unjust law, on this view, is legally binding, but is not fully law.

Like classical naturalism, Finnis’s naturalism is both an ethical theory and a theory of law. Finnis distinguishes a number of equally valuable basic goods: life, health, knowledge, play, friendship, religion, and aesthetic experience. Each of these goods, according to Finnis, has intrinsic value in the sense that it should, given human nature, be valued for its own sake and not merely for the sake of some other good it can assist in bringing about. Moreover, each of these goods is universal in the sense that it governs all human cultures at all times. The point of moral principles, on this view, is to give ethical structure to the pursuit of these basic goods; moral principles enable us to select among competing goods and to define what a human being can permissibly do in pursuit of a basic good.

On Finnis’s view, the conceptual point of law is to facilitate the common good by providing authoritative rules that solve coordination problems that arise in connection with the common pursuit of these basic goods. Thus, Finnis sums up his theory of law as follows:

[T]he term ‘law’ … refer[s] primarily to rules made, in accordance with regulative legal rules, by a determinate and effective authority (itself identified and, standardly, constituted as an institution by legal rules) for a ‘complete’ community, and buttressed by sanctions in accordance with the rule-guided stipulations of adjudicative institutions, this ensemble of rules and institutions being directed to reasonably resolving any of the community’s co-ordination problems (and to ratifying, tolerating, regulating, or overriding co-ordination solutions from any other institutions or sources of norms) for the common good of that community (Finnis 1980, 276).

Again, it bears emphasizing that Finnis takes care to deny that there is any necessary moral test for legal validity: “one would simply be misunderstanding my conception of the nature and purpose of explanatory definitions of theoretical concepts if one supposed that my definition ‘ruled out as non-laws’ laws which failed to meet, or meet fully, one or other of the elements of the definition” (Finnis 1980, 278).

Nevertheless, Finnis believes that to the extent that a norm fails to satisfy these conditions, it likewise fails to fully manifest the nature of law and thereby fails to fully obligate the citizen-subject of the law. Unjust laws may obligate in a technical legal sense, on Finnis’s view, but they may fail to provide moral reasons for action of the sort that it is the point of legal authority to provide. Thus, Finnis argues that “a ruler’s use of authority is radically defective if he exploits his opportunities by making stipulations intended by him not for the common good but for his own or his friends’ or party’s or faction’s advantage, or out of malice against some person or group” (Finnis 1980, 352). For the ultimate basis of a ruler’s moral authority, on this view, “is the fact that he has the opportunity, and thus the responsibility, of furthering the common good by stipulating solutions to a community’s co- ordination problems” (Finnis 1980, 351).

Finnis’s theory is certainly more plausible as a theory of law than the traditional interpretation of classical naturalism, but such plausibility comes, for better or worse, at the expense of naturalism’s identity as a distinct theory of law. Indeed, it appears that Finnis’s natural law theory is compatible with naturalism’s historical adversary, legal positivism, inasmuch as Finnis’s view is compatible with a source-based theory of legal validity; laws that are technically valid in virtue of source but unjust do not, according to Finnis, fully obligate the citizen. Indeed, Finnis (1996) believes that Aquinas’s classical naturalism fully affirms the notion that human laws are “posited.”

4. The Procedural Naturalism of Lon L. Fuller

Like Finnis, Lon Fuller (1964) rejects the conceptual naturalist idea that there are necessary substantive moral constraints on the content of law. But Fuller, unlike Finnis, believes that law is necessarily subject to a procedural morality. On Fuller’s view, human activity is necessarily goal-oriented or purposive in the sense that people engage in a particular activity because it helps them to achieve some end. Insofar as human activity is essentially purposive, according to Fuller, particular human activities can be understood only in terms that make reference to their purposes and ends. Thus, since lawmaking is essentially purposive activity, it can be understood only in terms that explicitly acknowledge its essential values and purposes:

The only formula that might be called a definition of law offered in these writings is by now thoroughly familiar: law is the enterprise of subjecting human conduct to the governance of rules. Unlike most modern theories of law, this view treats law as an activity and regards a legal system as the product of a sustained purposive effort (Fuller 1964, 106).

To the extent that a definition of law can be given, then, it must include the idea that law’s essential function is to “achiev[e] [social] order through subjecting people’s conduct to the guidance of general rules by which they may themselves orient their behavior” (Fuller 1965, 657).

Fuller’s functionalist conception of law implies that nothing can count as law unless it is capable of performing law’s essential function of guiding behavior. And to be capable of performing this function, a system of rules must satisfy the following principles:

  • (P1) the rules must be expressed in general terms;
  • (P2) the rules must be publicly promulgated;
  • (P3) the rules must be prospective in effect;
  • (P4) the rules must be expressed in understandable terms;
  • (P5) the rules must be consistent with one another;
  • (P6) the rules must not require conduct beyond the powers of the affected parties;
  • (P7) the rules must not be changed so frequently that the subject cannot rely on them; and
  • (P8) the rules must be administered in a manner consistent with their wording.

On Fuller’s view, no system of rules that fails minimally to satisfy these principles of legality can achieve law’s essential purpose of achieving social order through the use of rules that guide behavior. A system of rules that fails to satisfy (P2) or (P4), for example, cannot guide behavior because people will not be able to determine what the rules require. Accordingly, Fuller concludes that his eight principles are “internal” to law in the sense that they are built into the existence conditions for law.

These internal principles constitute a morality, according to Fuller, because law necessarily has positive moral value in two respects: (1) law conduces to a state of social order and (2) does so by respecting human autonomy because rules guide behavior. Since no system of rules can achieve these morally valuable objectives without minimally complying with the principles of legality, it follows, on Fuller’s view, that they constitute a morality. Since these moral principles are built into the existence conditions for law, they are internal and hence represent a conceptual connection between law and morality. Thus, like the classical naturalists and unlike Finnis, Fuller subscribes to the strongest form of the Overlap Thesis, which makes him a conceptual naturalist.

Nevertheless, Fuller’s conceptual naturalism is fundamentally different from that of classical naturalism. First, Fuller rejects the classical naturalist view that there are necessary moral constraints on the content of law, holding instead that there are necessary moral constraints on the procedural mechanisms by which law is made and administered: “What I have called the internal morality of law is … a procedural version of natural law … [in the sense that it is] concerned, not with the substantive aims of legal rules, but with the ways in which a system of rules for governing human conduct must be constructed and administered if it is to be efficacious and at the same time remain what it purports to be” (Fuller 1964, 96- 97).

Second, Fuller identifies the conceptual connection between law and morality at a higher level of abstraction than the classical naturalists. The classical naturalists view morality as providing substantive constraints on the content of individual laws; an unjust norm, on this view, is conceptually disqualified from being legally valid. In contrast, Fuller views morality as providing a constraint on the existence of a legal system: “A total failure in any one of these eight directions does not simply result in a bad system of law; it results in something that is not properly called a legal system at all” (Fuller 1964, 39).

Fuller’s procedural naturalism is vulnerable to a number of objections. H.L.A. Hart, for example, denies Fuller’s claim that the principles of legality constitute an internal morality; according to Hart, Fuller confuses the notions of morality and efficacy:

[T]he author’s insistence on classifying these principles of legality as a “morality” is a source of confusion both for him and his readers…. [T]he crucial objection to the designation of these principles of good legal craftsmanship as morality, in spite of the qualification “inner,” is that it perpetrates a confusion between two notions that it is vital to hold apart: the notions of purposive activity and morality. Poisoning is no doubt a purposive activity, and reflections on its purpose may show that it has its internal principles. (“Avoid poisons however lethal if they cause the victim to vomit”….) But to call these principles of the poisoner’s art “the morality of poisoning” would simply blur the distinction between the notion of efficiency for a purpose and those final judgments about activities and purposes with which morality in its various forms is concerned (Hart 1965, 1285-86).

On Hart’s view, all actions, including virtuous acts like lawmaking and impermissible acts like poisoning, have their own internal standards of efficacy. But insofar as such standards of efficacy conflict with morality, as they do in the case of poisoning, it follows that they are distinct from moral standards. Thus, while Hart concedes that something like Fuller’s eight principles are built into the existence conditions for law, he concludes they do not constitute a conceptual connection between law and morality.

Unfortunately, Hart overlooks the fact that most of Fuller’s eight principles double as moral ideals of fairness. For example, public promulgation in understandable terms may be a necessary condition for efficacy, but it is also a moral ideal; it is morally objectionable for a state to enforce rules that have not been publicly promulgated in terms reasonably calculated to give notice of what is required. Similarly, we take it for granted that it is wrong for a state to enact retroactive rules, inconsistent rules, and rules that require what is impossible. Poisoning may have its internal standards of efficacy, but such standards are distinguishable from the principles of legality in that they conflict with moral ideals.

Nevertheless, Fuller’s principles operate internally, not as moral ideals, but merely as principles of efficacy. As Fuller would likely acknowledge, the existence of a legal system is consistent with considerable divergence from the principles of legality. Legal standards, for example, are necessarily promulgated in general terms that inevitably give rise to problems of vagueness. And officials all too often fail to administer the laws in a fair and even-handed manner even in the best of legal systems. These divergences may always be prima facie objectionable, but they are inconsistent with a legal system only when they render a legal system incapable of performing its essential function of guiding behavior. Insofar as these principles are built into the existence conditions for law, it is because they operate as efficacy conditions and not because they function as moral ideals.

5. Ronald Dworkin’s “Third Theory”

Ronald Dworkin’s so-called third theory of law is best understood as a response to legal positivism, which is essentially constituted by three theoretical commitments: the Social Fact Thesis, the Conventionality Thesis, and the Separability Thesis. The Social Fact Thesis asserts it is a necessary truth that legal validity is ultimately a function of certain kinds of social facts; the idea here is that what ultimately explains the validity of a law is the presence of certain social facts, especially formal promulgation by a legislature.

The Conventionality Thesis emphasizes law’s conventional nature, claiming that the social facts giving rise to legal validity are authoritative in virtue of a social convention. On this view, the criteria that determine whether or not any given norm counts as a legal norm are binding because of an implicit or explicit agreement among officials. Thus, for example, the U.S. Constitution is authoritative in virtue of the conventional fact that it was formally ratified by all fifty states.

The Separability Thesis, at the most general level, simply denies naturalism’s Overlap Thesis; according to the Separability Thesis, there is no conceptual overlap between the notions of law and morality. As Hart more narrowly construes it, the Separability Thesis is “just the simple contention that it is in no sense a necessary truth that laws reproduce or satisfy certain demands of morality, though in fact they have often done so” (Hart 1994, 185-186).

Dworkin rejects positivism’s Social Fact Thesis on the ground that there are some legal standards the authority of which cannot be explained in terms of social facts. In deciding hard cases, for example, judges often invoke moral principles that Dworkin believes do not derive their legal authority from the social criteria of legality contained in a rule of recognition (Dworkin 1977, p. 40).

In Riggs v. Palmer, for example, the court considered the question of whether a murderer could take under the will of his victim. At the time the case was decided, neither the statutes nor the case law governing wills expressly prohibited a murderer from taking under his victim’s will. Despite this, the court declined to award the defendant his gift under the will on the ground that it would be wrong to allow him to profit from such a grievous wrong. On Dworkin’s view, the court decided the case by citing “the principle that no man may profit from his own wrong as a background standard against which to read the statute of wills and in this way justified a new interpretation of that statute” (Dworkin 1977, 29).

On Dworkin’s view, the Riggs court was not just reaching beyond the law to extralegal standards when it considered this principle. For the Riggs judges would “rightfully” have been criticized had they failed to consider this principle; if it were merely an extralegal standard, there would be no rightful grounds to criticize a failure to consider it (Dworkin 1977, 35). Accordingly, Dworkin concludes that the best explanation for the propriety of such criticism is that principles are part of the law.

Further, Dworkin maintains that the legal authority of standards like the Riggs principle cannot derive from promulgation in accordance with purely formal requirements: “[e]ven though principles draw support from the official acts of legal institutions, they do not have a simple or direct enough connection with these acts to frame that connection in terms of criteria specified by some ultimate master rule of recognition” (Dworkin 1977, 41).

On Dworkin’s view, the legal authority of the Riggs principle can be explained wholly in terms of its content. The Riggs principle was binding, in part, because it is a requirement of fundamental fairness that figures into the best moral justification for a society’s legal practices considered as a whole. A moral principle is legally authoritative, according to Dworkin, insofar as it maximally conduces to the best moral justification for a society’s legal practices considered as a whole.

Dworkin believes that a legal principle maximally contributes to such a justification if and only if it satisfies two conditions: (1) the principle coheres with existing legal materials; and (2) the principle is the most morally attractive standard that satisfies (1). The correct legal principle is the one that makes the law the moral best it can be. Accordingly, on Dworkin’s view, adjudication is and should be interpretive:

[J]udges should decide hard cases by interpreting the political structure of their community in the following, perhaps special way: by trying to find the best justification they can find, in principles of political morality, for the structure as a whole, from the most profound constitutional rules and arrangements to the details of, for example, the private law of tort or contract (Dworkin 1982, 165).

There are, thus, two elements of a successful interpretation. First, since an interpretation is successful insofar as it justifies the particular practices of a particular society, the interpretation must fit with those practices in the sense that it coheres with existing legal materials defining the practices. Second, since an interpretation provides a moral justification for those practices, it must present them in the best possible moral light.

For this reason, Dworkin argues that a judge should strive to interpret a case in roughly the following way:

A thoughtful judge might establish for himself, for example, a rough “threshold” of fit which any interpretation of data must meet in order to be “acceptable” on the dimension of fit, and then suppose that if more than one interpretation of some part of the law meets this threshold, the choice among these should be made, not through further and more precise comparisons between the two along that dimension, but by choosing the interpretation which is “substantively” better, that is, which better promotes the political ideals he thinks correct (Dworkin 1982, 171).

As Dworkin conceives it, then, the judge must approach judicial decision-making as something that resembles an exercise in moral philosophy. Thus, for example, the judge must decide cases on the basis of those moral principles that “figure[] in the soundest theory of law that can be provided as a justification for the explicit substantive and institutional rules of the jurisdiction in question” (Dworkin 1977, 66).

And this is a process, according to Dworkin, that “must carry the lawyer very deep into political and moral theory.” Indeed, in later writings, Dworkin goes so far as to claim, somewhat implausibly, that “any judge’s opinion is itself a piece of legal philosophy, even when the philosophy is hidden and the visible argument is dominated by citation and lists of facts” (Dworkin 1986, 90).

Dworkin believes his theory of judicial obligation is a consequence of what he calls the Rights Thesis, according to which judicial decisions always enforce pre-existing rights: “even when no settled rule disposes of the case, one party may nevertheless have a right to win. It remains the judge’s duty, even in hard cases, to discover what the rights of the parties are, not to invent new rights retrospectively” (Dworkin 1977, 81).

In “Hard Cases,” Dworkin distinguishes between two kinds of legal argument. Arguments of policy “justify a political decision by showing that the decision advances or protects some collective goal of the community as a whole” (Dworkin 1977, 82). In contrast, arguments of principle “justify a political decision by showing that the decision respects or secures some individual or group right” (Dworkin 1977, 82).

On Dworkin’s view, while the legislature may legitimately enact laws that are justified by arguments of policy, courts may not pursue such arguments in deciding cases. For a consequentialist argument of policy can never provide an adequate justification for deciding in favor of one party’s claim of right and against another party’s claim of right. An appeal to a pre-existing right, according to Dworkin, can ultimately be justified only by an argument of principle. Thus, insofar as judicial decisions necessarily adjudicate claims of right, they must ultimately be based on the moral principles that figure into the best justification of the legal practices considered as a whole.

Notice that Dworkin’s views on legal principles and judicial obligation are inconsistent with all three of legal positivism’s core commitments. Each contradicts the Conventionality Thesis insofar as judges are bound to interpret posited law in light of unposited moral principles. Each contradicts the Social Fact Thesis because these moral principles count as part of a community’s law regardless of whether they have been formally promulgated. Most importantly, Dworkin’s view contradicts the Separability Thesis in that it seems to imply that some norms are necessarily valid in virtue of their moral content. It is his denial of the Separability Thesis that places Dworkin in the naturalist camp.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Thomas Aquinas, On Law, Morality and Politics (Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Co., 1988)
  • John Austin, Lectures on Jurisprudence and the Philosophy of Positive Law (St. Clair Shores, MI: Scholarly Press, 1977)
  • John Austin, The Province of Jurisprudence Determined (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995)
  • Jeremy Bentham, A Fragment of Government (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1988)
  • Jeremy Bentham, Of Laws In General (London: Athlone Press, 1970) Jeremy Bentham, The Principles of Morals and Legislation (New York: Hafner Press, 1948)
  • Brian Bix, “On Description and Legal Reasoning,” in Linda Meyer (ed.), Rules and Reasoning (Oxford: Hart Publishing, 1999)
  • Brian Bix, Jurisprudence: Theory and Context (Boulder, CO: Westview Press, 1996) Brian Bix, “Natural Law Theory,” in Dennis M. Patterson (ed.), A Companion to Philosophy of Law and Legal Theory (Cambridge: Blackwell Publishing Co., 1996)
  • William Blackstone, Commentaries on the Law of England (Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1979)
  • Jules L. Coleman, “On the Relationship Between Law and Morality,” Ratio Juris, vol. 2, no. 1 (1989), 66-78
  • Jules L. Coleman, “Negative and Positive Positivism,” 11 Journal of Legal Studies 139 (1982)
  • Jules L. Coleman and Jeffrie Murphy, Philosophy of Law (Boulder, CO: Westview Press, 1990)
  • Ronald M. Dworkin, Law’s Empire (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1986)
  • Ronald M. Dworkin, Taking Rights Seriously (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1977)
  • John Finnis, Natural Law and Natural Rights (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1980)
  • John Finnis, “The Truth in Legal Positivism,” in Robert P. George, The Autonomy of Law (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1996), 195-214
  • Lon L. Fuller, The Morality of Law, Revised Edition (New Haven: Yale University Press, 1964)
  • Lon L. Fuller, “A Reply to Professors Cohen and Dworkin”, 10 Villanova Law Review 655 (1965), 657. Lon L. Fuller, “Positivism and Fidelity to Law–A Reply to Professor Hart,” 71 Harvard Law Review 630 (1958)
  • Klaus F¸þer, “Farewell to ‘Legal Positivism’: The Separation Thesis Unravelling,” in George, The Autonomy of Law, 119-162
  • Robert P. George, “Natural Law and Positive Law,” in George, The Autonomy of Law, 321-334
  • Robert P. George, Natural Law Theory: Contemporary Essays (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1992)
  • H.L.A. Hart, The Concept of Law, Second Edition (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1994)
  • H.L.A. Hart, “Book Review of The Morality of Law” 78 Harvard Law Review 1281 (1965) H.L.A. Hart, Essays on Bentham (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1982) H.L.A. Hart, “Positivism and the Separation of Law and Morals,” 71 Harvard Law Review 593 (1958)
  • Kenneth Einar Himma, “Positivism, Naturalism, and the Obligation to Obey Law,” Southern Journal of Philosophy, vol. 36, no. 2 (Summer 1999)
  • Kenneth Einar Himma, “Functionalism and Legal Theory: The Hart/Fuller Debate Revisited,” De Philosophia, vol. 14, no. 2 (Fall/Winter 1998)
  • J.L. Mackie, “The Third Theory of Law,” Philosophy & Public Affairs, Vol. 7, No. 1 (Fall 1977)
  • Michael Moore, “Law as a Functional Kind,” in George, Natural Law Theory, 188- 242
  • Joseph Raz, The Authority of Law: Essays on Law and Morality (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1979)
  • Joseph Raz, “Authority, Law and Morality,” The Monist, vol. 68, 295-324 Joseph Raz, “Legal Principles and the Limits of Law,” 81 Yale Law Review 823 (1972)
  • Geoffrey Sayre-McCord, “The Many Moral Realisms,” in Sayre-McCord (ed.), Essays on Moral Realism (Ithica: Cornell University Press, 1988)

Author Information

Kenneth Einar Himma
Seattle Pacific University
U. S. A.

Origen of Alexandria (185—254 C.E.)

OrigenOrigen of Alexandria, one of the greatest Christian theologians,  is famous for composing the seminal work of Christian Neoplatonism, his treatise On First Principles. Origen lived through a turbulent period of the Christian Church, when persecution was wide-spread and little or no doctrinal consensus existed among the various regional churches. In this environment, Gnosticism flourished, and Origen was the first truly philosophical thinker to turn his hand not only to a refutation of Gnosticism, but to offer an alternative Christian system that was more rigorous and philosophically respectable than the mythological speculations of the various Gnostic sects. Origen was also an astute critic of the pagan philosophy of his era, yet he also learned much from it, and adapted its most useful and edifying teachings to a grand elucidation of the Christian faith. Porphyry (the illustrious student of Plotinus), though a tenacious adversary of Christianity, nevertheless grudgingly admitted Origen’s mastery of the Greek philosophical tradition. Although Origen did go on to compose numerous biblical commentaries and sermons, his importance for the history of philosophy rests mainly on two works, the systematic treatise On First Principles, and his response to the pagan philosopher Celsus’ attack on Christianity, the treatise Against Celsus. Since the purpose of this article is to introduce students and interested laypersons to the philosophy of Origen, it will be necessary to focus mainly on the treatise On First Principles, which is the most systematic and philosophical of Origen’s numerous writings. In this work Origen establishes his main doctrines, including that of the Holy Trinity (based upon standard Middle Platonic triadic emanation schemas); the pre-existence and fall of souls; multiple ages and transmigration of souls; and the eventual restoration of all souls to a state of dynamic perfection in proximity to the godhead. He is unique among Platonists of his era for introducing history into his cosmological and metaphysical speculations, and his insistence on the absolute freedom of each and every soul, thereby denying the fatalism that so often found its way into the more esoteric teachings of the various philosophical and mystery schools of his day.

Table of Contents

  1. Origen’s Life and Times
  2. His Intellectual Heritage: Pagan, Jewish and Christian
  3. The Philosophical System of Origen
    1. The Trinity
    2. Souls and their Fall
    3. Multiple Ages, Metempsychosis, and the Restoration of All
  4. Important Themes in Origen’s Philosophy
    1. Free Will
    2. Education and History
    3. Eternal Motion of Souls
  5. Origen’s Importance in the History of Philosophy
    1. Hellenistic Philosophy
    2. Christianity
  6. Concluding Summary
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Origen’s Life and Times

Origen was, according to Eusebius, “not quite seventeen” when Septimius Severus’ persecution of the Christians began “in the tenth year of [his] reign,” (Ecclesiastical History; tr. Williamson, p. 179) which gives the approximate date of Origen’s birth as 185/6 C.E. He died around the reign of Gallus, which places his death in 254/5 C.E. Origen lived during a turbulent period of the Roman Empire, when the barbarian invasions were sweeping across Europe, threatening the stability of the Roman Empire. His was also a time of periodic persecution against Christians, notably during the reigns of the Emperors Severus, Maximin, and Decius, so that Origen’s life began and ended with persecution.

His family was devoutly Christian, and likely highly educated; for his father, who died a martyr, made sure that Origen was schooled not only in biblical studies, but in Hellenistic education as well. Eusebius (Ecclesiastical History, tr. Williamson, p. 182) tells us that Origen was only seventeen when he took over as Headmaster (didaskalos) of the Christian Catechetical School at Alexandria. He became interested in Greek philosophy quite early in his life, studying for a while under Ammonius Saccas (the teacher of Plotinus) and amassing a large collection of philosophical texts. It is probably around this time that he began composing On First Principles. However, as he became ever more devoted to the Christian faith, he sold his library, abandoning, for a time, any contact with pagan Greek wisdom, though he would eventually return to secular studies (Greek philosophy), from which he derived no small measure of inspiration, as Porphyry (recorded in Eusebius) makes quite clear, as he continued with his ever more sophisticated elucidation of biblical texts.

2. His Intellectual Heritage: Pagan, Jewish and Christian

Origen’s debt to Holy Scripture is obvious; he quotes the bible at great length, often drawing together seemingly disparate passages to make a profound theological point. Yet his thought is all the while informed by his Greek philosophical education, specifically that of the Middle Platonic tradition, notably the works of the Jewish Platonist Philo of Alexandria and the Neopythagorean philosopher Numenius of Apamea (fl. 150-176 C.E.). Origen shares with Philo an insistence on the free will of the person, a freedom that is direct evidence of humanity’s likeness to God – for, like God’s Being, human existence is free from all necessity. From Numenius, Origen likely adopted the conception of a “second god” proceeding from a first, ineffable being called the One, “First God,” or Father. Numenius referred to this “second god” as Demiurge or craftsman, and taught that he created the cosmos by imitating the intellectual content of the “First God.” Origen applied this basic notion to his doctrine of Christ, whom he also called Demiurge (Commentary on John 1.22), and went on to describe Christ as a reflection of the Truth of the Father, stating that compared to human beings Christ is Truth, but compared to the Father He is falsehood (Jerome, Epistle 92, quoting Origen; see also On First Principles 1.2.6).

Another extremely important part of Origen’s intellectual heritage is the concept of apokatastasis or “restoration of all things.” This term first appears, as a philosophical concept, in the writings of the Stoics, whose materialistic pantheism led them to identify Zeus with the pure, “craftsmanly” fire pervading and constituting the cosmos. According to the Stoics, this fire expands and contracts according to a fixed cycle. They called the contraction a “conflagration” (ekpurôsis), destroying the cosmos, yet only temporarily. This contraction was described as Zeus returning to his own thoughts, to contemplate the eternal perfection of his mind/cosmos (the material cosmos being the expression of his mind, or Logos). The expansion would occur when Zeus once again expressed his mind in the creation of the material cosmos; this re-creation or reconstitution of the cosmos is what the Stoics called apokatastasis. Some Stoics argued that since Zeus is perfect mind, then every reconstitution of the cosmos will resemble identically the one that preceded it. This Stoic doctrine was to have an immense influence on the development of the so-called esoteric traditions in the Hellenistic era, notably the Hermetic school, Gnosticism, and astrology, with all of which Origen was, in varying degrees, familiar.

In Origen’s time, Christianity as a religion had not yet developed a system of theology as a basis of orthodoxy; therefore, in addition to a wide variety of opinions regarding the faith, there were also various sects, each claiming to possess the truth of the Christian faith. Foremost among these sects was the group of schools loosely labelled ‘gnostic.’ The Valentinian school (founded by Valentinus, an outstanding teacher and philosopher who was at one point a candidate for bishop of Rome) was the most philosophically accomplished of the Christian Gnostic sects. In his Commentary on John, Origen refutes the doctrines of a Valentinian Gnostic named Heracleon, who had earlier written a commentary on the same Gospel. While Origen’s opposition to Gnosticism precluded any doctrinal influence, he saw in Gnosticism the value of a system, for it was precisely by virtue of their elaborate and self-consistent systems that the Gnostics were successful in gaining adherents. Since there were no non-Gnostic Christian theological systems in his day, it was up to Origen to formulate one. This was the program of his treatise On First Principles.

3. The Philosophical System of Origen

Origen was the first systematic theologian and philosopher of the Christian Church. Earlier Christian intellectuals had confined themselves to apologetic and moralizing works; notable among such writers is Clement of Alexandria (d. 215 C.E.), who, like Origen, found much of value in Hellenic philosophy. Before proceeding with an examination of Origen’s system, it must be noted that scholars are divided over the question of whether or not his On First Principles contains a system. Henri Crouzel (1989), for example, has argued that the presence of contradictory statements in certain portions of the treatise, as well as in other texts, is proof against the claim that Origen was presenting a system. Hans Jonas (1974), on the other hand, recognized a clear system in On First Principles and gave a convincing elucidation of such. The reason for this scholarly divide is mostly due to the lack of a precise definition of ‘system’ and ‘systematic’. If one approaches Origen’s text expecting a carefully worked-out system of philosophy in the manner of a Kant or a Hegel, one will be disappointed. However, if one reads the text with an eye for prominent themes and inner consistency of such themes with one another, a system does emerge. As John Dillon has pointed out, Origen succeeded in luring away several students of the renowned Platonic teacher Ammonius Saccas to study with him, and, Dillon convincingly observes, this would not have been possible if Origen did not have some system to offer (Dillon, in Kannengiesser, Petersen, ed. 1988, p. 216, and footnote). It must also be pointed out that the text of On First Principles that we possess is not complete. Origen’s original Greek is preserved only in fragments, the remainder of the text is extant only in a Latin translation by Rufinus, who was a defender of Origen against posthumous charges of heresy. While Rufinus’ translation is, as far as we can tell, faithful in most respects, there is ample evidence that he softened certain potentially troublesome passages in an ill-guided attempt to redeem his beloved teacher. When reading Origen’s treatise, then, one would do well to keep this in mind should one stumble across seemingly contradictory passages, for one has no way of knowing what the original Greek might have said.

a. The Trinity

Origen begins his treatise On First Principles by establishing, in typical Platonic fashion, a divine hierarchical triad; but instead of calling these principles by typical Platonic terms like monad, dyad, and world-soul, he calls them “Father,” “Christ,” and “Holy Spirit,” though he does describe these principles using Platonic language. The first of these principles, the Father, is a perfect unity, complete unto Himself, and without body – a purely spiritual mind. Since God the Father is, for Origen, “personal and active,” it follows that there existed with Him, always, an entity upon which to exercise His intellectual activity. This entity is Christ the Son, the Logos, or Wisdom (Sophia), of God, the first emanation of the Father, corresponding to Numenius’ “second god,” as we have seen above (section 2). The third and last principle of the divine triad is the Holy Spirit, who “proceeds from the Son and is related to Him as the Son is related to the Father” (A. Tripolitis 1978, p. 94). Here is Origen explaining the status of the Holy Spirit, in a passage preserved in the original Greek:

The God and Father, who holds the universe together, is superior to every being that exists, for he imparts to each one from his own existence that which each one is; the Son, being less than the Father, is superior to rational creatures alone (for he is second to the Father); the Holy Spirit is still less, and dwells within the saints alone. So that in this way the power of the Father is greater than that of the Son and of the Holy Spirit, and that of the Son is more than that of the Holy Spirit, and in turn the power of the Holy Spirit exceeds that of every other holy being (Fragment 9 [Koetschau] tr. Butterworth 1966, pp. 33-34, and footnote).

This graded hierarchy reveals an allotment of power to the second and third members of the Trinity: the Father’s power is universal, but the Son’s corresponds only to rational creatures, while the Spirit’s power corresponds strictly to the “saints” or those who have achieved salvation. Such a structure of divine influence on the created realm is found much later in the system of the Neoplatonic philosopher Proclus (see J. Dillon, in G. Vesey, ed. 1989).

b. Souls and their Fall

According to Origen, God’s first creation was a collectivity of rational beings which he calls logika. “Although Origen speaks of the logika as being created, they were not created in time. Creation with respect to them means that they had a beginning, but not a temporal one” (Tripolitis 1978, p. 94). Further, Origen explains that the number of these rational beings is necessarily limited, since an infinite creation would be incomprehensible, and unworthy of God. These souls were originally created in close proximity to God, with the intention that they should explore the divine mysteries in a state of endless contemplation. They grew weary of this intense contemplation, however, and lapsed, falling away from God and into an existence on their own terms, apart from the divine presence and the wisdom to be found there. This fall was not, it must be understood, the result of any inherent imperfection in the creatures of God, rather, it was the result of a misuse of the greatest gift of God to His creation: freedom. The only rational creature who escaped the fall and remained with God is the “soul of Christ” (Origen, On First Principles 2.6.5; Tripolitis 1978, p. 96). This individual soul is indicative of the intended function of all souls, i.e., to reveal the divine mystery in unique ways, insofar as the meaning of this mystery is deposited within them, as theandric (God-human) potentiality, to be drawn out and revealed through co-operation with God (On First Principles 2.9.2-8). As Origen explains, the soul of Christ was no different from that of any of the souls that fell away from God, for Christ’s soul possessed the same potential for communion with God as that of all other souls. What distinguished the soul of Christ from all others – and what preserved Him from falling away – was His supreme act of free choice, to remain immersed in the divinity.

What are now souls (psukhê) began as minds, and through boredom or distraction grew “cold” (psukhesthai) as they moved away from the “divine warmth” (On First Principles 2.8.3). Thus departing from God, they came to be clothed in bodies, at first of “a fine ethereal and invisible nature,” but later, as souls fell further away from God, their bodies changed “from a fine, ethereal and invisible body to a body of a coarser and more solid state. The purity and subtleness of the body with which a soul is enveloped depends upon the moral development and perfection of the soul to which it is joined. Origen states that there are varying degrees of subtleness even among the celestial and spiritual bodies” (Tripolitis 1978, p. 106). When a soul achieves salvation, according to Origen, it ceases being a soul, and returns to a state of pure “mind” or understanding. However, due to the fall, now “no rational spirit can ever exist without a body” (Tripolitis 1978, p. 114), but the bodies of redeemed souls are “spiritual bodies,” made of the purest fire (see A. Scott 1991, Chapter 9).

c. Multiple Ages, Metempsychosis, and the Restoration of All

Origen did not believe in the eternal suffering of sinners in hell. For him, all souls, including the devil himself, will eventually achieve salvation, even if it takes innumerable ages to do so; for Origen believed that God’s love is so powerful as to soften even the hardest heart, and that the human intellect – being the image of God – will never freely choose oblivion over proximity to God, the font of Wisdom Himself. Certain critics of Origen have claimed that this teaching undermines his otherwise firm insistence on free will, for, these critics argue, the souls must maintin the freedom to ultimately reject or accept God, or else free will becomes a mere illusion. What escapes these critics is the fact that Origen’s conception of free will is not our own; he considered freedom in the Platonic sense of the ability to choose the good. Since evil is not the polar opposite of good, but rather simply the absence of good – and thus having no real existence – then to ‘choose’ evil is not to make a conscious decision, but to act in ignorance of the measure of all rational decision, i.e., the good. Origen was unable to conceive of a God who would create souls that were capable of dissolving into the oblivion of evil (non-being) for all eternity. Therefore, he reasoned that a single lifetime is not enough for a soul to achieve salvation, for certain souls require more education or ‘healing’ than others. So he developed his doctrine of multiple ages, in which souls would be re-born, to experience the educative powers of God once again, with a view to ultimate salvation. This doctrine, of course, implies some form of transmigration of souls or metempsychosis. Yet Origen’s version of metempsychosis was not the same as that of the Pythagoreans, for example, who taught that the basest of souls will eventually become incarnated as animals. For Origen, some sort of continuity between the present body, and the body in the age to come, was maintained (Jerome, Epistle to Avitus 7, quoting Origen; see also Commentary on Matthew 11.17). Origen did not, like many of his contemporaries, degrade the body to the status of an unwanted encrustation imprisoning the soul; for him, the body is a necessary principle of limitation, providing each soul with a unique identity. This is an important point for an understanding of Origen’s epistemology, which is based upon the idea that God educates each soul according to its inherent abilities, and that the abilities of each soul will determine the manner of its knowledge. We may say, then, that the uniqueness of the soul’s body is an image of its uniqueness of mind. This is the first inkling of the development of the concept of the person and personality in the history of Western thought.

The restoration of all beings (apokatastasis) is the most important concept in Origen’s philosophy, and the touchstone by which he judges all other theories. His concept of universal restoration is based on equally strong Scriptural and Hellenistic philosophical grounds and is not original, as it can be traced back to Heraclitus, who stated that “the beginning and end are common” (Fragment B 103, tr. J. Barnes 1987, p. 115). Considering that Origen’s later opponents based their charges of heresy largely on this aspect of his teaching, it is surprising to see how well-grounded in scripture this doctrine really is. Origen’s main biblical proof-text is 1 Corinthians 15:25-28, especially verse 28, which speaks of the time “when all things shall be subdued unto him [Christ], then shall the Son also himself be subject unto him that put all things under him, that God may be all in all” (KJV, my emphasis). This scriptural notion of God being “all in all” (panta en pasin) is a strong theological support for his theory of apokatastasis. There are, of course, numerous other passages in scripture that contradict this notion, but we must remember that Origen’s strength resided in his philosophical ability to use reason and dialectic in support of humane doctrines, not in the ability to use scripture in support of dogmatical and anti-humanistic arguments. Origen imagined salvation not in terms of the saved rejoicing in heaven and the damned suffering in hell, but as a reunion of all souls with God.

4. Important Themes in Origen’s Philosophy

While Origen’s lengthy treatise On First Principles contains numerous discussions of a wide variety of issues relevant to the Christianity of his day, as well as to broader philosophical concerns, certain key themes do emerge that are of universal and timeless value for philosophy. These themes are: free will; the educational value of history; and the infinity and eternal motion (becoming) of human beings.

a. Free Will

Origen’s conception of freedom, as discussed above, was not the same as modern conceptions. This is not to say that his conception was wrong, of course. For Origen recognized freedom only in reason, in rationality, which is precisely the ability to recognize and embrace the good, which is for him God. Irrationality is ignorance, the absence of a conception of the good. The ignorant person cannot be held responsible for his ignorance, except to the extent that he has been lazy, not applying himself to the cultivation of reason. The moral dimension of this conception of freedom is that ignorance is not to be punished, but remedied through education. Punishment, understood in the punative sense, is of no avail and will even lead to deeper ignorance and sin, as the punished soul grows resentful, not understanding why he is being punished. Origen firmly believed that the knowledge of the good (God) is itself enough to remove all taint of sin and ignorance from souls. A ‘freedom’ to embrace evil (the absence of good) would have made no sense to Origen who, as a Platonist, identified evil with enslavement and goodness with freedom. The soul who has seen the good, he argued, will not fall into ignorance again, for the good is inspiring and worthy of eternal contemplation (see Commentary on Romans 5.10.15).

b. Education and History

Origen may rightfully be called the first philosopher of history, for, like Hegel, he understood history as a process involving the participation of persons in grand events leading to an eventual culmination or ‘end of history’. Unlike mainstream Christian eschatology, Origen did not understand the end of history as the final stage of a grand revelation of God, but rather as the culmination of a human-divine (co-operative) process, in which the image and likeness of God (humanity) is re-united with its source and model, God Himself (see Against Celsus 4.7; On First Principles 2.11.5, 2.11.7; Tripolitis 1978, p. 111). This is accomplished through education of souls who, having fallen away from God, are now sundered from the divine presence and require a gradual re-initiation into the mysteries of God. Such a reunion must not be accomplished by force, for God will never, Origen insists, undermine the free will of His creatures; rather, God will, over the course of numerous ages if need be, educate souls little by little, leading them eventually, by virtue of their own growing responsiveness, back to Himself, where they will glory in the uncovering of the infinite mysteries of the eternal godhead (On First Principles 2.11.6-7).

c. Eternal Motion of Souls

A common motif in Platonism during, before, and after Origen’s time is salvific stasis, or the idea that the soul will achieve complete rest and staticity when it finally ascends to a contemplation of the good. We notice this idea early on in Plato, who speaks in the Republic (517c-d, 519c-e) of a state of pure contemplation from which the philosopher is only wrenched by force or persuasion. In Origen’s own time, Plotinus developed his notion of an ‘about-face’ (epistrophê) of the soul resulting in an instant union of the soul with its divine principle, understood as an idealized, changeless form of contemplation, allowing for no dynamism or personal development (see Enneads 4.3.32, 4.8.4, for example). Influenced indirectly by Plotinus, and more directly by later Neoplatonists (both Christian and pagan), the Christian theologian St. Maximus the Confessor elaborated a systematic philosophical theology culminating in an eschatology in which the unique human person was replaced by the overwhelming, transcendent presence of God (see Chapters on Knowledge 2.88). Origen managed to maintain the transcendentality of God on the one hand, and the dynamic persistence of souls in being on the other. He did this by defining souls not by virtue of their intellectual content (or, in the Plotinian sense, for example, by virtue of their ‘prior’ or higher, constitutive principle) but rather by their ability to engage in a finite manner with the infinite God. This engagement is constitutive of the soul’s existence, and guarantees its uniqueness. Each soul engages uniquely with God in contemplating divine mysteries according to its innate ability, and this engagement persists for all eternity, for the mysteries of the godhead are inexhaustible, as is the enthusiastic application of the souls’ intellectual ability.

5. Origen’s Importance in the History of Philosophy

Throughout this article, Origen’s importance has largely been linked to his melding of philosophical insights with elucidations of various aspects of the Christian fatih. Yet his importance for Hellenistic philosophy is marked, and though not quite as pervasive as his influence on Christian thought, is nevertheless worth a few brief remarks. His role in the formation of Christian doctrine is more prominent, yet, because of its problematical nature, will be treated of only briefly.

a. Hellenistic Philosophy

Origen’s debt to Hellenistic (Greek) philosophy is quite obvious; his influence on the development of later pagan philosophy is – at least from the perspective of most contemporary scholarship – rather less obvious, but it is there. His trinitarian doctrine, for example, consisted of a gradation of influence beginning with the Father, whose influence was of the most general, universal kind, binding together all things; the influence of the Son extended strictly to sentient beings; the Holy Spirit’s influence extended only to the ‘elect’ or saints who had already achieved salvation (Dillon, in D.J. O’Meara, ed., 1982, p. 20; see also On First Principles 1.3.5). This conception found later expression in Proclus’ Elements of Theology (Proposition 57), where he elucidates this formulation: “Every cause both operates prior to its consequent and gives rise to a greater number of posterior terms” (tr. Dodds). For Origen, the pre-existent souls, through their fall, gave rise to a history over which both the Father and the Son came to preside, while the Holy Spirit only enters into human reality to effect a salvific re-orientation toward God that is already the result of an achieved history. The Holy Spirit, then, may be understood as the final cause, the preparatory causes of which are the Father and Son, the mutual begetters of history. A bit later, the pagan philosopher Iamblichus reversed this Origenian notion, claiming that the influence of the divine became stronger and more concentrated the further it penetrated into created reality, extending in its pure power even to stones and plants. In this sense, the Holy Spirit, limited as it is (according to Origen) to interaction with the saints alone, gives way to the universal power of the Father, which extends to the furthest reaches of reality. Iamblichus saw no reason to divide the divinity into persons or emanative effects; rather, he saw the divinity as operative, in varying degrees, at every level of reality. At the lowest level, however, this power is most effective, imparting power to plants and stones, and providing support for the theurgical practice advocated by Iamblichus (Olympiodorus, Commentary on Alcibiades I, 115A; Psellus, Chaldaean Expositions 1153a10-11; Dillon, ed. O’Meara 1982, p. 23).

b. Christianity

Origen’s ideas, most notably those in the treatise On First Principles, gave rise to a movement in the Christian Church known as Origenism. From the third through the sixth centuries this movement was quite influential, especially among the monastics, and was given articulate – if excessively codified form – by the theologian Evagrius Ponticus (c. 345-400 C.E.). It is to be noted that the spirit of philosophical inquiry exemplified by Origen was largely absent from the movement bearing his name. A far more creative use of Origen’s concepts and themes was made by Gregory of Nyssa (d. ca. 386 C.E.), who adopted Origen’s doctrine of apokatastasis or “restoration of all things.” Gregory was also responsible for articulating more clearly than did Origen the notion that redeemed souls will remain in a state of dynamic intellectual activity (see Gregory of Nyssa, Catechetical Oration, esp. Chapters 26 and 35). After the posthumous condemnation of Origen (and Origenism) in the fifth century, it became increasingly difficult for mainstream theologians to make use of his work. Pseudo-Dionysius the Areopagite (5th or 6th Century C.E.) drew upon Neoplatonic philosophy, especially Proclus (411-485 C.E.) and Iamblichus (ca. 240-325 C.E.), and though he followed in Origen’s footsteps in this use of pagan wisdom, he never mentioned his predecessor by name. In the seventh century, Maximus the Confessor (ca. 580-662), who may be called the last great Christian Neoplatonist, set about revising Origen’s doctrines in a manner more acceptable to the theological climate of the early Byzantine Church. Maximus changed the historicism of Origen into a more introspective, personal struggle to attain the divine vision through asceticism and prayer, the result being a total subsumption of the person by the godhead. This was Maximus’ vision of salvation: the replacement of the ego by the divine presence (see L. Thunberg 1985, p. 89; also Maximus, Chapters on Knowledge 2.88). While there is much that may be called brilliant and even inspiring in Maximus’ philosophical theology, this loss of the centrality of the person – as unique, unrepeatable entity – in the cosmic process of salvation led to the loss of a sense of co-operation of humanity and God, and sapped Christianity of the intellectual vigor that it displayed in the period leading up to the establishment of a theocratical Byzantine state.

Thankfully, Origen’s legacy was not lost. He was an inspiration to the Renaissance Humanists and, more recently, to certain Existentialist Christian theologians, notably Nicolas Berdyaev (1874-1948) whose insistence on the absolute autonomy and nobility of the person in the face of all objectifying reality is an echo across the ages of the humanism of Origen. Berdyaev himself admits Origen’s influence on his thought (as well as that of Gregory of Nyssa) and insists that the doctrine of hell and the eternal suffering of sinners is not compatible with authentic Christianity. He also places a great importance on history, and even broaches a modern, de-mythologized conception of metempsychosis in terms of a universal, shared history of which all persons are a part, regardless of their temporal specificity. History, according to Berdyaev (and in this he follows Origen) binds all of humanity together. No soul will be saved in isolation; all must be saved together, or not be saved at all. Berdyaev wrote numerous works, a few of the most important are Slavery and Freedom (Eng. tr. 1944), The Beginning and the End(Eng. tr.1952), and Truth and Revelation (Eng. tr. 1962).

6. Concluding Summary

Origen was an innovator in an era when innovation, for Christians, was a luxury ill-afforded. He drew upon pagan philosophy in an effort to elucidate the Christian faith in a manner acceptable to intellectuals, and he succeeded in converting many gifted pagan students of philosophy to his faith. He was also a great humanist, who believed that all creatures will eventually achieve salvation, including the devil himself. Origen did not embrace the dualism of Gnosticism, nor that of the more primitive expressions of the Christian faith still extant in his day. Rather, he took Christianity to a higher level, finding in it a key to the perfection of the intellect or mind, which is what all souls are in their pure form. The restoration of all souls to a purely intellectual existence was Origen’s faith, and his philosophy was based upon such a faith. In this, he is an heir to Socrates and Plato, but he also brought a new conception into philosophy – that of the creative aspect of the soul, as realized in history, the culmination of which is salvation, after which follows an eternal delving into the deep mysteries of God.

7. References and Further Reading


Selected Works by Origen in English Translation

  • Origen, Against Celsus, tr. F. Crombie (The Ante-Nicene Fathers 4; Michigan: Eerdmans 1979, reprint).
  • Origen, On First Principles, tr. G.W. Butterworth (New York: Harper and Row 1966).
  • Origen, Commentary on John, tr. A. Menzies (The Ante-Nicene Fathers 10; Michigan: Eerdmans 1978, reprint).
  • Origen, Commentary on Matthew, tr. J. Patrick (The Ante-Nicene Fathers 10; Michigan: Eerdmans 1978, reprint).
  • Origen, Commentary on the Epistle to the Romans (Books 1-5), tr. T.P. Scheck (Washington, D.C.: The Catholic University of America Press 2001).
  • Origen, Commentary on the Epistle to the Romans (Books 6-10), tr. T.P. Scheck (Washington, D.C.: The Catholic University of America Press 2002).

Other Sources

  • Berdyaev, Nicholas, The Beginning and the End, tr. R.M. French (New York: Harper and Brothers 1952).
  • Berdyaev, Nicholas, Slavery and Freedom, tr. R.M. French (New York: Charles Scribner’s Sons 1944).
  • Berdyaev, Nicholas, Truth and Revelation, tr. R.M. French (New York: Collier Books 1962).
  • Chadwick, H., Early Christian Thought and the Classical Tradition: Studies in Justin, Clement, and Origen (New York: Oxford University Press 1966).
  • Crouzel, H., Origen: The Life and Thought of the First Great Theologian, tr. A.S. Worrall (T.&T. Clark Ltd. 1989).
  • Dillon, J.M., The Middle Platonists(Ithaca: Cornell University Press 1977).
  • Hardy, E.R., Christology of the Later Fathers (Philadelphia: The Westminster Press 1954).
  • Jonas, H., “Origen’s Metaphysics of Free Will, Fall, and Salvation: A ‘Divine Comedy’ of the Universe,” in Philosophical Essays: From Ancient Creed to Technological Man (Englewood Cliffs, NJ: PrenticeHall 1974).
  • Kannengiesser, C., Petersen, W.L., eds., Origen of Alexandria: His World and His Legacy (Indiana: University of Notre Dame Press 1988).
  • Kelly, J.N.D., Early Christian Doctrines (New York: Harper and Row 1978).
  • Louth, A., Maximus the Confessor (New York: Routledge 1996).
  • Luibheid, C., Rorem, P., tr., Pseudo-Dionysius: The Complete Works (Mahwah, NJ: Paulist Press 1987).
  • Meyendorff, J., Christ in Eastern Christian Thought (Crestwood: St. Vladimir’s Seminary Press 1975).
  • Murphy, F.X., “Evagrius Ponticus and Origenism,” in R. Hanson and H. Crouzel, ed., Origeniana Tertia (1981).
  • O’Meara, D.J., ed., Neoplatonism and Christian Thought (New York: State University of New York Press 1982).
  • Pelikan, J., Christianity and Classical Culture: The Metamorphosis of Natural Theology in the Christian Encounter with Hellenism (New Haven: Yale University Press 1993).
  • Pelikan, J., The Christian Tradition: A History of the Development of Doctrine, vol. 2: “The Spirit of Eastern Christendom (600-1700) (Chicago: University of Chicago Press 1974).
  • Scott, A., Origen and the Life of the Stars: A History of an Idea (Oxford: Clarendon Press 1991).
  • Shaw, G., Theurgy and the Soul: The Neoplatonism of Iamblichus (University Park: Pennsylvania State University Press 1995).
  • Siorvanes, L., Proclus: Neo-Platonic Philosophy and Science (New Haven: Yale University Press 1996).
  • Stevenson, J., ed. A New Eusebius: Documents Illustrative of the History of the Church to A.D. 337 (London: S.P.C.K. 1957).
  • Tatakis, B., Byzantine Philosophy, tr. N.J. Moutafakis (Indianapolis: Hackett 2003).
  • Thunberg, L., Man and the Cosmos: The Vision of St. Maximus the Confessor (Crestwood, NY: St. Vladimir’s Seminary Press 1985).
  • Trigg, J.W., Origen: The Bible and Philosophy in the Third-century Church (Atlanta: John Knox Press 1983).
  • Tripolitis, A., The Doctrine of the Soul in the Thought of Plotinus and Origen (New York: Libra 1978).
  • Werner, M., The Formation of Christian Dogma, tr. S.G.F. Brandon ( Harper and Brothers 1957).
  • Williamson, G.A., tr., Eusebius, The History of the Church (New York: Penguin Books 1965).
  • Zeller, E., Outlines of the History of Greek Philosophy, tr. L.R. Palmer (New York: Meridian Books 1955).

Author Information

Edward Moore
St. Elias School of Orthodox Theology
U. S. A.


Neo-platonism (or Neoplatonism) is a modern term used to designate the period of Platonic philosophy beginning with the work of Plotinus and ending with the closing of the Platonic Academy by the Emperor Justinian in 529 C.E. This brand of Platonism, which is often described as ‘mystical’ or religious in nature, developed outside the mainstream of Academic Platonism. The origins of Neoplatonism can be traced back to the era of Hellenistic syncretism which spawned such movements and schools of thought as Gnosticism and the Hermetic tradition. A major factor in this syncretism, and one which had an immense influence on the development of Platonic thought, was the introduction of the Jewish Scriptures into Greek intellectual circles via the translation known as the Septuagint. The encounter between the creation narrative of Genesis and the cosmology of Plato’s Timaeus set in motion a long tradition of cosmological theorizing that finally culminated in the grand schema of Plotinus’ Enneads. Plotinus’ two major successors, Porphyry and Iamblichus, each developed, in their own way, certain isolated aspects of Plotinus’ thought, but neither of them developed a rigorous philosophy to match that of their master. It was Proclus who, shortly before the closing of the Academy, bequeathed a systematic Platonic philosophy upon the world that in certain ways approached the sophistication of Plotinus. Finally, in the work of the so-called Pseudo-Dionysius, we find a grand synthesis of Platonic philosophy and Christian theology that was to exercise an immense influence on mediaeval mysticism and Renaissance Humanism.

Table of Contents

  1. What is Neoplatonism?
  2. Plotinian Neoplatonism
    1. Contemplation and Creation
    2. Nature and Personality
    3. Salvation and the Cosmic Process
      1. Plotinus’ Last Words
    4. The Achievement of Plotinus
      1. The Plotinian Synthesis
  3. Porphyry and Iamblichus
    1. The Nature of the Soul
      1. The (re)turn to Astrology
    2. The Quest for Transcendence
      1. Theurgy and the Distrust of Dialectic
  4. Proclus and Pseudo-Dionysius
    1. Being — Becoming — Being
    2. The God Beyond Being
  5. Appendix: The Renaissance Platonists
  6. References and Further Reading

1. What is Neoplatonism?

The term ‘Neoplatonism’ is a modern construction. Plotinus, who is often considered the ‘founder’ of Neoplatonism, would not have considered himself a “new” Platonist in any sense, but simply an expositor of the doctrines of Plato. That this required him to formulate an entirely new philosophical system would not have been viewed by him as a problem, for it was, in his eyes, precisely what the Platonic doctrine required. In a sense, this is true, for as early as the Old Academy we find Plato’s successors struggling with the proper interpretation of his thought, and arriving at strikingly different conclusions. Also, in the Hellenistic era, certain Platonic ideas were taken up by thinkers of various loyalties — Jewish, Gnostic, Christian — and worked up into new forms of expression that varied quite considerably from what Plato actually wrote in his Dialogues. Should this lead us to the conclusion that these thinkers were any less ‘loyal’ to Plato than were the members of the Academy (in its various forms throughout the centuries preceding Plotinus)? No; for the multiple and often contradictory uses made of Platonic ideas is a testament to the universality of Plato’s thought — that is, its ability to admit of a wide variety of interpretations and applications. In this sense, Neo-Platonism may be said to have begun immediately after Plato’s death, when new approaches to his philosophy were being broached. Indeed, we already see a hint, in the doctrines of Xenocrates (the second head of the Old Academy) of a type of salvation theory involving the unification of the two parts of the human soul — the “Olympian” or heavenly, and the “Titanic” or earthly (Dillon 1977, p. 27). If we accept Frederick Copleston’s description of Neoplatonism as “the intellectualist reply to the … yearning for personal salvation” (Copleston 1962, p. 216) we can already locate the beginning of this reply as far back as the Old Academy, and Neoplatonism would then not have begun with Plotinus. However, it is not clear that Xenocrates’ idea of salvation involved the individual; it is quite possible that he was referring to a unified human nature in an abstract sense. In any case, the early Hermetic-Gnostic tradition is certainly to an extent Platonic, and later Gnosticism and Christian Logos theology markedly so. If an intellectual reply to a general yearning for personal salvation is what characterizes Neoplatonism, then the highly intellectual Gnostics and Christians of the Late Hellenistic era must be given the title of Neoplatonists. However, if we are to be rigorous and define Neoplatonism as the synthesis of various more or less ‘Platonistic’ ideas into a grand expression of Platonic philosophy, then Plotinus must be considered the founder of Neoplatonism. Yet we must not forget that these Platonizing Christian, Gnostic, Jewish, and other ‘pagan’ thinkers provided the necessary speculative material to make this synthesis possible.

2. Plotinian Neoplatonism

The great third century thinker and ‘founder’ of Neoplatonism, Plotinus, is responsible for the grand synthesis of progressive Christian and Gnostic ideas with the traditional Platonic philosophy. He answered the challenge of accounting for the emergence of a seemingly inferior and flawed cosmos from the perfect mind of the divinity by declaring outright that all objective existence is but the external self-expression of an inherently contemplative deity known as the One (to hen), or the Good (ta kalon). Plotinus compares the expression of the superior godhead with the self-expression of the individual soul, which proceeds from the perfect conception of a Form (eidos), to the always flawed expression of this Form in the manner of a materially derived ‘personality’ that risks succumbing to the demands of divisive discursivity, and so becomes something less than divine. This diminution of the divine essence in temporality is but a necessary moment of the complete expression of the One. By elevating the experience of the individual soul to the status of an actualization of a divine Form, Plotinus succeeded, also, in preserving, if not the autonomy, at least the dignity and ontological necessity of personality. The Cosmos, according to Plotinus, is not a created order, planned by a deity on whom we can pass the charge of begetting evil; for the Cosmos is the self-expression of the Soul, which corresponds, roughly, to Philo’s logos prophorikos, the logos endiathetos of which is the Intelligence (nous). Rather, the Cosmos, in Plotinian terms, is to be understood as the concrete result or ‘product’ of the Soul’s experience of its own Mind (nous). Ideally, this concrete expression should serve the Soul as a reference-point for its own self-conscious existence; however, the Soul all too easily falls into the error of valuing the expression over the principle (arkhê), which is the contemplation of the divine Forms. This error gives rise to evil, which is the purely subjective relation of the Soul (now divided) to the manifold and concrete forms of its expressive act. When the Soul, in the form of individual existents, becomes thus preoccupied with its experience, Nature comes into being, and the Cosmos takes on concrete form as the locus of personality.

a. Contemplation and Creation

Hearkening back, whether consciously or not, to the doctrine of Speusippus (Plato’s successor in the Academy) that the One is utterly transcendent and “beyond being,” and that the Dyad is the true first principle (Dillon 1977, p. 12), Plotinus declares that the One is “alone with itself” and ineffable (cf. Enneads VI.9.6 and V.2.1). The One does not act to produce a cosmos or a spiritual order, but simply generates from itself, effortlessly, a power (dunamis) which is at once the Intellect (nous) and the object of contemplation (theôria) of this Intellect. While Plotinus suggests that the One subsists by thinking itself as itself, the Intellect subsists through thinking itself as other, and therefore becomes divided within itself: this act of division within the Intellect is the production of Being, which is the very principle of expression or discursivity (Ennead V.1.7). For this reason, the Intellect stands as Plotinus’ sole First Principle. At this point, the thinking or contemplation of the Intellect is divided up and ordered into thoughts, each of them subsisting in and for themselves, as autonomous reflections of the dunamis of the One. These are the Forms (eidê), and out of their inert unity there arises the Soul, whose task it is to think these Forms discursively and creatively, and to thereby produce or create a concrete, living expression of the divine Intellect. This activity of the Soul results in the production of numerous individual souls: living actualizations of the possibilities inherent in the Forms. Whereas the Intellect became divided within itself through contemplation, the Soul becomes divided outside of itself, through action (which is still contemplation, according to Plotinus, albeit the lowest type; cf. Ennead III.8.4), and this division constitutes the Cosmos, which is the expressive or creative act of the Soul, also referred to as Nature. When the individual soul reflects upon Nature as its own act, this soul is capable of attaining insight (gnôsis) into the essence of Intellect; however, when the soul views nature as something objective and external — that is, as something to be experienced or undergone, while forgetting that the soul itself is the creator of this Nature — evil and suffering ensue. Let us now examine the manner in which Plotinus explains Nature as the locus of personality.

b. Nature and Personality

Contemplation, at the level of the Soul, is for Plotinus a two-way street. The Soul both contemplates, passively, the Intellect, and reflects upon its own contemplative act by producing Nature and the Cosmos. The individual souls that become immersed in Nature, as moments of the Soul’s eternal act, will, ideally, gain a complete knowledge of the Soul in its unity, and even of the Intellect, by reflecting upon the concrete results of the Soul’s act — that is, upon the externalized, sensible entities that comprise the physical Cosmos. This reflection, if carried by the individual soul with a memory of its provenance always in the foreground, will lead to a just governing of the physical Cosmos, which will make of it a perfect material image of the Intellectual Cosmos, i.e., the realm of the Forms (cf. Enneads IV.3.7 and IV.8.6). However, things don’t always turn out so well, for individual souls often “go lower than is needful … in order to light the lower regions, but it is not good for them to go so far” (Ennead IV.3.17, tr. O’Brien 1964). For when the soul extends itself ever farther into the indeterminacy of materiality, it gradually loses memory of its divine origin, and comes to identify itself more and more with its surroundings — that is to say: the soul identifies itself with the results of the Soul’s act, and forgets that it is, as part of this Soul, itself an agent of the act. This is tantamount to a relinquishing, by the soul, of its divine nature. When the soul has thus abandoned itself, it begins to accrue many alien encrustations, if you will, that make of it something less than divine. These encrustations are the ‘accidents’ (in the Aristotelian sense) of personality. And yet the soul is never completely lost, for, as Plotinus insists, the soul need simply “think upon essential being” in order to return to itself, and continue to exist authentically as a governor of the Cosmos (Ennead IV.8.4-6). The memory of the personality that this wandering soul possessed must be forgotten in order for it to return completely to its divine nature; for if it were remembered, we would have to say, contradictorily, that the soul holds a memory of what occurred during its state of forgetfulness! So in a sense, Plotinus holds that individual personalities are not maintained at the level of Soul. However, if we understand personality as more than just a particular attitude attached to a concrete mode of existence, and rather view it as the sum total of experiences reflected upon in intellect, then souls most certainly retain their personalities, even at the highest level, for they persist as thoughts within the divine Mind (cp. Ennead IV.8.5). The personality that one acquires in action (the lowest type of contemplation) is indeed forgotten and dissolved, but the ‘personality’ or persistence in intellect that one achieves through virtuous acts most definitely endures (Ennead IV.3.32).

c. Salvation and the Cosmic Process

Plotinus, like his older contemporary, the Christian philosopher Origen of Alexandria, views the descent of the soul into the material realm as a necessary moment in the unfolding of the divine Intellect, or God. For this reason, the descent itself is not an evil, for it is a reflection of God’s essence. Both Origen and Plotinus place the blame for experiencing this descent as an evil squarely upon the individual soul. Of course, these thinkers held, respectively, quite different views as to why and how the soul experiences the descent as an evil; but they held one thing in common: that the rational soul will naturally choose the Good, and that any failure to do so is the result of forgetfulness or acquired ignorance. But whence this failure? Origen gave what, to Plotinus’ mind, must have been a quite unsatisfactory answer: that souls pre-existed as spiritual beings, and when they desired to create or ‘beget’ independently of God, they all fell into error, and languished there until the coming of Logos Incarnate. This view has more than a little Gnostic flavor to it, which would have sat ill with Plotinus, who was a great opponent of Gnosticism. The fall of the soul Plotinus refers, quite simply, to the tension between pure contemplation and divisive action — a tension that constitutes the natural mode of existence of the soul (cf. Ennead IV.8.6-7). Plotinus tells us that a thought is only completed or fully comprehended after it has been expressed, for only then can the thought be said to have passed from potentiality to actuality (Ennead IV.3.30). The question of whether Plotinus places more value on the potential or the actual is really of no consequence, for in the Plotinian plêrôma every potentiality generates an activity, and every activity becomes itself a potential for new activity (cf. Ennead III.8.8); and since the One, which is the goal or object of desire of all existents, is neither potentiality nor actuality, but “beyond being” (epekeina ousias), it is impossible to say whether the striving of existents, in Plotinus’ schema, will result in full and complete actualization, or in a repose of potentiality that will make them like their source. “Likeness to God as far as possible,” for Plotinus, is really likeness to oneself — authentic existence. Plotinus leaves it up to the individual to determine what this means.

i. Plotinus’ Last Words

In his biography of Plotinus, Porphyry records the last words of his teacher to his students as follows: “Strive to bring back the god in yourselves to the God in the All” (Porphyry, Life of Plotinus 2, my translation). After uttering these words, Plotinus, one of the greatest philosophers the world has ever known, passed away. The simplicity of this final statement seems to be at odds with the intellectual rigors of Plotinus’ treatises, which challenge — and more often than not vanquish — just about every prominent philosophical view of the era. But this is only if we take this remark in a mystical or ecstatic religious sense. Plotinus demanded the utmost level of intellectual clarity in dealing with the problem of humankind’s relation to the highest principle of existence. Striving for or desiring salvation was not, for Plotinus, an excuse for simply abandoning oneself to faith or prayer or unreflective religious rituals; rather, salvation was to be achieved through the practice of philosophical investigation, of dialectic. The fact that Plotinus, at the end of his life, had arrived at this very simple formulation, serves to show that his dialectical quest was successful. In his last treatise, “On the Primal Good” (Ennead I.7), Plotinus is able to assert, in the same breath, that both life and death are good. He says this because life is the moment in which the soul expresses itself and revels in the autonomy of the creative act. However, this life, since it is characterized by action, eventually leads to exhaustion, and the desire, not for autonomous action, but for reposeful contemplation — of a fulfillment that is purely intellectual and eternal. Death is the relief of this exhaustion, and the return to a state of contemplative repose. Is this return to the Intellect a return to potentiality? It is hard to say. Perhaps it is a synthesis of potentiality and actuality: the moment at which the soul is both one and many, both human and divine. This would constitute Plotinian salvation — the fulfillment of the exhortation of the dying sage.

d. The Achievement of Plotinus

In the last analysis, what stands as the most important and impressive accomplishment of Plotinus is the manner in which he synthesized the pure, ‘semi-mythical’ expression of Plato with the logical rigors of the Peripatetic and Stoic schools, yet without losing sight of philosophy’s most important task: of rendering the human experience in intelligible and analyzable terms. That Plotinus’ thought had to take the ‘detour’ through such wildly mystical and speculative paths as Gnosticism and Christian salvation theology is only proof of his clear-sightedness, thoroughness, and admirable humanism. For all of his dialectical difficulties and perambulations, Plotinus’ sole concern is with the well-being (eudaimonia) of the human soul. This is, of course, to be understood as an intellectual, as opposed to a merely physical or even emotional well-being, for Plotinus was not concerned with the temporary or the temporal. The striving of the human mind for a mode of existence more suited to its intuited potential than the ephemeral possibilities of this material realm, while admittedly a striving born of temporality, is nonetheless directed toward atemporal and divine perfection. This is a striving or desire rendered all the more poignant and worthy of philosophy precisely because it is born in the depths of existential angst, and not in the primitive ecstasies of unreflective ritual. As the last true representative of the Greek philosophical spirit, Plotinus is Apollonian, not Dionysian. His concern is with the intellectual beautification of the human soul, and for this reason his notion of salvation does not, like Origen’s, imply an eternal state of objective contemplation of the divinity — for Plotinus, the separation between human and god breaks down, so that when the perfected soul contemplates itself, it is also contemplating the Supreme.

i. The Plotinian Synthesis

Plotinus was faced with the task of defending the true Platonic philosophy, as he understood it, against the inroads being made, in his time, most of all by Gnostics, but also by orthodox Christianity. Instead of launching an all-out attack on these new ideas, Plotinus took what was best from them, in his eyes, and brought these ideas into concert with his own brand of Platonism. For this reason, we are sometimes surprised to see Plotinus, in one treatise, speaking of the cosmos as a realm of forgetfulness and error, while in another, speaking of the cosmos as the most perfect expression of the godhead. Once we realize the extent to which certain Gnostic sects went in order to brand this world as a product of an evil and malignant Demiurge, to whom we owe absolutely no allegiance, it becomes clear that Plotinus was simply trying to temper the extreme form of an idea which he himself shared, though in a less radical sense. The feeling of being thrown into a hostile and alien world is a philosophically valid position from which to begin a critique and investigation of human existence; indeed, modern existentialist philosophers have often started from this same premise. However, Plotinus realized that it is not the nature of the human soul to simply escape from a realm of active engagement with external reality (the cosmos) to a passive receptance of divine form (within the plêrôma). The Soul, as Plotinus understands it, is an essentially creative being, and one which understands existence on its own terms. One of the beauties of Plotinus’ system is that everything he says concerning the nature of the Cosmos (spiritual and physical) can equally be held of the Soul. Now while it would be false to charge Plotinus with solipsism (or even narcissism, as one prominent commentator has done; cf. Julia Kristeva in Hadot 1993, p. 11), it would be correct to say that the entire Cosmos is an analogue of the experience of the Soul, which results in the attainment of full self-consciousness. The form of Plotinus’ system is the very form by which the Soul naturally comes to know itself in relation to its acts; and the expression of the Soul will always, therefore, be a philosophical expression. When we speak of the Plotinian synthesis, then, what we are speaking of is a natural dialectic of the Soul, which takes its own expressions into account, no matter how faulty or incomplete they may appear in retrospect, and weaves them into a cosmic tapestry of noetic images.

3. Porphyry and Iamblichus

Porphyry of Tyre (ca. 233-305 CE) is the most famous pupil of Plotinus. In addition to writing an introductory summary of his master’s theories (the treatise entitled Launching-Points to the Realm of Mind), Porphyry also composed the famous Isagoge, an introduction to the Categories of Aristotle, which came to exercise an immense influence on Mediaeval Scholasticism. The extent of Porphyry’s investigative interests exceeded that of his teacher, and his so-called “scientific” works, which survive to this day, include a treatise on music (On Prosody), and two studies of the astronomical and astrological theories of Claudius Ptolemy (ca. 70-140 CE), On the Harmonics, and an Introduction to The Astronomy of Ptolemy. He wrote biographies of Pythagoras and Plotinus, and edited and compiled the latter’s essays into six books, each containing nine treatises, giving them the title Enneads. Unlike Plotinus, Porphyry was interested primarily in the practical aspect of salvific striving, and the manner in which the soul could most effectively bring about its transference to ever higher realms of existence. This led Porphyry to develop a doctrine of ascent to the Intellect by way of the exercise of virtue (aretê) in the form of ‘good works’. This doctrine may owe its genesis to Porphyry’s supposed early adherence to Christianity, as attested by the historian Socrates, and suggested by St. Augustine (cf. Copleston 1962, p. 218). If Porphyry had, at some point, been a Christian, this would account for his belief in the soul’s objective relation to the divine Mind — an idea shared by Origen, whom Porphyry knew as a youth (cf. Eusebius, The History of the Church, p. 195) — and would explain his quite un-Plotinian belief in a gradual progress toward perfection, as opposed to the ‘instant salvation’ proposed by Plotinus (cf. Ennead IV.8.4).

Iamblichus of Apamea (d. ca. 330 CE) was a student of Porphyry. He departed from his teacher on more than a few points, most notably in his insistence on demoting Plotinus’ One (which Porphyry left unscathed, as it were) to the level of kosmos noêtos, which according to Iamblichus generates the intellectual realm (kosmos noêros). In this regard, Iamblichus can be said to have either severely misunderstood, or neglected to even attempt to understand, Plotinus on the important doctrine of contemplation (see above). This view led Iamblichus to posit a Supreme One even higher than the One of Plotinus, which generates the Intellectual Cosmos, and yet remains beyond all predication and determinacy. Iamblichus also made a tripartite division of Soul, positing a cosmic or All-Soul, and two lesser souls, corresponding to the rational and irrational faculties, respectively. This somewhat gratuitous skewing of the Plotinian noetic realm also led Iamblichus to posit an array of intermediate spiritual beings between the lower souls and the intelligible realm — daemons, the souls of heroes, and angels of all sorts. By placing so much distance between the earthly soul and the intelligible realm, Iamblichus made it difficult for the would-be philosopher to gain an intuitive knowledge of the higher Soul, although he insisted that everyone possesses such knowledge, coupled with an innate desire for the Good. In place of the vivid dialectic of Plotinus, Iamblichus established the practice of theurgy (theourgia), which he insists does not draw the gods down to man, but rather renders humankind, “who through generation are born subject to passion, pure and unchangeable” (On the Mysteries I.12.42; in Fowden 1986, p. 133). Whereas “likeness to God” had meant, for Plotinus, a recollection and perfection of one’s own divine nature (which is, in the last analysis, identical to nous; cf. Ennead III.4), for Iamblichus the relation of humankind to the divine is one of subordinate to superior, and so the pagan religious piety that Plotinus had scorned — “Let the gods come to me, and not I to them,” he had once said (cf. Porphyry, Life of Plotinus 10) — returns to philosophy with a vengeance. Iamblichus is best known for his lengthy treatise On the Mysteries. Like Porphyry, he also wrote a biography of Pythagoras.

a. The Nature of the Soul

In his introduction to the philosophy of Plotinus, entitled Launching-Points to the Realm of Mind, Porphyry remarks that the inclination of the incorporeal Soul toward corporeality “constitutes a second nature [the irrational soul], which unites with the body” (Launching-Points 18 [1]). This remark is supposedly a commentary on Ennead IV.2, where Plotinus discusses the relation of the individual soul to the All-Soul. While it is true that Plotinus often speaks of the individual soul as being independent of the highest Soul, he does this for illustrative purposes, in order to show how far into forgetfulness the soul that has become enamored of its act may fall. Yet Plotinus insists time and again that the individual soul and the All-Soul are one (cf. esp. Ennead IV.1), and that Nature is the Soul’s expressive act (see above). Irrationality does not constitute, for Plotinus, a “second nature,” but is merely a flawed exercise of rationality — that is, doxa untempered by epistêmê — on the part of the individual soul. Furthermore, the individual soul, which comes to unite with corporeality, governs and controls the body, making possible discursive knowledge as well as sense-perception. Uncontrolled pathos is what Plotinus calls irrationality; the soul brings aisthêsis (perceptive judgment) to corporeality, and so prevents it from sinking into irrational passivity. So what led Porphyry to make such an interpretative error, if error it was? It is quite possible that Porphyry had arrived at his own conclusions about the Soul, and tried to square his own theory with what Plotinus actually taught. One clue to the reason for the ‘misunderstanding’ may possibly lie in Porphyry’s early involvement with Christianity. While Porphyry himself never tells us that he had been a Christian, Augustine speaks of him as if he were an apostate, and the historian Socrates states outright that Porphyry had once been of the Christian faith, telling us that he left the fold in disgust after being assaulted by a rowdy band of Christians in Caesarea (Copleston 1962, p. 218). In any case, it is certain that he was acquainted with Plotinus’ older contemporary, the Christian Origen, and that he had been exposed to Christian doctrine. Indeed, his own spirited attack on Christianity (“Fifteen Arguments Against the Christians,” now preserved only in fragments) shows him to have possessed a wide knowledge of Holy Scripture, remarkable for a ‘pagan’ philosopher of that era. Porphyry’s exposure to Christian doctrine, then, would have left him with a view of salvation quite different from that of Plotinus, who seems never to have paid Christianity much mind. The best evidence we have for this explanation is Porphyry’s own theory of salvation — and it is remarkably similar to what we find in Origen! Porphyry’s salvation theory is dependent, like Origen’s, on a notion of the soul’s objective relation to God, and its consequent striving, not to actualize its own divine potentiality, but to attain a level of virtue that makes it capable of partaking fully of the divine essence. This is accomplished through the exercise of virtue, which sets the soul on a gradual course of progress toward the highest Good. Beginning with simple ‘practical virtues’ (politikai arêtai) the soul gradually rises to higher levels, eventually attaining what Porphyry calls the paradeigmatikai arêtai or ‘exemplary virtues’ which make of the soul a living expression of the divine Mind (cf. Porphyry, Letter to Marcella 29). Note that Porphyry stops the soul’s ascent at nous, and presumably holds that the ‘saved’ soul will eternally contemplate the infinite power of the One. If Porphyry’s concern had been with the preservation of personality, then this explanation makes some sense. However, it is more likely that the true reason for Porphyry’s rejection of the radically ‘hubristic’ theory (at least to pietistic pagans) of the nature of the individual soul held by Plotinus was a result of his intention to restore dignity to the traditional religion of the Greeks (which had come under attack not only by Plotinus, but by Christians as well). Evidence of such a program resides in Porphyry’s allegorical interpretations of Homer and traditional cultic practice, as well as his possibly apologetic work on Philosophy from Oracles (now lost). Compared to Plotinus, then, Porphyry was quite the conservative, concerned as he was with maintaining the ancient view of humankind’s relatively humble position in the cosmic hierarchy, over against Plotinus’ view that the soul is a god, owing little more than a passing nod to its ‘noble brethren’ in the heavens.

i. The (re)turn to Astrology

One of the results of Porphyry’s conservative position toward traditional religious practice and belief was the ‘return’ to the doctrine that the stars and planets are capable of affecting and ordering human life. Plotinus argued that since the individual soul is one with the All-Soul, it is in essence a co-creator of the Cosmos, and therefore not really subject to the laws governing the Cosmos — for the soul is the source and agent of those laws! Therefore, a belief in astrology was, for Plotinus, absurd, since if the soul turned to beings dependent upon its own law — i.e., the stars and planets — in order to know itself, then it would only end up knowing aspects of its own act, and would never return to itself in full self-consciousness. Furthermore, as we have seen, Plotinian salvation was instantly available to the soul, if only it would turn its mind to “essential being” (see above); because of this, Plotinus saw no reason to bring the stars and planets into the picture. For Porphyry, however, who believed that the soul must gradually work toward salvation, a knowledge of the operations of the heavenly bodies and their relation to humankind would have been an important tool in gaining ever higher levels of virtue. In fact, Porphyry seems to have held the view that the soul receives certain “powers” from each of the planets — right judgment from Saturn, proper exercise of the will from Jupiter, impulse from Mars, opinion and imagination from the Sun, and (what else?) sensuous desire from Venus; from the Moon the soul receives the power of physical production (cf. Hegel, p. 430) — and that these powers enable to the soul to know things both earthly and heavenly. This theoretical knowledge of the powers of the planets, then, would have made the more practical knowledge of astrology quite useful and meaningful for an individual soul seeking to know itself as such. The usefulness of astrology for Porphyry, in this regard, probably resided in its ability to permit an individual, through an analysis of his birth chart, to know which planet — and therefore which “power” — exercised the dominant influence on his life. In keeping with the ancient Greek doctrine of the “golden mean,” the task of the individual would then be to work to bring to the fore those other “powers” — each present to a lesser degree in the soul, but still active — and thereby achieve a balance or sôphrosunê that would render the soul more capable of sharing in the divine Mind. The art of astrology, it must be remembered, was in wide practice in the Hellenistic world, and Plotinus’ rejection of it was an exception that was by no means the rule. Plotinus’ views on astrology apparently found few adherents, even among Platonists, for we see not only Porphyry, but also (to an extent) Iamblichus and even Proclus declaring its value — the latter being responsible for a paraphrase of Claudius Ptolemy’s astrological compendium known as the Tetrabiblos or sometimes simply as The Astronomy. In addition to penning a commentary on Ptolemy’s tome, Porphyry also wrote his own Introduction to Astronomy (by which is apparently meant “Astrology,” the modern distinction not holding in Hellenistic times). Unfortunately, this work no longer survives intact.

(For more on this topic, see Hellenistic Astrology.)

b. The Quest for Transcendence

The philosophy of Plotinus was highly discursive, meaning that it operated on the assumption that the highest meaning, the most profound truth (even a so-called mystical truth) is translatable, necessarily, into language; and furthermore, that any and every experience only attains its full value as meaning when it has reached expression in the form of language. This idea, of course, placed the One always beyond the discursive understanding of the human soul, since the One was proclaimed, by Plotinus, to be not only beyond discursive knowledge, but also the very source and possibility of such knowledge. According to Plotinus, then, any time the individual soul expresses a certain truth in language, this very act is representative of the power of the One. This notion of the simultaneous intimate proximity of the One to the soul, and, paradoxically, its extreme transcendence and ineffability, is possible only within the confines of a purely subjective and introspective philosophy like that of Plotinus; and since such a philosophy, by its very nature, cannot appeal to common, external perceptions, it is destined to remain the sole provenance of the sensitive and enlightened few. Porphyry did not want to admit this, and so he found himself seeking, as St. Augustine tells us, “a universal way (universalem viam) for the liberation of the soul” (City of God 10.32, in Fowden, p. 132), believing, as he did, that no such way had yet been discovered by or within philosophy. This did not imply, for Porphyry, a wholesale rejection of the Plotinian dialectic in favor of a more esoteric process of salvation; but it did lead Porphyry (see above) to look to astrology as a means of orienting the soul toward its place in the cosmos, and thereby allowing it to achieve the desired salvation in the most efficacious manner possible. Iamblichus, on the other hand, rejected even Porphyry’s approach, in favor of a path toward the divinity that is more worthy of priests (hieratikoi) than philosophers; for Iamblichus believed that not only the One, but all the gods and demi-gods, exceed and transcend the individual soul, making it necessary for the soul seeking salvation to call upon the superior beings to aid it in its progress. This is accomplished, Iamblichus tells us, by “the perfective operation of unspeakable acts (erga) correctly performed … acts which are beyond all understanding (huper pasan noêsin)” and which are “intelligible only to the gods” (On the Mysteries II.11.96-7, in Fowden, p. 132). These ritualistic acts, and the ‘logic’ underlying them, Iamblichus terms “theurgy” (theourgia). These theurgic acts are necessary, for Iamblichus, because he is convinced that philosophy, which is based solely upon thought (ennoia) — and thought, we must remember, is always an accomplishment of the individual mind, and hence discursive — is unable to reach that which is beyond thought. The practice of theurgy, then, becomes a way for the soul to experience the presence of the divinity, instead of merely thinking or conceptualizing the godhead. Porphyry took issue with this view, in his Letter to Anebo, which is really a criticism of the ideas of his pupil, Iamblichus, where he stated that, since theurgy is a physical process, it cannot possibly translate into a spiritual effect. Iamblichus’ On the Mysteries was written as a reply to Porphyry’s criticisms, but the defense of the pupil did not succeed in vanquishing the persistent attacks of the master. While both Porphyry and Iamblichus recognized, to a lesser and greater extent, respectively, the limitations of the Plotinian dialectic, Porphyry held firm to the idea that since the divinity is immaterial it can only be grasped in a noetic fashion — i.e., discursively (and even astrology, in spite of its mediative capacity, is still an intellectual exercise, open to dialectic and narratization); Iamblichus, adhering roughly to the same view, nevertheless argued that the human soul must not think god on its own terms, but must allow itself to be transformed by the penetrating essence of god, of which the soul partakes through rituals intended to transform the particularized, fragmented soul into a being that is “pure and unchangeable” (cf. On the Mysteries I.12.42; Fowden, p. 133).

i. Theurgy and the Distrust of Dialectic

According to the schema of Plotinian dialectic, the ‘stance’ of the individual soul is the sole source of truth certainty, being a judging faculty dependent always upon the higher Soul. From the perspective of one who believes that the soul is immersed in Nature, instead of recognizing, as Plotinus did, the soul’s status as an intimate governor of Nature (which is the Soul’s own act), dialectic may very well appear as a solipsistic (and therefore faulty) attempt on the part of an individual mind to know its reality by imposing conceptual structures and strictures upon the phenomena that constitute this reality. Iamblichus believed that since every individual soul is immersed in the ‘bodily element,’ no soul is capable of understanding the divine nature through the pure exercise of human reason — for reason itself, at the level of the human soul-body composite, is tainted by the changeable nature of matter, and therefore incapable of rising to that perfect knowledge that is beyond all change (cp. Plato, Phaedrus 247e). Dialectic, then, as the soul’s attempt to know reality, is seen by Iamblichus as an attempt by an already fallen being to lead itself up out of the very locus of its own forgetfulness. Now Iamblichus does not completely reject dialectical reason; he simply requests that it be tempered by an appeal to intermediate divinities, who will aid the fallen soul in its ascent back towards the Supreme Good. The practice of ritualistic theurgy is the medium by which the fallen soul ascends to a point at which it becomes capable of engaging in a meaningful dialectic with the divinity. This dependence upon higher powers nevertheless negates the soul’s own innate ability to think itself as god, and so we may say that Iamblichus’ ideas represent a decisive break with the philosophy of Plotinus.

4. Proclus and Pseudo-Dionysius

Proclus (410-485 CE) is, next to Plotinus, the most accomplished and rigorous of the Neoplatonists. Born in Constantinople, he studied philosophy in Athens, and through diligent effort rose to the rank of head teacher or ‘scholarch’ of that great school. In addition to his accomplishments in philosophy, Proclus was also a religious universalist, who had himself initiated into all the mystery religions being practiced during his time. This was doubtless due to the influence of Iamblichus, whom Proclus held in high esteem (cf. Proclus, Theology of Plato III; in Hegel, p. 432). The philosophical expression of Proclus is more precise and logically ordered than that of Plotinus. Indeed, Proclus posits the Intellect (nous) as the culmination of the productive act (paragein) of the One; this is in opposition to Plotinus, who described the Intellect as proceeding directly from the One, thereby placing Mind before Thought, and so making thought the process by which the Intellect becomes alienated from itself, thus requiring the salvific act in order to attain the fulfillment of Being, which is, for Plotinus, the return of Intellect to itself. Proclus understands the movement of existence as a tripartite progression beginning with an abstract unity, passing into a multiplicity that is identified with Life, and returning again to a unity that is no longer merely abstract, but now actualized as an eternal manifestation of the godhead. What constituted, for Plotinus, the salvific drama of human existence is, for Proclus, simply the logical, natural order of things. However, by thus removing the yearning for salvation from human existence, as something to be accomplished, positively, Proclus is ignoring or overly intellectualizing, if you will, an existential aspect of human existence that is as real as it is powerful. Plotinus recognized the importance of the salvific drive for the realization of true philosophy, making philosophy a means to an end; Proclus utilizes philosophy, rather, more in the manner of a useful, descriptive language by which a thinker may describe the essential realities of a merely contingent existence. In this sense, Proclus is more faithful to the ‘letter’ of Plato’s Dialogues; but for this same reason he fails to rise to the ‘spirit’ of the Platonic philosophy. Proclus’ major works include commentaries on Plato’s Timaeus, Republic, Parmenides, Alcibiades I, and the Cratylus. He also wrote treatises on the Theology of Plato, On Providence, and On the Subsistence of Evil. His most important work is undoubtedly the Elements of Theology, which contains the clearest exposition of his ideas.

a. Being — Becoming — Being

We found, in Plotinus, an explanation and expression of a cosmos that involved a gradual development from all but static unity toward eventual alienation — a moment at which the active soul must make the profound decision to renounce autonomous existence and re-merge with the source of all Being, or else remain forever in the darkness of forgetfulness and error. Salvation, for Plotinus, was relatively easy to accomplish, but never guaranteed. For Proclus, on the other hand, the arkhê or ‘ruling beginning’ of all Life is the ‘One-in-itself’ (to auto hen), or that which is responsible for the ordering of all existents, insofar as existence is, in the last analysis, the sovereign act or expression of this primordial unity or monad. The expression of this One is perfectly balanced, being a trinity containing, as distinct expressions, each moment of self-realization of this One; and each of these moments, according to Proclus, have the structure of yet another trinity. The first trinity corresponds to the limit, which is the guide and reference-point of all further manifestations; the second to the unlimited, which is also Life or the productive power (dunamis); and the third, finally, to the ‘mixture’ (mikton, diakosmos), which is the self-reflective moment of return during which the soul realizes itself as a thinking — i.e., living — entity. Thought is, therefore, the culmination of Life and the fulfillment of Being. Thought is also the reason (logos) that binds these triadic unities together in a grand harmonious plêrôma, if you will. Being, for Proclus, is that divine self-presence, “shut up without development and maintained in strict isolation” (Hegel, p. 446) which is the object of Life’s thinking; this ‘object’ gives rise to that thinking which leads, eventually, to understanding (nous), which is the thought of being, and appears (ekphanôs), always, as ‘being’s begetter’. When the circle is completed, and reflected upon, logically, we are met with the following onto-cosmological schema: thought (noêtos, also known as ‘Being’) giving rise to its “negative” which is thinking (Hegel, p. 393) and the thought ‘it is’ (noêtos kai noêros), produces its own precise reflection — ‘pure thinking’ — and this reflection is the very manifestation (phanerôsis) of the deity within the fluctuating arena of individual souls. Being is eternal and static precisely because it always returns to itself as Being; and ‘Becoming’is the conceptual term for this process, which involves the cyclical play between that which is and is not, at any given time. “[T]he thought of every man is identical with the existence of every man, and each is both the thought and the existence” (Proclus, Platonic Theology III., in Hegel, p. 449). The autonomous drive toward dissolution, which is so germane to the soul as such, is wiped away by Proclus, for his dialectic is impeccably clean. However, he does not account for the yearning for the infinite (as does Plotinus) and the consequent existential desire for productive power falls on its face before the supreme god of autonomous creation — which draws all existents into its primeval web of dissolution.

b. The God Beyond Being

Very little is known about the life of the so-called Pseudo-Dionysius. For many centuries, the writings of this mystical philosopher were believed to have been from the pen of none other Dionysius, the disciple of St. Paul. Later scholarship has shed considerable doubt on this claim, and most modern scholars believe this author to have been active during the late fifth century CE. Indeed, the earliest reference to the Dionysian Corpus that we possess is from 533 CE. There is no mention of this author’s work before this date. Careful study of the Pseudo-Dionysian writings has uncovered many parallels between the theurgical doctrines of Iamblichus, and the triadic metaphysical schema of Proclus. Yet what we witness in these writings is the attempt by a thinker who is at once religiously sensitive and philosophically engaged to bring the highly developed Platonism of his time into line with a Christian theological tradition that was apparently persisting on the fringes of orthodoxy. To this extent, we may refer to the Pseudo-Dionysius as a ‘decadent,’ for he (or she?) was writing at a time when the heyday of Platonism had attained the status of a palaios logos (‘ancient teaching’) to be, not merely commented upon, but savored as an aesthetic monument to an era already long past. It is important to note, in this regard, that the writings of Pseudo-Dionysius do not contain any theoretical arguments or dialectical moments, but simply many subtle variations on the apophatic/kataphatic theology for which our writer is renowned. Indeed, he writes as if his readers already know, and are merely in need of clarification. His message is quite simple, and is manifestly distilled from the often cumbersome doctrines of earlier thinkers (especially Iamblichus and Proclus). Pseudo-Dionysius professes a God who is beyond all distinctions, and who even transcends the means utilized by human beings to reach Him. For Pseudo-Dionysius, the Holy Trinity (which is probably analogous to Proclus’ highest trinity, see above) serves as a “guide” to the human being who seeks not only to know but to unite with “him who is beyond all being and knowledge” (Pseudo-Dionysius, The Mystical Theology 997A-1000A, tr. C. Luibheid 1987). In the expression of the Pseudo-Dionysius the yearning for the infinite reaches a poetical form that at once fulfills and exceeds philosophy.

5. Appendix:`The Renaissance Platonists

After the closing of the Neoplatonic Academy in Athens by the Emperor Justinian in 529 CE, Platonism ceased to be a living philosophy. Due to the efforts of the Christian philosopher Boethius (480-525 CE), who translated Porphyry’s Isagoge, and composed numerous original works as well, the Middle Ages received a faint glimmer of the ancient glories of the Platonic philosophy. St. Augustine, also, was responsible for imparting a sense of Neoplatonic doctrine to the Latin West, but this was by way of commentary and critique, and not in any way a systematic exposition of the philosophy. Generally speaking, it is safe to say that the European Middle Ages remained in the grip of Aristotelianism until the early Renaissance, when certain brilliant Italian thinkers began to rediscover, translate, and expound upon the original texts of Platonism. Chief among these thinkers were Marsilio Ficino (1433-1492) and Pico della Mirandola (1463-1494). Ficino produced fine Latin translations of Plato’s Dialogues, the Enneads of Plotinus, and numerous works by Porphyry, Iamblichus, Proclus, Pseudo-Dionysius, and many others. In addition to his scholarly ability, Ficino was also a fine commentator and philosopher in his own right. His brilliant essay on Five Questions Concerning The Mind is a concise summary of general Neoplatonic doctrine, based upon Ficino’s own view that the lot of the human soul is to inquire into its own nature, and that since this inquiry causes the human soul to experience misery, the soul must do everything it can to transcend the physical body and live a life worthy of the blessed angels (cf. Cassirer, et. al. (ed) 1948, p. 211-212). Giovanni Pico, the Count of Mirandola, was a colorful figure who lived a short life, fraught with strife. He roused the ire of the papacy by composing a voluminous work defending nine-hundred theses drawn from his vast reading of the Ancients; thirteen of these theses were deemed heretical by the papacy, and yet Pico refused to change or withdraw a single one. Like his friend Ficino, Pico was a devotee of ancient wisdom, drawing not only upon the Platonic canon, but also upon the Pre-Socratic literature and the Hermetic Corpus, especially the Poimandres. Pico’s most famous work is the Oration on the Dignity of Man, in which he eloquently states his learned view that humankind was created by God “as a creature of indeterminate nature,” possessed of the unique ability to ascend or descend on the scale of Being through the autonomous exercise of free will (Oration 3, in Cassirer, et. al. (ed) 1948, p. 224). Pico’s view of free will was quite different from that expressed by Plotinus, and indeed most other Neoplatonists, and it came as no surprise when Pico composed a treatise On Being and the One which ended on Aristotelian terms, declaring the One to be coincident with or persisting amidst Being — a wholly un-Platonic doctrine. With Ficino, then, we may say that Platonism achieved a brief moment of archaic glory, while with Pico, it was plunged once again into the quagmire of self-referential empiricism.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Cassirer, Ernst; Kristeller, Paul Oskar; Randall, John Herman Jr. (editors) The Renaissance Philosophy of Man (University of Chicago Press 1948).
  • Cooper, John M. (ed.), Plato: Complete Works (Hackett Publishing 1997).
  • Copleston S.J., Frederick, A History of Philosophy (vol. I, part II): Greece and Rome (Image Books 1962).
  • Dillon, John (1977), The Middle Platonists (Cornell University Press).
  • Eusebius (tr. G.A. Williamson 1965), The History of the Church (Penguin Books).
  • Fowden, Garth, The Egyptian Hermes: A Historical Approach To The Late Pagan Mind (Cambridge University Press 1986).
  • Hadot, Pierre (tr. M. Chase), Plotinus, or The Simplicity of Vision (University of Chicago Press 1993).
  • Hegel, Georg Wilhelm Friedrich (tr. E.S. Haldane and Frances H. Simson), Lectures on the History of Philosophy (vol. II): Plato And The Platonists (Bison Books 1995).
  • Jaeger, Werner, Early Christianity and Greek Paideia (Harvard University Press 1961).
  • Layton, Bentley (1987), The Gnostic Scriptures (Doubleday: The Anchor Bible Reference Library).
  • O’Brien S.J., Elmer (1964), The Essential Plotinus: Representative Treatises From The Enneads (Hackett Publishing).
  • Origen of Alexandria, Commentary on John, tr. in The Ante-Nicene Fathers, vol. X. (Eerdmans 1979, reprint).
  • Origen of Alexandria, On First Principles [De Principiis], tr. in The Ante-Nicene Fathers, vol. IV. (Eerdmans 1979, reprint).
  • Philo of Alexandria (tr. F.H. Colson and G.H. Whitaker), On the Creation of the World [De Opificio Mundi], in vol. 1 of The Loeb Classical Library edition of Philo (Harvard University Press 1929).
  • Plotinus (tr. A.H. Armstrong), The Enneads, in seven volumes (Loeb Classical Library: Harvard University Press 1966).
  • Porphyry (tr. K. Guthrie), Launching-Points to the Realm of Mind [Pros ta noeta aphorismoi] (Phanes Press 1988).
  • Porphyry (tr. A. Zimmern), Porphyry’s Letter to His Wife Marcella Concerning the Life of Philosophy and the Ascent to the Gods (Phanes Press 1986).
  • Porphyry (tr. A.H. Armstrong), Life of Plotinus [Vita Plotini], in volume one of the Loeb Classical Library edition of Plotinus (Harvard University Press 1966).
  • Proclus (tr. T. Taylor), Lost Fragments of Proclus (Wizards Bookshelf 1988).
  • Proclus (tr. T. Taylor), Ten Doubts Concerning Providence, and On the Subsistence of Evil (Ares Publishers 1980).
  • Pseudo-Dionysius (tr. C. Luibheid 1987), Pseudo-Dionysius: The Complete Works (Paulist Press).

Author Information

Edward Moore
St. Elias School of Orthodox Theology
U. S. A.


Relativism is sometimes identified (usually by its critics) as the thesis that all points of view are equally valid. In ethics, this amounts to saying that all moralities are equally good; in epistemology it implies that all beliefs, or belief systems, are equally true. Critics of relativism typically dismiss such views as incoherent since they imply the validity even of the view that relativism is false. They also charge that such views are pernicious since they undermine the enterprise of trying to improve our ways of thinking.

Perhaps because relativism is associated with such views, few philosophers are willing to describe themselves as relativists. However, most of the leading thinkers who have been accused of relativism–for example, Ludwig Wittgenstein, Peter Winch, Thomas Kuhn, Richard Rorty, Michel Foucault, Jacques Derrida–do share a certain common ground which, while recognizably relativistic, provides a basis for more sophisticated, and perhaps more defensible, positions.

Although there are many different kinds of relativism, they all have two features in common.

(1) They all assert that one thing (e.g. moral values, beauty, knowledge, taste, or meaning) is relative to some particular framework or standpoint (e.g. the individual subject, a culture, an era, a language, or a conceptual scheme).

(2) They all deny that any standpoint is uniquely privileged over all others.

It is thus possible to classify the different types and sub-types of relativism in a fairly obvious way. The main genera of relativism can be distinguished according to the object they seek to relativize. Thus, forms of moral relativism assert the relativity of moral values; forms of epistemological relativism assert the relativity of knowledge. These genera can then be broken down into distinct species by identifying the framework to which the object in question is being relativized. For example, moral subjectivism is that species of moral relativism that relativizes moral value to the individual subject.

How controversial, and how coherent, these forms of relativism are will obviously vary according to what is being relativized to what, and in what manner. In contemporary philosophy, the most widely discussed forms of relativism are moral relativism, cognitive relativism, and aesthetic relativism.

Author Information

Emrys Westacott
Alfred University
U. S. A.

Hans Reichenbach (1891—1953)

ReichenbachHans Reichenbach was a leading philosopher of science, a founder of the Berlin circle, and a proponent of logical positivism (also known as neopositivism or logical empiricism). He is known for his philosophical investigations of Einstein’s theory of relativity, quantum mechanics, the theory of probability, the nature of space and time, the character of physical laws, and conventionalism in physical science.

He was a critic of the Kantian theory of the synthetic a priori. Reichenbach complained that Kant and Poincaré should more carefully have distinguished mathematical geometry [that is, pure, a priori geometry] from physical geometry [that is, applied, synthetic geometry]. Mathematical geometry is about abstract objects in mathematical space; physical geometry is about physical objects in physical space. Kant and Poincaré failed to appreciate that it is the complete package of physics, coordinating definitions, and mathematical geometry that is compared to observation in order to select the appropriate physical geometry, said Reichenbach. This geometry cannot be selected a priori, as Kant wanted, nor by convention, as Poincaré wanted. When the package is in fact compared to observation the proper geometry is non-Euclidean geometry, as Einstein was the first to discover. In addition, developing an idea of Leibniz’s, Reichenbach created a detailed theory whose goal is to explain the direction of time in terms of the direction from causes to their effects.

His methods of teaching philosophy were something of a novelty; students found him easy to approach (this fact was uncommon in German universities); and his courses were open to discussion and debate. In 1930, he and Carnap became the editors of the influential philosophical journal Erkenntnis.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. The Philosophy of Space and Time and the Philosophical Meaning of the Theory of Relativity
    1. Space
    2. Time
    3. The Special Theory of Relativity
    4. The General Theory of Relativity
    5. The Reality of Space and Time
  3. Quantum Mechanics
    1. Interpretation of Quantum Physics: Part I
    2. Mathematical Formulation of Quantum Mechanics
    3. Examples of Quantum Operators
    4. Classical and Quantum Physical Quantities; Schrodinger Equations
    5. Heisenberg Indeterminacy Principle
    6. The Interpretation of Quantum Physics: Part II
  4. Reichenbach’s Epistemology
    1. The Structure of Science and the Verifiability Principle
    2. Conventionalism vs. Empiricism
    3. Causality
    4. Science and Philosophy
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Life

Hans Reichenbach was born on September 26th 1891 in Hamburg, Germany. He was a leading philosopher of science, a founder of the Berlin circle, and a proponent of logical positivism (also known as neopositivism or logical empiricism). He studied physics, mathematics and philosophy at Berlin, Erlangen, Gottingen and Munich in the 1910s. Among his teachers were the neo-Kantian philosopher Ernst Cassirer, the mathematician David Hilbert, and the physicists Max Planck, Max Born and Albert Einstein. Reichenbach received his degree in philosophy from the University at Erlangen in 1915; his dissertation on the theory of probability was published in 1916. He attended Einstein’s lectures on the theory of relativity at Berlin in 1917-20; at that time Reichenbach chose the theory of relativity as the first subject for his own philosophical research. He became a professor at Polytechnic at Stuttgart in 1920. In the same year he published his first book on the philosophical implications of the theory of relativity, The Theory of Relativity and A Priori Knowledge, in which Reichenbach criticized Kantian theory of the synthetic a priori. In the following years he published three books on the philosophical meaning of the theory of relativity: Axiomatization of the theory of Relativity (1924), From Copernicus to Einstein (1927) and The Philosophy of Space and Time (1928); the last in a sense states logical positivism’s view on the theory of relativity. In 1926 Reichenbach became a professor of philosophy of physics at the University at Berlin. His methods of teaching philosophy were something of a novelty; students found him easy to approach (this fact was uncommon in German universities); his courses were open to discussion and debate. In 1928 he founded the Berlin circle (named Die Gesellschaft fur empirische Philosophie, “Society for empirical philosophy”). Among the members of the Berlin circle were Carl Gustav Hempel, Richard von Mises, David Hilbert and Kurt Grelling. In 1930 Reichenbach and Carnap undertook the editorship of the journal Erkenntnis (“Knowledge”).

In 1933 Adolf Hitler became Chancellor of Germany. In the same year Reichenbach emigrated to Turkey, where he became chief of the Department of Philosophy at the University at Istanbul. In Turkey, Reichenbach promoted a shift in philosophy courses; he introduced interdisciplinary seminars and courses on scientific subjects. Then in 1935 he published The theory of Probability.

In 1938 he moved to the United States, where he became a professor at the University of California at Los Angeles; in the same year he published Experience and Prediction. Reichenbach’s work on quantum mechanics was published in 1944 (Philosophic foundations of quantum mechanics). Afterwards he wrote two popular books: Elements of symbolic logic (1947) and The rise of scientific philosophy (1951). In 1949 he contributed an essay on The philosophical significance of the theory of relativity to Albert Einstein: philosopher-scientist edit by Paul Arthur Schillp. Reichenbach died on April 9th 1953 at Los Angeles, California, while he was working on the philosophy of time. Two books Nomological statements and admissible operations (1954) and The direction of time (1956) were published posthumously.

2. The Philosophy of Space and Time and the Philosophical Meaning of the Theory of Relativity

a. Space

Euclidean geometry is based on the set of axioms stated by Greek mathematician Euclid who developed geometry into an axiomatic system, in which every theorem is derivable from the axioms. Euclid’s work revealed that the truth of geometry depends on the truth of axioms and therefore the question arose whether the axioms were true. Many Euclidean axioms were self-evident, but the axiom of parallels, which states that there is one and only one parallel to a given line through a given point, was considered not self-evident, and many mathematicians tried to derive it from the other axioms. Eventually it was proved the axiom of parallels is not a logical consequence of the remainder. As a result of this research non-Euclidean geometries were discovered and mathematicians became aware of the existence of a plurality of geometries, namely:

  • Euclidean geometry, in which the axiom of parallels is true;
  • geometry of Bolyai and Lobachevsky, also known as hyperbolic geometry, in which there is an infinite number of parallels to the given line through the given point (Janos Bolyai (1802-1860), Hungarian mathematician, published in 1832 the first account of a non-Euclidean geometry; Nikolay Lobachevsky (1793-1856), Russian mathematician, independently discovered hyperbolic geometry);
  • elliptical geometry, in which there exist no parallel.

In Reichenbach’s opinion, it must be realized that there are two different kinds of geometry, namely mathematical geometry and physical geometry. Mathematical geometry, a branch of mathematics, is a purely formal system and it does not deal with the truth of axioms, but with the proof of theorems. That is, it only produces the consequences of axioms. Physical geometry is concerned with the real geometry, that is, the geometry which is true in our physical world: it searches for the truth (or falsity) of axioms, using the methods of empirical science: experiments, measurements, and so forth; it is a branch of physics.

How can physicists discover the geometry of the real world? Look at the following example, which Reichenbach analyses in The philosophy of space and time. Two-dimensional intelligent beings live in a two-dimensional world, on the surface of a sphere, but they do not know where they live; in their opinion, they might live on a plane, a sphere or whatever surface. How can they discover where they live? They could use some mathematical properties that characterize a geometry; for example, in Euclidean geometry the ratio of the circumference of a circle to its diameter equals pi (3.14…) while in elliptical geometry the ratio is variable and it is less than pi; also in hyperbolic geometry the ratio is variable but greater than pi. Therefore they could measure the circumference and the diameter of a circle; if the ratio equals pi the surface is a plane; if the ratio is less than pi the surface is a sphere. Thus they could discover where they live with the help of such measurements. This method, invented by Gauss (Karl Friedrich Gauss, b 1777 d 1855, German mathematician, was the first to discover a non-Euclidean geometry although he did not published his work) is suitable for a two-dimensional world. Riemann (Bernhard Riemann, b 1826 d 1866, German mathematician, developed both the elliptical geometry and the generalized theory of metric space in any number of dimension which Einstein used in his general theory of relativity) invented a method suitable for a three-dimensional world. There is no reason in principle why physicists could not use Riemann’s method to discover the geometry of our world.

Riemann’s method is based on physical measurements. Reichenbach carefully examines the epistemological implications of measuring geometrical entities. The empirical measurement of geometrical entities depends on physical objects or physical processes corresponding to geometrical concepts. The process of establishing such correlation is called a co-ordinative definition. Usually, a definition is a statement that gives the exact meaning of a concept; this kind of definition is called an explicit definition. There is another kind of definition, namely the co-ordinative definition; it is not a statement, but an ostensive definition. The co-ordinative definition of a concept is a correlation between a real object or a physical process and the concept itself. Some geometrical entities cannot be defined by an explicit definition but they require a co-ordinative definition. For example, the unit of length, ie the metre, is defined by a co-ordinative definition; the physical object corresponding to the metre is the standard rod in Paris (Museum of weights and measures in Paris houses the units of measure for International System of Units). Another example is the definition of straight line which is co-ordinated with a physical process, namely the path of a light ray.

What is the philosophical meaning of a co-ordinative definition? Reichenbach proposes the following problem, discussed in The philosophy of space and time. A measuring rod is moved from one point of space (say A) to another point (say B). When the measuring rod is in B, is its length altered? Many physical circumstances can alter the length, for example, if temperature in A differs from temperature in B. In this example, we can discover whether the temperature is the same by means of a metallic rod and a wooden rod which are of equal length when they are in A. Move the two rods to B: if their length becomes different then the temperature is also different, otherwise the temperature is the same. This method is suitable because temperature is a differential force, ie a force that produces different effects on different substances. But there are universal forces, which produce the same effect on all type of matter. The best known universal force is gravity: its effect is the same on all bodies and therefore all bodies fall with the same acceleration. Now suppose a universal force alters the length of the measuring rods when they are moved from A to B; in this instance, we do not observe any difference between the measuring rods and we cannot know whether the length is altered. Consequently, if a rod stays in A and the other is moved to B where a universal force alters its length, we cannot know their length is different. So we must acknowledge that there is not any way of knowing whether the length of two measuring rods, which are equal when they are in the same point of space, is the same when the two rods are in two different points of space. We can define the two rods equal in length if all differential forces are eliminated and disregard universal forces. But we can adopt a different definition, of course. Thus we must accept – Reichenbach says – that the geometrical form of a body is not an absolute fact, but depends on a co-ordinative definition. There is an astonish consequence of this fact. If a geometry G was proved to be the real geometry by a set of measurements, we could arbitrarily choose a different geometry G’ and adopt a different set of co-ordinative definitions so that G’ would become the real geometry. This is the principle of relativity of geometry, which Reichenbach examines, from a mathematical point of view, in Axiomatization of the theory of relativity and, from a philosophical point of view, in The philosophy of space and time. This principle states that all geometrical systems are equivalent; it falsifies alleged a priori character of Euclidean geometry and thus it falsifies the Kantian philosophy of space too.

At a first glance, the principle of relativity of geometry proves it is not possible to discover the real geometry of our world. This is true if we limit ourselves to metric relationships. Metric relationships are geometric properties of bodies depending on distances, angles, areas, and so forth; examples of metric relationships are “the ratio of circumference to diameter equals pi” and “the volume of A is greater than the volume of B.” But we can study not only distances, angles, areas but also the order of space, the topology of space, i.e., the way in which the points of space are placed in relation to one another; an example of a topological relationship is “point A is between points B and C”. A consequence of the principle of relativity of geometry is, for instance, that a plane and a sphere are equivalent with respect to metric. From a topological point of view, a sphere and a plane are not equivalent (in topology, two geometrical objects are equivalent if and only if there is a continuous transformation that assign to every point of the first object a unique point of the second and vice versa; there is not any transformation of this kind between a sphere and a plane). What is the philosophical significance of topology?

Reichenbach examines the following example (The philosophy of space and time). Measurements of space, performed by a two-dimensional being, suggest that he lives on a sphere, but, in spite of such measurements, he believes he lives on a plane. There is not any difficult, when he limits himself to metric relationships: he could adopt appropriate co-ordinative definitions and those measurements would become compatible with a plane. But the surface of a sphere is a finite surface and he might do a round-the-world tour, that is he could walk along a straight line from a point A and eventually he would arrive to the point A itself. Really this is impossible on a plane and he therefore should assert that this last point is not the point A, but a different point B which, in all other respects, is identical to A. Now there are two possibilities: (i) he changes his theory and acknowledges that he lives on a sphere or (ii) he maintains his position, but he needs to explain why point B is identical to A although A and B are different and distant points of space; he could accomplish his task only fabricating a fictitious theory of pre-established harmony: everything that occurs in A, immediately occurs in B.

Reichenbach says the second possibility entails an anomaly in the law of causality. If we assume normal causality, topology become an empirical theory and we can discover the geometry of the real world. This example is another falsification of Kantian theory of synthetic a priori. Kant believed both the Euclidean geometry and the law of causality were a priori. But if Euclidean geometry were an a priori truth, normal causality might be false; if normal causality were an a priori truth, Euclidean geometry might be false. We arbitrarily can choose the geometry or we arbitrarily can choose the causality; but we cannot choose both. Thus the most important implication of the philosophical analysis of topology is that the theory of space depends on normal causality.

b. Time

Normal causality is the main principle that underlies not only the theory of space but also the theory of time. The solution to the problem of an empirical theory of space was found when we acknowledged the priority of topological relationships over metric relationships. Also in the philosophy of time we must recognize the priority of topology. We must distinguish between two different concepts which are fundamental to the theory of time, namely the order of time and the direction of time. Time order is definable by means of causality (see The philosophy of space and time). The definition is: event A occurs before event B (and, of course, event B occurs after event A) if event A can produce a physical effect on event B. When can event A affect event B? The theory of relativity states that a finite time is required for an effect to go from event A to event B. The required time is finite because the velocity of light is a speed limit for all material particles, messages or effects, and because this velocity is finite. Suppose A and B are two events occurring in point PA and PB. Event A can affect event B if a light pulse emitted from PA when event A occurs reaches the point PB before event B occurs. If the light pulse reaches point PB when event B already occurred, event A cannot affect event B. If event A cannot affect event B and event B cannot affect event A, the order of the two events is indefinite and we could arbitrarily choose the event that occurs first or we might define the two event simultaneous; therefore simultaneity depends on a definition.

Reichenbach examines the consistency of this definition. Suppose an event A occurs before an event B and, from another point of view (reference frame), the event A occurs after the event B. In this circumstance there is a closed causal chain so that the event A produces an effect on the event B and the event B produces an effect on the event A. The definition is consistent only if we assume that there are not closed causal chains: the order of time depends on normal causality.

Reichenbach asserts that the relativity of simultaneity is independent of the relativity of motion. The relativity of simultaneity is due to the finite velocity of causal propagation. So it is a mistake – Reichenbach asserts in The philosophy of space and time and From Copernicus to Einstein – to derive the relativity of simultaneity from the relative motion of observers. Reichenbach also cautions against a possible misunderstanding of the multiplicity of observers in some expositions of the theory of relativity: observers are used only for convenience; the relativity of simultaneity has nothing to do with the relativity of observers. We must recognize – Reichenbach asserts – that the theory of an absolute simultaneity is a consistent theory although it is a wrong one. Absolute simultaneity and absolute time does not exist, but they are clever concepts.

Reichenbach also faces the problem of the direction of time. All mechanical processes are reversible: if f(t) is a solution of the equations of classical mechanics then f(-t) is also an admissible solution; also in the theory of relativity f(-t) is an admissible solution. Thus neither theory gives a consistent definition of the direction of time. In fact the direction of time is definable only by means of irreversible processes, that is, processes that are characterized by an increase of entropy. But the definition is not straightforward. The second law of thermodynamics, which states the principle of increase of entropy, is a statistical law, not a deterministic law. Really the elementary processes of statistical thermodynamics are reversible, because they are controlled by the laws of classical mechanics. In fact all macroscopic processes are theoretically reversible because statistical thermodynamics asserts that, in an isolated system, after an extremely large amount of time, the entropy will diminish to infinitesimally close to the initial value. In an isolated system, in an infinite time, there are as many downgrades as upgrades of the entropy. Thus if we observe two states A and B, and the entropy of B is greater than the entropy of A, we cannot assert that B is later than A. But if we consider not an isolated system, but many isolated systems over relatively short durations compared to the duration required for a return to the same value of entropy, then the probability that we observe a decrease of entropy is less than the probability we observe an increase of entropy. We can therefore use “many-system probabilities” to define a direction of time. Reichenbach asserts that it is possible to define an entropy for the whole universe, and statistical theory proves that the entropy of the universe first increases and then decreases; thus we can define a direction of time, but only for sections of time, not for the whole time. Reichenbach notes that this theory of time was stated in 19th century by Boltzmann (Ludwig Boltzmann, 1844-1906, Austrian physicist who formulated the statistical theory of entropy).

c. The Special Theory of Relativity

The special theory of relativity gives an unified theory of space and time in the absence of gravitational field. One example of the necessity of an unified theory of space and time is the length contraction, an effect predicted by the theory; this effect shows that the length of a moving rod depends on simultaneity. The special theory of relativity states that the length of a rod measured using a metre that is at rest with respect to the rod is different from the length measured using a metre which is moving with respect to the rod. In the first instance we measure the length of the rod by means of the well-known method used by classical mechanics. But we use a different method when the measuring rod is not at rest with respect to the metre. We measure the length of the moving rod by means of the distance between the two points occupied at a given time by the two ends of the moving rod, ie we mark the simultaneous positions of the two ends and we measure the distance between those positions; thus this method depend on the definition of simultaneity, which also depends on a definition. It must be acknowledged that the length of a moving rod is a matter of definition, but the length contraction is a genuine physical hypothesis confirmed by experiments. We must also recognize the priority of time over space: the ability to measure time is a requisite for the theory of space. Therefore only an unified theory of space and time is suitable. In spite of the necessity for an unified theory of space and time, Reichenbach states (in The philosophy of space and time) that space and time are different concepts which remain distinct in the theory of relativity. The real space is three-dimensional and the real time is one-dimensional: the four-dimensional space-time used in the theory of relativity is a mathematical artefact. Also the mathematical formulation of the special theory of relativity acknowledges the difference between space and time: the equation that defines the metric is dx^2 + dy^2 + dz^2 – dt^2 = ds^2 and the time coordinate is distinguishable from the space coordinates by the negative sign. How can we know the space is three-dimensional? and how can we recognize the difference between a real space and a mathematical space?

A physical effect is not immediately transmitted from one point to another distant point but it passes through every point between the source and the destination. This principle is known as the principle of local action and it denies the existence of action at a distance. In three-dimensional space the principle of local action is true while in a four-dimensional space it is false, so we can recognize that the real space is three-dimensional. We can also distinguish between a mathematical space and the real space because in a mathematical space the principle of local action is false. Reichenbach says that the truth of the principle of local action is an empirical fact, not an a priori truth: it could be false. But if this principle is true then there is only one n-dimensional space in which it is true; this n-dimensional space is the real space and n is the number of the dimensions of space. So we recognize that the real space is three-dimensional while the four-dimensional space used in the theory of relativity is a mathematical space, not a real one. We also recognize that the unified theory of space and time depends on normal causality.

Among the results of the special theory of relativity is time dilation: the period of a moving clock is greater than the period of a clock at rest and therefore the moving clock slows. Time dilation is an empirical hypothesis and Reichenbach says its physical meaning is that a clock does not measure the time coordinate but it measures the interval, ie the space-time distance between two events. In classical mechanics space is Euclidean and Pythagoras’ theorem gives the distance ds between two points: ds^2 = dx^2 + dy^2 + dz^2; x,y,z are the space coordinates. The distance ds is measured by rod. Time is an independent coordinate and is measured by clock. The mathematical formulation of the special theory of relativity uses a four-dimensional space-time known as the Minkowski space (mathematician Hermann Minkowski, b 1864 d 1909, gave a mathematical formulation of Einstein’s special theory of relativity), in which three coordinates are the space coordinates and one coordinate is the time coordinate. The distance ds between two points of Minkowski space is: ds^2 = dx^2 + dy^2 + dz^2 – dt^2; t is the time coordinate and ds (or ds^2) is the interval. A positive (negative) ds^2 is called a spacelike (timelike) interval. Suppose A and B are two events, interval ds^2 is negative and S is an inertial frame of reference moving with constant velocity v so that both events A and B occurs at the origin O of S, and suppose there is a clock in O; the time measured by the clock, called characteristic time, equals the interval ds. When the interval is positive, there is an inertial frame of reference S’ with respect to which the two events are simultaneous; in this instance, the interval ds is realized by a measuring rod with the two ends coinciding with the events A and B and at rest with respect to S’. Time dilation shows an important difference between the special theory of relativity and classical mechanics; the special theory asserts that clocks and rods measure the interval while classical mechanics asserts they measure coordinates.

I briefly mention also Reichenbach’s view on the velocity of light. He asserts that there is no way of measuring the velocity of light and proving it is constant, because the measurement of the velocity of light requires the definition of simultaneity which depends on the speed of light. Einstein – Reichenbach says – does not prove the speed of light is constant, but the special theory of relativity assumes it is constant, ie it is constant by definition.

d. The General Theory of Relativity

Newton’s second law of motion states that the acceleration a of a body is proportional to the force F applied, so that F = m * a, where m is the inertial mass which represents the resistance to acceleration (force and acceleration are vectors and I use bold face as indicator of vector). Newton’s law of gravitation asserts that every particle attracts every other particle with a force F proportional to the product of gravitational masses: F = G (m * m’) / r^2; r is the distance between the two particles, m and m’ are the gravitational mass which represent the response to the gravitational force. In classical mechanics, gravitational mass and inertial mass are equivalent; this principle of equivalence accounts for the law of free fall which states that the acceleration of every falling body is the same. The principle of equivalence is one of the principle of the general theory of relativity and its consequences are very important.

Suppose a physicist is into a closed elevator and he observers a body attached to a spring; he find the spring is stretched. There are two different although equivalent explanations.

  • First explanation. The body is attracted by the Earth and the gravitational force accounts for the stretching of the spring.
  • Second explanation. The elevator is in empty space so there is not any gravitational force, but the elevator is accelerated and the inertia of the body causes the stretching of the spring.

The two explanation are indistinguishable because of the equivalence between gravitational and inertial mass. This thought experiment shows that an accelerated frames of reference can simulate a gravitational field. Now suppose that in another thought experiment the body does not exert any force on the spring. Also in this instance there are two explanations.

  • First explanation. The elevator is at rest in empty space so there is not any force.
  • Second explanation. The elevator is free falling in a gravitational field so its acceleration equals gravitational acceleration; the body is falling but also the spring, the elevator and the physicist are falling with the same acceleration and therefore they are relatively at rest and there is not any force.

The consequence of this second thought experiment is that a gravitational field can be eliminated by means of an accelerated frame of reference. The theory of general relativity states that free falling accelerated frames of reference are inertial systems. Reichenbach says that this hypothesis is not a consequence of the principle of equivalence; it is a genuine physical hypothesis which goes beyond experience. There is an important consequence of this hypothesis. The special theory of relativity is true in inertial frames of reference, so in every inertial system the motion of a light ray is represented by a straight line. But the general theory of relativity states that a free falling frame of reference is an inertial system, so the light moves in a straight line with respect to this frame of reference; with respect to a frame of reference which is at rest on Earth (in this system there is a gravitational field) the light rays are curved. The consequence is that light is curved by gravity. Another consequence of the hypothesis that a free falling frame of reference is an inertial system is the time dilation in the presence of a gravitational field.

The general theory of relativity gives an unified theory of space, time and gravitation; it requires a non-Euclidean four-dimensional geometry, known as Riemannian geometry. Reichenbach explains the main properties of this kind of geometry and the main differences between Euclidean geometry and Riemannian geometry. In Euclidean geometry the distance between two points is given by a simple function of coordinates; also in Minkowski four-dimensional space-time the interval is calculable by means of coordinates. In Euclidean geometry the coordinates have both a metric and topological significance; this is true also in the special theory of relativity. In Riemannian geometry the four coordinates perform a topological function, not a metric one. This means that we cannot calculate the distance between two points by means of coordinates. The metric functions is performed by the metric tensor g; it is a mathematical entity represented by 16 components. The geometry of four-dimensional space-time depends on the metric tensor g; for example, if the components of g are

1 0 0 0
0 1 0 0
0 0 1 0
0 0 0 1

then the geometry is a Minkowski geometry (ie the geometry of the special theory). Thus the tensor g expresses the geometry. But g is determined by the gravitational field, because the metric tensor also expresses the acceleration of the frame of reference and the effects of an acceleration are equivalent to the effects of a gravitational field. The metric tensor g expresses both the physical geometry and the gravitational field. The consequence is astonishingly: the geometry of the universe is produced by gravitational fields. Therefore the general theory of relativity does not reduce gravitation to geometry; on the contrary, geometry is based on gravitation. The properties of space and time are empirical properties caused by gravitational fields.

e. The Reality of Space and Time

Reichenbach asserts (in The philosophy of space and time) that the reality of space and time is an unquestionable result of the epistemological analysis of the theory of relativity. With respect to the problem of reality, space and time are not different from the other physical concepts. But the reality of space and time does not imply the concept of an absolute space and time. Space and time are relational concepts and we can study their properties because of the existence of physical objects, for example, clocks, that realize relationships between space-time entities. Reichenbach also emphasizes the causal theory of space and time: causality is the basis of both philosophical and physical theory of space and time.

3. Quantum Mechanics

a. Interpretation of Quantum Physics: Part I

The main thesis of Reichenbach’s work on quantum mechanics (Philosophic foundations of quantum mechanics) is that there is not any exhaustive interpretation of quantum mechanics which is free from causal anomalies. A causal anomaly is a violation of the principle of local action; this principle states that the action at a distance does not exist. We have found the principle of local action and causal anomalies in Reichenbach’s philosophy of space and time.

Two main interpretations of quantum mechanics are involved with the wave-particle duality. Wave interpretation states that atomic entities are waves or things that resemble waves; it grew out of the discovery of the wave-like nature of light and it is supported by many experiments, for example the two-slit experiment. In this experiment a beam of electrons is direct towards a screen with two slits and an interference pattern is produced behind the screen, showing that electrons act as waves. The corpuscolar interpretation regards atomic entities as particles; it is supported by a long standing tradition and by the fact that atomic entities show corpuscular properties, for example, mass and momentum. Both wave and corpuscular interpretation entail causal anomalies. For example corpuscular interpretation cannot fully explain the two-slit experiment. An electron acting as a particle goes through only one slit and its behaviour is independent of the existence of another slit in a different point of space. In fact, if one slit is open and the other is close, the interference pattern is not produced: electrons behave as if they were informed whether the other slit is open. But wave interpretation cannot fully explain a slightly different experiment. An electron can be localized by a detector put near a slit and the electron is detected as particle. However for every event in quantum realm there is an interpretation by means of particles or waves but there is not a unique interpretation for all events. Both corpuscular and wave interpretation are not verifiable; they are not matter of experience but they are matter of definition.

There are two models that are free of causal anomalies; they are restricted interpretations, ie they exclude the admissibility of certain statements. One is Bohr-Heisenberg interpretation (Niels Bohr, b 1885 d 1962, Danish physicist winner of Nobel prize in 1922, gave the first account of the quantum theory of atoms; Werner Karl Heisenberg, b 1901 d 1976, German physicist winner of Nobel prize in 1932, formulated matrix mechanics and proved the principle of indeterminacy according to which there is no way of measuring both position and momentum of atomic particles). This interpretation states that speaking about values of not measured physical quantities is meaningless. In the two-slit experiment, when the two slits are open and electrons interfere with themselves, the position of electrons cannot be measured; thus a statement about the position of electrons is meaningless and the particle interpretation is forbidden. There are two main faults – Reichenbach says – in Bohr-Heisenbergh interpretation: (i) Heisenberg indeterminacy principle becomes a meta-statement on the semantics of the language of physics and (ii) it implies the presence of meaningless statements in physics.

The other interpretation depends on three-valued logic, ie a formal system that acknowledges three truth values: true, false and indeterminate.

b. Mathematical Formulation of Quantum Mechanics

Reichenbach carefully examines and explains the mathematical formulation of quantum mechanics. It is based on the notion of quantum operator; a quantum operator is a mathematical entity corresponding to a given classical quantity. For example, the quantum operator energy correspond to the energy in classical physics. A quantum operator can only assume discrete values while the corresponding classical quantity assumes continuous values. Note that an operator is not a function; it indicates a set of operation to be performed on a function.

Let U be a classical quantity; U depends on position Q and momentum P, that is U=F[Q,P] (position and momentum are vectors and I use bold face as indicator of vector; I use square brackets to show that a function depends on given quantities). The quantum operator corresponding to U is called Uop and is defined by the following statements.

  1. For every function F[Q], substitute ‘multiply by F[Q]’ to ‘F[Q]’.
  2. Substitute ‘multiply the first partial derivative with respect to Q by C’ to ‘P‘, where C=h/(2*pi*i), h is the Planck constant, pi equals 3.14…, i is the square root of -1.
  3. Substitute ‘multiply the second partial derivative with respect to Q by C^2′ to ‘P‘, where C=h/(2*pi*i), h is the Planck constant, pi equals 3.14…, i is the square root of -1.

c. Examples of Quantum Operators

Let T be the kinetic energy; in classical mechanics, the kinetic energy is given by the ratio of the square of momentum P to twice the mass m, that is T=P^2 / 2m. Quantum operator Top is given by Top=C^2 * (1/2m) * D” (I use symbol D’ to indicate the first partial derivative with respect to position and D” to indicate the second partial derivative with respect to position).

Let H be the mechanical energy, ie the sum of the kinetic energy T and the potential energy V: H=T+V[Q]; therefore Hop=Top+Vop=C^2 * (1/2m) * D” + V[Q]. If F is a given function, the result (indicated by Hop F) of performing the operations described by operator Hop on function F is C^2 * (1/2m) * D” F + V * F.

d. Heisenberg Indeterminacy Principle

Let Pop and Qop the quantum operator corresponding to momentum and position. It is easy to verify that for every function F

(H) Pop Qop F – Qop Pop F = C * F

and the equation H is a mathematical formulation of Heisenberg indeterminacy principle. The proof of equation H is straightforward.

Pop Qop F – Qop Pop F =
Pop (Q * F) – Qop (C * D’ F) =
C * (D’ (Q * F) – Q * (D’ F) =
C * (D’ Q * F + Q * D’ F – Q * D’ F) =
C * F

Reichenbach explains the physical meaning of equation H. Equation H proves that the eigenvalues of position and momentum are different. Now suppose a physicist measures both position and momentum of a particle; let Fp be the eigenfunction corresponding to the measured momentum and Fq be the eigenfunction corresponding to the measured position. From the measurement of position: PSI = Fp; from the measurement of momentum: PSI = Fq. Therefore Fp = Fq and the eigenvalues are the same; but the eigenvalues are different. So position and momentum of a particle cannot be simultaneously measured. Reichenbach asserts that Heisenberg indeterminacy principle is not due to the alleged interference an observer exerts on particles (the explanation of indeterminacy principle in terms of an interference is due to Heisenberg). This principle is an objective law of nature, and it can be stated without reference to observers.

e. The Interpretation of Quantum Physics: Part II

After the mathematical formulation of quantum mechanics, Reichenbach states the basic assumption of the different interpretation of quantum mechanics. Corpuscolar interpretation relies on the following definition. If a measurement of U equals Um, then Um is the values of U not only at the time of measurement but also immediately before and immediately after. If a physicist measures the position of an electron and immediately after its momentum, than he know both position and momentum of the electron. In this interpretation atomic particles have both momentum and position, so they are real particles; a physicist can also measure both momentum and position. The knowledge of both position and momentum is unusable because of the difference between the eigenfunctions: if PSI equals the eigenfunction “position” the knowledge of momentum is totally unused while if PSI equals the eigenfunction “momentum” the knowledge of position is totally unused.

Wave interpretation states that the value of a measured quantity exists after the measurement but before the measurement the quantity assumes simultaneously all possible values. The effect of the measurement is the collapse of wave function.

Bohr-Heisenberg interpretation asserts that the value of a physical quantity exists only after the measurement; a statement about this value before the measurement is therefore meaningless.

The interpretation based on three-valued logic states that a statement about a not measured physical quantity can be neither true nor false: it can be indeterminate. The following tables show the properties of logical connectives in the three-valued logic suggested by Reichenbach (symbols used in these tables differ from symbols used by Reichenbach).

negation: cyclic (-) diametrical (?) complete (^))

A -A ?A ^A

or (v) and (&)
implication: standard (>) alternative (#) quasi (*)
equivalence: standard (=) alternative ()

A B (AvB) (A&B) (A>B) (A#B) (A*B) (A=B) (AB)

Suppose P is the statement “the momentum of the particle is p” and Q is the statement “the position of the particle is q”; then Heisenberg indeterminacy principle is expressed by the following statement: (Pv-P) # –Q. The following table is the truth-table of this sentence.

P Q -P Pv-P -Q –Q (Pv-P) # –Q

The truth of (Pv-P) # –Q implies that the situations described in 1st, 3rd, 7th and 9th row of the truth-table are forbidden. Reichenbach explains how the three-valued interpretation hides causal anomalies. Look at the two-slit experiment. Suppose the two slits are open and the interference pattern is produced. Let P(A) be the probability that an electron goes through the first slit; let P(B) be the probability that an electron goes through the second slit; let P(A,C) be the probability that an electron gone through the first slit hits the screen in point C; let P(B,C) be the probability that an electron gone through the second slit hits the screen in point C; let P(C) the probability that an electron hits the screen in point C. Corpuscular interpretation suggests that

(E2) P(C)=P(A)*P(A,C)+P(B)*P(B,C)

In fact P(C) is not given by equation E2: this is the origin of causal anomalies. Equation E2 can be expressed by the following statement: (AvB)#C, where A is “the electron goes through the first slit”, B is “the electron goes through the second slit” and C is E2. We know that (i) if an electron goes through the first slit then it does not go through the second slit and vice versa, ie A # -B and B # -A; (ii) if an electron does not go through a slit then it goes through the other slit, ie -A # B and -B # A. In classical logic, (i) and (ii) imply AvB, ie [(A # -B)&(B # -A)&(-A # B)&(-B # A)] # AvB is true (look at the following table).

A B [((A # -B) & (B # -A)) & ((-A # B) & (-B # A))] # AvB

The truth-table is restricted to one combination of truth-values because in the other combinations the consequence AvB is true and the statement Z # (AvB) is true for all Z. In corpuscular interpretation of two-slit experiment the statement (A # -B)&(B # -A)&(-A # B)&(-B # A) is true; in classical logic the statement [(A # -B)&(B# -A)&(-A # B)&(-B # A)] # AvB is true and thus also AvB is true; therefore E2 is true. But E2 does not give the correct formula for the probability and so there is a causal anomaly. In three-valued logic, (i) and (ii) do not imply AvB; this fact is proved by means of the following table.

A B [((A # -B) & (B # -A)) & ((-A # B) & (-B # A))] # AvB

Thus we cannot assert E2 and there is not any causal anomaly.

4. Reichenbach’s Epistemology

a. The Structure of Science and the Verifiability Principle

A scientific theory is a formal system which requires a physical interpretation by means of co-ordinative definitions. Reichenbach’s philosophical research on the theory of relativity and quantum mechanics implicitly depends on this view. For example, the distinction between mathematical geometry and physical geometry entails the distinction between a purely formal system and a system interpreted by means of definitions. Co-ordinative definitions are true by convention and cannot be verified, but they are not meaningless; in fact scientific theories require them to acquire an empirical significance. The acknowledgement of the existence of meaningful and not verifiable sentences is very important for a right interpretation of the epistemology of logical positivism. The verifiability principle is often regarded as the most important principle of logical positivism; it states that the meaning of a sentence is its method of verification and a sentence which cannot be verified is meaningless. According to this principle, co-ordinative definitions might be meaningless; on the contrary, in Reichenbach opinion, they are not only meaningful but also required by scientific theories. Note that Reichenbach explicit agrees with verifiability principle. In ‘The philosophical significance of the theory of relativity’ (1949) he says that the meaning of a sentence is reducible to its method of verification; he also says that a physicist can fully understand the Michelson’s experiment only if he adopts the verifiability theory of meaning. In the same essay, Reichenbach says that the logic foundation of the theory of relativity is the discovery that many problems are not verifiable; these problems can be solved by means of co-ordinative definitions. Thus co-ordinative definitions are meaningful and not verifiable. So we must acknowledge that Reichenbach agrees with the verifiability principle and, at the same time, asserts that in scientific theories there are meaningful sentences, namely co-ordinative definitions, that are not verifiable. Why these sentences are not meaningless? Because they belong to scientific theories that are verifiable. For example, Reichenbach states that (i) the Euclidean geometry is not verifiable, (ii) the co-ordinative definitions of geometrical entities are not verifiable but (iii) the Euclidean geometry plus the co-ordinative definitions of geometrical entities is verifiable. The theory must be verifiable, the individual statements belonging to the theory can be not verifiable.

b. Conventionalism vs. Empiricism

In Reichenbach opinion, among the purposes of the philosophy of science is the search for a distinction between empirical and conventional sentences. The separation of empirical from conventional sentences is not only possible but also necessary for a full understanding of scientific theories. Philosophical research on modern science clearly shows that conventional elements are present in scientific knowledge. The description of our world is not uniquely determined by observations, but there is a plurality of equivalent descriptions; for example, we can use different geometry for describing the same space. But conventionalism is in error. For example, conventionalism states that we can always adopt the Euclidean geometry by means of appropriate definitions. But if we adopt a set of definitions so that the geometry on the Earth is Euclidean, it is possible that in another point of the universe the same set of definitions entails a non-Euclidean geometry; so we can discover an objective difference between different points of space. Note that Reichenbach does not state that scientific knowledge can be proved by means of experience. On the contrary, he asserts that scientific theories are based on physical hypotheses which are not a logical consequence of experiments, for example, the general theory of relativity is based on Einstein’s hypothesis that free falling frames of reference are inertial systems; we cannot prove this hypothesis, but we can verify its consequences. Scientific theories cannot be proved, but we can test their forecasts.

c. Causality

Causality plays a central role in Reichenbach’s philosophy of science. Reichenbach uses the theory of causality as a key to provide access to modern physics and understanding of the philosophical significance of both the theory of relativity and quantum mechanics. According to Reichenbach, the causal theory of space and time is the basis for both the theory of relativity and the philosophy of space and time. In the theory of relativity it is always possible to choose a set of co-ordinative definitions satisfying normal causality. Therefore different geometrical systems are not equivalent and they can be divided into two groups, one group satisfying normal causality while the other entails causal anomalies. Only geometrical systems belonging to the first group are admissible. It is the experience that decides whether a given geometry belongs to the first group; thus conventionalism’s view on geometry is wrong. In quantum mechanics there is not any set of co-ordinative definitions which is free from causal anomalies and satisfies classical logic. In fact, a three-valued logic is required to give an interpretation satisfying normal causality.

d. Science and Philosophy

First of all, we must acknowledge his scientific seriousness and physical-mathematical skill. His deep knowledge of modern physics is unquestionable. Reichenbach’s positive attitude towards scientific knowledge was influenced not only by his teachers but also by his own philosophical views. In his opinion, modern physics is concerned with problems that, until the late 19th century, were regarded as philosophical problems, for example, the nature of space and time, the source of gravitation, the real extent of causality. In 17th and 18th century – Reichenbach says – philosophers were usually interested in science and many of them were also mathematicians and physicists, for example, Descartes and Leibniz; Kant’s epistemology was based on scientific knowledge. But since 18th science became extraneous to philosophy. Nowadays – Reichenbach wrote in 1928 – there is an almost complete separation of philosophy from physical sciences; philosophical researches into epistemology are fruitless, because of this separation. On the other hand, scientists cannot explicitly help the progress of epistemology: they are too much involved in technical researches. There is only one way to overcome this difficulty: philosophers, who are not concerned with technical subjects but deal with genuine philosophical problems, must dedicate themselves to the philosophical analysis of modern physics, so they can clearly express the implicit philosophical content of scientific theories. In fact, modern physics is rich in philosophical consequences: there is more philosophy in Einstein’s work than in many philosophical systems.

5. References and Further Reading

Reichenbach’s Main Works, arranged in Chronological Order..

  • 1916 Der Begriff der Wahrscheinlichkeit fur die mathematische Darstellung der Wirklichkeit, dissertation, Erlangen, 1915
  • 1920 Relativitatstheorie und Erkenntnis apriori (English translation The theory of relativity and a priori knowledge, Berkeley : University of California Press, 1965)
  • 1921 ‘Bericht uber eine Axiomatik der Einsteinschen Raum-Zeit-Lehre’ in Phys. Zeitschr., 22
  • 1922 ‘Der gegenwartige Stand der Relativitatsdiskussion’ in Logos, X (English translation ‘The present state of the discussion on relativity’ in Modern philosophy of science : selected essays by Hans Reichenbach, London : Routledge & Kegan Paul ; New York : Humanities press, 1959)
  • 1924 Axiomatik der relativistischen Raum-Zeit-Lehre (English translation Axiomatization of the theory of relativity, Berkeley : University of California Press, 1969)
  • 1924 ‘Die Bewegungslehre bei Newton, Leibniz und Huyghens’ in Kantstudien, 29 (English translation ‘The theory of motion according to Newton, Leibniz, and Huyghens’ in Modern philosophy of science : selected essays by Hans Reichenbach, London : Routledge & Kegan Paul ; New York : Humanities press, 1959)
  • 1925 ‘Die Kausal-strukture der Welt und der Unterschied von Vergangenheit und Zukunft’ in Sitzungsber d. Bayer. Akad. d. Wiss., math-naturwiss.
  • 1927 Von Kopernikus bis Einstein. Der Wandel unseres Weltbildes (English translation From Copernicus to Einstein, New York : Alliance book corp., 1942)
  • 1928 Philosophie der Raum-Zeit-Lehre (English translation The philosophy of space and time, New York : Dover Publications, 1958)
  • 1929 ‘Stetige Wahrscheinlichkeits folgen’ in Zeitschr. f. Physik, 53
  • 1929 ‘Ziele und Wege der physikalische Erkenntnis’ in Handbuch der Physik ed. by Hans Geiger and Karl Scheel, Bd IV, Berlin : Julius Springer
  • 1930 Atom und kosmos. Das physikalische Weltbild der Gegenwart (English translation Atom and cosmos; the world of modern physics, London : G. Allen & Unwin, ltd., 1932)
  • 1931 Ziele und Wege der heutigen Naturphilosophie (English translation ‘Aims and methods of modern philosophy of nature’ in Modern philosophy of science : selected essays, Westport : Greenwood Press, 1959)
  • 1933 ‘Kant und die Naturwissenschaft’, Die Naturwissenschaften, 33-34
  • 1935 Wahrscheinlichkeitslehre : eine Untersuchung uber die logischen und mathematischen Grundlagen der Wahrscheinlichkeitsrechnung (English translation The theory of probability, an inquiry into the logical and mathematical foundations of the calculus of probability, Berkeley : University of California Press, 1948)
  • 1938 Experience and prediction: an analysis of the foundations and the structure of knowledge, Chicago : University of Chicago Press
  • 1944 Philosophic foundations of quantum mechanics, Berkeley and Los Angeles : University of California press
  • 1947 Elements of symbolic logic, New York, Macmillan Co.
  • 1948 Philosophy and physics, ‘Faculty research lectures, 1946’, Berkeley, Univ. of California Press
  • 1949 ‘The philosophical significance of the theory of relativity’ in Albert Einstein: philosopher-scientist, edit by P. A. Schillp, Evanston : The Library of Living Philosophers
  • 1951 The rise of scientific philosophy, Berkeley : University of California Press
  • 1953 ‘Les fondaments logiques de la mechanique des quanta’ in Annales de l’Istitut Henri Poincare’, Tome XIII Fasc II
  • 1954 Nomological statements and admissible operations, Amsterdam : Nort Holland Publishing Company
  • 1956 The direction of time, Berkeley : University of California Press

Collected works (in German).

  • Gesammelte Werke : in 9 Banden ; herausgegeben von Andreas Kamlah und Maria Reichenbach, Wiesbaden : Vieweg
  • 1977 Bd. 1: Der Aufstieg der wissenschaftlichen Philosophie
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Author Information

Mauro Murzi

Wang Bi (226—249 C.E.)

Wang Bi (Wang Pi), styled Fusi, is regarded as one of the most important interpreters of the classical Chinese texts known as the Daodejing (Tao Te Ching) and the Yijing (I Ching). He lived and worked during the period after the collapse of the Han dynasty in 220 C.E., an era in which elite interest began to shift away from Confucianism toward Daoism. As a self-identified Confucian, Wang Bi wanted to create an understanding of Daoism that was consistent with Confucianism but which did not fall into what he considered to be the errors of then-popular Daoist sectarian groups.  He understood his main task to be the restoration of order and a sense of direction to Chinese society after the turbulent final years of the Han, and offered the ideal of establishing the “true way” (zhendao) as the solution.  Although he died at the age of twenty-four, his interpretations of Daoism became influential for several reasons.  The edition of the Daodejing that he used in his commentary on that work has been the basis for almost every translation into a Western language for nearly two centuries.  Moreover, his interpretations of Daoist material did not undermine Confucianism, making them palatable to later Confucian thinkers.  Finally, Wang Bi’s work provided a way of talking about indigenous Chinese beliefs that made them seem compatible with the introduction of Indian Buddhist texts and ideas in the decades to follow.

Table of Contents

  1. The Context of Wang Bi’s Work
  2. Wang Bi’s Commentaries
    1. On the Analects
    2. On the Yijing
    3. On the Daodejing
  3. Central Ideas in Wang Bi’s Writings
    1. On Language
    2. On Non-Being
    3. On “The One”
    4. On Wuwei
    5. On Ziran
  4. Wang Bi’s Influence on Chinese Philosophy
  5. References and Further Reading

1. The Context of Wang Bi’s Work

Wang Bi lived and worked during the period after the collapse of the Han dynasty in 220 C.E., an era in which elite interest began to shift toward Daoism. A brief explanation of this transformation of intellectual interests in early medieval China is necessary in order to understand Wang Bi’s thought in its original context.

Beginning with the reign of Emperor Wu (c. 140-187 B.C.E.), the Han state embraced Confucianism as its official ideology. Training in the Confucian classics became mandatory for all officials, and there was an active program of suppression of alternative thought, including the persecution of Prince Liu An of Huainan, a prominent Daoist supporter. Nevertheless, Daoism did not disappear. By the first century C.E., Daoist texts began to reappear in political discussion, and during the following century, sectarian Daoist movements such as the tianshi (Celestial Masters) became active. Although Confucian scholars were still needed by the rulers of post-Han states such as the Wei because of their knowledge and experience in state rituals and administrative matters, by Wang Bi’s time Daoism was “in the air” and exercising a powerful influence on the thinking of commoner and aristocrat alike.

Accordingly, the interests of some members of the educated elite turned toward Daoism. They labored to create a renaissance in Daoist thought, but one that directly avoided following the religious beliefs and practices of the Celestial Masters and the various permutations of Daoism that had rapidly developed. These thinkers are generally gathered loosely under the title of xuanxue (Dark Learning, Mysterious Learning or Profound Learning), sometimes called Neo-Daoism. The term xuanxue was derived from a line in the first chapter of the Daodejing, according to which the dao (Way) is xuan zhi you xuan (darker than dark). Among the principal xuanxue figures were Zhong Hui (225-264 C.E.), Xiang Xiu (c. 223-300 C.E.), Guo Xiang (d. 312 C.E.), and Wang Bi.

A Confucian rather than a sectarian Daoist, Wang Bi wanted to create an understanding of Daoism that was consistent with Confucianism but which did not fall into what he considered to be the errors of the Celestial Masters and their popular religious practices. He understood his main task to be the restoration of order and a sense of direction to Chinese society after the turbulent final years of the Han. He offered the ideal of establishing the “true way” (zhendao) as the solution. Undoubtedly, his ultimate goal was to examine the mysterious knowledge of creation and translate it into a viable political and social program. Due to his untimely death, however, he had very little impact on the politics of his day. Nevertheless, through his commentarial work and the way in which his ideas were regarded as congenial to early Chinese Buddhism, his philosophical influence was profound.

2. Wang Bi’s Commentaries

Wang Bi’s best known commentaries are those on the Daodejing and Yijing. What is often overlooked is that he also wrote a commentary on the Confucian Analects (Lunyu Shiyi), some fragments of which still survive. His writings have been collected and annotated in two volumes entitled Wang Bi ji jiaoshi (Critical Edition of Wang Bi’s Collected Works). The bibliography below lists this work and other English translations of his major commentaries (see References and Further Reading).

a. On the Analects

What we know about the Analects commentary is that it was written as a criticism of the texts that Wang’s mentor He Yan (Ho Yen, d. 249 B.C.E.) considered to be most important. Wang’s approach, as far as we can tell from what remains of the commentary, was to focus on those passages that stress the limited capacity of language, especially with respect to the inability to define in language the nature of the sage. His selection of passages and remarks sets up a substantial rapprochement between Confucianism and his version of Daoism by basically providing him with a kind of hermeneutical license. His commentaries are in the zhangju (“chapter and verse”) format, in which a great deal of emphasis is placed on individual words and images in the “verses” and the meaning that lies behind them, carefully avoiding any sort of approach that regards philosophical concepts as referential.

b. On the Yijing

Wang’s commentary on the Yijing, a traditional Chinese divinatory text of uncertain antiquity consisting of hexagrams and their interpretations, cross-annotates it with the Daodejing. In this way, he transforms the interpretive tradition concerned with the Yijing by setting aside what he regards as an over-reliance on mathematical and symbolic readings of the text (typical of Han scholars) and exposing what he takes to be its xuanxue.For example, while Han thinkers such as Ma Rong (79-106 C.E.) tried to make textual images referential, Wang avoided this consistently. Alan Chan specifically mentions Ma’s explanation of the Yi jing comment, “the number of the great expansion is fifty, but use is made only of forty-nine.” Ma claims that “fifty” refers to the polestar, the two forms of yin and yang, the sun and moon, the four seasons, the five elements (wuxing), the twelve months, and the twenty-four calendar periods. In Ma’s interpretation, because the polestar does not move, it is not used, and thus the number is forty-nine, not fifty. In contrast to this approach, Wang looks behind the language for underlying principles or xuanxue meanings.

Wang’s commentary on the hexagrams draws heavily from passages in the Daodejing and Zhuangzi . He uses major Daoist ideas to interpret the Yijing, culminating in his theory that change and dao are unified and his position that Laozi’s ideas are already contained in the Yijing. He appropriates the notions of being (you) and nothingness (wu) from the Daodejing and uses them in his interpretation of divination.

c. On the Daodejing

Many of Wang’s most basic ideas concerning the Daodejing are discussed below. But with respect to his commentary on this work, he is probably as well known for the text that was transmitted with the commentary as he is famed for the commentary itself. This text became the basis, first for Chinese scholarship on the Daodejing, and later for translations of the text into Western languages. In his A Chinese Reading of the Daodejing: Wang Bi’s Commentary on the Laozi with Critical Text and Translation, the best-known Western scholar of Wang Bi, Rudolf Wagner, provides a careful study of Wang’s work on the text.

The recent translation of the Daodejing by Roger Ames and David Hall is based on a conflation of the two Mawangdui (MWD) versions of the text, supplemented by that of Wang Bi. Mawangdui is the name of a site near Changsha in Hunan province in which some early Han tombs containing texts were discovered in 1972. These discoveries include two incomplete editions of the Daodejing on silk scrolls, now simply called “A”and “B.” Ames and Hall believe that Wang was actually working from a textual source that was closer to their own conflated version of the MWD materials than the received text that he had put in his own commentary (Ames and Hall, 76). In contrast, another recent translator of the Daodejing, P.J. Ivanhoe, believes that although the MWD versions offer help with how one might translate certain passages, there is nothing in them that fundamentally conflicts with or alters our understanding of the core philosophical notions of the Wang Bi text.

Wang’s version of the Daodejing contains eighty-one chapters that are divided into two books, but the actual division of the text into two books predates the Wang Bi edition. Later versions of the text built upon that of Wang and added book and chapter titles. In Wang’s edition, Book One consists of chapters 1 through 37, and later it came to be called the dao half of the text. Book Two consists of chapters 38 to 81 and is known as the de half. One of the principal differences between the MWD versions and that of Wang Bi is that the order of the chapters is reversed, with 38-81 in the Wang Bi coming before chapters 1-37 in the MWD versions. Robert Henricks has published a translation of these texts with extensive notes and comparisons with the Wang Bi under the title Lao-Tzu: Te-tao Ching.

3. Central Ideas in Wang Bi’s Writings

a. On Language

A substantial part of Wang’s interpretive philosophy is rooted in his view of language. His view of language is consistent with that of the Daodejing and the Zhuangzi. Both works teach that words are inadequate for the expression of truth. As Daodejing 1 says, “The way that can be spoken of is not the constant way. The name that can be named is not the true name.” For Wang, this means that the dao lies beyond language He goes further, however, holding that words must always be distinguished from their underlying meaning. Indeed, Wang claims that taking words referentially is an obstacle to xuanxue — that words must be forgotten in order to penetrate into the world of meaning. He finds support for this view in classical Daoist texts. Specifically, he makes use of the Zhuangzi’s teaching about “forgetfulness” (chs. 4, 12, 24). This view of language gives Wang the freedom to uncover what he believes to be the profound meaning that lies behind the words of the classical texts of Daoism, which in turn makes it easier for him to tie them to the Yijing and even to the Confucius of the Analects. It also allows him to offer a construction of Daoist ideas that can be distinguished sharply from that of the sectarian Daoism of his day.

b. On Non-Being

Wang’s commentary on the Daodejing centers around his interpretation of the concept of “nothing” (wu) or “non-being” as that out of which the ten thousand things (e.g., all phenomena) arise. He believes that “nothing” is pointed to in the text by means of its fundamental analogies: valley, canyon, bowl, door, window, pitcher, and hub of a wheel. There can be no doubt that Wang regards “nothing” as the dao. When he explains the first sentence of Daodejing 6 (“The spirit of the valley never dies; it is called the obscure female”), he says, “The spirit of the valley is the Non-Being found in the center of a valley. The Non-Being has neither form, nor shadow; it conforms completely to what surrounds it….Its form is invisible: it is the Supreme Being.”

c. On “The One”

In articulating his understanding of the dao, Wang appeals directly to the Daodejing’s comments on cosmogony, according to which the dao gives birth to One, One gives birth to two, two to three, and three to the ten thousand things. Yet Wang does not believe that the One is a being. On the contrary, it is the mysterious center of things, like the hub of a wheel. The dao is Non-Being. Dao is not an agent. It does not have a will. To say that it lies at the “beginning” is not to make a temporal statement, but a metaphysical one. On Daodejing 25, Wang writes, “It is spoken of as ‘Dao’ insofar as there is thus something [for things] to come from.” Interpreting the fifty-first chapter, he writes, “The Dao—this is where things come from.” Wang makes his views clearer when he offers a commentary on the word “One.” Han thinkers took the One referentially and identified it with the North Star. But Wang takes a radically different approach. For him, the One is not used referentially in terms of some external thing, nor is it a number. It is that on which numbers depend.

The idea that the One underlies and unites all phenomena is also vigorously stressed in Wang’s commentary on the Yijing. In this work, Wang makes it clear just how it is that dao as Non-Being is related to the world of Being. The Yijing consists of hexagrams made up of six broken lines (representing the yin cosmic force) and unbroken lines (representing the yang cosmic force). Since ancient times, the text has been used as a tool for divination. In Wang’s day, the typical interpretation of a hexagram associated it with a specific external event, but Wang uses his theory of language to put forward the view that the hexagram’s meaning lies in identifying the general principle (li) behind all particular objects. Wang thinks that the principle is discoverable in one of the six lines of a hexagram, so that the other five become secondary. These principles constitute the fiber of the One.

d. On Wuwei

Wang Bi’s views on the sage reveal his understanding of wuwei (effortless action). He believes that the sage rises above all distinctions and contradictions. According to Wang, although the sage remains in the midst of human affairs, he accomplishes things by taking no unnatural action. Thus, the sage’s conduct is an example of wuwei. Wang is clear that this does not mean that the sage “folds his arms and sits in silence in the midst of some mountain forest.” It means that the sage acts naturally. To such a sage, all life transformations are the same and one must not impose value judgments on them. In making decisions, the sage should have “no deliberate mind of his own” (wuxin) but instead should respond to life events spontaneously, without any discrimination. In short, this means that the sage puts aside desires because they are corrupting and destructive. Strictly speaking, the sage’s wuwei is not a strategy to diminish desire; it is evidence of the absence of desire — emptiness, or Non-Being. In Wang’s view, Confucius was such a sage because his life had broadened the dao. (Analects 15.29) Such interpretations created fertile ground in which Buddhism could take root, thereby entering the Chinese intellectual stream through Daoism.

e. On Ziran

The Daoist concept of ziran (usually translated as “spontaneity” or “naturalness”) is interpreted by Wang Bi to mean “the real.” Likewise, in his commentary on the Daodejing, de is not a reference to virtue (as it usually is understood), or even less to specific virtues, but to that which persons obtain from dao (see ch. 51). Yet, for Wang, the text teaches that dao moves spontaneously and accomplishes its tasks. Providing for all, “nothing is done, but no thing is left undone.” Thus, Wang thinks that humans have created disorder by their thought and action. If they return to dao in wuwei, then de will become available as ziran. De will not be the result of human action, politics, or contrivance. If the ruler becomes a sage and embraces wuwei, he will transform the people and broaden the dao, just as Confucius (not Laozi) did.

4. Wang Bi’s Influence on Chinese Philosophy

Wang Bi’s metaphysics has influenced the development of Chinese philosophy in at least two important respects.

First, after Wang Bi, some Chinese literati began to distinguish “philosophical” Daoism (daojia) from “religious” Daoism (daojiao), a distinction that was reinforced by the geographical relocation of the tianshi movement and elite attempts to devalue it as a legitimate extension of classical Daoist thought. This distinction has persisted throughout the history of Chinese thought, but it is an unfortunate one, and moreover one without any basis in the historical practice of Daoist communities (Kirkland, 2). In constructing his interpretive framework, Wang avoided sectarian Daoism and did not take seriously the philosophical roots of tianshi thought. He made no serious attempt to consider how Daoism was practiced before the Han. Thus, Wang’s typology of Daoism laid the groundwork for what is arguably not only the most influential, but also the most systematically misleading, way of thinking about the development of Chinese philosophy.

Second, Wang’s commentary on the Daodejing was crucial for the process by which the Mahayana Buddhist dharma (doctrine, teaching) began to gain a foothold in China. The most obvious example of Wang’