Romanization Systems for Chinese Terms

Originally, the Chinese language and its many dialects did not use any form of alphabetical writing to express the meanings and sounds of Chinese characters. As Western interest in China intensified during the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries, various systems of romanization (transliteration into the Roman alphabet used in most Western languages) were proposed and utilized. Of these, the most frequently used today are the pinyin system and the Wade-Giles system. Both are based on the pronunciation of Chinese characters according to “Mandarin,” used as the official language of government in both the People’s Republic of China (mainland China) and the Republic of China (Taiwan).

The Wade-Giles system prevailed in both China and the West until the late twentieth century, at which point the pinyin system (developed in the People’s Republic of China during the 1950s) began to gain adherence among journalists and scholars. Today, the most current scholarship tends to use pinyin renderings of Chinese terms. For this reason, the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy introduces the names of Chinese philosophical concepts and figures in pinyin romanizations, with the exception of Wade-Giles forms that appear in bibliographical entries. The difference between the two systems can be compared by examining the renderings of some common Chinese philosophical terms according to each:

Pinyin Wade-Giles English Translation
Dao Tao Way, path
de te virtue, moral force, power
jing ching classic, scripture
junzi chün-tzu gentleman, profound person
ren jen benevolence, humaneness
Tian T’ien Heaven, nature
ziran tzu-jan spontaneity, naturalness

The following table may be used to convert pinyin and Wade-Giles romanizations:

Pinyin Wade-Giles Pronounce As-
b p b as in “be,” aspirated
c ts’, ts’ ts as in “its”
ch ch’ as in “church”
d t d as in “do”
g k g as in “go”
ian ien
j ch j as in “jeep”
k k’ k as in “kind,” aspirated
ong ung
p p’ p as in “par,” aspirated
q ch’ ch as in “cheek”
r j approx. like “j” in French “je”
s s, ss, sz s as in “sister”
sh sh sh as in “shore”
si szu
t t’ t as in “top”
x hs sh as in the “she” – thinly sounded
yi I
you yu
z ts z as in “zero”
zh ch j as in “jump”
zi tzu

Author Information

Jeffrey L. Richey
Berea College