The Compactness Theorem

The compactness theorem is a fundamental theorem for the model theory of classical propositional and first-order logic. As well as having importance in several areas of mathematics, such as algebra and combinatorics, it also helps to pinpoint the strength of these logics, which are the standard ones used in mathematics and arguably the most important ones in philosophy.

The main focus of this article is the many different proofs of the compactness theorem, applying different Choice-like principles before later calibrating the strength of these and the compactness theorems themselves over Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory ZF. Although the article’s focus is mathematical, much of the discussion keeps an eye on philosophical applications and implications.

We first introduce some standard logics, detailing whether the compactness theorem holds or fails for these. We also broach the neglected question of whether natural language is compact. Besides algebra and combinatorics, the compactness theorem also has implications for topology and foundations of mathematics, via its interaction with the Axiom of Choice. We detail these results as well as those of a philosophical nature, such as apparent ‘paradoxes’ and non-standard models of arithmetic and analysis. We then provide several different proofs of the compactness theorem based on different Choice-like principles.

In later sections, we discuss several variations of compactness in logics that allow for infinite conjunctions / disjunctions or generalised quantifiers, and in higher-order logics. The article concludes with a history of the compactness theorem and its many proofs, starting from those that use syntactic proofs before moving to the semantic proofs model theorists are more accustomed to today.

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Author Information

A. C. Paseau
University of Oxford
United Kingdom


Robert Leek
University of Birmingham
United Kingdom