The Axiology of Theism

The existential question about God asks whether God exists, but the axiology of theism addresses the question of what value-impact, if any, God’s existence does (or would) have on our world and its inhabitants. There are two prominent answers to the axiological question about God. Pro-theism is the view that God’s existence does (or would) add value to our world. Anti-theism, by contrast, is the view that God’s existence does (or would) detract from the value of our world. Philosophers have observed that the answer to the axiological question may vary depending on its target and scope. For instance, assessments about God’s value-impact could made from an impersonal perspective without reference to individuals, or from a personal perspective with reference to the value-impact of God only for a particular person or persons. Axiological assessments can also take into account one, some, or all of the purported advantages and downsides of God’s existence.

No general consensus has emerged in the literature regarding the correct answer(s) to the axiological question about God. Some philosophers argue that the answer to the question is obvious, or that the very question itself is unintelligible. For instance, it might be unintelligible to the many theists who hold that if God does not exist then nothing else would exist. So, it is impossible to compare a world with God to a world without God. The most promising argument in support of anti-theism in the literature is the Meaningful Life Argument, which suggests that God’s existence would make certain individuals’ lives worse, for those individuals have life plans so intimately connected with God’s non-existence that, if it turned out God exists, their lives would lose meaning if God were to exist. The most promising argument for pro-theism is best understood as a cluster of arguments pointing to many of the purported advantages of God’s existence including divine intervention (that is, God performing miracles that help people) and the impossibility of gratuitous evil on theism. Additionally, some pro-theists claim that since God is infinitely good that any state of affairs with God is also infinitely good. To date, the literature has focused on comparing the axiological value of theism (especially Christianity) to atheism (especially naturalism). Future work will likely include axiological assessments of the other religious and non-religious worldviews.

Table of Contents

  1. The Axiological Question about God
  2. Is the Axiological Question Intelligible?
  3. Different answers to the Axiological Question
  4. Arguments for Pro-Theism
    1. The Infinite Value Argument
    2. The Morally Good Agents Argument
    3. The Goods of Theism Argument
  5. Arguments for Anti-Theism
    1. The Meaningful Life Argument
    2. The Goods of Atheism Argument
  6. Connections to the Existence of God
    1. Divine Hiddenness
    2. Problem of Evil
    3. Anti-Theism entails Atheism
  7. Future Directions
    1. Exploration of Different Answers
    2. Other Worldviews
  8. References and Further Reading

1. The Axiological Question about God

A perennial topic in the philosophy of religion is the existential question of whether God exists. Arguments in support of theism include the ontological, cosmological, teleological, and moral arguments. Arguments in support of atheism, on the other hand, include the arguments from evil, from no best world, and from divine hiddenness. Many of these arguments and topics have a rich philosophical history and sophisticated versions of them continue to be discussed in the literature. The importance of the existential question is obvious: God’s existence is tied to the truth value of the theistic religions. It is of little surprise, then, that philosophers of religion have spilled so much ink over these topics.

This article does not discuss the existential question of whether God exists. Rather, it will examine the question of the axiological question about the value-impact of God’s existence. Some brief remarks by Thomas Nagel are often credited as the starting point in the literature (Kahane 2011, 679; Kraay and Dragos 2013, 159; Penner 2015, 327). In his book The Last Word, Thomas Nagel quips: “I hope there is no God! I don’t want there to be a God; I don’t want the universe to be like that” (1997, 130). Nagel is an atheist who thinks he is rational in his atheism. He thinks that in light of the evidence, atheism is the correct answer to the existential question about God. Yet here he expresses a desire or preference about the non-existence of God. Reflections on this brief quote from Nagel have led to the emergence of discussion about the axiological question in the philosophy of religion. While it is clear Nagel is expressing a preference, philosophers initially wanted to know whether it could be developed into an axiological position.

One interesting aspect of this question is that it seems to be conceptually distinct from the existential question about God. For instance, it seems perfectly consistent for an atheist who denies that God exists to simultaneously believe that God’s existence would be good, though some have denied this claim (for example, Schellenberg 2018).  It also seems consistent for a theist who is convinced that God exists to hold that there are negative consequences of God’s existence. Finally, it’s worth pointing out that the axiological question has come to be understood as a comparative question about the difference in value between different possible worlds or states of affairs (that is, between God worlds and God-less worlds).

2. Is the Axiological Question Intelligible?

In explaining what the axiological question is asking, Guy Kahane writes in an early and influential piece that

We are not asking theists to conceive of God’s death—to imagine that God stopped existing. And given that theists believe that God created the universe, when we ask them to consider His inexistence we are not asking them to conceive an empty void […] I will understand the comparison to involve the actual world [where God exists] and the closest possible world where [God does not exist] (Kahane 2011, 676).

While this makes clear the relevant comparison that Kahane and others have in view, some have suggested that the axiological question itself is unintelligible (Kahane 2012, 35-37; Mugg 2016). This is based on the fact that on a standard (Lewis/Stalnaker) semantics, counterpossibles are trivially true. God is typically understood as a necessary being. This means that if God exists, then God exists in every possible world (that is, in every possible state of affairs). Given this, the statement ‘God does not exist’ is a counterpossible. Now, consider the following conditional: If God does not exist, then the world would be better (or worse). Given theism, any counterpossible with the antecedent in the previous conditional is trivially true because there is no way that the antecedent could be true while the consequent is false. This is because there is no way for the antecedent to be true on theism. If this worry is correct, then cross-world axiological judgements are uninformative at best, and possibly unintelligible or impossible at worst. Notice that the same applies to atheism if the view in mind has it that there is no possible world in which God exists (that is, necessitarian atheism, the view that God necessarily does not exist).

One approach to this objection suggests that this type of axiological comparison is possible as a result of a process called cognitive decoupling. This occurs when an agent extracts information from a representation and then performs computations on it in isolation. Certain information is ‘screened off’ and thus not used in the reasoning process. Likewise, “[t]hose beliefs that are allowed into the reasoning process, along with suppositions, are ‘cognitively quarantined’ from the subject’s beliefs” (Mugg 2016, 448). Consider:

Bugs Bunny might pick up a hole off the ground and throw it on a wall. It is not metaphysically possible to pick up a hole, but we are able to suppose that Bugs has picked up the whole and recognize that Bugs can now jump through the wall. Thus, we can imagine an impossible state of affairs and make judgments about what would obtain within that state of affairs. In representing the impossible state of affairs, we screen out those beliefs that would lead to outright contradiction (Mugg 2016, 449).

In this context, cognitive decoupling occurs in situations in which, “when considering a counterfactual, subjects can screen out those beliefs that (with the antecedent of the counterfactual) imply contradictions” (Mugg 2016, 449). A theist who holds that God necessarily exists could address the axiological question by engaging in cognitive decoupling. This means that when addressing the axiological question, she ‘screens off’ her belief that God necessarily exists (and conversely, a necessitarian atheist could screen off her belief that God necessarily doesn’t exist). This proposal raises a number of questions, including how we can be confident that we have ‘screened off’ the appropriate beliefs, and also whether the comparison made when engaging in cognitive decoupling is relevantly similar to the real-world comparison needed to answer the axiological question.

Another proposal for dealing with this objection suggests that this worry about counterpossibles arises only when the comparison in question is understood as one between metaphysically possible worlds. But, so the proposal goes, when the relevant comparison is one between epistemically possible worlds, the counterpossible problem doesn’t apply (Mawson 2012; see also Chalmers 2011). After all, the theist who believes that God exists of metaphysical necessity holds that there are no metaphysically possible worlds where God doesn’t exist. But for a state-of-affairs to be epistemically possible for such a theist, she only needs to concede that it could obtain, for all she knows. Thus, the theist just needs to concede that, for all she knows, God may not exist. A helpful analogy comes by way of reflecting on the idea that water is H2O. While there are no metaphysically possible worlds where water is not H20, for all one knows, water is not H20. Hence, there are epistemically possible worlds where water is not H20 (Chalmers 60-62). For all the necessitarian theist knows, atheism is true, while for all the necessitarian atheist knows, theism is true. Thus, regardless of whether the comparison between metaphysically possible worlds is intelligible, the comparison between epistemically possible worlds is perfectly intelligible.

Yet another reply to the counterpossible problem holds that value can intelligibly be assigned to metaphysical impossibilities (Kahane2012, 36-37). For if it is possible to assign a value to a metaphysical impossibility, then perhaps the theist who thinks that atheism is metaphysically impossible could still assign a value to the relevant counterpossibles. Consider, for instance, that a mathematical proof could rightly be called beautiful or elegant even if it turns out to be invalid. Of course, it’s controversial whether it’s appropriate to talk of the beauty of an invalid proof. If such judgments turn out not to be appropriate, then it turns out that many of our value assignments will be apparent, not factual (Kahane 2012, 37). We will think we are making a factual value judgment when it is in fact not.

To conclude this section, it’s worth noting that the literature on the axiology of theism often treats rational preference as supervening on axiological judgments (that are understood to be objective). But it is an open question whether an agent’s rational preference need always correspond to correct axiological judgments. Perhaps it could be rational for an agent to prefer a worse state of affairs to a better one, or to disprefer a better state of affairs to a worse one. Kahane (2011) appears to think this is a genuine possibility. I won’t dwell on this issue, but it’s worth keeping in mind as one explores this topic. We’re now in a position to examine different answers that can be proposed to the axiological question.

3. Different answers to the Axiological Question

While some have attempted to address worries about the intelligibility of the axiological question, many philosophers have simply proceeded directly to attempting to answer the question (presumably because they are either unaware of the problem or implicitly assume that it has a reasonable solution). No consensus as to the correct answer to the axiological question has emerged in the literature (and seems unlikely to anytime soon). What has become clear, though, is that there are a great number of different possible answers one could offer to the axiological question.

The two main general positions that have been taken up in the literature are pro-theism and anti-theism. Pro-theism is, roughly, the view that it would be good if God were to exist. Anti-theism, on the other hand, holds that it would be bad if God were to exist. There are, however, other potential answers which haven’t received as much attention. For instance, the neutralist about the axiological question holds that God’s existence has (or would have) a neutral impact on the value of the world. The quietest holds that the axiological question cannot (in principle) be answered. Finally, the agnostic holds that the axiological question might be answerable, but we are currently unable to answer it. Much more remains to be said about the plausibility of these three latter positions. (For more on these answers see Kraay 2018, 10-18.)

There are numerous specific variants of these answers to the question. There is a difference between personal and impersonal judgements about the axiological question. The former focus on the axiological implications of God’s existence with respect to individual persons, while the latter focuses on such implications without any reference to God’s value-impact on persons. Additionally, there are narrow and broad judgements about the axiological question. The former refers to just one advantage (or downside) of God’s existence (or non-existence), while the latter refers to the axiological consequences of God’s existence or non-existence overall. These judgments – personal/impersonal and narrow/broad–combine to form at minimum sixty possible answers to the axiological question when applied to five general answers stated above. Klaas J. Kraay’s (2018, 9) helpful chart enables us to visualize all of these different possibilities:

Axiological Positions
Pro-Theism Anti-Theism Neutralism Agnosticism Quietism
Impersonal Personal
Narrow Wide Narrow Wide

The first column contains all of the sub-divisions relevant to pro-theism. The other general answers can subdivided in precisely the same way. Likewise, inasmuch as there are additional general answers to the axiological question to the five offered here, this chart will increase in size. These distinctions are important for a number of different reasons. For instance, later we will see that some have claimed that defending wide personal/impersonal anti-theism is a very difficult, if not impossible task. Another interesting idea that has emerged in the literature thus far is that someone can be a narrow personal anti-theist and a wide personal/impersonal pro-theist (Lougheed 2018c). In other words, someone could hold that it would be a bad thing for her, in certain respects, if God exists, while acknowledging that would be a good thing overall if God exists.

4. Arguments for Pro-Theism

This section outlines three different considerations that speak in favour of pro-theism.

a. The Infinite Value Argument

One argument for pro-theism appeals to the idea that God is infinitely valuable (for discussion see Van Der Veen and Horsten 2013). The thought is that if God is infinitely valuable, then any world with God is infinitely valuable because God exists in every world and confers infinite value on each one. From this it follows that any theistic world is more valuable than an atheistic world (or at least not worse if atheistic worlds can be infinitely valuable). There are at least two areas in need of further development regarding this line of argument. First, more work has to be done to show how God’s infinite value can sensibly be thought to make a world (assuming theism is true) infinitely valuable. There is a vast literature on the divine attributes, but the idea of God’s infinite value has been neglected (at least in the contemporary literature). What is it to say God is infinite? How is an abstract concept, infinity, supposed to accurately describe God’s value? Second, the claim that all theistic worlds have the same infinitely high value appears to violate very basic modal and moral intuitions. Consider two worlds in which God exists, one of which includes a genocide that the other does not. These two worlds are otherwise identical. Surely such a world–all else being equal–is axiologically superior to ours.

b. The Morally Good Agents Argument

The Morally Good Agents Argument is another argument in favour of pro-theism. Here is a thought experiment motivating this argument. Imagine that Carl’s car breaks down on the highway. Carl has no phone to call for help, and he doesn’t know anything about car mechanics. First, consider a case in which Susan, a morally good agent, discovers Carl on the side of the highway and offers help. She calls a tow truck for Carl, and when she discovers Carl doesn’t have his wallet, she pays for the tow herself. Second, consider a case in which no one pulls over to assist Carl. He attempts to flag down cars, but no one stops. While Carl is in poor health he has no choice but to attempt to walk to nearest gas station for assistance. These two cases are designed to show that morally good agents tend to add value to states of affairs. If the point generalizes, then a world with morally good agents is better than one without such agents, all else being equal (Penner and Lougheed 2015, 56).

Now consider two additional scenarios. Imagine that George sees Carl attempting to flag down vehicles. George attempts to pull over in order to assist Carl, but his brakes fail and he crashes into Carl, killing him on impact. Or consider Tom, who sees a truck crash into Carl’s car and then drives away. Carl’s car is now on fire with Carl trapped inside. Tom calls 911 but knows that the paramedics won’t arrive in time to save Carl. Tom tries to open the door to save Carl, but he isn’t strong enough to pry the bent door open. The idea behind these two additional cases is to acknowledge that morally good agents, despite good intentions, don’t necessarily have the power to do good. Of course, this doesn’t apply to God. Since God is all-powerful, God won’t be constrained or unable to add value to states of affairs in ways that other morally good agents might be constrained. Inasmuch as it makes sense to think that morally good agents add value to states of affairs, then God adds value to states of affairs. All else being equal, then, a world with God is better than a world without God (Penner and Lougheed 205, 57-58).

There are a number of objections to this line of argument which attempt to show that not all else is equal. One reason to think God’s existence isn’t valuable (at least for certain individuals) is based on the idea that God violates everyone’s privacy. If God exists, then there is a sense in which God automatically violates our privacy (that is, if God is all-knowing, then God knows all of our mental states/thoughts). Without a justifying reason to violate a person’s privacy, this is an aspect in which God’s existence is a bad thing, for part of what’s involved in people forming trusting relationships with each other is that they choose what information about themselves they reveal. But this type of choice is impossible for individuals to make in the case of God. (The issue of privacy will be discussed further in section 5a below.) The question remains, however, whether this worry, assuming it really is a downside, is enough to outweigh all of the goods associated with theism. Another objection invokes a worry about an inverted moral spectrum. Suppose that what we think is good is actually bad according to God, and vice versa. If this is right, then, while it might still be technically true that God is a morally good agent (and adds value), it would make little sense to think we ought to prefer that God exist (Penner and Lougheed 2015, 68).

c. The Goods of Theism Argument

The Goods of Theism Argument represents a family of arguments (some quite informally expressed) that focus on highlighting specific goods of theism. This style of argument need not deny that there are genuine goods associated with atheism. Rather, the goods identified in connection to theism are taken to outweigh any goods associated with atheism. Also, some might acknowledge that these goods need not make it rational for certain individuals, in certain respects, to prefer theism. But, so the thought goes, these goods do show that theism is better than atheism overall.

Various theistic goods that have been identified in the literature include objective meaning or purpose, an afterlife, and cosmic justice. For perhaps only God can be the source of objective meaning, and without God every human life would ultimately be meaningless (Cottingham 2005, 37-57; Metz 2019, 9-21) In addition, theism is often associated with the existence of an afterlife, which is connected to the idea that God’s existence ensures that there will be final justice. Many who are wronged on earth are not compensated for being wronged. Those who perpetrate evil often seem to go unpunished. However, God’s existence is good because God will ensure that everyone will receive their due. This could be a logical consequence of a perfect being. The pro-theist need not be committed to the specific details of how this good is instantiated (Lougheed 2018a).

Perhaps one of the most important putative advantage of theism is that if God exists, there are no instances of gratuitous evil. For many theists hold that the existence of gratuitous evil is logically impossible if God exists (Kraay and Dragos 2013, 166; McBrayer 2010). This is because God would ensure that evil only occurs to achieve some otherwise unobtainable good or that every victim of evil will receive just compensation. Notice that there is no pressure on the pro-theist to explain how certain apparent instances of gratuitous evil are not in fact gratuitous (though this is a problem when defending the existence of God). For the pro-theist is merely claiming that if God exists, then there is no gratuitous evil. She isn’t claiming that in fact there is no gratuitous evil. That there is no gratuitous evil if God exists appears to be a very strong consideration in favour of pro-theism.

One worry for this general line of argument is about whether the goods mentioned here are goods that only obtain on theism. If it could be shown that these goods obtain on atheism (or other religious and non-religious worldviews) then they would be of little help in demonstrating that a world with God is more valuable than one without God (Kahane 2018). A more pressing worry, however, is not whether these goods also obtain on naturalism, but whether theism is exclusively what’s required for them to obtain. Perhaps a very good, very powerful, very knowledgeable being who is only slightly lesser than God could ensure that all the goods in question obtain. If this is right, then theism isn’t required for these goods to obtain. For even if such a being existed, atheism would technically be true since God does not exist in this scenario. This is one area where it becomes problematic for the axiology of the theism literature to use ‘naturalism’ and ‘atheism’ interchangeably.

5. Arguments for Anti-Theism

This section examines two important arguments for anti-theism.

a. The Meaningful Life Argument

Perhaps the most widely discussed argument for anti-theism is an argument which has come to be known as the Meaningful Life Argument. Guy Kahane is responsible for first gesturing at this argument, and his discussion is what sparked much recent interest in the axiological question about God. Kahane takes his cue from well-known objections to utilitarianism raised by Bernard Williams. Williams argues that utilitarianism is so demanding that it requires individuals to sacrifice things which give them meaning (1981, 14.). The problem, then, is that utilitarianism is so demanding that, to follow it, one’s own life would cease to have meaning (or at least one would have to stop pursuing those things which confer meaning on her life). According to Kahane, his worry about utilitarianism has a parallel in the present context:  he claims that theism might be too demanding in the way that utilitarianism is too demanding. It could require that certain individuals give up things which confer meaning on their lives. Kahane writes:

If a striving for independence, understanding, privacy and solitude is so inextricably woven into my identity that its curtailment by God’s existence would not merely make my life worse but rob it of meaning, then perhaps I can reasonably prefer that God not exist—reasonably treat God’s existence as undesirable without having to think of it as impersonally bad or as merely setting back too many of my interests. The thought is that in a world where complete privacy is impossible, where one is subordinated to a superior being, certain kinds of life plans, aspirations, and projects cannot make sense… Theists sometime claim that if God does not exist, life has no meaning. I am now suggesting that if God does exist, the life of at least some would lose its meaning (Kahane 2011, 691-692).

This is the first statement of the Meaningful Life Argument. Note that these thoughts only defend narrow personal anti-theism: according to this argument, it would be worse, in certain respects and for certain individuals, if it turns out that God exists.

The merits of this argument have been debated. For instance, it has been objected that we are often mistaken about what constitutes a meaningful life (Penner 2015, 335). Consider that we often pursue some end thinking it will fulfill us. But when we achieve that end, we often find we are no more fulfilled than we were before. In other words, we often end up thinking we’ve pursued the wrong end. Since we’re highly fallible with respect to what goods contribute to a meaningful life, then we should not be confident in using such judgements to support personal anti-theism. Others have countered that for this objection to succeed, one would have to deny that the goods Kahane mentions such as independence, understanding, privacy, and solitude could contribute to an individual’s meaningful life (Lougheed 2017). But most of us don’t want to deny that these are goods. Still, it seems likely that there are quantitative and qualitative difference between how these goods are instantiated on theism compared to atheism. It remains to be seen whether such differences can successfully be articulated in a way that successfully answers the objection, and hence personal anti-theism.

Additionally, while it has been observed from the very beginning of the debate over the Meaningful Life Argument that for a good like privacy to successfully be harnessed in support of anti-theism, it needs to shown that it is intrinsically valuable, but little has been said in this regard (Kahane 2011, 684). Something is intrinsically valuable if it is valuable in and of itself. Consider that if privacy is only extrinsically valuable, it might turn out not to matter if God violates our privacy. Something is extrinsically valuable if it is only valuable based on what we can get from it. This means that God always knows where we are, what we are doing, and what we are thinking. Also, consider that this issue is one at the very heart of whether personal forms of anti-theism can be defended. For if the anti-theist and pro-theist both agree that privacy is intrinsically valuable, then in order to defend personal anti-theism, it need only be shown that God violates our privacy (as opposed to also explaining why it matters if our privacy is violated). Thus, providing a case for why goods associated with atheism such as privacy are intrinsically valuable would greatly strengthen the case for narrow personal anti-theism.

Finally, a closely related but less developed argument for anti-theism appeals to considerations about dignity to defend personal anti-theism (Kahane 2011, 688-689). Imagine that parents decide to have a child merely in order for the child to become an accomplished musician, or professional athlete, or simply for more help on the farm. The idea here is that a child should have the freedom to choose their own life path. A parent should support a child in doing this inasmuch as possible (and inasmuch as the life path in question is morally permissible). To have a child in order to fulfill some end other than their own fundamentally violates the dignity of the child. It treats the child as a means rather than solely as an end (Lougheed 2017, 350-351). The parallel case, of course, is supposed to be with respect to God’s relationship with humans. Many theistic traditions hold that humans were created solely to fulfill God’s purposes for them. If this is true, then humans aren’t permitted to pursue their own ends; they are obliged to pursue the ends God has set for them. Hence, the existence of God violates the dignity of humans. The next step in developing this line of argument is to provide more details about the conception of dignity this argument requires in order to be successful (Lougheed 2017, 351).

b. The Goods of Atheism Argument

The Goods of Atheism Argument has emerged after the Meaningful Life Argument, and it is also best understood as a cluster of arguments. It has been observed that goods associated with atheism need not necessarily be connected to meaning in order to justify narrow personal anti-theism. With respect to goods such as privacy, autonomy, and understanding, it has seemed to some that a world without God could be better for certain individuals, at least when only considering those specific goods. For if goods such as privacy and autonomy are intrinsically valuable, then they don’t need to be connected to meaning in order to support personal forms of anti-theism (Lougheed 2018c). Of course, given the many advantages associated with theism (for example, no gratuitous evil), it is difficult see how this line of argument could ever justify broad versions of anti-theism. It also remains an open question whether an individual could value these goods enough to justify personal anti-theism in absence of them being connected to her life pursuits and hence meaning.

6. Connections to the Existence of God

This section explores connections that have been drawn between the axiological question about God and the existential question of whether God exists.

a. Divine Hiddenness

The most work that has been done to connect the axiological and existential questions about God to one another is with respect to the argument from divine hiddenness for atheism. This argument runs roughly as follows. If God exists, then a relationship with God is one of the greatest goods possible. Because of this fact, if God exists there would be no instances of non-culpable, non-resistant, non-belief among those capable of a relationship with God. For belief that God exists is a necessarily requirement for a relationship with God. Yet there appear to be instances of non-culpable, non-resistant, non-belief. Or at the very least, it is more likely that such individuals exist than that God exists. Thus, it’s probable that God doesn’t exist (Schellenberg 2006; 2015)

One line of argument in the literature attempts to demonstrate that reflections on the axiological consequences of theism and atheism can be used to object to arguments from divine hiddenness. Assume that an actual good obtaining is axiologically equivalent to the experience of the same good (even when that good doesn’t actually obtain). This is intuitive when one considers that from a first-person perspective there is no difference between a good actually obtaining and the mere experience of that same good (Lougheed 2018). They’re both experienced in exactly the same way from the first person perspective. Now consider some goods often used to defend personal forms of anti-theism: privacy, independence, and autonomy. The key move in the argument is to suggest that these atheistic goods can be experienced in a theistic world where God is hidden. For example, consider the atheistic good of total and complete privacy. One can experience this good in a world where God hides. Indeed, many devoutly religious individuals sometimes report feeling alone and unable to feel God’s presence. Likewise, in a world where God hides one also gets many theistic goods. Maybe God intervenes and does a miracle to help someone, but the cause of the help is sufficiently unclear. So, it’s possible to doubt that God performed a miracle, and hence possible to doubt that God exists. Therefore, in a world where God hides, one is able to experience atheistic goods and also the theistic goods since they actually obtain. But atheistic goods cannot be experienced in a world where God isn’t hidden. If God’s existence were obvious (along with some of the divine attributes), for example, then one could not ever have the experience of total and complete privacy (even if turns out to be, in some sense, an illusion). Finally, in an atheistic world no theistic goods obtain. Thus, a world where God is hidden is axiologically superior to an atheistic world, but more importantly, it’s also superior to a world where God isn’t hidden. These considerations serve to support that idea that God might hide in order to maximize the axiological value of the world (Lougheed 2018a)

One line of thought attempts to complete the axiological solution to divine hiddenness by showing that theistic goods do indeed obtain in a world where God hides. On the one hand, it’s clear that theistic goods obtain in a world where God hides simply because this is logical consequence of God’s existence. However, on the other hand it’s not clear that the experience of theistic goods such as forming a relationship with God, cosmic justice, or the afterlife is the same in both worlds. Indeed, the experience of such goods might be so different that the axiological assessment of them ought to differ too. At best, then, we aren’t in a good position to tell whether a world where God hides is axiologically superior to a world where God isn’t hidden. This suggests that the axiological solution to divine hiddenness is at best incomplete (Lougheed 2018b).

One objection to the axiological solution to divine hiddenness attempts to show that it’s intelligible to say that many of the goods typically associated with theism can be experienced in a world where God does not exist (even if they don’t actually obtain). For instance, an afterlife and divine intervention are goods that could both be experienced in a world where God doesn’t exist (Hendricks and Lougheed 2019). Also consider that a world in which God doesn’t exist is consistent with there being an extremely powerful being who is only slightly less powerful than God.  This less powerful being could intervene to help humans and bring an afterlife, and so forth. Such a being might not be possible on naturalism, but it is perfectly consistent with atheism. One of the benefits of the discussion of divine hiddenness and the axiology of theism is that it has brought into focus the goods associated with both theism and atheism, along with how we should understand the value of the experience of such goods. It seems that this is just the beginning of such discussions and much more work remains to be done on this topic.

b. Problem of Evil

One version of the problem of evil, known as the evidential (or probabilistic) problem of evil, suggests that if it’s probable that gratuitous evil exists, then it’s probable that God doesn’t exist. This is because the existence of God is taken to be logically incompatible with the existence of gratuitous evil. Some have suggested that if an individual endorses this or related arguments from evil, then she must also endorse pro-theism. This is because if she accepts the problem of evil then she believes that certain world bad-making properties (for example, gratuitous evil) are incompatible with God’s existence. But if God exists, then those bad-making properties would not exist, and hence the world would be better. So, the atheist who endorses the problem of evil as a reason for atheism must, in order to be consistent, also be a pro-theist (Penner and Arbour 2018).

c. Anti-Theism entails Atheism

Finally, some have argued that if anti-theism is true, then atheism is true. Since God is perfectly good, God must always bring about the better over the worse. However, if anti-theism is true, then there are ways in which God doesn’t always bring about the better. But if God doesn’t always bring about the better over the worse then God doesn’t exist. So, the truth of anti-theism implies the truth of atheism. More strongly, it has been suggested that any negative feature associated with theism (for example, a lack of certain types of privacy) is evidence for atheism. This is because it is logically impossible that there be any negative features associated with a God who is omnibenevolent (Schellenberg 2018).

7. Future Directions

As noted, pro-theism and anti-theism are by far the two broad answers to the axiological question that have received the most attention in the literature to date. Given that much of contemporary philosophy of religion is focused on Christian theism, it isn’t surprising that many of the advantages and drawbacks associated with theism are also most clearly associated with typically Christian conceptions of God. In light of this, it seems that minority views deserve more attention in their own right. Additionally, comparative axiological analyses of other religious and non-religious worldviews would further expand the debate.

a. Exploration of Different Answers

As noted earlier, there are at least three additional answers to the axiological question worthy of further consideration. The first is quietism.  One reason to hold quietism was alluded to earlier, in Section 2. The necessitarian theist thinks there are no worlds where God doesn’t exist, and the necessitarian atheist thinks that there are no worlds where God exists. Given these views and given that the axiological question is a question about comparative judgments, one might think that it’s impossible to make the relevant comparison. As mentioned above, one way around this counterpossible worry might be to think of the comparison as one between epistemically possible worlds as opposed to metaphysically possible worlds. Another reason for quietism might be that worlds are somehow fundamentally incommensurable with one another and hence can’t be compared (Kraay 2018, 13). Consider that what makes an apple taste good is wholly different from what makes cheese taste good. It doesn’t make sense to compare them axiologically even though they’re both foods. This is a simple example intended to motivate incommensurability (Kraay 2011; Penner 2014).

The second additional answer to the axiological question is agnosticism. This view holds that while the axiological question is perhaps in principle answerable, we aren’t currently in a good position to discover the answer. Hence, we should suspend judgment about the answer to the axiological question. One way of motivating this view is that scepticism about whether we have all of the relevant information required in order to make cross-world value judgments. Not only that, we might worry that even if we could identify particular good-making and bad-making features of a specific world, that we don’t know how to combine those features so as to discover the overall value of that world. So, the agnostic holds that we aren’t in a good position to make value judgments about worlds, though such judgments are in principle possible (Kraay 2018, 10-11).

The third additional answer to the axiological question is neutralism. This involves the claim that God’s existence does not make an axiological difference to worlds. Perhaps God is valuable but shouldn’t be factored into assessments of world value. Or maybe one believes the axiological values of theism and atheism are precisely identical (Kraay 2018, 14). Quietism, agnosticism, and neutralism are surely not the only additional answers to the axiological question, but they represent a starting place for further research into different perspectives on the axiology of theism.

b. Other Worldviews

While the axiological question has only been asked about theism (and atheism), there is no in-principle reason why it couldn’t also be asked about other religious and non-religious worldviews. Indeed, the name ‘axiology of theism’ gives away the rather narrow focus of the literature so far. And it’s even narrower still in focusing not just on ‘theism’ in general but on ‘monotheism’ in particular. There are numerous ways the current debate could be expanded. For instance, pantheism considers God and the Universe to be one. The axiological question might not make sense with respect to pantheism (or might need to be reconstructed) since world value apart from God makes little since if pantheism is true. Panentheism considers the universe to be a proper part of God and thus suffers from a similar worry. Or consider that on a polytheistic religion such as Hinduism the axiological question can be asked with respect to many different Gods. Many of the different deities of Hinduism each have their own unique axiological value. Furthermore, one can explore whether it makes sense to assess the value of each deity separately or whether they need to be assessed together. Finally, consider that it’s far from clear that there is the concept of evil on Buddhism. At the very least, the Buddhist understanding of evil is quite different from how the Judeo-Christian tradition understands it. This brings into focus the question of whether it’s possible to make objective axiological judgments without somehow depending on the values of what one is supposed to be assessing in the first place. These concerns are raised only to show that the axiological question is quite far-ranging, and that much work remains to be done not only in assessing the value of theism and atheism, but also the values of other religious and non-religious worldviews.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Azadegan, E. (2019) “Antitheism and Gratuitous Evil.” The Heythrop Journal 60 (5): 671-677.
    • Argues that personal anti-theism is a form of gratuitous evil.
  • Cottingham, John. (2005) The Spiritual Dimension: Religion, Philosophy and Human Value. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Chalmers, David (2011) “The Nature of Epistemic Space,” in Epistemic Modality Andy Egan and Brian Weatherson (eds) Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 60-106.
    • Provides a model of epistemic possibility.
  • Davis, S.T. (2014) “On Preferring that God Not Exist (or that God Exist): A Dialogue.” Faith and Philosophy 31: 143-159.
    • A simply written dialogue discussing different ways of defending both anti-theism and pro-theism.
  • Dumsday, T. (2016) “Anti-Theism and the Problem of Divine Hiddenness.” Sophia 55: 179-195.
  • Hedberg, T., and Huzarevich, J. (2017) “Appraising Objections to Practical Apatheism.” Philosophia 45: 257-276.
  • Hendricks, P. and Lougheed, K. (2019) “Undermining the Axiological Solution to Divine Hiddenness.” International Journal for Philosophy of Religion 86: 3-15.
    • Argues that theistic goods could be experienced in a world where God doesn’t exist.
  • Kahane, G. (2011) “Should We Want God to Exist?” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 82: 674-696.
    • This is responsible for starting the axiology of theism literature is the first statement of the Meaningful Life Argument for anti-theism.
  • Kahane, G. (2012) “The Value Question in Metaphysics.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 85: 27-55.
  • Kahane, G. (2018) “If There Is a Hole, It Is Not God-Shaped.” In Kraay, K. [Ed.] Does God Matter? Essays on the Axiological Consequences of Theism. Routledge, 95-131.
    • Argues that God isn’t required to get many of the theistic goods mentioned by pro-theists.
  • Kraay, K.J. Ed. (2018) Does God Matter? Essays on the Axiological Consequences of Theism. Routledge.
    • This is the only edited collection on the axiological question and contains essays addressing a wide variety of issues from well-known philosophers of religion.
  • Kraay, K.J. (2018). “Invitation to the Axiology of Theism.” In Kraay, K.J.[Ed.] Does God Matter? Essays on the Axiological Consequences of Theism. Routledge, 1-36.
    • An extremely detailed survey chapter of the current debate including helpful prompts for further discussion.
  • Kraay, K.J. (2011) “Incommensurability, Incomparability, and God’s Choice of a World. International Journal for Philosophy of religion 69 (2): 91-102.
  • Kraay, K.J. and Dragos, C. (2013) “On Preferring God’s Non-Existence.” Canadian Journal of Philosophy 43: 153-178.
    • Responsible for identifying many of the more fine-grained answers to the axiological question.
  • Linford, D. and Megill, J. (2018) “Cognitive Bias, the Axiological Question, and the Epistemic Probability of Theistic Belief.” In Ontology of Theistic Beliefs: Meta-Ontological Perspectives. Ed. Mirslaw Szatkowski. Berlin: de Gruyter.
  • Lougheed, K. (2017) “Anti-Theism and the Objective Meaningful Life Argument.” Dialogue 56: 337-355.
    • Defends the Meaningful Life Argument against Penner (2018).
  • Lougheed, K. (2018a) “The Axiological Solution to Divine Hiddenness.” Ratio 31: 331-341.
    • Argues that a world where God hides is more valuable than a world where God’s existence is obvious and a world where God doesn’t exist.
  • Lougheed, K. (2018b) “On the Axiology of a Hidden God.” European Journal for Philosophy of Religion 10: 79-95
    • Argues that we cannot tell whether a world where God hides is more valuable than world where God’s existence is obvious.
  • Lougheed, K. (2018c). “On How to (Not) to Argue for the Non-Existence of God.” Dialogue: Canadian Philosophical Review 1-23.
    • Argues that pro-theism is not easier to defend than anti-theism.
  • Luck, M. and Ellerby, N. (2012) “Should we Want God Not to Exist?” Philo 15: 193-199.
  • Mawson, T. (2012) “On Determining How Important it is Whether or Not there is a God.” European Journal for Philosophy of Religion 4: 95-105.
  • McBrayer, J. (2010). “Skeptical Theism.” Philosophy Compass 5: 611-623.
  • McLean, G.R. (2015) “Antipathy to God.” Sophia 54: 13-24.
  • Metz, T. (2019). God, Soul and the Meaning of Life. Cambridge University Press.
    • An introduction to different theories of what constitutes a meaningful life.
  • Mugg, Joshua (2016) “The Quietist Challenge to the Axiology of God: A Cognitive Approach to Counterpossibles.” Faith and Philosophy 33: 441-460.
    • Applies a theory from the philosophy of mind to solve the worries about whether the axiological question is intelligible.
  • Penner, M.A. (2018) “On the Objective Meaningful Life Argument: A Reply to Kirk Lougheed.” Dialogue 57: 173-182.
    • Replies to Lougheed (2017).
  • Penner, M.A. (2015) “Personal Anti-Theism and the Meaningful Life Argument.” Faith and Philosophy 32: 325-337.
    • Develops Kahane (2011) into a more detailed version of the Meaningful Life Argument for anti-theism, but ultimately rejects it.
  • Penner, M.A. (2014) “Incommensurability, incomparability, and rational world-choice.” International Journal for Philosophy of Religion 75 (1): 13-25.
  • Penner, M.A. and Arbour, B.H. (2018) “Arguments from Evil and Evidence for Pro-Theism.” In Kraay, K.J. [Ed.] Does God Matter? Essays on the Axiological Consequences of Theism. Routledge, 192-202.
  • Penner, M.A. and Lougheed, K. (2015) “Pro-Theism and the Added Value of Morally Good Agents.” Philosophia Christi 17: 53-69.
    • Argues that God’s existence adds value to the world since God is a morally good agent.
  • Rescher, N. (1990) “On Faith and Belief.” In Human Interests. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 166-178.
    • The first time the axiology of God’s existence is explicitly mentioned in the contemporary literature.
  • Schellenberg, J.L. (2006). Divine Hiddenness and Human Reason. Cornell University Press.
    • This book represents the first statement of the argument from divine hiddenness as discussed in the contemporary literature.
  • Schellenberg, J.L. (2015) The Hiddenness Argument: Philosophy’s New Challenge to Belief in God. Oxford University Press.
    • A statement on divine hiddenness intended to be accessible to a wide audience.
  • Schellenberg, J.L. (2018) “Triple Transcendence, the Value of God’s Existence, and a New Route to Atheism.” In Kraay, K.J.[Ed.] Does God Matter? Essays on the Axiological Consequences of Theism. Routledge, 181-191.
  • Van Der Veen, J. and Horsten, L. (2013) “Cantorian Infinity and Philosophical Concepts of God.” European Journal for Philosophy of Religion 5: 117-138.
  • Williams, B. (1981) “Persons, Character and Morality,” in Moral Luck. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Author Information

Kirk Lougheed
Concordia University of Edmonton