Collective Moral Responsibility

Focusing on groups through the lens of collective moral responsibility has broadened the scope of moral philosophy.  As a social practice, as well as an important theoretical issue, moral responsibility has most often been understood in the context of relationships among friends, neighbors, co-workers, and family members.  In this context, ascriptions of responsibility and judgments of blame are usually triggered by harm caused to one person by another.

Wars, gang violence, toxic waste spills, world hunger, overcrowding and brutality in U.S. prisons, corporate fraud, the manufacture of unsafe and defective products, failure of legislative bodies to respond to pressing public policy concerns, or financial waste by a governmental agency, are some examples of the serious and widespread harms associated with collective actions and a variety of groups.  They are matters of very real and growing concern to people living in every country on the planet.

Collective moral responsibility refers to arrangements appropriate for addressing widespread harm and wrongdoing associated with the actions of groups.  The key components of the basic notion of moral responsibility are deeply rooted in the fabric of every society and are constitutive of social life. Without some conception of moral responsibility no amount of imaginative insight will render a society recognizable as a human society.  While there is broad, often tacit, agreement regarding the basic model of moral responsibility as it applies to individuals; there is considerable debate about how this notion might be applied to groups and their members.

Collective moral responsibility raises disagreement between conceptions of collective responsibility which maintain that only individual human agents can be held morally responsible, and conceptions which maintain that groups, such as corporations, can be held morally responsible as groups, independently of their members.  These opposing positions rest on a deeper conflict between methodological individualists, for whom all social phenomena, such as group activities, can (at least in principle) be explained by reference only to facts about individual humans, and methodological holists who defend the ontological position that there are social groups capable of actions that cannot be reduced to the actions and interests of their individual members.

Meir Dan-Cohen (1986) explains that both of these philosophical preconceptions obscure our understanding of the moral, social, and legal distinctiveness of groups and promote simplistic and misleading pictures of complex organizations in particular.  He argues for a normative conception which adequately represents organizations and which may help us understand how to best address the practical problems faced by societies increasingly dominated by large and powerful organizations that often cause widespread harm.

Table of Contents

  1. Feinberg’s Taxonomy of Collective Moral Responsibility Arrangements
    1. Group Liability Without Fault
    2. Group Liability with Contributory and Noncontributory Fault
    3. Group Liability with the Contributory Fault of Every Member
    4. Group Liability with Collective, Nondistributive Fault
  2. Moral Responsibility of Formal Organizations
  3. Conclusion
  4. References and Further Reading


1. Feinberg’s Taxonomy of Collective Responsibility Arrangements

Joel Feinberg’s (1970) taxonomy of collective responsibility arrangements is a valuable contribution to the exploration of issues regarding the culpability of groups and their members.  In his essay, “Collective Responsibility.” he presents four logically distinct responsibility arrangements as follows: (a) “Whole groups can be held liable even though not all of their members are at fault…” (b) “A group can be held collectively responsible through the fault, contributory or noncontributory, of each member” (c) “Group liability” through the contributory faults of each and every member” and (d) “Through the collective but nondistributive fault of the group itself” it bears liability independently of its members” (p. 233).  This last of Feinberg’s responsibility arrangements presents a version of responsibility which has generated substantially greater debate than the other three.

a. Group Liability without Fault

In this first arrangement, a whole group is liable (held morally responsible) for the morally faulty actions of one or several members of the group.  This type of responsibility, Feinberg notes, typically involves groups possessing a significant degree of solidarity, and it normally reinforces that solidarity.   Such arrangements run counter to Western liberal ideals of individual responsibility and autonomy.  But, punishment of all for the wrongdoing of a few is no less defensible on moral or logical grounds than alternative interpretations and applications of moral responsibility.  Feinberg notes that the voluntary acceptance of collective liability is grounded in a group’s “large community of interest”.  The well-being of all is seen as necessary for the well-being of each.  In addition, bonds of reciprocal sentiment foster a community in which both goods and harms are collective and must necessarily be shared.  These features help preserve solidarity and promote a mutual sense of collective destiny.  For some tribes in parts of sub-Saharan Africa and for clans in central Asia, including Afghanistan and Pakistan, where conditions are frequently so harsh and barren that life depends on groups sticking together, it is accepted practice for a family, a clan, or a tribe to be held liable and to be punished for the wrongdoing of one of its members.

Feinberg explains that arrangements in which the whole group is punished for the faults or wrongdoing of a few are examples of vicarious liability, and a person punished on account of another’s wrongdoing is said to have been punished vicariously.  Outside of those human communities in which group liability is instrumental in maintaining authentic solidarity, vicarious liability conflicts with Western and other ideals of individual moral responsibility.  These individualistic conceptions ascribe liability to each individual who is personally responsible for his or her voluntary actions that are morally at fault.  Moral agency, act and causation, and moral fault are reconnected.  There are some examples of vicarious liability in Anglo-American law, such as parents being held liable for the actions of their minor children.

Group liability is currently used in the U.S. military, particularly in the Navy.  It is not uncommon for all enlisted sailors on a ship in port to be denied shore leave or to be given an early curfew as a result of the wrongdoing of several of their shipmates.  Not surprisingly, the effect on morale is negative, and such vicarious punishment is most often ineffective in achieving its goals.  An even more troubling proposal for the use of vicarious punishment is D.J. Levinson’s (2003) argument for sanctioning all members of a group as a means “to motivate them to identify the guilty individuals in their midst”.  The practice by Israel of destroying the homes of the families of Palestinian suicide bombers is a tactic of war, not vicarious punishment, but is based on the same principle.

After examining Feinberg’s first collective responsibility arrangement, it is clear that group liability is an arrangement that is unsuitable for most human communities.  It is not compatible with the lack of social cohesion which is characteristic of developed industrial societies or the ideology of individual moral responsibility.  It is important to note that our support for individual liability over group liability is a matter of preference, not a matter of moral superiority.  It is worth considering that Christian teaching interprets Jesus’ crucifixion as his vicarious punishment for the sins of all humankind.  Clearly there is something inspiring about this instance of vicarious punishment to Christians and others when they reflect upon Jesus’ death.

b. Group Liability with Contributory and Noncontributory Fault

Feinberg’s second collective responsibility arrangement uses a category rather than an actual or hypothetical social group to examine the moral implications of luck for a group of individuals sharing a common moral fault.  It is stipulated that all members of a group drink alcohol to impairment and afterwards, drive their vehicles anyway.  Some will be lucky and reach home without an accident, and some will be unlucky and cause harm to others.  Feinberg asserts:

Most of us are ‘guilty’ of this practice, although only the motorist actually involved in the accident is guilty of the resultant injury.  He is guilty of or for more than we are, and more harm is his fault, but it does not necessarily follow that he is more guilty or more at fault than the rest of us (Feinberg 1970, p. 242).

He explains how causing harm is associated with character flaws that are often widely shared.  In fact, he finds some flaws to be so prevalent and capable of leading to harmful actions, under circumstances impossible for many to anticipate, that everyone should be aware of the serious and dangerous character flaws found “in the least suspected places”.

Only that person who caused harm is morally responsible and blameworthy.  It is a mistake to conflate the judgment of an act and a judgment that is agent-based.  The ascription of moral responsibility requires that an act causing harm occurred.  As Judith Jarvis Thompson (1996) claims, one only has control of their intentions, not how the world operates.  The morally responsible driver’s reckless disregard for the safety of others created circumstances which made it unjustifiably probable that harm would result.  Bad luck didn’t reach out and bring about the accident for which the driver now bears responsibility.  Others may be equally or even more blameworthy if they were more impaired or drove with less care, but only one person is morally responsible for the accident.  Judgments of blame, according to Elizabeth Beardsley (1979), are primarily agent evaluational, but reaching such judgments does not mean, she cautions, that the blamee’s worth as a person or his character as a whole is on the line.

Aristotle believed one was responsible for one’s actions as well as for the content of their character.  Greek society and political institutions supported the development of character containing the proper virtues.  Politics and ethics were mutually supportive, and unlike contemporary American society, which many parents consider a negative influence in their efforts to raise healthy and morally good children, ancient Athens’ harmony and cultural solidarity stands in sharp contrast.  Aristotle also understood that in pursuing the good life, aspects of achieving happiness would remain subject to some degree of luck.  A happy, morally virtuous life can end with a death that is drawn-out and painful.  Such end of life bad luck will to some degree diminish the happiness of that person’s life taken as a whole.

Feinberg presents a view of our characters which is more than a bit pessimistic and in which some of our most serious flaws are suggested to be beyond our understanding or our ability to control.  He suggests that there is a point, in what he admits is an exaggerated conception of fault and responsibility, in ascribing a “common fault” to everyone.  Feinberg holds that doing so may serve to underscore how common grave and potentially harmful character flaws are.  His gloomy egalitarian view of our blighted moral prospects is the flip side of Rawls’ (1971) egalitarian claim that our characters, capacities, and talents are social assets, because they are largely the result of an arbitrary outcome of the genetic lottery.  Both views on character, particularly Feinberg’s, may well discourage a robust sense of individual moral responsibility.

David Lewis (1989), in “The Punishment that Leaves Something to Chance.” would add luck into the criminal law with a proposal for a penal lottery.  It is designed to address the substantial disparity between the lenient sentences given to people for serious, wholehearted murder attempts that fail and the sentence one receives for a successful murder.  Morally, Lewis considers agents in both cases to be equally culpable and claims the attempter may well be more dangerous to society because he will be released fairly soon.  His penal lottery has several variations, but all provide for a person guilty of attempted murder to pull straws that will either sentence him to death, a short incarceration, or he will receive no punishment at all.  Lewis thinks his proposal would have defensive, expressive, and deterrent values.  Pure luck rendered a serious murder attempt unsuccessful.  Perhaps having the perpetrator test his luck at sentencing strikes him as “balancing the scales.” but he needs to provide an argument for the justness of his penal lottery.  As he admits, such an argument is not part of his current proposal.

What each of us may consider lucky or unlucky depends on what goals we are pursuing,   the vagaries of the world, our interactions with others, and many other factors.  That which one considers unlucky today may strike her as lucky weeks later.  Fortunate and unfortunate occurrences unfold, but to a large degree luck is a concept embraced by those who often see the way their lives unfold in superstitious terms. Bernard Williams (1982) argues that luck does matter in the moral assessment of people’s actions and characters.  He takes the position that our moral assessment of a person will be affected by good consequences which could not have been foreseen.

c. Group Liability with the Contributory Fault of Every Member

This is an especially rich category of groups, including mobs and other loosely organized groups as well as ad hoc collectives, clubs, teams, and orchestras.  With the exception of formal organizations, such as business corporations or nation-states and public bureaucracies, a tremendous variety of groups fall under this heading.

Peter French’s (1984) distinction between aggregate collectivities and conglomerates is useful in understanding some important differences between groups.  An aggregate collective is a loose collection of people.  Members come and go.  Mobs or a crowd which happens to form at an automobile accident are examples of the least structured aggregates and are sometimes also referred to as random collectives.  Some aggregates meet at a particular place at about the same time with some regularity, but form no strong bonds of solidarity.  A second sort of aggregate is defined by a characteristic common to each member, such as being Korean War vets.  If moral responsibility were ascribed to either kind of aggregate for some alleged harm or wrongdoing, it would be ascribed to group members and shared among them as individuals.

A conglomerate is often referred to as an organization.  Conglomerates have internal structures, such as procedures for making decisions and for accepting new members.  French notes that this level of organization has a degree of solidarity that makes it possible for group identity to be more than simply the sum of its members at any particular time.  Organizational structure makes it possible to preserve group identity as membership changes.  Conglomerates have what Meir Dan-Cohen refers to as “temporal independence” (1986, p.32) and can operate in a time span which extends into both past and future beyond the spans of individual members.  Conglomerate collectives include large complex formal organizations, such as giant corporations, universities, and governmental bureaucracies, as well as smaller local organizations of various sorts.  Morally, the actions of conglomerates and ascriptions of moral responsibility are not reducible or distributed to individual members.  They are borne by the group as a whole.  Larry May (1992) has identified what he calls a “putative group”.  It falls between aggregates and conglomerates, because a putative group is an aggregate which possesses the potential leadership and solidarity necessary to set up the kind of structure and decision procedures that would qualify it as a conglomerate.


Virginia Held (1970) has examined the circumstances under which a random collective can be morally responsible for failing to act.  In one of her examples three pedestrians come upon a man who has been injured and is trapped in a collapsed building.  His most pressing problem is a bleeding leg injury.  Held identifies the trapped man’s most immediate need to be a leg tourniquet.  She suggests that if an organized group, a conglomerate, had come along, they would have been prepared as a group to do what was required to help the injured man.  The random collective, on the other hand, fails to decide what action to take first or even how to organize their efforts to be in a position as a group to plan appropriate action.  As a result no action is taken.  Held concludes that the random collective is morally responsible for failing to organize themselves to develop a method for deciding to act.  This is a puzzling judgment.  First, because this is an aggregate, moral responsibility will be distributed, without remainder, to the three people individually.  Why blame the group?  Second, what was called for here was action and leadership not deliberation.  What was needed was at least one person with good sense who was willing to initiate action.  Often, as Andreou and Thalos (2007) recognize, morality calls for good impulses to assess the situation and take the appropriate actions immediately.  As a member of any sort of group, one is obliged to resist any influences detrimental to his individual moral duties and his practical wisdom.  Held’s example raises questions of individual moral responsibility only.  Working well with strangers may be a social skill, but it is not a moral trait.  The disposition to take charge and help in an emergency is a moral virtue.

In what manner should moral responsibility be ascribed when an aggregate or a small, very simply organized group causes harm?  Most philosophers would probably support the distribution of moral responsibility on the basis of the degree of contribution each member made to the untoward outcome.  The instigators and leaders of a looting mob would bear greater responsibility than reluctant participants who spent most of the riot outside the scope of the action.  Feinberg supports this approach where responsibility is collective and distributive, but acknowledges the frequent difficulty in making degree ascriptions of responsibility with precision.  Degree judgments of blame present even greater challenges because they are based on each member’s intentions and state of mind.  May also supports proportional ascription of responsibility and also recognizes how profoundly a person’s attitudes and behavior can be influenced in a group setting.  This factor must always be included in moral responsibility judgments and may mitigate or aggregate an agent’s responsibility and blameworthiness.  Examples of mitigation could arise in cases in which younger or emotionally unstable individuals are manipulated by older members or group leaders to participate in wrongdoing.  There is never a finite amount of responsibility to be distributed, so the size of the group is relevant only if it happens to affect the degree of an individual’s contribution to the harm.

Michael Zimmerman (1985) also believes there is no finite amount of responsibility in cases of group wrongdoing, but disagrees that moral responsibility should be ascribed on the basis of a member’s contribution to the harm or injury caused.  He uses examples of acts by aggregates, but defends ascriptions of full moral responsibility for all participants in group wrongdoing, except in cases, such as a teenager or an adult of diminished mental capacity coerced to take part.  His approach would hold even more validity if every participant were equally blameworthy, but that would be unlikely and attempting to determine comparative blameworthiness would be more difficult than unraveling the causal chain of events, which his approach avoids, by ascribing full responsibility to every participant.  There is a normative advantage to Zimmerman’s full responsibility approach.  In some conceptions, a larger group will affect the degree of the contribution to harm of each member.   In one of Zimmerman’s examples, a number of people push a boulder off a cliff onto a vehicle below.  According a conception in which group size is morally relevant, if a greater number take part, the causal contribution of each participant will be decreased, and this will result in the reduction of the degree of individual moral responsibility for the untoward outcome.  Zimmerman’s full responsibility approach avoids this counter-intuitive conclusion that adding additional members to a group can diminish the moral responsibility of each.

Harm or wrongdoing by conglomerates must be analyzed differently, because these groups are organizational entities that possess decision procedures and leadership features.  Where to draw the line between conglomerates, which French and others believe can be held morally responsible, independently of individual member responsibility, and those which are more like aggregates will depend on the factors of size, the degree of organizational complexity, and the level of the members’ joint commitment to shared goals and values.  Some conglomerates, such as clubs, teams, and local charities and service groups possess intentions which are expressions of aggregated individual goals and values.  For Margaret Gilbert (2000), a group intention is present when members “are jointly committed to intending as a body to do A. In the case of borderline conglomerates, a group’s structure will play a significant role in shaping its actions, and this is an important factor in making judgments concerning degrees of individual responsibility and blameworthiness for harm caused by the group.  Leaders in the group should normally bear more responsibility than followers.

May’s notion of “shared responsibility” is drawn from his interpretation of the social existentialism of Heidegger, Jaspers, and the later Sartre.  He asserts that both the conscious and pre-reflective attitudes of individuals are profoundly affected by their membership in groups and communities.  According to May:

…[w]e need an expanded notion of responsibility which includes responsibility for some harms our communities have committed, with or without our participation.  I develop the notion of shared agency to capture the idea that people are empowered by, and also aid in the empowerment of their fellow community members.  In this sense, all of the members share in what each member does, and each member of a community shares in what each member does, and each member should feel responsible for what the other members do (May 1992, pp. 10-11).

Shared responsibility is a form of individual responsibility, but is grounded in an expanded conception of both individual agency and the scope of moral culpability for both the harm caused by collective inaction, as well as by attitudes fostered in groups.  May uses an example to show how a person whose attitudes are part of perpetuating a climate of racism bears a significant degree of moral responsibility for any overt harm, such as racist violence, even if he or she is not involved in the wrongdoing itself.  Since putative groups possess leadership, solidarity, and intersubjective communication, their members share responsibility if they fail to organize to prevent harm.  Ultimately, our moral sensitivities can be developed, and we can become more self-aware of the influence such sensitivities have on our thoughts and actions.  This heightened sensitivity will greatly help people view themselves as members of the most inclusive of communities, humankind.  This was Jaspers’ vision, and if achieved, the enhanced recognition of interconnectedness would be a necessary component in responding to global social problems, such as war, hunger, or political repression.

d. Group Liability with Collective, Nondistributive Fault

This final arrangement subsumes various conceptions of collective responsibility that defend the form of collective moral responsibility which is independent of any or all a group’s membership.  Feinberg uses the example of a philosophy department that fails to honor its commitment to supervise a student’s dissertation after two faculty members who agreed to do so are no longer part of the department.  The department reneged on its commitment, because no remaining members were willing to read the student’s thesis.  This is a case where the department as a department is morally responsible for the failure to keep its promise to a student, and its structure is faulty for having no mechanism in place to deal with situations such as this.  As a conglomerate, the department’s identity should be capable of surviving changes in its membership and if its decision making procedure is intact, it should also be capable of making arrangements to keep its commitments to the student regardless of departmental membership changes.

Questions involving the moral responsibility of groups qua groups have focused on large public bureaucracies, but business corporations have received most of the attention.  The complex organizational nature of the nation-state and the circumstances under which one or more of its bureaucratic components can be held morally responsible are issues that have begun to receive greater attention as the field of political ethics matures.  No other kinds of formal organization come close to having the power corporations and states can exercise.  They are distinctively different from each other, and there is great diversity among these two kinds of organization, but they all share the potential to influence the lives of tremendous numbers of people in profound and far-reaching ways.


2. Moral Responsibility of Formal Organizations

Although the pictures of organizations as either persons or as aggregations of people are based on competing philosophical assumptions, organizations “share the normative status of persons.” and this supports the conclusion that they “should be treated likewise” (Dan-Cohen 1986, p.15).  The implications of both the personification and aggregation views are unsuitable as a basis for a new normative conception of organizations in morality and in the law.  Both pictures also reflect an unhelpful belief that some sort of cognitive conception of organizations is required before normative issues can be examined.

The work of William Connolly (1974) and Steven Lukes (1974, 2005) in the field of political theory has made some influential contributions to understanding organizations from a moral perspective.  Without being at all preoccupied with the metaphysical disputes dominant in philosophy, they have investigated the relationship between power and responsibility.  Lukes claims that the identification of an exercise of power by either an individual or an organization is at the same time an ascription of responsibility.  For Lukes:

The point, in other words, of locating power is to fix responsibility for consequences held to flow from the action, or inaction, of certain specifiable agents. …C Wright Mills perceived the relations I have argued for between these concepts in his distinction between fate and power (Lukes 1974, p. 56).

William Connolly (1974) explains that conceptual disputes over notions, such as political power, are in part disputes over what is worth trying to control in society.  Engaging in disagreements of this sort is to engage in politics itself.  He adds:

Moreover, since our ideas about power and responsibility are so intimately related, disagreements about the appropriate criteria for holding collectives responsible for consequences will be reflected in disputes about the meaning of ‘power’ (Connolly 1974, p.128).

Increasingly, people express reactive attitudes toward both corporations and the state and its agencies.  By expressing these attitudes, organizations fall under the same expectations as individual agents for being capable of acting responsibly and for being subject to ascriptions of moral responsibility if their actions fall below accepted norms and moral standards.  David Cooper (1968) concludes that these reactive attitudes directed at collectives cannot be analyzed in terms of individual blame, and that this use of language supports the morally responsible status of collectives.

Organizations must satisfy three criteria in order to be morally responsible agents: (1) They must be intentional agents able to act. (2) They must be able to conform to rules and appreciate the effects of their actions on other individuals and groups, and (3) They must be capable of responding to moral censure with corrective measures.  Opponents of collective moral responsibility have argued that organizations cannot meet some or all of these criteria.

John Searle refers to organizations and other “social objects” as “ontologically subjective” and advises:

In the case of social objects, however, the grammar of the noun phrases conceals from us the fact that, in such cases, process is prior to product. Social objects are always…constituted by social acts; and, in a sense, the object is just the continuous possibility of the activity (Searle 1995, p. 36).

But, for most philosophers actively engaged with the issues surrounding collective moral responsibility, the debate over the status of formal organizations and specifically corporations, has remained at center stage, and the question of whether some organizations can be morally responsible is seen to hinge on questions of the metaphysical identity of organizations.

The majority of positions on these issues are grounded in some version of methodological or normative individualism, and most of these present some version of a contractualist analysis of the aggregationist conception of groups.

Ross Grantham’s (1998) claim that a corporation is little more than “a collective noun for the web of contracts that link the various participants” is an example of this sort of analysis.  Manuel Velasquez (1983) takes the position that in spite of its organizational complexity, a corporation is ultimately a group of humans who are engaged among themselves in a variety of specific occupational and professional relationships which each believes to be in his or her self-interest.  Corporate actions are the result of procedures and policies intentionally designed by members of the corporation to achieve specific goals.  If harm is caused or wrongdoing occurs, moral responsibility is borne by individuals to the extent that each one participated in policy formulation, implementation, or oversight.  Velasquez does support the vicarious liability of the corporation itself in cases where there is an absence of punishable individual members or to compensate victims of corporate harm.

Another version of the individualistic conception of corporate identity is Michael Keeley’s (1981) agency theory which has its roots in classical Lockean liberalism and F.A. Hayek’s economic theories.  For Keeley, a corporation is a contractual nexus representing mutually self-interested human contractors.  A central aspect of this nexus is the hiring of managers and directors to maximize their financial investments.  These ‘agents’ hired by the shareholders are also motivated by financial gain themselves.  For Keeley, the only intentions are individual human ones.  The goals that guide corporate actions and give direction to the activities of its members are an inseparable admixture of overlapping individual goals.

Wittgenstein offers a very useful observation in Remarks on Colour that is an analogy for the shortcomings of methodological individualism:

53. Description of a jig-saw puzzle by means of the description of its pieces.  I assume that these pieces never exhibit a three-dimensional form, but always appear as small flat bits, single- or many-coloured.  Only when they are put together does something become a ‘shadow’, a ‘high-light’, a concave or convex monochromatic surface’, etc. (edited by G. E. M. Anscombe 1977, p. 23e).

Methodological individualists may claim that corporate actions can be reduced to a set of facts about individuals which can then be arranged to provide an adequate description, at least in theory, of corporate activity, but problems are evident which have a striking family resemblance to the problems in giving a description of Wittgenstein’s puzzle through a description of its pieces.

The main appeal of methodological individualism is ideological.  Paul Thompson (in Curtler 1986, pp. 127-128) identifies methodological individualism as an ideological position which supports a view of society determined by individual choice and implying that attempts to interfere with the actions of individuals in the marketplace are a corruption of the natural order of the economy.

Many individualist critics of collective moral responsibility attempt to show that only individuals can act and groups cannot make choices or possess desires and beliefs which it is claimed make group intentionality impossible.  For example, Edmund Wall’s statement about corporate organizations is representative of this position:

Even if corporations and social groups are actual entities in the world (which has not been established), a corporation lacks cognitive ability to follow reasons.  It cannot act, let alone be considered an agent whose actions can elicit praise or blame.  In the absence of beliefs and desires, reasons and actions cannot be attributed to an entity (Wall 2000,  p.189).

Wall assumes that arguments that organizations can act must contain the metaphysical claim that actual group entities, separate from their members, exist.  Further, organizations, such as corporations, are decision making, goal-pursuing structures that act for reasons which are not reducible to individual intentions.  The activities of group members in their roles in the internal decision structure make collective cognitive abilities possible.  Finally, the planning/reasons in pursuit-of-goals account of intentionality, now held by French and others, makes it unnecessary to attribute beliefs and desires to a corporation or other formal organization.

Larry May (1983, 1986, 1987, 1992) believes that corporate actions are best conceived of on the model of vicarious agency.  He holds that the corporation is a place-holder for the actions of many individuals.  The members of a corporation “stand in various relationships to each other and act through or for the corporation” (May in Curtler 1986, p.141).  May identifies two types of relationship within a corporation: (1) high ranking managers work together in the corporation’s existing decision making procedures to reach joint decisions and (2) employees and supervisors act in the name of the corporation to carry out the joint decisions of the managers.  For May, corporate actions are complex arrangements or manifestations of the joint and vicarious actions of individuals.  He holds that the relationships and networks in a corporation, both formal and informal in nature, are best understood as the activities of the firm’s members engaged in a manner which cannot be explained in terms of the activities of individuals outside of these relationships and networks.  It is these complex human interactions that ground collective intentions and collective responsibility.  May compares corporate action to the vicarious actions of a representative on behalf of his or her constituency’s interests which are themselves the outcome of complex interactions and various relationships among the constituency’s members.

John Ladd (1970, 1984, 1991) holds strong objections to Peter French’s earlier “moral person” position regarding corporations and argued it greatly reduced the moral status of human persons while at the same time “thinning” the concept of the moral community.  He also implies that the theory of corporate moral agency is associated with a number of constitutional rights, such as the 14th Amendment in 1886 and more recently, aspects of the 1st Amendment being extended to corporations.  Both of these legal developments took place during periods in which the individualistic contract model of corporations was dominant.

Ladd’s position on corporations and formal organizations generally, is based in the philosophy of language, which French employs to build a competing position supporting corporate moral responsibility.  In Ladd’s analysis, moral language can be incorporated into a group’s operating procedures.  Ladd does believe that bureaucracies, i.e. formal organizations, are capable of using the language of goals and strategies.  In his view, corporations are able to rationally calculate to achieve a repertoire of specifically defined goals and therefore, can employ language to guide action in a somewhat limited sense.  Organizations can even incorporate moral considerations, which serve as limitations on collective actions.  For Ladd, this is not the authentic use of moral language, but rather only the reflection of conventional norms of behavior.  For Ladd, to be fully moral involves constructing one’s own values and goals as a part of developing one’s sense of self and one’s personal identity.  Ladd uses the analogies of a computer or a complex machine to help clarify his position on organizations and morality.

The actions of organizations are less rule-governed than Ladd seems to recognize.  He has in mind a Weberian ideal type which will operate much like a language game.  Actual organizations are far more diverse than Weber’s formalistic, hierarchical model would imply.  The well springs of organizational action are far more complex and involve informal factors that are beyond the scope of Weber’s model.  Dan-Cohen notes that the focus of attention has shifted “when thinking of a membership organization, from the group of individual members to the permanent self-perpetuating bureaucratic apparatus that constitutes the organization” (1986, p22).  Organizations cannot operate at the highest level of moral development, but many individual humans will not or cannot operate at that level either.  Being able to obey conventional norms and being capable of understanding the effects of one’s actions on others, capacities Ladd does attribute to organizations, are sufficient to qualify an agent to be morally responsible, even if such capacities may fall short of a Kantian account of moral autonomy.

Dan-Cohen (1986) employs a thought experiment in which all members of a corporation, including all managers, are replaced by computers that are responsible, in addition to more mundane functions, for all planning and decision making.  He believes such a development is conceivable and feasible, and that the replacement of people by computers would have little effect on the operations of the firm.  The point of Dan-Cohen’s “personless corporation” is to be a heuristic device to help in understanding the implications of his organizational metaphor of an intelligent machine.  He thinks this characterization is well suited to show the distinctiveness of important organizational qualities.

For most purposes, Dan-Cohen finds it advantageous overall to view organizations from a holistic perspective.  He finds that a holistic view is preferable to the individualistic view, but he makes it clear that:

The intelligibility of such holistic terminology as we daily use need not accordingly depend on a metaphorical personification of the organization nor on some far-reaching metaphysical commitments (Dan-Cohen 1986, p. 39).

Organizational theory is the least explored body of valuable research for philosophers involved with the issue of collective moral responsibility.  The following passage is a valuable summary drawn from this important body of empirical research:

The permanence of organizations renders them temporarily independent: they operate on a different time scale, in terms of both their memory and their planning, from that of any particular individual.  Because of their complexity and formality, organizations are both opaque and impermeable: their acts and decisions are not the straightforward product or expression of any particular individual will, nor is the effect one’s action has on an organization readily reducible to the effect that action may have on any particular individual.  Being structures, organizations are manipulable: their performance is amenable to change through structural modifications. And finally, due to the nature of their decision making function, organizations can be plausibly seen as intentional systems endowed with organizational intelligence (Dan-Cohen 1986, pp. 38-39).

Dan-Cohen also proposes a morally relevant distinction between “protective” and “utilitarian” organizations (1986, p.117).  The recognition of distinctive differences between organizations leads him to distinguish organizations, such as unions, which protect individual autonomy rights from those, such as corporations, which do not have such protection as one of their organizational goals.  This basic but critical distinction has implications for our expectations about the treatment various organizations should receive in moral, legal, and political contexts.

Peter French (1979, 1984, 1985, 1992, 1995) is perhaps the most influential scholar defending collective moral responsibility.  His position has evolved over the last 30 years.  He first approached corporations from a metaphysical angle that defended the position that they were full-fledged moral persons due all the same rights, duties, and privileges as human members of the moral community.  French challenged methodological individualism directly with bold arguments to show that corporate entities are intentional agents.  In making this argument, he refined his case and bolstered it through creative use of work by Donald Davidson on action and agency and by Daniel Dennett on intentionality.

He now refers to corporations as moral actors, not moral persons, but continues to hold a functionalist account of the capacities of moral actors, including the ability to act intentionally and be morally responsible.  He also changed his account of acting intentionally from the more traditional desire/belief model to a planning model of intention.  A key element of his position is that corporations and other formal organizations possess internal decision structures which make corporate decisions and actions possible.  By coordinating, subordinating, and synthesizing the actions and intentions of various individual members of the organization, the structure transforms them into a corporate action taken for truly corporate reasons.  The decision structure also makes it possible for corporations to adjust and respond constructively after being morally blamed.

French’s corporate decision structure is composed of two elements: (1) an organizational flow chart that delineates stations and levels within the corporation; and (2) rules that reveal how to recognize decisions that are corporate ones and not simply personal decisions of the humans who occupy the positions on the organizational flow chart.  These rules are typically embedded, whether explicitly or implicitly, in corporate policy.  The decision structure also provides continuity in the identity of corporations as membership changes.

French, together with Brent Fisse has made many scholarly contributions to our understanding of corporate legal liability and have proposed notable corporate punishment strategies.  French is particularly well known for developing and advocating the Hester Prynne sanction, which is a form of court-ordered mandatory adverse publicity designed to elicit shame rather than guilt.  His earlier writings tended to emphasize similarities between corporate and human agents, but more recently he has focused on the unique features of corporations and recognizes the tremendous power they wield.  In more recent scholarship, he has also defended a theory of corporate integrity.

As is Ladd’s position, French’s approach is rooted in the philosophy of language.  For instance, the internal decision structure performs a prescriptive and not just a descriptive function.  It tells members of the corporation how they ought to act.  This structure’s linguistic function is the feature most critical to French’s argument that organizational moral actors can bear ascriptions of responsibility, because he claims it licenses a redescription of events which allow the actions of many human employees at one level to be described at another level as a corporate act done for corporate reasons.  An action performed according to the organizational flow chart which is consistent with policy and procedure rules in the second element of the decision structure affirms the action to be official corporate policy.  For French, corporate moral actors have ontological status, and corporate acts and intentions are normative and rule-governed.  His conception of an organizational internal decision structure is not primarily an empirical concept, but rather a logical one.

Virginia Held (1986) recognizes the validity of collective moral responsibility, but thinks different criteria for corporate and personal responsibility are appropriate and should be developed.  She disagrees with Larry May (1983) that individuals have “vicarious agency” for the actions of corporations and other collectives.  She finds merit in French’s explanation of the way internal decision structures facilitate corporate actions, and agrees that a corporation’s intentions cannot be reduced to the intentions of any or all of the corporation’s members.  A corporation is capable of carrying through on its plans or on its goal-directed decisions.  Held disagrees with May that a corporation’s intentions are grounded in the intentions of individual members and maintains that corporations have intentions and interests of their own.

Held observes that the law is ahead of many philosophers in its recognition of the legal standing of corporations and other groups.  These groups and corporations have gained many constitutional rights, including speech and privacy.  They are also subject to both the civil and criminal law.  Held disagrees with Susan Wolf, who opposes criminal liability because of corporations lack mens rea, and she does see advantages in bringing criminal charges against corporations.  She rejected French’s earlier position on corporate metaphysical personhood.  Held is doubtful that French’s Hester Prynne sanction can be effective and rejects the idea that corporations can feel shame.  Held suggests that corporations have no right to continued existence and that something like a corporate death penalty may be called for in some cases.  She strongly rejects Ladd’s machine analogy as applied to corporations, particularly given his recognition that they can comply with principles of morality.  She thinks it is morally significant that corporations are able to adapt easily and can change goals relatively quickly.  If an analogy is in order, a person is best, although Held observes that ‘person’ and ‘personhood’ are abstractions.  She proposes that corporations be able to earn a kind of citizenship and believes that a re-examination of corporate behavior be initiated to assess the overall status of moral values in business.  Compared to people, the most significant difference is that corporations lack an emotional life.  She thinks French’s previous support of corporate moral personhood went too far in personifying corporations, but thinks Kenneth Goodpaster properly emphasizes their distinctiveness as moral agents (Goodpaster in Curtler 1986, pp. 101-112).

David Risser’s (1978, 1989, 1992, 1996) approach to collective moral responsibility does not address the ontological status of groups.  He shares Searle’s view that organizations are “ontologically subjective” and supports Caplow’s (1966) use of unifying phrases to understand making reference to organizations.   Risser’s internal decision structure (IDS) is an empirical generalization used to better describe and explain how the actions of individuals are transformed into irreducibly organizational actions taken for organizational reasons.  His IDS contains two components: (1) a procedural hierarchy outlining the manner in which the various units in the organization become involved in decision making and how decisions are ratified in the name of the whole organization, and (2) a system of differentiated roles that provide a division of labor, power, and communication for the organization.  The actions of group members and the actions of a group are inseparable, but the relationship between the two kinds of action is not causal.  David Copp (1979) refers to the actions of individuals as “constituting” an organizational action.  An organizational action is not reducible to the actions which constituted it and is based on reasons compatible with organizational goals.  These reasons and the goals that inform them are also not reducible to the reasons or motivations organizational members have for their constituting actions.

Risser’s use of Goodpaster’s (1983) four stages of decision making – perception, reasoning, coordination, and implementation – identifies the points at which moral reasons and considerations can be included in the decision process an IDS makes possible.  Decisions and actions that an organization produces can be checked for their consistency with established group policies by referring to formal policy statements, to the informal features of organizational culture, and to past decisions.  An organization’s collective memory can also help provide evidence of policy continuity.  The planning activities characteristic of organizations both depend upon and support the development of organizational memory.

Public and private bureaucracies are human inventions justified by their success in meeting human needs better than alternative modes of human organization.  Ultimately, they are instrumentalities or organizational tools.  Risser’s instrumental view of organizations is supported by the observation, implied by Locke and stated more explicitly by Jefferson, that people are far more likely to submit to abuse and domination for too long than they are to rise up prematurely.  Risser argues that organizations do not have moral rights, and the legal rights they do have serve ideally to protect human interests.  This arrangement is a consequence of the moral priority of human interests and the value humans place on individual dignity and autonomy.

Collective moral responsibility is part of a social practice which can effectively lead to   reform, particularly when groups make structural modifications targeted at organizational flaws associated with wrongdoing.  Both collective and individual judgments are possible.  Risser proposes that degrees of individual responsibility are based on the degree of influence one is able to exercise in a particular collective decision process and the level of knowledge one had or should have gained about the nature and probable effects of that particular decision or action.  Usually members with positions higher in the IDS will be more influential and knowledgeable, but informal factors can affect that general rule.  Degree judgments of blame (Risser 1978, 1996) are also possible at both a group and an individual level.  Organizations only deserve to be liable for punishment if they are culpable of wrongdoing, but consequentialist considerations should guide the decisions if and how to punish.

3. Conclusion

The conceptual relationship between power and moral responsibility is firmly established.   Responsibility and disputes concerning its proper meanings and uses are part of politics itself.  Not surprisingly, a society’s more powerful individuals and organizations will resist being held responsible and will support narrow and restrictive definitions or both power and moral responsibility.  Sufficiently strong popular support and political leadership committed to holding organizations morally responsible will be necessary to support collective responsibility arrangements in practice.

Widespread harms for which organizations are responsible are frequent occurrences.  People want more than vague excuses or insincere apologies.  Collective responsibility is not as widely accepted a notion as individual moral responsibility, but its emphasis on the structure of organizations suggests a promising approach to organizational punishment after a judgment of responsibility is made.  The primary goal in punishing an organization should be to make it less likely that it will cause harm in the future.  Both moral and legal approaches are being developed and refined which give attention to structural reforms that identify and repair organizational flaws associated with wrongdoing.

Discussions in political theory and the social sciences have given increasing attention to the design of new organizations that are safer and more responsive to the interests of their members and the communities in which they are active.  Ian Shapiro claims “that the most interesting questions about power are best thought of as questions of institutional design geared to preventing domination without interfering with the legitimate exercise of power” (2006, p.146).  Because Shapiro considers hierarchical social relations to have a tendency to atrophy into systems of domination, his “…suggestions in this regard have been to democratize power relations through the redesign of social institutions so as to minimize domination” (2006 p. 154).

The most powerful organizations have been, for the most part, immune from moral responsibility and legal liability.  This immunity has made it possible over time for social structures which are supportive of their organizational interests to become well entrenched.  Advocates of actively promoting political responsibility, which is a fitting companion to moral responsibility, are committed to social justice even under circumstances in which there are no discrete individual or organizational agents to hold morally responsible for situations, such as the exclusion of people from the political mainstream or from key economic opportunities.  Clarissa Rile Hayward explains political responsibility as follows:

Even if no identifiable agent or agents can be held morally responsible for creating a given relation of domination, those actors whose actions helped produce that relationship are obligated to attempt to understand and to change it (2006, pp.156).

Hayward’s work is inspired by Lukes’ analysis of power and responsibility, but her conception of political responsibility was developed as a critique of his work.  She argues that Lukes’ sharp distinction between power and structural determinism excludes constraints on freedom and circumstances of domination that should be remedied, but for which no persons or organizations are morally responsible.   Lukes holds that unless the untoward consequences or conditions in question are caused by the exercise of power, they are the result of structural constraints or collective action problems.  His analysis concludes that when power is absent, ascriptions of responsibility cannot be made.  Hayward’s conception of political responsibility addresses untoward circumstances she believes are excluded by Lukes’ position with an appeal to the forward-looking political responsibilities of the actors whose actions helped create conditions of domination.  This approach may encourage progressive change more effectively than backward-looking moral responsibility.  It has been argued that the concepts of blame, moral fault, and censure can often inhibit reformative change (Waller 2007, pp. 456-464).

In an increasingly bureaucratized world, there are diminished possibilities for the spontaneous, informal, and intimate human interactions essential to civil society, that social space which is considered a buffer between big government and big corporations.

This contraction of social space results in less opportunities for freedom and human diversity and creativity; what Hannah Arendt speaks of as “human plurality”.  The implications of relentless bureaucratization for the well-being of human communities are pressing concerns for both moral philosophy and political theory.

4. References and Recommended Reading

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Author Information

David T. Risser
Penn State University Harrisburg
U. S. A.