Conquest-era Aztecs conceived philosophy in essentially pragmatic terms. The raison d’etre of philosophical inquiry was to provide humans with practicable answers to what Aztecs identified as the defining question of human existence: How can we maintain our balance while walking upon the slippery earth? Aztec philosophers addressed this question against an assumed metaphysics which held that the cosmos and its human inhabitants are constituted by and ultimately identical with a single, vivifying, eternally self-generating and self-regenerating sacred energy. Knowledge, truth, value, rightness, and beauty were defined in terms of the aim of humans maintaining their balance as well as the balance of the cosmos. Every moment and aspect of human life was meant to further the realization of this aim.
Table of Contents
- Nahua Metaphysics
- The Defining Problematic of Nahua Philosophy
- Intrinsic Value: Balance and Purity
- Morality: Living in Balance and Purity
- References and Further Reading
a. Who were the Aztecs?
The indigenous peoples of Mesoamerica enjoy a long and rich tradition of philosophical speculation. The Aztecs and other Nahuatl-speaking peoples of the High Central Plateau of Mexico were no exception. Nahuatl-speaking peoples originated in northern Mexico and southwestern United States, migrating south in successive waves to the central Mexican highlands during the thirteenth and fourteenth centuries. Nahuatl is a member of the Uto-Aztecan linguistic family and related to Ute, Hopi, and Comanche. Nahuatl-speakers included among others the Mexicas (known to us but not to themselves as “Aztecs”), Texcocans, Chalcans, and Tlaxcaltecs. Due to their common language and culture, scholars standardly refer to Nahuatl-speakers as “Nahuas”, and to their culture, as “Nahua culture”. I follow this practice here. Nahua culture flourished in the fifteenth- and sixteenth- centuries prior to 1521 (CE), the fall of the Aztec capital, Tenochtitlan, and official date of the Conquest.
b. Sources for Studying Nahua Philosophy
Our sources for studying Conquest-era Nahua philosophy include: (1) native pictorial histories, ritual almanacs, tribute records, and maps, including the Codex Mendoza (painted several years after the Conquest), Codex Borgia (painted shortly before the Conquest), and Codex Borbonicus (painted about the time of the Conquest); (2) reports of the Spanish conquerors (e.g. Hernando Cortes and Bernal Diaz del Costillo); (3) ethnography-style works composed by missionaries (e.g. Friars Olmos, Motolinia, Sahagun, Duran and Mendieta) entering Mexico shortly after the Conquest — most notably Sahagun’s encyclopedic Historia General de las Cosas de Nueva Espana; (4) early seventeenth-century chronicles of Fernando de Alva Ixtlilxochitl and Domingo de San Anton Munon Chimalpahin Quauhtlehuanitzin, both Spanish-educated creole descendants of Aztec nobility; (5) native sources of non-Nahuatl-speaking indigenous peoples of Mexico (e.g. the Dresden Codex and Popol Vuh; (6) ethnographies of contemporary Nahuatl-speaking (e.g. Knab 1995; Sandstrom 1991) and non-Nahuatl-speaking (e.g. Hunt 1977; Monaghan 1995; Myerhoff 1974; Schaefer 2002; Tedlock 1992) indigenous peoples; and (6) archaeological studies (e.g. Smith 1996). (For further discussion see Carmack, et al. 1996; Leon-Portilla 1963).
c. The Approach of This Study
I approach Conquest-era Nahua philosophy by hermeneutical triangulation using the above sources. I assume Nahua philosophy to be a coherent body of thought consisting tentatively of four interrelated divisions: metaphysics, epistemology, theory of value, and aesthetics. In hermeneutical fashion, understanding Nahua philosophy as a whole depends upon understanding each division, while understanding each division depends upon understanding the other divisions as well as the whole.
Approaching Nahua philosophy in these terms is not without hazard. Although mainstays in European philosophy, they demarcate categories for which there are no precise, noncontroversial synonyms in Nahuatl. Nahua tlamatinime (“knowers of things,” “sages,” “philosophers;” tlamatini [singular]) do not appear to have analyzed philosophical thought in these terms. Rather, they conceived metaphysics, epistemology, theory of value, and aesthetics in conceptually overlapping if not equivalent terms.
Why then employ them? I believe doing so offers Western readers an intuitive first step into Nahua philosophy since they are deeply entrenched in Western thought. What’s more, they are commonly employed in Nahua scholarship (e.g. Burkhart 1989; Gingerich 1987, 1988; Leon-Portilla 1963; Lopez Austin 1988, 1997; Read 1998). Their heuristic utility notwithstanding, employing them must not mislead us into thinking that Nahua philosophers conceived philosophy in precisely these terms. Successfully understanding Nahua philosophy requires in the final analysis that we reconceive these divisions as a single, seamless conceptual whole. (For discussion of the pitfalls involved in using Western concepts to understand non-Western thought, see Asad 1986; Hall and Ames 1995; Maffie 2004; Wiredu 1996.)
I attribute the following views to the Nahuas generally, although it is more accurate to attribute them to the upper elite of priests, scholars, and educated nobility. Afterall, views differed between: priests, merchants, and farmers; men and women; dominant and subordinate city-states; and various regional and ethnic subgroups. I attribute the views to the period of the Mesoamerican-European contact, realizing full well that philosophies are living works in progress.
a. Teotl as Ultimate Reality and Root Metaphor
At the heart of Nahua philosophy stands the thesis that there exists a single, dynamic, vivifying, eternally self-generating and self-regenerating sacred power, energy or force: what the Nahuas called teotl (see Boone 1994; Burkhart 1989; Klor de Alva 1979; Monaghan 2000; H.B. Nicholson 1971; Read 1998; Townsend 1972). Elizabeth Boone (1994:105) writes, “The real meaning of [teotl] is spirit — a concentration of power as a sacred and impersonal force”. According to Jorge Klor de Alva (1979:7), “Teotl …implies something more than the idea of the divine manifested in the form of a god or gods; instead it signifies the sacred in more general terms”. The multiplicity of gods in official, state sanctioned Aztec religion does not gainsay this claim, for this multiplicity was merely the sacred, merely teotl, “separated, as it were by the prism of human sight, into its many attributes” (I. Nicholson 1959:63f).
Teotl continually generates and regenerates as well as permeates, encompasses, and shapes the cosmos as part of its endless process of self-generation-and–regeneration. That which humans commonly understand as nature — e.g. heavens, earth, rain, humans, trees, rocks, animals, etc. — is generated by teotl, from teotl as one aspect, facet, or moment of its endless process of self-generation-and-regeneration. Yet teotl is more than the unified totality of things; teotl is identical with everything and everything is identical with teotl. Since identical with teotl, they cosmos and its contents ultimately transcend such dichotomies as personal vs. impersonal, animate vs. inanimate, etc. As the single, all-encompassing life force of the universe, teotl vivifies the cosmos and its contents. Lastly, teotl is both metaphysically immanent and transcendent. It is immanent in that it penetrates deeply into every detail of the universe and exists within the myriad of created things; it is transcendent in that it is not exhausted by any single, existing thing.
Nahua metaphysics is processive. Process, movement, becoming and transmutation are essential attributes of teotl. Teotl is properly understood as ever-flowing and ever-changing energy-in-motion — not as a discrete, static entity. Because doing so better reflects teotl’s dynamic and processual nature, I suggest (following Cooper’s  proposal that we treat “God” of the mystical teachings of the Jewish Kabbalah as a verb) that we treat the word “teotl” as a verb denoting process and movement rather than as a noun denoting a discrete static entity. So construed, “teotl” refers to the eternal, universal process of teotlizing.
b. Dialectical Polar Monism
Although essentially processive and devoid of any permanent order, the ceaseless becoming of the cosmos is nevertheless characterized by an overarching balance, rhythm, and regularity: one provided by and constituted by teotl. Teotl’s and hence the cosmos’ ceaseless becoming is characterized by what I call “dialectical polar monism”. Dialectical polar monism holds that: (1) the cosmos and its contents are substantively and formally identical with teotl; and (2) teotl presents itself primarily as the ceaseless, cyclical oscillation of polar yet complementary opposites.
Teotl’s process presents itself in multiple aspects, preeminent among which is duality. This duality takes the form of the endless opposition of contrary yet mutually interdependent and mutually complementary polarities which divide, alternately dominate, and explain the diversity, movement, and momentary arrangement of the universe. These include: being and not-being, order and disorder, life and death, light and darkness, masculine and feminine, dry and wet, hot and cold, and active and passive. Life and death, for example, are mutually arising, interdependent, and complementary aspects of one and the same process. Life contains the seed of death; death, the fertile, energizing seed of life. The artists of Tlatilco and Oaxaca, for example, presented this duality artistically by fashioning a split-faced mask, one-half alive, one-half skull-like (see Markman and Markman 1989:90). The masks are intentionally ambiguous. Skulls simultaneously symbolize death and life, since life springs from the bones of the dead. Flesh simultaneously symbolizes life and death, since death arises from the flesh of the living. The faces are thus neither-alive-nor-dead-yet-both-alive-and-dead all at once.
The Nahuas’ notion of duality contrasts with Zoroastrian-style eschatological dualisms. The latter claim: (1) order (goodness, life, light) and disorder (evil, death, darkness) are mutually exclusive forces; and (2) order (life, etc.) triumphs over disorder (death, etc.) at the end of history. Acording to Nahua duality, order and disorder, life and death, etc. alternate endlessly without resolution. It neither conceives death as inherently evil and life as inherently good nor advocates the conquest of death or the search for eternal life (see Caso 1958; Burkhart 1989; Carmack, et al. 1996; Hunt 1977; Knab 1995; Leon-Portilla 1963; Lopez Austin 1988, 1993, 1997; Monaghan 2000; Read 1998; Sandstrom 1991).
The created cosmos consists of the unending, cyclical tug-of-war or dialectical oscillation of these polarities — all of which are the manifold manifestations of teotl. Because of this, the created cosmos is characterized as unstable, transitory, and devoid of any lasting being, order or structure. Yet teotl is nevertheless characterized by enduring pattern or regularity. How is this so? Teotl is the dynamic, sacred energy shaping as well as constituting these endless oscillations; it is the immanent balance of the endless, dialectical alternation of the created universe’s interdependent polarities.
Because essentially processive and dynamic, teotl is properly characterized neither by being nor not-being but by becoming. Being and not-being are simply two dialectically interrelated presentations or facets of teotl, and as such inapplicable to teotl itself. Similarly, teotl is properly understood as neither ordered (law-governed) nor disordered (anarchic) but as unordered. Indeed, this point is fully general: life/death, active/passive, male/female, etc. are strictly speaking not predicable of teotl. Teotl captures a tertium quid transcending these dichotomies by being simultaneously neither-alive-nor-dead-yet-both-alive-and-dead, simultaneously neither-orderly-nor-disorderly-yet-both-orderly-and-disorderly, etc.
In the end, teotl is essentially an unstructured and unordered, seamless totality. Differentiation, regularity, order, etc. are simultaneously fictions of human unknowing and artistic-shamanic presentations of teotl. In Western philosophical terminology, one perhaps best characterizes the radical ontological indeterminacy of Nahua metaphysics as an extreme nominalist anti-realism, and teotl, as a Kantian-like noumenon.
Nahuas philosophers also conceived teotl pantheistically: (a) everything that exists constitutes an all-inclusive and interrelated unity; (b) this unity is sacred; (c) everything that exists is substantively identical and hence one with the sacred; (d) the sacred is teotl. There is only one thing, teotl, and all other forms or aspects of reality and existence are identical with teotl; (e) teotl is not a minded being or ‘person’ (in the Western sense of having intentional states or the capacity to make decisions). (See Levine 1994 for discussion of pantheism.)
Hunt (1977) and I. Nicholson (1959) offer closely similar interpretations of pre-Hispanic metaphysics. Eva Hunt writes:
…reality, nature and experience were nothing but multiple manifestations of a single unity of being… The [sacred] was both the one and the many… It was also multiple, fluid, encompassing of the whole, its aspects were changing images, dynamic, never frozen, but constantly recreated, redefined (Hunt 1977:55f.).
Alan Sandstrom’s ethnography of contemporary Nahuatl-speakers in Veracruz, Mexico, offers a similar interpretation:
…everybody and everything is an aspect of a grand, single, overriding unity. Separate beings and objects do not exist–that is an illusion peculiar to human beings. In daily life we divide up our environment into discrete units so that we can talk about it and manipulate it for our benefit. But it is an error to assume that the diversity we create in our lives is the way reality is actually structured … everything is connected at a deeper level, part of the same basic substratum of being… The universe is a deified, seamless totality (Sandstrom 1991:138).
d. Teotl as Self-Transforming Shaman and Artist
Teotl’s ceaseless generating-and-regenerating of the cosmos is also one of ceaseless self-transformation-and-self-retransformation. The cosmos is teotl’s self-transformation or self-transmutation — not its creation ex nihilo. The Nahuas understood this process in two closely interrelated ways.
First, they conceived it artistically. Teotl is a sacred artist who endlessly fashions and refashions itself into and as the cosmos. The cosmos is teotl’s in xochitl, in cuicatl (“flower-and-song”). The Nahuas used “in xochitl, in cuicatl” to refer specifically to the composing and performing of song-poems and to refer generally to creative, artistic, and metaphorical activity (e.g. singing poetry, music, painting/writing [the Nahuas regarded painting and writing as a single activity]). As teotl’s “flower and song” the cosmos is teotl’s grand, ongoing artistic-cum-metaphorical self-presentation; teotl’s ongoing work of performance art or “metaphor in motion” (Markman and Markman 1989).
Second, they conceived teotl’s self-transmutation in shamanic terms. The cosmos is teotl’s nahual (“disguise” or “mask”). The Nahuatl word “nahual” derives from “nahualli” signifying a form-changing shaman (suggesting its indigenous shamanic roots). The continual becoming of the cosmos and its myriad aspects are teotl’s shamanic self-masking and self-disguising (see P. Furst 1976; Gingerich 1988; H.B. Nicholson 1971; Ortiz de Montellano 1990).
Teotl artistically-cum-shamanically presents and masks itself to humans in a variety of ways: (1) the apparent thingness of existents, i.e. the appearance of static entities such as humans, mountains, trees, insects, etc. This is illusory, since one and all are merely facets of teotl’s sacred motion; (2) the apparent multiplicity of existents, i.e. the appearance of discrete, independently existing entities such as individual humans, plants, mountains, etc. This is illusory since there is only one thing: teotl; and (3) the apparent exclusivity, independence, and irreconcilable oppositionality of dualities such as order and disorder, life and death, etc. This is illusory since they are interrelated, complementary facets of teotl.
As an epistemological consequence of teotl’s self-disguising, when humans customarily gaze upon the world, what they see is teotl as a human, as a tree, as female, etc.–i.e. teotl self-disguised — rather than teotl as teotl. As we shall see shortly below, wisdom enables humans to discern the sacred presence of teotl in its myriad disguises.
e. Teotl as Root Metaphor of Nahua Philosophy
Teotl functions as Stephen Pepper (1970) calls the “root metaphor” and what Alfredo Lopez Austin (1997) calls the “archetype” and “logical principle” governing the “unifying” “coherent nucleus” of Nahua philosophy. Teotl possesses metaphysical, epistemological, moral, and aesthetic facets in that it functions simultaneously as the source, object, and/or standard of reality, knowledge, value, rightness, and beauty.
f. Popular Aztec Religion
Many of the preceding claims were expressed mythologically and polytheistically in state-sanctioned, popular Aztec religion. Although the priests, nobility, and sages embraced its monistic aspect, the uneducated masses tended to embrace the polytheistic aspects of Nahua metaphysics (see Caso 1958; Leon-Portilla 1963:Ch II; H.B. Nicholson 1971:410-2; I. Nicholson 1959:60-3). State-sanctioned Aztec religion construed teotl as the supreme god, Ometeotl (literally, “Two God”, also called in Tonan, in Tota, Huehueteotl, “our Mother, our Father, the Old God”), as well as a host of lesser gods, stars, fire, and water (Leon-Portilla 1963). Ometeotl was the god of duality, a male-female unity who resided in Omeyocan, “The place of duality”, which occupied the highest levels of the heavens. S/he fathered/mothered her/himself as well as the universe. As “Lord and Lady of our flesh and sustenance”, Ometeotl provided the universal cosmic energy from which all things derived their original as well as continued existence and sustenance; s/he provided and maintained the oscillating rhythm of the universe; and s/he gave all things their particular natures. In virtue of these attributes s/he was called the “one through whom all live” (Caso 1958:8) and the one “who is the very being of all things, preserving them and sustaining them” (Alonso de Molina, in Leon-Portilla 1963:92). Because metaphysically immanent, Ometeotl was called Tloque Nahuaque, the “one who is near to everything and to whom everything is near” (Angel Garibay, quoted in Leon-Portilla 1963:93). Because epistemologically transcendent (in the sense that humans are not guaranteed knowledge of Ometeotl), Ometeotl was called Yohualli-ehecatl, the one who is “invisible (like the night) and intangible (like the wind)”.
g. Living in “The House of Paintings”
Nahua tlamatinime standardly characterized earthly existence as consisting of pictures, images, and symbols painted-written by teotl on its sacred amoxtli (Mesoamerican papyrus-like paper). The tlamatini Aquiauhtzin (ca.1430-ca.1500, from Chalco-Amaquemecan), for example, characterized the earth as “the house of paintings” (Cantares mexicanos fol.10 r., trans. by Leon-Portilla 1992:282.). According to Xayacamach (second half of the fifteenth century, from Tlaxcala), “Your home is here, in the midst of the paintings” (Cantares mexicanos fol.11 v., trans. by Leon-Portilla 1992:228). Like the images on amoxtli painted-written by human artists, the images on teotl’s sacred canvas are fragile and evanescent. The renowned tlamatini and ruler of Texcoco, Nezahualcoyotl (1402-1472), sung:
With flowers You paint, O Giver of Life!
With songs You give color, with songs you give life on the earth.
Later you will destroy eagles and tigers: we live only in your painting here, on the earth.
With black ink you will blot out all that was friendship, brotherhood, nobility.
You give shading to those who will live on the earth…
we live only in Your book of paintings, here on the earth. (Romances de los senores de Nueva Espana, fol.35 r., trans. by Leon-Portilla 1992:83).
Because they saw everything earthly as teotl’s nahual, Nahua tlamatinime claimed everything earthly is dreamlike. Tochihuitzin Coyolchiuhqui sung: “We only rise from sleep, we come only to dream, it is ahnelli [unrooted, untrue] it is ahnelli [unrooted, untrue] that we come on earth to live.” (Cantares mexicanos, fol.14v., trans. by Leon-Portilla 1992:153). Once again, Nezahualcoyotl sung:
Is it nelli [rooted, true, authentic] one really lives on the earth?
Not forever on earth, only a little while here.
Though it be jade it falls apart, though it be gold it wears away, though it be quetzal plumage it is torn asunder.
Not forever on this earth, only a little while here.
(Cantares mexicanos, fol 17r., trans. by Leon-Portilla 1992:80).
Nahua tlamatinime conceived the dreamlikeness or illusoriness of earthly existence in epistemological — not ontological — terms (pace Leon-Portilla 1963). Illusion was not an ontological category as it was, say, for Plato. In the Republic (Book VI) Plato employed the notion of illusion: to characterize an inferior or lower grade of reality or existence; to distinguish this inferior grade of reality from a superior, higher one (the Forms); and to deny that earthy existence is fully real. This conception of illusion commits one to an ontological dualism that divides the universe into two fundamentally different kinds of existents: illusion and reality.
Nahua tlamatinime employed the concepts of dreamlikeness and illusion as epistemological categories in order to make the epistemological claim that the natural condition of humans is to be deceived by teotl’s disguise and misunderstand teotl — not the metaphysical claim that as teotl’s disguise all earthly existence is ontologically substandard and not genuinely real. Earthly existence provides the occasion for human misperception, misjudgment, and misunderstanding. The dreamlike character of earthly existence, the mask of unknowing which beguiles us as human beings, is a function of our human perspective and teotl’s artistic self-disguise (these being ultimately one and the same!) — not a metaphysical dualism inherent in the make-up of things. When Nahua tlamatinime characterized earthly existence as ephemeral and evanescent, they did so not because earthly existence lacks complete reality but because as facets of teotl’s disguise they are subject to the endless oscillation of dialectical polar monism. Illusion is a function our mistaking the commonly perceived characteristics of the myriad shapes, structures, and entities of teotl’s disguise as characteristics of teotl itself. In sum, the Nahuas’ epistemological conception of illusion does not commit them to an ontological dualism between two different kinds of existents — illusion and reality — and is therefore consistent with their ontological monism.
A further consequence of Nahua monism is the metaphysical impossibility of human beings perceiving de re anything other than teotl, for teotl is the only thing to be perceived de re! But then how can Nahua tlamatinime claim that humans normally misperceive and misunderstand teotl? Humans normally perceive and conceive teotl de dicto or under a description, e.g. as Nezahualcoyotl, as maleness, as death, as night, etc. When doing so they perceive and conceive teotl’s nahual (self-disguise) and consequently perceive and conceive teotl in a manner that is ahnelli — i.e. untrue, unrooted, inauthentic, unconcealing, and nondisclosing. It is humans’ misperceiving and misunderstanding teotl as its disguise (nahual) which prevents them from seeing teotl (reality) as it really is.
The only way humans experience teotl knowingly is to experience teotl sans description. Humans experience teotl knowingly via a process of mystical-style union between their hearts and teotl that enables them to experience teotl directly i.e. without mediation by language, concepts, or categories. One comes to know teotl through teotl. One’s perception and conception are no longer befogged by “the cloud of unknowing” (to borrow from the fourteenth century English mystical text by the same name) or the “breath on the mirror” (to borrow from the Mayan Popol Vuh) constituted by de dicto perception and conception. Note however that although metaphysically immanent within human hearts (in keeping with Nahua metaphysical monism), teotl is nevertheless epistemologically transcendent in the sense that humans are not guaranteed knowledge of teotl.
A fundamental metaphysical difference thus divides the underlying problematics of Nahua and Cartesian-style Western epistemology. The latter conceives subject and object dualistically and the relationship between subject and object as one mediated by a “veil of perception”. The subject’s access to the object is indirect, being mediated, for example, by appearances or representations of the object. The Nahuas’ epistemological problematic conceives the subject and object monistically and the relationship between subject and object in terms of a mask. And masks in Mesoamerican epistemology have different properties than veils.
In their study of masks in Mesoamerican shamanism (in which sixteenth-century Nahua epistemology was deeply rooted and to which it remained closely related), Markman and Markman (1989:xx) argue that masks “simultaneously conceal and reveal the innermost spiritual force of life itself”. For example, the life/death masks mentioned above simultaneously conceal and reveal the simultaneously neither-alive-nor-dead-yet-both-alive-and-dead figure. The mask does not symbolize, represent, or point to something deeper, something hiding behind itself, for the simultaneously neither-alive-nor-dead-yet-both-alive-and-dead figure rests right upon the surface of the figure. The simultaneously neither-alive-nor-dead-yet-both-alive-and-dead figure does not lurk behind the mask; nor is our access to it obstructed by a veil or representation. It is fully present de re yet hidden de dicto by our unknowing, i.e. by our normal tendency to misperceive reality as exclusively either dead or alive — as opposed to neither-alive-nor-dead-yet-both-alive-and-dead. After years of ritual preparation, Nahua tlamatinime were able to see the life-death mask de re or “unmasked” as it were, and in so doing discern the complementary unity and interdependence of life and death.
Nahua metaphysics conceives time and its various patterns as the dynamic unfolding of teotl. Time and space form an indistinguisable time-space continuum. The four cardinal directions, for example, are simultaneously directions of space and time. Weeks, months, seasons, years, and year-clusters all had spatial directions. Time-space is concrete, quantitative, and qualitative. It does not consist of a uniform succession of qualitatively identical moments, nor is it a neutral frame of reference abstracted from terrestrial and celestial events and processes. The quantitative dimensions of time-space are inseparable from its qualitative, symbolic dimensions. Different time-spaces bear different qualities.
All these dimensions coalesced in the activity of Nahua time-space-keeping (astronomy), which included observing, counting, measuring, interpreting, giving an account of, and creating an artistic-written record of various patterns of time-space. Nahua time-space-keeping included tonalpohualli (“counting the days”) or counting the days of the 260-day cycle; xiuhpohualli (“counting the years”) or counting the days of the 360+5-day cycle; xiuhmolpilli (“binding the years”) or counting the 52 years of the “calendar round”; counting the 65 “years” of the cycle of Quetzalcoatl (the Venusian cycle); and counting other cycles in celestial and terrestrial processes. Nahua “time-keepers” (cahuipouhqui) were knowledgeable of the time-space rhythms of teotl and responsible for keeping society and humankind in balance with the cosmos.
Calendrical cycles govern human existence. A person’s birth date in the tonalpohualli determines her tonalli: a vital force having important consequences for her character and destiny. The Nahuas used the tonalpohualli to divine the nature of this force. The tonalpohualli assigned different daysigns to each day, each daysign having different effects on a person’s character and destiny. Time-space bears destinies, carried burdens, and conveyed these to events falling under its influence. The reckoning of any period of time-space always leads one to investigate the tonalli or “day-time-destiny” associated with it. Everything happening on the earth and in humans’ lives from birth to death is the outcome of tonalli.
The history of the universe falls into five successive ages or “suns,” each representing the temporary dominance of a different aspect of teotl. The present era, the “Age of the Fifth Sun,” is the final one and the one in which the Aztecs believed they lived. Like its four predecessors, the Fifth Sun is destined to cataclysmic destruction, at which time the earth will be destroyed by earthquakes and humankind will vanish forever. (For further discussion, see Lopez Austin 1988, 1997; Leon-Portilla 1963; Read 1998; Carrasco 1990; Maffie [forthcoming].)
3. The Defining Problematic of Nahua Philosophy
a. How Can Humans Maintain their Balance on the Slippery Earth?
The Nahua regarded earthly life as filled with pain, sorrow, and suffering. Indeed, the earth’s surface is a treacherous habitat for human beings. Its name, “tlalticpac,” literally means “on the point or summit of the earth”, suggesting a narrow, jagged, point-like place surrounded by constant dangers (Michael Launey, quoted in Burkhart 1989:58). The Nahuatl proverb, “Tlaalahui, tlapetzcahui in tlalticpac,” “It is slippery, it is slick on the earth,” was said of a person who had lived a morally upright life but then lost her balance and fell into moral wrongdoing, as if slipping in slick mud (Sahagun 1953-82:VI,p.228, trans. by Burkhart 1989). Humans lose their balance easily on tlalticpac and so suffer misfortune frequently. They therefore desparately need guidance.
Nahua tlamatinime conceived the raison d’etre of philosophy in terms of this situation, and turned to philosophy for practicable answers to what they regarded as the defining question of human existence: How can humans maintain their balance upon the slippery earth? This situation and question jointly constitute the problematic which functions as the defining framework for Nahua philosophy. Morally, epistemologically, and aesthetically appropriate human activity are defined in terms of the goal of humans maintaining their balance upon the slippery earth. All human activities are to be directed towards this aim. At bottom, Nahua philosophy is essentially pragmatic.
Because of this I suggest Nahua philosophy is better understood as a “way-seeking” rather than as a “truth-seeking” philosophy. “Way-seeking” philosophies such as classical Taoism, classical Confucianism, and contemporary North American pragmatism adopt as their defining question, “What is the way?” or “What is the path?”. In contrast, “truth-seeking” philosophies such as most European philosophies adopt as their defining question, “What is the truth?” (For discussion see Hall 2001; Hall and Ames 1998; Maffie [ed] 2001.)
To the question, “How can humans maintain their balance upon the slippery earth?”, Nahua tlamatinime answered, “Humans must conduct every aspect of their lives wisely”. To the question, “What is the best path for humans to follow on the narrow, jagged surface of the earth?”, they answered, “The balanced, middle path since it avoids excess and imbalance, hence mistepping and slipping, hence misfortune and ill-being”.
b. The Character of Wisdom
Wisdom aims at instructing humans how to maintain their balance (like skilled mountaineers) as they walk upon the narrow, twisting, and jagged path of life upon the summit of the earth (see Burkhart 1989; Gingerich 1988; Leon-Portilla 1963; I. Nicholson 1959). The Nahuas conceived wisdom dynamically in terms of balancing — a conception rooted in indigenous shamanism (see Eliade 1964; Gingerich 1988; P. Furst 1976; Myeroff 1974) and in their conception of teotl. They conceived wisdom adverbially, not substantively. Wisdom is a characteristic of how one conducts oneself and one’s affairs — not a thing or a set of eternal truths one grasps, apprehends, or possesses. By enabling them to walk in balance, wisdom affords humans some measure of stability and well-being in an otherwise evanescent life filled with pain, sorrow, struggle, and suffering, here on an impermanent, doomed earth.
Nahua sages conceived tlamatiliztli (knowledge, wisdom) in pragmatic, creative, and performative terms rather than in propositional or theoretical terms. Tlamatiliztli consists of non-propositional ‘know how’ — not propositional ‘knowledge that’. It consists of knowing how to live so as to make one’s way safely upon the slippery surface of earth. How do humans become wise? They must become neltiliztli, i.e. well-rooted, authentic, true, and non-referentially disclosing. Their intellectual, emotional, imaginative, and physical dispositions and behavior must become deeply and firmly rooted in teotl.
Tlamatiliztli involved four, ultimately indistinguishable aspects: (1) the practical ability to conduct one’s affairs in such a way as to attain some measure of balance and purity–and hence some measure of well-being–in one’s personal, domestic, social, and natural surroundings; (2) the practical ability to conduct one’s life in such a way as to creatively participate in, reinforce, adapt, and extend into the future the way of life inherited from one’s predecessors; (3) the practical ability to conduct one’s life in such a way as to participate in the regeneration-cum-renewal of the cosmos, and; (4) the practical know how involved in performing ritual activities which: genuinely present teotl; authentically embody teotl; preserve existing balance and purity; create new balance and purity; and participate alongside teotl in the regeneration of the universe.
The Nahua universe is a “participatory universe” characterized by a “relationship of compelling mutuality” or “interdependence” between humans and universe (Wilbert 1975; see also Leon-Portilla 1993; Lopez Austin 1988, 1997; Read 1998; and Sandstrom 1991). This is simply a consequence of the interrelatedness and oneness of all things. Not only does the universe causally affect humans, but humans causally affect the universe. Human actions promote cosmic harmony, balance, and purity, on the one hand, or cosmic disharmony, imbalance, and impurity, on the other.
The Nahuas conceived moral, psychological, and physical (these all being indistinguishable in their eyes) health, well-being, righteousness, and purity in terms of keeping one’s balance on the earth’s slippery surface, and so regarded the earth’s surface as a psychologically, physically, and morally dangerous place. Nahua wisdom urged humans to act with extreme care and to follow the guidelines of the ancestors — as any other path would inevitably lead one to stumble down the earth’s slopes into psychological, physical, and moral imbalance, perverseness, instability, and disease. With this in mind, a father offered his son the following advice:
… on earth we travel, we live along a mountain peak. Over here there is an abyss, over there there is an abyss. Wherever thou art to deviate, wherever thou art to go astray, there will thou fall, there wilt thou plunge into the deep (Sahagun 1953-82:VI,p.125).
Yet the dire situation of humans on earth did not prompt the Nahuas to reject earthly life in favor of some other-worldly life. The earth’s surface is the only realm wherein humans enjoy the full potential for well-being since only here are their various vital forces fully integrated. The Nahuas resolved to live as best they could on tlalticpac. And indeed, earthly life does allow some measure of well-being: sleep, laughter, food, sexual pleasure, conjugal union, and procreation. Yet these were scarce, momentary, and needed to be taken in moderation, as any excess resulted in imbalance. This ambiguous character of earthly life is summarized in a mother’s advice to her daughter: “the earth is not a good place. It is not a place of joy; it is not a place of contentment. It is merely said it is a place of joy with fatigue, of joy with pain” (Sahagun 1953-82:VI,p.93).
Nahua philosophers saw humans as creatures yearning for rootedness — i.e. for a deep, firm, and lasting anchoring for their lives — and who restlessly search for it. Obtaining well-rootedness enables one to become an “upright man” (tlacamelahuac, trans. by Lopez Austin 1988:I,p.189) and to live a balanced, pure, and genuinely human life. Without roots, one finds neither balance, purity, nor humanness. Obtaining well-rootedness is difficult, and in their search many humans give their hearts to what appears to be well-rooted and authenthic but is not. Since this cannot provide grounding and stability, humans eventually become dissatisfied with it and abandon it, only to begin their search anew, often times repeating the process over and over again. Their hearts eventually become scattered, unbalanced, and lost (Lopez Austin 1988:II, Appendix 5). As Nezahualcoyotl put it, “If you give your heart to each and everything, you lead it nowhere: you destroy your heart” (Cantares mexicanos fol.2, v., trans. by Leon-Portilla 1963:5). Such humans become vagabonds, wandering about aimlessly from one illusion to the next. They become beastly, unstable, unbalanced, impure, perverse, dull-witted, intemperate, and vicious. They fail to realize their humanness and merely appear to be human. They become deceivers, rogues, and dissimulators. They “act on things with [their] humanity dead” (Lopez Austin 1988:I,p.189). They are “lump[s] of flesh with two eyes” (Sahagun 1953-82:X,pp.3,11) and “defective human weight[s]” (Sahagun 1953-82:X,p.11, trans. by Lopez Austin 1988:II,p.271).
The beastly apparent-human eschews the company of other humans and in so doing forsakes his humanness in yet another way. Humans are essentially social; they need the company of others in order to become genuine human beings. Humans are born “faceless” (i.e. incomplete or with undeveloped powers of judgment) and need other humans for the education and discipline needed for acquiring a “face”, becoming balanced, and becoming fully human. Developing proper “face and heart” is only possible through the opportunities provided by well-ordered social living. Unstable, foolish, and diseased, the loner slips constantly upon the path of life.
The notion of maintaining one’s balance plays a central role in other aspects of Nahua thought. One’s mind and body possess or lack balance, and are healthy or not depending upon whether they possess the proper balance of opposing polarities such as hot and cold, dry and wet, etc. (Lopez Austin 1988:I,ch.8). One’s home, neighborhood, polity, and environment are healthy or diseased depending upon whether they are balanced or not. Personal, domestic, and social balancedness are interdependent. Imbalance, iimpurity, and ill-being are contagious.
The Nahuas believed the human body serves as the temporary location for three different animistic forces, each residing in its own center. Tonalli (from the root tona, “heat”) resides in the head. It provides the body with character, vigor, and the energy needed for growth and development. Individuals acquire their tonalli from the sun. A person’s tonalli may leave her body during dreams and shamanic journeys. Tonalli is ritually introduced into an infant as one of her animistic entities. It is closely united to a person as her link to the universe and as determining factor of her destiny. Everything belonging to a human by virtue of her relation to the cosmos received the name of tonalli. Teyolia (“that which gives life to people”) resides in the heart. It provides memory, vitality, inclination, emotion, knowledge, and wisdom. Unlike tonalli, one’s teyolia is not separable while alive. It “goes beyond after death” and enjoys a postmortem existence in the world of the dead. The Nahuas likened teyolia to “divine fire” (Carrasco 1990:69). Finally, ihiyotl (“breath, respiration”) resides in the liver. It provides passion, cupidity, bravery, hatred, love, and happiness.
Every human is the living center and confluence of these three forces. They direct humans’ physiological and psychological processes, giving each person her own unique character. All three must operate harmoniously with one another in order to produce a mentally, physically, and morally pure, upright, whole, and balanced person. Disturbance of any one affects the other two. Only during life on earth are all three forces fully integrated within humans. After death, each goes its own way.
Lastly, individuals possess free will within the constraints imposed by their tonalli. One is born with either favorable or unfavorable tonalli and with a corresponding predetermined character. While this places certain constraints upon what one may accomplish, one freely chooses what to make of one’s tonalli within these limits. Someone born with favorable tonalli may squander it through improper action; someone with unfavorable tonalli may neutralize its adverse effects through knowledge of the sacred calendar and careful selection of actions. (For further discussion, see Lopez Austin 1988, 1997; J. Furst 1995; Carrasco 1990; Sandstrom 1991.)
a. The Raison D’etre of Epistemology
The philosophical problematic above defines the raison d’etre of Nahua epistemology. The aim of cognition from the epistemological point of view is walking in balance upon the slippery earth, and epistemologically appropriate inquiry is that which promotes this aim. Nahua epistemology does not pursue goals such as truth for truth’s sake, correct description, and accurate representation; nor is it motivated by the question “What is the (semantic) truth about reality?” Knowing (tlamatiliztli) is performative, creative, and participatory, not discursive, passive or theoretical. It is concrete, not abstract; a knowing how, not a knowing that.
b. Truth as Well-Rootedness-cum-Alethia
Nahua epistemology conceived knowing (tlamatiliztli) in terms of neltiliztli. Scholars standardly translate neltiliztli (and its cognates) as “truth” (and its cognates) (Karttunen 1983; Gingerich 1987; Leon-Portilla 1963). However, unlike most Western philosophers, Nahua philosophers did not understand truth in terms of correspondence (or coherence). According to Leon-Portilla (1963:8), “`truth’… was to be identified with well-grounded stability [well-foundedness or well-rootedness].” To say a person cognizes truly is therefore to say she cognizes with well-grounded stability or well-rootedly. Nahua philosophers thus possessed a concept of truth (neltiliztli) but they conceived truth in terms of well-grounded stability, well-foundedness, and well-rootedness — not in terms of correspondence, aboutness, representation, reference, fit, or successful description. In short, they understood neltiliztli (truth) non-semantically.
Willard Gingerich (1987:102f.) defends Leon-Portilla’s translation-interpretation of neltiliztli. He points out that “truth” occurs in the early post-Conquest sources more often in its adverbial form, nelli, meaning “truly” or “with truth” (which I believe reflects the Nahuas’ processive metaphysics). However, Gingerich contends well-rootedness does not exhaust the full meaning of neltiliztli. The Nahuas’ understanding of neltiliztli contained an ineliminable Heideggerian component: “non-referential alethia — [i.e.] ‘disclosure,'” (1987:104), “unconcealedness” (1987:102), “self-deconcealing” (1987:105), and “unhiddenness” (1987:105). That which is neltiliztli is both well-rooted and non-referentially unconcealing or disclosing. Nahuas understood neltiliztli (truth) non-semantically, i.e. in terms other than correspondence, reference, representation, and aboutness. In sum, Nahua epistemology conceives neltiliztli in terms of well-rootedness-cum-alethia.
The Nahuas characterized persons, things, activities, and utterances equally and without equivocation in terms of neltiliztli, and understood neltiliztli in terms of well-rootedness in teotl. That which is well-rooted in teotl is genuine, true, authentic, and well-balanced as well as non-referentially disclosing and unconcealing of teotl (Gingerich 1987, 1988; Maffie 2002). Created things exist along a continuum ranging from those that are well-rooted in teotl (i.e. nelli) and hence authentically present and embody teotl as well as disclose and unconceal teotl, at one end, to those things that are poorly rooted in teotl (i.e. ahnelli) and hence neither authentically embody and present teotl nor disclose and unconceal teotl, at the other end. The former, which include fine jade and well-crafted song-poems (“flower and song”), enjoy sacred presence.
c. Cognitive Burgeoning and Flowering
Humans thus cognize knowingly if and only if they cognize with well-rootedness-cum-alethia. They cognize with well-rootedness-cum-alethia if and only if their cognizing is well-rooted in teotl. The Nahuas conceived well-rootedness-cum-alethia in terms of burgeoning (Brotherston 1979). Burgeoning and rootedness are both vegetal notions deriving from the organic world of agricultural life. A plant’s flowers and fruits burgeon from its seeds, soil, and roots, and in so doing embody, present, and disclose the latter’s qualities. Analogously, cognizing knowingly is a form of cognitive flourishing. It is the flower of an organic-like process consisting of teotl’s sap-like burgeoning, unfolding, and blossoming within a person’s heart. By doing so, teotl discloses and unconceals itself. As the generative presentation of teotl, human knowing thus represents one of the ways teotl faithfully, genuinely, and authentically discloses itself here on earth. As a consequence, human cognizing moves knowingly: it understands, presents, embodies, enacts, and expresses teotl.
By contrast, unknowing (illusory, befogged) cognizing is poorly if not wholly unrooted (ahnelli) in teotl. It is inauthentic, ingenuine, and undisclosing. Teotl fails to burgeon, flower, and faithfully disclose itself within such cognizing. Unknowing cognition constitutes a form of cognitive crookedness, perversity, or disease. It represents one of the ways by which teotl unfaithfully and inauthetically presents — i.e. disguises and masks — itself here on earth.
Humans come to know teotl using their heart — not head or brain. Situated between head and liver, the heart is uniquely qualified to attain the proper balance of the head’s reason and the liver’s passion needed for understanding teotl. The heart serves as the center for teyolia, that vital force which induces humans towards that which alone fills their emptiness and gives them roots: teotl. Knowing requires that one possess a yolteotl or “teotlized heart”, i.e. a heart charged with teotl’s sacred energy and enjoying sacred presence. The “teotlized heart” possesses an extraordinary amount of teyolia. One possessing a “teotlized heart” has “teotl in his heart” and is “wise in the things of teotl” (Lopez Austin 1988:I,pp.258ff., II,pp.245,298; see also Leon-Portilla 1963).
Yollotl, the Nahuatl word for heart, derives from ollin, the Nahuatl word for movement (Lopez Austin 1988). This indicates yet another way in which the heart the organ best suited for knowing teotl way. Teotl is essentially movement. A teotlized heart moves in balance with the movement of teotl, and as a result moves knowingly. As one’s heart comes to move knowingly, one becomes “wise in the things of teotl”; one comes to have “teotl in his heart”. Teotl presents and discloses itself to and through one’s heart. One experiences teotl directly and de re. The de dicto mask of unknowing beguiles one’s heart no more.
Teotl is ultimately ineffable since it is undifferentiated and unordered; a seamless totality. Consequently, humans only experience teotl knowingly in a manner unmediated, unspecified, and undefined by language, concepts, and categories (along with their divisions, classification, and distinctions). These are facets of teotl’s disguise or mask and thus contribute to humans’ de dicto misperceiving and misunderstanding of teotl. To the degree language, concepts, and categories are essential to human reasoning, humans thus understand teotl non-rationally. Alternatively expressed, teotl only genuinely discloses itself non-linguistically, non-discursively, and non-rationally.
d. “Flower and Song”
In light of the preceding, Nahua tlamatinime turned to “flower and song” (poetry, writing-painting, music) to disclose and present (not re-present) teotl as well as display and embody their understanding of teotl. Composing-and-performing song-poems in particular are the highest form of human artistry and the finest way for humans to present teotl since this activity most closely imitates and participates in teotl’s own cosmic, creative artistry. Hence song-poems rather than discursive arguments are the appropriate medium of sagely expression, and sages are perforce singer-songwriter-poets.
“Flower and song” comes from a ritually prepared heart that embodies and presents a proper balance of reason and passion, male and female, active and passive, etc. This balance was symbolized in popular Aztec religion by Quetzalcoatl, the “Plummed Serpent”, who served as patron deity of artists and sages. By combining the attributes of birds (heaven) and snakes (earth), the “Plummed Serpent” symbolized the union of male and female. Indeed, Quetzalcoatl’s joint patronage of sages and artists points to their ultimate identity and to the equivalence of sagacity and artistic excellence.
Acquiring a teotlized heart and becoming knowledgeable of teotl also requires that one engage in “flower and song”. Artistic activity epistemologically improves one’s heart, causing it move in balance with teotl and hence move knowingly. By engaging in creative artistry humans imitate and participate in — albeit imperfectly — the self-transforming, cosmic creativity of teotl. In so doing they fashion their hearts after teotl.
Acquiring a teotlized heart and becoming knowledgeable of teotl also requires that one be well-rooted, well-balanced, pure, authentic, and morally righteous, and that one possess strength, self-control, moderation, and modesty (see Gingerich 1988; Burkhart 1989). Humans must show humility and respect towards teotl before teotl discloses itself. The foregoing characteristics are not only epistemological but moral and aesthetic as well. They not only help humans become knowledgeable and live wisely, they help them live morally, authentically, purely, well-balancedly. and beautifully. Humans cannot become knowledgeable of teotl without becoming genuine, pure, morally righteous and beautiful (and vice versa). In short, the process of epistemological self-improvement is also one of moral and aesthetic self-improvement.
Finally, the Nahuas understood the process of becoming knowledgeable in terms of tlamacehualiztli or “the meriting of things”. According to Burkhart (1989:142), tlamacehualiztli derives from the verb macehua, “to obtain or deserve what is desired” (see also Klor de Alva, 1993; Leon-Portilla 1993; Gingerich 1988; Read 1998). Humans come to “merit” — i.e. “deserve” or “be worthy of” — tlamatiliztli as a consequence of performing prescribed ritual activities. Humans and teotl coexist in a moral interrelationship of reciprocity, and becoming knowledgeable involves a morally regulated exchange with teotl. When humans behave in ritually prescribed ways, they may expect to attain those things they have come to merit. Tlamatiliztli emerges as a consequence of moral-cum-epistemological-cum-aesthetic interaction and co-participation with teotl.
5. Intrinsic Value: Balance and Purity
Nahua value theory sees balance and purity jointly as the condition that is ideal as well as intrinsically valuable and worth-cultivating for humans. To the degree humans approximate balance-and-purity in their lives, they perfect their humanness and flourish; to the degree they do not, they destroy their humanness and suffer beastly, miserable lives. Nahua theory of intrinsic value is rooted in Nahua metaphysics in the following way. Teotl functions as the ultimate source and standard of intrinsic value since balance-and-purity are properties of teotl. Teotl’s own balance-and-purity are genuinely embodied and presented in well-formed quetzal tail feathers, jade, and turquoise. Thet are green: the color of balance, purity, life, renewal, and well-being (Sahagun 1953-82:XI, pp.224,248; see also Gingerich 1988; Burkhart 1989.) One obtains this balance-and-purity by rooting oneself firmly and deeply in teotl.
6. Moral Theory: How to Live in Balance and Purity
Nahua philosophy reflects upon the appropriateness of human conduct, attitudes, and states of affairs from the standpoint of achieving, restoring, and maintaining balance-and-purity. This single point of view encompasses under a single rubric what Western thought standardly divides into moral, religious, political, legal points of view. Nahua philosophers saw no significant difference between these, however. For simplicity’s sake I discuss this single point of view using the terms “morality”, “ethics” and their cognates.
Nahua morality is rooted in the claim that balance-and-purity constitute the ideal condition as well as what is intrinsically valuable for humans, and derives two fundamental moral precepts from this claim: humans should promote balance-and-purity and avert imbalance-and-impurity. Nahua morality accordingly appraised the moral appropriateness of conduct, attitudes, and states of affairs in light of their consequences upon balance-and-purity. Morally appropriate conduct, for example, is that which promotes, sustains or renews balance-and-purity or that which averts imbalance-and-impurity; morally inappropriate conduct is that which disrupts existing balance-and-purity or creates new imbalance-and-impurity (see Burkhart 1988; Gingerich 1988; Lopez Austin 1988, 1997). Good intentions do not suffice; one must actually succeed.
Nahua ethics standardly characterizes morally appropriate conduct as in quallotl in yecyotl, i.e. as that which is “fitting for” and “assimilable by” humans in the sense of contributing to their balance-and-purity. Morally appropriate conduct helps humans “assume a face,” “develop a heart,” and enrich their life. It helps them become authentically human. Morally inappropriate conduct, on the other hand, causes humans to leave their heart undeveloped, lose their face, and impoverish their lives. It causes them to become lumps of flesh with two eyes. (See Leon-Portilla 1963:146-48; Burkhart 1989:38ff.; Gingerich 1988:524; Lopez Austin 1988, 1997.)
The soundest, wisest course is moderation. One should neither do too much nor too little of anything: e.g. eating, sleeping, or bathing. If one overindulges by feasting, one must restore balance by overindulging in its contrary, fasting. Acting wisely consists of walking a middle path between two extremes. As a Nahuatl proverb proclaims: tlacoqualli in monequi: “the center good is required,” “the middle good is necessary” (Sahagun 1953-82:VI, p.231, trans. by Burkhart 1989:134).
Nahua ethics also employs the notion of tlatlacolli — i.e. damage, harm or spoilage — when characterizing the moral character of conduct (Burkhart 1989:28). Immoral conduct is tlatlacolli because it causes an entity to suffer a loss of balance, which in turn causes it to suffer decay, disorder, randomness, and spoilage. Spoilage in humans, for example, typically results in physical or psychological disease. Nahua ethics also uses the notions of purity and impurity in this regard. The basic Nahuatl pollution concept is tlazolli, the most literal meaning of which is, “something useless, used up, something that has lost its original order or structure and has been rendered loose and undifferential matter” (Burkhart 1989:88). Immorality is identified with dirt and filth. Immoral behavior is dirty because it pollutes the actor(s) involved, e.g. two adulterers. Purity and impurity are closely related to spoilage. Moral impurity is a form of spoilage accompanied by a loss of balance.
Nahua ethics had a this-worldly rather than other-worldly orientation. Its foundation and justification rested in human nature, the nature of life on earth, and ultimately the nature of the teotl — not in the commandments of some remote deity. The Nahuas’ search for the correct codes of conduct was not motivated by a desire for reward in an afterlife, nor did it presuppose the possibility of determining one’s destiny after death. There was no talk of punishment or reward in an afterlife for the kind of life one led on earth.
This notwithstanding, Nahua morality did prescribe a way of life which promised well-being here on earth. The Nahuas believed the destiny of humankind in the beyond to exceed human control and knowledge, and concluded that the rewards and punishments for earthly conduct are earthly. These included conversation, health, laughter, sleep, strength, sexual pleasure, honor, longevity and respect in the case of morally appropriate behavior; hunger, pain, sorrow, insanity, physical deformity and disease in the case of inappropriate behavior.
The Nahuas characterized education as “the art of strengthening or bringing up men” (tlacahuapahualiztli) and “the act of giving wisdom to the face” (neixtlamachiliztli). Humans are born incomplete and “faceless” (i.e. without character) yet are perfectible through proper education (Leon-Portilla 1963; Lopez Austin 1988). Education aims at perfecting children by developing in them “a wise face and a strong, humanized heart” and fashioning their character into a “well smoked, precious turquoise” (Sahagun 1953-82:VI,p.113). This equips them with the means for keeping their balance on the slippery earth. Towards this end Nahua education sought to cultivate dispositions that enable humans to live well (such as self-control, self-sufficiency, moderation, modesty, and personal and domestic hygiene) and extricate dispositions that disable humans (such as pride, intemperance, carelessness, duplicity, uncleanliness, gluttony, and drunkenness).
Only tlamatinime were qualified to cultivate wisdom in people. In his/her capacity as educator, moralist, and role model — i.e. as “teacher of people’s faces” (teixtlamachtiani) — the sage is akin to an artist who skillfully shapes a formless block of stone into a beautiful statue. The sage shapes a child’s “faceless”, lump of human flesh into a genuinely human “face and heart”. Of the sage the Nahuas said:
The wise man: a light, a torch, a stout torch that does not smoke.
A perforated mirror, a mirror pierced on both sides.
His are the black and red ink, his are the illuminated manuscripts, he studies the illuminated manuscripts.
He himself is writing and wisdom.
He is the path, the true way for others.
He directs people and things; he is a guide in human affairs.
Teacher of truth, he never ceases to admonish.
He makes wise the countenances of others; to them he gives a face; he leads them to develop it.
He opens their ears; he enlightens them.
He puts a mirror before others, he makes them prudent, cautious; he causes a face to appear on them.
He attends to things; he regulates their path, he arranges and commands.
He applies his light to the world.
Thanks to him people humanize their will and receive a strict education.
(Codice Matritense de la Real Academia, VIII,fol.118, r.- 118,v. trans. by Leon-Portilla 1963:10-11).
“Face and heart” (in ixtli in yollotl) expresses the notion of character (Leon-Portilla 1963). To possess a “perfected, wise face and good heart” is to exhibit sound judgment and sentiment: one’s psychological, intellectual, and physical behavior promotes balance-and-purity and averts imbalance-and-impurity. The person with “good heart, humane and stout” has is wise in the ways of teotl. The person lacking such a heart has an “enshrouded heart” (Leon-Portilla 1963:175). He is mad, foolish, and dull-witted.
The Nahuas likened the person with a “wise face and good heart” to well-formed quetzal plumage, jade, and turquoise. These objects faithfully and authentically present teotl’s balance-and-purity. They are green, the color of balance, purity, life, renewal, and well-being (Sahagun 1953-82:XI, pp.224,248). As one of Sahagun’s Nahua informants put it:
…the pure life is considered as a well-smoked, precious turquoise: as a round, reedlike, well-formed, precious green stone. There is no blotch, no blemish. Those perfect in their hearts, in their manner of life, those of pure life — like these are the precious green stone, the precious turquoise, which are glistening… They are those of pure life, those called good-hearted (Sahagun 1953-82:VI, p.113).
Living wisely also requires performing ritual activities devoted to restoring lost balance-and-purity or to averting future imbalance-and-impurity. Such activities included penitence, mortification, and “straightening one’s heart” (neyolmelahualiztli; “confession”) (Burkhart 1989:214). These helped restore balance to one’s heart by purifying it of tlazolli, by casting off tlatlacolli, and returning it to its proper shape. Humans also acquired moral “merit” through self-deprivation, moderation, and penitential self-denial.
The Nahuas used the expression “flower and song” to refer to artistic activity and its products. Broadly construed, “flower and song” refers to creative activity generally including composing-performing song-poems, painting-writing, playing music, featherworking, and goldsmithing. However, translating-interpreting “flower and song” in this manner is potentially misleading. For the Nahuas did not have a concept of art in the modern Western sense of “art for art’s sake” i.e. in the sense that “art and works of art deserve the title by virtue of being products and activities with no other purpose than their contemplation” (Wilkinson 1998:383). Since the Nahuas did not produce objects soley for aesthetic contemplation, we might, then, rightly say that in this sense the Nahuas did not do or make art. They had no notion of a distinctly aesthetic — as opposed to moral or epistemological — point of view from which to judge the value (or beauty) of human creativity activity and its products. Rather, Nahua philosophers conceived aesthetics in terms of the problematic defining all philosophical speculation: helping humans maintain their balance on the slippery surface of the earth. As with all other human activities, creative activity and its products are meant to help humans maintain their balance and evaluated accordingly. Aesthetics is thus interwoven with moral and epistemological purposes. That which is aesthetically valuable (or beautiful) is also morally valuable and epistemologically valuable (and conversely). It is the well-rooted, well-balanced, true, disclosing, and pure. That which is aesthetically valueless (or ugly) is disordered, duplicitous, perverse, unbalanced, impure, and deceptive since unrooted, undisclosing, inauthentic, and false.
Nahuas aesthetics views creative activity and its products in the following terms. First, creative activity and its products are aesthetically valuable if and only if they genuinely present and truly disclose teotl. Like well-formed jade, turquoise, and quetzal plumes, they authentically unconceal balance-and-purity.
Secondly, creative activity and its products are aesthetically valuable if and only if they contribute positively to the existing store of balance-and-purity in the cosmos. Works of art accomplish this by faithfully presenting and hence actually embodying balance-and-purity, i.e. by literally being well-balanced and pure.
Third, aesthetically valuable creative activity and products must spring forth from a morally and epistemologically qualifed, “teotlized heart”, and hence burgeon from and be well-rooted in teotl. The accomplished artist is necessarily morally upright and knowledgable of teotl. Fools and rogues are incapable of creating beautiful works of art.
Fourth, aesthetically valuable creative activity and its products must have the appropriate effects upon their audience. Beautiful art improves and uplifts its audience psychologically, physically, morally, and epistemologically. It promotes psychological and physical balance-and-purity, moral righteousness, and proper understanding of teotl, and consequently helps humans attain greater degrees of humaness and well-being. By contrast, ugly art promotes physical and psychological imbalance-and-impurity, immorality, depravity, misunderstanding, and ill-being.
The ephemerality and fragility of earthly life loomed large over Conquest-era the Nahuatl-speaking peoples. Nahua wisdom aimed at enabling them to make the best of life under such circumstances by helping them to walk in balance upon the slippery earth. Walking in balance was simultaneously a moral, epistemological, practical, and aesthetic notion: it involved one’s being well-rooted, authentic, knowledgeable, true, pure, morally upright, and beautiful. A life wisely lived offered humans a fleeting, momentary repose from the inevitable sorrow, suffering, and transience of earthly existence. It enabled humans, if only momentarily, to flower and sing.
9. References and Further Reading
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- Brotherston, Gordon (1979). Image of the New World: The American Continent Portrayed in Native Texts. London: Thames and Hudson.
- Burkhart, Louise (1989). The Slippery Earth: Nahua-Christian Dialogue in Sixteenth-Century Mexico. Tucson: University of Arizona Press.
- Carmack, Robert, Janine Gasco, and Gary Gossen (eds) (1996). The Legacy of Mesoamerica: History and Culture of a Native American Civilization. Upper Saddle River: Prentice-Hall.
- Carrasco, David (1990). Religions of Mesoamerica: Cosmovision and Ceremonial Centers. San Francisco: Harper and Row.
- Caso, Alfonso (1958). The Aztecs: People of the Sun, trans. by L. Dunham. Norman: University of Oklahoma Press.
- Cooper, David (1997). God is a Verb: Kabbalah and the Practice of Mystical Judaism. New York: Penguin Putnam, Inc.
- Eliade, Mircea (1964). Shamanism: Archaic Techniques of Ecstasy. Princeton: University of Princeton Press.
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- Gingerich, Willard (1987). “Heidegger and the Aztecs: The Poetics of Knowing in Pre-Hispanic Nahuatl Poetry,” in B. Swann and A. Krupat (eds), Recovering the Word: Essays on Native American Literature. Berkeley: University of California Press, pp.85-112.
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- Karttunen, Francis (1983). An Analytical Dictionary of Nahuatl. Austin: University of Texas.
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- Leon-Portilla, Miguel (1963). Aztec Thought and Culture: A Study of the Ancient Nahuatl Mind, trans by J. Davis. Norman: University of Oklahoma Press.
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