The Benacerraf Problem of Mathematical Truth and Knowledge
Before philosophical theorizing, people tend to believe that most of the claims generally accepted in mathematics—claims like “2+3=5” and “there are infinitely many prime numbers”—are true, and that people know many of them. Even after philosophical theorizing, most people remain committed to mathematical truth and mathematical knowledge.
These commitments come as a package. Those committed to mathematical knowledge are committed to mathematical truth because knowledge is factive. One can only know claims that are true. And those committed to mathematical truth turn out to be committed to mathematical knowledge as well. The reasons for this are less transparent. But regardless of what those reasons are, commitments to mathematical truth and to mathematical knowledge always seem to stand and fall together.
There is a serious problem facing the standard view that we know most of the mathematical claims we think we know, and that these claims are true. The problem, first presented by Paul Benacerraf (1973), is that plausible accounts of mathematical truth and plausible accounts of mathematical knowledge appear to be incompatible with each other. It has received a great deal of attention in the philosophy of mathematics throughout the late 20th and early 21st centuries.
This article focuses on illuminating Benacerraf’s mathematical truth-mathematical knowledge problem. Section 1 outlines how two plausible constraints on accounts of mathematical truth, the semantic constraint and the epistemological constraint, give rise to challenges for those committed to mathematical truth and mathematical knowledge. The details of these challenges are developed in sections 2–5. Sections 2 and 3 focus on platonistic accounts of mathematical truth; semantic arguments that support mathematical platonism are addressed in section 2, and epistemological arguments against mathematical platonism are addressed in section 3. Section 4 expands the epistemological arguments beyond the platonistic context and sketches a range of responses to the epistemological concerns. Section 5 focuses on a category of accounts of mathematical truth that Benacerraf calls combinatorial. Such accounts appear to make sense of mathematical epistemology but seem semantically implausible. Taken together, these arguments suggest a serious problem for those committed to both mathematical truth and mathematical knowledge: it is unclear how an account of mathematical truth can fare well both semantically, as an account of truth, and also epistemologically, so that we can make sense of our possession of mathematical knowledge.
This article is about the mathematical truth-mathematical knowledge problem stemming from Benacerraf 1973. It does not address a different issue also sometimes called “the Benacerraf problem”, stemming from Benacerraf 1968, which centers on the existence of multiple candidates for set-theoretic reductions of the natural numbers.
Table of Contents
- Introducing the Problem
- The Semantic Constraint and Mathematical Platonism
- Epistemological Problems for Platonism
- Related Epistemological Challenges and Responses
- Epistemologically Plausible Accounts of Mathematical Truth
- References and Further Reading
Most discussion of the mathematical truth-mathematical knowledge problem traces back to Benacerraf’s 1973 paper “Mathematical Truth.” In that paper, Benacerraf identifies two constraints on accounts of mathematical truth. These constraints are:
Semantic Constraint: The account of mathematical truth must cohere with a “homogeneous semantical theory in which semantics for the propositions of mathematics parallel the semantics for the rest of the language” (p. 661).
Epistemological Constraint: “The account of mathematical truth [must] mesh with a reasonable epistemology,” that is, with a plausible general epistemological theory (p. 661).
Why should anyone accept the semantic constraint? Accounts of truth are intimately connected to accounts of what sentences mean, that is, to accounts of the semantics of language. If the semantics of mathematical language were to differ substantially from the semantics of the rest of language, then mathematical truth would correspondingly differ, again substantially, from truth in other domains. As Benacerraf puts it,
A theory of truth for the language we speak, argue in, theorize in, mathematize in, etc., should… provide similar truth conditions for similar sentences. The truth conditions assigned to two sentences containing quantifiers should reflect in relevantly similar ways the contribution made by the quantifiers. (p. 662)
A divide between semantics and truth in mathematics and semantics and truth in other domains would render mathematical truth unrecognizable as truth, rather than some other property. (The discussion of what Benacerraf calls “combinatorial” accounts of mathematical truth in section 5 illustrates this point more clearly.) Part of the motivation for the semantic constraint is the idea that an account of mathematical truth should fall under an account of truth quite generally, and that, for this to happen, mathematical language needs the same kind of semantics as the rest of language.
Why should anyone accept the epistemological constraint? First, mathematical knowledge is intertwined with knowledge of other domains. A lot of science, for example, involves mathematics. If our ability to possess mathematical knowledge is unintelligible, that unintelligibility is liable to infect the intelligibility of the rest of our knowledge as well. And second, as discussed in the introduction to this article, commitments to mathematical truth stand and fall with commitments to mathematical knowledge. On a plausible account of mathematical truth, many mathematical truths are known. In short, one cannot maintain commitments to both mathematical truth and mathematical knowledge if one’s account of mathematical truth renders mathematical knowledge unintelligible. For both of these reasons, it is important to ensure that people can have mathematical knowledge. And to do that, a plausible account of mathematical truth should cohere with a plausible general account of knowledge.
As Benacerraf first presented the mathematical truth-mathematical knowledge problem, the issue is that the semantic constraint and the epistemological constraint appear to be in tension with each other. He put it like this:
It will be my general thesis that almost all accounts of the concept of mathematical truth can be identified with serving one or another of these masters [the semantic and epistemological constraints] at the expense of the other. Since I believe further that both concerns must be met by any adequate account, I find myself deeply dissatisfied with any package of semantics and epistemology that purport to account for truth and knowledge both within and outside of mathematics. (Benacerraf 1973: 661-2).
Although Benacerraf presents this tension as a problem, it is worth noting that he does not appear to abandon his commitments to mathematical truth and mathematical knowledge in light of his concerns. Instead, he takes it to be reason for dissatisfaction with existing accounts of mathematical truth and mathematical knowledge. The ultimate intent is to challenge philosophers to develop a better account of mathematical truth and mathematical knowledge—an account that satisfies both constraints. Indeed, Benacerraf writes, “I hope that it is possible ultimately to produce such an account” (p. 663).
There are two distinct problems that arise from the tension between the semantic and epistemological constraints. One is a problem for accounts of mathematical truth in general. The other is a targeted problem that specifically engages with platonistic accounts of mathematical truth.
Benacerraf presents the general problem in the form of a dilemma. One horn, which is addressed in section 2c and 3a, is concerned with accounts of mathematical truth that appear to satisfy the semantic constraint. Though there are such accounts, Benacerraf argues that they do not satisfy the epistemological constraint: “accounts of truth that treat mathematical and nonmathematical discourse in relevantly similar ways do so at the cost of leaving it unintelligible how we can have any mathematical knowledge whatsoever.” (p. 662)
The other horn, which is addressed in section 5, is concerned with accounts that appear to satisfy the epistemological constraint. Though there are accounts of this sort as well, Benacerraf argues that they are inadequate as accounts of truth: “whereas those [accounts] which attribute to mathematical propositions the kinds of truth conditions we can clearly know to obtain, do so at the expense of failing to connect these conditions with any analysis of the sentences which shows how the assigned conditions are conditions of their truth.” (p. 662)
The reasons that such accounts appear to fall short of explaining truth are entwined with reasons for thinking that they rely on semantics that seem quite different from the semantics of the rest of language. In short, the general problem for accounts of mathematical truth is that, while accounts of mathematical truth can satisfy the semantic constraint or the epistemological constraint, an account that satisfies one constraint appears to be doomed to violate the other.
The targeted problem is effectively one horn of the general dilemma, specifically, the horn engaging with accounts that satisfy the semantic constraint. The targeted problem involves two separate arguments, which together suggest an incompatibility of the semantic and epistemological constraints.
The first argument in the targeted problem aims to establish that the semantic constraint requires the existence of mathematical objects—objects that presumably are abstract and independent of human minds and language. Mathematical platonism is the view on which mathematical objects exist, are abstract, and are independent of human minds and language, so the upshot of this argument is that platonistic accounts are the only accounts of mathematical truth that satisfy the semantic constraint. Section 2c addresses Benacerraf’s semantic argument to this effect. Frege and Quine also gave semantic arguments for the existence of mathematical objects; their arguments are discussed in sections 2a and 2b, respectively.
The second argument in the targeted problem aims to establish that mathematical truths are not knowable if platonistic accounts are correct, because causal interaction with objects is required for knowledge of those objects. Benacerraf’s argument to this effect is discussed in section 3a, and further epistemological arguments are discussed in sections 3c and 4a. Putting the semantic argument for mathematical platonism together with the epistemological argument against mathematical platonism, the targeted problem is that the specific kind of account of mathematical truth that seems to be required to satisfy the semantic constraint—namely, mathematical platonism—is precluded by the epistemological constraint.
There are several ways of responding to Benacerraf’s mathematical truth-knowledge problem and the apparent incompatibility of the semantic and epistemological constraints. Some proponents of mathematical truth and knowledge have focused on undermining the arguments that purport to establish the apparent incompatibility (see section 3b). Other proponents of mathematical truth have focused on developing positive accounts of mathematical truth and mathematical knowledge that are compatible with one another (see section 4b). And some philosophers have taken the apparent incompatibility as an argument against mathematical truth.
Somewhat confusingly, the term “Benacerraf’s dilemma” has been used for two distinct problems in the literature emerging from Benacerraf 1973. In the years before 1990, the term did not get much use, and when it was used, it sometimes denoted as “the general problem” (see Bonevac 1983: 98, Weinstein 1983: 266-267, and Papineau 1988: 15) and sometimes denoted as “the targeted problem” (see Parsons 1979: 161 n.12, Kitcher & Aspray 1987: 14). Uses of the term were about evenly split between these two problems. In at least one paper, both problems were described as dilemmas raised by Benacerraf (see Creath 1980: 335, 336).
Starting with three papers in 1991 (Maddy 1991: 155, Hart 1991a, 1991b: 61), usage of the term “Benacerraf’s dilemma” shifted almost exclusively to “the targeted problem”. (There are some rare exceptions, for example, Halimi 2016: 45.) And starting in the early 2000s, the term “Benacerraf’s dilemma” came to be used much more often. This article adopts the usage that has been standard since about 1991. That is, it uses the term “Benacerraf’s dilemma” as a name for the targeted problem that focuses on platonistic accounts of mathematical truth.
Benacerraf’s dilemma, which comprises one horn of the general dilemma, focuses on platonistic accounts of mathematical truth. The first half of Benacerraf’s dilemma consists of semantic arguments in favor of mathematical platonism. This section covers three such semantic arguments, each of which starts by presupposing the truth of certain mathematical or number-involving claims, specifically claims that involve no quantification or start with existential quantifiers. In accord with the semantic constraint, each semantic argument then draws on some general semantical theory thought to cover all of language (and not just mathematics). The arguments differ in the semantical theories they presuppose, but each uses semantic and grammatical features of specific mathematical sentences—ones that are assumed to be true—in conjunction with those general semantical theories to argue for the existence of mathematical objects. Mathematical platonism will follow from this conclusion if one assumes, as many but not all do, that these mathematical objects must be outside of space, time, and the causal realm, and independent of human minds and language.
The second half of Benacerraf’s dilemma focuses on epistemological problems for mathematical platonism; those are the topic of section 3.
One prominent semantic argument for mathematical platonism is Frege’s. Frege’s primary reasons for believing that numbers are objects came from observations about the way numerical expressions are used in language. In The Foundations of Arithmetic, he gives two reasons for endorsing the view that numbers are objects. The first is that we apply the definite article to numerical expressions. In his words: “[W]e speak of ‘the number 1’, where the definite article serves to class it as an object” (1884: §57).
Furthermore, assuming the truth of basic arithmetic, such definite descriptions appear in true sentences, for example, ‘the number 1 is less than the number 4’. This ensures that “the number 1” denotes successfully. (In ordinary, straightforward contexts, definite descriptions that do not denote, for example, “the king of France”, do not appear in true sentences.) The use of the definite description indicates that “the number 1” plays the grammatical role of denoting an object (as opposed to, say, a concept), and its use in true sentences indicates that it does so successfully.
Frege’s second reason for believing that numbers are objects is that numerical expressions are used in (true) identity statements, where identity is presumed to be a relation between an object and itself. (Frege rejects the idea that there can be identities between, say, concepts.) He appeals to two kinds of numerical statements to establish that numerical expressions are used in this way. First, he claims that statements of the following form are identity statements:
(a) The number of Jupiter’s moons is four.
(Jupiter has dozens of moons, but only its Galilean moons—Io, Europa, Ganymede, and Callisto—were known in 1884. What follows pretends that (a) is true.) In treating statements like (a) as identity statements, Frege denies that statements of number are predicative statements akin to ‘The surface of Earth’s moon is rocky’. As he explains it: “Here ‘is’ has the sense of ‘is identical with’ or ‘is the same as.’ So that what we have is an identity, stating that the expression ‘the number of Jupiter’s moons’ signifies the same object as the word ‘four’” (§57).
Second, Frege claims that arithmetical equalities (for example, “1 + 1 = 2”) are numerical identity statements too. With such equalities in mind, he asserts that, “identities are, of all forms of proposition, the most typical of arithmetic” (§57).
If Frege is right, numerical identity statements are overwhelmingly common, and many of them are true. If he is also right that identity statements are true precisely when one and the same object is signified by the expressions on either side of the identity sign, then it follows that numbers are objects.
A third reason that some neo-Fregeans (but not Frege himself) have offered for thinking that numbers are objects, rather than (Fregean) concepts, is the so-called “Aristotelian test”. The basic idea, in Bob Hale’s words, is this:
[W]hereas for any given predicate there is always a contradictory predicate, applying to any given object if and only if the original predicate fails to apply, there is not, for singular terms, anything parallel to this—we do not have, for a given singular term, another ‘contradictory’ singular term such that a statement incorporating the one is true if and only if the corresponding statement incorporating the other is not true. (Hale 2001: 40)
Numerical expressions are singular terms—they have the grammatical role of referring to objects—because they do not have contradictories in the sense Hale describes. Consider, for example, the statement “The number of Jupiter’s moons is greater than the square root of four”. If (a) is true, then this statement is true too. But there is no contradictory of the word “four”, for example, “non-four”, that will make both these statements false. Perhaps, grammatical awkwardness aside, “The number of Jupiter’s moons is non-four” would be false. But there is no straightforward way to evaluate the truth-value of “The number of Jupiter’s moons is greater than the square root of non-four”. That is because “four” functions grammatically as a singular term, and not as a predicate.
Fregean arguments for the claim that numbers are objects, then, start with the assumption that a range of mathematical claims are true, and then appeal to grammatical considerations to argue that the truth of those claims requires the existence of mathematical objects like numbers.
There is an obvious objection to these semantic considerations in favor of taking numbers to be objects: not all numerical language seems to fit this pattern. Numerical expressions are often used as nouns; following Geach (1962) and Dummett (1973), call such uses substantival. The concern is that not all uses of numerical expressions are substantival. Frege offers the following example in the Grundlagen:
(b) Jupiter has four moons.
Again, following Geach and Dummett, call such uses of numerical expressions adjectival. Adjectival uses of numerical expressions do not seem to support the claim that numbers are objects.
Frege does not think that adjectival uses undermine the claim that numbers are objects. Rather, he thinks that such uses are secondary to substantival uses. Because of the centrality of identity statements (that is, equations) in arithmetic, substantival uses are more useful for developing “a concept of number usable for the purposes of science” (§57). Furthermore, he suggests that adjectival uses of numerical expressions are eliminable. Adjectival uses appear in sentences that have the same content as substantival uses. For example, sentences like (b) and (a) express the same proposition. Expressing that proposition in the form of (a) instead of (b) eliminates the adjectival use of ‘four’ in (b) in favor of the substantival use in (a). But the converse does not hold. Substantival uses cannot always be eliminated in favor of adjectival uses because identity claims like “1+1=2” cannot be transformed into sentences with adjectival uses of numerical expressions without changing propositional content. So, since substantival uses of numerical expressions are the central uses, and adjectival uses are eliminable, the subjectival uses are the ones that reveal the ontology.
Although Frege does not appeal to adjectival uses of numerical expressions in his arguments for the existence of numbers as objects, his treatment of adjectival uses would seem to combine well with the Quinean semantic arguments for mathematical platonism discussed in section 2b. As Frege describes it, adjectival uses attribute properties to concepts. For example, (b) attributes a property to the concept “moon of Jupiter”. He writes: “This is perhaps clearest with the number 0. If I say ‘Venus has 0 moons’… what happens is that a property is assigned to the concept ‘moon of Venus’, namely that of including nothing under it” (1884: §46).
More specifically, the properties that Frege takes adjectival uses of numerical expressions to attribute to concepts are properties concerning how many things instantiate the concept in question. For example, to say that there are zero Fs, where F designates a concept, is to say that nothing falls under the concept F, that is, F is not instantiated, that is, there do not exist any Fs. Or, equivalently, to say that Fs do exist is to say that there are not zero Fs. In Frege’s words, “affirmation of existence is in fact nothing but denial of the number nought” (§53).
This idea extends to adjectival uses of other numerical expressions. To say that there is one F is to say that there is something that falls under F, and that anything that falls under F is identical with that thing. To say that there are two Fs is to say that there exist things a and b that fall under F, that a and b are non-identical, and that anything that falls under F is either a or b. And so on. In practice, this means that sentence (b) can be understood as equivalent to the more explicitly quantificational statement “There are four moons of Jupiter”.
On Frege’s view, then, adjectival uses of numerical expressions have something akin to quantificational significance. And that leads us to the Quinean semantic argument.
Quinean semantic arguments for mathematical platonism appeal to uses of quantification in mathematics to establish that true mathematical sentences commit us to the existence of (presumably platonistic) mathematical objects. Quine (1948: 28), for example, starts with this sentence:
(c) There is a prime number between 1000 and 1010.
Sentence (c) appears to quantify over prime numbers between 1000 and 1010.
To get from the truth of sentences like (c) to the existence of mathematical objects, proponents of Quinean arguments appeal to Quine’s criterion of ontological commitment: “[A] theory is committed to those and only those entities to which the bound variables of the theory must be capable of referring in order that the affirmations made in the theory be true” (1948: 33).
The Quinean semantic argument depends on a general claim about the connection between true sentences and ontology: we must take the quantificational claims of our accepted theories (including arithmetic) at face value. If theories that we accept include sentences that purport to quantify over mathematical objects, then we are committed to accepting those objects into our ontology. Since we accept arithmetic, and since standard arithmetic entails (c), that sentence commits us to the existence of an object that witnesses its existential claim—the prime number 1009.
The Quinean approach differs from the Fregean approach in that the two arguments rely on different grammatical features to generate the commitment to mathematical objects. The Fregean argument appeals to singular terms, and the Quinean argument appeals to quantification. But either kind of semantic argument can be used to support the claim that there are mathematical objects—and also to support mathematical platonism, if such objects are assumed to be abstract and independent of human minds and language. Vestiges of both kinds of arguments seem to appear in Benacerraf’s argument that accounts of mathematical truth that satisfy the semantic constraint are inevitably platonistic.
The semantic constraint on accounts of mathematical truth requires that an account of mathematical truth cohere with a “homogeneous semantical theory in which semantics for the propositions of mathematics parallel the semantics for the rest of the language” (Benacerraf 1973: 661). An account on which names, descriptions, or predicates function differently in mathematics than they do in the rest of language, for example, will not satisfy the semantic constraint. Neither will an account on which quantifiers function differently in mathematics than they do in non-mathematical language.
Benacerraf appeals to David Hilbert’s finitist account of mathematical truth in “On the Infinite” (1925) to illustrate how an account of mathematical truth can violate the semantic constraint. The semantic problem with Hilbert’s account arises in his treatment of quantified arithmetical statements. Consider two different statements about how, given some prime number p, there is a greater prime number:
(d) ∃n (n>p and n is prime)
(e) ∃n (p!+1≥n>p and n is prime)
(Note: “p!” is the product of all the natural numbers up to and including p, that is, “1×2×3×…×(p-1)×p”.) As Hilbert sees it, both (1) and (2) abbreviate non-quantified statements:
(d’) (n=p+1 and n is prime) or (n=p+2 and n is prime) or (n=p+3 and n is prime) or …
(e’) (n=p+1 and n is prime) or (n=p+2 and n is prime) or … or (n=p!+1 and n is prime)
Statement (e) abbreviates a finitary statement, (e’), because it sets an upper limit of p!+1 on the candidate numbers that might be primes greater than p. But statement (d) does not; it sets no upper limit and does not abbreviate a finitary statement. Hilbert contends that only finitary statements are meaningful. So, while statements like (d) are theoretically useful, they are ‘ideal statements’ and strictly speaking “signify nothing”.
[W]e conceive mathematics to be a stock of two kinds of formula: first, those to which meaningful communications of finitary statements correspond; and, secondly, other formulas which signify nothing and which are the ideal structures of our theory. (Hilbert 1925: 146)
One might have a uniform semantics, across language, on which quantifiers represent universal disjunctions or universal conjunctions. But in claiming that quantified statements like (d) “signify nothing”, Hilbert treats arithmetical quantifiers in a heterogenous fashion, with no apparent parallel in non-mathematical discourse. Accordingly, Hilbert’s finitist account does not satisfy the semantic constraint.
This offers a sense of what sort of account fails to satisfy the semantic constraint. But what, precisely, is required for an account to satisfy that constraint? In addition to providing a homogenous semantics, such an account should apply the same general semantic account to mathematical and non-mathematical language. This was done by both Frege and Quine; both gave arguments for the existence of mathematical objects that depended on the idea that semantic features of language incur the same ontological commitments regardless of whether or not that language is mathematical.
Benacerraf’s key take-away from the semantic constraint is that, if non-mathematical and mathematical sentences are similar in superficial sentential form, they should have parallel semantics. With that in mind, he focuses his argument for mathematical platonism on two sentences that are both standardly accepted as true:
(1) There are at least three large cities older than New York.
(2) There are at least three perfect numbers greater than 17.
Assuming a compositional semantics, (1) seems to be an instance of a fairly simple “logico-grammatical” form involving straightforward uses of quantification, predicates, and singular terms:
(3) There are at least three FGs that bear R to a.
(In keeping with standard interpretation, the form of (3) is preserved when the English phrase ‘There are at least three’ is replaced with more transparently quantificational notation.) Furthermore, since (1) and (2) are similar in superficial sentential form, an account that satisfies the semantic constraint ought to attribute the same form to (2). That is, the reasoning goes, if (1) exhibits the form of (3), then (2) ought to exhibit the form of (3) as well. (For discussion of Benacerraf’s assimilation of (1) and (2) to (3), see Katz 1995: 497 and Nutting 2018.)
At this point in the argument, Benacerraf wants to place an account of mathematical truth that satisfies the semantic constraint within the context of a general account of truth. He only sees one plausible general account of truth on offer: “I take it that we have only one such account: Tarski’s, and that its essential feature is to define truth in terms of reference (or satisfaction) on the basis of a particular kind of syntactico-semantical analysis of the language” (1973: 667).
The “particular kind of syntactico-semantical analysis of the language” of a Tarskian account is one that will treat both (1) and (2) as having the ‘logico-grammatical’ form of (3).
A “Tarskian” account of truth goes beyond the T-Convention. (For more on the T-Convention, see the IEP article on Truth.) As Benacerraf sees it, Tarskian accounts are correspondence-style accounts of truth; they “define truth in terms of reference (or satisfaction).” Because he takes the only plausible accounts of truth to be Tarskian in this sense, and hence referential in nature, Benacerraf takes there to be ontological import to analyzing (2) as exhibiting the form of (3). The truth of (2) requires both that its singular term (“17”) refer to a mathematical object and that its quantifiers range over mathematical objects such as 28 (a perfect number). Just as the truth of (1) requires the existence of cities, the truth of (2) requires the existence of numbers.
Furthermore, if there are such mathematical objects, Benacerraf assumes that they are platonistic. That is, mathematical objects are abstract objects, outside of space, time, and the causal realm, as well as independent of human minds and language. So, the argument goes, an account of mathematical truth that satisfies the semantic constraint will be an account on which the singular terms of true mathematical sentences refer to platonistic mathematical objects, and the quantifiers of such sentences quantify over the same. This view is mathematical platonism. (See the IEP article on mathematical platonism.) So, on the picture presented in Benacerraf’s argument, accounts that satisfy the semantic constraint appear to be versions of mathematical platonism. (Not all philosophers have accepted that mathematical objects must be platonistic. For example, Maddy (1990) offers an account on which some mathematical objects, namely impure sets, can be perceived, and hence are causally efficacious. Alternatively, Kit Fine (2006) and Audrey Yap (2009) both offer views on which mathematical objects depend for their existence on human minds. All of these views are briefly sketched in section 4b.)
Some philosophers (for example, Creath 1980, Tait 1986) have objected to Benacerraf’s characterization of Tarskian accounts of truth, claiming that Tarski’s account is not referential and that it does not have the ontological implications that Benacerraf claims. But, assuming that statements (1) and (2) both have the form of (3), Benacerraf only needs one of two key claims from his Tarskian assumption to get a semantic argument for mathematical platonism off the ground. The first, which also is used in Fregean arguments (see section 2a), is that singular terms in true sentences refer to objects. This claim allows one to argue that, since the term “17” in (2) plays the same role as “New York” in (1), it refers to some specific mathematical object. The second, which also is used in Quinean arguments (see section 2b), is that quantifiers quantify over objects; that is, true existential claims must be witnessed by objects. This claim allows one to argue that, given the quantification in (2), the truth of (2) commits us to the existence of perfect numbers greater than 17—and hence, numbers. For the purposes of Benacerraf’s semantic argument, it does not matter whether either of these claims is genuinely Tarskian. It only matters that any plausible general semantics will uphold at least one of them, and that either claim entails that the truth of (2) requires the existence of mathematical objects.
Mathematical platonists claim that mathematical sentences involve reference to, and quantification over, abstract mathematical objects like numbers and sets. Such accounts of mathematical truth appear to fare well with respect to the semantic constraint. But because of the abstract nature of the mathematical objects that such accounts posit, they do not appear to fare as well with respect to the epistemological constraint. This section addresses the two most central epistemological arguments against mathematical platonism in the literature: Benacerraf’s (1973) and Hartry Field’s (1989).
Benacerraf’s and Field’s arguments have given rise to a range of further epistemological arguments and challenges that bear something of a family resemblance to one another, and that target a broader range of accounts of mathematical truth (and not just mathematical platonism). More of these epistemological arguments and challenges are addressed in section 4a.
In “Mathematical Truth,” Benacerraf presents a tentative argument against mathematical platonism. The argument depends on a causal constraint on accounts of mathematical knowledge: “for X to know that S is true requires some causal relation to obtain between X and the referents of the names, predicates, and quantifiers of S” (Benacerraf 1973: 671).
This suggested causal constraint on knowledge poses a problem for mathematical platonism. As described above, mathematical platonism entails the view that the terms (including names) in mathematical sentences refer to abstract mathematical objects, which are outside space, time, and the causal realm. According to platonistic views, the quantifiers of such sentences (“there are…”, “every…”) range over those same abstract mathematical objects. But causal relations cannot obtain between people and the referents of names, predicates, and quantifiers of mathematical sentences if those referents are abstract, acausal mathematical objects. As a result, Benacerraf’s causal constraint renders mathematical knowledge impossible if mathematical platonism is true.
The thrust of this argument is that it appears to be impossible for mathematical platonists to explain mathematical knowledge in a way that coheres with a plausible general epistemological theory. At least, that is the case if Benacerraf’s causal constraint is a consequence of any plausible general epistemological theory. But why should someone endorse the causal constraint?
Benacerraf suggests two different reasons for endorsing the causal constraint. First, he thinks it is a consequence of a causal account of knowledge. And second, he thinks it is a consequence of a causal theory of reference.
The causal account of knowledge that Benacerraf cites is not precisely specified. But it seems to be motivated, in part, by the idea that there are limits to what kinds of justification, warrant, or evidence can support knowledge of a claim. As Benacerraf sees it, “it must be possible to establish an appropriate sort of connection between the truth conditions of p… and the grounds on which p is said to be known” (Benacerraf 1973: 672).
Benacerraf seems to think that, if one is to know a claim, one’s evidence for that claim must trace back to the constraints that the truth of the claim imposes upon the world. More specifically, Benacerraf thinks one’s evidence must trace back to those constraints—those truth-conditions—in a causal way. In his words, a person must “make necessary (causal) contact with the grounds of the truth of the proposition… to be in a position of evidence adequate to support the inference (if an inference was relevant)” (1973: 671–672).
Benacerraf’s causal epistemological picture appears to require that instances of knowledge depend on some kind of causal interaction with the facts known.
The causal theories of knowledge that Benacerraf cites are found in the work of Alvin Goldman (1967), Brian Skyrms (1967), and Gilbert Harman (1973). All three of them propose that causal interaction with at least some facts is a necessary condition for knowledge of those facts. (None of them, however, actually accepts such a necessary condition for all knowledge.) But without any sense of what is required to causally interact with a fact, this necessary condition does not yet entail the causal constraint on knowledge set out at the beginning of this section—that knowing a sentence to be true requires causal interactions with the referents of the names, and so forth, that appear in that sentence.
To support the causal constraint on knowledge, Benacerraf also seems to rely on something like Paul Grice’s (1961) causal theory of perception to get that causal interaction with a fact necessarily includes causal interaction with the objects involved in that fact, that is, the referents of the names and quantifiers in sentences that state the fact. To use an example of Benacerraf’s (1973: 671), Hermione knows that she holds a black truffle because she visually perceives that fact. The view seems to be that, as part of perceiving that fact, she perceives the truffle itself. So, not only do instances of knowledge depend on some kind of causal interaction with the facts known, but causal interaction with the facts known seems to require causal interaction with the objects involved in those facts. Together, these two claims support the causal constraint on knowledge.
The second reason that Benacerraf gives for endorsing the causal constraint is that he explicitly endorses a causal theory of reference. Maddy offers a standard description of such a theory, focusing on predicates and reference to natural kinds.
According to the causal theory, successful reference to a natural kind is accomplished by means of a chain of communication from the referrer back to an initial baptism. (Of course, the baptist refers without such a chain, but most of us are rarely in that role.) One member of this chain acquires the word by means of a causal interaction with the previous link; that is, I learn a word, in part, by hearing it, reading it, or some such sensory experience, caused, in part, by my predecessor in the chain. (Maddy 1980: 166)
In cases of reference to individual objects through names, the same general picture of baptism and transmission is thought to hold. Benacerraf takes a causal theory of reference to entail that reference to an object (or kind) through a name (or predicate) requires a causal connection—perhaps a complex one—with the object (or an instance of the kind) so named.
If that is correct, then the successful use of language depends on appropriate causal connections with the referents of the relevant names and predicates. A person cannot even entertain a proposition expressed by a sentence that includes names, predicates, or quantification without causal connections with the referents of those linguistic elements. And a person cannot know the truth of a sentence if she cannot entertain the proposition it expresses. Thus, the argument goes, a causal theory of reference also entails Benacerraf’s causal constraint on knowledge.
Benacerraf is not fully committed to his epistemological argument against platonism. Ultimately, his aim is to show that there is a need for a better unified account of mathematical truth and mathematical knowledge. But regardless of his own attitude towards the argument, the success or failure of the argument ultimately rides on the plausibility of the causal constraint on knowledge.
The standard objection to Benacerraf’s epistemological argument against mathematical platonism is that one ought not to presuppose a causal theory of knowledge. At least two different sorts of reason are given for this argument. First, causal theories of knowledge had a short-lived prominence in epistemology. As David Liggins puts it, “These days, Benacerraf’s argument has little force, since causal theories of knowledge are not taken very seriously” (2006: 137).
Second, causal constraints seem to be designed for empirical knowledge, and not for knowledge in general. Some philosophers have even proposed the very case at issue, namely mathematics, as a counterexample to fully general causal constraints. W.D. Hart objects to a general causal constraint on reference: “since I believe that some people and some singular terms refer to causally inert numbers, I am therefore forced to conclude that such causal theories of reference are false of numbers” (Hart 1979: 164). David Lewis says something similar about knowledge: “Causal accounts of knowledge are all very well in their place, but if they are put forward as general theories, then mathematics refutes them” (Lewis 1986: 109).
But counterexamples are not the only objections that have been raised to the general causal constraint. Some have objected that the general causal constraint leads to implausible results in domains other than mathematics. John Burgess and Gideon Rosen (1996: 40), for example, argue that causal theories of knowledge implausibly preclude knowledge of future contingents. Others have objected that the causal constraint involves an unwarranted assumption of empiricism, or an unwarranted assimilation of all knowledge to empirical knowledge (for example, Katz 1995: 493, Linnebo 2006: 546). And, in a similar vein, Lewis (1986: 111) has argued that causal interaction is only required for knowledge of contingent truths, not for knowledge of necessary truths (like mathematical truths). On his view, the role of causal requirements is to ensure that our beliefs are counterfactually dependent on the world around us; had the world been different, a causal requirement can ensure that our beliefs would likewise have been different. But no causal interaction is required to ensure such counterfactual dependence in the case of necessary truths. Those facts could not have been different, and so it is vacuously true that if the facts had been different our beliefs would likewise have been different.
A third sort of objection focuses on the resources Benacerraf uses to support the causal constraint. While Benacerraf cites both a causal theory of reference and a causal theory of knowledge as supporting his causal constraint on knowledge, it is not clear that either kind of causal theory actually entails his causal constraint on knowledge. Proponents of causal theories of knowledge (for example, Goldman 1967, Skyrms 1967) typically restrict their accounts to empirical or a posteriori knowledge, and do not apply causal constraints to domains like logic and mathematics that are standardly taken to be a priori. And causal theories of reference are typically accounts of the transmission of a name or predicate from one person to another; they are not accounts of how objects get baptized with names in the first place. Such theories of reference transmission leave open the possibility that names might be originally assigned without causal interactions with the things named (see Burgess and Rosen 1996: 50). Causal theories in epistemology and in the philosophy of language do not entail Benacerraf’s causal constraint.
After these objections are raised, Benacerraf’s argument against platonism is left in an unsettled dialectical position. Proponents and opponents of the argument agree that, if the causal constraint holds, then knowledge of platonistic mathematical truths is impossible. They simply disagree about the plausibility of the causal constraint. Proponents of the argument take the causal constraint on knowledge to be secure enough to pose a serious problem to platonistic theories of mathematical truth. (Recall that commitments to mathematical truth and commitments to mathematical knowledge stand and fall together.) Opponents of the argument take the causal constraint to be insufficiently secure to do such work. Opponents like Burgess and Rosen (1996) argue that the burden of proof is on the argument’s proponents to establish its premises. Burgess and Rosen (1996, 2005) also contend that proponents of the epistemological argument against mathematical platonism unreasonably expect mathematical platonists to develop accounts of knowledge and reference in the mathematical domain that far exceed what is expected of such accounts in, for example, the perceptual domain; for example, one ought not to demand a more detailed account of how the referent of ‘4’ is fixed than for how the referent of “the Rock of Gibraltar” is fixed.
In light of the problems with Benacerraf’s appeal to a causal constraint, or a causal theory of knowledge, Benacerraf’s epistemological argument against mathematical platonism has been recast in several ways. First, the epistemological argument is often understood instead as a challenge that mathematical platonists must overcome; platonists seem to bear the burden of setting out a plausible epistemological picture on which knowledge of platonistically construed mathematical truths is feasible. This, in fact, seems to be Benacerraf’s own attitude, given his overall conclusion that a better theory of mathematical truth (and knowledge) is required.
Second, on some interpretations, Benacerraf’s use of the causal constraint on knowledge reduces to a weaker casual constraint. Some (Maddy 1984: 51, Hart 1991a: 95, Nutting 2016 and 2020) suggest that a weaker causal constraint still applies to direct, immediate, or non-inferential knowledge, something akin to Grice’s (1961) causal theory of perception. While this interpretation weakens the objectionable causal constraint, it appears to build in the assumption that platonists are committed to positing some perception-like cognition of mathematical abstracta into Benacerraf’s epistemological argument. Colin Cheyne (1998: 35) suggests that a weaker causal constraint applies specifically to knowledge of existence claims, and that it can be used successfully in an argument to the effect that we cannot know that abstract mathematical objects exist.
Third, some philosophers have suggested replacing Benacerraf’s causal constraint, or his appeal to a causal theory of knowledge, with other conditions on knowledge or justification in the epistemology literature. Penelope Maddy (1984) suggests that the causal constraint might be swapped out for a reliability constraint on justification (and hence knowledge, assuming knowledge entails justification). While the resulting argument has a more plausible epistemological constraint, she suggests that it is consistent with a platonistic account of mathematical truth. Against this suggestion, Albert Casullo (1992) argues that reliabilism does not help platonism cohere with a plausible general epistemology. In a different vein, Joshua Thurow (2013) offers a reformulation of Benacerraf’s argument which sets a ‘no-defeater’ condition on knowledge, instead of a causal one. Thurow then suggests that the lack of causal interaction with mathematical entities makes it unlikely that beliefs about them are true, and this fact serves as a defeater for mathematical knowledge. This reformulation avoids an appeal to the causal theory of knowledge, but still entails a kind of causal constraint on knowledge.
Benacerraf’s original epistemological argument does not appear to be easily revised into a plausible, convincing argument against mathematical platonism. But it does at least pose a serious challenge for platonists. The proponent of Benacerraf’s epistemological argument may well bear the burden of defending the causal constraint on knowledge, or of showing how some more plausible alternative constraint can be used to argue against mathematical platonism. But the mathematical platonist still seems to bear the burden of setting out a plausible epistemological picture on which knowledge of platonistically construed mathematical truths is feasible. Benacerraf’s epistemological challenge exposes that it is unclear how a platonist can make mathematical reference and mathematical knowledge consistent with a plausible general theory of reference or a plausible general epistemological picture.
Unlike Benacerraf, Hartry Field (1989) appears to endorse an epistemological argument against mathematical platonism. (Though some think he treats it as a forceful challenge; see Liggins 2010.) Field employs his version of such an argument in support of mathematical fictionalism. (See the IEP article on mathematical fictionalism.) His view is that there are no mathematical objects, and so mathematical claims that don’t begin with universal quantifiers are literally false. On this view, mathematical claims that begin with universal quantifiers are vacuously true, because they have empty domains of quantification.
Field’s epistemological argument against mathematical platonism is the most influential reformulation of Benacerraf’s in the literature. It avoids the most common objections to Benacerraf’s version by avoiding any appeal to constraints on knowledge whatsoever. Largely because of this, Field’s version is widely taken to be a refinement of, or improvement on, Benacerraf’s version (see, for example, Burgess and Rosen 1997: 41, Liggins 2010: 71, Clarke-Doane 2014: 246). (But this perspective is not universal; see Kasa 2010 and Nutting 2020.)
Field avoids appealing to constraints on knowledge in his argument by avoiding any mention of knowledge. Instead, he focuses on an epistemological phenomenon that seems to be entailed by knowledge: believing, or accepting, claims. Specifically, Field (1989: 230) argues that mathematical platonists are obligated to explain why the following holds for the overwhelming majority of mathematical sentences:
(1) If most mathematicians accept “p”, then p.
In short, platonists think that mathematicians are remarkably reliable about the mathematical realm. The kind of reliability that platonists posit is both overwhelming and surely not coincidental. It calls out for explanation.
Field grants that a partial explanation of this reliability is possible. In particular, the platonist can appeal to the fact that most mathematical claims are accepted on the basis of proof from axioms. If so, Field writes in (Field 1989: 231), “what needs explanation is only the fact that the following holds for all (or most) sentences ‘p’”:
(2) If most mathematicians accept “p” as an axiom, then p.
But this partial explanation merely reduces the challenge of explaining mathematicians’ remarkable reliability to the challenge of explaining why mathematicians reliably accept true axioms. Field argues that the platonist cannot explain this:
The claims that the platonist makes about mathematical objects appear to rule out any reasonable strategy for explaining the systematic correlation in question.… [I]t is impossible in principle to give a satisfactory explanation of the general fact (2). (Field 1989: 230-231)
The reason that it appears to be impossible to satisfactorily explain this reliability fact is that the way abstract mathematical objects are described appears to leave people without any way to access facts about the mathematical realm. If mathematicians lack any interaction whatsoever with mathematical objects, then the idea that they would be reliably right about the facts involving those objects seems to be inexplicable.
Field does think that it is possible to explain why the axioms that mathematicians accept are mutually consistent. Over time, mathematicians discover when combinations of potential axioms lead to contradictions. Such discoveries lead them to reject or revise axiom candidates in the interest of setting out consistent systems of axioms. Field thinks that this gradual process explains why we accept consistent systems of axioms (though Leng 2007 registers doubts). But the mere fact that certain sentences are mutually consistent does not generally entail that they are all true. Unless one develops an account on which mutually consistent mathematical claims must be true (as in Balaguer 1998), appealing to aspects of mathematical practice that promote consistency will not thereby serve to explain why mathematicians tend to accept axioms that are true.
These concerns about the putative reliability of mathematicians give rise to Field’s epistemological argument against mathematical platonism. According to mathematical platonism, mathematical facts are facts about abstract mathematical objects, and mathematicians are remarkably reliable in accepting those facts. But there must be an explanation of such a remarkable correlation between the claims mathematicians accept and the mathematical facts. And there is not one. The abstract nature of mathematical objects renders it impossible, in principle, to explain the correlation. Without the possibility for an explanation, Field concludes, the posited correlation must not hold—or, at the very least, we are not justified in believing that it holds. So, the argument goes, mathematical platonism is wrong—or, at the very least, unjustified. Ultimately, Field infers, we ought not to believe mathematical statements unless they are vacuously true (that is, begin with universal quantifiers).
Some philosophers find Field’s argument compelling, if not knock-down (see Liggins 2006, 2010: 74). Others have raised objections to it. First, Burgess and Rosen (1996: 41-45) object that the remarkable reliability that Field thinks demands explanation reduces to a much less remarkable correlation between (or, more accurately, conjunction of) exactly two facts:
(i) It is true that the full cumulative hierarchy of sets exists.
(ii) It is believed that the full cumulative hierarchy of sets exists.
They also contend that demanding an explanation of this true belief amounts to demanding a heavy-duty sort of justification of the standards of a science, and this is potentially objectionable.
Second, objections have been raised to Field’s apparent assumption that the correlation between mathematical facts and mathematical beliefs requires a causal explanation. Ivan Kasa (2010) and Eileen Nutting (2020) argue that Field’s assumption that the explanation must be causal is effectively a minor modification of Benacerraf’s causal constraint on knowledge; this leaves Field’s causal assumption open to some of the same sorts of criticisms as Benacerraf’s. Øystein Linnebo (2006: 553) points out that some correlations have good non-causal explanations, such as the correlation between the consistency of a first-order theory and the existence of a model for that theory. Linnebo suggests that a dubious analogy between the discipline of mathematics and the discipline of physics motivates Field’s assumption that the correlation at issue in his argument (between mathematical facts and mathematical beliefs) requires a causal explanation.
Section 3 focused specifically on the epistemological arguments against mathematical platonism raised by Benacerraf and Field. Section 4a addresses further epistemological challenges and arguments, most of which are taken to apply equally well to other accounts of mathematical truth, and hence to generalize the epistemological problems raised by Benacerraf and Field. (Many of these challenges also are taken to apply to other domains as well, such as morality, modality, and logic. Those other domains are not addressed in this article.) Section 4b addresses some proposed solutions to Benacerraf’s dilemma, which involve presenting an account of mathematical knowledge, and, in many cases, also involve shifting to a non-platonistic account of mathematical truth.
Both Benacerraf’s and Field’s epistemological arguments have been generalized or modified in ways that appear to raise epistemological challenges for views beyond mathematical platonism.
Recall that Benacerraf’s argument against platonism is rooted in the problem of combining a causal constraint on knowledge, as well as a causal constraint on reference, with a platonistic account on which mathematical objects are abstract and acausal. This problem can be generalized in two ways. First, there are other accounts of mathematical truth on which mathematical claims are true in virtue of some mathematical subject matter with which we do not causally interact. The causal constraint on knowledge might appear to equally pose a problem for, for example, accounts of mathematical truth on which mathematical claims are true in virtue of transcendent mathematical properties (as in, for example, Yi 1998), or in virtue of mathematical structures that have dual object/universal natures (as in, for example, Shapiro 1997), or in virtue of systems of concrete possibilia (as in, for example, Hellman 1989). Strictly speaking, these views (with the possible exception of Shapiro’s) are not platonistic; they do not appeal to abstract mathematical objects.
The second generalization emerges from the fact that concerns have been raised about causal constraints on knowledge and reference. Even so, Benacerraf’s problem can be posed as the challenge of providing an epistemological account that explains knowledge of the entities in question. The more general challenge, then, is to combine an account of mathematical truth with an account of the way in which we know those truths. While this challenge may seem particularly pressing for accounts of mathematical truth on which some causal form of knowledge is impossible, it will arise for any correspondence-style account on which mathematical claims are true in virtue of some kind of subject matter, be that mathematical objects, mathematical properties, mathematical structures, or anything else. The general strategies to approaching this subject-matter-oriented challenge seem to require either providing an account of knowledge of certain specific kinds of causally inaccessible entities or positing some causally efficacious mathematical subject matter (see Nutting 2016). (Approaches of both kinds are sketched in section 4b.)
Recall that Field’s epistemological argument against mathematical platonism focuses on the problem of explaining the correlation between mathematicians’ beliefs and mathematical facts, which are assumed to be about acausal mathematical entities. Field’s is the first in a family of epistemological challenges that focus on the reliability of mathematicians. Some of these are presented as attempts to make Field’s argument more precise; others are presented as new epistemological challenges, distinct from Field’s.
Most of the ensuing reliability challenges generalize the problem as presented by Field to apply equally to a range of non-platonistic accounts. These challenges take the problem of explaining mathematicians’ reliability to apply to any account of mathematical truth, platonistic or otherwise, that assumes that mathematicians are, in fact, remarkably reliable when it comes to some mind-independent mathematical facts. Given the kinds of claims and logic that mathematicians usually accept, views on which mathematicians are remarkably reliable typically are ones that entail what is sometimes called semantic realism or truth-value realism, that is, that all (mathematical) claims are either true or false. However, these challenges may still apply to accounts that allow for some indeterminate claims, for example, in set theory—though the challenges are perhaps less likely to apply to accounts that admit indeterminate claims in, for example, arithmetic.
Some of the reliability challenges rooted in Field’s work arise from attempts to make something in Field’s argument precise. Field claims that the correlation between mathematical facts and mathematicians’ beliefs is so remarkable as to demand an explanation. He further suggests that such an explanation is impossible if mathematical objects are abstract and acausal. But, setting aside Field’s focus on abstract objects, what kind of explanation is required for such a correlation? One seemingly unsatisfactory explanation is what Linnebo (2006: 554) calls ‘the Boring Explanation’: mathematicians are taught true mathematical claims (especially axioms) as part of their training, and then go on to prove things that logically follow from those true claims, and hence are also true. Given that the Boring Explanation is unsatisfactory, what conditions must a satisfactory explanation satisfy?
One possibility is that explaining mathematicians’ reliability requires showing that the correlation between facts and beliefs has counterfactual force, where that is usually interpreted as showing that mathematicians’ beliefs are sensitive to the mathematical facts. For any claim p, a person’s belief that p is sensitive if and only if, had p been false, the person would not have believed p. But intuitively, it seems that demonstrating that mathematicians’ beliefs are sensitive to the mathematical facts will not suffice to explain the reliability in question. That is because mathematical truths are usually taken to be necessary; they could not have been false. If so, the antecedent of the sensitivity counterfactual is always false. That guarantees that mathematical beliefs are sensitive (Lewis 1986: 111, Linnebo 2006: 550-51, Clarke-Doane 2017: 26). But this seems inadequate; the necessity of mathematical truths does not seem to explain mathematicians’ reliability at all.
Another possibility is that the epistemological challenge to platonists is to explain why it is—that is, what makes it the case—that mathematicians’ beliefs are reliable. Linnebo takes such an approach, and he argues that platonists must provide an ‘external explanation’ to show that mathematicians’ methods are “conducive to finding out whether these claims are true” (Linnebo 2006: 563). But Linnebo takes the sensitivity of mathematical beliefs to be an indication that these methods are, in fact, conducive to determining whether mathematical claims are true. He tries to revive sensitivity from the vacuity problem by appealing to meta-semantic facts about what propositions are picked out by sentences. Mathematical propositions might be necessary, but there is a sense in which mathematical sentences could have been false; they could have expressed different propositions (or no propositions at all). And, Linnebo contends, there is a sensible question about whether mathematicians would have still accepted those sentences in those meta-semantically different situations.
A slightly different way of casting the epistemological challenge is as an evolutionary debunking argument. (See Korman 2020 on debunking arguments in general.) Like standard moral evolutionary debunking arguments, such as those of Street (2006) and Joyce (2006), a mathematical evolutionary debunking argument appeals to the role of evolutionary pressures in guiding many of our most fundamental mathematical beliefs. These evolutionary pressures provide an explanation of our mathematical beliefs that, according to the argument, are independent of the mathematical facts. This gives reason to doubt the reliability of the beliefs formed on that evolutionary basis, and even to doubt that there are any mathematical facts at all.
But, as Justin Clarke-Doane (2012, 2014) cashes out the evolutionary debunking argument, the claim that evolutionary pressures are independent of the mathematical facts amounts to a sensitivity claim: had the mathematical facts not been facts, the beliefs resulting from evolutionary pressures would have remained the same. Like Linnebo, Clarke-Doane tries to make sense of this counterfactual by identifying a sense in which mathematical claims are not necessary. His suggestion is that, while mathematical truths might be metaphysically necessary, we might appeal to conceptual possibility instead. On this approach, conceptual possibility does not entail metaphysical possibility, and it is conceptually possible (that is, intelligible to imagine) that mathematical claims could have been different (Clarke-Doane 2012: 321, 2014: 249-50). A third approach to reviving a sensitivity interpretation of the reliability challenge might also be available if one were to deny the vacuous truth of counterfactual claims with necessary antecedents. This third approach would involve accepting an account of counterfactuals that depends on counterpossibles. (See Nolan 1997, Williamson 2017, and Berto and others 2018.)
A wide range of new accounts of mathematical knowledge have been developed in attempts to overcome these epistemological challenges. This section provides an incomplete survey of some of those attempts.
With the notable exception of minimalist responses (vi), the accounts below are primarily targeted at addressing epistemological challenges in the mold of Benacerraf’s, rather than those in the mold of Field’s. That is, they are primarily concerned with explaining knowledge of some mathematical subject matter, rather than with explaining the reliability of mathematicians. Many of the accounts described seem to be less well-suited to addressing Fieldian reliability challenges, because they appeal to considerations that likely would not have influenced most mathematicians. Even when it comes to addressing Benacerrafian concerns, some of the accounts below appear to have trouble explaining all mathematical knowledge. They might, for example, fail to explain knowledge of those parts of set theory that are, for example, not involved in scientific theorizing or that lack clearly observable instances or applications.
In addition to potential failures to fully address the epistemological challenges, it is worth noting that substantive objections have been raised to each of the accounts below, though this article does not engage with those objections.
i. Mathematics’ role in empirical science.
Some philosophers have appealed to the important role of mathematics in empirical science to explain how the epistemological challenges might be avoided, or why mathematical beliefs are justified. For example, Mark Steiner (1973: 61) suggests that, although people do not causally interact with mathematical objects, mathematical truths play a role in causal explanations of mathematical beliefs. A thorough causal explanation of a person’s mathematical beliefs inevitably will involve a scientific theory that presupposes mathematics, and so the mathematical claims will play a role in those causal explanations. If this is correct, then mathematical claims do play a causal role of some sort in mathematical beliefs.
A different science-oriented approach is to appeal to some of the reasoning in so-called indispensability arguments (see for example, Resnik 1995, Colyvan 2001, Baker 2005). According to these arguments, mathematics and quantification over mathematical objects are indispensable to the best scientific theories, or to our best scientific explanations, and so mathematical theories are supported by the same body of evidence that supports those empirical theories or explanations. Typically, indispensability arguments are used to establish the existence of mathematical objects. But similar reasoning supports a more epistemological claim: mathematical claims, and the positing of mathematical objects, are justified by empirical science (see for example, Colyvan 2007). If that is the case, then mathematical knowledge does not appear to depend on causal interaction with mathematical objects. (See the IEP article on indispensability arguments article.)
ii. Perceiving sets.
Maddy (1980: 178-84, 1990: 58-63) offers a view on which we do causally interact with some mathematical objects. Specifically, on this view people routinely perceive sets. For example, a person might perceive a set of three eggs in the refrigerator. In the exact same location, that person might also perceive two disjoint sets: a set of two eggs, and a singleton set of one egg. On this view, we are causally related to the sets we perceive, and we can have non-inferential perceptual knowledge involving those sets. That non-inferential perceptual knowledge can be numerical, for example, that the set of eggs is three-membered. The causal constraint, it seems, would not undermine mathematical knowledge if people routinely perceived impure sets and their numerical properties.
iii. Pattern-recognition and abstraction.
On certain versions of mathematical structuralism, mathematical objects are abstract mathematical structures and the positions in those structures. Michael Resnik (1982), Charles Parsons (2008), and Stewart Shapiro (1997) all offer accounts on which mathematical structures, and the positions in those structures, can be epistemically accessed by pattern recognition and/or abstraction that starts from concrete objects. (Parsons differs from Resnik and Shapiro in talking of ‘intuition’ of what are effectively the types of which concreta are tokens.) Consider, for example, the following sequence of strokes written (let us suppose) on a piece of paper:
| , || , |||
At each additional step in the sequence, an additional stroke is added. The pattern here, of course, is the beginning of the sequence of natural numbers. On Shapiro’s (1997: 115-116) view, for example, the sequence above is a physical instantiation of the 3-ordinal pattern, that is, a system of 3 objects taken in a particular order. “A, B, C” is another physical instantiation of that same pattern. People can abstract the ordinal number 3 from sequences such as these by using the ordinary human capacity of pattern recognition. This is the same capacity that allows us to recognize, for example, the pattern of player positions on a baseball diamond. Shapiro’s view adds an additional step for access to the natural number 3, which is a position in the structure of the natural numbers, and hence distinct from the 3-ordinal pattern. Once a person has cognition of various ordinal patterns, the structure of the natural numbers can be abstracted from thinking about the natural ordering of all those ordinals. This further step, too, can be done using ordinary human capacities of abstraction. On this sort of account, causal interaction with mathematical objects is not required for cognitive access to those objects; people can access abstract mathematical objects through an ordinary process of abstraction that starts with the recognition of patterns in concrete, perceived things. (See the structuralism article.)
iv. Abstraction Principles.
Neo-Fregeans like Bob Hale, Crispin Wright, and Linnebo turn to a somewhat different form of abstraction, one that relies on abstraction principles to address epistemological challenges (see, for example, Hale and Wright 2002, Linnebo 2018). The most-discussed abstraction principle is Hume’s Principle:
ꓯFꓯG (#F=#G ↔ the Fs are in 1-1 correspondence with the Gs).
That is, for any concepts F and G (for example “finger on my left hand”, “U.S. president in the 21st century”), the number of Fs is identical with the number of Gs if and only if there is a relation that pairs each F with exactly one G, and vice versa. On this view, it is not just a lucky happenstance that concepts have the same number precisely when they are in one-to-one correspondence with each other. Rather, according to Hale and Wright, that is just how numbers work; the claim about number identity on the left side of the biconditional has the same content as the claim about one-to-one correspondence on the right side of the biconditional, but expresses that content in a different way. Hume’s Principle is analytic, that is, true in virtue of meaning; it implicitly defines what the term ‘number’ means. On this view, if we understand one-to-one correspondences between concepts (for example, we understand what it is to be able to pair up the fingers on my left hand with the fingers on my right hand in a tidy way), we can use the implicit definition of number given in Hume’s Principle to come to know things about numbers—even though numbers are abstract objects with which we do not causally interact. Other abstraction principles can be used in similar ways to provide epistemological access to other kinds of mathematical objects. Linnebo (2018) even appeals to a different abstraction principle to define the natural numbers as ordinals (positions in orderings), though he still accepts Hume’s Principle as an account of the cardinal numbers (how many). (For more on abstractionism, see the IEP article on abstractionism.)
v. Logical Knowledge and Knowledge through Descriptions.
Philosophers with very different accounts of mathematical objects have offered epistemological accounts on which mathematical knowledge is acquired through definitions. The neo-Fregeans described above, who take abstraction principles like Hume’s Principle to be implicit definitions, are one example.
Other approaches in this general category shift away from the traditional conception of mathematical objects as abstract and mind-independent. Audrey Yap (2009), for example, follows Richard Dedekind (1888) in taking mathematical objects to be “free creations of the human mind.” On Yap’s version of the account, because the second-order Peano Axioms (which govern arithmetic) are both consistent and categorical (that is, all models of them are isomorphic/structurally identical), stipulating those axioms effectively serves to create the subject matter of arithmetic—the natural numbers. People who engage in such generative stipulations are in a position to know what they have stipulated—and so, to know mathematical truths. In a similar vein, Kit Fine (2006) has a view on which all mathematical knowledge is derived from what he calls ‘procedural postulations’, which serve to generate mathematical objects. Again, on his picture, mathematical knowledge is possible because our postulations create the subject matter of mathematics.
A rather different account of mathematical knowledge through description is found in Mark Balaguer’s (1998) plenitudinous platonism. According to plenitudinous platonism, all logically possible mathematical objects exist in some mathematical universe. There are, for example, many set theoretic universes, and the Continuum Hypothesis is true in some and false in others. Balaguer thinks that any consistent mathematical theory truly describes some part of the mathematical universe. And, Balaguer suggests, all that is required for mathematical knowledge is knowledge that a mathematical theory is consistent. On Balaguer’s account, then, all that is required for mathematical knowledge is the description of a consistent theory and the knowledge that it is consistent. Similarly, Sharon Berry argues that any coherent mathematical theory could have expressed a truth, and that “the mathematical realist only needs to explain how we came to accept some logically coherent characterization of ‘the numbers’ and derive our beliefs from that characterization” (2018: 2293).
vi. Minimalist Responses.
Some accounts of mathematical knowledge are in the spirit of what Korman (2019) and Korman and Locke (2020) call minimalist responses. These accounts involve an explanation of why no interaction with abstract mathematical objects is required for mathematical knowledge. But they do not provide much in the way of accounts of how mathematical knowledge is acquired; they claim that little is required on this front. One such account is Lewis’s (1986) (see section 3b). Lewis claims that only contingent facts require causal explanation, and we have mathematical knowledge because mathematical claims are necessary, and so our beliefs about them are inevitably sensitive (in the sense discussed in section 4a). Clarke-Doane (2017) spins an idea similar to Lewis’s into a rejection of Field’s challenge. According to Clarke-Doane, requiring an explanation of the reliability of mathematicians would require explaining the counterfactual dependence of mathematicians’ beliefs on the mathematical facts. But, as Lewis points out, sensitivity is trivial due to the necessity of mathematical truth. And, Clarke-Doane argues, the counterfactual notion of safety—that a belief could not easily have been false—does not pose much of a problem either.
vii. Mathematical fictionalism.
Some philosophers have been convinced that mathematical truth does require a platonistic account, and that the epistemological arguments are compelling enough to reject such an account. For example, Field (1989) and Mary Leng (2007, 2010) both conclude, on the basis of these arguments, that there are no mathematical objects. Hence, they conclude that mathematical sentences that purport to refer to or quantify over such objects must be false. Note that universally quantified sentences are vacuously true on such fictionalist accounts; if there are no numbers, then it is vacuously true that every number has a successor.
There are a number of related epistemological arguments against mathematical platonism, and a wide range of attempts to address them. But if the semantic constraint really does require an account of mathematical truth that involves reference to or quantification over mathematical objects, as the arguments in section 2 suggest, and especially if it requires reference to platonistic mathematical objects, then there are real epistemological challenges for those who accept mathematical truth.
This section examines the second horn of the general dilemma, which finds a problem for accounts of mathematical truth that appear to satisfy the epistemological constraint.
Benacerraf uses the description “‘combinatorial’ views of the determinants of mathematical truth’’ for those accounts that he takes to fare well with respect to the epistemological constraint (Benacerraf 1973: 665). He also treats such accounts as largely motivated by epistemological concerns. But what are combinatorial accounts? Why are they supposed to fare well epistemologically? And why think they fail to satisfy the semantic constraint?
Benacerraf’s ‘combinatorial’ classification encompasses views from multiple distinct traditions in the philosophy of mathematics. He specifically discusses two different kinds of accounts of mathematical truth that qualify as combinatorial:
(a) accounts on which mathematical truth is a matter of formal derivability from axioms; and
(b) conventionalist accounts on which “the truths of logic and mathematics are true (or can be made true) in virtue of explicit conventions where the conventions in question are usually postulates of the theory” (p. 676).
Benacerraf also mentions “certain views of truth in arithmetic on which the Peano axioms are claimed to be “analytic” of the concept of number” (p. 665). Benacerraf does not develop such accounts any further; neither does this article`.
Paradigmatically, accounts of the first type (a) are formalist accounts. Benacerraf specifically identifies David Hilbert (1925) as a formalist of this stripe; Haskell B. Curry and Johann von Neumann seem to be too. (Note that formalist accounts of this sort need not adopt Hilbert’s heterogeneous semantics, discussed in section 2c.) On such formalist accounts, formalized axioms are stipulated and taken to give rise to a mathematical system. Here is how Benacerraf describes it:
The leading idea of combinatorial views is that of assigning truth values to arithmetic sentences on the basis of certain (usually proof-theoretic) syntactic facts about them. Often, truth is defined as (formal) derivability from certain axioms. (Frequently a more modest claim is made—the claim to truth-in-S, where S is the particular system in question.) (Benacerraf 1973: 665)
A formalist of this stripe might, for example, set out the axioms of Zermelo Fraenkel set theory (ZFC) as sentences in a symbolic language, and then stipulate ZFC to be a set-theoretic system. The axioms of ZFC would be taken to be “true by definition” (Curry 1964: 153.) The remaining set-theoretic truths—or the claims that are true-in-ZFC—would be syntactically derivable from the axioms of ZFC using the symbolic manipulations licensed by the inference rules of the specified logical system. The same formalist might equally accept ZF (ZFC minus the axiom of choice) to be a set-theoretic system, giving rise via derivations to sentences that are true-in-ZF. The formalist can accept multiple systems at once.
Some formalist accounts characterize mathematics as something of a game of symbol-manipulation. That is how von Neumann describes Hilbert’s view:
We must regard classical mathematics as a combinatorial game played with the primitive symbols, and we must determine in a finitary combinatorial way to which combinations of primitive symbols the construction methods or “proofs” lead. (von Neumann 1964: 51)
Typically, combinatorial accounts of this formalist stripe do not take the “primitive symbols” of mathematics—for example, “0” or “∈”—to be meaningful outside the mathematical game. Rather, the meanings of these symbols are implicitly defined by the axioms (and perhaps logical rules) of the system adopted. As a consequence, such accounts do not take the claims of mathematics to have meanings or truth-values outside of the specified system of axioms. This, together with a syntactic understanding of logic in terms of derivation rules, motivates the idea that mathematical truth is a matter of derivability from the axioms of the system.
Conventionalist accounts of type (b) were common in the mid-twentieth century, especially among logical positivists and Wittgensteinians. According to such views, mathematical sentences are true in virtue of linguistic convention. The main idea has much in common with formalist views of type (a). Certain basic sentences are set out as true by fiat, as “stipulated truths” or “truths by convention”, and the rest of the truths of the relevant branch of mathematics are taken to follow logically from them. Often, the sentences initially set out are axioms for some branch of mathematics, for example, the Peano Axioms for arithmetic or the axioms of ZFC for set theory. These axioms, which conventionalists often called ‘postulates’, are taken to serve as implicit definitions of the non-logical terms in the theory. On both formalism and conventionalism, the primitive terms or symbols in the relevant branch of mathematics are not meaningful until the axioms are set out to define them.
For example, according to a conventionalist, a convention can be formed to take the Peano Axioms as true. Those axioms are then true by convention, and they implicitly define arithmetical terms like “number” and “zero”. The Peano Axioms would then also be true in virtue of the meaning of the relevant arithmetical terms, because the convention that established the truth of those axioms also set out the conventional meanings of those terms. Alfred Jules Ayer captures this idea when he says about analytic sentences, among which he specifically includes mathematical truths, “they [analytic sentences] simply record our determination to use words in a certain fashion. We cannot deny them without infringing the conventions which are presupposed by our very denial, and so falling into self-contradiction” (1964: 299).
For the conventionalist about mathematical truth, denying, for example, one of the Peano Axioms would involve rejecting part of the conventional meaning of some of the relevant arithmetical terms, while also presupposing that same conventional meaning in order to make a meaningful statement using those terms.
There are some differences between these conventionalist and formalist accounts. One is that, while formalists of the early and mid-20th century were open to different stipulated axiomatic systems, they traditionally defended classical logic against the likes of intuitionists (who deny, for example, the law of excluded middle). But conventionalists thought of logic, like mathematics, as true by convention. Accordingly, conventionalists were not wedded to classical logic. They were free to adopt whatever logic they chose, provided that the relevant conditions for making something a convention were met—whatever those conditions might be.
The most significant difference between formalism and conventionalism is that formalist accounts are primarily concerned with symbols and their manipulations, while conventionalist accounts are primarily concerned with the linguistic meanings of terms. This difference matters because mathematical language can be used outside the context of pure mathematics. The conventionalist, but not the formalist, will typically think that mathematical terms should be used with the same conventional meaning in mathematics as in relevant scientific or other applied contexts; changing the mathematical conventions would require changing the use of those mathematical terms in such applications. This idea can be seen in Hector-Neri Casteñeda’s characterization of conventionalist Douglas Gasking’s (1964) view: “Professor Gasking has argued most persuasively for the view that mathematical propositions are like conventions or rules as to how we should describe what happens in the world” (1964: 405).
While the formalist need not ignore applications entirely, the basic formalist project does not require any coordination between mathematical systems and the world. Indeed, the formalist can equally accept multiple competing mathematical systems governed by different axioms, regardless of how well those systems serve in applications. The conventionalist typically is constrained to one system (though not always—Carnap (1947) might allow for different logical systems for different linguistic frameworks), and applications serve as pragmatic considerations in deciding which system that will be.
It is worth noting that the conventionalist thinks that these applications neither can confirm/disconfirm mathematical claims, nor provide any grounds for their truth. Again, mathematical sentences are true by convention. As Gasking put it, “I… say that 3×4=12 depends upon no fact about the world, other than some facts about usage of symbols” (1964: 400). But the conventionalist does think that other conventions are entirely possible. Again quoting Gasking, “we could use any mathematical rules we liked, and still get on perfectly well in the business of life” (1964: 397). Indeed, Gasking thinks that “we need never alter our mathematics,” because we can always modify our discussion of the world to fit our existing mathematics. But he also suggests that there are possible circumstances in which we might want to; there could be pragmatic reasons to change existing mathematical conventions, for example, to simplify particularly cumbersome applications in physics (Gasking 1964: 402-3). This is a typical conventionalist approach, on which we can form conventions to use whatever mathematics we like, but there may well be practical reasons to choose conventions that are convenient for everyday and scientific applications. This idea that we can choose which conventions (or frameworks) to adopt on the basis of pragmatic considerations is especially prominent in the conventionalist work of Rudolf Carnap (1946).
Together, these formalist and conventionalist accounts comprise a class of “combinatorial” views on which a mathematical claim is true in virtue of following logically (typically via syntactic derivation rules) from sentences that are stipulated or postulated as starting points or axioms.
Combinatorial views are well-placed to satisfy the epistemological constraint. In fact, Benacerraf repeatedly cites them as having “epistemological roots” or being “motivated by epistemological concerns” (1973: 668, 675). Such views appear to start with the idea that mathematical knowledge is acquired via proof, and then work backwards to an account of mathematical truth as the sort of thing that can be known in that way.
Combinatorial accounts appear to fare well epistemologically for two reasons. First, our knowledge of sentences that are stipulated or postulated is almost trivial. We know foundational mathematical truths independently of our knowledge or examination of any independent subject matter because we ourselves set them out as truths to define certain terms or symbols. They are human constructions. Second, if truth is identified with formal derivability, then in Benacerraf’s words, “We need only account for our ability to produce and survey formal proofs” to explain knowledge of non-foundational truths (Benacerraf 1973: 668). Even if mathematical truth is identified with the results of less formal logical derivation, explaining our knowledge of those truths simply becomes a matter of accounting for our ability to reason deductively. Mathematical truths are knowable on combinatorial accounts because mathematical truths just are the results of logical derivation from the stipulated or postulated starting points.
All this makes combinatorial accounts likely to mesh with a reasonable epistemology. That is, they are likely to satisfy the epistemological constraint. It seems plausible that any plausible epistemological account that accommodates our ability to know stipulated or postulated truths, and that accommodates our ability to reason deductively, will accommodate mathematical knowledge as well.
Despite all this, some objections have been raised to the epistemological adequacy of combinatorial accounts. Nutting (2013) argues that, for reasons having to do with nonstandard models, combinatorial accounts cannot explain our understanding of the structure of the natural numbers. Clarke-Doane (2022: 19, 34) claims both that proofs are themselves abstracta and hence no more epistemologically accessible than numbers, and also that combinatorial accounts cannot explain why mathematicians typically accept CON(ZF)—the sentence in Gödel coding that is often translated as “ZF is consistent”.
Although combinatorial accounts appear to satisfy the epistemological constraint, they also appear to fare poorly as accounts of mathematical truth. This will seem obvious if one is convinced by Benacerraf’s semantic arguments described in section 2c, and the idea that an account of mathematical truth must invoke reference, denotation, and satisfaction in order to parallel the semantics of the rest of language. Combinatorial accounts explain mathematical truth in terms of logical consequences from stipulated or postulated sentences; on such accounts, “truth is conspicuously not explained in terms of reference, denotation, or satisfaction” (Benacerraf 1973: 665). If Benacerraf is right that a Tarskian account of truth is required to satisfy the semantic constraint, then combinatorial accounts seem not to satisfy it.
But appeals to the semantic arguments provided in section 2 are not the only concerns that have been raised about the adequacy of combinatorial accounts as accounts of mathematical truth. Perhaps the most prominent concern about such views is specifically targeted at accounts, most notably formalist accounts, on which mathematical truth is a matter of syntactic derivability from stipulated axioms. This concern starts from the observation that, if the initial mathematical truths of such accounts are to be stipulated, they must be enumerable. But Gödel’s First Incompleteness Theorem shows that, if it is possible to enumerate the axioms of a formal system, then either (a) the formal system is not strong enough to characterize the basic arithmetic of the natural numbers, (b) there are statements in the language of the formal system that can neither be proved nor disproved in the system itself, or (c) it is possible to prove a contradiction in the system. Accordingly, formalist accounts, and other accounts on which mathematical truths follow from stipulated or postulated truths by syntactic derivation rules, inevitably suffer from at least one of three major problems: (a) they do not include the Peano Axioms governing arithmetic; (b) they leave some arithmetical claims indeterminate in truth-value because neither they nor their negations are syntactically derivable from the initially stipulated/postulated truths; or (c) they are inconsistent. Accordingly, Gödel’s result suggests that formalist and other combinatorial accounts that rely on syntactic derivation do not capture all the truths of arithmetic. And this problem is not restricted to arithmetic; similar concerns also arise for set theory.
Attempts have been made to circumvent the incompleteness problem. Carnap’s conventionalist account in The Logical Syntax of Language (1937) explains mathematical truth in terms of syntactic derivability from initial sentences that are postulated to be true by convention, and so seems like it might succumb to this Gödelian concern. But Gödel’s incompleteness theorems do not directly apply to Carnap’s view because Carnap expands the standard syntactic derivation rules of classical logic to include an omega rule:
A(0), A(1), A(2) … A(i), A(i+1), …
Gödel’s Incompleteness Theorems do not apply to systems that include the omega rule. However, a few problems remain for accounts that, like Carnap’s, include an omega rule. First, the omega rule cannot be stated without presupposing the structure of the natural numbers; the numbers need to be presupposed in order to be included among the premises. Second, because the omega rule requires infinitely many premises, it cannot be used in a finite proof. And third, incompleteness results akin to Gödel’s can be secured for systems, like Carnap’s, that include an omega rule (see Rosser 1937).
Regardless of whether derivability accounts could be extensionally adequate, Benacerraf argues that they are inadequate as accounts of truth. He argues that derivability, or “theoremhood” in a formal system, is at best a condition that guarantees truth; it is not an account of truth itself. To put it another way, there is a difference between derivability (which is akin to verification) and truth (or even satisfaction). A sentence is derivable in a system if it has a proof in that system; in contrast, a sentence is valid in the system if it is satisfied (or true) in all models of the system. The fact that derivability coincides with validity in many logical systems is a substantive result—we prove that these two distinct features coincide by proving soundness and completeness theorems for the relevant systems. But to prove that derivability and validity coincide, we need an account of the semantics of the system; we need an account of what makes it the case that a sentence is satisfied (or true) in a model of the system. The same is required if derivability is to coincide with truth; a substantive account of truth will also be required. In Benacerraf’s words, “any theory that proffers theoremhood as a condition of truth [must] also explain the connection between truth and theoremhood” (1973: 666). Combinatorial accounts that identify mathematical truth with derivability fail to explain this connection, and hence are inadequate as accounts of mathematical truth.
Certain stripes of conventionalists might avoid both the Gödelian Incompleteness problem and Benacerraf’s derivability-truth problem by taking a different approach to how additional true sentences logically follow from the initial postulates. A conventionalist need only claim that mathematical truth is to be explained in terms of being a logical consequence of the initial sentences that are postulated to be true by convention, where logical consequence is a semantic notion cashed out in terms of satisfaction in all models. A later iteration of Carnap, in Meaning and Necessity (1947), takes such an approach (though Carnap strictly speaks of holding in all state descriptions, rather than satisfaction in all models).
Benacerraf argues that such conventionalists encounter a different problem, albeit one that will also be a problem for formalists. The problem is that merely setting a convention does not guarantee truth; the fact that certain mathematical claims are true cannot simply consist in the fact that there is a convention of taking them as true. Here is how Benacerraf describes the problem:
[O]nce the logic is fixed, it becomes possible that the conventions thus stipulated turn out to be inconsistent. Hence it cannot be maintained that setting down conventions guarantees truth. But if it does not guarantee truth, what distinguishes those cases in which it provides for it from those in which it does not? Consistency cannot be the answer. To urge it as such is to misconstrue the significance of the fact that inconsistency is proof that truth has not been attained. (Benacerraf 1973: 678-9)
This problem mirrors the formalist’s problem. Proof and inconsistency are methods of demonstrating that mathematical claims are true, or that systems of postulates cannot be jointly true, respectively. In either case, the epistemological explanation of how we know or demonstrate that a sentence is true, or how we know or demonstrate that a collection of sentences cannot be jointly true, is not itself an explanation of the concept of truth that is to be explained. They confuse methods of discovery with the nature of what is discovered. The problem for both the formalist and the conventionalist is that their explanations of what makes mathematical claims true show no clear connections with any property that might be recognizable as truth.
So, there are accounts of mathematical truth that appear to fare well with respect to the epistemological constraint; they are combinatorial accounts. The concern about such accounts is that they tie mathematical truth too closely to mathematical proof. In tending too closely to the methods of demonstration or verification, such accounts lose track of the target phenomenon of truth that they are supposed to explain.
The mathematical truth-mathematical knowledge problem boils down to the fact that commitments to mathematical truth and commitments to mathematical knowledge stand and fall together, and that it is difficult to develop an account of mathematical truth that is amenable to both. It seems that accounts of mathematical truth that satisfy the semantic constraint and fare well as accounts of truth (as opposed to some other property) are platonistic accounts that face substantial intuitive epistemological problems. This is Benacerraf’s dilemma, the platonism-focused problem that has received most of the attention in the literature on the mathematical truth-mathematical knowledge problem. But it is not the whole of the problem. It also seems that accounts that are designed to fare well epistemologically are conventionalist or formalist accounts that rely on stipulation and derivation to undergird truth, and that these accounts intuitively fail to provide genuine accounts of truth.
Either way, proponents of mathematical truth face the challenge of developing an account of mathematical truth that satisfies both the semantic constraint and the epistemological constraint. Some philosophers attempt to take on this challenge, and to develop accounts of mathematical truth and mathematical knowledge that are compatible with each other. Others conclude that the challenge is so difficult as to be impossible. Rejecting both mathematical truth and mathematical knowledge, these philosophers tend to adopt mathematical fictionalism instead.
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Eileen S. Nutting
The University of Kansas
U. S. A.