Autonomy is an individual’s capacity for self-determination or self-governance. Beyond that, it is a much-contested concept that comes up in a number of different arenas. For example, there is the folk concept of autonomy, which usually operates as an inchoate desire for freedom in some area of one’s life, and which may or may not be connected with the agent’s idea of the moral good. This folk concept of autonomy blurs the distinctions that philosophers draw among personal autonomy, moral autonomy, and political autonomy. Moral autonomy, usually traced back to Kant, is the capacity to deliberate and to give oneself the moral law, rather than merely heeding the injunctions of others. Personal autonomy is the capacity to decide for oneself and pursue a course of action in one’s life, often regardless of any particular moral content. Political autonomy is the property of having one’s decisions respected, honored, and heeded within a political context.

Another distinction that can be made is between autonomy as a bare capacity to make decisions and of autonomy as an ideal. When autonomy functions as an ideal, agents who do not meet certain criteria in having reached a decision are deemed non-autonomous with respect to that decision. This can function both locally, in terms of particular actions, and globally, in terms of agents as a whole. For instance, children, agents with cognitive disabilities of a certain kind, or members of oppressed groups have been deemed non-autonomous because of their inability to fulfill certain criteria of autonomous agency, due to individual or social constraints.

There is debate over whether autonomy needs to be representative of a kind of “authentic” or “true” self. This debate is often connected to whether the autonomy theorist believes that an “authentic” or “true” self exists. In fact, conceptions of autonomy are often connected to conceptions of the nature of the self and its constitution. Theorists who hold a socially constituted view of the self will have a different idea of autonomy (sometimes even denying its existence altogether) than theorists who think that there can be some sort of core “true” self, or that selves as agents can be considered in abstraction from relational and social commitments and contexts.

Finally, autonomy has been criticized as being a bad ideal, for promoting a pernicious model of human individuality that overlooks the importance of social relationships and dependency. Responses to these criticisms have come in various forms, but for the most part philosophers of autonomy have striven to express the compatibility of the social aspects of human action within their conceptions of self-determination, arguing that there need not necessarily be an antagonism between social and relational ties, and our ability to decide our own course of action.

This article will focus primarily on autonomy at the level of the individual and the work being done on personal autonomy, but will also address the connection of autonomy to issues in bioethics and political theory.

Table of Contents

  1. The History of Autonomy
    1. Before Kant
    2. Kant
    3. The Development of Individualism in Autonomy
    4. Autonomy and Psychological Development
  2. Personal Autonomy
    1. Content-Neutral or Procedural Accounts
      1. Hierarchical Procedural Accounts
      2. Criticisms of Hierarchical Accounts
      3. Coherentist Accounts
    2. Substantive Accounts
  3. Feminist Philosophy of Autonomy
    1. Feminist Criticisms of Autonomy
    2. Relational Autonomy
  4. Autonomy in Social and Political Context
    1. Autonomy and Political Theory
    2. Autonomy and Bioethics
  5. References and Further Reading

1. The History of Autonomy

a. Before Kant

The roots of autonomy as self-determination can be found in ancient Greek philosophy, in the idea of self-mastery. For both Plato and Aristotle, the most essentially human part of the soul is the rational part, illustrated by Plato’s representation of this part as a human, rather than a lion or many-headed beast, in his description of the tripartite soul in the Republic. A just soul, for Plato, is one in which this rational human part governs over the two others. Aristotle identifies the rational part of the soul as most truly a person’s own in the Nicomachean Ethics (1166a17-19).

Plato and Aristotle also both associate the ideal for humanity with self-sufficiency and a lack of dependency on others. For Aristotle, self-sufficiency, or autarkeia, is an essential ingredient of happiness, and involves a lack of dependence upon external conditions for happiness. The best human will be one who is ruled by reason, and is not dependent upon others for his or her happiness.

This ideal continues through Stoic philosophy and can be seen in the early modern philosophy of Spinoza. The concept of autonomy itself continued to develop in the modern period with the decrease of religious authority and the increase of political liberty and emphasis on individual reason. Rousseau’s idea of moral liberty, as mastery over oneself, is connected with civil liberty and the ability to participate in legislation.

b. Kant

Kant further developed the idea of moral autonomy as having authority over one’s actions. Rather than letting the principles by which we make decisions be determined by our political leaders, pastors, or society, Kant called upon the will to determine its guiding principles for itself, thus connecting the idea of self-government to morality; instead of being obedient to an externally imposed law or religious precept, one should be obedient to one’s own self-imposed law.  The former he called heteronomy; the latter autonomy. In his “What is Enlightenment” essay, he described enlightenment as “the human being’s emergence from his self-incurred minority” and called on his readers to have the courage to use their own understanding “without direction from another” (Kant 1996, 17). This description is close to what we might acknowledge today as personal autonomy, but Kant’s account is firmly located within his moral philosophy.

In acting we are guided by maxims, which are the subjective principles by which we might personally choose to abide. If these maxims can be deemed universal, such that they would be assented to and willed by any rational being, and thus not rooted in any individual’s particular contingent experience, then they may gain the status of objective laws of morality. Each moral agent, then, is to be seen as a lawgiver in a community where others are also lawgivers in their own right, and hence are to be respected as ends in themselves; Kant calls this community the kingdom of ends.

While the will is supposed to be autonomous, for Kant, it is also not supposed to be arbitrary or particularistic in its determinations. He sees our inclinations and emotional responses as external to the process of the will’s self-legislation; consequently, letting them determine our actions is heteronomous rather than autonomous. Feelings, emotions, habits, and other non-intellectual factors are excluded from autonomous decision-making. Any circumstances that particularize us are also excluded from autonomous decision-making.

The reason for Kant’s exclusion of feelings, inclinations, and other particular aspects of our lives from the structure of autonomy is rooted in his metaphysical account of the human being, which radically separates the phenomenal human self from the noumenal human self. All empirical aspects of our selfhood — all aspects of our experience — are part of the phenomenal self, and subject to the deterministic laws of natural causality. Our freedom, on the other hand, cannot be perceived or understood; rather we must posit the freedom of the will as the basis for our ability to act morally.

Contemporary Kantians within moral theory do not adhere to Kant’s metaphysics, but seek to understand how something like Kant’s conception of autonomy can still stand today. Thomas Hill suggests, for example, that the separation of our free will from our empirical selfhood be taken less as a metaphysical idea but as a normative claim about what ought to count as reasons for acting (Hill 1989, 96-97)

There are significant differences between Kant’s conception of moral autonomy and the conceptions of personal autonomy developed within the last thirty years, which attempt to articulate how social and cultural influences can be compatible with autonomous decision-making. Further, the majority of contemporary theories of personal autonomy are content-neutral accounts of autonomy which are unconcerned with whether or not a person is acting according to moral laws; they focus more on determining whether or not a person is acting for his or her own reasons than on putting any restrictions on autonomous action.

c. The Development of Individualism in Autonomy

Between Kant’s description of moral autonomy and the recent scholarship on personal autonomy, however, there was a process of individualizing the idea of autonomy. The Romantics, reacting against the emphasis on the universality of reason put forth by the Enlightenment, of which Kant’s philosophy was a part, prized particularity and individuality. They highlighted the role of the passions and emotions over reason, and the importance of developing one’s own unique self. John Stuart Mill also praised and defended the development and cultivation of individuality as worthwhile in itself, writing that “A person whose desires and impulses are his own – are the expression of his own nature, as it has been developed and modified by his own culture – is said to have a character. One whose desires and impulses are not his own has no character, no more than a steam engine has a character” (Mill 1956, 73).

The Romantic conception of individuality was then echoed within the conception of authenticity that runs through phenomenological and existential philosophy. Heidegger posits an inner call of conscience summoning us away from ‘das Man’: in order to be authentic, we need to heed this inner call and break away from inauthentically following the crowd. This conception of authenticity became intertwined with the idea of autonomy: both involve a call to think for oneself and contain a streak of individualism (see Hinchman 1996).

Unlike the universalism espoused by Kantian autonomy, however, authenticity, like the Romantic view, involves a call to be one’s own person, not merely to think for oneself. For Kant, thinking for oneself would, if undertaken properly, lead to universalizing one’s maxims; for both the Romantics and the Existentialists, as well as for Mill, there is no such expectation. This division is still present in the contrast between conceiving of autonomy as a key feature of moral motivation, and autonomy as self-expression and development of individual practical identity.

The emphasis on autonomy within this strain of philosophy was criticized by Emmanuel Lévinas, who sees autonomy as part of our selfish and close-minded desire to strive toward our own fulfillment and self-gratification rather than being open to the disruptive call of the other’s needs (Lévinas 1969). He argues for the value of heteronomy over autonomy. For Lévinas, in heteronomy, the transcendent face of the other calls the ego into question, and the self realizes its unchosen responsibility and obligation to the other. The self is hence not self-legislating, but is determined by the call of the other. This criticism of the basic structure of autonomy has been taken up within continental ethics, which attempts to determine how or whether a practical, normative ethics could be developed within this framework (see for example Critchley 2007).

d. Autonomy and Psychological Development

The connection between autonomy and the ideal of developing one’s own individual self was adopted within the humanistic psychologies of Abraham Maslow and Carl Rogers, who saw the goal of human development as “self-actualization” and “becoming a person,” respectively. For Maslow and Rogers, the most developed person is the most autonomous, and autonomy is explicitly associated with not being dependent on others.

More recently Lawrence Kohlberg developed an account of moral psychological development, in which more developed agents display a greater amount of moral autonomy and independence in their judgments. The highest level bears a great resemblance to the Kantian moral ideal, in its reference to adopting universal values and standards as one’s own.

Kohlberg’s work was criticized by Carol Gilligan, who argued that this pattern reflected male development, but not female. Instead of taking “steps toward autonomy and independence,” in which “separation itself becomes the model and the measure of growth,” “for women, identity has as much to do with intimacy as with separation” (Gilligan 1982, 98). The trajectory is thus less about individualization and independence than toward ultimately balancing and harmonizing an agent’s interests with those of others.

Gilligan does not entirely repudiate autonomy itself as a value, but she also does not suggest how it can be distinguished from the ideals of independence and separation from others. Her critiques have been widely influential and have played a major role in provoking work on feminist ethics and, despite her criticism of the ideal of autonomy, conceptions of “relational autonomy.”

The contemporary literature on personal autonomy within philosophy tends to avoid these psychological ideas of individual development and self-actualization. For the most part, it adopts a content-neutral approach that rejects any particular developmental criteria for autonomous action, and is more concerned with articulating the structure by which particular actions can be deemed autonomous (or, conversely, the structure by which an agent can be deemed autonomous with respect to particular actions).

2. Personal Autonomy

The contemporary discussion of personal autonomy can primarily be distinguished from Kantian moral autonomy through its commitment to metaphysical neutrality. Related to this is the adherence to at least a procedural individualism: within contemporary personal autonomy accounts, an action is not judged to be autonomous because of its rootedness in universal principles, but based on features of the action and decision-making process purely internal and particular to the individual agent.

The main distinction within personal autonomy is that between content-neutral accounts, which do not specify any particular values or principles that must be endorsed by the autonomous agent, and substantive accounts which specify some particular value or values that must be included within autonomous decision-making.

a. Content-Neutral or Procedural Accounts

Content-neutral accounts, also called procedural, are those which deem a particular action autonomous if it has been endorsed by a process of critical reflection. These represent the majority of accounts of personal autonomy. Procedural accounts determine criteria by which an agent’s actions can be said to be autonomous, that do not depend on any particular conception of what kinds of actions are autonomous or what kinds of agents are autonomous. They are neutral with respect to what an agent might conceive of as good or might be trying to achieve.

i. Hierarchical Procedural Accounts

The beginning of the contemporary discussion of personal autonomy is in the 1970s works of Harry Frankfurt and Gerald Dworkin. Their concern was to give an account of what kind of individual freedom ought to be protected, and how that moral freedom may be described in the context of contemporary conceptions of free will. Their insight was that our decisions are worth protecting if they are somehow rooted in our values and overall commitments and objectives, and that they are not worth protecting if they run counter to those values, commitments, and objectives. The concept of personal autonomy, thus, can be used as a way of protecting certain decisions from paternalistic interference. We may not necessarily want to honor the decision of a weak-willed person who decides to do something against their better judgment and against their conscious desire to do otherwise, whereas we do want to protect a person’s decision to pursue an action that accords with their self-consciously held values, even if it is not what we ourselves would have done. Frankfurt and Dworkin phrase this insight in terms of a hierarchy of desires.

Frankfurt’s and Dworkin’s hierarchical accounts of autonomy form the basis upon which the mainstream discussion builds and reacts against. Roughly speaking, according to this hierarchical model, an agent is autonomous with respect to an action on the condition that his or her first-order desire to commit the act is sanctioned by a second-order volition endorsing the first-order desire (see Frankfurt 1988, 12-25). This account is neutral with respect to what the origins of the higher-order desires may be, and thus does not exclude values and desires that are socially or relationally constituted. The cause of such desires does not matter, solely the agent’s identification with them (Frankfurt 1988, 53-54). Autonomy includes our ability to consider and ask whether we do, in fact, identify with our desires or whether we might wish to override them (Dworkin 1988).  The “we”, in this case, is constituted by our higher-order preferences; Dworkin speaks of them as the agent’s “true self” (Dworkin 1989, 59).

ii. Criticisms of Hierarchical Accounts

There are several different objections to the hierarchical model, mostly revolving around the problem in locating the source of an agent’s autonomy, and questioning the idea that autonomy can be located somehow in the process of reflective endorsement itself.

First, the Problem of Manipulation criticism points out that because Frankfurt’s account is ahistorical, it does not protect against the possibility that someone, such as a hypnotist, may have interfered with the agent’s second-order desires. We would hesitate to call such a hypnotized or mind-controlled agent autonomous with respect to his or her actions under these circumstances, but since the hierarchical model does not specify where or how the second order volitions ought to be generated, it cannot adequately distinguish between an autonomous agent and a mind-controlled one. The structure of autonomous agency therefore seems to have a historical dimension to it, since the history of how we developed or generated our volitions seems to matter (see Mele 2001, 144-173).

John Christman develops a historical model of autonomy in order to rectify this problem, such that the means and historical process by which an agent reaches certain decisions is used in determining his or her status as autonomous or not (Christman 1991). This way, an agent brainwashed into having desire X would be deemed nonautonomous with respect to X.  The theory runs into difficulty in a case where an agent might freely choose to give up his or her autonomy, or conversely where an agent might endorse a desire but not endorse the means by which he or she was forced into developing the desire (see Taylor 2005, 10-12), but at least it draws attention to some of the temporal features of autonomous agency.

Another criticism of the hierarchical model is the Regress or Incompleteness Problem. According to Frankfurt and Dworkin, an agent is autonomous with respect to his or her first order desires as long as they are endorsed by second-order desires. However, this raises the question of the source of the second-order volitions; if they themselves rely on third-order volitions, and so on, then there is the danger of an infinite regress in determining the source of the autonomous endorsement (see Watson 1975). If the second order desires are autonomous for some other reason than a higher-order volition, then the hierarchical model is incomplete in its explanation of autonomy. Frankfurt, while acknowledging that there is “no theoretical limit” to the series of higher order desires, holds that the series can end with an agent’s “decisive commitment” to one of the first order desires (Frankfurt 1988, 21). However, the choice of terminating the series is itself arbitrary if there no reason behind it (Watson 1975).

Frankfurt responds to this criticism in “Identification and Wholeheartedness” by defining a decisive commitment as one which the agent makes without reservation, and where the agent feels no reason to continue deliberating (Frankfurt 1988, 168-9). To stop at this point is, Frankfurt argues, hardly arbitrary. It is possible that the agent is mistaken in his or her judgment, but that is always a possibility in deliberation, and thus not an obstacle to Frankfurt’s theory in particular. In making a decision, an agent “also seeks thereby to overcome or to supersede a condition of inner division and to make himself into an integrated whole” (Frankfurt 1988, 174). Thus, by making this decision, the agent has endorsed an intention that establishes “a constraint by which other preferences and decisions are to be guided” (Frankfurt 1988, 175), and thus is self-determining and autonomous.

The criterion of wholeheartedness and unified agency has been criticized by Diana Meyers, who argues for a decentered, fivefold notion of the subject, which includes the unitary, decision-making self, but also acknowledges the functions of the self as divided, as relational, as social, as embodied, and as unconscious (Meyers 2005). The ideal of wholeheartedness has also been criticized on the grounds that it does not reflect the agency of agents from oppressed groups or from mixed traditions. Edwina Barvosa-Carter sees ambivalence as an inescapable feature of much decision-making, especially for mixed-race individuals who have inherited conflicting values, commitments, and traditions (Barvosa-Carter 2007). Marina Oshana makes a similar point, with reference to living within a racist society (Oshana 2005).

In any case, it is a puzzle how decisive commitments or higher-order desires acquire their authority without themselves being endorsed, since deriving authority from external manipulation would seem to undermine this authority. This is the Ab Initio Problem: If the source of an agent’s autonomy is ultimately something that can’t itself be reflectively endorsed, then the agent’s autonomy seems to originate with something with respect to which he or she is non-autonomous, something that falls outside the hierarchical model.

A related objection to the Regress Problem is that this hierarchical account seems to give an unjustified ontological priority to higher versions of the self (see Thalberg 1978). Marilyn Friedman has argued that it begs the question to assume some sort of uncaused “true self” at the top of the hierarchical pyramid. In order to give a procedural account that would avoid these objections, Friedman has proposed an integration model in which desires of different orders ought to be integrated together, rather than being constructed in a pyramid (Friedman 1986).

iii. Coherentist Accounts

Part of the appeal of understanding autonomy is not simply in explaining how we make decisions, but because the idea of autonomy suggests something about how we identify ourselves, what we identify with. For Frankfurt, we identify with a lower level desire if we have a second order volition endorsing it. However, our second order volitions don’t necessarily represent us — we may have no reason for them, which Frankfurt acknowledges.

This concern drives some of the other approaches to personal autonomy, such as Laura Ekstrom’s coherentist account (Ekstrom 1993). Since autonomy is self-governance, it stands to reason that in order to understand autonomous agency, we must clarify our notion of the self and hence what counts as the self’s own reasons for acting; she argues that this will help avoid the Regress Problem and the Ab Initio Problem.

Ekstrom’s account of self is based on the endorsement of preferences. An agent has a preference if he or she holds a certain first level desire to be good; it is similar to a second order volition for Frankfurt. It presupposes higher level states since they are the result of an agent’s higher order reflection about the agent’s desires with regard to goodness. A self, then, is a particular character with certain beliefs and preferences which have been endorsed in a process of self-reflection, and the ability to reshape those beliefs and preferences in light of self-evaluation. The true self includes those beliefs and preferences which cohere together; that coherence itself gives them authorization. A preference is thus endorsed if it coheres with the agent’s character.

Michael Bratman develops a similar account, arguing that our personal identity is partly constituted by the organizing and coordinating function of our long-range plans and intentions (Bratman 2007, 5). Our decisions are autonomous or self-governing with respect to these plans.

This is, of course, only a very brief account of some of the literature on proceduralist accounts of autonomy, and it omits the various defenses of the hierarchical model and the objections to Friedman’s, Christman’s, and others’ formulations. But it should be enough to make clear the way in which theorists offering these accounts strive to ensure that no particular view of what constitutes a flourishing human life is imported into their accounts of autonomy. Autonomy is just one valued human property amongst others, and need not do all the work of describing human flourishing (Friedman 2003).

b. Substantive Accounts

Some doubt, however, that proceduralist accounts are adequate to capture autonomous motivation and action, or to rule out actions that or agents who we would hesitate to call autonomous. Substantive accounts of autonomy, of which there are both weak and strong varieties, set more requirements for autonomous actions to count as autonomous. Whether weak or strong, all substantive accounts posit some particular constraints on what can be considered autonomous; one example might be an account of autonomy that specifies that we might not autonomously be able to choose to be enslaved. Susan Wolf offers a strong substantive account, in which agents must have “normative competency,” in other words, the capacity to identify right and wrong (Wolf 1990). We do not need to be metaphysically responsible for ourselves or absolutely self-originating, but as agents we are morally responsible, and capable of revising ourselves according to our moral reasoning (Wolf 1987). Similarly, Paul Benson’s early accounts of autonomy also advocated a strong substantive account, stressing normative competence, and also the threat of oppressive or inappropriate socialization to our normative competence and thus to our autonomy (Benson 1991).

Contemporary Kantians such as Thomas Hill and Christine Korsgaard also advocate substantive accounts of autonomy. Korsgaard argues that we have practical identities which guide us and serve as the source of our normative commitments (Korsgaard 1996). We have multiple such identities, not all of which are moral, but our most general practical identity is as a member of the “kingdom of ends,” our identity as moral agents. This identity generates universal duties and obligations. Just as Kant called autonomy our capacity for self-legislation, so too Korsgaard calls autonomy our capacity to give ourselves obligations to act based on our practical identities. Since one of these is a universal moral identity, autonomy itself thus has substantive content.

Autonomy, for Hill, means that principles will not simply be accepted because of tradition or authority, but can be challenged through reason. He acknowledges that in our society we do not experience the kind of consensus about values and principles that Kant supposed ideally rational legislators might possess, but argues that it is still possible to bear in mind the perspective of a possible kingdom of ends. Human dignity, the idea of humanity as an end in itself, can represent a shared end regardless of background or tradition (Hill 2000, 43-45).

Substantive accounts have been criticized for conflating personal and moral autonomy and for setting too high a bar for autonomous action. If too much is expected of autonomous agents’ self-awareness and moral reflection, then can any of us be truly said to be autonomous (see for example Christman 2004 and Narayan 2002)? Does arguing that agents living under conditions of oppressive socialization have reduced autonomy help set a standard for promotion of justice, or does it overemphasize their diminished capacity without encouraging and promoting the capacities that they do have? This interplay between our socialization and our capacity for autonomy is highlighted in the relational autonomy literature, covered below.

In order to come to some middle ground between substantive and procedural accounts, Paul Benson has also suggested a weak substantive account, which does not specify any content, but sets the requirement that the agent must regard himself or herself as worthy to act; in other words, that the agent must have self-trust, self-respect (Benson 1991). This condition serves to limit what behavior can be deemed autonomous and to bring it in line with our intuition that a mind-controlled or utterly submissive agent is not acting autonomously, while not ruling out the agent’s ability to decide what values he or she wants to live by.

3. Feminist Philosophy of Autonomy

a. Feminist Criticisms of Autonomy

Feminist philosophers have been critical of concepts and values traditionally seen to be gender neutral, finding that when examined they reveal themselves to be masculine (see Jaggar 1983, Benjamin 1988, Grimshaw 1986, Harding and Hintikka 2003, and Lloyd 1986). Autonomy has long been coded masculine and associated with masculine ideals, despite being something which women have called for in their own right. Jessica Benjamin argues that while we are formally committed to equality, “gender polarity underlies such familiar dualisms as autonomy and dependency” (Benjamin 1988, 7). There has been some debate over whether autonomy is actually a useful value for women, or whether it has been tarnished by association.

Gilligan’s criticisms of autonomy have already been covered, but Benjamin writes along similar lines that:

The ideal of the autonomous individual could only be created by abstracting from the relationship of dependency between men and women. The relationships which people require to nurture them are considered private, and not truly relationships with outside others. Thus the other is reduced to an appendage of the subject – the mere condition of his being – not a being in her own right. The individual who cannot recognize the other or his own dependency without suffering a threat to his identity requires the formal, impersonal principle of rationalized interaction, and is required by them. (Benjamin 1988, 197)

Benjamin ultimately argues that the entire structure of recognition between men and women must be altered in order to permit an end to domination. Neither Gilligan nor Benjamin addresses the possibility of reformulating the notion of autonomy itself, but each sees it as essentially linked with individualism and separation. Sarah Hoagland is more emphatic: she openly rejects autonomy as a value, referring to it as “a thoroughly noxious concept” as it “encourages us to believe that connecting and engaging with others limits us” (Hoagland 1988, 144).

These criticisms have been countered, however, by feminists looking to retain the value of autonomy, who argue that the critics conflate the ideal of “autonomy” with that of “substantive independence.” Autonomy, while it has often been associated with individualism and independence, does not necessarily entail these. Most feminist criticism of autonomy is based on the idea that autonomy implies a particular model or expectation of the self. Marilyn Friedman and John Christman, however, point out that the proceduralist notion of autonomy which is the focus of contemporary philosophical attention does not have such an implication, but is metaphysically neutral and value neutral (Friedman 2000, 37-46; Christman 1995).

b. Relational Autonomy

A feminist attempt to rehabilitate autonomy as a value, and to further underscore the contingency of its relationship to atomistic individualism or independence, emerges in the growing research on “relational autonomy” (Nedelsky 1989, Mackenzie and Stoljar 2000). It addresses the challenge of balancing agency with social embeddedness, without promoting an excessively individualistic liberal atomism, or denying women the agency required to criticize or change their situation. The feminist work on relational autonomy attempts to capture the best of the available positions.

It is worth noting first, for clarity, that there are two levels of relationality at work within relational autonomy: social and relational sources of values, goals, and commitments, and social and relational commitments themselves. While all acknowledge that relationality at both levels is not incompatible with autonomy, not all accounts of relational autonomy require that we pursue social and relational commitments. For instance, on Marilyn Friedman’s account, a person could autonomously choose to be a hermit, despite having been brought up in a family and in a society and having been shaped by that upbringing (Friedman 2003, 94). However other relational autonomy theorists are skeptical about neatly separating the two, because they note that even our unchosen relationships still affect our self-identity and opportunities. They argue that while we need not pursue relationships, we cannot opt out entirely. Anne Donchin demonstrates this with regard to testing for genetically inherited disease (Donchin 2000).

In general, on relational autonomy accounts, autonomy is seen as an ideal by which we can measure how well an agent is able to negotiate his or her pursuit of goals and commitments, some of which may be self-chosen, and some the result of social and relational influences. Social and relational ties are examined in terms of their effect on an agent’s competency in this negotiation: some give strength, others create obstacles, and others are ambiguous. The primary focus of most relational autonomy accounts, however, tends to be less on procedure and more on changing the model of the autonomous self from an individualistic one to one embedded in a social context.

4. Autonomy in Social and Political Context

The value of autonomy can be seen in its social and political context. The idea that our decisions, if made autonomously, are to be respected and cannot be shrugged off, is a valuable one. It concerns the legitimacy of our personal decisions in a social, political, and legislative context.

a. Autonomy and Political Theory

The importance and nature of the value of autonomy is debated within political theory, but is generally intertwined with the right to pursue one’s interests without undue restriction. Discussions about the value of autonomy concern the extent of this right, and how it can be seen as compatible with social needs.

Kant described the protection of autonomy at the political level as encapsulated in the principle of right: that each person had the right to any action that can coexist with the freedom of every other person in accordance with universal law (Kant 1996, 387). Mill’s On Liberty similarly defends the rights of individuals to pursue their own personal goals, and emphasizes the need for being one’s own person (Mill 1956). On his view, this right prohibits paternalism, or restrictions or interference with a person of mature age for his or her own benefit. As Mill writes, “The only part of the conduct of anyone for which he is amenable to society is that which concerns others. In the part which merely concerns himself, his independence is, of right, absolute. Over himself, over his own body and mind, the individual is sovereign” (Mill 1956, 13).

Non-interference is generally seen as key to political autonomy; Gerald Gaus specifies that “the fundamental liberal principle” is “that all interferences with action stand in need of justification” (Gaus 2005, 272). If any paternalistic interference is to be permitted, it is generally restricted to cases where the agent is not deemed to be autonomous with respect to a decision (see for example Dworkin 1972); autonomy serves as a bar to be reached in order for an agent’s decisions to be protected (Christman 2004). The question is then how high the bar ought to be set, and thus what individual actions count as autonomous for the purposes of establishing social policy. Because of this, there is a strong connection between personal and political autonomy.

Further, there is also a connection between political liberalism and content-neutral accounts of autonomy which do not require any predetermined values for the agent to be recognized as autonomous. As Christman and Anderson point out, content-neutral accounts of autonomy accord with liberalism’s model of accommodating pluralism in ways of life, values, and traditions (Christman and Anderson 2005).

The framework of seeing the value of political autonomy in terms of protecting individual choices and decisions, however, has been criticized by those who argue that it rests on an inadequate model of the self.

Communitarians such as Michael Sandel criticize the model of the autonomous self implicit in liberal political theory, arguing that it does not provide an adequate notion of the human person as embedded within and shaped by societal values and commitments. Procedural accounts of autonomous decision-making do not adequately recognize the way our relational commitments shape us. We do not choose our values and commitments from the position of already being autonomous individuals; in other words, the autonomous self does not exist prior to the values and commitments that constitute the basis for its decisions. To deliberate in the abstract from these values and commitments is to leave out the self’s very identity, and that which gives meaning to the deliberation (Sandel 1998).

Feminist scholars have agreed with some of the communitarian criticism, but also caution that the values and commitments that communitarians appeal to may not be ones that are in line with feminist goals, in particular those values that concern the role and makeup of the family (Okin 1989 and Weiss 1995).

Another criticism of the dominant model of autonomy within political theory is made by Martha Fineman, who argues for the need to rethink the conceptions of autonomy that undergird legal and governmental policies in order to better recognize our interdependence and the dependence of all of us upon society (Fineman 2004, 28-30). While not drawing on the philosophical literature on personal autonomy or relational autonomy, but rather drawing upon sociological theories and accounts of legal and government policy, she traces the historical and cultural associations of autonomy with individuality and masculinity, and argues the need to see that real human flourishing includes dependency.

Recognizing the different levels of autonomy at play within the political sphere as a whole can help to clarify what is at stake, and to avoid one-sided accounts of autonomy or the autonomous self. Rainer Forst outlines five different conceptions of autonomy that can combine into a multidimensional account (Forst 2005). The first is moral autonomy, in which an agent can be considered autonomous as long as he or she “acts on the basis of reasons that take every other power equally into account” and which are “justifiable on the basis of reciprocally and generally binding norms” (Forst 2005, 230). Even though this is an interpersonal norm, it is relevant to the political, argues Forst, because it promotes the mutual respect needed for political liberty. Ethical autonomy concerns a person’s desires in the quest for the good life, in the context of the person’s values, commitments, relationships, and communities. Legal autonomy is thus the right not to be forced into a particular set of values and commitments, and is neutral toward them. Political autonomy concerns the right to participate in collective self-rule, exercised with the other members of the relevant community. Finally, social autonomy concerns whether an agent has the means to be an equal member of this community. Attending to social autonomy helps to demonstrate the responsibility of members of the community to consider each other’s needs, and to evaluate political and social structures in terms of whether they serve to promote the social autonomy of all of the members. Forst argues that ultimately “citizens are politically free to the extent to which they, as freedom-grantors and freedom-users, are morally, ethically, legally, politically, and socially autonomous members of a political community … Rights and liberties therefore have to be justified not only with respect to one conception of autonomy but with a complex understanding of what it means to be an autonomous person” (Forst 2005, 238).

Whether or not one agrees with this particular way of dividing the conceptions of autonomy, or with the particular explanation of the details of any of the conceptions, Forst’s account highlights the way that understanding the contribution of autonomy to political theory involves a multifaceted approach. It is of limited use to say that citizens are autonomous because they have the right to vote, if their material needs are not met, or if they are not free in their choice of values or ethical commitments.  Taking ethical autonomy into consideration can help to meet some of the concerns raised above by communitarian and feminist critics of autonomy; meanwhile, taking legal autonomy into account alongside ethical autonomy can help to provide the bulwark of protection against oppressive traditions that feminists are concerned about.

This can also be related to the work done by Martha Nussbaum and Amartya Sen on the capabilities approach to human rights, in which societies are called upon to ensure that all human beings have the opportunity to develop certain capabilities; agents then have a choice whether or not to develop them (see for example Sen 1999 and Nussbaum 2006).  The kind of political autonomy granted to subjects, then, depends on their ability to cultivate these various capabilities within a given society.

b. Autonomy and Bioethics

In applied ethics, such as bioethics, autonomy is a key value. It is appealed to by both sides of a number of debates, such as the right to free speech in hate speech versus the right to be free from hate speech (Mackenzie and Stoljar 2000, 4). There is a lack of consensus, however, on how autonomy ought to be used: how much rationality it requires, whether it merely involves the negative right against interference or whether it involves positive duties of moral reflection and self-legislation.

Autonomy has long been an important principle within biomedical ethics. For example, in the Belmont report, published in 1979 in the United States, which articulates guidelines for experimentation on human subjects, the protection of subjects’ autonomy is enshrined in the principle of “respect for persons.” One of the three key principles of the Report, it states that participants in trials ought to be treated as autonomous, and those with diminished autonomy (due to cognitive or other disabilities or illnesses) are entitled to protection. The way this principle is to be applied takes shape in the form of informed consent, as the Report presumes that this is the best way to protect autonomy.

One of the standard textbooks in biomedical ethics, Principles of Biomedical Ethics by Tom L. Beauchamp and James F. Childress, defends four principles for ethical decision-making, of which “respect for autonomy” is the first, even though it is not intended to override other moral considerations.  The principle can be seen as both a negative and a positive obligation. The negative obligation for health care professionals is that patients’ autonomous decisions should not be constrained by others. The positive obligation calls for “respectful treatment in disclosing information and fostering autonomous decision-making” (Beauchamp and Childress 2001, 64).

Beauchamp and Childress accept that a patient can autonomously choose to be guided by religious, traditional, or community norms and values. While they acknowledge that it can be difficult to negotiate diverse values and beliefs in sharing information necessary for decision-making, this does not excuse a failure to respect a patient’s autonomous decision: “respect for autonomy is not a mere ideal in health care; it is a professional obligation. Autonomous choice is a right, not a duty of patients” (Beauchamp and Childress 2001, 63).

Autonomy is also important within the disability rights movement. Within the disability rights movement, the slogan, “Nothing about us without us” is a call for autonomy or self-determination (see Charlton 1998). It goes beyond merely rejecting having decisions made for people with disabilities by others, but also speaks to the desire for empowerment and recognition as being agents capable of self-determination.

The relational approach to autonomy has become popular in the spheres of health care ethics and disability theory. The language of relational autonomy has been helpful in reframing the dichotomy between strict independence and dependence and providing a way of framing the relationship between a person with a disability and his or her caretaker or guardian. It has also been argued that a relational approach to patient autonomy provides a better model of the decision-making process.

Criticisms of a rationalistic and individualistic ideal of autonomy and the development of the idea of relational autonomy have been taken up within the mainstream of biomedical ethics. In response to criticism that early editions of their textbook on biomedical ethics had not paid adequate heed to intimate relationships and the social dimensions of patient autonomy, Beauchamp and Childress emphasize that they “aim to construct a conception of respect for autonomy that is not excessively individualistic (neglecting the social nature of individuals and the impact of individual choices and actions on others), not excessively focused on reason (neglecting the emotions), and not unduly legalistic (highlighting legal rights and downplaying social practices)” (Beauchamp and Childress, 2001, 57).

Their account of autonomy, however, has still been criticized by Anne Donchin as being a “weak concept” of relational autonomy (Donchin 2000). While they do not deny that selves are developed within a context of community and human relationships, agents are still assumed to have consciously chosen their beliefs and values and to be capable of detaching themselves from relationships at will (Donchin 2000, 238). A strong concept of relational autonomy, on the other hand, holds that “there is a social component built into the very meaning of autonomy,” and that autonomy “involves a dynamic balance among interdependent people tied to overlapping projects” (Donchin 2000, 239). The autonomous self is one “continually remaking itself in response to relationships that are seldom static,” and which “exists fundamentally in relation to others” (Donchin 2000, 239). Donchin argues that it is the strong concept of relational autonomy that offers the most helpful account of decision-making in health care.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Barvosa-Carter, Edwina. “Mestiza Autonomy as Relational Autonomy: Ambivalence and the Social Character of Free Will,” The Journal of Political Philosophy Vol. 15, no. 1 (2007), 1-21.
  • Beauchamp, Tom L. and James F. Childress. Principles of Biomedical Ethics, 5th ed, Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press, 2001.
  • Benjamin, Benjamin. The Bonds of Love: Psychoanalysis, Feminism, and the Problem of Domination, New York: Pantheon Books, 1988, 183-224.
  • Benson, Paul. “Autonomy and Oppressive Socialization,” Social Theory and Practice 17, no. 3 (1991), 385-408.
  • Bratman, Michael. Structures of Agency, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007.
  • Charlton, James I. Nothing About Us Without Us: Disability, Oppression and Empowerment, Berkeley and Los Angeles: University of California Press, 1998.
  • Christman, J., (ed.). The Inner Citadel: Essays on Individual Autonomy, New York and Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1989.
  • Christman, John, and Joel Anderson (ed.) Autonomy and the Challenges to Liberalism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005.
  • Christman, John. “Autonomy and Personal History,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 21 no. 1(1991), 1-24.
  • Christman, John. “Autonomy, Self-Knowledge, and Liberal Legitimacy,” in Autonomy and the Challenges to Liberalism, ed. John Christman and Joel Anderson, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005.
  • Christman, John. “Feminism and Autonomy,” “Nagging” Questions: Feminist Ethics in Every Life, ed. Dana E. Bushnell. Lanham, MD: Rowman and Littlefield Publishers, Inc., 1995, 17-39.
  • Christman, John. “Relational Autonomy, Liberal Individualism, and the Social Constitution of Selves,” Philosophical Studies 117, no. 1-2 (2004), 143-164.
  • Critchley, Simon. Infinitely Demanding: Ethics of Commitment, Politics of Resistance, London: Verso, 2007.
  • Donchin, Anne. “Autonomy and Interdependence: Quandaries in Genetic Decision Making.” In Relational Autonomy: Feminist Perspectives on Autonomy, Agency, and the Social Self, edited by Catriona Mackenzie and Natalie Stoljar, 236-258. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2000.
  • Dworkin, Gerald. “Paternalism,” The Monist, 56 no. 1 (1972), 64-84.
  • Dworkin, Gerald. The Theory and Practice of Autonomy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1988.
  • Dworkin, Gerald. “The Concept of Autonomy,” in The Inner Citadel, ed. John Christman, 54-62.
  • Ekstrom, Laura. “A Coherence Theory of Autonomy,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 53 (1993), 599–616.
  • Fineman, Martha Albertson. The Autonomy Myth: A Theory of Dependency. New York: The New Press, 2004.
  • Forst, Rainer. “Political Liberty: Integrating Five Conceptions of Autonomy,” in Autonomy and the Challenges to Liberalism, 2005, 226-242.
  • Frankfurt, Harry. The Importance of What We Care About, ed. Harry Frankfurt, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1988.
  • Friedman, Marilyn. “Autonomy and the Split-Level Self,” Southern Journal of Philosophy 24 (1986), 19-35.
  • Friedman, Marilyn. Autonomy, Gender, Politics, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2003.
  • Gaus, Gerald F. “The Place of Autonomy Within Liberalism,” in Autonomy and the Challenges to Liberalism, 2005, 272-306.
  • Gilligan, Carol. In a Different Voice: Psychological Theory and Women’s Development. Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, 1982.
  • Grimshaw, Jean. Philosophy and Feminist Thinking. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1986.
  • Harding, Sandra and Merrill B. Hintikka, eds., Discovering Reality: Feminist Perspectives on Epistemology, Metaphysics, Methodology, and Philosophy of Science, 2 ed.. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 2003.
  • Hill, Thomas. “The Kantian Conception of Autonomy,” in The Inner Citadel, ed. John Christman, 91-105.
  • Hill, Thomas. “A Kantian Perspective on Moral Rules,” in Respect, Pluralism, and Justice: Kantian Perspectives (Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press, 2000), 33-55.
  • Hinchman, Lewis. “Autonomy, Individuality, and Self-Determination,” in What is Enlightenment? Eighteenth-Century Answers and Twentieth-Century Questions., ed. James Schmidt. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1996, 488-516.
  • Hoagland, Sarah L. Lesbian Ethics: Toward New Value. Palo Alto, California: Institute of Lesbian Studies, 1988, 144.
  • Jaggar, Alison M. Feminist Politics and Human Nature, Totowa, NJ: Rowman & Allenheld, 1983.
  • Lévinas, Emmanuel. Totality and Infinity, trans. Alphonso Lingis, Pittsburgh: Duquesne University Press, 1969.
  • Lloyd, Genevieve. The Man of Reason: Male and Female in Western Philosophy (London: Routledge, 1986).
  • Kant, Immanuel. Practical Philosophy. ed. and trans. Mary Gregor. 1996
  • Korsgaard, Christine. The Sources of Normativity. New York: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
  • Kymlicka, Will. Contemporary Political Philosophy: An Introduction. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1991.
  • Mackenzie, Catriona, and Stoljar, Natalie, (eds.). Relational Autonomy, New York and Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2000.
  • Mele, Alfred R. Autonomous Agents: From Self-Control to Autonomy, New York and Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2001.
  • Meyers, Diana Tietjens. Self, Society, and Personal Choice, New York: Columbia University Press, 1989.
  • Meyers, Diana Tietjens. “Decentralizing Autonomy: Five Faces of Selfhood.” In Autonomy and the Challenges to Liberalism, edited by John Christman and Joel Anderson, 27-55. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005.
  • Mill, John Stuart. On Liberty, Indianapolis and New York: The Liberal Arts Press, 1956; originally published 1859.
  • Narayan, Uma. “Minds of Their Own: Choices, Autonomy, Cultural Practices, and Other Women,” in A Mind of One’s Own: Feminist Essays on Reason and Objectivity, ed. Louise M. Antony and Charlotte Witt (Boulder, CO: Westview Press, 2002), 418-432.
  • Nedelsky, Jennifer. “Reconceiving Autonomy: Sources, Thoughts and Possibilities.” Yale Journal of Law and Feminism, no. 1 (1989): 7-36.
  • Nussbaum, Martha. Frontiers of Justice: Disability, Nationality, Species Membership, Cambridge, MA: Belknap Press, 2006.
  • Okin, Susan Moller. Justice, Gender, and the Family, New York: Basic Books, Inc., 1989.
  • Oshana, Marina A. L. “Autonomy and Self-Identity.” In Autonomy and the Challenges to Liberalism: New Essays, edited by John Christman and Joel Anderson, 77-97. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005
  • Sandel, Michael J. Liberalism and the Limits of Justice, 2nd ed., Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
  • Sen, Amartya. Development as Freedom, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999.
  • Taylor, James S. (ed.). Personal Autonomy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005.
  • Thalberg, Irving. “Hierarchical Analyses of Unfree Action,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy, no. 8 (1978).
  • Watson, Gary. “Free Agency,” Journal of Philosophy, no. 72 (1975), 205-220.
  • Weiss, Penny A. “Feminism and Communitarianism: Comparing Critiques of Liberalism.” In Feminism and Community, edited by Penny A. Weiss and Marilyn Friedman. Philadelphia: Temple University Press, 1995, 161-186.
  • Wolf, Susan. Freedom within Reason (New York: Oxford University Press, 1990).
  • Wolf, Susan. “Sanity and the Metaphysics of Responsibility,” in Responsibility, Character and the Emotions, ed. Ferdinand Schoeman. New York: Cambridge University Press, 1987, 46-62.

Author Information

Jane Dryden
Mount Allison University