Giordano Bruno (1548—1600)
Giordano Bruno was an Italian philosopher of the later Renaissance whose writings encompassed the ongoing traditions, intentions, and achievements of his times and transmitted them into early modernity. Taking up the medieval practice of the art of memory and of formal logic, he focused on the creativity of the human mind. Bruno criticized and transformed a traditional Aristotelian theory of nature and helped revive atomism. His advocacy of Copernicanism and the claim that there is an infinite number of worlds was innovative. In metaphysics, he elevated the concepts of matter and form to absolutes so that God and creation coincide. Bruno also advocated for a version of pantheism, and he probed the powers that shape and develop reality, including occult forces that traditionally belong to the discipline of magic. Most of his theories were made obsolete in detail with the rise of early modern empiricism; nevertheless, modern rationalism, which explored the relation between mind and world, and the modern critique of dogmatic theology were both influenced by Bruno’s philosophy.
Bruno was born in 1548 in southern Italy. He was educated in Naples, first by free-lance teachers, then at the Dominican convent of San Domenico Maggiore. After giving early indications of a provocative and critical attitude to Church teachings, he started the life of a migrant scholar that led him to Switzerland, France, England, and Germany. Throughout his travels, he continually tried to secure a position at a university, and he was frequently supported by monarchs and princes. While in Padua he was denounced a heretic by his host, a Venetian patrician, and he was interrogated by the Inquisition, first in Venice. In Rome, he was burned as an unrepentant heretic in 1600.
Bruno’s death at the will of the Catholic Church was immediately perceived as emblematic for the freedom of thought against dogmatic intolerance; this was especially due to an eyewitness report from the stake that spread via Protestant circles. John Toland, a freethinker himself, made Bruno a hero of anti-Christian propaganda. Bruno probably influenced Baruch Spinoza in his alleged pantheism, if not his atheism. As such, Bruno aroused the interest of defenders and critics of pantheism in the 18th and 19th centuries, until he was rediscovered as a critical thinker in his own right, one who broke with medieval traditions and paved the way to modern idealism.
Table of Contents
- Life and Works
- Major Philosophical Themes
- References and Further Reading
Bruno was born in February 1548 in the historic town of Nola, a cultural center in Campania, Southern Italy (about 25 km northeast of Naples). The following summary of his life aims at introducing philosophical themes as they developed throughout his career. Most details of his early life are known through Bruno’s depositions at the Inquisition trial (Firpo 1993; Mercati 1988; Spampanato 2000; Canone 1992; 2000). He was given the name Filippo. His father Giovanni Bruno was in military service, and his mother was Fraulisa Savolino. Bruno began his education in his home town of Nola, and at age 15 he went to Naples where he studied with private and public teachers. One of them was Giovanni Vincenzo Colle, known as Il Sarnese (d. 1574); another known teacher was Theophilus Vairanus, a friar of the order of the Augustinians who later taught at an Augustinian school in Florence and became a professor at the University of Rome. He died in Palermo in 1578. Colle might have introduced the student to Averroism, as he defended the philosophy of Averroes, according to Hieronymus Balduinus (Destructio destructionum dictorum Balduini, Naples 1554). Vairanus probably taught the young student Augustinian and Platonic approaches to wisdom and might have inspired him to name some interlocutors in his Italian dialogues Teofilo.
At this early stage, Bruno also started studying the art of memory by reading Peter of Ravenna’s book Foenix, which likens the art of memory to the combination of paper and letters: images are ‘placed’ on an ideal chart so that the memorized content can be recalled in a quasi-mechanical way. Likely to finance his further education, Bruno entered the convent of the Dominicans in Naples, San Domenico Maggiore, a center of the order, where Thomas Aquinas once had resided, and which was an early stronghold of Thomism. Bruno acquired the name Giordano, which he maintained, with few exceptions, for the rest of his career in spite of his conflicts with the Church. After being consecrated a priest and enrolling in the study of theology, in 1575 Bruno concluded his studies with two theses that confirm the scholastic/Thomist character of the curriculum: “It is all true what Thomas Aquinas teaches in the Summa contra Gentiles” and “It is all true what the Magister Sententiarum says [Peter Lombard in his Sentences]”. Early during his novitiate, Bruno raised suspicion for giving away images of saints, specifically one of St. Catherine of Siena and perhaps one of St. Antonino, while maintaining only a crucifix. Around the same time, he scolded a fellow novice for reading a pious book in praise of the Virgin Mary. In view of his later productions, this incident can be read as indicating Bruno’s critique of the cult of saints, which makes him appear friendly with Protestantism. The accusation, however, was soon dropped. Nevertheless, about ten years later, in 1576, a formal process was opened returning to the earlier incident and adding new accusations regarding the authority of the Church Fathers, and the possession of books by Chrysostom and Gerome that included commentaries by Erasmus of Rotterdam, which were prohibited. This amounted to his excommunication. As a student in Naples, Bruno might have learned of Erasmus through a group of local heretics, the Valdensians, who adhered to the teachings of Juan de Valdes (d. 1541), who questioned the Christian doctrine of the Trinity. Bruno argued with another friar about scholastic argumentation and the possibility to express theological themes in other forms of argumentation. He adduced Arius as an example (an ancient heretic who denied the dual nature of Jesus as man and God), and the resulting investigation touched upon the essentials of Catholic theology. Bruno traveled to Rome, probably defending his case at the Dominican convent Santa Maria sopra Minerva (the center of the Inquisition and in charge of approving or prohibiting books), and then left the Dominican convent, thus starting his career as a wandering scholar.
Bruno traveled northern Italy (Genoa, Turin, Savona, and other places) and allegedly published a book De’ segni de’ tempi (Signs of the times) in Venice, which is lost and might have dealt with astronomy and meteorology in Italian; for he reported to have taught, around that time, lectures on the popular textbook of astronomy, Sphaera, by the 13th-century author Johannes de Sacrobosco. In 1579 Bruno arrived in Geneva, the preferred destination of religious refugees albeit a fortress of Calvinism. After working at a printing press, Bruno enrolled at the university and published a pamphlet against Antoine de la Faye, then professor of philosophy and, as a protégé of Theodore Beza, an eminent theologian and the successor to John Calvin. The content of the pamphlet is unknown, but as the result of a formal trial, Bruno was excommunicated from the Reformed Church and had to apologize. He left Geneva and moved to Toulouse, where he stayed from 1579 through 1581, again teaching the Sphaera and also on the soul according to Aristotle. In Toulouse, Bruno also met the Portuguese philosopher Francisco Sanchez (died 1623) who dedicated to Bruno his new book Quod nihil scitur (Nothing is known). The book is a manifesto of modern skepticism that upends traditional, scholastic reliance on logical argument. Bruno shared his critique of scholastic Aristotelian logic but trusted the potency of the human intellect; therefore, he despised Sanchez, a sentiment which is confirmed by a note in his copy, where he calls him a “wild ass.” France was troubled with interconfessional struggles, Huguenots (Reformed) against Catholics; when these tensions broke out, Bruno had to leave Toulouse and moved to Paris, where he hoped to impress King Henry III.
In Paris in 1582, Bruno published and dedicated to the King two of his first works, which treated in his peculiar way the art of memory that seems to have been of interest to the monarch. De umbris idearum (The shadows of ideas) is a theory of mind and reality, the annexed Ars memoriae (Art of memory) applies that to the construction of mental contents; at the same time Bruno dedicated to Henri d’Angoulême the Cantus Circaeus (Circe’s chant), Circe being a mythological figure that elicits humanity from animalistic appearance and, again, practices memory. In political terms, the philosopher opted with these dedications for the Catholic faction. The King had been interested in the theory of memory and offered the guest a provisional lectureship. Also in Paris, Bruno published a comedy Il candelaio (Chandler). With letters from the French King Bruno came to the embassy of Michel de Castelnau in London, where he stayed, close to the court of Queen Elizabeth, from 1583 through 1585.
England was in a complex political situation, given the tensions between the Protestant Queen Elizabeth of England and the Catholic King Philip II of Spain, each of whom was having to deal with religious dissension in their respective kingdoms; and, France mediated there. Bruno, who was not the only Italian dwelling in England at the time, befriended courtiers and intellectuals like Philip Sidney and John Florio and, vying for recognition and stability in London, produced six of his works in the Italian language (as it was fashionable at the court) commonly called the Italian Dialogues, the best known of his literary and philosophical legacy. Nevertheless, when a Polish diplomat, Albert Laski, was sent to Oxford to visit the university, Bruno joined him with the intent to find an academic position. He debated and gave lectures on various topics but eventually was ridiculed and accused of plagiarism. He thus left Oxford and returned to London, before heading to Paris when Castelnau was recalled to France.
In Paris, Bruno befriended Fabrizio Mordente and first promoted then chastised his geometrical work; this was the first time Bruno entered the field of mathematics. His interest was directed towards the ontological truth and practical application of geometry that he was to discuss in his works on physics and epistemology. He also published a summary of Aristotle’s Physics according to mnemotechnical principles (Figuratio physici auditus), thus showcasing his competence in scholastic philosophy. At the Collège de Cambrai, the institution for teachers sponsored by the King, Bruno arranged a public disputation in May 1586. As was customary at the time, a student of Bruno’s presented a number of the teacher’s theses, which were directed against Aristotle. These were at the same time printed and dedicated to King Henry III as Centum et viginti articuli de natura et mundo adversus Peripateticos (One hundred and twenty theses on nature and the world, against the Aristotelians) and reprinted in 1588 as Camoeracensis acrotismus (Cambrai lecture). The debate became tumultuous, Bruno left the lecture hall immediately and was next seen in Germany at the Calvinist University of Marburg.
Still in 1586, Bruno started as a private lecturer at Wittenberg University, the center of Lutheran education, where, among others, Philip Melanchthon had taught. The lectures covered mostly Aristotelian philosophy, some of them were published in the 19th century based on transcripts by a student. Bruno also publishes several works that apply the Lullian method to principles of research under the heading lampas (lamp) and composes a major work Lampas triginta statuarum (Torch of thirty statues), a cosmology according to Lullism and art of memory, in which every part of reality is scrutinized by thirty categories.
In 1588, Bruno leaves Wittenberg, on account of the rising influence of Calvinists. He delivered a programmatic “Farewell Lecture” (Oratio valedictoria) and subsequently sought a position in Prague, where Rudolf II of Habsburg entertained a court of scholars and scientists, among whom were later the astronomers Tycho Brahe (d. 1601) and Johannes Kepler (d. 1630). In Prague, Bruno publishes a Lullian study and dedicates to the Emperor a critique of mathematics (Articuli adversus mathematicos) without professional success. He next moved on to Helmstedt, again a Lutheran university, where he stays from January 1589 through mid-1590. Here, Bruno garnered a third excommunication, because the Lutheran pastor appears to have detected some heresy (Omodeo 2011) in his thought. While in Helmstedt, Bruno worked on his trilogy, soon to be published in Frankfurt, and on several works that dealt with occult sciences and magic.
In 1590 Bruno traveled to Frankfurt where he published a trilogy of poems in hexameter (on the model of Lucretius) with prose commentaries that encompass his philosophy: De minimo, on the infinitely small, De monade, a theory of monads that are both metaphysical and physical minimal parts or atoms, and De immenso, the theory of the infinity of magnitude and innumerous worlds. From Frankfurt, Bruno traveled for a short time to Zurich, where he delivered lectures on the principles of metaphysics, which were later published as a compendium of metaphysical terms (Summa terminorum metaphysicorum). While in Frankfurt, Bruno received letters from a patrician in Venice, Giovanni Mocenigo, inviting him to give private lectures on the art of memory. Soon after he arrived in Venice in 1591, Bruno proceeded to the Venetian university in Padua to lecture on geometry hoping to find a permanent academic position. This attempt failed (Galileo Galilei later obtained that position) and he returned to Venice. His sponsor Mocenigo, however, was dissatisfied with Bruno’s service (most likely, he expected some magical practice) and denounced him in May 1592 to the Inquisition as a heretic. In early 1593, Bruno was transferred to the Inquisition in Rome where interrogations and investigations continued. His books were censured for heretical content. Among others, the accusations regard the eternity of creation, the equivalence of divine and created powers, the transmigration of the human soul, the soul as the form of the human body, the motion of the earth in relation to the teaching of the Bible, and the multitude of worlds. Pope Clement VIII ordered not to use torture as the case of heresy was proven, and Cardinal Robert Bellarmine, the author of a history of heresies (De controversiis, 1581-1593), presented a list of eight heretical propositions the defendant had to recant. Only two of the propositions are known: one questioning the sacrament of reconciliation, the other the theory of the soul as the helmsman of the body. Both tenets challenge the Christian doctrine of the individual soul and its afterlife. Bruno was declared a heretic, formally “unrepentant, pertinacious, and obstinate”, and thus delivered to the authorities who burned him at the stake on Campo de’Fiori in Rome on 17 February 1600.
The standard editions of Bruno’s works are the 19th-century collection of his Latin writings initiated by Francesco Fiorentino (Bruno 1962) and the Italian dialogues edited by Giovanni Gentile and Giovanni Aquilecchia (Bruno 1958). These texts are also available online (see References below). Besides many separate text editions, there is a collection of Latin works in progress, commented with Italian translations, under the direction of Michele Ciliberto (Bruno 2000a; 2001; 2009; 2012). Bilingual editions with extensive commentaries of the Italian works were published with French translation under the direction of Giovanni Aquilecchia (Bruno 1993-2003) and with German translation under the direction of Thomas Leinkauf (Bruno 2007-2019).
Bruno’s works have unusual but meaningful titles. They are listed here in chronological order of publication or – for works published posthumously – of composition. No original manuscripts are extant. The list will help readers find them as they are mentioned in the following text.
- De umbris idearum (The shadows of ideas) 1582
- Cantus Circaeus ad memoriae praxim ordinatus (Circe’s chant applied to the practice of memory) 1582
- De compendiosa architectura et complemento artis Lullii (Comprehensive construction and complement to the art of Lull) 1582
- Candelaio (Chandler) 1582
- Ars reminiscendi (Art of memory; reprint of dialogue II of Cantus Circaeus) 1583
- Explicatio triginta sigillorum et Sigilli sigillorum (Unfolding of the 30 sigils and the sigil of sigils) 1583
- London dialogues in Italian:
- La cena de le ceneri (The Ash Wednesday supper) 1584
- De la causa, principio e uno (Cause, principle, and one) 1584
- De l’infinito, universo e mondi (The infinite, universe, and worlds) 1584
- Spaccio de la bestia trionfante (Expulsion of the triumphant beast) 1584
- Cabala del cavallo Pegaseo con l’aggiunta dell’Asino Cillenico
(Cabal of the Pegasus horse with the ass of Cyllene) 1585
- De gli eroici furori (Heroic frenzies) 1585
- Figuratio aristotelici physci auditus (Arrangement of the Physics of Aristotle) 1586
- Dialogi duo de Fabricii Mordentis Salernitani prope divina adinventione (Two dialogues on Fabrizio Mordente’s almost divine invention) 1586
- Dialogi. Idiota triumphans. De somnii interpretatione. Mordentius. De Mordentii circino (Dialogues: The triumphant idiot; Interpretation of a dream; Mordente; Mordente’s compass) 1586
- Centum et viginti articuli de natura et mundo adversus Peripateticos (One hundred and twenty theses on nature and world, against the Aristotelians) 1586
- De lampade combinatoria lulliana (Torch of Lullian combinatorics) 1587
- De progressu et lampade venatoria logicorum (Procedure and searching torch of logicians) 1587
- Artificium perorandi (The art of persuasion) 1587
- Animadversiones circa lampadem lullianam (Advice regarding the Lullian torch) 1587
- Lampas triginta statuarum (Torch of thirty statues) 1587
- Oratio valedictoria (Farewell speech) 1588
- Camoeracensis Acrotismus seu rationes articulorum physicorum adversus Peripateticos (Cambrai lecture, or arguments for the theses in physics against the Aristotelians) 1588
- De specierum scrutinio et lampade combinatoria Raymundi Lullii (Investigation of species and Lullian combinatory torch) 1588
- Articuli centum et sexaginta adversus huius tempestatis mathematicos atque philosophos (One hundred and sixty theses against mathematicians and philosophers of our times) 1588
- Libri physicorum Aristotelis explanati (Aristotle’s Physics explained) 1588
- Oratio consolatoria (Funeral speech) 1589
- De rerum principiis, elementis et causis (Principles, elements, and causes of things) 1589-1590
- De magia (Magic) 1589-1590
- De magia mathematica (Mathematical magic) 1589-1590
- Medicina lulliana (Lullian medicine) 1590
- Frankfurt Trilogy
- De triplici minimo et mensura (The threefold minimum and measure) 1591
- De monade, numero et figura (Monad, number, and shape) 1591
- De innumerabilibus, immenso et infigurabili (The innumerable, immense, and shapeless) 1591
- De imaginum, signorum et idearum compositione (The composition of images, signs, and ideas) 1591
- Summa terminorum metaphysicorum (Compendium of metaphysical terms) 1591
- Theses de magia (Theses on magic) 1591
- De vinculis in genere (Bonds in general) 1591
- Praelectiones geometricae (Lectures in geometry) 1591
- Ars deformationum (Art of geometrical forms) 1591
Giordano Bruno’s philosophical production spanned only ten years. One is therefore not likely to detect major phases or turns in his development. While it is certainly possible to differentiate certain subdisciplines of philosophy in his work (epistemology, physics, metaphysics, mathematics, natural theology, politics), what is typical of his many writings is that almost all themes are present in all the treatises, dialogues, and poems. Therefore, it is feasible to outline his theories with some works, in which one aspect is prevalent, provided we remain aware of the interconnection with the rest.
Bruno entered the professional stage with his De umbris idearum (The Shadows of Ideas), which contains his lectures on mnemotechnic introduced by a dialogue between Hermes and a philosopher that explains its underlying philosophy. Hermes Trismegistus was a legendary Egyptian sage, the alleged source of Plato and of others, whose spurious writings became fashionable in the Renaissance for seemingly reconciling Christian with pagan wisdom. Bruno was one of the promotors of Hermeticism. The book explains the purpose of mnemotechnic or art of memory. Throughout history, memory was not only a subjective experience of remembering things but a specific faculty of the human mind that can be trained and directed. Memory consists in creating an internal writing that represents ideas as though the internal cognition were the shadow of the absolute ideas. Ideas are only worth pursuing if they are real. Bruno endorses strains of the Neoplatonic tradition, according to which the Platonic Forms are not more real than the visible world but equally present in that world. In that vein, Bruno explains the metaphor of shadow as not made of darkness (as one would think) but as being the vestige of light and, vice versa, the trace of reality in the ideal. Shadow is open for light and makes light accessible. Consequently, while human understanding is only possible by way of ‘shadows,’ that is, wavering between truth and falsehood, every knowledge is apt to be either deformed or improved towards the good and true. In an analogy from physics: in the same way as matter is always informed by some form, form can take on various kinds of matter, and in this sense, the intellect, including memory, can be informed by any knowledge. If it is true that whatever is known is known by way of ideas, then any knowledge is known by the mediation of something else. This mediation is the task of the art of memory. Bruno elaborates on these principles in repeated sequences of thirty chapters, headed as ‘intentions’ and ‘concepts’, which reiterate the pattern that everything is, in a way, a shadow of everything else. Based upon the universal and unbreakable concordance of things (horizontally and across layers), memory does nothing other than connect contents that on the surface are distinct. To make this approach plausible, Bruno invokes the ancient and Renaissance Platonists, as well as Kabbalah, which have in common to see any one thing as referencing everything else and truth as such. One example, borrowed from Nicholas of Cusa, is a rectangular line erected upon a basis: when the line inclines towards the basis, it not only makes the angle acute, it creates at the same time an obtuse angle so that both imply each other mutually, and in that sense the different is equal. In arguing this way, Bruno expressly abandons the traditional philosophical standards of determination and classification of the Aristotelian school; he dismisses them as ‘merely logical’ while postulating and claiming to construe a harmonious unity and plurality, which is at the same time correct as to concepts and controls reality.
All this gives a philosophical explanation of the technique of memorizing that had dominated Bruno’s reputation throughout his career from his early lectures up to his invitation to Venice. Memory is the constructive power of the soul inherited from the life-giving principle of the world, and thus it orders, understands, and senses reality. Artifice and nature coincide in their mutual principles; the internal forces and the external perception correlate. Traditional mnemotechnic construed concentric wheels with letters of the alphabet, which represented images and contents; such wheels provided means to memorize contents quasi mechanically. Bruno also endorses this technique with the philosophical argument that such technique applies this universal harmony in diversity, which structures the world, and recreates its intelligibility. The psychological experience of memorizing content consists of concepts, triggers, passive and active evocation of images, and ways of judgment. This art of memory claims that it conforms with both metaphysical truth and the creative power of the mind. At the same time, on the concentric circles are tokens that actualize the conversion of anything intended into anything, because, as stated, imagination is not plainly abstract but vivid and alive. Creating schemata (‘figuring out’) for memorization is an art and yet not artificial in the negative sense; it is the practical execution or performance of reality. Here is an example from De umbris idearum: Suppose we need to memorize the word numeratore (numberer), we take from the concentric wheels the pairs NU ME RA TO RE. Each pair is represented by an image, and together they form a sentence: NU=bee, ME=on a carpet, RA=miserable, and so on. This produces a memorizable statement describing an image: ‘A bee weaves a carpet, dressed in rags, feet in chains; in the background a woman holding out her hands, astride a hydra with many heads.’ (Bruno 1991, LXV). This appears farfetched, but less so if we consider that, with any single change of one of the pairs, we arrive at a different statement yet supported by the same imagined picture. Such a picture, though artificial, allows for a smooth transition from concept to concept; and such concepts capture the complexity of reality.
Without making any claims in this direction, Bruno practices what today is called semiotics, namely, the discipline that approaches understanding reality from the perspective of designating and intellectually processing. That is clear from the title of his last book on memory, De imaginum, signorum et idearum compositione (The composition of images, signs, and ideas). Although this discipline deals with signification and its methods, it still relies on depicting reality as though it were ‘digesting’ it. A key concept in Bruno’s epistemology and metaphysics of memory is conversion (convertere, conversio). The purposefully arranged images that support remembrance are effective because one sign must be converted into a referent, and images convert according to schemata into new images or signs and representations. This is exercised in all of Bruno’s mnemotechnic works. Such transformations might appear arbitrary but are based on the constant transformation of psychic states and physical reality and on the intellectual activity of turning attention to an object. Love is an example of this conversion: profiting from Marsilio Ficino’s theory of love, Bruno claims that love not only dominates the relations between humans, and between God and humans, but is also the force that organizes the living and non-living world. This is only possible because love means that any of these can take on the essence of any other so that the loving and the beloved convert mutually into each other (Sigillus Sigillorum n. 158; Bruno 2009, 2:256, 472). Bruno’s interest in the art of memory was fueled by his Platonizing metaphysics, which seeks the convergence of the universe in one principle and the convertibility of truth into understanding. For this purpose, he also invoked the (late ancient) tradition of Hermeticism as visible in Hermes as the messenger of the philosophical principles and in making the sorceress Circe speaker of a treatise on memory. During his time in Germany, Bruno produced texts and excerpts on magic, on spellbinding (De vinculis), universal principles, mathematical and medical application of Lullism, and on the cosmology of the soul (Lampas triginta statuarum). All of them have the idea of transformation at their basis. Before modern empiricism and science based on mathematical calculus and projections, natural magic was a reputable discipline, which investigated the invisible ‘occult’ forces that drive events in nature, including spiritual powers. Bruno contributed to magical theories by raising the question of how those forces are related to empirical and metaphysical certainties. In his notes on magic, Bruno likens the interconnectedness of things to the ‘conversation’ in human languages by way of translation as transformation: in an analogous way, magical signs and tokens are hints that make understanding divinity possible (De magia, Bruno 2000a, 192–94 [1962 vol. III, 412]).
Bruno became best known for his Copernicanism and his end as a heretic. However, Bruno’s epistemology of memory, his cosmology, and his interest in magic are all convergent with the project of a universal theory of everything that, by definition, purports the unity of thought, existence, and objectivity. This can be seen in two literary descriptions of subjectivity and objectivity. In the Heroic Frenzies, Bruno narrates the mythos of Actaeon who in search of the goddess Diana is turned into a deer and eaten by his own dogs. The dogs allegorize the human intellect and the convergence of knowledge and object, a dissolution in which knowledge achieves its end. The other example can be found in Bruno’s De immenso: Bruno remembers his childhood experience that from the mountain Cicala of his home town the Vesuvius looked menacing, but from the Vesuvius the familiar mountain was alien. From this, he concluded that the center of the world is wherever one stands and that the world has no physical boundaries (Bruno 1962, vol. I 1, 313-317). His cosmology is based on an epistemology that aims at overcoming the divide between theory, practice, and objective truth.
Bruno’s fame as a heretic was closely linked to his opposition to Aristotelian physics and his endorsement of Copernicanism, which was particularly pronounced in three of the Italian dialogues and in the Frankfurt trilogy. Since Nicolaus Copernicus had introduced a planetary system in which the earth orbits around the sun—as opposed to the astronomy of Ptolemy that explained the movement of planets with circles and epicycles around the earth—, Bruno discusses the question of whether this is only a mathematical model or reality. He points out that both models are mutually convertible, with the sun taking the place of the earth. However, preferable is not what is easier to calculate, more plausible, or more traditional (indeed, all this is the case in the Copernican model, including his reliance on ancient philosophy) but what is compelling on all fronts. If it is true that the earth moves, it must be so because it is “possible, reasonable, true, and necessary” (Ash Wednesday Supper III, Bruno 2018, 153; 1958, 131). The emphasis lies on the combination of possibility and truth; for a theory cannot suffice in being plausible and true, in a way, it also has to be necessary, so that what is possible is also real. If the planetary orbs are not mere hypothetical objects of mathematical calculation, philosophy has to accept them as real movements and explain how this motion comes about. Whatever changes is driven by an effective principle, which is necessarily internal; and that maxim applies to the stars as well as to magnetism and animal sex (Ash Wednesday Supper III, Bruno 2018, 123; 1958, 109). Copernicanism, for Bruno, is not only one segment of knowledge about reality, it is symptomatic of how human understanding of the powers of the world works. Astronomy exemplifies that mathematics is more than calculus; it is the real structure of the world (as the Pythagoreans had taught), and in being intellectual it has to be a reality that transcends the material and is inherent in everything.
In this context, Bruno equates the world to a machine and to an animal: as any living being is composed of distinct parts, which would not exist without the whole, so is the world one diverse organism that is composed of distinct parts. When he returns to Copernicus and discusses astronomy in great detail and with some modifications in his De immenso, Bruno reiterates that the universe is one, to the effect that there cannot be any first-mover (beyond the ultimate sphere in Aristotelian astronomy); rather, the earth and everything else is animated with the soul as the center of every part (De immenso III 6, Bruno 1962, vol. I 1, p. 365). In Aristotelian natural philosophy, the soul was the incorporeal principle of movement of living bodies. Bruno transfers and applies this notion to the universe. Hence it follows for him that there is a world soul, that the heavenly spheres are animated, that all planets are alike (that is, the earth is as much a planet as any other), that the number of spheres and suns is innumerable or even infinite, and that nature and God are identical insofar as God is omnipresent. This is the reason why Bruno famously extended the Copernican ‘closed world’ to an open and infinite universe. Copernicus had made the sun the center of the universe and assigned the earth and the planets their orbits accordingly, but he did not expressly deny the Aristotelian theory that the world is finite in extension. Bruno went a step further and inferred from the equivalence of all planets and the infinite power of God that the universe must be infinite. God, causation, principles, elements, active and passive potencies, matter, substance, form, etc. are all parts of the One and distinguished only by logical conceptualization, as it is inevitable in human discourse (De immenso VIII 10, Bruno 1962, vol. I 2, p. 312). These cosmological ideas have led later readers to the interpretation that Bruno was a pantheist, identifying God and nature, both being the whole of the universe; they also could talk of atheism if he meant to say that God is nothing but a name for natural mechanisms. The terms ‘atheism’ and ‘pantheism’ were coined later, but as a matter of fact, these possible interpretations dominated the reception of Bruno from the mid-18th century in relation to Baruch Spinoza while others insisted that God’s absolute immanence admits for some sort of transcendence and distinction from the finite world (see below section 4).
To consolidate this novel approach to traditional themes, Bruno had to rearrange philosophical terminology and concepts. In his De la causa, he addressed the scholastic philosophy of cause and principle, matter and form, substance and accident, and also one and many. In Aristotelian causality, finality was the dominating force, and, in Christian thought, that had been identified with God who governs the world. Bruno correlated universal finality with the internal living power and controlling reason in all things. Accordingly, if God is usually understood as beyond the world and now identified as the internal principle, the distinction between internal and external causation vanishes. Bruno uncovers the conceptual problems of Aristotelian causality, which includes matter and form as two of the principles: if they are only descriptors of things, they are not real, but if they are supposed to be real, they need to be matching to the extent that there is no matter without form, no form without matter, and both are co-extensive. Prime matter in school philosophy is either nothing (prope nihil, for lack of form) or everything and receptacle of all forms. What is logically necessary to be kept distinct, such as forms and matter or the whole and its parts, is metaphysically one and also as infinite as all potentialities. Bruno closes his dialogue on Cause, Principle, and the One with an encomium of the One. Being, act, potency, maximum, minimum, matter and body, form and soul – all are one, which harkens back to Neoplatonist themes. However, in the fifth dialogue, Bruno challenges this praise of unity by raising the question of how it is at all possible to have individual or particular items under the canopy of oneness. He pronounces the adage “It is profound magic to draw contraries from the point of union,” in other words: how is plurality at all possible if all is one?
In his Frankfurt trilogy, Bruno unfolds the interconnection of nature, understanding, metaphysics, and mathematics. In his dedication to Duke Henry Julius, Bruno announces its contents: De minimo explains the principles of understanding as the foundational project while relying on sensation; it belongs to mathematics and deals with minimum and maximum in geometrical figurations. De monade, numero, et figura traces imagination and experience at the basis of research, which conforms to language and is quasi-divine; its theme is the monad as the substance of things and the basis of unity, diversity, and relationality. De immenso, innumerabilibus et infigurabili shows the order of the worlds with proofs that factually nature is visible, changing, and composed of elements, heaven, and earth, and yet an infinite whole (Bruno 1962, vol. I 1, 193-199; 2000b, 231–39). The theory of monads encompasses three elements: the geometrical properties of points, the physical reality of minimal bodies (atoms), and the cognitive method of starting with the ultimate simple when understanding complexity. In this function, the monad is the link between the intellectual and the physical realms and provides the metaphysical foundation of natural and geometrical investigations. Thus the monad is what makes everything particular as something singular; at the same time it constitutes the wholeness of the universe, which is made up of infinitely many singular things and necessarily infinite. With his monadology, and the research into the minimal constituents of thought and being, Bruno revived ancient atomism, as adopted from Lucretius. There is no birth nor death in the world, nothing is truly new, and nothing can be annihilated since all change is but a reconfiguration of minimal parts, monads, or atoms (depending on the context of the discourse). The concept of mathematical, geometrical, and physical atoms is the methodical channel to relate things and ideas with one another and to explain the existence of distinctions out of the One, thus turning geometrical and physical theories into metaphysics.
Mathematics, for Bruno, is geometry in the first place because arithmetic performs quantitative calculations of measurements of figures that are defined geometrically. Therefore, in his Articuli adversus mathematicos of 1588, he establishes the methodical and ontological chain of concepts that leads from the mind – via ideas, order, definitions, and more – down to geometrical figures, the minimum, and the relation of larger and smaller. Bruno’s geometry, inspired by Euclid and Nicholas of Cusa, becomes the paradigmatic discipline that encompasses the intelligibility and reality of the world. Precisely for the sake of intelligibility, Bruno does admit infinitude in the extension of the world, but not in the particulars: the infinitely small would be unintelligible, and therefore there is a minimum or atom that terminates the process of ever smaller division. Not only is the earth one star among many, the sphere in a geometrical sense becomes the infinite as such if taken to be universal; ‘universal’ now meaning ubiquitous, logically referring to everything, and physically encompassing the universe. Since such infinity escapes human measurement, if not intelligence, any quantity has to originate from the minimal size that is not just below sensibility, rather, it is the foundational quality that constitutes any finite measurement. Without the minimum, there is no quantity by analogy to the thought that unity is the substance of number and the essence of anything existing. It is the minimum that constitutes and drives everything.
One consequence of this line of thinking is Bruno’s understanding of geometry in the technical sense. In his De minimo and also in his Padua lectures of 1591, he explains that all geometrical figures, from lines to planes and bodies, are composed of minima. A line, then, is the continuation of a point, which is defined as first part or as end, and the line is the fringe of a plane. This entails that angles are also composed of minimal points which then build up the diverging lines. Bruno suggests angles are generated by gnomons (equal figures that when added combine to a like figure), namely minimal circles that surround a minimal circle; thus gnomons create a new circle, and through tangents, at the points of contact these create lines that spread out. Invoking the ancient atomist Democritus, Bruno created an atomistic geometry and claimed to find a mathematical science that is not merely arithmetic but conforms with the essence of the world (Bruno 1962, vol. I 3, 284 and 183-186; 1964).
Bruno’s scholarly language abounds with analogies, parallels, repetitions, metaphors, and specifically with serial elaboration of properties; after all, the mnemotechnic and Lullist systems were permutations of terms, too. Bruno also never misses a chance to play with words. For instance, he spells the Italian word for reason as ‘raggione’ with duplicated letter g: in this spelling, reason and ray (ragione and raggio) become associated and suggest that thought is a search light (notice the recurrence of the term lampas – torchlight) into reality and illuminated by truth. This poetic and ingenious handling of language parallels his understanding of geometry that makes up reality: visible reality is structured by measurable, construable, and retraceable proportions and is intelligible only with recourse to the perfection of geometrical relations. Thus, all understanding consists in appropriation of the unfolding of the minimum, which is a creative process that reconstructs what there is. This also applies to human life. In his Heroic Frenzies, he uses the motto Amor instat ut instans (Love is an insistent instant): the momentary experience of love lasts and keeps moving, it is like the minimal point in time that lasts forever and keeps pushing (Bruno 1958, 1066–69).
The question Bruno had to face through his life, until his condemnation as a heretic, was in what sense he agreed with basic tenets of Christianity. He advocated some kind of natural theology, that is, an understanding of God that is revealed not only in sacred texts but first and foremost in what is theologically to be called creation, and philosophically the contingent and finite world. Reality and human understanding contain clues for the ultimate meaning and demand means of explanation (such as the absolute, infinity, minimum, creativity, power). Revelation as that of the Bible competes with literary and mythological sources and with hidden powers as investigated in magic (in that regard, Bruno is an heir to Renaissance humanism). Much of this can be found in his depositions during the Inquisition trials. His major work on the question of religion was the Expulsion of the Triumphant Beast, a staged conversation among the Greek Gods about virtues and religion. Bruno sets religion into a historical and relativist context: Christianity, Egyptian, and Greek or Jewish traditions have in common that they try to represent the divine in the world and to edify the souls of humans. Thus, religious symbolism works like mnemotechnic imagery that may and must be permutated according to the circumstances of the community. The altar (i.e., the place of the eucharistic mystery) represents the core of religious meaning and is, in Bruno’s age of Protestantism and Counter Reformation, the relic (as he terms it) of the “sunken ship of religion and divine cult” (Bruno 1958, 602). Since “nature is God in things” (Bruno 1958, 776), the divine is as accessible through nature as the natural is through the divine. Consequently, worship means the continuous reformation of the individual towards better understanding the world and the self. Established religious cults have two valid purposes: inquiry into the ultimate principle of reality and communal order for all members of society who lack the means of true philosophy. Inspired by the debates among humanists and reformers (for instance, Thomas More, Erasmus of Rotterdam, Martin Luther, John Calvin, Juan Valdès), Bruno inaugurated two branches of religion, namely, natural religion and political theology. It was probably the discovery of this dialogue of the Triumphant Beast by the inquisitors in 1599 that sealed Bruno’s fate as a heretic (Firpo 1993, 100, 341).
Bruno’s afterlife as a character and a philosopher (Canone 1998; Ricci 1990; 2007) shows a great variety, not mutually exclusive, of interpretations of his philosophy. The history of his fame encompasses many possible interpretations of his philosophical aims. During the trial of Bruno in Rome, the German recent convert Kaspar Schoppe wrote a witness report of the testimony, which was first published in print by the Hungarian Calvinist Peter Alvinczi to vilify the Catholics (Alvinczi 1621, 30–35; Schoppe 1998). With his fate, Bruno began to symbolize the struggle between religious persecution and freedom of thought, thus inaugurating philosophical modernity. Bruno was heralded as the individualist “knight errant of philosophy” (Bayle 1697, 679) and associated with Baruch Spinoza’s alleged atheism, according to which all things are attributes of God. Already in 1624, Marin Mersenne included Bruno in his polemic against deists, libertines, and atheists. He reported that Bruno taught that circle and straight line, point and line, surface and body are all the same thing, advocated the transmigration of souls, denied God’s freedom for the sake of infinite worlds, but also held that God could have made a different world, and he reduced miracles to natural data (Mersenne 1624, pts. I, 229–235; II, passim). To this Charles Sorel responded by emphasizing the literary style of Bruno’s Latin poems. Both interpretations inspired an anonymous treatise by the title J. Brunus redivivus (Bruno revived, 1771) that discussed whether Bruno’s cosmology was atheistic (Sorel 1655, 238–43; Del Prete 1995; Schröder 2012, 500–504). The historian Jacob Brucker (Brucker 1744, IV 2:12–62) presented Bruno as the first thinker to promote modern eclecticism while also pointing to the Neoplatonic elements of his thought. Around 1700, John Toland identified the Spaccio as a manifesto against the Church and published Schoppe’s report and an English translation of the introductory letter to De l’infinito; in correspondence with Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz, he branded Bruno as pantheist (Begley 2014). A debate in German Protestant circles in the late 18th century on Spinozism as the epitome of atheism prompted Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi to publish letters to Moses Mendelssohn, to which, in 1789, he added excerpts from Bruno’s De la causa with the intent to prove thereby that Spinoza was an atheist. These excerpts were actually free paraphrases from dialogues II to V that culminated in the praise of the infinite essence that is cause and principle, one and all. As a consequence of the fascination with Bruno, Nicholas of Cusa was rediscovered, being among his philosophical sources. Friedrich Schelling, contrary to Jacobi’s intentions, incorporated Bruno in the program of German Idealism in a book of 1802 with the title Bruno presenting Bruno’s purported pantheism as a step towards idealist philosophy of unity and identity. Using excerpts from Jacobi’s paraphrase, he termed the above-quoted adage about “drawing contraries from the point of union” the symbol true philosophy. From there Georg Wilhelm Friedrich Hegel discovered Bruno’s Lullism and art of memory as a “system of universal determinations of thought” or the coincidence of nature and creative mind (Hegel 1896, II 3 B 3, p. 130), which prompted the Catholic philosopher Franz Jakob Clemens to present Bruno as a precursor of Hegel. In England, Bruno’s brief sojourn left an impression that was less academically philosophical and more literary and legendary, which fits his disastrous appearance in Oxford. There is an ongoing debate on to what extent he might have influenced Christopher Marlowe and William Shakespeare. Henry Percy, Earl of Northumberland, collected Bruno’s works and wrote essays that appear to be inspired by Bruno’s literary style and themes, while members of his circle appreciated Bruno in the context of the rise of modern science. It was the philosopher-poet Samuel Taylor Coleridge who later, in the wake of the Spinoza debate, brought Bruno back from Germany to England. Rita Sturlese discovered that the reception of Bruno can be retraced through the fate of single copies of his early editions (Sturlese 1987). The 19th century inaugurated philological and historical research on Bruno and his Renaissance context. Italian scholars and intellectuals made Bruno a hero of national pride and anticlericalism (Rubini 2014; Samonà 2009): Vincenzo Gioberti and Bertrando Spaventa claimed that the German idealism from Spinoza to Hegel had its antecedent in Bruno, the Italian renegade (Molineri 1889; Spaventa 1867, 1:137–267). The edition of his Latin works was started in 1879 as a national project, and a monument was erected on Campo de’Fiori in Rome. In the second half of the 20th century, Bruno was perceived both as the turning point into modernity and as the heir of ancient occultism (Blumenberg 1983 [originally 1966], pt. 4; Yates 2010 [originally 1964]).
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Paul Richard Blum
Palacký University Olomouc
Loyola University Maryland