Boethius (480-524)

Boethius was a prolific Roman scholar of the sixth century AD who played an important role in transmitting Greek science and philosophy to the medieval Latin world. His most influential work is The Consolation of Philosophy. Boethius left a deep mark in Christian theology and provided the basis for the development of mathematics, music, logic, and dialectic in medieval Latin schools. He devoted his life to political affairs as the first minister of the Ostrogothic regime of Theodoric in Italy while looking for Greek wisdom in devout translations, commentaries, and treatises.

During the twenty century, his academic modus operandi and his Christian faith have been a matter of renewed discussion. There are many reasons to believe his academic work was not a servile translation of Greek sources

The Contra Eutychen is the most original work by Boethius. It is original in its speculative solution and its methodology of using hypothetical and categorical logic in its analysis of terms, propositions, and arguments. The Consolation of Philosophy is also original, though many authors restrict it to his methodology and the way to dispose of the elements, but not the content, which would represent the Neoplatonic school of Iamblichus, Syrianus, and Proclus. Boethius was primarily inspired by Plato, Aristotle, and Pythagoras. His scientific, mathematical and logical works are not original, as he recognized.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Time
  3. Writings
    1. Literary Writings 
      1. The Consolation of Philosophy
    2. Theological Treatises
    3. Scientific Treatises
    4. Logical Writings
      1. Translations
      2. Commentaries
      3. Treatises
        1. On the Division
        2. On the Topics
        3. On the Hypothetical Syllogisms
      4. Treatises on Categorical Syllogisms
        1. The De Syllogismo Categorico
        2. The Introductio ad Syllogismos Categoricos
  4. Influence of the Treatises
  5. His Sources
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Life

Anicius Manlius Severinus Boethius (c. 480-524 AD), Boethius, was a prominent member of the gens Anicia, a family with strong presence in the republican and imperial Roman life. From the time of Constantine its members were converted and advocated for the doctrine of the Christian church of Rome. The study of Latin epigraphy (compare Martindale 1980, p. 232) and some biographical details about his childhood delivered by Boethius himself (Consolation of Philosophy ii, 3, 5) allow believing that his father was another Boethius, Narius Manlius Boethius, who was praetorian prefect, then prefect of Italy, and finally consul and patrician in 487 AD (compare Cameron 1981, pp. 181-183). It is not clear if this Boethius is the one who was the prefect of Alexandria in 457 AD, but Courcelle (1970, p. 299, n.1) suggested it so to give more weight to his hypothesis that Boethius could have used his social situation to go to Athens or Alexandria and learn Greek and deepen his study of philosophy and theology. What seems more likely is that Boethius’ grandfather was the same Boethius who was murdered by Valentinian III in 454 AD (compare Martindale 1980, p. 231).

After his father’s death, which occurred when Boethius was a child, he received the protection of Quintus Aurelius Symmachus Memmius, who belonged to a very influential family of the Roman nobility. Later, Boethius married Symmachus’s daughter, Rusticiana, sealing a family alliance that was disturbing to Theodoric, the Ostrogoth king, who was in Italy to impose authority and governance to the collapsed Western Empire by following the request of Flavius Zeno, the Eastern Roman Emperor. The political commitment of Boethius with Rome is attested not only by the public office of magister officiorum, the highest political rank that could be exercised in the reign of Theodoric, but also for the education and cursus honorum of his two sons, Symmachus and Boethius, who became senators (Consolation of Philosophy ii, 3,8; 4,7).

The prestige of Boethius in sixth-century Rome is attested not only by the honors granted him during his youth (some of which were denied to his older fellows, compare Consolation of Philosophy ii, 3), but also by the requests from friends and relatives to write commentaries and treatises to explain some difficult matters. In addition, Cassiodorus (Magnus Aurelius Cassiodorus), well known for founding in 529 AD the monastery of Vivarium, reports a scientific mission entrusted to him by Theodoric in terms of giving a horologium, a clock regulated by a measured flow of water, to the king of the Burgundians, Gundobad (compare. Variae I, 45 and I, 10. Mommsen ed. 1894).

2. Time

Theodoric must have been an ominous character for Romans, perhaps the lesser evil. The difficulties involved in moving from the pure ideal of Rome to Theodoric’s nascent eclectic culture must have been the context in which Boethius lived. By this time the unity of the Western Roman Empire was fragile, and the political power continuously disputed by various Germanic warlords, from Genseric the Vandal king, in 455 AD until Theodoric, the Ostrogoth king, in 526 AD.

It was Theodoric who organized a more stable government and attracted greater political unity among the leaders of the dominant two ethnic groups, the Roman and the Ostrogoth. In 493 Theodoric founded in Ravenna, northern Italy, the political and diplomatic capital of his government after defeating Odoacer there, as planned by the Emperor Flavius Zeno in Constantinople as a punishment for not respecting the authority of the host eastern Empire.

Theodoric brief reign (he died in 526, two years after Boethius) kept the administrative structure of the Roman Empire and sustained a joint government between the two main ethnic and political groups. Theodoric was not an entirely uneducated man (though see Excerpta Valesiana II, 79. Moreau ed. 1968) and would have had familiarity with Greek culture after staying in Constantinople, as hostage at the age of eight; it is known that, whatever his motivation was, he regularly respected the Roman civil institutions (but see the opinion of Anderson 1990, pp. 111-115). Boethius himself gave a panegyric to Theodoric during the ceremony in which Boethius’ two children were elected consuls (Consolation of Philosophy ii, 3, 30).

But the association of the two political powers, the military of Theodoric and the political of Rome, had many reasons to be adverse. By this time, Boethius must have been not only the most influential Roman politician in the Ostrogoth government but also the most distinguished public figure of the Roman class. The personal and political opposition was, after all, deep and irreconcilable. The Arianism of Theodoric and the Catholicism of Boethius clashed in 518, when Justin was appointed Roman emperor of the East. He abolished the Henoticon and embarked on a recovery policy of the Catholic faith of the Council of Chalcedon, and he began a plan to approach to Rome (Matthews 1981, p. 35). The most difficult years came as the elder Theodoric began to be worried about the destiny of his non-Catholic Eastern allies and concerned on his own stability in Italy. Around 524 AD, Boethius was accused of treason by Theodoric himself, without the right to be defended by the Roman Senate, which was also accused of treason (compare also Excerpta Valesiana II, 85-87. Mommsen ed. 1984). He was quickly imprisoned near Pavia, where he remained until being executed.

The detailed circumstances of the accusation have been not entirely clear to posterity, even if Boethius gives a summary of them in his Consolation of Philosophy i, 4. In essence, the charge was treason against the Ostrogoth government by seeking the alliance of Justin in Constantinople. The evidence for this charge includes Boethius’ intention of defending the senate of being involved in protecting the senator Albinus (who was accused of the same charge before), and the exhibition of some letters sent to Justin that contained expressions adverse to Theodoric and his regime. Boethius calls these letters apocryphal (Consolation of Philosophy i, 4). Probably Albinus was not in secret negotiations with the Eastern empire, and Boethius was innocent of wishing to defend the Senate of treason and concealment. However, he was accused and punished for his conspiracy, at the mercy of a violent despotic king who did not establish a proper defense or prove the charge against him. The execution of Boethius came quickly, and the manslaughter of his father-in-law, Symmachus, followed soon as well as the abuse and death of Pope John I. During his imprisonment, Boethius wrote his masterpiece The Consolation of Philosophy, which was not only a work of great influence in the Middle Ages and the Renaissance, but one of the most respected works of human creativity.

3. Writings

Boethius’ writings divide into three kinds: philosophical, theological, and scientific. The scientific writings are divided into mathematical and logical. The relationship between Boethius and his work remains complex. His completed works are traditionally conceived as original. The disorganized and incomplete shape of some of his works, especially his scientific treatises, is explained by his execution and death. However, many twentieth century scholars believe that this classical description only applies to his Theological treatises and partly to the Consolation of Philosophy, for Boethius depends on his sources more than an original work. However, this opinion is somehow a generalization of the situation that surrounded the scientific writings, and the truth is more in the middle.

a. Literary Writings

i. The Consolation of Philosophy

Boethius’ philosophical work is identified with his Consolatio Philosophiae, which combines stylistic refinement through the composition of prose and poetry with philosophical ideas within a conceptual framework based on a Neoplatonic interpretation of Aristotle with some subtle touches of Christian philosophy‑although this has been a matter of discussion. The unexpected visit of Lady Philosophy in his prison allows for a dialogue with a wonderful counterpoint between human opinion and the wisdom of Lady Philosophy, although Boethius says that Lady Philosophy is just the announcer of the light of truth (IV, 1, 5). The themes raised by The Consolation of Philosophy, such as the nature of fortune, human happiness, the existence of God and evil, human freedom and divine providence, became the focus of attention for Christian metaphysics of the Latin Middle Ages.

In Book I, Boethius briefly reviews his political life and the reasons for his accusation and imprisonment, showing that he is fully aware of those who accused him. In Book II, he discusses the nature of fortune and the reasons why no one should trust in it. In Book III he argues‑already in a different sense from what we might expect from the philosophy of Plato and Aristotle‑that true happiness (beatitudo) identifies with divinity itself, whose nature is unique and simple. He identifies the highest good (perfectus bonum) with the father of all things (III, 10, 43), and maintains that it is not possible to possess happiness without first having access to the highest good. The difference between his theory of happiness and that of Aristotle and Plato is that Boethius places God as a sine qua non condition for the possession of happiness, implying that every man must trust in divine wisdom and God’s provident wisdom to be happy. In Book IV, he addresses the issue of the existence of evil in the realm of one who knows and can do everything (IV, 1, 12: in regno scientis omnia potentis omnia). The allusion to the kingdom of God (regnum dei) is highly significant for proving its implicit Christianity mostly because he completes this allusion with the metaphor of the gold and clay vessels that the master of the house disposes since this symbol is found in the Letters of Saint Paul (Timothy 2,20; 2 Corinthians 4,7; and Romans 9, 21), and because it had an enormous Patristic citation. In Book V, Boethius examines one of the most complex problems of post-Aristotelian philosophy: the compatibility of human freedom and divine foreknowledge (divina praescientia). Boethius’ treatment will be of great theoretical value for later philosophy, and the remains of his discussion can be seen in Thomas Aquinas, Valla, and Leibniz (compare Correia (2002a), pp. 175-186).

Neoplatonic influence has been discerned in the Consolation, especially that of Proclus (412-485 AD), and Iamblichus. But this fact is not enough to affirm that Boethius in the Consolation only follows Neoplatonic authors. The issue is whether there is an implicitly Christian philosophy in this work. Furthermore, the absence of the name of Christ and Christian authors has led some scholars to believe that the Consolation is not a work of Christian philosophy, and Boethius’ Christianity was even doubted for this fact (compare Courcelle, 1967, p. 7-8). Added to this is the fact that, if Boethius was a Christian, he would seek consolation in the Christian faith rather than in pagan philosophy. However, it must be considered that the genre of philosophical consolation, in the form of logotherapy, was traditional in Greek philosophy. Crantor of Solos, Epicurus, Cicero, and Seneca had written consolations about the loss of life, exile, and other ills that affect the human spirit. Cicero in his Tusculan Disputations (3.76) even shows that the different philosophical schools were committed to the task of consoling the dejected and recognizes various strategies applied by the different schools as they conceived the place of human beings in the universe. Boethius was surely aware of this tradition (Cicero wrote his consolation for himself) and if we take this assumption for granted, Boethius’ Consolation of Philosophy would fit within the genre of consolation as a universal genre together with the themes of universal human grief (evil, destiny, fortune, unhappiness). At the same time, Boethius would be renovating this literary genre in a Christian literary genre, since Lady Philosophy does not convey Boethius’ spirit towards pagan philosophy in general, but rather to a new philosophy that should be called Christian. We see this not only in the evocations of Saint Paul’s letters and the new theory of happiness but also when, in Book V, Boethius identifies God with the efficient principle (de operante principio) capable of creating from nothing (V, 1, 24-29). Hence, he adapts Aristotle’s definition of chance by incorporating the role of divine providence (providentia) in disposing all things in time and place (locis temporibusque disponit: V, 1, 53-58).

b. Theological Treatises

The Opuscula sacra or Theological treatises are original efforts to resolve some theological controversies of his time, which were absorbed by Christological issues and by the Acacian schism (485-519). Basically, they are anti-heretical writings, where a refined set of Aristotelian concepts and reasoning are put in favor of the Chalcedonian formula on the unity of God and against both Nestorious’ dyophysitism and Eutyches’ monophysitism. Boethius claims to be seeking an explanation on these issues using Aristotle’s logic. This makes him a forerunner of those theologians trusting theological speculations in logic. The following five treatises are now accepted as original: (1) De Trinitate, (2) If the Father and the Son and the Holy Spirit are substantially predicated of divinity, (3) How the substances are good in virtue of their existence without being substantially good, (4) Treatise against Eutyches and Nestorius, and (5) De Fide Catholica. The most original and influential of Boethius’ theological treatises is the Contra Eutychen.

Because of the absence of explicit Christian doctrines in the Consolation of Philosophy, the authenticity of the theological treatises was doubted by some scholars in the early modern era. But Alfred Holder discovered a fragment of Cassiodorus in the manuscript of Reichenau, which later was published by H. Usener (1877), in which the existence of these treatises and their attribution to Boethius is reported. Cassiodorus served as senator with Boethius and succeeded him in the charge of Magister officiorum in Theodoric’s government. Cassiodorus mentions that Boethius wrote “a book on the Trinity, some chapters of dogmatic teaching, and a book against Nestorius” (compare Anecdoton Holderi, p. 4, 12-19. Usener ed. 1877). This discovery confirmed not only the authenticity of Boethius’ theological treatises, but also cleared the doubts over whether Boethius was a Christian or not. The Treatise against Eutyches and Nestorius has been admitted as the most original of Boethius’s theological treatises (Mair, 1981, p. 208). By the year 518 Boethius had translated, commented on, and treated a large part of Aristotle’s Organon (compare De Rijk’s chronology, 1964). Thus, Boethius makes use of Aristotelian logic as an instrument. In Contra Eutychen, he uses all the resources that are relevant to the subject in question: division and definition, hypothetical syllogisms, distinction of ambiguous meanings of terms, detection and resolution of fallacies involved. This is accompanied by the idea that human intelligence can store arguments against or in favor of a certain thesis to possess a copia argumentorum (a copy of arguments; p. 100, 126-130), suggesting that there can be several arguments to demonstrate the same point under discussion, which is a matter reminiscent of Aristotle’s Topics. Thus, Boethius gives a perfect order of exposition, rigorously declared at the beginning of the central discussion of the treatise: 1) Define nature and person, and distinguish these two concepts by means of a specific difference; 2) Know the extreme errors of the positions of Nestorius and Eutyches; 3) Know the middle path of the solution of Catholic faith. Boethius’s solution is the Catholic solution to theological problem of the two natures of Christ. According to his view, Christ is one person and two natures, the divine and the human, which are perfect and united without being confused. He is thus consubstantial with humanity and consubstantial with God.

c. Scientific Treatises

Within the scientific writings, we find mathematical and logical works. Boethius gives us scientific writings on arithmetic, geometry, and music; no work on astronomy has survived, but Cassiodorus (Variae I. 45, 4) attributed to him one on Ptolemy. Similarly, Cassiodorus attributes another on geometry with a translation of Euclid’s Elementa, but what we count as Boethius’ writing on geometry does not correspond to Cassiodorus’ description. His logical works are on demonstrative and inventive logic. A treatise on division (De divisione) has also credited to him (compare Magee 1998). But one on definition (De definitione) has been refuted as original and attributed to Marius Victorinus (Usener, 1877). Boethius devotes to logic three types of writings: translations, commentaries, and treatises.

Boethius uses the term quadrivium (De Institutione Arithmetica I, 1, 28) to refer to arithmetic, geometry, music, and astronomy, which reveals that he might be engaged not only in the development of these sciences, but also in the didactic of them. However, his works on logic do not reveal that this plan might also have covered the other disciplines of the trivium, grammar and rhetoric.

The scientific writings of Boethius occupied an important place in the education of Latin Christendom. The influence that these treatises had in the medieval quadrivium and even into early modern tradition is such that only Newton’s physics, Descartes’ analytical geometry, and Newton’s and Leibniz’s infinitesimal calculus were able to prevail in the Boethian scientific tradition.

It is known that the way Boethius approaches arithmetic and music is speculative and mathematical. Arithmetic is known as the science of numbers and does not necessarily include calculation. And music is a theoretical doctrine of proportion and harmony and has nothing directly to do with making music or musical performance techniques. In De Institutione musica I, 2, 20-23, Boethius makes a distinction of three types of music: cosmic (mundana), human (humana) and instrumental. He distinguishes them according to their universality. The mundana is the most universal, since it corresponds to celestial harmony and the order of stars: some stars rotate lower, others higher, but all form a set with each other. It is followed by human music, which is what we, as humans, experience and reproduce directly within ourselves. It is the song, the melodies that are created by poetry. It is responsible for our own harmony, especially the harmonious conjunction between the sensitive part and the intellectual part of our nature, just as the bass and treble voices articulate in musical consonance. The third is instrumental music, generated by tension of a string or by the breath of air or by percussion.

At the beginning of his De Institutione Musica (I, 10, 3-6), when following Nichomachus of Gerasa, Boethius adopts without criticism not only Pythagoras’ theory of music, but also the supernatural context in which Pythagoras announces the origin of music through a divine revelation given by the symmetric and proportional sounds coming from a blacksmith. The marked tendency of the Pythagorean theory of music impedes Boethius from making a richer report of music by including the more empirical approach by Aristoxenus, who is criticized by Boethius just as the Stoics are in logic.

d. Logical Writings

Boethius has three kinds of works on logic: translations, commentaries, and treatises. Their content revolves mainly around Aristotle’s logical writings: Categories, De Interpretatione, Prior Analytics, Posterior Analytics, Topics and Sophistical Refutations, traditionally called the Organon. But even if Boethius wanted to devote works on each one, he did not complete the task.

i. Translations

As a translator, Boethius has a consummate artistry. His translations are literal and systematic. They do not lack the force of the Greek, and they never spoil the style of Latin. Its literal translation method has been compared to that developed later by William of Moerbeke (who translated some works of Aristotle and other Greek commentators) for their use and study of Thomas Aquinas. Boethius’ translations from Greek are so systematic that scholars often can determine what the Greek term behind the Latin word is. Boethius’ translations are edited in Aristoteles Latinus (1961-1975). Translations on every work by Aristotle’s Organon have been found. In addition to these works, Boethius translated the Isagoge of Porphyry, which is an introduction (Eisagogé is the Greek term for ‘introduction’) to Aristotle’s Categories.

In these translations, Boethius exceeded the art of Marius Victorinus, who had earlier translated into Latin Aristotle’s Categories and De Interpretatione, and Porphyry’s Isagoge. Boethius himself attributed certain errors and confusions in Marius Victorinus and informs us that Vetius Praetextatus’ translation of Aristotle’s Prior Analytics, rather than being a translation of Aristotle’s text, is a paraphrase of the paraphrase made by Themistius on this Aristotelian work (compare Boethius in Int 2, p. 3; Meiser ed. 1877-1880). The translation of Greek works into Latin was common. Apuleius of Madaura, a Latin writer of 2 AD., born and settled in North Africa, had translated the arithmetic of Nicomachus of Gerasa and wrote an abridgement of Aristotelian logic. In general, we can say that Boethius saw very clearly the importance of systematic translations into Latin of Greek philosophy and science as an educational service to the nascent European Latin Christianity.

ii. Commentaries

Even if Boethius planned to comment on the complete Organon, he finished only the following:

    • On Porphyry’s Isagoge (In Porphyry Isagogen, two editions).
    • On Aristotle’s Categories (In Aristotelis Categorias, two editions).
    • On Aristotle’s De Interpretatione (In Aristotelis Peri hermeneias, two editions).
    • On the Topics of Cicero (In Ciceronis Topica, one edition).

Though no commentary on Posterior Analytics, Topics or Sophistical Refutations exist, this does not suggest that Boethius was unaware of them. In his Introductio ad syllogismos categoricos (p. 48, 2), when Boethius deals with singular propositions, he seems to follow some explanations closely related to a commentary on Sophistical Refutations. Even if his plan of performing a double commentary on every work is not original, he explained this modus operandi. The first edition contains everything which is simple to understand, and the second edition focuses on everything which is more subtle and requires deeper, longer explanation.

The influence of these commentaries on medieval education was enormous, as they contain key concepts that became central to both the logica vetus and medieval philosophy. In fact, his comments on Porphyry’s Isagoge contain the so-called problem of universals (Brandt 1906 ed.p. 24, 159), and his comments on De Intepretatione give the linguistic and semantic basis of the long tradition of logical analysis of medieval thinkers until Peter Abelard. Additionally, his comments on Cicero’s Topics were influential in the history of logic and sciences by dividing logic into the demonstrative and the dialectic branches, underlining the distinction between Aristotle’s Analytics and Topics.

Many times, Boethius’ commentaries are given through long explanations, but they contain valuable information on the history of logic as they build upon many doctrines on earlier commentators of Aristotle. The commentary on Aristotle’s logic had a long Greek tradition, and Boethius knew to select those commentators and doctrines that improve Aristotle’s text. In that tradition, the earlier author played an important role over the latter. However, there is important evidence that Boethius is not following any continuous copy of any of the earlier Greek commentators.

iii. Treatises

Boethius not only translated and commented on the works of Aristotle and Porphyry, but he wrote some monographs or logical treatises that are different from his commentaries, for they are not intended to provide the correct interpretation of Aristotle’s text, but to improve the theory itself. If we leave aside the De definitione, five treatises are recognized:

    • On Division (De divisione liber)
    • On Categorical syllogism (De syllogismo categorico)
    • Introduction to categorical syllogisms (Introductio ad syllogismos categoricos)
    • On Topical Differences (De Topicis differentiis)
    • On hypothetical syllogisms (De hypotheticis syllogismis).
1. On the Division

Boethius’ De divisione transmitted the Aristotelian doctrine of division, that is, the doctrine that divides a genus into subordinate species. The aim of division is to define (compare Magee 1998). For example:


In Aristotle’s works there are examples of divisions (for example, Politics 1290b21, De generatione et corruptione 330a1), which proves that Boethius accepted this definition method regardless of the fact that its origin was Platonic. The logical procedure was also appreciated by the first Peripatetics, and the proof is that, as Boethius reports at the beginning of this treatise, Andronicus of Rhodes published a book on the division, because of its considerable interest to Peripatetic philosophy (De divisione 875D; compare also Magee 1998, pp. xxxiv-xliii). Also, the Neoplatonic philosopher Plotinus studied Andronicus’ book and Porphyry adapted its contents for commenting on Plato’s Sophist (De divisione 876D). The species of division that were recounted by Boethius are that any division is either secundum se or secundum accidens. The first has three branches: (i) a genus into species (for example, animal is divided into rational and non-rational); (ii) the whole into its parts (for example, the parts of a house); and (iii) a term into its own meanings (for example, ‘dog’ means quadruped capable of barking, a star in Orion and an aquatic animal). The division secundum accidens is also triple: (i) a subject into its accidents (for example, a man into black, white and an intermediate color); (ii) accidents into a subject (for example, among the things that are seeking, some belong to the soul and some belong to body); finally, (iii) the accidents into accidents (for example, among white things some are liquid some are solid).

It is worth noting that not all the genus-species divisions are dichotomous, as it was with Platonists, because Peripatetic philosophers also accepted that a genus can be divided into three species or more, since the general condition of a division to be correct is that it must never have less than two species and never infinite species (De divisione 877C-D). As it seems, this is one of the differences between Aristotle and the Platonists. In fact, Aristotle criticizes the Platonists’ dependence on dichotomous divisions by arguing that if all divisions were dichotomous, then the number of animal species would be odd or a multiple of two (Aristotle, Parts of Animals I, 3, 643a16-24).

2. On the Topics

Boethius’ idea of logic is complex and in no way reduces only to formal demonstration. When he refers to logic as such (compare In Isagogen 138,4-143,7; De Top Diff 1173C.; and In Ciceronis topica I 2.6-8), he distinguishes between demonstrative and dialectical syllogism and criticizes the Stoics for leaving out the dialectical part of logic and maintaining a narrower idea of it. In fact, Boethius does not reduce logic to demonstration, but he divides logic into two parts: judgement and the discovery of arguments. Since he identifies the former to Analytics and the later to Topics, the division applies to reconcile these two main procedures of logic. Logic is both a demonstration and a justification of reasonable premises, as the syllogism can manage necessary or possible matters.

In Ciceronis Topica Boethius is commenting on Cicero’s Topics. The objective of this work is to adopt Ciceronian forensic cases and explain them within his understanding of Peripatetic tradition of Aristotle’s Topics. Boethius’ notion of topic is based on what seems to be the Theophrastean notion, which is a universal proposition, primitive and indemonstrable, and in and of itself known (Stump, 1988, pp. 210-211). A topic is true if demonstrated through human experience, and its function is to serve as a premise within the argument sought. The topic may be within or outside argumentation. One example in the treatise (1185C) appears to be autobiographic: the question of whether to be ruled by a king is better than by a consul. According to Boethius, one should argue thus: the rule of a king lasts longer than the government maintained by a consul. If we assume that both governments are good, it must be said that a good that lasts longer is better than one that takes less time. Consequently, to be ruled by a king is better than being governed by a consul. This argument clearly shows the topic or precept: goods that last longer are more valuable than those that last a shorter time. Within the argument it works as an indemonstrable proposition. Boethius often calls them a maximal proposition (propositio maxima).

Boethius called dialectic the discipline studying this type of argumentation. The syllogism can be categorical or hypothetical, but it will be dialectic if the matter in its premises is only credible and non-demonstrative. In De Top Diff 1180C, Boethius introduces a general classification of arguments in which demonstrative arguments can be non-evident to human opinion and nevertheless demonstratively true. In fact, our science has innumerable non-evident affirmations that are entirely demonstrable. On the other hand, dialectical arguments are evident to human opinion, but they could lack demonstration.

Boethius devotes the entire Book 5 of this commentary to discussing dialectical hypothetical syllogisms and here, as in his treatise on hypothetical syllogisms, the role of belief (fides) is quite important in defining dialectical arguments in general, as it will be more explained in the following section.

3. On the Hypothetical Syllogisms

The De hypothetico syllogismo (DHS), perhaps originally titled by Boethius De hypotheticis syllogismis, as Brandt (1903, p. 38) has suggested, was published in Venice in 1492 (1st ed.) and 1499 (2nd ed.). This double edition was the basis for the editions of Basel (1546 and 1570) and the subsequent publication of J.P. Migne in Patrologia Latina, vols. 63 and 64 (1st ed., 1847) and (2nd ed. 1860), which appears to be a reprint of the Basel edition. The editions of 1492 and 1499 form the editio princeps, which has been used regularly for the study of this work to the critical revision of the text by Obertello (1969). DHS is the most original and complete treatise of all those written in the antiquity on hypothetical logic that have survived. It was not systematically studied during medieval times, but it had a renaissance in the twentieth century, through the works of Dürr (1951), Maroth (1979), Obertello (1969), and others.

According to the conjecture of Brandt (1903, p. 38), it was written by Boethius between 523 and 510, but De Rijk (1964, p. 159) maintains that it was written between 516 and 522. In DHS Boethius does not follow any Aristotle’s text but rather Peripatetic doctrines. This is because Aristotle wrote nothing about hypothetical syllogisms, although he was aware of the difference between categorical and hypothetical propositions. Thus, De Interpretatione 17a15-16 defines that “A single-statement-making sentence is either one that reveals a single thing or one that is single in virtue of a connective” (Ackrill’s translation, 1963), and later (17a20-22) he adds, “Of these the one is a simple statement, affirming or denying something of something, the other is compounded of simple statements and is a kind of composite sentence” (Ackrill’s translation, 1963). Even if Aristotle promised to explain how categorical and hypothetical syllogisms are related to each other (compare Prior Analytics 45b19-20 and 50a39-b1), he never did.

Aristotle only developed  a syllogistic logic with simple or categorical propositions, that is, propositions saying something of something (e.g., “Virtue is good”). The syllogism with conditional premises (for example, “The man is happy, if he is wise”) was covered by the first associates of Aristotle, Theophrastus and Eudemus (DHS I, 1,3). Boethius’ DHS contains the most complete information about this Peripatetic development. The theory is divided into two parts: disjunctive and connective propositions. A conditional connection is like “If P, then Q”, where P and Q are simple propositions. A disjunctive proposition is instanced as “Either P or Q”. Boethius presents two indemonstrable syllogisms to each part. The first disjunctive syllogism: ‘It is P or it is Q. But, it is not P. Therefore, it is Q.’ And the second: ‘It is P or it is Q. But, it is not Q. Therefore, it is P.’ As to connectives, the first syllogism is “If it is P, then it is Q. But it is P. Then, it is Q”. And the second is “If it is P, then it is Q. But it is not Q. Then, it is not P”.  Boethius accepts that ‘It is P or it is Q’ is equivalent to ‘If it is not P, then it is Q. Accordingly, Boethius leaves implicit the concordance between hypothetical and disjunctive syllogisms:

First disjunctive syll. First hypothetical syll.   Second disjunctive syll. Second hypothetical syll.
It is P or it is Q

It is not P

Therefore, it is Q.

If it is not P, it is Q

It is not P

Therefore, it is Q.

It is P or it is Q

It is not Q

Therefore, it is P.

It is not P, it is Q

It is not Q

Therefore, it is P.

The theory also develops more complex syllogisms and classifies them in modes. For example, DHS II, 11, 7, says correctly that: “The eighth mode is what forms this proposition: “If it is not a, it is not b; and if it is not b, it is not c; but it is c; therefore, it must be a”.

Boethius’ development does not use conjunctions, and this must be an important difference between the Stoic theory and the Peripatetic original development. This fact makes Boethius deny the hypothetical affirmation “If it is P, then it is Q” by attaching the negative particle to the consequent. Thus ‘If it is P, then it is not Q’ (DHS I, 9,7). This is an internal negation, instead of Stoic negation, which is external or propositional, since applies the negative particle to the entire proposition. This explains why he does not consider Stoic axioms based on conjunction in DHS, which he did in his In Ciceronis Topica, V.

The question of whether Boethius is right in believing that the theory comes from Theophrastus and other Peripatetics is still difficult to answer. Speca (2001, p. 71) raises the doubt that we cannot presently be certain of its Peripatetic provenance, because the sources cannot go further back than the end of II century AD, and by then the hypothetical theory was already terminologically conflated with Stoic terminology. He is right, if we look at Boethius’ examples like ‘It is day, then it is light’, and so forth, which are from the Stoic school. On the other hand, Bobzien (2002 and 2002a) has supported the contrary view, and she is inclined to belief in the historical view of Boethius’ account.

The scrupulous view of Speca (2001) is methodologically safe, but it is worth noticing that there are at least three important differences between Boethius’ hypothetical syllogistic logic and Stoic logic. One is negation: Peripatetic hypothetical negation follows the argumentative line of categorical negation; the negative particle must be posed before the most important part of the proposition, and that is the consequent in the case of a conditional proposition. Thus, as said, the negation of “If P, then Q” will be “If P, then  not Q”. Stoic negation poses the negative particle before the entire proposition. And thus, the negation will be “It is not the case that if P, then Q”.

The second difference is that Boethius, in his DHS, distinguishes material and formal conclusions just as he does in his treatises on categorical logic (compare DHS I, iv, 1-2; 3; and I, ii, 1-7; II, ii, 7). In a hypothetical syllogism, to affirm the consequent is fallacious, but if the terms mutually exclude (as if they had an impossible matter) and the third hypothetical mood is given (“If it is not P, it is Q”), there will be a syllogism. Boethius gives the example “If it is not day, it is night. It is night. Therefore, it is not day”. But the conclusion does not obtain if ‘white’ and ‘black’ are correspondingly proposed by P and Q. Thus, a syllogism, either categorical or hypothetical, is logically valid if it does not depend on a specific matter of proposition to be conclusive. On the contrary, material syllogisms, either categorical or hypothetical, are valid under certain matters within a certain form, as they are not logical conclusions, for they are not valid universally or in every propositional matter. Accordingly, Boethius (DHS II, iv, 2) distinguishes between the nature of the relation (natura complexionis) and the nature of the terms (natura terminorum).

The third difference lies in the function Boethius puts on fides, belief (DHS I, 2,4; I, 2,5;  II, 1,2). The role of fides is the crucial core of Boethius’ DHS. According to him, if someone argues through the first indemonstrable, or by any other hypothetical syllogism, he needs to confirm the minor premise, which is a belief. It is not the syllogism as such which is in doubt, but its conclusion, which is conditioned to the truth of the categorical proposition. Boethius’ reason is the originality and primitiveness of categorical syllogisms. He calls categorical syllogisms ‘simple’ and hypothetical syllogisms ‘non-simple’, because the latter resolves into the former (DHS I, 2,4. Non simplices vero dicuntur quoniam ex simplicibus constant, atque in eosdem ultimos resolvuntur). The role of belief in Boethius’ theory of hypothetical syllogisms is also emphasized in his ICT and, if Stump (1988, pp. 210-1) is right, in recognizing the activity of Theophrastus behind Boethius’ theory of Aristotle’s Topics, then Theophrastus and the activity of the first Peripatetics could be well behind DHS.

iv. Treatises on Categorical Syllogisms

The De syllogismo categorico (DSC) and Introductio ad syllogismos categoricos (ISC) ​​are two treatises on categorical syllogisms composed by the young Boethius. Their contents are similar and almost parallel, which have raised various explanations during the early twenty-first century. They have greatly influenced the teaching of logic in medieval Western thought, especially the former which is the only one that contains syllogistic logic.

1. The De Syllogismo Categorico

DSC was written by Boethius early in his life, perhaps around 505 or 506 AD (for the chronology of Boethius works in logic, compare De Rijk 1964). Despite its importance, it did not received a critical edition until the work by Thörnqvist Thomsen (2008a). In the oldest codices (for example, Orleans 267, p. 57), DSC is entitled “Introductio in syllogi cathegoricos”, but this title changed to De syllogismo categorico after the editions by Martianus Rota (Venice, 1543) and Henrichus Loritus Glareanus (Basel, 1546). The edition of Migne (1891) is based on these two editions of the sixteenth century. During the twentieth century, most scholars have corrected this title to De categoricis syllogismis, after Brandt (1903, p. 238, n. 4), argued for using the plural.

The sources of DSC seem to be a certain introduction to categorical syllogistic logic that Porphyry had written to examine and approve the syllogistic theory of Theophrastus, whose principles are inspired by Aristotle’s Prior Analytics. This seems to be suggested from what Boethius says at the end of this work (p. 101, 6-8): “When composing this on the introduction to the categorical syllogism as fully as the brevity of an introductory work would allow, I have followed Aristotle as my principal source and borrowed from Theophrastus and Porphyry occasionally” (Thomsen Thörnqvist transl.). The existence of a similar work by Theophrastus is confirmed by various ancient references; for example, Boethius attributes to him the work “On the affirmation and negation” (in Int 2, 9, 25; Meiser ed.; also Alexander of Aphrodisias in An Pr 367, 15 and so forth), and Alexander of Aphrodisias cites profusely Theophrastus’ own Prior Analytics (in An Pr 123, 19 and 388, 18; Wallies ed. On the works by Theophrastus, see Bochenski 1947 and Sharples 1992, p. 114-123). Moreover, J. Bidez, in the life and works of Porphyry (compare Bidez 1923, p. 198, and Bidez 1964, p. 66*) confirms the existence of a written work entitled “Introduction to categorical syllogisms” written by Porphyry.

DSC is divided into two books. In the first, Boethius reviews the theory of simple propositions, in a way that recalls his commentaries on Aristotle’s De Interpretatione (ed. Meiser 1877-1880). However, DSC exceeds both the commentaries and what Aristotle teaches in his De Interpretatione. In fact, it includes some extra matters: (i) the law of subalternation when reviewing the logical relationships of the Square of oppositions; (ii) a broader explanation on conversion by containing conversion in contraposition (which Aristotle only developed for universal affirmative propositions); (iii) conversion by accident for universal negative propositions (which Aristotle did not include); and (iv) the division of simple propositions.

The second book is a synopsis of the central part of Aristotle’s theory of syllogism (Prior Analytics I, 2-8) plus Theophrastus’ doctrine of indirect syllogistic moods. Theophrastus added five indirect moods to Aristotle’s four moods. Medieval logicians knew these moods through the technical names: Baralipton, Celantes, Dabitis, Fapesmo, and Frisesomorum. Moreover, the second book of DSC (69, 8-72, 11) contains a complete explanation of the definition of syllogism, which recalls Alexander of Aphrodisias’ teaching in his commentary on Aristotle’s Topics. Again, DSC is more technical and elaborated than Aristotle’s Prior Analytics. In addition, Boethius’ explanation on reducing the imperfect moods of the second and third syllogistic figures to the first four modes of the first figure (Barbara, Celarent, Darii and Ferio) suggests a more systematic way than Aristotle’s own explanations.

A careful reading of the logical contents of DSC also makes clear that Boethius (DSC 17, 10) is following a division of categorical propositions to define the three main logical operations of Aristotelian logic: the opposition of propositions (contradiction, contrariety, and subcontrariety); the conversion of propositions (simple, by accident, and by contraposition); and syllogisms, with its figures, syllogistic moods, and the main extensions of first figure. This division is not Boethius’. Already Alexander of Aphrodisias (In An Pr 45,9) gives a complete use of it. There are remnants in Apuleius (PeriH 7, 9-14, p. 183) and Galen (Inst Log, 6,3), and it reappears in Boethius’ time in Ammonius (In An Pr 35.26) and Philoponus (In An Pr 40.31). It is also present in later authors.

Boethius, after commenting on the definitions of the elements of simple propositions (name, verb, indefinite name and verb, and phrase) takes a pair of propositions and divides them into categorical propositions as follows: a pair of simple propositions can or cannot have terms in common. If they do not have any term in common, then they do not have any logical relation. But if they have some terms in common, there is an alternative: either both terms are in common or some term in common. If both terms are in common, they can or cannot have the same order. When they have same order, the theory of Opposition is stated. If both terms change their order, the theory of Conversion is defined. On the other hand, if the pair has only one term in common, the syllogistic theory will appear.

2. The Introductio ad Syllogismos Categoricos

Boethius is the author of DSC and ISC, two treatises on categorical logic. They have a notorious similarity, and they look parallel to some extent. This opens the question of why Boethius wrote two. The first modern explanation proposed a strong dependence between them. Prantl (1855, I, p. 682, n.80) believed that the first book of DSC was an excerpt of ISC. But the presence of syllogistic logic in the second book of DSC and its total absence in ISC is enough to contradict Prantl’s explanation. Brandt (1903, p. 245) was right in refuting him. However, the reason why the treatises are so alike each other had not been found at all. Murari (1905) and McKinlay (1907) have suggested that the second book of DSC (dedicated to syllogistic logic) was originally the second book of ISC, while the first book of DSC was not by Boethius, but it was attached later to the codices in the middle age. According to McKinlay’s later revision of his hypothesis (1938, p. 218), ISC must be identified to Boethius’s Institutio categorica, thought to be lost, and mentioned by Boethius in his treatise On Hypothetical Syllogism (833B).

McKinlay’s hypothesis has lost support due to later works by De Rijk (1964, p. 39) and Magee (1998, p. xvii-xix). In the early twenty-first century, in her critical edition of both treatises, Christina Thomsen Thörnqvist (2008a and 2008b) has given a new explanation. She thinks (2008a, p. xxxix) that ISC is a review of the first book of DSC and that Boethius was intending to give a review of DSC’s two books, but this original plan was not completed (compare Thomsen Thörnqvist), for while Boethius was writing the first book, he realized that he had gone too far in what was supposed to be nothing more than an introduction to Aristotle’s syllogistic logic. In this conjecture she follows Marenbon (2003, p. 49).

In any case, ISC is different from DSC not only because of its absence of syllogistic logic. ISC (15.2) incorporates the notion of strict and non-strict definitions of the elements of the categorical proposition (name, verb, and so on). It incorporates with high interest proofs based on the matters of proposition (29.18). And it has a high consideration of singular propositions by including material that was not in his commentaries (48.2). Additionally, ISC contains a crucial difference: the logic of indefinite propositions. It states their opposition (51.9), their equivalence (62.9), and it develops with more detail conversion by contraposition (69.1).

The divisions of DSC and ISC

ISC cannot be the breviarium Boethius promised to write in his second commentary on Aristotle’s De Interpretatione (in Int 2, p. 251, 8-9). However, Shiel (1958, p. 238) thinks the contrary. The only reason is that ISC contains more than Boethius’ commentaries on De Interpretatione.  The essence of ISC must come from its division.

After developing the linguistic section of Aristotle’s De Interpretatione, both ISC and DSC present their plans through the establishment of a division of a pair of categorical propositions. These divisions contain identical branches, but they also contain important differences. On the one hand, the division of ISC is not as complete as that of DSC, because it does not incorporate the theory of syllogism, but it is more specific than that of DSC by incorporating indefinite terms, on which DSC says nothing. The following description shows how both divisions overlap one another, and what the differences between them are:

On the one hand, if ISC were the first book of DSC, then the indefinite propositions (which only ISC develops) would not take any part of the second book of DSC (which is only on syllogisms). Accordingly, their introduction would be purposeless. On the other hand, if the plan of ISC were a review of DSC’s two books, then Boethius was obliged to develop a theory of syllogisms with indefinite premises, which is unlikely since ISC’s division does not contain syllogistic logic (despite ISC’s being an introduction to syllogistic). But even if one thinks that this could have been so, there are several doubts concerning the logical capacity to do so in Boethius’ sources, even though the issue was not unknown. Boethius indeed recounts (in Int 2, 12-26, p. 316) that Plato and others made ​​conclusive syllogisms with negative premises, which is not allowed by Aristotle in his Prior Analytics (I, 4.41b7-9). According to Boethius, it is possible because Plato in Theaetetus (186e3-4) knew that sometimes a negative categorical proposition can be replaced with the correspondent affirmation with indefinite predicate terms. Boethius (in Int 2, 9, p. 317) cites Alexander of Aphrodisias as one the ancient authors in dealing with syllogisms with indefinite premise, which is certain because Alexander, in his commentary on Aristotle’s Prior Analytics, quotes another syllogism of this sort (in An Pr 397, 5-14). Even Aristotle’s De caelo (269b29-31) has another example. However, this does not seem sufficient to believe that Boethius in his ISC was able to introduce a theory of syllogistic logic with indefinite premises. (To this point, compare I. M. Bochenski (1948), pp. 35-37; and Thomas (1949), pp. 145-160; also, Álvarez & Correia (2012), pp. 297-306. Compare also Correia (2001), pp. 161-174.).

4. Influence of the Treatises

DSC and ISC were taken together and never considered separate. There are no signs that both treatises were studied by the medieval logicians and philosophers before the eleventh century (compare Van de Vyver, 1929, pp. 425-452).

The first text where the influence of their teaching is clear is the twelve century Anonymus Abbreviatio Montana. The other is the Dialectic by Peter Abelard. We know this not only because the name of Boethius is cited as the main source, but also because the division of propositions we have seen above is accepted and maintained by Abelard and the anonymous author of the Abbreviatio.

Later on, the authority of these treatises is more evident. In the fourteenth century, Peter of Spain’s Summulae logicales adopted the indirect moods of the first figure—the doctrine of the matters of proposition (which can be traced in the history of logic as far back as Alexander of Aphrodisias and Apuleius)—and he follows Boethius in the idea that is originally found in Aristotle of reducing the imperfect moods of the second and third syllogistic figures to the first four perfect moods of the first figure.

5. His Sources

The Contra Eutychen is the most original work by Boethius. It is original in its speculative solution and its methodology of using hypothetical and categorical logic in his analysis of terms, propositions, and arguments. The Consolation of Philosophy is also original, though many authors restrict it to his methodology and the way to dispose of the elements, but not the content, which would represent the Neoplatonic school of Iamblichus, Syrianus, and Proclus. As to his inspiring figures, Boethius gives his most respectful words to Plato and Aristotle, but the figure of Pythagoras is also venerated in De Institutione musica (DIM I, 10-20).

As to his scientific writings, his mathematical and logical works are not original, and Boethius recognizes it. When dealing with these scientific matters, Boethius relies on specific Greek sources: in mathematical disciplines, he follows the middle-Platonist Nicomachus of Gerasa (compare Bower, C., 1978, p. 5). However, not everything comes from him (Barbera, A. 1991. pp. 1-3 and 48-49). In his De Institutione musica (IV, 1-2), he follows with some changes (Barbera, ibid., pp. 38-60) to the Sectio Canonis, attributed to Euclides; and, in developing books V, and part of IV, he uses C. Ptolemy’s Harmonicas (compare DIM V, 4, 25; V, 5, 5; V, 8, 13; V, 11, 1; V, 14, 21, V, 18, 24 et al.; also, Redondo Reyes, 2002, p. cxv).

As to Aristotelian logic, he recognizes agreement with the certainty of the Peripatetic doctrines reviewed by the Neoplatonist Porphyry (compare Boethius in Int 2, 24-27, p. 17. Meiser ed., 1877-1880), but it is also true that not everything comes from him, for Boethius also names Syrianus, Proclus’s master.

As to the sources of his logical works, though far from being resolved, there is a basic agreement with refusing the hypothesis proposed by Pierre Courcelle (1969, p. 28) that they are dependent on the work of Ammonius Hermias in Alexandria. This same rebuttal attacks the widespread belief (from Courcelle too) that Boethius studied Greek in Alexandria. Indeed, Courcelle followed Bidez (1923, pp. 189-201), who some years before had shown that Boethius’ logical commentaries (not the treatises) owed almost everything to Porphyry. But Courcelle (1969) made a valuable observation about this: Boethius also refers to Syrianus, the teacher of Proclus, who taught later than Porphyry. Accordingly, Courcelle proposed that the occurrence of post-Porphyrian authors was due to Boethius’ reliance on the school of Ammonius in Alexandria, as Boethius’ logical works were written between 500 and 524, and by this time the school of Athens had fallen into decline after the death of Proclus in 485. On the other hand, Alexandria, where Ammonius taught from this date, had flourished as the center of philological, philosophical, and medical studies. Courcelle showed several parallels in the texts, but these, as he also saw, implied only a common source. However, he proposed that, in a passage of the second commentary on Aristotle’s De Interpretatione (in Int 2, 9, p. 361), the corrupt phrase sicut audivimus docet should be amended as follows: sicut Ammonius docet. Courcelle knew that the absence of the name of Ammonius in Boethius’ writings was the main objection of his hypothesis, but this emendation made it very convincing. He refused, therefore, the emendation that Meiser had done earlier in 1880, in the critical edition of Boethius’s commentaries on De Interpretatione (compare Praefatio, iv). Indeed, before Courcelle, Meiser had proposed emending Eudemus to read: sicut Eudemus docet. Subsequent studies showed that the emendation of Meiser was correct because the doctrine in question was given by Eudemus.

The focus of Courcelle, however, was to place the problem of the sources of Boethius’s logical writings into the correct focus. That is why Shiel (1958, pp. 217-244) offered a new explanation to this status quaestionis: he proposed that Boethius managed all his material, either pre- or post-Porphyrian, from a Greek codex of Aristotle’s Organon, having glosses and marginal notes from which he translated all the comments and explanations. This singular hypothesis has seduced many scholars and has even been generalized as Boethius’ general modus operandi. Shiel’s hypothesis is plausible in some respects when applied to the works on logic, but it seems to have many problems when applied to other kinds of writing. Many scholars have accepted the existence of this manuscript in Boethius’s hands by his verbatim allusions (for example, in Int 2 20-3 p. 250), although not all have accepted Shiel’s conclusions, which remove all originality to Boethius, when presenting him only as a mechanical translator of these Greek glosses. And even though Shiel always referred to Boethius’ works on logic, it is easy to generalize the servile attitude in his scientific material to his other works, but the poems or the philosophical synthesis of the Consolation or the logical analysis of Contra Eutychen have no parallel in earlier sources and are by themselves evidence of a lucid thinker.

According to Shiel (1990), Boethius’s logic comes from a copy of the commentary of Porphyry that was used in the school of Proclus in Athens. This copy was a codex containing Aristotle’s Organon with margins strongly annotated with comments and explanations. Magee has shown the difficulty to accepting the existence of this kind of codex before the ninth century AD (Magee, 1998, Introduction). On the other hand, some scholars find that Shiel’s hypothesis does not accurately apply to all the logical writings of Boethius, as Stump (1974, p. 73-93) has argued in his defense of the comments on the Topics. Moreover, the absence of Proclus’s name in Boethius’ works on logic, even when Proclus made important contribution to logic as in the case of the Canon of Proclus (compare Correia, 2002, pp. 71-84), raises new doubts about the accuracy of the formula given by Shiel.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Ackrill, J.L., 1963. Aristotle’s Categories and De Interpretatione. Translation with notes.  Oxford 1963: Oxford University Press.
  • Alvarez, E. & Correia, M. 2012. “Syllogistic with indefinite terms”. History and Philosophy of Logic, 33, 4, pp. 297-306.
  • Anderson, P. 1990. Transiciones de la antigüedad al feudalismo, Madrid: Siglo XXI.
  • Barbera, A. 1991. The Euclidean division of the Canon. Greek and Latin sources. Lincoln: The University of Nebraska Press, pp. 1-3, y 48-49.
  • Bidez, J. 1923. “Boèce et Porphyre”, en Revue Belge de Philologie et d’Histoire, 2 (1923), pp. 189-201.
  • Bidez, J. 1964. Vie de Porphyre. Le philosophe néoplatonicien, Hildesheim: G. Olms.
  • Bidez, J. 1984. Boethius und Porphyrios, en Boethius, M. Fuhrmann und J. Gruber (eds.). Wege der Forschung, Band 483, Darmstadt, pp. 133-145.
  • Bobzien, S. 2002. “The development of Modus Ponens in Antiquity: from Aristotle to the 2nd century AD. Phronesis vol. 47, 4, pp. 359-394.
  • Bobzien, S. 2002a. “A Greek Parallel to Boethius’ De Hypotheticis Syllogismis”, Mnemosyne 55 (2002a), pp. 285-300.
  • Bochenski, I.M. 1947. La logique de Théophraste, 2nd ed., Fribourg: Libraire de L’Université.
  • Bochenski, I.M. 1948. “On the categorical syllogism”, en Dominican Studies, vol. I, 1, pp. 35-37.
  • Bower, C., 1978. “Boethius and Nicomachus: An essay concerning the sources of De Institutione Musica”, Vivarium, 6, 1, pp. 1-45-
  • Brandt, S. 1903. “Entstehungszeit und zeitliche Folge der Werke von Boethius”, en Philologus, 62, pp. 234-275.
  • Cameron, A. 1981. “Boethius’ father’s name”, en Zeitschrifts für Papyrologie und Epigraph, 44, 1981, pp. 181-183.
  • Chadwick, H. 1981. “Introduction”, en Gibson (1981), pp. 1-12.
  • Correia, M. 2002a. “Libertad humana y presciencia divina en Boecio”, Teología y Vida, XLIII (2002), pp. 175-186
  • Correia, M. 2001. “Boethius on syllogisms with negative premisses”, en Ancient Philosophy 21, pp. 161-174.
  • Correia, M. 2009. “The syllogistic theory of Boethius”, en Ancient Philosophy 29, pp. 391-405.
  • Correia, M. 2002. “El Canon de Proclo y la idea de lógica en Aristóteles”. Méthexis 15, pp. 71-84.
  • Courcelle, P. 1967. La Consolation de Philosophie dans la tradition littéraire. Antécédent et Postérité de Boèce. Etudes Augustiniennes. Paris: Editions du Centre National de la Recherche Scientifique. C.N.R.S.
  • Courcelle, P. 1969. Late Latin Writers and their Sources, Harvard University Press, Cambridge/Massachusetts (see: Les Lettres Grecques en Occident de Macrobe à Cassiodore, 2nd. Ed., París, 1948).
  • De Rijk, L. 1964. On the chronology of Boethius’ works on logic (I and II), en Vivarium, vol. 2, parts 1 & 2, pp. 1-49 and 122-162.
  • Devereux, D. & Pellegrin, P. 1990. Biologie, logique et métaphysique chez Aristote, D. Devereux et P. Pellegrin (eds.). Paris: Editions du Centre National de la Recherche Scientifique. C.N.R.S.
  • Dürr, K. 1951. The propositional logic of Boethius. Amsterdam: North Holland Publishing. (Reprinted in 1980 by Greenwood Press, USA).
  • Friedlein, G. 1867. Anicii Manlii Torquati Severini Boetii De Institutione Arithmetica libri duo. De Institutione Musica libri quinque. Accedit Geometria quae fertur Boetii. G. Friedlein (ed.). Leipzig: Teubner.
  • Fuhrmann, M. & Gruber, J. 1984. Boethius. M. Fuhrmann y J. Gruber (eds.). Wege der Forschung, Band 483, Darmstadt.
  • Gibson, M. 1981. Boethius, his life, thought and influence. Gibson, M. (ed.). Oxford: Blacwell.
  • Isaac, I. 1953. Le Peri Hermeneias en Occident de Boèce à Saint Thomas. Histoire littéraire d’un traité d’Aristote, París.
  • Kaylor, N.H. & Phillips, P.E. 2012. A Companion to Boethius in the Middle Ages. Kaylor, N.H. & Phillips, P.E (eds.). Leiden/Boston : Brill.
  • Kretzmann, N. 1982. “Syncategoremata, exponibilia, sophismata”. The Cambridge History of Later Medieval Philosophy, pp. 211-214. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Lloyd, G.E.R. 1990. “Aristotle’s Zoology and his Metaphysics: the status quaestionis. A critical review of some recent theories”, en Devereux & Pellegrin (1990), pp. 8-35.
  • Lukasiewicz, J. 1951. Aristotle’s Syllogistic. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Magee, J. 1998. Anicii Manlii Severini Boethii De divisione liber. Critical edition, translation, prolegomena and commentary. Leiden/Boston/Koln: Brill.
  • Mair, J. 1981. “The text of the Opuscula Sacra”, pp. 206-213. In Gibson, M. (1981).
  • Marenbon, J. 2003. Boethius. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Marenbon, J. 2009. The Cambridge Companion to Boethius. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Maroth, M. 1979. “Die hypothetischen Syllogismen”, en Acta Antigua 27 (1979), pp. 407-436.
  • Martindale, J. R. 1980. The prosopography of the Later Roman Empire: A.D. 395-527. Cambridge 1980: Cambridge University Press.
  • Matthews, J., 1981. Boethius. His life, thought and influence, en M. Gibson (ed.), Oxford.
  • McKinlay, A. P. 1907. “Stylistic tests and the chronology of the works of Boethius”, en Harvard Studies in Classical Philology, XVIII, pp. 123-156.
  • McKinlay, A.P. 1938. “The De syllogismis categoricis and Introductio ad syllogismos categoricos of Boethius”, en Classical and Mediaeval Studies in honor of E. K. Rand, pp. 209-219.
  • Meiser, C. 1877-1880. Anicii Manlii Severini Boetii Commentarii in Librum Aristotelis PERI ERMHNEIAS. Prima et secunda editio. C. Meiser (ed.), Leipzig.
  • Migne, J.-P. 1891. De Syllogismo Categorico, en Patrologia Latina, 64, vol. 2, J.-P. Migne (ed.), París.
  • Migne, J.-P. 1981. Introductio ad Syllogismos Categoricos, en Patrologia Latina, 64, vol. 2, J.-P. Migne (ed.), París.
  • Minio Paluello, L. 1972. Opuscula. The Latin Aristotle, Amsterdam: A. Hakkert. Eds.
  • Minio-Paluello, L. 1965. Aristoteles Latinus, II, 1-2, L. Minio-Paluello (ed.), París: Desclée de Brouwer.
  • Mommsen, Th. 1894. Cassiodori Senatoris Variae, Monumenta Germaniae Historica, Auctorum Antiquissimorum Tomus XII, Mommsen, Th. (ed.), Berlin: Weidmann.
  • Moreau, J. & Velkov, V. 1968. Excerpta Valesiana. Moreau, J and Velkov, V. (eds.), Leipzig, Academia Scientiarum Germanica Berolinensis: Teubner.
  • Murari, R. 1905. Dante e Boezio, Contributo allo studio delle fonti Dantesche. Bologna: Nicola Zanichelli.
  • Mynors, R.A.B. 1963. Cassiodori Senatori Institutiones, R.A.B. Mynors (Ed.), Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Nuchelmans, G. 1973. Theories of the Proposition, Leiden 1973: North Holland.
  • Obertello, L.A.M. 1969. Severino Boezio De hypotheticis syllogismis. Testo, traduzione e commento. Brescia: Paideia Editrice.
  • Prantl, C., 1855. Geschichte der Logik im Abendlande, Leipzig, 1855-1870: G. Olms.
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Author Information

Manuel Correia
Pontifical Catholic University of Chile