Care Ethics

The moral theory known as “ the ethics of care” implies that there is moral significance in the fundamental elements of relationships and dependencies in human life. Normatively, care ethics seeks to maintain relationships by contextualizing and promoting the well-being of care-givers and care-receivers in a network of social relations. Most often defined as a practice or virtue rather than a theory as such, “care” involves maintaining the world of, and meeting the needs of, ourself and others. It builds on the motivation to care for those who are dependent and vulnerable, and it is inspired by both memories of being cared for and the idealizations of self. Following in the sentimentalist tradition of moral theory, care ethics affirms the importance of caring motivation, emotion and the body in moral deliberation, as well as reasoning from particulars. One of the original works of care ethics was Milton Mayeroff’s short book, On Caring, but the emergence of care ethics as a distinct moral theory is most often attributed to the works of psychologist Carol Gilligan and philosopher Nel Noddings in the mid-1980s. Both charged traditional moral approaches with male bias, and asserted the “voice of care” as a legitimate alternative to the “justice perspective” of liberal human rights theory. Annette Baier, Virginia Held, Eva Feder Kittay, Sara Ruddick, and Joan Tronto are some of the most influential among many subsequent contributors to care ethics.

Typically contrasted with deontological/Kantian and consequentialist/utilitarian ethics, care ethics is found to have affinities with moral perspectives such as African ethics, Confucian ethics, and others. Critics fault care ethics with being a kind of slave morality, and as having serious shortcomings including essentialism, parochialism, and ambiguity. Although care ethics is not synonymous with feminist ethics, much has been written about care ethics as a feminine and feminist ethic, in relation to motherhood, international relations, and political theory. Care ethics is widely applied to a number of moral issues and ethical fields, including caring for animals and the environment, bioethics, and more recently public policy. Originally conceived as most appropriate to the private and intimate spheres of life, care ethics has branched out as a political theory and social movement aimed at broader understanding of, and public support for, care-giving activities in their breadth and variety.

Table of Contents

  1. History and Major Authors
    1. Carol Gilligan
    2. Nel Noddings
    3. Other Influential authors
      1. Annette Baier
      2. Virginia Held
      3. Eva Feder Kittay
      4. Sara Ruddick
      5. Joan Tronto
  2. Definitions of Care
  3. Criticisms
    1. Care Ethics as a Slave Morality
    2. Care Ethics as Empirically Flawed
    3. Care Ethics as Theoretically Indistinct
    4. Care Ethics as Parochial
    5. Care Ethics as Essentialist
    6. Care Ethics as Ambiguous
  4. Feminine and Feminist Ethics
  5. Relation to Other Theories
  6. Maternalism
  7. International Relations
  8. Political Theory
  9. Caring for Animals
  10. Applied Care Ethics
  11. Care Movements
  12. References and Further Reading

1. History and Major Authors

a. Carol Gilligan

While early strains of care ethics can be detected in the writings of feminist philosophers such as Mary Wollstonecraft, Catherine and Harriet Beecher, and Charlotte Perkins, it was first most explicitly articulated by Carol Gilligan and Nel Noddings in the early 1980s. While a graduate student at Harvard, Gilligan wrote her dissertation outlining a different path of moral development than the one described by Lawrence Kohlberg, her mentor. Kohlberg had posited that moral development progressively moves toward more universalized and principled thinking and had also found that girls, when later included in his studies, scored significantly lower than boys. Gilligan faulted Kohlberg’s model of moral development for being gender biased, and reported hearing a “different voice” than the voice of justice presumed in Kohlberg’s model. She found that both men and women articulated the voice of care at different times, but noted that the voice of care, without women, would nearly fall out of their studies. Refuting the charge that the moral reasoning of girls and women is immature because of its preoccupation with immediate relations, Gilligan asserted that the “care perspective” was an alternative, but equally legitimate form of moral reasoning obscured by masculine liberal justice traditions focused on autonomy and independence. She characterized this difference as one of theme, however, rather than of gender.

Gilligan articulated these thematic perspectives through the moral reasoning of “Jake” and “Amy”, two children in Kohlberg’s studies responding to the “Heinz dilemma”. In this dilemma, the children are asked whether a man, “Heinz”, should have stolen an overpriced drug to save the life of his ill wife. Jake sees the Heinz dilemma as a math problem with people wherein the right to life trumps the right to property, such that all people would reasonably judge that Heinz ought to steal the drug. Amy, on the other hand, disagrees that Heinz should steal the drug, lest he should go to prison and leave his wife in another predicament. She sees the dilemma as a narrative of relations over time, involving fractured relationships that must be mended through communication. Understanding the world as populated with networks of relationships rather than people standing alone, Amy is confident that the druggist would be willing to work with Heinz once the situation was explained. Gilligan posited that men and women often speak different languages that they think are the same, and she sought to correct the tendency to take the male perspective as the prototype for humanity in moral reasoning.

Later, Gilligan vigorously resisted readings of her work that posit care ethics as relating to gender more than theme, and even established the harmony of care and justice ethics (1986), but she never fully abandoned her thesis of an association between women and relational ethics. She further developed the idea of two distinct moral “voices”, and their relationship to gender in Mapping the Moral Domain:  A Contribution of Women’s Thinking to Psychological Theory and Education (Gilligan, Ward, and Taylor, 1988), a collection of essays that traced the predominance of the “justice perspective” within the fields of psychology and education, and the implications of the excluded “care perspective”. In Making Connections:  The Relational Worlds of Adolescent Girls at Emma Willard School, Gilligan and her co-editors argued that the time between the ages of eleven and sixteen is crucial to girls’ formation of identity, being the time when girls learn to silence their inner moral intuitions in favor of more rule bound interpretations of moral reasoning (Gilligan, Lyons, and Hamner, 1990, 3). Gilligan found that in adulthood women are encouraged to resolve the crises of adolescence by excluding themselves or others, that is, by being good/responsive, or by being selfish/independent. As a result, women’s adolescent voices of resistance become silent, and they experience a dislocation of self, mind, and body, which may be reflected in eating disorders, low leadership aspiration, and self-effacing sexual choices. Gilligan also expanded her ideas in a number of articles and reports (Gilligan, 1979; 1980; 1982; 1987).

b. Nel Noddings

In 1984 Noddings published Caring, in which she developed the idea of care as a feminine ethic, and applied it to the practice of moral education. Starting from the presumption that women “enter the practical domain of moral action…through a different door”, she ascribed to feminine ethics a preference for face-to face moral deliberation that occurs in real time, and appreciation of the uniqueness of each caring relationship. Drawing conceptually from a maternal perspective, Noddings understood caring relationships to be basic to human existence and consciousness. She identified two parties in a caring relationship—“one-caring” and the “cared-for”—and affirmed that both parties have some form of obligation to care reciprocally and meet the other morally, although not in the same manner. She characterized caring as an act of “engrossment” whereby the one-caring receives the cared-for on their own terms, resisting projection of the self onto the cared-for, and displacing selfish motives in order to act on the behalf of the cared-for. Noddings located the origin of ethical action in two motives, the human affective response that is a natural caring sentiment, and the memory of being cared-for that gives rise to an ideal self. Noddings rejected universal principles for prescribed action and judgment, arguing that care must always be contextually applied.

Noddings identified two stages of caring, “caring-for” and “caring-about”. The former stage refers to actual hands-on application of caring services, and the latter to a state of being whereby one nurtures caring ideas or intentions. She further argued that the scope of caring obligation is limited. This scope of caring is  strongest towards others who are capable of reciprocal relationship. The caring obligation is conceived of as moving outward in concentric circles so enlarged care is increasingly characterized by a diminished ability for particularity and contextual judgment, which prompted Noddings to speculate that it is impossible to care-for everyone. She maintained that while the one-caring has an obligation to care-for proximate humans and animals to the extent that they are needy and able to respond to offerings of care, there is a lesser obligation to care for distant others if there is no hope that care will be completed. These claims proved to be highly controversial, and Noddings later revised them somewhat. In her more recent book Starting From Home, Noddings endorsed a stronger obligation to care about distant humans, and affirms caring-about as an important motivational stage for inspiring local and global justice, but continued to hold that it is impossible to care-for all, especially distant others. (See 3a.iv below)

c. Other Influential authors

Although many philosophers have developed care ethics, five authors are especially notable.

i. Annette Baier

Annette Baier observes certain affinities between care ethics and the moral theory of David Hume, whom she dubs the “women’s moral theorist.” Baier suggests both deny that morality consists in obedience to a universal law, emphasizing rather the importance of cultivating virtuous sentimental character traits, including gentleness, agreeability, compassion, sympathy, and good temperedness (1987, 42). Baier specially underscores trust, a basic relation between particular persons, as the fundamental concept of morality, and notes its obfuscation within theories premised on abstract and autonomous agents. She recommends carving out room for the development of moral emotions and harmonizing the ideals of care and justice.

ii. Virginia Held

Virginia Held is the editor and author of many books pertaining to care ethics. In much of her work she seeks to move beyond ideals of liberal justice, arguing that they are not as much flawed as limited, and examines how social relations might be different when modeled after mothering persons and children. Premised on a fundamental non-contractual human need for care, Held construes care as the most basic moral value. In Feminist Morality (1993), Held explores the transformative power of creating new kinds of social persons, and the potentially distinct culture and politics of a society that sees as “its most important task the flourishing of children and the creation of human relationships”. She describes feminist ethics as committed to actual experience, with an emphasis on reason and emotion, literal rather than hypothetical persons, embodiment, actual dialogue, and contextual, lived methodologies. In The Ethics of Care (2006), Held demonstrates the relevance of care ethics to political, social and global questions. Conceptualizing care as a cluster of practices and values, she describes a caring person as one who has appropriate motivations to care for others and who participates adeptly in effective caring practices. She argues for limiting both market provisions for care and the need for legalistic thinking in ethics, asserting that care ethics has superior resources for dealing with the power and violence that imbues all relations, including those on the global level. Specifically, she recommends a view of a globally interdependent civil society increasingly dependent upon an array of caring NGOs for solving problems. She notes: “The small societies of family and friendship embedded in larger societies are formed by caring relations… A globalization of caring relations would help enable people of different states and cultures to live in peace, to respect each others’ rights, to care together for their environments, and to improve the lives of their children”(168). Ultimately, she argues that rights based moral theories presume a background of social connection, and that when fore-grounded, care ethics can help to create communities that promote healthy social relations, rather than the near boundless pursuit of self-interest.

iii. Eva Feder Kittay

Eva Feder Kittay is another prominent care ethicist. Her book, Women and Moral Theory (1987), co-edited with Diana T. Meyers, is one the most significant anthologies in care ethics to date. In  this work they map conceptual territory inspired by Gilligan’s work, both critically and supportively, by exploring major philosophical themes such as self and autonomy, ethical principles and universality, feminist moral theory, and women and politics. In Love’s Labor (1999), Kittay develops a dependency based account of equality rooted in the activity of caring for the seriously disabled. Kittay holds that the principles in egalitarian theories of justice, such as  those of John Rawls, depend upon more fundamental principles and practices of care, and that without supplementation such theories undermine themselves (108). Kittay observes that in practice some women have been able to leave behind traditional care-giving roles only because other women have filled them, but she resists the essentialist association between women and care by speaking of “dependency workers” and “dependency relations”. She argues that equality for dependency workers and the unavoidably dependent will only be achieved through conceptual and institutional reform. Employing expanded ideals of fairness and reciprocity that take interdependence as basic, Kittay poses a third principle for Rawls’ theory of justice: “To each according to his or her need, from each to his or her capacity for care, and such support from social institutions as to make available resources and opportunities to those providing care” (113). She more precisely calls for the public provision of Doulas, paid professional care-workers who care for care-givers, and uses the principle of Doula to justify welfare for all care-givers, akin to worker’s compensation or unemployment benefits.

iv. Sara Ruddick

Held identifies Sara Ruddick as the original pioneer of the theory of care ethics, citing Ruddick’s 1980 article “Maternal Thinking” as the first articulation of a distinctly feminine approach to ethics. In this article, and in her later book of the same title (1989), Ruddick uses care ethical methodology to theorize from the lived experience of mothering, rendering a unique approach to moral reasoning and a ground for a feminist politics of peace. Ruddick explains how the practices of “maternal persons” (who may be men or women), exhibit cognitive capacities or conceptions of virtue with larger moral relevance. Ruddick’s analysis, which forges strong associations between care ethics and motherhood, has been both well-received and controversial (see Section 6, below).

v. Joan Tronto

Joan Tronto is most known for exploring the intersections of care ethics, feminist theory, and political science. She sanctions a feminist care ethic designed to thwart the accretion of power to the existing powerful, and to increase value for activities that legitimize shared power. She identifies moral boundaries that have served to privatize the implications of care ethics, and highlights the political dynamics of care relations which describe, for example, the tendency of women and other minorities to perform care work in ways that benefit the social elite. She expands the phases of care to include “caring about”, “taking care of” (assuming responsibility for care), “care-giving” (the direct meeting of need), and “care-receiving”. She coins the phrase “privileged irresponsibility” to describe the phenomenon that allows the most advantaged in society to purchase caring services, delegate the work of care-giving, and avoid responsibility for the adequacy of hands-on care. (See Sections 2 and 8 below).

2. Definitions of Care

Because it depends upon contextual considerations, care is notoriously difficult to define. As Ruddick points out, at least three distinct but overlapping meanings of care have emerged in recent decades—an ethic defined in opposition to justice, a kind of labor, and a particular relationship (1998, 4). However, in care ethical literature, ‘care’ is most often defined as a practice, value, disposition, or virtue, and is frequently portrayed as an overlapping set of concepts. For example, Held notes that care is a form of labor, but also an ideal that guides normative judgment and action, and she characterizes care as “clusters” of practices and values (2006, 36, 40). One of the most popular definitions of care, offered by Tronto and Bernice Fischer, construes care as “a species of activity that includes everything we do to maintain, contain, and repair our ‘world’ so that we can live in it as well as possible. That world includes our bodies, ourselves, and our environment”. This definition posits care fundamentally as a practice, but Tronto further identifies four sub-elements of care that can be understood simultaneously as stages, virtuous dispositions, or goals. These sub-elements are: (1) attentiveness, a proclivity to become aware of need; (2) responsibility, a willingness to respond and take care of need; (3) competence, the skill of providing good and successful care; and (4) responsiveness, consideration of the position of others as they see it and recognition of the potential for abuse in care (1994, 126-136). Tronto’s definition is praised for how it admits to cultural variation and extends care beyond family and domestic spheres, but it is also criticized for being overly broad, counting nearly every human activity as care.

Other definitions of care provide more precise delineations. Diemut Bubeck narrows the definitional scope of care by emphasizing personal interaction and dependency. She describes care as an emotional state, activity, or both, that is functional, and specifically involves “the meeting of needs of one person by another where face-to-face interaction between care and cared for is a crucial element of overall activity, and where the need is of such a nature that it cannot possibly be met by the person in need herself” (129). Bubeck thus distinguishes care from “service”, by stipulating that “care” involves meeting the needs for others who cannot meet their needs themselves, whereas “service” involves meeting the needs of individuals who are capable of self-care. She also holds that one cannot care for oneself, and that care does not require any emotional attachment. While some care ethicists accept that care need not always have an emotional component, Bubeck’s definitional exclusion of self-care is rejected by other care ethicists who stress additional aspects of care.

For example, both Maurice Hamington and Daniel Engster make room for self-care in their definitions of care, but focus more precisely on special bodily features and end goals of care (Hamington, 2004; Engster, 2007). Hamington focuses on embodiment, stating that: “care denotes an approach to personal and social morality that shifts ethical considerations to context, relationships, and affective knowledge in a manner that can only be fully understood if care’s embodied dimension is recognized. Care is committed to flourishing and growth of individuals, yet acknowledges our interconnectedness and interdependence” (2004, 3). Engster develops a “basic needs” approach to care, defining care as a practice that includes “everything we do to help individuals to meet their vital biological needs, develop or maintain their basic capabilities, and avoid or alleviate unnecessary or unwanted pain and suffering, so that they can survive, develop, and function in society” (2007, 28). Although care is often unpaid, interpersonal, and emotional work, Engster’s definition does not exclude paid work or self-care, nor require the presence of affection or other emotion (32). Although these definitions emphasize care as a practice, not all moral theorists maintain this view of.

Alternatively, care is understood as a virtue or motive. James Rachels, Raja Halwani, and Margaret McLaren have argued for categorizing care ethics as a species of virtue ethics, with care as a central virtue (Rachels, 1999; McLaren, 2001; Halwani, 2003). The idea that that care is best understood as virtuous motives or communicative skills is endorsed by Michael Slote who equates care with a kind of motivational attitude of empathy, and by Selma Sevenhuijsen, who defines care as “styles of situated moral reasoning” that involves listening and responding to others on their own terms.” (Slote, 2007; Sevenhuijsen, 1998, 85).

Some ethicists prefer to understand care as a practice more fundamental than a virtue or motive because doing so resists the tendency to romanticize care as a sentiment or dispositional trait, and reveals the breadth of caring activities as globally intertwined with virtually all aspects of life. As feminist ethicists, Kittay and Held like to understand care as a practice and value rather than as a virtue because it risks “losing site of it as work” (Held, 2006, 35). Held refutes that care is best understood as a disposition such as compassion or benevolence, but defines “care” as “more a characterization of a social relation than the description of an individual disposition.”

Overall, care continues to be an essentially contested concept, containing ambiguities that Peta Bowden, finds advantageous, revealing  “the complexity and diversity of the ethical possibilities of care”(1997, 183).

3. Criticisms

A number of criticisms have been launched against care ethics, including that it is: a) a slave morality; b) empirically flawed; c) theoretically indistinct; d) parochial, e) essentialist, and f) ambiguous.

a. Care Ethics as a Slave Morality

One of the earliest objections was that care ethics is a kind of slave morality valorizing the oppression of women (Puka, 1990; Card, 1990; Davion, 1993). The concept of slave morality comes from the philosopher Frederick Nietzsche, who held that oppressed peoples tend to develop moral theories that reaffirm subservient traits as virtues. Following this tradition, the charge that care ethics is a slave morality interprets the different voice of care as emerging from patriarchal traditions characterized by rigidly enforced sexual divisions of labor. This critique issues caution against uncritically valorizing caring practices and inclinations because women who predominantly perform the work of care often do so to their own economic and political disadvantage. To the extent that care ethics encourages care without further inquiring as to who is caring for whom, and whether these relationships are just, it provides an unsatisfactory base for a fully libratory ethic. This objection further implies that the voice of care may not be an authentic or empowering expression, but a product of false consciousness that equates moral maturity with self-sacrifice and self-effacement.

b. Care Ethics as Empirically Flawed

Critics also question the empirical accuracy and validity of Gilligan’s studies. Gilligan has been faulted for basing her conclusions on too narrow a sample, and for drawing from overly homogenous groups such as students at elite colleges and women considering abortion (thereby excluding women who would not view abortion as morally permissible). It is argued that wider samples yield more diverse results and complicate  the picture of dual and gendered moral perspectives (Haan, 1976; Brabeck, 1983). For instance, Vanessa Siddle Walker and John Snarey surmise that resolution of the Heinz dilemma shifts if Heinz is identified as Black, because in the United States African-American males are disproportionately likely to be arrested for crime, and less likely to have their cases dismissed without stringent penalties (Walker and Snarey, 2004). Sandra Harding observes certain similarities between care ethics and African moralities, noting that care ethics has affinities with many other moral traditions (Harding, 1987). Sarah Lucia Hoagland identifies care as the heart of lesbian connection, but also cautions against the dangers of assuming that all care relations are ideally maternalistic (Hoagland, 1988). Thus, even if some women identify with care ethics, it is unclear whether this is a general quality of women, whether moral development is distinctly and dualistically gendered, and whether the voice of care is the only alternative moral voice. However, authors like Marilyn Friedman maintain that even if it cannot be shown that care is a distinctly female moral orientation, it is plausibly understood as a symbolically feminine approach (Friedman, 1987).

c. Care Ethics as Theoretically Indistinct

Along similar lines some critics object that care ethics is not a highly distinct moral theory, and that it rightly incorporates liberal concepts such as autonomy, equality, and justice. Some defenders of utilitarianism and deontology argue that the concerns highlighted by care ethics have been, or could be, readily addressed by existing theories (Nagl-Docekal, 1997; Ma, 2002). Others suggest that care ethics merely reduces to virtue ethics with care being one of many virtues (Rachels, 1999; Slote, 1998a; 1998b; McLaren, 2001, Halwani, 2003). Although a number of care ethicists explore the possible overlap between care ethics and other moral theories, the distinctiveness of the ethic is defended by some current advocates of care ethics, who contend that the focus on social power, identity, relationship, and interdependency are unique aspects of the theory (Sander-Staudt, 2006). Most care ethicists make room for justice concerns and for critically scrutinizing alternatives amongst justice perspectives. In some cases, care ethicists understand the perspectives of care and justice as mutual supplements to one another. Other theorists underscore the strategic potential for construing care as a right in liberal societies that place a high rhetorical value on human rights. Yet others explore the benefits of integrating care ethics with less liberal traditions of justice, such as Marxism (Bubeck, 1995).

d. Care Ethics as Parochial

Another set of criticisms center around the concern that care ethics obscures larger social dynamics and is overly parochial. These critiques aim at Noddings’ original assertion that care givers have primary obligations to proximate others over distant others (Tronto, 1995, 111-112; Robinson, 1999, 31). Critics worry that this stance privileges elite care-givers by excusing them from attending to significant differences in international standards of living and their causes. Critics also express a concern that without a broader sense of justice, care ethics may allow for cronyism and favoritism toward one’s family and friends (Friedman, 2006; Tronto, 2006). Noddings now affirms an explicit theme of justice in care ethics that resists arbitrary favoritism, and that extends to public and international domains. Yet she upholds the primacy of the domestic sphere as the originator and nurturer of justice, in the sense that the best social policies are identified, modeled, and sustained by practices in the “best families”. Other care ethicists refine Noddings’ claim by emphasizing the practical and moral connections between proximate and distant relations, by affirming a principle of care for the most vulnerable on a global level, and by explicitly weaving a political component into care theory.

e. Care Ethics as Essentialist

The objection that care ethics is essentialist stems from the more general essentialist critique made by Elizabeth Spelman (1988). Following this argument, early versions of care ethics have been faulted for failing to explore the ways in which women (and others) differ from one another, and for thereby offering a uniform picture of moral development that reinforces sex stereotypes (Tronto, 1994). Critics challenge tendencies in care ethics to theorize care based on a dyadic model of a (care-giving) mother and a (care-receiving) child, on the grounds that it overly romanticizes motherhood and does not adequately represent the vast experiences of individuals (Hoagland, 1991). The charge of essentialism in care ethics highlights ways in which women and men are differently implicated in chains of care depending on variables of class, race, age, and more. Essentialism in care ethics is problematic not only because it is conceptually facile, but also because of its political implications for social justice. For example, in the United States women of color and white women are differently situated in terms of who is more likely to give and receive care, and of what degree and quality, because the least paid care workers predominantly continue to be women of color. Likewise, lesbian and heterosexual women are differently situated in being able to claim the benefits and burdens of marriage, and are not equally presumed to be fit as care-givers. Contemporary feminist care ethicists attempt to avoid essentialism by employing several strategies, including: more thoroughly illuminating the practices of care on multiple levels and from various perspectives; situating caring practices in place and time; construing care as the symbolic rather than actual voice of women; exploring the potential of care as a gender neutral activity; and being consistently mindful of perspective and privilege in the activity of moral theorizing.

f. Care Ethics as Ambiguous

Because it eschews abstract principles and decisional procedures, care ethics is often accused of being unduly ambiguous, and for failing to offer concrete guidance for ethical action (Rachels, 1999). Some care ethicists find the non-principled nature of care ethics to be overstated, noting that because a care perspective may eschew some principles does not mean that it eschews all principles entirely (Held, 1995). Principles that could be regarded as central to care ethics might pertain to the origin and basic need of care relations, the evaluation of claims of need, the obligation to care, and the scope of care distribution. On principle, it would seem, a care ethic guides the moral agent to recognize relational interdependency, care for the self and others, cultivate the skills of attention, response, respect, and completion, and maintain just and caring relationships. However, while theorists define care ethics as a theory derived from actual practices, they simultaneously resist subjectivism and moral relativism.

4. Feminine and Feminist Ethics

Because of its association with women, care ethics is often construed as a feminine ethic. Indeed, care ethics, feminine ethics, and feminist ethics are often treated as synonymous. But although they overlap, these are discrete fields in that although care ethics connotes feminine traits, not all feminine and feminist ethics are care ethics, and the necessary connection between care ethics and femininity has been subject to rigorous challenge. The idea that there may be a distinctly woman-oriented, or a feminine approach to ethics, can be traced far back in history. Attempts to legitimate this approach gained momentum in the 18th and 19th centuries, fueled by some suffragettes, who argued that granting voting rights to (white) women would lead to moral social improvements. Central assumptions of feminine ethics are that women are similar enough to share a common perspective, rooted in the biological capacity and expectation of motherhood, and that characteristically feminine traits include compassion, empathy, nurturance, and kindness.

But once it is acknowledged that women are diverse, and that some men exhibit equally strong tendencies to care, it is not readily apparent that care ethics is solely or uniquely feminine. Many women, in actuality and in myth, in both contemporary and past times, do not exhibit care. Other factors of social identity, such as ethnicity and class, have also been found to correlate with care thinking. Nonetheless, care has pervasively been assumed to be a symbolically feminine trait and perspective, and many women resonate with a care perspective. What differentiates feminine and feminist care ethics turns on the extent to which there is critical inquiry into the empirical and symbolic association between women and care, and concern for the power-related implications of this association. Alison Jaggar characterizes a feminist ethic as one which exposes masculine and other biases in moral theory, understands individual actions in the context of social practices, illuminates differences between women, provides guidance for private, public, and international issues, and treats the experiences of women respectfully, but not uncritically (Jaggar, 1991).

While most theorists agree that it is mistaken to view care ethics as a “woman’s morality”, the best way to understand its relation to sex and gender is disputed. Slote develops a strictly gender neutral theory of care on the grounds that care ethics can be traced to the work of male as well as female philosophers. Engster endorses a “minimally feminist theory of care” that is largely gender neutral because he defines care as meeting needs that are more generally human. Although he acknowledges that women are disadvantaged in current caring distributions and are often socialized to value self-effacing care, his theory is feminist only in seeking to assure that the basic needs of women and girls are met and their capabilities developed.

In contrast, Held, Kittay, and Tronto draft more robust overlaps between care and feminist theory, retaining yet challenging the gender-laden associations of care with language like “mothering persons” or “dependency workers”. While cautious of the associations between care and femininity, they find it useful to tap the resources of the lived and embodied experiences of women, a common one which is the capacity to birth children. They tend to define care as a practice partially in order to stay mindful of the ongoing empirical (if misguided) associations between care and women, that must inform utopian visions of care as a gender-neutral activity and virtue. Complicating things further, individuals who are sexed as women may nonetheless gain social privilege when they exhibit certain perceived traits of the male gender, such as being unencumbered and competitive, suggesting that it is potentially as important to revalue feminine traits and activities, as it is to stress the gender-neutral potential of care ethics.

As it currently stands, care ethicists agree that women are positioned differently than men in relation to caring practices, but there is no clear consensus about the best way to theorize sex and gender in care ethics.

5. Relation to Other Theories

Care ethics originally developed as an alternative to the moral theories of Kantian deontology and Utilitarianism consequentialism, but it is thought to have affinities with numerous other moral theories, such as African ethics, David Hume’s sentimentalism, Aristotelian virtue ethics, the phenomenology of Merleau-Ponty, Levinasian ethics, and Confucianism. The most pre-dominant of these comparisons has been between care ethics and virtue ethics, to the extent that care ethics is sometimes categorized as a form of virtue ethics, with care being a central virtue. The identification of caring virtues fuels the tendency to classify care ethics as a virtue ethic, although this system of classification is not universally endorsed.

Some theorists move to integrate care and virtue ethics for strategic reasons. Slote seeks to form an alliance against traditional “masculine” moral theories like Kantianism, utilitarianism, and social contract theory (Slote, 1998). He argues that, in so doing, care ethics receives a way of treating our obligations to people we don’t know, without having to supplement it with more problematic theories of justice. McLaren posits that virtue theory provides a normative framework which care ethics lacks (McLaren, 2001). The perceived flaw in care ethics for both authors is a neglect of justice standards in how care is distributed and practiced, and a relegation of care to the private realm, which exacerbates the isolation and individualization of the burdens of care already prevalent in liberal societies. McLaren contends that virtue theory provides care ethics both with a standard of appropriateness and a normative framework: “The standard of appropriateness is the mean—a virtue is always the mean between two extremes…The normative framework stems from the definition of virtue as that which promotes human flourishing” (2001, 105). Feminist critics, however, resist this assimilation on the grounds that it may dilute the unique focus of care ethics (Held, 2006; Sander-Staudt, 2006). They are optimistic that feminist versions of care ethics can address the above concerns of justice, and doubt that virtue ethics provides the best normative framework.

Similar debates surround the comparison between care ethics and Confucianism. Philosophers note a number of similarities between care ethics and Confucian ethics, not least that both theories are often characterized as virtue ethics (Li, 1994, 2000; Lai Tao, 2000). Additional similarities are that both theories emphasize relationship as fundamental to being, eschew general principles, highlight the parent-child relation as paramount, view moral responses as properly graduated, and identify emotions such as empathy, compassion, and sensitivity as prerequisites for moral response. The most common comparison is between the concepts of care and the Confucian concept of jen/ren. Ren is often translated as love of humanity, or enlargement. Several authors argue that there is enough overlap between the concepts of care and ren to judge that care ethics and Confucian ethics are remarkably similar and compatible systems of thought (Li, 1994; Rosemont, 1997).

However, some philosophers object that it is better to view care ethics as distinct from Confucian ethics, because of their potentially incompatible aspects. Feminist care ethicists charge that a feminist care ethic is not compatible with the way Confucianism subordinates women. Ranjoo Seodu Herr locates the incompatibility as between the Confucian significance of li, or formal standards of ritual, and a feminist care ethics’ resistance to subjugation (2003). For similar reasons, Lijun Yuan doubts that Confucian ethics can ever be acceptable to contemporary feminists, despite its similarity to care ethics. Daniel Star categorizes Confucian ethics as a virtue ethic, and distinguishes virtue ethics and care ethics as involving different biases in moral perception (2002). According to Star, care ethics differs from Confucian ethics in not needing to be bound with any particular tradition, in downgrading the importance of principles (versus merely noting that principles may be revised or suspended), and in rejecting hierarchical, role-based categories of relationship in favor of contextual and particular responses.

There are also refutations of the belief that care ethics is conceptually incompatible with the justice perspectives of Kantian deontology and liberal human rights theory. Care ethicists dispute the inference that because care and justice have evolved as distinct practices and ideals, that they are incompatible. Some deny that Kantianism is as staunchly principled and rationalistic as often portrayed, and affirm that care ethics is compatible with Kantian deontology because it relies upon a universal injunction to care, and requires a principle of caring obligation. An adaptation of the Kantian categorical imperative can be used to ground the obligation to care in the universal necessity of care, and the inconsistency of willing a world without intent to care. Other theorists compare the compatibility between care ethics and concepts of central importance to a Kantian liberal tradition. Thus, Grace Clement argues that an ideal of individual autonomy is required by normative ideals of care, in the sense that care-givers ideally consent to and retain some degree of autonomy in caring relations, and also ideally foster the autonomy of care-receivers (Clement, 1996). Mona Harrington explores the significance of the liberal ideal of equality to care ethics by tracing how women’s inequality is linked to the low social valuing and provision of care work (Harrington, 2000). Other ways that Kantianism is thought to benefit care ethics is by serving as a supplementary check to caring practice, (denouncing caring relations that use others as mere means), and by providing a rhetorical vehicle for establishing care as a right.

6. Maternalism

As a theory rooted in practices of care, care ethics emerged in large part from analyses of the reasoning and activities associated with mothering. Although some critics caution against the tendency to construe all care relations in terms of a mother-child dyad, Ruddick and Held use a maternal perspective to expand care ethics as a moral and political theory. In particular, Ruddick argues that “maternal practice” yields specific kinds of thinking and supports a principled resistance to violence. Ruddick notes that while some mothers support violence and war, they should not because of how it threatens the goals and substance of care. Defining a mother as “a person who takes responsibility for children’s lives and for whom providing child care is a significant part of his or her working life”, Ruddick stipulates that both men and women can be mothers (40). She identifies the following metaphysical attitudes, cognitive capacities, and virtues associated with mothering: preservative love (work of protection with cheerfulness and humility), fostering growth (sponsoring or nurturing a child’s unfolding), and training for social acceptability (a process of socialization that requires conscience and a struggle for authenticity). Because children are subject to, but defy social expectations, the powers of mothers are limited by the “gaze of the others”. Loving attention helps mothers to perceive their children and themselves honestly so as to foster growth without retreating to fantasy or incurring loss of the self.

Expanding on the significance of the bodily experience of pregnancy and birth, Ruddick reasons that mothers should oppose a sharp division between masculinity and femininity as untrue to children’s sexual identities. In so doing, mothers should challenge the rigid division of male and female aspects characteristic of military ideology because it threatens the hope and promise of birth. Ruddick creates a feminist account of maternal care ethics that is rooted in the vulnerability, promise, and power of human bodies, and that by resisting cheery denial, can transform the symbols of motherhood into political speech.

But however useful the paradigm for mothering has been to care ethics, many find it to be a limited and problematic framework. Some critics reject Ruddick’s suggestion that mothering is logically peaceful, noting that mothering may demand violent protectiveness and fierce response. Although Ruddick acknowledges that many mothers support military endeavors and undermine peace movements, some critics are unconvinced that warfare is always illogical and universally contrary to maternal practice. Despite Ruddick’s recognition of violence in mothering, others object that a motherhood paradigm offers a too narrowly dyadic and romantic paradigm, and that this approach mistakenly implies that characteristics of a mother-child relationship are universal worldly qualities of relationship. For these reasons, some care ethicists, even when in agreement over the significance of the mother-child relationship, have sought to expand the scope of care ethics by exploring other paradigms of care work, such as friendship and citizenship.

7. International Relations

Care ethics was initially viewed as having little to say about international relations. With an emphasis on known persons and particular selves, care ethics did not seem to be a moral theory suited to guide relations with distant or hostile others. Fiona Robinson challenges this idea, however, by developing a critical ethics of care that attends to the relations of dependency and vulnerability that exist on a global scale (Robinson, 1999). Robinson’s analysis expands the sentiment of care to address the inequalities within current international relations by promoting a care ethic that is responsive and attentive to the difference of others, without presuming universal homogeneity. She argues that universal principles of right and wrong typically fail to generate moral responses that alleviate the suffering of real people. But she is optimistic that a feminist phenomenological version of care ethics can do so by exploring the actual nature, conditions, and possibilities of global relations. She finds that the preoccupation with the nation state in cosmopolitanism and communitarianism, and the enforced global primacy of liberal values such as autonomy, independence, self-determination, and others, has led to a ‘culture of neglect’. This culture is girded by a systemic devaluing of interdependence, relatedness, and positive interaction with distant others. A critical ethic of care understands the global order not as emerging from a unified or homogeneous humanity, but from structures that exploit differences to exclude, marginalize and dominate. While Robinson doubts the possibility of “a more caring world” where poverty and suffering are entirely eliminated, she finds that a critical care ethic may offer an alternative mode of response that can motivate global care.

Likewise, Held is hopeful that care ethics can be used to transform international relations between states, by noticing cultural constructs of masculinity in state behaviors, and by calling for cooperative values to replace hierarchy and domination based on gender, class, race and ethnicity (Held, 2006). Care ethicists continue to explore how care ethics can be applied to international relations in the context of the global need for care and in the international supply and demand for care that is served by migrant populations of women.

8. Political Theory

As a political theory, care ethics examines questions of social justice, including the distribution of social benefits and burdens, legislation, governance, and claims of entitlement. One of the earliest explorations of the implications of care ethics for feminist political theory was in Seyla Behabib’s article “The Generalized and the Concrete Other:  The Kohlberg-Gilligan Controversy and Feminist Theory” (Benhabib, 1986). Here, Benhabib traces a basic dichotomy in political and moral theory drawn between the public and private realms. Whereas the former is thought to be the realm of justice, the social and historical, and generalized others, the latter is thought to be the realm of the good life, the natural and atemporal, and concrete others. The former is captured by the favored metaphor of social contract theory and the “state of nature”, wherein men roam as adults, alone, independent, and free from the ties of birth by women. Benhabib traces this metaphor, internalized by the male ego, within the political philosophies of Thomas Hobbes, John Locke, and John Rawls, and the moral theories of Immanuel Kant and Lawrence Kohlberg. She argues that under this conception, human interdependency, difference, and questions about private life become irrelevant to politics.

The earliest substantial account of care as a political philosophy is offered by Tronto, who identifies the traditional boundary between ethics and politics as one of three boundaries  which serves to stymie the political efficacy of a woman’s care ethic, (the other two being the boundary between the particular and abstract/impersonal moral observer, and the boundary between public and private life) (Tronto, 1993). Together, these boundaries obscure how care as a political concept illuminates the interdependency of human beings, and how care could stimulate democratic and pluralistic politics in the United States by extending a platform to the politically disenfranchised. Following Tronto, a number of feminist care ethicists explore the implications of care ethics for a variety of political concepts, including Bubeck who adapts Marxist arguments to establish the social necessity and current exploitation of the work of care; Sevenhuijsen who reformulates citizenship to be more inclusive of caring need and care work; and Kittay who develops a dependency based concept of equality (Bubeck, 1995; Sevenhuijsen, 1998; Kittay, 1999). Other authors examine the relevance of care ethics to the political issues of welfare policy, restorative justice, political agency, and global business.

The most comprehensive articulation of care ethics as a political theory is given by Engster, who defends a need based account of moral obligation (Engster, 2007). Engster’s “minimal capability theory” is formed around two major premises—that all human beings are dependent upon others to develop their basic capabilities, and that in receiving care, individuals tacitly and logically become obliged to care for others. Engster understands care as a set of practices normatively informed by three virtues: attention, responsiveness, and respect. Defining care as everything we do to satisfy vital biological needs, develop and sustain basic capabilities, and avoid unnecessary suffering, Engster applies these goals to domestic politics, economic justice, international relations, and culture. Engster holds governments and businesses responsible for offering economic provisions in times of sickness, disability, frail old age, bad luck, and reversal of fortune, for providing protection, health care, and clean environments, and for upholding the basic rights of individuals. He calls for businesses to balance caring and commodity production by making work and care more compatible, although he surmises that the goals of care need not fully subordinate economic ends such as profitability.

According to Engster, care as a political theory has universal application because conditions of dependency are ubiquitous, but care need not be practiced by all groups in the same way, and has no necessary affinities with any particular political system, including Marxism and liberalism. Governments ought to primarily care for their own populations, but should also help the citizens of other nations living under abusive or neglectful regimes, within reasonable limits. International humanitarian interventions are more obligatory than military given the risk of physical harm, and the virtues of care can help the international community avoid dangers associated with humanitarian assistance. With specific reference to cultural practices in the U.S., Engster recommends a number of policy changes to education, employment, and the media.

9. Caring for Animals

While Gilligan was relatively silent about the moral status of animals in care ethics, Noddings made it clear that humans have moral obligations only to animals which are proximate, open to caring completion, and capable of reciprocity. On these grounds she surmises that while the one-caring has a moral obligation to care for a stray cat that shows up at the door and to safely transport spiders out of the house, one is under no obligation to care for a stray rat or to become a vegetarian. She further rejects Peter Singer’s claim that it is specieist to favor humans over animals. Other care ethicists, however, such as Rita Manning, point out differences in our obligations to care for companion, domesticated, and wild animals based upon “carefully listening to the creatures who are with you in [a] concrete situation” (Manning, 1992; 1996).

The application of care ethics to the moral status of animals has been most thoroughly explored by Carol Adams and Josephine Donovan (Adams and Donovan 1996; 2007). Expanding on Adams’ original analysis of the sexual politics of meat (Adams, 1990), they maintain that a feminist care tradition offers a superior foundation for animal ethics. They specifically question whether rights theory is an adequate framework for an animal defense ethic because of its rationalist roots and individualist ontology, its tendency to extend rights to animals based on human traits, its devaluing of emotion and the body, and its preference for abstract, formal, and quantifiable rules. Alternatively, they argue that a feminist care ethic is a preferable foundation for grounding moral obligations to animals because its relational ontology acknowledges love and empathy as major bases for human-animal connections, and its contextual flexibility allows for a more nuanced consideration of animals across a continuum of difference.

Engster similarly argues that the human obligation to care for non-human animals is limited by the degree to which non-human animals are dependent upon humans (Engster, 2006). Because an obligation to care is rooted in dependency, humans do not have moral obligations to care for animals that are not dependent upon humans. However, an obligation to care for animals is established when humans make them dependent by providing food or shelter. Engster surmises that neither veganism nor vegetarianism are required providing that animals live happy, mature lives, and are humanely slaughtered, but also acknowledges that the vast majority of animals live under atrocious conditions that care ethics renounces.

Empirical studies suggest interesting differences between the way that men and women think about the moral status of animals, most notably, that women are more strongly opposed to animal research and meat eating, and report being more willing to sacrifice for these causes, than men (Eldridge and Gluck, 1996). While feminist care ethicists are careful not to take such empirical correlations as an automatic endorsement of these views, eco-feminists like Marti Kheel explicate the connection between feminism, animal advocacy, environmental ethics, and holistic health movements (Kheel, 2008). Developing a more stringent obligation to care for animals, Kheel posits the uniqueness of all animals, and broadens the scope of the moral obligation of care to include all individual beings as well as larger collectives, noting that the majority of philosophies addressing animal welfare adopt masculine approaches founded on abstract rules, rational principles, and generalized perspectives.

10. Applied Care Ethics

In addition to the above topics, care ethics has been applied to a number of timely ethical debates, including reproductive technology, homosexuality and gay marriage, capital punishment, political agency, hospice care, and HIV treatment, as well as aspects of popular culture, such as the music of U-2 and The Sopranos. It increasingly informs moral analysis of the professions, such as education, medicine, nursing, and business, spurring new topics and modes of inquiry. It is used to provide moral assessment in other ethical fields, such as bioethics, business ethics, and environmental ethics. Perhaps because medicine is a profession that explicitly involves care for others, care ethics was quickly adopted in bioethics as a means for assessing relational and embodied aspects of medical practices and policies. As well as abortion, both Susan Sherwin and Rosemary Tong consider how feminist ethics, including an ethic of care, provides new insights into contraception and sterilization, artificial insemination and in vitro fertilization, surrogacy, and gene therapy. Care ethics is also applied by other authors to organ transplantation, the care of high risk patients, artificial womb technologies, advanced directives, and the ideal relationships between medical practitioners and patients.

11. Care Movements

There are a rising number of social movements organized around the concerns highlighted in care ethics. In 2000, Deborah Stone called for a national care movement in the U.S. to draw attention to the need for social programs of care such as universal health care, pre-school education, care for the elderly, improved foster care, and adequate wages for care-givers. In 2006, Hamington and Dorothy Miller compiled a number of essays concerning the theoretical understanding and application of care ethics to public life, including issues of welfare, same-sex marriage, restorative justice, corporate globalization, and the 21st century mother’s movement (Hamington and Miller, 2006). A number of formal political organizations of care exist, most of them on the internet, which variously center around themes of motherhood, fatherhood, health care, care as a profession, infant welfare, the woman’s movement, gay and lesbian rights, disability, and elder care. These organizations work to disseminate information, organize care advocates on key social issues, and form voting blocks. Of those focused around mothering, one of the most prominent is, organized by Joan Blades, one of the original founders of, and Kristin Rowe-Finkbeiner. Others include: The Mothers Movement Online,  Mothers Ought to Have Equal Rights, the National Association of Mothers’ Centers, and Mothers and More. Judith Stadtman Tucker notes that problems with some mother’s movements include an overly exclusive focus on the interests of white, middle class care-givers, and an occasional lack of serious-mindedness, but she is also hopeful that care movements organized around motherhood can forge cultural transitions, including shorter work weeks, universal health care unhitched from employment, care leave policies, and increased levels of care work performed by men and states (Tucker, 2001).

12. References and Further Reading

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  • Baier, Annette. “Hume: The Woman’s Moral Theorist?” in Women and Moral Theory, Kittay, Eva Feder, and Meyers, Diana (ed.s). U.S.A.: Rowman & Littlefield, 1987.
  • Baier, Annette. Moral Prejudices: Essays on Ethics. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1994.
  • Benhabib, Seyla. “The Generalized and Concrete Other:  The Kohlberg-Gilligan Controversy and Moral Theory”, in Praxis International (1986) 38-60.
  • Blades, Joan and Rowe-Finkbeiner, Kristin. The Motherhood Manifesto: What America’s Moms Want and What to do about It. New York, NY: Nation Books, 2006.
  • Bowden, Peta. “An ‘Ethics of Care’ in Clinical Settings: Encompassing ‘Feminine” and “Feminist” Perspectives.” Nursing Philosophy 1.1 (2001): 36-49.
  • Bowden, Peta. Caring: Gender Sensitive Ethics. New York, NY: Routledge, 1997.
  • Brabeck, Mary. “Moral Judgment:  Theory and Research on Differences between males and Females” Developmental Review 3 (1983) 274-91.
  • Bubeck, Diemut. Care, Gender and Justice. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1995.
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  • Clement, Grace. Care, Autonomy and Justice: Feminism and the Ethic of Care. Boulder, CO: Westview Press, 1996.
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  • Donovan, Josephine and Adams, Carol, ed. Beyond Animal Rights: A Feminist Caring Ethic for the Treatment of Animals. New York, NY: Continuum Press, 1996.
  • Engster, Daniel. “Care ethics and Animal Welfare.” Journal of Social Philosophy 37.4 (2006): 521.
  • Engster, Daniel. The Heart of Justice. Oxford:  Oxford University Press, 2007.
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Author Information

Maureen Sander-Staudt
Arizona State University
U. S. A.